Anthony Collins

First published Mon Aug 25, 2003; substantive revision Thu Oct 8, 2020

Anthony Collins (1676–1729) was a wealthy English free-thinker, deist and materialist who in his later years became a country squire and local government official in Essex. Along with John Toland, Collins was the most significant member of a close knit circle of radical free thinkers that arose in England in the first three decades of the eighteenth century. This group included such men as Samuel Bold, Matthew Tindal, Thomas Woolston and William Wollaston.[1] Collins was a friend of John Locke in Locke’s old age and Locke was one important formative influence on his philosophical views. In respect to his materialism and determinism Collins was clearly influenced more by Hobbes, Bayle and possibly Spinoza than he was by Locke. The Latitudinarians may well have influenced his views about free thinking as well as Locke. Collins’ works had some influence in England and much more on the continent during the eighteenth century.

Collins’ central passion is the autonomy of reason particularly with respect to religion. Collins was strongly motivated by an aversion to religious persecution. Issues revolving around religious freedom are the threads that run through all of his writing. It is possible to divide Collins’ works into those that are mainly philosophical and those that are more narrowly religious, but they are clearly connected. His 1707–8 pamphlet controversy with Samuel Clarke over whether “matter can think” and other topics, and his book about free will and determinism are chiefly engaged with philosophical topics. Even these topics, however, involve such religious issues as the immortality of the soul and punishment and reward in the next life. His writing about reason and free-thinking may be regarded as on the borderline between philosophy and religion. Although it deals with epistemological and sometimes metaphysical issues, it focuses almost entirely on religious issues. His religious works are even more narrowly focused. The Thirty-nine Articles are the only official confessional statement of Anglicanism. Two of Collins’ books deal with the authenticity of Article 20 of the Thirty-nine Articles and whether the church has the power to make doctrine. In large measure, these represent the doctrines of free-thinking applied to the particular case of the Anglican Church. Collins also wrote a book examining the question of whether the prophecies of Christ’s messiahship could be accepted. This seems to be a rejection of Christianity as a revealed religion. How far Collins went in the direction of atheism is still a matter of scholarly debate.

Collins was clearly a controversial figure in his time; nor has scholarly treatment down the years done much better at being objective. As Ernest Campbell Mossner remarks:

The Deists were long subjected to the odium theologicum and the historians of the movement have almost without exception downgraded or slandered them both socially as well as intellectually since the time of John Leland in the eighteenth century. (Mossner 1967b: 335)

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Anthony Collins was born in Heston, Middlesex on June 21, 1676 into a family of lawyers. He went to Eton and then King’s College, Cambridge in 1693. Though he had not graduated from Cambridge, Collins went to the Middle Temple in 1694 to study law. He didn’t like the law and was never called to the Bar. In 1698 he married the daughter of a rich London merchant, Sir Francis Child. She died in childbirth in 1703. At the time of his marriage he received some property in Essex from his father. Together with his wife’s dowry, this made him a very rich man indeed. Collins met John Locke on a visit to Oates in Essex in 1703, visited Locke five times over the next 18 months and carried on a correspondence with him about various philosophical topics. In one of his letters to Collins Locke remarked:

Believe it, my good friend, to love truth for truth’s sake is the principal part of human perfection in this world, and the seed bed of all other virtues; and if I mistake not, you have as much of it as I have ever met with in anybody.

Collins was a lifelong bibliophile with a large private research library. In the article on Collins in Birch’s Dictionary, Birch notes that his

large and curious [library] was open to all men of letters, to whom he readily communicated all the lights and assistance in his power, and even furnished his antagonists with books to confute himself, and directed them how to give their arguments all the force of which they were capable. (Birch, quoted in Berman 1975: 50)

During this period Collins also met Samuel Bold and John Toland. From 1703 until 1706, after his wife’s death, Collins spent the winters in London and the summers at his fine summer mansion in Buckinghamshire—where Queen Anne and her court visited him. In 1707 Collins began a pamphlet controversy with Samuel Clarke, a prominent British philosopher and member of Newton’s inner circle, over the question of whether matter can think. The controversy continued until 1708. In 1707 Collins also published anonymously the Essay Concerning the Use of Reason in Propositions, the evidence whereof depends on human testimony. During this period Collins frequented the London coffee shops where the deists and free-thinkers met. Berkeley apparently met him at such a gathering in 1713. In 1710 Collins made his first trip to the Continent, spending his time buying books in Holland and meeting John Churchill, first Duke of Marlborough, and Prince Eugene. Back in England, Collins met several times with Samuel Clarke and William Whiston at the house of Lady Calverly and Sir John Hubern for “frequent but friendly debates about the truth of the Bible and the Christian Religion” (Whiston, quoted in O’Higgins 1970: 77). In 1713 he published A Discourse Concerning Free-Thinking. The Discourse was his most controversial work. He made a second trip to the continent about the time that the Discourse was published. Again he went to Holland and France and planned to go on to Italy. The trip was cut short by the death of a close kinsman. In 1715 Collins, in effect, took root in Essex, moving into Mowdon Hall. Collins probably owned a good 2000 acres in Essex, much of it prime agricultural land. In 1717 he published A Philosophical Enquiry Concerning Human Liberty in which he argues for a compatibilist form of determinism and rejects freedom of the will. Samuel Clarke reviewed the book, continuing the argument that had begun during the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08.

From 1717 on Collins spent most of his time in the country, but still had a keen interest in national politics at a distance, and local politics in person. Collins was a Whig and became a spokesman for the Whigs in the country. Collins took a serious role in the government of Essex—serving as a justice, a commissioner for taxes, and then Treasurer of the County. He examined roads and bridges. He was involved in finding a place for housing county records. As Treasurer he was a model of integrity. In considering the relation between Collins, the County official and Collins the writer, O’Higgins notes that Collins was probably less tolerant towards Catholics than other justices (O’Higgins 1970: 128–9). Collins the writer is consistently anti-Catholic. So, while one might hope that the use of reason would produce a higher degree of toleration towards all religious groups than one would expect to find among true believers, there seems to be little conflict here between the writer and the jurist.

In December 1723 Collins’ only son suddenly became ill and died. His father was grief-stricken. Collins remarried in 1724 and he published what is perhaps his most successful book, A Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion as well as An Historical and Critical Essay on the Thirty Nine Articles of the Church of England. From 1725 until 1729 Collins’ health began to deteriorate. Still, in 1726 he published The Scheme of Literal Prophecy Considered. In 1729 Collins published A Discourse Concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing. He was suffering from gall stones and finally died of his disease on December 13, 1729. His second wife Elisabeth and his two daughters survived him. He willed his unpublished manuscripts to Pierre Desmaizeaux but Desmaizeaux took an offer from Collins’ widow to buy them. Desmaizeaux quickly regretted his decision, but it was too late. He accused Elisabeth Collins of giving some of Collins unpublished papers to the Bishop of Lincoln. She denied that the story was true. She willed some or all of Collins unpublished papers to a friend. What became of them is still a mystery.

1.2 Chief Works

  • An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, 1707
  • Collins contributions to the Clarke Collins controversy:
    • A Letter to Mr. Dodwell, 1706
    • A Reply to Mr. Clarke’s Defence of His Letter to Mr. Dodwell
    • Reflections on Mr. Clarke’s Second Defence of His Letter to Mr. Dodwell
    • An Answer to Mr. Clarke’s Third Defence of His Letter to Mr. Dodwell, 1708
  • Priestcraft In Perfection 1710
  • A Vindication of the Divine Attributes, in some Remarks on His Grace the Archbishop of Dublin’s sermon intitled “Divine Predestination Consistent with the Freedom of Man’s Will”, 1710
  • A Discourse of Free-Thinking, 1713
  • Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty, 1717
  • A Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion, 1724
  • An Historical and Critical Essay on the Thirty Nine Articles of the Church of England, 1724
  • The Scheme of Literal Prophecy Considered, 1726
  • A Discourse concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing, 1729

2. The Clarke Collins Correspondence (1707–08)

2.1 Background: Consciousness and Material Systems

The chief topic of the Clarke Collins controversy of 1707–08 is whether consciousness can inhere in a material system, a highly controversial issue largely inspired in this case by Locke’s notorious speculation about thinking matter. In Book IV of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, in stressing the limits of human knowledge of substances, Locke writes:

We have the Ideas of Matter and Thinking, but possibly shall never be able to know, whether any mere material Being thinks, or no; it being impossible for us, by the contemplation of our own Ideas, without revelation, to discover whether Omnipotency has not given to some System of Matter fitly disposed, a power to perceive and think, or else joined and fixed to Matter so disposed, a thinking immaterial Substance…. (Locke 1690 IV, iii, 6 [1975: 540–1])

Locke then went on to conjecture that it might be just as easy for God to add the power of thought to a system of matter organized in the right way as for God to connect an immaterial thinking thing to a body (Ibid.). Clearly, the difficulties in explaining how an immaterial mind could relate to a material body play a significant role in leading Locke to this position. This “thinking matter” passage “raised a storm of protest and discussion that lasted right through to the last years of the eighteenth century” (Yolton 1983: 17). One of the first of these protests came from Bishop Stillingfleet and Locke’s response helps us better understand the thinking matter hypothesis. Starting with God’s creation of matter, Locke goes through a series of superadditions of motion to matter, life and the excellencies of vegetation such as those of a rose or a peach tree, then sense and spontaneous motion and the other properties of an elephant. Then he notes that if there are no objections to God performing these actions upon matter, why object to the next step which is superadding the powers to matter to make a thinking, intelligent material thing. Thus, superaddition seems to involve the creation of organizations out of matter that have particular functional powers characteristic of different kinds of living things.

Locke and Collins discussed some of the responses to the thinking matter passage that were published before Locke’s death in 1704. Locke’s conjecture about thinking matter is, in effect, the centerpiece of the debate between Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins between 1707 and 1708, although the issue was also discussed on the continent. Still, as Ann Thompson writes in Bodies of Thought:

Here I shall only observe that despite the undeniable importance of Locke’s hypothesis and the arguments put forward in his second reply to Stillingfleet, they should not be seen as a starting point for speculations about the soul, but as part of an ongoing philosophical and theological discussion. While Locke’s arguments probably provided a new stimulus for discussion, claims that his hypothesis constituted the sole impetus for the late seventeenth century materialistic works ignore the preceding theological debates. (Thompson 2008: 58)

There were some diverse strands to this debate.

The Catholic Church at the Fifth Lateran Council in 1553 had declared the soul immaterial and therefore immortal. Philosophers were invited to produce proof of the soul’s immateriality. There was a tradition going back to Plato that the soul is a unity without parts. Presumably having no parts it cannot fall apart. The kind of substance dualism that one finds in Descartes, for example, was intended to distinguish humans from animals. In England, the new science was both regarded suspiciously by some religious conservatives while its proponents saw it as an ally of religion. In his will, Robert Boyle provided for a series of lectures that would use the new science to defend religious orthodoxy. These Boyle lectures were aimed at defending religion against atheists, deists, Epicurean philosophers, as well as Hobbes, Spinoza, and their followers. One of Richard Bently’s sermons in 1692 was titled Matter and Motion Cannot Think. Bently claimed that even God’s omnipotence could not produce a cognitive body (Thompson 2008: 61). This claim that there was a limit to God’s omnipotence was shocking to some. Samuel Clarke gave the Boyle lecture two years in a row, 1704 and 1705, and these were published together as A Discourse Concerning the Being and Attributes of God and the Obligations of Natural Religion and the Truth and Certainty of the Christian Revelation. It is quite likely that Collins had read this work and so when he opposed Clarke, he surely knew who and what philosophical positions he was dealing with.

On the other side, the mechanical philosophy of Descartes, Mersenne and Gassendi played a role on the materialist side of the debate. Insofar as animals could be treated like machines, it became possible for one to argue that humans were sufficiently like other animals that they too could be treated as machines. Thus an immaterial soul could be dispensed with. There were also medical treatises that suggested that matter is active and that the soul dies with the body. There were the works of Hobbes and Spinoza which argued for a materialistic monism. In 1704 John Toland published his Letters to Serena in which he argues that motion is essential to matter. Finally, there was a Christian mortalist strand in Protestantism. One strand of these Christian mortalists claimed to derive their mortalism from scripture alone and urged that the immaterial soul was a Platonic invention that had been foisted on Christianity and should be dispensed with. In England, this movement can be traced back as far as William Tindale in the sixteenth century and included such luminaries as Overton, Milton, and Hobbes. Henry Dodwell, a well respected biblical scholar, was one such figure in this tradition.

2.2 The Correspondence

The correspondence between Clarke and Collins took its rise from a book published in 1706 by Henry Dodwell. Dodwell claimed on the basis of various passages from the Bible that without divine intervention the soul would perish at death. Clarke wrote a public refutation of Dodwell’s book. Besides rejecting Dodwell’s interpretation of scripture, Clarke gave a single argument to show that consciousness could not be a property of a material system since the most plausible reason, apart from appeals to scripture, for the soul being naturally mortal is that it is material. Clarke claims

matter being a divisible substance, consisting always of separable—nay of actually separate and distinct parts—it is plain, unless it were essentially conscious—in which case every particle of matter must consist of innumerable separate and distinct consciousnesses—no system of it in any possible composition or division can be an individual conscious being. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 757]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 48)

Clarke went on to pose a thought experiment in which we are to imagine “three or three hundred particles at a mile, or any given distance, one from another” (ibid.). Clarke claims that this collection of particles could not constitute one individual conscious being. Then he has us supposes these particles brought together so as to touch one another.

Will they, thereby, by any motion or composition whatever, become any whit less truly distinct beings than they were at the greatest distance? How, then, can their being disposed in any possible system, make them one individual conscious being? (ibid.)

Clarke’s argument in effect denies that organization can play any role in unifying parts into a whole. Clarke’s argument, without mentioning Locke by name, is a refutation of Locke’s thinking matter hypothesis.

Collins, writing to Dodwell concerning matters about which they disagreed, noted that he would be happy to see Dodwell have the liberty “to publish whatever he thinks fit” (Dybikowski 2011: 188). Collins then wrote a public “Letter to Mr. Dodwell” in which he claimed to show that Clarke’s philosophical argument against the mortality of the soul was inconclusive. Clarke responded with “A Defence of a Letter to Mr. Dodwell”. Over the next two years, Clarke wrote three more defenses of his original letter to Henry Dodwell and Collins wrote three replies. Each of these was longer than its predecessor. Clarke, who became increasingly irritated as the debate continued, got the final word in “The Fourth Defence of A Letter”.

While the central issue of the correspondence is whether it is possible for consciousness to inhere in a material system and thus for matter to think, the discussion toward the end turned to other issues such as free will and determinism and the adequacy of Collins’ account of personal identity. Rather than explain the Correspondence in detail, what follows is a discussion of Collins’ position in respect to two central issues, that of emergent properties and personal identity.[2]

2.2.1 Clarke’s categories

To give a materialist account of life and consciousness, Collins needs to show that from lifeless and unthinking matter one can get life and thought. In his “Letter to Dodwell” Collins claims that there are material systems all about us whose parts do not have the properties found in the whole. He gives the example of a rose that has the power to produce its sweet scent in us, while the particles that compose it individually do not have this power (Clarke 1738 [1928: 751]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 48–9). These material systems provide models and analogies to understand how life and consciousness can arise from lifeless and thoughtless particles. Thus, from the beginning, Collins is arguing that consciousness is an emergent property, i.e. a property had by the whole, but not by the parts that compose that whole.

In his First Defence, Clarke responds by giving an argument to show that there are no real emergent properties. He does this by giving an enumeration of all of the kinds of properties. It turns out that there are only three categories. These categories correspond roughly to the primary, secondary and tertiary qualities of the mechanical philosophy (Attfield 1977: 46). The correspondence is not precise because Clarke claims to be categorizing all properties, not just properties that belong to matter. Thus, he includes consciousness in the first category, though on a different basis than the first category properties of matter such as magnitude and motion. Clarke claims that only properties of the first kind are real. Properties of the second kind are

not really Qualities of the System, and evidently do not in any proper Sense belong to it, but are only Effects occasionally produced by it in some other Substance, and truly are Qualities or Modes of that other Substance in which they are produced…. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 759]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 56)

Heat, light, taste, and sound are examples of this class of properties. Clarke claims that these properties are largely irrelevant to the question about consciousness because they are modes of the other substance in which they are produced. He claims, inaccurately that Collins’s example of the smell of a rose belongs to this class. The properties of the third kind are fictional. They

are not real Qualities at all, residing in any subject, but merely abstract Names to express the Effects of some determinate Motions of certain streams of Matter…. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 760]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 57)

The examples that Clarke gives of third category properties are magnetism, electrical attractions, and gravity.

What conditions are required for belonging to Clarke’s first class? In respect to material wholes, Clarke is a reductionist who holds that whatever real property one finds in the whole must be found proportionally in the parts. The height of the bricks and the mortar in a wall sum to the height of the wall as a whole. Thus, all the properties in a material whole are compositions of the properties of the parts. Call this Clarke’s Composition Principle. Any property of a material system that fails to conform to this pattern is not a real property. It follows that emergent properties, properties possessed by the whole but not by the parts, cannot be real. As a result of his examination of the kinds of categories, Clarke claims that all properties of a whole which are not proportionally present in the parts belong in his third class, the class of fictional properties. It follows that since consciousness is a real property it cannot be an emergent property.

Since consciousness is a real property it must belong in Clarke’s first class of properties. This being so, it would seem that it could not violate the Composition Principle. But consciousness, on Clarke’s account, is so strongly unified that it cannot be either compounded or divided. This is why it cannot belong to any material system. So, there must be a second sufficient condition for belonging to Clarke’s first category. Clarke second sufficient condition is that

an Individual Power, properly and strictly speaking…can only proceed from or reside in, an Individual Being. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 750]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 58).

To be an individual power, Clarke tells us, a power must be truly unitary, and thus not composed of parts. Call this the Individual Power Principle. So, consciousness is an individual power, which belongs to an individual being, the soul. The soul, too, is so unified that it does not have parts. Magnitude, in contrast, satisfies the Composition Principle but is not an individual power. This is because the matter to which it belongs can always be divided, or more precisely, actually is divided.

Underlying Clarke’s categories and his rejection of the possibility that wholes have properties not possessed by their parts is a principle that from material properties such as magnitude, motion, or solidity, only other material properties, or properties of the same kind, may result. The same kind of restriction can be said to apply to mental properties. Call this the Homogeneity Principle. This Principle, in turn, is related to what has been called an heirloom theory of causality. The idea here is that whatever ends up in an effect, must have been in the cause of that effect. Otherwise one gets contradictions such as that something has come from nothing, or there is more of a given property in the whole than there is in the parts, and so on.[3] Later, in “A Third Defense of an Argument” Clarke calls Collins’s attention to the fact that in his proof for the existence of God in Book IV of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke invokes the Homogeneity Principle to argue that an eternal, immaterial thinking being could not arise from matter (Clarke 1738 [1928: 837]; Clarke and Collins, 2011: 170–171). Clarke holds that this puts an end to Locke’s claim that God could as easily make matter organized in the right way to think. We will return to this when we consider the outcome of the debate.

Marleen Rozemond, in her article of 2008, writes that Clarke’s position is that something made out of matter can never constitute a genuine individual because it is infinitely divisible, and so lacks the required unity. She notes the similarity on this score of Clarke’s position with that of Leibniz (Rozemond 2008: 175). One might think that a whole, at least one that obeyed the Composition Principle, would be a real individual being. But, it turns out that this is not the case. The magnitude of the collected particles is a real property but such a whole is not a genuine individual. The only real individuals have no parts. So, while Locke and Collins agree with Clarke that matter is infinitely divisible, they disagree on the role that organization plays in producing real, unified wholes that have parts. Clarke holds that organization cannot unify such wholes into individuals, and Locke and Collins hold that it can, both at a time and over time; notably in cases of living things, where the matter composing that individual changes while the organization persists. Clarke holds that as soon as a whole loses or gains a single particle it becomes a different substance.

In his “Reply to Mr. Clarke’s Defense of A Letter to Mr. Dodwell” Collins challenges the enumeration of categories of properties with which Clarke seeks to prove that consciousness cannot belong to a material system (Clarke 1738: Vol. 3: 751; 767–70; Clarke and Collins 2011: 69–72). He continues to maintain that consciousness is a real emergent property. He also challenges the Individual Power Principle.

2.2.2 Real emergent properties

In responding to Clarke’s Defense, Collins claims that Clarke has not properly enumerated the kinds of properties. He claims that Clarke needs to show that his enumeration is complete but has not done so. There may be powers unknown to Clarke that need to be included in order to give a complete enumeration of the properties and powers of matter. In order to effectively defend his materialist account of consciousness, however, Collins points out a new class of properties that are arguably real and that are emergent and do not fit Clarke’s composition model for real properties of matter.

Collins’ chief strategy for showing that there are real emergent properties is likely derived from Locke’s claim in the Chapter “Of Identity and Diversity” in the Essay that living things are individuated not by the matter that composes them at a time but by their functional organization (Locke 1975: ii. xxvii 3–4: 330–331; see also Attfield 1977: 52).[4]

Collins begins by considering the different roles that matter and organization may play in producing all the different kinds of things in the universe. He starts with the hypothesis that different parts of matter are different from one another. If this is so the particles of matter may work in the way different parts of a clock work—the parts of the clock are different from one another and consequently have different powers. The whole to which they contribute will have powers that none of the parts have (Clarke 1738 [1928: 768]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 72). The second hypothesis Collins puts forth is that all matter is the same and therefore completely interchangeable. Collins prefers this hypothesis because it makes it easy to argue that all of the differences between the various kinds of things are a result of their organization. The distinction between matter and its organization is useful for Collins’ purposes because the properties that result from the organization of matter are different from the properties of the particles. As Collins notes:

…if the powers of a System of Matter may intirely cease upon the least Alteration of a Part of that System, it is evident that the Powers of the System inhere not in the Parts in the same Sense with Magnitude and Motion: for divide and vary the Parts of Matter as much as you will, there will be Magnitude and may be Motion; but divide or vary the least Part of the Eye, and the Power of contributing to the Act of Vision is intirely at an end. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 768]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 72)

The organization of the eye is essential to its proper functioning and indeed to it being an eye at all (Clarke 1738 [1928: 769]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 72). It is an emergent property. Collins does not explicitly make the point that since the organization of the eye is an essential property it must also be a real property. Perhaps he thought this obvious. Clarke’s response was to claim that the power of the eye to see is a fictional and not a real property (Clarke 1738: 790]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 100).

Serious engagement with emergent properties did not really take place until the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. There are now a variety of different versions of emergentism, both scientific and philosophical, many of which bear hardly any resemblance to Collins account of properties had by wholes which are not had by the parts of that whole. However, in an article “Aggregativity: Reductive Heuristics for Finding Emergence” William Wimsatt describes a version of the distinction between emergent and non-emergent properties, coming from Complexity theory, that both improves on and articulates the insight that makes Collins’ account so interesting, though Wimsatt was unaware of the historical precedent (Wimsatt 1997 [2008]). That insight is that properties that are a result of the organization of parts are essentially emergent. Even if they can ultimately be explained, this will not change their status as emergent properties (see also Uzgalis 2018: 272).

2.2.3 Personal Identity

The topic of personal identity comes up as early as Clarke’s Second Defence of an Argument because Clarke objects to consciousness being an emergent property of the brain and also objects to the brain being the bearer or seat of personal identity (Clarke 1738 [1928: 787]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 96). Correspondingly, there are important connections between Collins’ account of emergent properties and his account of personal identity. Consciousness, for Collins is both an emergent property and constitutive of personal identity. In addition, Collins claims that because of the mind-body problem, dualist views do not serve the ends and purposes of religion. Clarke replies that it is Collins’ materialist views that not only are useless, but have dangerous consequences for the ends and purposes of religion. Many of these consequences have to do with personal identity.

What are the connections between Collins’ account of emergent properties and his account of personal identity? The most important connection is the Lockean distinction between the matter that composes a material thing at any given time and the organization of matter. The distinction comes from Locke’s account of the individuation of masses of matter and living things in his chapter “Of Identity and Diversity” in Book II of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. A mass of matter is individuated by the particles that compose it, however organized. If the mass gains or loses a single particle it becomes a different substance. Living things, by contrast, are individuated by their functional organization (Locke 1690: II. xxvii 3 [1975: 330). Collins’ summary of his views on identity and personal identity make it clear that he agrees almost completely with Locke’s account of identity and the individuation of masses, living things and persons (Clarke 1738 [1928: 875]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 231–232). But Clarke insists that in order for something to remain the same, it must remain the same substance. In the case of material things like oaks, this means that the matter that composes it must remain the same or it is not the same oak. Only atoms, souls and God fulfill this same substance condition for Clarke. So, oaks are only identical in a fictional sense. In addition, it is not possible for any entity to have the same properties it had previously if its substance has changed, because it is not possible to transfer properties from one substance to another (Clarke 1738 [1928: 798]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 113). So, just as Clarke holds that emergent properties are fictional, so he holds that any identity not based on identity of substance is fictional. The clash between the two over the metaphysical importance of organization is fundamental to their different views of emergent properties, identity, and personal identity.

Collins accepts Locke’s revolutionary view that consciousness and not the substantial soul is the bearer of personal identity. Again agreeing with Locke, he regards memory as crucial to personal identity and feelings of pleasure and pain as important concomitants of consciousness. Still, Collins’ account of personal identity is not exactly the same as Locke’s. Locke’s account is officially neutral in regard to whether “the substance that thinks in us” is material or immaterial, simple or compounded (Locke 1690: II, xxvii. 17 [1975: 341). Collins, by contrast, is giving an account that makes “the substance that thinks in us” material and compounded. But the neutrality of Locke’s account of personal identity ought to allow Collins to adopt it without significant change, and this is what he does. Collins also defends the view against attacks addressed to the concept of memory involved. Clarke holds that Collins’ account of memory violates a basic principle of Clarke’s substantialist account of identity—that properties cannot be transferred from one substance to another. So, if the particles of the brain have changed, a memory cannot be a veridical memory of that new substance. Locke and Collins,by contrast hold that representations of events can be transferred from one substance to another and these constitute genuine memories (Clarke 1738 [1028: 787]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 96).

Collins’ response to this is to claim that annexing consciousness to the brain explains the phenomena of consciousness far better than positing an unchanging immaterial substance. There is also a perfectly reasonable sense for properties to be transferred from one substance to another. In his Reflections on Mr. Clarke’s Second Defence he writes:

For if we utterly forget, or cease to be conscious of having done many things in former Parts of our Lives which we certainly did, as much as any of those which we are conscious that we have done; and if in fact we do by degrees forget everything which we do not revive by frequent Recollection, and by again and again imprinting our decaying Ideas; and if there be in a determinate Time a partial or total flux of Particles in our Brains: What can better account for out total Forgetfulness of some things, our partial Forgetfulness of others, than to suppose that the Substance of the Brain in constant Flux? (Clarke 1738 [1928: 787 and 809]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 130)

As for the problem of transferring consciousness from one substance to another he writes:

I will suppose myself conscious at Forty of having been carried to a Market or Fair at Five Years old, without any Particle of Matter about me, the same which I had at that Age: now in order to retain the Consciousness of that Action, it is necessary to revive the Idea of it before any considerable Flux of Particles, (otherwise I must totally lose the Memory of it (as I do of several things done in my Childhood) and by reviving the Idea of that Action, I imprint afresh the Consciousness of having done that Action, by which the Brain has a lively an Impression of Consciousness (though it be not entirely composed of the same Particles) as it had the day after it did the Action…. (ibid.)

This account of how memory works nicely fits the model of the preservation of an organization through a change of matter that Locke uses to explain the identity of living things. However, Clarke does not accept this explanation because he holds that only a theory of the substantial soul can provide the underpinnings for an account of veridical memory (Clarke 1738 [1928: 787; Clarke and Collins 2011: 180).

2.3 Evaluating the Clarke Collins Correspondence

One might ask who won the debate? In the eighteenth century, the answer largely depended on whether you were a dualist or a materialist. If you were a dualist you saw Clarke as the winner. If you were a materialist you saw Collins as the winner. In her 2009 article focusing on Collins’ emergentism, Marleen Rozemond gives an account of the way she thinks the dialogue proceeded and concludes that Clarke was the victor. She holds that Collins, in fact, conceded a crucial point and as a result subsequently changed his position.

In order to understand why she thinks this we need to grasp the distinction Collins makes between numerical and generical powers in his “Reflections on Mr. Clarke’s Second Defence of his Letter to Mr Dodwell”. He writes:

By numerical powers I understand such powers as motions and figures of the same species. The power of the eye to contribute towards seeing is a species of motion, and the roundness of a body is a species of figure. By generical powers I understand all the several species of numerical powers—as motion signifies all the various species of motion, and figure all the various species of figure. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 805–806]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 124–125)

Rozemond notes that after making this distinction Collins admits that all generical powers conform to the Homogeneity Principle. In her 2008 article, Rozemond claims that Locke did not accept that emergent properties are possible, because in his proof for the existence of God in Chapter 10 of Book IV of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding he invokes the Homogeneity Principle to show that an eternal and Intelligent Being could not be created by matter (Rozemond 2008:163). In fact, Clarke draws Collins’ attention to this very passage in the Essay (Clarke 1738 [1928: 837]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 170–171). If this were the only reference to the Homogeneity Principle in the Essay it would be difficult to see how Locke could also maintain that it would be possible for God to cause matter to think even if it were arranged in the right way. Clarke’s point to Collins is that on this basis he should give up the idea that thinking matter is possible. I take it that this is Rozemond’s point as well and she holds that in saying that the Homogeneity Principle applies to all generical powers, Collins is conceding the crucial point.

Rozemond notes that there is one other way that Collins could have proceeded.

One way to reject Clarke’s position is to reject his qualitative constraints on causation. One could do this by becoming a Humean about causation. Collins did not do this and the world had to wait another while for Hume. (Rozemond 2009: 186–7)

So, on her view, Collins gives up the possibility of emergent properties and does not have the kind of empiricist theory of causality that Hume has. And there seem to be no other alternatives. She claims that after this Collins substantively changes his position by suggesting that consciousness is a mode of motion. She takes this to be a quite unattractive version of mind-brain identity theory (Rozemond 2009: 187).

There is, however an alternative view of how the Correspondence ends. This view is that Collins has not changed his position, or at least not changed it in the way Rozemond suggests. He is conceding nothing to Clarke. In introducing the distinction between numerical and generical powers he writes that

having set forth the entire strength of what can be said against my instances, an answer to it will set this dispute in a clearer light than possibly it has hitherto been, and perhaps give Mr. Clarke particular satisfaction with relation to the inconclusiveness of hiss argument, by detecting what I conceive has previously imposed upon him. (Clarke 1738: [1928: 805], Clarke and Collins 2011: 124)

His response to Clarke’s attack on his examples is to make the distinction between numerical and generical properties. This is hardly the words of someone who is about to concede the decisive point being debated.

There are a couple of possibilities about what Collins has in mind for numerical powers. One is that numerical powers would include both powers that conform to the Composition Principle (figure and motion), and powers that do not (the power of the eye to see). Generical powers, by contrast, simply treat powers that are numerically different (such as different kinds of motion) just as motions. Thus, all material powers, treated as generical, conform to the Homogeneity Principle (Clarke 1738 [1928: 806–807]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 28–30).

The second possibility, which is what the examples Collins gives really suggest, is that all numerical powers are emergent and do not conform to the Composition Principle. All generical powers, on the other hand, do conform to the Homogeneity Principle. If the second interpretation is true, Collins thinks that all of Clarke’s first category powers, or at least his favorite ones, can be treated as wholes that have properties not had by the parts. This would indeed be a change of position, but in just the opposite direction to the one that Rozemond supposes. But, even on this second interpretation, all generical properties conform to the Homogeneity Principle. So, why isn’t Collins in trouble in the way Rozemond claims? The answer is that the use of the Homogeneity Principle in Locke’s proof for the existence of God is not the only reference to that principle in Locke’s Essay.

In replying to Clarke in “An Answer to Mr. Clarke’s Third Defense of A Letter to Mr. Dodell”, Collins points out to Clarke that Locke had distinguished two situations involving the Homogeneity Principle (Clarke 1738 [1928: 868]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 220–221). In the proof for the existence of God as an immaterial intelligence, the Principle applies in full force to show that matter could not create an eternal, immaterial, intelligent being. The second case is the creation of human thought. In this second case, Locke supposes that an omnipotent, immaterial God exists and that God, because He is omnipotent, could violate the Principle of Homogeneity. In fact, Locke claims that God has in fact done so – in the case of secondary properties, such as color and sound, where what is produced in the mind bears no resemblance to the causes of those ideas in the material world or motions in the brain. Thus, Locke holds, there is good reason to think that God could produce thinking matter. He is explicit that there is no contradiction between the two cases, knowing as he did that some people thought his use of the Homogeneity Principle in the proof for the existence of God ruled out the possibility of thinking matter (Locke 1690: IV. iii. 6 [1975: 541). Collins adopts this position as well (Clarke 1738 [1928: 837]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 170–171; see also Uzgalis 2018: 270–271). If this is right Collins can continue to maintain that emergent properties are possible as they are all numerical properties and so need not conform to the Homogeneity Principle and actually exist and that God’s omnipotence allows him to make matter duly arranged to think. Clarke, in his next Defense, rejects both Collins’ distinction between numerical and generical powers and the Lockean distinction concerning the Homogeneity Principle (Clarke 1738 [1928: 829–830]; Clarke and Collins: 158–159). He claims in respect to the Homogeneity principle that the reasoning is the same in both cases. Clarke’s view is that even an omnipotent God cannot violate the Homogeneity Principle (Clarke 1738: 901; Clarke and Collins 2011: 268–269). As a consequence, he holds that emergent properties are not possible, nor can matter think. So. on this alternative view of who won the debate, if the criteria for victory is a concession by one side or the other, the Correspondence ends not in a victory for Clarke, but in a stand-off.

In evaluating the controversy, one would have to say that of all the encounters between the Newtonians and the free thinkers, the one between Collins and Clarke was the most philosophically significant and influential. O’Higgins holds that Collins is important to us mainly because he defends an early version of materialism. While there is surely some truth to this, O’Higgins is clearly damning Collins with faint praise. What we should recognize is that Collins was indeed a pioneer in trying to show that consciousness is a real emergent property of the brain and in this regard certainly showed much more originality than O’Higgins gives him credit for (see note 2). One need only compare Locke’s claim that we would need revelation to understand how matter could think and his use of the term ’superaddition’ with Collins account of emergent properties to see what an improvement in explanatory power the latter has over the former. O’Higgins also claims that Collins’ arguments are not very good. This also does not give Collins enough credit. It is true that Collins does give some arguments that are not very good. On the other hand, Collins forced Clarke to clarify his position in a number of respects. He also uncovered a number of weak points in Clarke’s position. Clarke’s poor treatment of Collins’ example of the power of a rose to produce a sweet smell in us is one example. He answered as if Collins was talking about the smell of the rose and claims that this secondary quality belongs in his second class of properties. But Collins properly objects that he was talking about the organization of the particles of the rose—the cause of this effect, and not the effect on us. Clarke’s response is weak. One of Collins’ strongest points was his critique of Clarke’s doctrine that though the soul is immaterial it is extended (Vailati 1993). One can also see how much pressure Collins is applying to Clarke’s system as the number of properties in Clarke’s third class—fictional properties—continues to mount in the course of the correspondence.

In respect to the central issues of the debate, Collins is struggling to articulate a materialist and empiricist metaphysics that can compete with the well developed dualist, a priori metaphysics that Clarke deploys. As Barresi and Martin comment:

His faltering, but often successful attempts to reformulate traditional metaphysical issues empirically, embodies the birth pangs of a new approach. (Martin and Barresi 2000: 51)

But perhaps most strikingly, Collins is attempting to defend a doctrine of emergent properties that does not become prominent in English philosophy until Mill’s System of Logic (1843) and the twentieth century British Emergentism movement.

3. Determinism and Free Will

3.1 Background

Collins deals in passing with determinism and freedom of the will in the 1707–08 correspondence with Samuel Clarke and in his 1707 book An Essay concerning the Use of Reason. His A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Liberty of 1717 is entirely devoted to the issue. From the beginning, Collins is a determinist with a compatibilist account of free action (Clarke 1738 [1928: 872]; Clarke and Collins: 226–227). Clarke attacked Collins’ determinism in the 1707–08 correspondence. He also reviewed the 1717 book and defended a doctrine of libertarian free will as he had in the earlier correspondence.

Since the nature of human choices and actions are central to debates about free will and determinism there is a close connection between positions about these issues and positions about consciousness and personal identity. The kind of determinism that Collins advocates is a natural extension of his materialist, empirical, and naturalistic account of consciousness. In his account of consciousness, Collins makes the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain the most basic motives of action. This makes happiness and misery necessary concomitants of consciousness, and thus conscious beings are endowed with a desire for happiness. This is true as much of animals as it is of human beings and accounts for a large number of similarities in the behavior of humans and animals. Collins holds that if the behavior of animals is determined, then that of humans must be as well.

3.2 Determinism in Collins’ early works

In the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 Collins claims that Clarke’s argument for dualism is useless to religion and morality because of the problem of explaining how the immaterial mind and the material body interact. One of Clarke’s counter-charges is that Collins’ materialism is not just useless but dangerous to religion and morality because it implies a determinism that is destructive of religion and morality (Clarke 1738 [1928: 831], Clarke and Collins: 192).

Collins claims that human action is caused in much the same way as the actions of clocks. Both are necessary agents, though the causes that produce the action, in either case, are very different.

Both are necessarily determined in their Actions: the one by the Appearances of Good and Evil, the other by a Weight or Spring. (Clarke 1738 [1928: 872]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 226)

Collins also attacks the free will position. He holds that the same causes will always produce the same effects and claims that the free will explanation of being able to do otherwise violates this basic principle of causal explanations (Clarke 1738 [1928: 873 and 874]; Clarke and Collins 2011: 227 and 230).

Collins also expressed determinist views in his first book—An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, 1707. He does this in the context of the problem of reconciling God’s foreknowledge with human free will. As O’Higgins puts it:

He solved the problem to his own satisfaction by saying that all things, including human choices, are determined in their causes and as such can be foreseen by an all-knowing God. (O’Higgins 1976: 6)

This view also plays a role in Collins’ 1710 critique of Archbishop King’s views about the problem of evil and the epistemological status of the attributes of God. King claimed that God’s attributes, including his foreknowledge of events, was analogical. In the case of God’s foreknowledge, he did this to avoid contradictions between God’s knowing what was to come and the contingency of events and human free will. Collins is content to reject human free will and to suppose that ‘foreknowledge’ has a univocal meaning when used with reference to God or humans.

3.3 A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty, 1717

At the beginning of his discussion of Collins and determinism Jacopo Agnesina remarks: “Determinism is the aspect of Anthony Collins thought that has always met with the most success” (Agnesina 2018: 97). In A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty Collins briefly states his position. He rejects the view that there is any freedom from necessity and claims that insofar as there is human freedom it is “liberty or freedom from outward impediment to action”. Such freedom is compatible with necessity. Collins holds that every action has been caused and must necessarily have occurred. The future is as much determined as the past. He then gives six arguments for this form of determinism.

The first of Collins’ arguments has to do with experience. Defenders of free will hold that the experience of even ordinary people shows that they choose freely. Collins’ response is much the same as that of Hobbes and Spinoza. He claims that those who say such things are either not attending to, or not seeing, the causes of their actions. Collins goes on to claim that some defenders of free will admit that the issues are tangled and not to be resolved by appeals to vulgar experience (Collins 1717: 12–31 [1976: 60–69]).

William Rowe notes that Collins and Clarke share a volitional theory of action. Rowe describes the theory in this way:

According to this theory, actions are of two sorts: thoughts and motions of the body. What makes a thought or bodily motion an action is its being preceded by a certain act of will (volitions) which bring about the thought or motion. Volitions, then, are “action starters”. (Rowe 1987: 54)

Rowe also notes that Collins and Clarke share the assumption that if a volition is causally determined then the person doing the act does not have free will (Rowe 1987: 53). Rowe says that as the two antagonists agree on these points, they play little or no part in the debate. But they do explain the strategy that Collins uses to argue that experience actually shows that we are determined. He examines experience under four topics relating to choice and action: (1) Perception of Ideas; (2) Judging of Propositions; (3) Willing; and (4) Doing as we will. Collins argues that each of these is causally determined.

He holds that perception of ideas of sensation and reflection are not voluntary. So, perception can hardly be free. In respect to judging, he claims that we judge in terms of how things appear to us and that we can’t change these appearances. In respect to the will, he claims that there are two questions to be considered. One is whether we are at liberty to will or not. The second is whether we are at liberty to will “one or the other of two or more objects”. In respect to the first question, he claims that Locke made a mistake in holding that people are at liberty to will because they can suspend willing. So, Collins holds that Locke’s answer to the first question would be affirmative. Collins claims that suspense of willing is as much an act of will as any other. So, his answer is negative. In respect to the second question, Collins argues for a value determinism that makes the answer to the second question negative as well. In defining willing, he remarks: “Willing or preferring is the same with respect to good and evil, that judging is with respect to truth or falsehood”. So, if something seems better than the alternatives we will choose it. Collins is thus a moral determinist who holds that we must do what seems best to us. In giving his negative answer to his second question, Collins is also rejecting the claim that we could have done otherwise in cases where we have decided which of the alternative choices is best (Collins 1717: 31–40 [1976: 69–73]). Collins then proceeds to consider cases where we can see no difference between the objects we are to choose among, e.g., which of two eggs we will take. Collins’ response is that:

It is not enough to render things equal to the will, that they are equal or alike in themselves. All the various modifications of the man, his opinions, prejudices, temper, habit, and circumstances, are to be taken in and considered as causes of the election no less than the objects without us among which we chuse; and these will ever incline or determine our wills, and make the choice we do make, preferable to us, though the external objects of our choice are ever so much alike to each other. (Collins 1717: 47 [1976: 77])

If one were truly indifferent one simply would not choose. But once there is a will to choose, the cascade of causes that leads to action will determine the choice one way or the other. What Collins means by “doing as we will” is what we do consequent to willing. Here again, he finds no freedom from necessity. We do what we have willed unless some external impediment or intervening cause hinders us from doing so. Finally, he compares the actions of animals to those of men. He claims that while animals are supposed to be necessary agents and humans free agents, there is no perceivable difference between their actions that would allow us to make this distinction (Collins 1717: 53–57 [1976: 80–82]).

Collins’ second argument is that man is a necessary agent because all his actions have a beginning. He holds that whatever has a beginning has a cause and all causes are necessary. Collins (as he had in the Clarke Collins controversy) also rejects the proposition that the same causes could produce different effects. Thus Collins rejects the doctrine of free will because it violates the basic principle of causal explanations. The third argument claimed that liberty is an imperfection. Going back to judging propositions, Collins points out that if we were free, we would be able to judge probable what is improbable, and so on. This is the analog of moral determinism to the epistemic realm. Just as we are not free to knowingly choose the worse over the better, we cannot affirm that what seems improbable to us is probable. If we could we would be worse off than we are. The fourth argument is that liberty is inconsistent with God’s foreknowledge. This is again similar to the view that Hobbes held and repeats the assertions of Collins’ first book An Essay concerning the Use of Reason. The fifth is that if man were not a necessary agent, and determined by pleasure and pain, there would be no foundation for rewards and punishments. The sixth is that if a man were not a necessary agent he would be ignorant of morality and have no motive to practice it. These last two arguments make the point that causality is necessary for the operation of morality in the world, and to introduce a causeless free will is to make the teaching of morality or its motivation by punishment or reward pointless (Collins 1717: 57–108 [1976: 82–108]).

James Harris and Jacopo Agnesina have both argued that the An Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty was in fact a response to Dr. Clarke and rational theology. They claim that Collins was attempting to demonstrate that determinism follows from Clarke’s first principles (Agnesina 2011, 2018: 105; Harris 2005: 58). Agnesina has also been at pains to argue that Collins’ determinism is a logical and not just a causal determinism.

Agnesina characterizes the distinction between these two kinds of determinism in this way. Causal determinists maintain:

…that present and future events are determined causally by their antecedents. This theory has its roots in the principle of causality or the principle of sufficient reason: all events have a sufficient cause that determines them. Thus causal determinism excludes events that arise ex abrupto, but without stating that this is the only possible and conceivable world: unrealized possibilities exist that, though they are not logically contradictory, cannot come about because they are incompatible with the law of nature, that is with the causal chain of events of this world. Necessitarianism strengthens causal determinism from just this latter standpoint: all unrealized possibilities are excluded and it is held that the current law of nature is the only possible one. (Agnesina 2018: 98)

In this regard, he thinks Collin’ position is that of a logical determinist, and so close to that of Spinoza. O’Higgins claimed that it was possible that Collins did not understand the Spinozistic implications of his position (Collins 1717 [1976: 45 note 114]). O’Higgins seems to be suggesting that Collins, if he read Spinoza’s Ethics, might have been confused by the book, even though Collins had also read the critiques of Spinoza by Pierre Bayle and G. W. Leibniz. Agnesina counters that even if Collins had not read the Ethics, he had read the critiques of Spinoza by Bayle and Leibniz and that these critics of Spinoza had clearly spelled out the implications of the kind of logical determinism that Collins seems perfectly willing to adopt (Agnesina 2018: 120–125). One problem with taking Collins to be a logical determinist is that Collins is a compatibilist, thus regarding freedom as freedom from outside obstruction. But it would seem that while compatibilism is possible under causal determinism; it is not under logical determinism. But, Hobbes too claimed to be a compatibilist and had the same kind of tendencies towards logical determinism that Collins has.

Interestingly, there was only one response to Collins’ book in England. Samuel Clarke reviewed it and argued that the notion of a ’necessary agent’ was incoherent, for to be an agent one must be active and Collins’ position was that the humans are completely passive and thus (in Clarke’s sense) not agents at all. Clarke charges that in discussing being able to do otherwise, Collins fails to distinguish between physical and moral necessity (see Harris 2005: 59). Clarke also complained that Collins treated perception as actions, when in fact, perception is passive (Clarke 1738 [1928: 722]). Clarke develops his own account of free will arguing that motives, pleasures and pains, reasons and arguments, are simply occasions for the self-moving power that is active to freely determine action. What we have again is a competing set of explanations for the same phenomena. It appears that Clarke failed to take a number of Collins’ arguments seriously, because the free will arguments being refuted were not his arguments.

In a series of letters, Collins discussed Clarke’s review of his book with his long time friend and collaborator Pierre Desmaizeaux. He had written up a reply. Eventually, however, Collins concluded that Clarke had been threatening him with civil action, and that to reply would provide Clarke with the opportunity to do so (Dybikowski 2011: 260–1, 269 and 281). Consequently, Collins made no reply to Clarke’s review.

In 1729 a short book, A Dissertation of Liberty and Necessity, with the initials A.C. on the title page, was published. For a number of reasons O’Higgins holds that Collins is not the author of this work. O’Higgins first reason for rejecting Collins’ authorship is that the book treats the substance of the soul as unknown—a Lockean doctrine that Collins had rejected. O’Higgins also cites contemporary reviews that claim the arguments of the book are weak compared to the Inquiry. Jacopo Agnesina agrees with O’Higgins that the work is not by Collins and gives a full discussion of the argument over attribution (Agnesina 2018: 125–132, see also Harris 2005: 60). Still while making claims that Collins would not make about the soul and substance, the arguments are certainly consistent with the determinist position that Collins was holding in the earlier work. The author also takes into account at least one of Clarke’s criticisms of the Inquiry.

The author of A Dissertation remarks that he will

attempt to solve the Point of Free Will, by tracing the progress of the Soul through all its Operations which we are conscious of, and examining in each whether “tis Active or Passive”. (Collins 1729: 1)

The point is that at every stage in the process, from perception to action, we are passive. The author apparently accepted Clarke’s point in his review of Collins’ Inquiry that perception is not an action, for he calls it not an ‘action’ but an ‘operation.’ The author explicitly takes up Clarke’s views when he argues that we are passive in judgment. He quotes Clarke at length. Clarke holds that judgment is passive but distinguishes between judging and acting. The author continues:

But I conceive the doctor here begs the Question, by asserting the Self-motive Power in the Soul without proving it, and then reasons from it as granted to him. (1729: 6)

The author of A Dissertation thus returns to Clarke a charge that Clarke had made about Collins in his 1717 review of A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty.

4. Collins, Deism and Freethinking

The seventeenth and early eighteenth century in England saw a rationalist treatment of theology that spanned many competing groups from the Latitudinarians to the Dissenters to the Deists. Samuel Hefelbower in The Relation of John Locke to English Deism remarks that among the progressives—theologians, philosophers and deists—all accepted a rationalistic religion. The question then becomes what exactly is the role of reason vis à vis revelation. The discussion of the relation of reason to revelation goes back at least to Albertus Magnus and Thomas Aquinas—that is to the scholastic authorities. Albert held that reason has a role to play in religion, but there are questions where philosophy has no final answer and revelation must decide. Revelation is above reason but not contrary to it. Thomas has a similar position (Hefelbower 1918: 47). Locke holds that reason is responsible for determining what counts as a genuine revelation. Locke also holds the view that there is revelation that tells us about things above reason but not contrary to it.

Thus that part of the Angels rebelled against GOD, and thereby lost their first happy state: And that the dead shall rise, and live again: These, and the like, being beyond the Discovery of Reason, are purely matters of Faith, with which Reason has directly, nothing to do. (Locke 1690: IV. xviii. 7. [1975: 694])

The Deists tend to hold a more radical view than the one that Locke advocates.

Samuel Clarke in his Boyle lectures of 1704 distinguishes four grades of deists. First there were those who acknowledged a future life and other doctrines of natural religion. Second were those who while denying a future life, admitted the moral role of the deity. Third are those who acknowledged providence in natural religion, but not in morality. And finally, those who denied providence altogether. Where does Collins fit, in these grades of deism? According to O’Higgins:

In his books, Collins came to emphasize the part that morality should play in religion and to assert the importance of natural religion. (O’Higgins 1970: 40)

Collins claims to believe in a future life (if not natural immortality). Collins rejects Revelation. So, if O’Higgins is right, Collins fits Clarke’s first grade of deists.

David Berman has disputed this view, arguing that Collins is, in fact, an atheist (Berman 1988: 801). Jacopo Agnesina in his book The Philosophy of Anthony Collins: Free Thought and Atheism strongly agrees with Berman. Agnesina’s strategy is to take the whole of Collins’ work and by putting the pieces together makes clear what the parts only partially display—Collins atheism (Agnesina 2018: 192).

4.1 An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, 1707

An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, Collins’ first book, was published anonymously in 1707 a little before his Letter to Mr. Dodwell. The main thrust of the book is to reject religious mysteries. Collins starts his approach to the issues of religion and reason along the same lines that Locke does. He defines reason as “that faculty of the Mind, whereby it perceives the truth, Falsehood, Probability or Improbability of Propositions” (1707 [1984: 3]). Propositions consist of words “which stand for Ideas concerning which some agreement is affirm’d or deny’d” (1707 [1984: 3–4]). Thus he accepts Locke’s definition of knowledge. He also distinguishes in the way Locke does intuitive, demonstrative and probable truths, and treats claims about revelation as probable propositions that largely derive from testimony. Perhaps one diversion from Locke is that Collins distinguishes between two different kinds of probability. The stronger kind resembles demonstration but the connection between ideas is merely probable. The weaker kind of probability is a testimony. Collins’ position is that a person is not expected to believe anything that is not comprehensible by the human intellect. So, if terms take on meanings that cannot be understood, humans cannot be expected to believe them.

O’Higgins sees a strong affinity between Collins’ book and John Toland’s Christianity Not Mysterious, which had been published in 1696. He quotes Toland’s remark that:

We hold that reason is the only foundation of all certitude…that nothing reveal’d, whether as to its manner or to its existence, is more exempted from its disquisitions, than the ordinary phenomena of nature…that there is nothing in the gospel contrary to or above it.

O’Higgins claims that this is very much the position that Collins is taking in the Essay. In An Essay Concerning Human Understanding Locke allowed that there were some truths that were above reason but compatible with it. Some scholars regard this as a mere verbal commitment to truths above reason, while others regard it as substantive. What is clear is that Locke would not accept truths above and contrary to reason. On this point, Locke, Toland, and Collins are in complete agreement. Toland, however, has a more radical position than Locke in that he rejects truths above reason, even where these truths are compatible with reason (see Woolhouse 2007: 372). Thus Toland would not accept the story of the rebellion of the angels or the claim that the dead shall rise. Collins, on the other hand, seems to hold the same position Locke does. He quotes with approval a passage from Robert Boyle who uses an analogy of a deep-sea diver to make the distinction between above reason and contrary to reason plausible. If the diver asks you if you can see to the bottom of the ocean and after you have declared that you cannot, brings up oysters with pearls in them, you will have no objection to the claim that there are oysters with pearls in them at the bottom of the sea. If, on the other hand, the diver claims that the pearls he shows you are larger than the shells containing them, “you would doubtless judge what he asserts contrary to the information of your eyes” (Collins 1707 [1984: 25–6]). This sounds like Locke’s position. But Agnesina points out that Collins gives this analogy a twist. He writes:

…Collins reduces Boyle’s example to its conceptual scheme: it is simply a matter of acquisition of knowledge, not of a different type or degree of knowledge. (Agnesina 2018: 149)

Thus Agnesina agrees with O’Higgins that Collins holds the same position as Toland: there are no truths above or contrary to reason.

Turning from analogy to theological doctrines, we find that Collins rejecting transubstantiation (1707 [1984: 24]). Collins also objects to the doctrine of the Trinity because it is not understandable and on some interpretations involves contradictions. Acceptance of the doctrine of the Trinity is the first of the Thirty-nine Articles to which an Anglican was supposed to subscribe. It is plain that Collins, like Locke, Newton, Clarke, Whiston, Toland, and others, objected to this article. Many of these men concealed their views about the Trinity and claimed that they were orthodox Anglicans.

Given that Collins rejects mysteries and the claims that there are truths above reason why should we accept any part of Holy Scripture? Collins holds that it is on account of testimony. Collins writes:

There are ideas join’d in Propositions, which the Mind perceives to agree or disagree by the testimony of others. (Collins, 1707: 5)

Testimony gives rise to a particular kind of knowledge, faith. We learn about facts, current events, historical, scientific ones, and so on by having them communicated to us by others. But testimony itself is not enough to produce faith or assent unless the people and events themselves are credible. Collins, like Spinoza in the Theological-Political Treatise concludes that the writers of the Bible were not writing for philosophers, but adapted their expressions to the capacity of understanding of the bulk of mankind (Collins 1707: 14). Agnesina points out the similarity in Collins’ conclusions not only with Spinoza, but Locke, Le Clerc, Richard Simon, and Toland. He remarks that these similarities:

…show what enormous pressure the Bible was subjected to in those years. Freed from the Holiness that made it untouchable, it was now minutely examined with the tools of philology. As may easily be imagined, this operation was exploited by the most radical thinkers, who discredited its contradictions and inconsistencies, in order to gain credit for their own positions. From the opposing side, in a sort of contrasting action, the desire was growing to preserve the Bible and to ’update’ according to the findings of science. (Agnesina 2018: 151)

Besides the kinds of pressure just noted, there was the act of toleration which came along with the Glorious Revolution of 1688. The Anglican Church in the 1690s was on edge as it saw its revenues falling and debates about the fundamental doctrines of the Church were at a fever pitch. Thus, the advent of the Boyle Lectures to defend the views of the Anglican Church and show their compatibility with Newtonian science is hardly surprising.

4.2 Analogical language

In A Vindication of the Divine Attributes, in some Remarks on His Grace the Archbishop of Dublin’s sermon intitled “Divine Predestination Consistent with the Freedom of Man’s Will”, (published in 1710) Collins takes on another way of evading his demand that whatever we believe must be comprehensible to us. This is the doctrine of analogy that goes back to St. Thomas Aquinas. The form in which Collins finds it in the works of Archbishop King of Dublin, is the doctrine that not only does God not have hands and feet and a beard in a literal sense, he does not have wisdom, benevolence or justice in any sense that we can understand these terms. Thus King remarked:

It does not follow from hence, that any of these are more properly or literally in God after the manner they are in us, than hands or eyes, than mercy, than love or hatred are.

Collins rejects the claim that God’s wisdom and benevolence could have meanings that we do not comprehend. He asserts that God’s knowledge and his attributes are univocal with ours (O’Higgins 1970: 63).

David Berman in his A History of Atheism in Great Britain, gives a number of reasons to take Collins as an atheist rather than a deist. He sees Collins’ account of the creation of matter ex nihilo in the Answer to Mr. Clarke’s Third Defence in the Clarke Collins correspondence as an argument for atheism disguised as an argument against atheism (Berman 1988: 80–81). He sees Collins as using Bayle to raise the problem of evil in the Vindication of the Divine Attributes and then showing that both the solution offered by Bayle and Dr. King are unacceptable. Collins’ official position at the end of the Vindication is that King is wrong but atheism is avoidable. Berman asks what the actual conclusion of the Vindication is. He continues:

It is simply that there are very formidable, or insuperable, difficulties in the theistic conception of God—revealed by the Manichean problems—and that the latest attempt to cope with, or solve, these difficulties, i.e. King’s theory, has failed; for the medicine is as bad as the disease. But the disease remains! (Berman 1988: 84)

Collins clearly rejects theism based on revelation. But one could also be a theist based on arguments from natural religion. Berman sees the Vindication as aimed at the heart of natural religion (1988: 84). If this were so, we would have good reason to regard Collins as an atheist. On the one hand, Collins’ position about analogical language may seem to strongly support natural religion. Insofar as the meaning of the divine attributes is univocal with our use of the same words about human beings, the analogy that natural religion relies on would work at its best. (The basic analogy on which natural religion depends is that humans are to the machines they make as God is to the world.) Archbishop King’s position, on the other hand, would completely undermine the analogy. There is, however, a second consideration. Insofar as the problem of evil is left unresolved in natural religion, it would suggest that it can provide no effective answer to this fundamental difficulty in theism. This is Berman’s point. O’Higgins, by contrast, claims that in the Vindication Collins simply sets aside the problem of evil (O’Higgins 1970: 63).

4.3 A Discourse of Free Thinking, 1713

Like Locke, Collins is an advocate of the use of reason to determine religious truths. One necessary condition for being able to think freely is not to be persecuted for considering views that are different from the accepted ones. Only in such an environment can one genuinely consider alternatives. It must be possible to adopt whichever of the possibilities turns out to be the most reasonable. Collins, like Locke, is committed to the view that one should proportion assent to a proposition on the basis of the evidence for it. Religious persecution aims to limit the possibilities and the evidence that one can consider. Though Collins was strongly anti-clerical, he does distinguish between good priests and bad priests. The good priests are the ones who advocate freedom of thought; the bad priests, on the other hand, are persecutors who want to prevent people from thinking through the truths of religion for themselves. In his own time, Collins’ most controversial work was his A Discourse of Freethinking (1714).

Concerning the Discourse, J.M. Robertson writes that it

…may be said to sum up and unify the drift not only of previous English freethinking, but of the great contribution of Bayle, whose learning and temper influence all English deism from Shaftesbury onward. (Robertson 1915: 123)

Perhaps the motto of A Discourse of Free-Thinking ought to be “Where experts disagree, any person is free to reason for themselves”. Collins is chiefly concerned with religion, so the vast bulk of the disagreements he cites have to do with religious issues, from whether one religion is better than another, down to the details of Anglicanism. Looking at conflicting claims often leads to skepticism. Where exactly this approach leads Collins is a question that we will have to consider.

In A Discourse of Free-thinking Collins defines free-thinking as

The Use of the Understanding, in endeavouring to find out the Meaning of any Proposition whatsoever, in considering the nature and Evidence for or against it, and in judging of it according to the seeming Force or Weakness of the Evidence. (Collins 1713 [1984: 5)

Collins claims that we have a right to think freely. Richard Bently in his Remarks about a Late Discourse of Free-Thinking charges that this definition is too broad—that it amounts to a definition of thinking. James O’Higgins in his study of Collins agrees with Bently. This, however, is not a good evaluation. Collins’ account is surely intended to rule out believing without evidence, or against the evidence, or without carefully considering conflicting evidence. Either these are not going to be admitted as thinking at all, or Collins’ definition is not too broad.

The Discourse is divided into three sections. In the first two Collins gives a series of arguments in favor of free-thinking and in the third he answers objections to free-thinking and gives a list of historical figures who he views as free-thinkers. The arguments treat thinking effectively as like a craft or art and a number of the early arguments work on this analogy. He claims that just as putting restrictions on painting would reduce the proficiency of the painter, so putting restrictions on thinking can only reduce the proficiency of the thinker. To fail to think freely leads to the holding of absurd beliefs and superstition. Collins gives a brief history of the efforts of priests to control what people believe by fraud from the ancient world to the Reformation. Collins then claims that free-thinking is responsible for the decline in the belief in witchcraft.

Section 2 begins with Collins arguing that right opinion in matters of religion is supposed to be essential to salvation and errors to lead to damnation. But if one is not to think freely oneself about such subjects, then one must simply take up the opinions of those among whom one happens to live. But this means that they will only be right by accident. On the other hand, if people think freely, they will have “the evidence of things to determine them to the side of truth” (Collins 1713 [1984: 33). There are in all ages an infinite number of pretenders to revelations from Heaven, supported by miracles. These pretenders offer new notions of the Deity, new doctrines, commands, ceremonies and modes of worship. To decide which of these are genuine and which spurious requires that one think freely about the competing evidence that would show that one is genuine while the other an imposter. Collins remarks that since the Anglican Church has an organization to support foreign missionaries (The Society for Propagating the Gospel in Foreign Lands) this really requires supporting free-thinking throughout the world and therefore at home as well. Indeed:

As there can be no reasonable change of opinions among men, no quitting of any old religion, no reception of any new religion, nor believing any religion at all, but by means of free-thinking; so the Holy Scriptures agreeably to reason, and to the design of our blessed Savior of establishing his religion throughout the whole universe, imply everywhere and press in many places the duty of free thinking. (Collins 1713 [1984: 43–46])

Finally Collins claims that the conduct of the priests

who are the chief Pretenders to be the Guides to others in matters of Religion, makes free-thinking on the nature and attributes of the eternal being of God, on the authority of the scriptures, and on the sense of scriptures, unavoidable. (Collins 1713 [1984: 46])

He goes on to list disagreements and differences of opinion among priests on all these topics.

In section 3 Collins takes up various objections to free-thinking. To suppose that all men have a right to think freely on all subjects is to suppose that they have the capacity to do so. But they do not. So it is absurd to think that they have a duty to think freely. Collins replies that to suppose a right to a thing “also implies a Right in him to let it alone, if he thinks fit” (Collins 1713 [1984: 100). As for free-thinking being a duty, Collins responds that it is so only in cases where those who contend “for the Necessity of all Men’s assenting to certain Propositions, must allow that men are qualify’d to do so” (ibid.). If it were the case that the great bulk of mankind lacked the capacity to think freely on matters of speculation, then the priests should conclude that men should in no way be concerned about truth and falsehood in speculative matters. In short, they should hold no opinion. Even in this case, however, the right to think freely would remain untouched in those disposed to think freely. The second objection is that to encourage free-thinking “will produce endless Divisions of Opinion and by consequence Disorders in Society”. Collins suggests that the consequence is false and that any remedy is worse than the disease. Third, free-thinking may lead to atheism. Collins points out that many divines hold that there never was a real atheist in the world while Bacon holds that contemplative atheists are rare. Still, even if free-thinking were to produce many atheists, the number of those who are superstitious or enthusiastic that will be produced in the absence of free-thinking is even greater. And these are worse evils for society than atheism. Fourthly, priests are the experts who are to be relied upon in their subject as doctors and lawyers are to be relied upon in theirs. Collins argues that the analogy between doctors and lawyers and priests does not hold. First, while doctors and lawyers act for us, we need not believe the principles or opinions on which one prescribes and the other acts. But in matters of religion, “I am obliged to believe certain opinions myself. No man’s belief will save me except my own” (Collins 1713: 109). Finally, free-thinkers are “the most infamous, wicked and senseless of all mankind” (Collins 1713: 118). Collins answers this objection in various ways—arguing that in fact free-thinking makes one virtuous. He ends by listing a variety of men he considers free-thinkers whose moral character was impeccable—Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, Plutarch, Cicero, Varo and others among the ancients. Among the moderns he includes, Bacon, Hobbes and Archbishop Tillotson.

4.4 Interpreting A Discourse of Free Thinking

The Discourse leaves us with a variety of questions. What exactly is Collins trying to achieve in this book? Reflecting on the first two sections of the Discourse, James O’Higgins notes:

A good deal of what he wrote can be interpreted as the writing of an anti-clerical protestant, insisting on private judgment for the laity. A few other passages…such as those from Varo and Socrates, seem to imply a bias against Christianity itself, or at least against Revelation. (O’Higgins 1970: 89)

Some of Collins’ critics accused him of being an atheist. But, unless one gives the work an esoteric reading, this hardly seems warranted. Collins is, however, clearly extolling a universal religion based on reason.

The Discourse received a good number of replies. Steele commented that the author of the Discourse deserved “to be denied the common benefits of air and water” (quoted in O’Higgins 1970: 78). The Guardian campaigned against the Discourse. Among the articles it published were some by the young George Berkeley. There is a certain amount of scholarly debate about how effective these replies were. From early on, historians have often claimed that Richard Bently in his Remarks about a late Discourse of Freethinking delivered a crushing rejoinder to Collins. James O’Higgins in his book-length study of Collins probably gives the most balanced assessment. O’Higgins admits that Bently, on the whole, makes a strictly ad hominem attack on Collins. He attacked Collins’ scholarship and accused him of atheism. O’Higgins thinks that Bently succeeded in showing that “Collins was not the man to produce a critical edition of the Bible” (O’Higgins 1970: 84). O’Higgins also remarks that Bently correctly points out that Collins did not understand the role of textual variants in reducing (rather than increasing) our uncertainty about the meaning of a text. Since Collins is maintaining that everyone capable of doing so should reason about religious matters, claims that he failed to reason correctly may have more bite to them than other ad hominem arguments. But while these are good points, set against the fact that Bently completely failed to address the main issue of religious authority, this can hardly amount to a crushing rejoinder.

5. Collins and Religion

Edward and Lillian Bloom note in their introduction to A Discourse Concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing that:

For several years and in such works as Priestcraft in Perfection (1710) and A Discourse of Free-Thinking (1713), he was a flailing polemicist against the entire Anglican hierarchy. Not until 1724 did he become a polished debater, when he initiated a controversy that made “a very great noise” and which ended only with his death. The loudest shot in the persistent barrage was sounded by Grounds and Reasons and its last fusillade by the Discourse Concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing. (Collins 1729 [1970: iii])

In Priestcraft in Perfection, 1710, and An Historical and Critical Essay on the Thirty Nine Articles of the Church of England, 1724, Collins attacks the first clause of Article 20 of the 39 articles: “The Church hath power to decree rites or ceremonies, and authority in controversies of faith”. Collins goes over the history of the clause in considerable detail to argue that it is a forgery. Clearly if this were a forgery, the church would have no power to decree rites nor authority in controversies of faith. The point is that:

…the just and true establishment of religion lies, in allowing every man to have a conscience of his own; to use and follow his own private judgment; and particularly, to understand, profess and practice, what he thinks God teaches in the holy scriptures. (Collins, Preface to the Essay, quoted in O’Higgins 1970: 143–4)

O’Higgins notes that this might be the position of any dissenting minister. He gives a detailed summary of the controversy in Chapter IX of his study of Collins.

In A Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion, 1724, Collins attacks the basis of Christianity as a revealed religion. In The Reasonableness of Christianity, Locke had made the messiahship of Christ the single fundamental tenet for being a Christian. In the Discourse Collins rejects it. The argument is that Christianity is founded on Judaism, or the New Testament on the Old. The New Testament is only of importance in this regard insofar as it shows that the prophecies of the Old are fulfilled. Collins rejects the claim that they are fulfilled in the New Testament. This, he asserts, is the only proof for Christianity. Collins’ critics disputed this claim; there was the proof from miracles. But Collins rejected such proofs.

In rejecting the argument from prophecies Collins is once again jousting with the Newtonians. William Whiston (1667–1752) was a close associate of Newton’s and was probably influenced by Newton’s interest in prophetic arguments. Stephen Snobelen points out in his review of the controversy that Whiston hoped to set up an exact science of prophecies. As Snobelen notes: “For Whiston, fulfilled prophecy was as certain as a Boylean experiment or a Newtonian demonstration” (Snobelen 1996: 205). Collins shared much of Whiston’s desire for precision. Often it was allowed that a prophecy in the Old Testament had dual fulfillments, one in the prophet’s own day and one in the more remote future. One of these was supposed to be literal, the other allegorical. Both Whiston and Collins reject ‘allegorical’ interpretations for literal ones. But while Whiston regarded the later fulfillment as literal and the earlier as allegorical, Collins insisted that it was the earlier one that should be regarded as literal.

Using the catalog of Collins’ library produced by Giovanni Tarantino, Jacopo Agnesina has persuasively argued that A Discourse Concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing published in 1729 is a genuine work of Anthony Collins, though O’Higgins in his biography of Collins doubted its authenticity (Agnesina 2009). Edward and Lillian Bloom in their introduction to their reprint of the Discourse remark that:

For the modern reader, the Discourse concerning Ridicule and Irony is the most satisfying of Collins’s many pamphlets and books. It lacks the pretentiousness of the Scheme, the snide convolutions of the Grounds and Reasons, the argument by half-truths of the Discourse of Free-Thinking. His last work is free of the curious ambivalence which marked so many of his earlier pieces, a visible uncertainty that made him fear repression and yet court it. On the contrary, his last work is in fact a justification of his rhetorical mode and religious beliefs; it is an apologia pro vita sua written with all the intensity and decisiveness that such a justification demands. (Collins 1729 [1970: xv])

The aim of the Discourse is to refute a claim by Nathanael Marshall that while serious arguments about religious issues should be allowed, ridicule and irony in attacks on established religion should be prosecuted by the magistrate. This is a clear indication of how much his Anglican opponents had let Collins’ irreverent wit, biting satire and ironical remarks get under their skin. Collins’ opponent was vulnerable on a number of points and Collins makes telling arguments against his claim. He notes that the best writers on religion will be found to be committing these crimes in disputation; that the best punishment would be either to be ignored or to return ridicule with ridicule—rather than to be punished by the magistrate. He points out that when Mr. Marshall discovers how many of those who practice these crimes are of his party and are encouraged in these practices he will give up his position, and so on. The theme of allowing liberty of discourse in public debates about religion is the over-arching theme of the Discourse, and it is certainly one of the main themes of Collins’ work throughout his life.

6. Influences

6.1 In England

We have already considered in some detail Samuel Clarke’s reaction to Collins’ views about emergent properties, personal identity and issues about determinism and free will in the early eighteenth century. The Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 was reprinted twice and referred to many times in the course of the eighteenth century (Martin and Barresi 2000: 33). The conservative reaction to Locke and Collins concerning personal identity and materialism represented by Clarke continued to be maintained by many thinkers in eighteenth century England as well as on the continent. In fact, we can see an on-going debate between the materialists and dualists on these topics all the way through the eighteenth and into the early nineteenth century in England.

Bishop Joseph Butler (1692–1752) a protege of Samuel Clarke attacked the Locke/Collins account of personal identity in the Appendix on Personal Identity to his Analogy of Religion. Butler largely accepted Clarke’s substantialist account of identity and personal identity. Indeed he clarified Clarke’s position by summarizing it briefly and naming the distinction Clarke had been making between real and fictional identity. He called it the distinction between identity in the strict and proper sense and identity in the loose and popular sense (Ducharme 1986: 370). He reiterates Clarke’s claim that Collins’ account of personal identity is dangerous to religion and in particular the doctrine of the resurrection. He accused Collins of taking Locke’s doctrines “to a strange length” (Butler as quoted in Perry 2008: 102). By this Butler meant that Collins’ account of personal identity would not allow a person’s identity to persist for more than a moment and thus that Locke’s account of personal identity implied and that Collins explicitly stated a doctrine of successive persons. Butler claimed that such a doctrine would destroy both morality and any doctrine of the resurrection. This has been an influential misinterpretation of Collins (see Uzgalis 2008a: 322–326).

George Berkeley (1685–1753) met Collins at a freethinking coffee house meeting and later told his American follower, Samuel Johnson, that Collins was an atheist. As noted earlier, Berkeley attacked the Discourse of Free-Thinking in Steele’s Guardian, and continued his attacks on Collins in Alciphron. While Berkeley holds a quite distinct set of philosophical views from those of Clarke, together they represent a conservative Anglican response to Locke and Collins on the issue of personal identity. Berkeley agrees with Clarke about the substantial nature of persons.

Scholars are still debating the influence of Collins on David Hume (1711–1776). How much influence is attributed to Collins depends largely on the interpretation given to Hume’s philosophy (see McIntyre 1994, Russell 1995, and Harris 2005). McIntyre and Russell despite their differences agree that in A Treatise Of Human Nature Hume was systematically attacking Clarke’s position on the mind/body relation as articulated both in Clarke’s Boyle lectures and the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 and that many of Hume’s arguments resemble those of Collins. Harris, focusing on the issue of free will and determinism and using the Enquiries to interpret the Treatise, has a contrasting view. He argues that Hume’s account of necessity is weaker than “that defended by Collins and before him by Hobbes”, and he goes on to claim that in giving this weaker account Hume is giving the same kind of account that Bramhall and Clarke gave in trying to find a middle way between necessitarianism and the liberty of indifference (Harris 2005: 73). Harris may be correct in noting a variety of ways in which Hume’s account of causality and necessity differs from that of Hobbes, Locke and Collins. On the other hand, central to Hume’s analysis of causality is the total rejection of the a priori Homogeneity Principle and the necessary connection implicit in heirloom theories of causality. Collins also rejects the Homogeneity Principle, and heirloom theories of causality that underlie it. He strenuously denies that any of the contradictions that are supposed to follow from violating the Principle actually occur. These are clear similarities between Collins’ account of causality and Hume’s that Harris fails to note. I think these considerations tend to weaken Harris’ judgement that while Collins is a dogmatist on these issues, Hume is a skeptic (see Harris 2005: note 22 p. 79).

Thomas Reid (1710–1796) holds positions on materialism, personal identity and free will that have much in common with the views of Clarke. Reid deploys reduplication arguments in objecting to the views about personal identity of Joseph Priestly (see Martin and Barresi 2000: 47). Priestly’s views have strong connections to those of Locke and Collins.

Joseph Priestley (1733–1804) was sufficiently impressed with Collins’ Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Free Will to arrange the publication of a new edition of that work. Priestley also held that matter can think, but his views were based on a different conception of matter than the one which Collins and Clarke shared. Priestley had an active conception of matter derived from Boscovich. Priestley was also impressed by Collins’ work on the prophecies (Yolton 1983: 108–113).

6.2 On the continent

Collins’ influence on the continent in the second half of the eighteenth century was much more considerable than his influence in England. O’Higgins remarks that

Small though his part in English literature may have been, during his own lifetime there were few English writers who were more fully reported in the continental journals, or more noted in foreign universities. (O’Higgins 1970: 203)

Pierre Desmaizeaux knew Collins for some 26 years and was his friend and collaborator. Desmaizeaux played an important role in raising Collins’ reputation both in England and on the continent. Collins discussed Clarke’s response to his book on determinism with Desmaizeaux and Desmaizeaux kept Collins in contact with the intellectual life on the continent and also served as a publicist for Collins. He had Collins’ Inquiry translated into French and handled the printing of his other books. In 1720, under Collins’ direction, Desmaizeaux published A collection of several pieces of Mr. John Locke, never before printed, or not extant in his works. Pub. by the author of the Life of the ever-memorable Mr. John Hales, &c which contained a number of Locke’s letters to Collins. There was considerable interest on the continent in the thinking-matter controversy. There is a certain amount of debate about the influence of Collins’ book on free will and determinism on Voltaire. O’Higgins accepts the evidence produced by Torrey in Voltaire and the English Deists that Voltaire was converted to determinism by reading Collins (O’Higgins 1970: 219–20). As time passed free-thinking came out into the open in France and Collins’ name was associated with it. Finally, his works on the materiality of the soul, determinism and free will and the prophecies influenced the group around Baron d’Holbach. (For a detailed treatment of Collins’ influence on the continent, see O’Higgins 1970: Chapter XI.) Whether Collins would have been happy with this depends on whether we view him as a deist with O’Higgins, or as an atheist with David Berman and Jacopo Agnesina. This disagreement over whether to regard Collins as a deist or as an atheist (or someone whose views changed over time or were unclear even to himself) is our most serious unresolved problem in determining Collins’ proper place in the history of ideas.


Primary Literature

Work by Collins

  • Collins, Anthony, 1707 [1984], An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason and A Discourse of Free Thinking, Peter Schouls (ed.), 1707; republished New York: Garland Press, 1984.

    A republication of Collins’ first book and his 1713 book on free thinking, both in their original eighteenth century type.

  • –––, 1707 [1976], Determinism and Free Will, introduction by James O’Higgins, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

    Provides the facsimile text of Collins’ A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Freedom along with annotations and a useful introduction that discusses Collins’ place in the debate over free will and determinism and provides an analysis of the text.

  • –––, 1729 [1970], A Discourse concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing, Edward A. Bloom and Lillian D. Bloom (eds.); republished, Los Angeles: The William Andrews Memorial Clarke Library, No. 142, 1970.

    A republication of Collins’ last book with an interesting introduction and notes.

  • Clarke, Samuel and Anthony Collins, 2011, The Correspondence of Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins, 1707–08, William Uzgalis (ed.), Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press.

    A new edition of the Correspondence with an introduction, notes, index and supplementary readings that put the correspondence in context.

  • Dybikowski, James (ed.), 2011, The Correspondence of Anthony Collins (1676–1729), Freethinker, Paris: Honoré Champion.

    A fine edition of Collins’ letters that includes an introduction, extensive notes that make clear many of the references in the letters that would otherwise be unintelligible, and an index.

Works by Others

  • Bayle, Pierre, 1697 [1991], Historical and Critical Dictionary Selections, Richard Popkin (ed. and trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.

    This contains a translation of the article “Diaearchus” in which Bayle attacks the thinking matter hypothesis.

  • Clarke, Samuel, 1738 [1928], The Works of Samuel Clarke, volumes 1–4; republished New York: Garland Press, 1928.

    Clarke’s Works have Clarke’s Boyle lectures, the Clarke Collins correspondence in its entirety and Clarke’s review of Collins’ 1717 book on determinism and free will.

  • Locke, John, 1690 [1975], An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Peter Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    Locke’s magnum opus had a considerable influence on Collins both in respect to his epistemological views and in respect to particular issues such as whether matter can think. This is currently the standard edition of Locke’s Essay.

  • –––, 1989, The Correspondence of John Locke, volume 8, E. S. De Beer (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    Contains Locke’s letters to Collins during the period of their eighteen month friendship. It is thus a major source for the study of their relationship.

Secondary Literature

  • Agnesina, Jacopo, 2009, «Sur l’attribution à Anthony Collins du Discourse Concerning Ridicule and Irony in Writing» (in French), in La Lettre Clandestine, 17, Paris: Presses de l’université de Paris-Sorbonne, 277–290.

    Agnesina argues on the basis of a comparison of the sources used in A Discourse on Ridicule and Irony in Writing and the catalog of Anthony Collins library that the Discourse is a genuine work of Anthony Collins.

  • –––, 2011, “Anthony Collins e il Determinismo Logico” (in Italian), Rivista di Storia della Filosofia, 66(3): 409–430.

    Agnesina argues that Collins was not just a determinist but a logical determinist or necessitarian who was influenced indirectly by Spinoza through Bayle and Leibniz.

  • –––, 2018, The Philosophy of Anthony Collins: Free Thought and Atheism, Paris: Honoré Champion

    An account of the life and works of Anthony Collins focused on the question of whether Collins was an atheist. Agnesina fills in some of the philosophical background to Collins’ work, identifies previously unknown works, and often gives a compelling analysis of some of the works themselves.

  • Attfield, Robin, 1977, “Clarke, Collins and Compounds”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 15(1): 45–54. doi:10.1353/hph.2008.0087

    Introduces the Clarke Collins controversy, and focuses on the issue of Clarke’s categories. Attfield suggests that if one does not wish to accept Clarke’s reductionism one should focus on the powers of functional objects.

  • Bedau, Mark A. and Paul Humphreys (ed.), 2008, Emergence, Contemporary Readings in Philosophy and Science, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. doi:10.7551/mitpress/9780262026215.001.0001

    While not dealing with emergent properties before J. S. Mill, the twentieth and twenty-first century treatments of emergence in this book gives some real perspective on the interest and importance of the arguments Collins gives for such properties in the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08.

  • Berman, David, 1975, “Anthony Collins: Aspects of His Thought and Writings”, Hermathena, 119: 49–70.

    This is, in effect, a critical review of James O’Higgins book Anthony Collins: The Man and His Work. Berman fills in the gaps that O’Higgins account leaves in our understanding of Collins. The article, then, is intended as a supplement to the book. Berman paints a picture of Collins as a genuine lover of truth who uses his wealth to create a research library used by many scholars. He relates Collins to Locke and Berkeley in terms of the meaning of terms for religious mysteries, e.g. the trinity, as well as in other ways.

  • –––, 1980, “Hume and Collins on Miracles”, Hume Studies, 6(2): 150–154. doi:10.1353/hms.2011.0618
  • –––, 1988, A History of Atheism in Great Britain: From Hobbes to Russell, London, Croom Helm.

    Berman makes the case that Collins was an atheist. This is a competing interpretative hypothesis to O’Higgins’ view that Collins believed in the existence of God and a future state.

  • Colie, Rosalie L., 1959, “Spinoza and the Early English Deists”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 20(1): 23–46. doi:10.2307/2707965

    Develops the political dimension of early English Deism. Colie claims that Collins was the least political of the early English Deists. She discusses the relation of Collins’ views on necessity and the problem of evil to those of Spinoza.

  • Copenhaver, Rebecca (ed.), 2018 Philosophy of Mind in the Early Modern and Modern Ages: The History of the Philosophy of Mind, Volume 4, London: Routledge.

    An anthology of works about Philosophy of Mind in the early modern and modern periods, including a chapter about the Clarke Collins correspondence (Uzgalis 2018).

  • Cottingham, John, 1988, The Rationalists, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    Explains heirloom theories of causality

  • Ducharme, Howard M, 1986, “Personal Identity in Samuel Clarke”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 24(3): 359–383. doi:10.1353/hph.1986.0062

    Makes the case that Clarke develops the metaphysical view that underlies the distinction between identity in the strict and philosophical sense and identity in the loose and popular sense that Butler later named.

  • Edwards, Paul, 2009, God and the Philosophers, Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.

    Puts Collins in the context of a brief history of Deism.

  • Fergusen, James, 1974, The Philosophy of Dr. Samuel Clarke and its Critics, New York: Vantage Press.

    Fergusen deals with the Clarke Collins controversy over determinism and free will. He considers critically Clarke’s response to Spinoza and Hobbes.

  • Fox, Christopher, 1988, Locke and the Scriblerians, Identity and Consciousness in Early Eighteenth Century Britain, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.

    A fine treatment of the seventeenth and early eighteenth century debate over consciousness and personal identity that includes an account of the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 and the influence it had on the Scriblerians.

  • Harris, James A., 2005, Of Liberty and Necessity, The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth Century British Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199268606.001.0001

    Puts the views of Clarke and Collins in the context of other views about free will and determinism in the eighteenth century.

  • Hefelbower, Samuel Gring, 1918, The Relation of John Locke to English Deism, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

    An effort to characterize the defining features of English Deism

  • Jacob, Margaret C., 1976, The Newtonians and the English Revolution 1689–1720, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press

    Profiles the latitudinarian Anglicans both before and after the Revolution of 1688 who used Newtonian natural philosophy as a basis for justifying a particular social order against a materialistic, Hobbesian philosophy that they regarded as atheistic that justified a competing social order. Jacob thus puts the controversies between Clarke and Collins in a meaningful and interesting historical and intellectual context.

  • Lennon, Thomas M. and Robert J. Stainton (eds), 2008, The Achilles of Rationalist Psychology, Dordrecht: Springer.

    A collection of articles dealing with a Kantian argument intended to show the partless unity of the soul and variants of that argument. It includes an article about the Clarke Collins correspondence focused in part on Collins conception of matter.

  • Martin, Raymond and John Barresi, 2000, The Naturalization of the Soul: Self and Personal Identity in Eighteenth Century, London: Routledge.

    Deals with the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 in the context of the history of the debate over consciousness and personal identity in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries.

  • McIntyre, Jane L., 1994, “Hume: Second Newton of the Moral Sciences”, Hume Studies, 20(1): 3–18.

    Deals with Hume’s relation to Clarke and Collins particularly in relation to the issue of whether the self is simple or compounded, and personal identity.

  • McLaughlin, Brian P., 1992 [2008], “The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism”, in Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism, Ansgar Beckermann, Hans Flohr, and Jaegwon Kim (eds), Berlin: Walter de Gruyter. Reprinted in Bedau and Humphreys 2008: 19–59. doi:10.7551/mitpress/9780262026215.003.0003

    Explains the origins of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries’ school of British emergentist philosophers.

  • Miller, Jon (ed.), 2009, Topics in Early Modern Philosophy of Mind (Studies in the History of Philosophy of Mind: Volume 9), Dordrecht: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-2381-0

    A collection of articles on European philosophers from Descartes to Hume and including material about the Clarke Collins correspondence.

  • Mijuskovic, Ben Lazare, 1974, The Achilles of Rationalist Arguments, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

    Gives a history and analysis of the simplicity argument, central to Clarke’s claims about consciousness and the soul, that Collins argues against in the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08. He discusses its uses in arguing for immortality and in questions about personal identity.

  • Mossner, Ernest Campbell, 1967, two articles in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, volume 2, Paul Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan.
    • 1967a, “Anthony Collins”, pp. 144–146.

      Provides a good account of Collins, though significantly shorter and less detailed than the one provided here.

    • 1967b, “Deism”, pp. 326–336.

      Provides a fine overview of Deism both in England and on the continent with brief biographies of both major and minor figures.

  • O’Higgins, James, 1970, Anthony Collins The Man and His Works, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

    The first full length study of Anthony Collins. The book is strong in its account of Collins’ life, his predecessors, his theological views, and his influence on the continent. What is missing is depth in the account of Collins’ philosophical views.

  • Overhoff, Jurgen, 2000, Hobbes’ Theory of the Will: Ideological Reasons and Historical Circumstances, Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield Publishers.

    Provides an excellent account of the nature of Hobbes’ determinism and its context. This is helpful in assessing Collins’ place in the history of determinism.

  • Perry, John (ed.), 2008, Personal Identity, 2nd edition, Los Angeles, CA: University of California Press.

    The second edition of the book includes selections on personal identity from the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 and an essay on Collins’ views on personal identity as well as many of the relevant chapters on personal identity from the early modern period as well as the twentieth century.

  • Robertson, J. M., 1915, A Short History of Freethought: Ancient and Modern, London: Watts & Co.

    Treats Collins sympathetically in the context of the history of Freethinking.

  • Rowe, William L., 1987, “Causality and Free Will in the Controversy Between Collins and Clarke”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 25(1): 51–67. doi:10.1353/hph.1987.0008

    Examines the debate over free will between Collins and Clarke and compares both views with those of Locke. Rowe explores assumptions the two sides have in common. His aim is to develop Clarke’s free agent theory.

  • –––, 1991, Thomas Reid on Freedom and Reality, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

    Treats Locke, Collins and Clarke’s views concerning free will and necessity as background for an exposition of the views of Thomas Reid. Rowe sees Reid as giving the best account of libertarian free will. In discussing the Clarke Collins interaction on determinism, he focuses on Clarke’s account of agency as an important antecedent to Reid.

  • Rozemond, Marleen, 2008, “The Achilles Argument and the Nature of Matter in the Clarke Collins Correspondence”, in Lennon and Stainton 2008: 159–175.

    Treats Clarke’s original argument as a variant of the Achilles of Rationalist arguments, finds the fundamental disagreement between Clarke and Collins in their differing views of matter (apart from their disagreement about emergent properties and discusses Clarke’s emergent soul.

  • –––, 2009, “Can Matter Think? The Mind–Body Problem in the Clarke–Collins Correspondence”, in Miller 2009: 171–182. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-2381-0_8

    Discusses the debate between Clarke and Collins over emergent properties and concludes that Collins abandoned his emergentism in favor of a version of the mind-brain identity theory.

  • Russell, Paul, 1995, “Hume’s ‘Treatise’ and the Clarke Collins Controversy”, Hume Studies, 21(1): 95–115. doi:10.1353/hms.2011.0074

    Puts the controversies between Clarke and Collins over materialism and free will and determinism in context, summarizes the controversies themselves, and then considers the influence these had on Hume.

  • Snobelen, Stephen, 1996, “The Argument over Prophecy: An Eighteenth-Century Debate between William Whiston and Anthony Collins”, Lumen: Selected Proceedings from the Canadian Society for Eighteenth-Century Studies, 15: 195–213. doi:10.7202/1012482ar

    Explains the controversy between Collins and Whiston over the argument from prophecy and makes the point that Newton believed in the argument from prophecy and that Whiston is trying to apply Newtonian methods to biblical prophecy.

  • Stephen, Leslie, 1936, History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, London: Watts & Co.

    Gives a detailed history of English Deism in both the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries and on the continent. There are several chapters devoted to Deism and one of these to Collins.

  • Talbot, Ann, 2019, “Anthony Collins and China: The Philosophical Impact of the Missionary Encounter”, Journal of Early Modern History, 23(4): 325–349. doi:10.1163/15700658-12342629

    Argues that Collins found in the reports of the Jesuits about neo-Confucians, an atheistic and monistic ethic held by a government that was tolerant of different religious views

  • Tarantino, Giovanni, 2007, Lo scrittoio di Anthony Collins (1676–1729). I libri e i tempi di un libero pensatore (in Italian), Milan: Franco Angeli.

    This catalog of Collins’ library, the third largest in England when he died, allows one to see what sources were available to Collins the prolific writer.

  • Thompson, Ann, 2008, Bodies of Thought: Science, Religion and Soul in the Early Enlightenment, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199236190.001.0001

    Provides a detailed context for the Clarke Collins debate and follows the debate up to mid-eighteenth century France.

  • –––, 2010, “Animals, Humans, Machines and Thinking Matter, 1690–1707”, Early Science and Medicine, 15(1–2): 3–37. doi:10.1163/138374210X12589831573027

    Provides a context for Collins’ position about the similarities between animals and humans by explaining the views of a number of authors leading up to the Clarke Collins correspondence.

  • Toland, John, 1704 [2013], Letters to Serena, Ian Leask (ed.), Dublin, Four Court’s Press, 2013.

    A modern edition of the Letters with an interpretative introduction suggesting that Toland uses arguments he learned from Leibniz to fix a problem in the philosophy of Spinoza. Toland holds that motion is essential to matter.

  • Torrey, Norman L., 1930, Voltaire and the English Deists, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.

    Discusses the influence Collins had on Voltaire’s conversion to determinism.

  • Uzgalis, William, 2008a, “Locke and Collins, Clarke and Butler, on successive persons”, in Perry 2008: 315–326.

    Argues that Collins has a materialist Lockean theory of personal identity and that nothing either Locke or Collins wrote committed them to a doctrine of successive persons as Bishop Butler alleged.

  • ––– (ed.), 2008b, “Selections from the Clarke-Collins Correspondence”, in Perry 2008: 283–314.

    This includes all of the material in the Clarke Collins correspondence of 1707–08 on personal identity.

  • –––, 2009, “Anthony Collins on the Emergence of Consciousness and Personal Identity”, Philosophy Compass, 4(2): 363–379. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2009.00203.x

    Argues that Collins has an emergent account of consciousness and defends a materialist version of Locke’s account of personal identity.

  • –––, 2018, “Minds and Persons in the Clarke Collins Correspondence ”, in Copenhaver 2018: ch. 12.

    Examines some of the arguments, their strengths and weaknesses of the two protagonists in the Clarke Collins Correspondence.

  • Vailati, Ezio, 1993, “Clarke’s Extended Soul”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 31(3): 387–403. doi:10.1353/hph.1993.0052

    Argues that Collins’ most successful arguments in the Collins Clarke exchange of 1706–08 were against Clarke’s claim that the soul is extended.

  • –––, 1997, Leibniz and Clarke: A Study of their Correspondence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    Talks about the Clarke Collins correspondence to set the stage for the Leibniz Clarke Correspondence.

  • Wimsatt, William C., 1997 [2008], “Aggregativity: Reductive Heuristics for Finding Emergence”, Philosophy of Science, 64(Suppl.2): S372–S384. Reprinted in Bedau and Humphreys 2008: 99–110.
  • Woolhouse, Roger S., 2007, Locke: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

    The most recent biography of Locke which includes an account of Locke’s relations with Collins in Locke’s old age and other valuable material.

  • Yolton, John W., 1956, Locke and the Way of Ideas, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

    Yolton’s book has a section on the beginning phases of the “thinking matter” controversy in which we see that there were a number of writers on both sides while Locke was alive and that Locke discussed some of these with Collins.

  • –––, 1983, Thinking Matter: Materialism in Eighteenth Century Britain, Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.

    This book begins with Locke’s account of the possibility of “thinking matter” and traces the controversy over this suggestion well into the eighteenth century beginning with the Clarke Collins controversy of 1707–8

Other Internet Resources


The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for noticing and reporting a number of typographical and other infelicitous errors in this entry.

Copyright © 2020 by
William Uzgalis <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free