First published Mon Dec 1, 1997; substantive revision Fri Apr 13, 2018

Colors are of philosophical interest for a number of reasons. One of the most important reasons is that color raises serious metaphysical issues, concerning the nature both of physical reality and of the mind. Among these issues are questions concerning whether color is part of a mind-independent reality, and what account we can give of experiences of color. These issues have been, and continue to be, inextricably linked with important epistemological and semantic issues.

1. The Philosophy of Color

In this section, we consider some central puzzles that arise in the philosophy of color, concerning the nature of colors and how they fit into scientific accounts of the world.

1.1 A Problem with Color

The visual world, the world as we see it, is a world populated by colored objects. Typically, we see the world as having a rich tapestry of colors or colored forms—fields, mountains, oceans, skies, hairstyles, clothing, fruit, plants, animals, buildings, and so on. Colors are important in both identifying objects, i.e., in locating them in space, and in re-identifying them. So much of our perception of physical things involves our identifying objects by their appearance, and colors are typically essential to an object’s appearance, that any account of visual perception must contain some account of colors. Since visual perception is one of the most important species of perception and hence of our acquisition of knowledge of the physical world, and of our environment, including our own bodies, a theory of color is doubly important.

One of the major problems with color has to do with fitting what we seem to know about colors into what science (not only physics but the science of color vision) tells us about physical bodies and their qualities. It is this problem that historically has led the major physicists who have thought about color, to hold the view that physical objects do not actually have the colors we ordinarily and naturally take objects to possess. Oceans and skies are not blue in the way that we naively think, nor are apples red (nor green). Colors of that kind, it is believed, have no place in the physical account of the world that has developed from the sixteenth century to this century.

Not only does the scientific mainstream tradition conflict with the common-sense understanding of color in this way, but as well, the scientific tradition contains a very counter-intuitive conception of color. There is, to illustrate, the celebrated remark by David Hume:

Sounds, colors, heat and cold, according to modern philosophy are not qualities in objects, but perceptions in the mind. (Hume 1738: Bk III, part I, Sect. 1, [1911: 177]; Bk I, IV, IV, [1911: 216])

Physicists who have subscribed to this doctrine include the luminaries: Galileo, Boyle, Descartes, Newton, Thomas Young, Maxwell and Hermann von Helmholtz. Maxwell, for example, wrote:

It seems almost a truism to say that color is a sensation; and yet Young, by honestly recognizing this elementary truth, established the first consistent theory of color. (Maxwell 1871: 13 [1970: 75])

This combination of eliminativism—the view that physical objects do not have colors, at least in a crucial sense—and subjectivism—the view that color is a subjective quality—is not merely of historical interest. It is held by many contemporary experts and authorities on color, e.g., Zeki 1983, Land 1983, and Kuehni 1997. Palmer, a leading psychologist and cognitive scientist, writes:

People universally believe that objects look colored because they are colored, just as we experience them. The sky looks blue because it is blue, grass looks green because it is green, and blood looks red because it is red. As surprising as it may seem, these beliefs are fundamentally mistaken. Neither objects nor lights are actually “colored” in anything like the way we experience them. Rather, color is a psychological property of our visual experiences when we look at objects and lights, not a physical property of those objects or lights. The colors we see are based on physical properties of objects and lights that cause us to see them as colored, to be sure, but these physical properties are different in important ways from the colors we perceive. (Palmer 1999: 95)

This quote, however, needs unpacking. Palmer is obviously challenging our ordinary common-sense beliefs about colors. Specifically, he is denying that objects and lights have colors in the sense of colors-as-we-experience-them (or colors as we see them), As far as this goes, it is compatible with objects and lights having colors in some other sense, e.g., colors, as defined for scientific purposes. Secondly, he is saying that color (i.e., color-as-we-experience it) is a psychological property, which in turn, might be interpreted in different ways. Accordingly, the view is quite complex (see the next section). If we examine the writings of others in the scientific tradition, we find that their views are also complex. The view maybe color-eliminativism, but it is not merely that.

1.2 Resistance to Eliminativism/Subjectivism

There has been a strong resistance among philosophers, both to the Eliminativist tendency within the scientific tradition, and the related subjectivism. One form this resistance takes reflects the fact that each component of this traditional view is very puzzling. A common response is to say that our color terms—red, blue, purple, orange, yellow, green, brown, etc.—are in order: we have paradigms of colors to which the color terms apply: ripe lemons are yellow, tomatoes and rubies are red, and so on. We have no trouble, by and large, in learning these terms and teaching them in ostensive practices to children and others. In the second place, it is hard to make sense of the claim that colors are properties of sensations or are psychological properties: if they are anything they are properties of material objects and light sources—of peaches, and emeralds, of skies, of rainbows, of glasses of wine, of headlamps, and so on.

It should be noted, however, that things are more complex than the earlier remarks of Hume and Maxwell suggest. Descartes and Locke, for example, think that there are no colors in the physical world—no colors, as we ordinarily and naively understand them to be. But they are also widely interpreted as holding a secondary quality view of colors, i.e., holding the view that colors are powers or dispositions to cause experiences of a certain type. It is instructive to try to understand this dual position. We find, for example, this passage in Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy:

It is clear then that when we say we perceive colors in objects, it is really just the same as saying that we perceived in objects something as to whose nature we are ignorant but which produces in us a very clear and vivid sensation, what we call the sensation of color. (Descartes 1644 [1988]: para. 70; see also paras 68–70)

The implication of “it is really just the same as saying” is that this is not what it is ordinarily taken to be saying. As Descartes later explains, the ordinary way involves the mistake of “judging that the feature of objects that we call ‘color’ is something ‘just like the color in our sensation’”. However, Descartes is not implying that we should dispense with our ordinary talk. Instead, it is being suggested, we should go on using our ordinary color talk, but give it a novel interpretation: when we say “X”, then it is as though we said “Y”. That is to say, we should not understand the sentences literally, but rather translate them into other more appropriate sentences. Descartes, here, is following the principle common to many thinkers of the time, the principle of “talking with vulgar, and thinking with the learned”. The justification for this proposal is that it acknowledges that our color language serves very useful purposes: the reconstruction allows the language to continue to serve those purposes, while avoiding metaphysical error. Thus, there is at least a partial response to the common-sense criticism: the reconstruction central to this form of eliminativism embraces a principle of respect for our ordinary language.

There are also complications with respect to the subjectivist component of the traditional view. When philosophers such as Descartes and Locke wrote of sensations of color, or of (sensory) ideas of color, there are different interpretations of what is meant by the terms. The common interpretation is that a sensation of red is a sensory experience in which a certain subjective quality is presented. Expressed in modern terms, the subjective qualities are construed as qualia, or as qualities of sensory individuals such as sensa or sense-data or as sensational properties. There is, however, an alternative interpretation: a sensation of color is a sensory experience, which represents something as having a certain quality (the experience has a certain intentional content). On this second interpretation, Descartes’ view would be that the relevant quality our color experience represents objects as having is one that no object possesses. Accordingly, it would not be inappropriate to call the theory fictionalist (rather than subjectivist). This interpretation, we should note, allows for qualia or sensa, but does not mandate them. And some Cartesian scholars deny that Descartes, in particular, was committed to qualia.

Finally, there is yet another complication. It is in fact possible to combine the two versions in a single interpretation. That is to say, the representationalist view does not rule out a version with subjectivist elements. For such a view allows for a type of projectivism, whereby the experience both presents a sensory quality, and represents a physical object as having that quality. The experience is said to “project” the subjective, sensory qualities onto the physical objects. A model for this would be the experience of pain: the supposition is that when one has a toothache, the experience represents the pain as being in the tooth. (This projectivist view seems to suit Hume’s thought, but in any case, it fits modern projectivist accounts.)

We might note the it is common to find, in authoritative texts, definitions like “Color attributes are attributes of visual sensations, e.g., hue, saturation and brightness”; “hue: attribute of color perception denoted by the terms yellow, red, blue, green and so forth”; “Brightness is the attribute of a visual sensation according to which a given visual stimulus appears to be more or less intense”. There is a range of ways we might interpret these definitions:

Color attributes are:

  1. attributes of sensations;
  2. attributes presented in sensations;
  3. attributes sensations represent objects as having.

Several of these ways understanding the definitions leave it open whether physical objects actually have the attributes or not, and whether the attributes (that form part of the representational content of the experiences) might have subjective components.

1.3 The Problem of Color Realism

From our discussion of the scientific tradition on colors, it is clear (enough) that two questions face us:

  1. What is the right account of colors-as-we-experience-them? of colors-as-we-see-them? colors-as-we-ordinarily-talk-and-think of them?
  2. Are there such colors?

For obvious reasons, these questions present us with what we might call “the Problem of Color Realism”. The discussion also indicates that finding answers may be a little tricky. (We should also note that there are complexities associated with our understanding of Realism, that we will need to slide over—see the entry on realism.)

Let us turn to a more recent description of the problem. Byrne and Hilbert (2003) say, of the problem of color realism, that it “concerns various especially salient properties that objects visually appear to have”. By way of clarification, they say:

If someone with normal color vision looks at a tomato in good light, the tomato will appear to have a distinctive property—a property that strawberries and cherries also appear to have, and which we call “red” in English. The problem of color realism is posed by the following two questions. First, do objects like tomatoes, strawberries and radishes really have the distinctive property that they do appear to have? Second, what is this property? (Byrne & Hilbert 2003: 3–4)

It would seem that Byrne and Hilbert give us another expression—“the color things appear to be” or “the color things look to have”—to go with our earlier expressions, “colors-as-we-experience-them”, “colors as-we-see-them”. (As we shall see, with each expression, there is an ambiguity which will need to be taken care with, but, it would seem, the same ambiguity applies to each expression.)

The use of the expression“colors-as-we-see-them” has certain advantages, in that it brings out certain important features of colors. The first is that it implies that a comprehensive account of color is going to depend on an account of perceptual experience. Given the controversies on that topic, it is likely to mean that similar disputes will spill over to the subject of color. For example, on some views, colors-as-we-see-them will be certain properties presented in experience. According to other views, they will be certain properties that material things are represented as having. On a third view, Color Projectivism, the qualities presented in visual experiences are subjective qualities, which are ‘projected’ on to material objects: the experiences represent material objects as having the subjective qualities. Those qualities are taken by the perceiver to be qualities instantiated on the surfaces of material objects (the perceiver does not ordinarily think of them as subjective qualities).

Deciding the question will depend on theories of representational content (intentional content) perceptual experiences carry; see the entry the problem of perception. Some important readings that delve, extensively, into these areas are Byrne & Hilbert 1997 Introduction, Shoemaker 1994 [1997], Chalmers 2006.

1.4 Colors as We Ordinarily Talk and Think About Them

Before proceeding, there is an important point to clarify. Byrne and Hilbert, in their characterization of the problem of Color Realism, draw attention to the importance of our theories of perception in providing an account of colors. There is another aspect to their characterization, though the authors tend to downplay its importance. When Byrne and Hilbert introduce the problem, they take pains to emphasize that it does not concern, at least in the first instance, color language or color concepts.

Hardin seems to adopt a different approach, in his highly influential book, Color for Philosophers (1988 [1993]):

What’s essential to chromatic phenomena, and what’s accidental? What might we safely dispense with? Rather than undertaking to identify, characterise and then sort through all of the folk notions of color, I shall say what it is that I have in mind when I think and talk about colors. Primarily, what I have in mind are red and yellow and green and blue, though I am also inclined to include white and black and gray as well, along, perhaps, with a special place for brown. (Hardin 1993: xx)

The disagreement is, however, less than it first appears. When they introduce the problem of color realism, Byrne and Hilbert say:

If someone with normal color vision looks at a tomato in good light, the tomato will appear to have a distinctive property—a property that strawberries and cherries also appear to have, and which we call “red” in English. The problem of color realism is posed by the following two questions. First, do objects like tomatoes, strawberries and radishes really have the distinctive property that they do appear to have? Second, what is this property? (Byrne & Hilbert 2003: 3–4)

It will be noted that I have re-instated their characterization of the property as “one that we call ‘red’ in English”. The point is that we need this clause to identify the property in question. So, among other things, the enquiry is directed at uncovering the property which our ordinary color terms, such as ‘red’, designate. So, it cannot entirely avoid issues to do with color language and color concepts. We can reinforce the point by referring to the fact that it is common to find color authorities explain central aspect of color, the property of having hue, as follows: “Hue: attribute of color perception denoted by the terms yellow, red, blue, green and so forth” (Kuehni 2005: 187; see also Byrne & Hilbert 1997b: 447, Hardin 1988 [1993: 212]).

The upshot is that it is hard to see how we can avoid questions concerning how our color terms are ordinarily used and understood. One important approach to answering the questions is that followed by Mark Johnston, in a highly influential paper (Johnston 1992). In that paper, he implicitly acknowledges the existence of a set of linguistic and conceptual practices that underpin what might be called “our ordinary thinking about color”. This thinking is not meant to comprise theoretical thinking or theorizing about color, or at least, it is much more than that. It comprises our thinking and talking that involves our exercise of concepts of color. Johnston asks the question of which principles such thinking about color must consist in, in order to count as exercising those concepts of color.

Like David Lewis and Frank Jackson, he endorses the view that our ordinary color concepts are captured in those that those with mastery of the concept possess. Johnston says that the ordinary concept of color is a “cluster concept”, which incorporates a wide set of beliefs. There are, he points out, many beliefs about color to which we are susceptible, beliefs resulting from our visual experience and our tendency to take that visual experience in certain ways. Johnston says that some of these beliefs are “core” beliefs, which we can contrast with the more “peripheral” beliefs. The point about the core beliefs is this: were such beliefs to turn out not to be true, we would then have trouble saying what they were false of, i.e., we would be deprived of a subject matter, rather than having our views changed about a given subject matter. By contrast, the peripheral beliefs are such that “as they change we are simply changing our mind about a stable subject matter” (Johnston 1992 [1997: 137]).

Taking canary yellow as an illustrative example, he writes that beliefs with a legitimate title to be included in a core of beliefs about canary yellow include:

  1. Paradigms. Some of what we take to be paradigms of canary yellow things (e.g., some canaries) are canary yellow.
  2. Explanation. The fact of a surface or volume or radiant source being canary yellow sometimes causally explains our visual experience as of canary yellow things.
  3. Unity. Thanks to its nature and the nature of the other determinate shades, canary yellow has its own unique place in the network of similarity, difference and exclusion relations exhibited by the whole family of shades.
  4. Perceptual Availability. Justified belief about the canary yellowness of external things is available simply on the basis of visual perception. That is, if external things are canary yellow we are justified in believing this just on the basis of visual perception and the beliefs, which typically inform it.
  5. Revelation. The intrinsic nature of canary yellow is fully revealed by a standard visual experience as of a canary yellow thing.

Canary yellow is an example. More generally, for each color property F, beliefs that are legitimately included in the core of beliefs concerning F, will include the relevant instances of the beliefs (1) to (5). Johnston goes on to argue that in fact there are no properties for which all of these beliefs hold true. Accordingly, “speaking ever so inclusively”, the world is not colored. However, he maintains, “speaking more or less inclusively”, the world is colored, for there are properties which make true enough of these beliefs, so as to deserve to be called colors. Johnston then goes on to defend the view that the closest candidates for the various colors are the dispositional properties, dispositions to look yellow, to look blue, etc. The item in the list that provides most trouble is item (5) the doctrine of Revelation. To drop this from the list, he thinks, is a price worth paying, to preserve that claim that there really are colors.

It is of course an important question as to whether the list is accurate or complete. To make progress on that question, however, there is, a prior question to answer: what are the criteria for inclusion in the list? (Whose beliefs are they supposed to be?) On the face of it, they are beliefs of those who have mastery of the concepts of color, i.e., including the many ordinary people who lack detailed scientific knowledge. This is certainly the view of Lewis and Jackson, who use the term “folk concept” in referring to the ordinary concept and who, in addition, see the possession of the concept as involving having a theory, e.g., a folk theory of color: a set of beliefs or platitudes about color.

However, when we look at the items of Johnston’s list, it seems difficult to maintain this view about the status of the various items. Take item (5), Revelation. Whatever its status, it doesn’t look like a folk belief. It looks more like something a philosopher might come up with. In the second place, it seems to have a peculiar status. Experiences of color, it is claimed, are enough to inform us of the nature of color. If it is true or if it is a folk belief, it is hard to see what need there is of the other items in the list. Perhaps, though, this formulation of the doctrine is misleading, and there is a better formulation available. One possibility is that the doctrine should be interpreted as addressing certain necessary conditions, rather than all necessary conditions, or all necessary and sufficient conditions. This point is important since there is group of philosophers who are sympathetic to Primitivism and/or Naïve Realism, who seem to favor a principle that differs in this way from Johnston’s formulation (see section 2.1).

But let us concentrate on item, (3), which Johnston labels “Unity”. What it points to is the fact that the various colors can be ordered systematically, in a structured array of all the colors, where that array is based on the system of relations of similarity, difference and exclusion holding among the colors. The color “yellow” is said to have a unique place in this array. Johnston explains the principle in more detail:

Think of the relations exemplified along the axes of hue, saturation and brightness in the so-called color solid. The color solid captures central facts about the colors, e.g., that canary yellow is not as similar to the shades of blue as they are similar among themselves, i.e., that canary yellow is not a shade of blue. (Johnston 1992 [1997: 138])

There is little doubt that this is an important principle, one which plays a central part in the reasoning of many philosophers who have written on color, e.g., Wittgenstein 1977, Harrison 1973, Hardin 1988, Thompson 1995, Maund 1995. It is regarded as an important factor which physicalist-realist theories of color must explain, and have a problem in explaining. However, whatever the status of this principle, it is not a folk belief (and few of these last-mentioned theorists say that it is). Nor is it plausibly a tacit belief. For example, it does not seem a belief it is necessary to have, in order to have mastery of concepts of color and, in particular, of a concept of yellow. It is surely quite a sophisticated belief, which requires considerable experience with colors. For one thing, the dimensions mentioned by Johnston—hue, saturation and brightness—apply to aperture colors or film colors, which few folk would be aware of, and not to surface colors. Aperture colors are colors perceived under a special mode of viewing: one views the objects or light sources through a small aperture in a screen (of an achromatic color). The appearance of these colors differs from that of colors seen under more usual circumstances. “Surface colors” are the colors of illuminated samples seen under conditions in which it is possible for the viewer to distinguish the color of the surface from that of the ambient light. Indeed, for surface colors, there are two sets of dimensions: hue, chroma, and lightness (the Munsell system) and hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness (the Swedish Natural Color system, NCS). Nevertheless, Unity (or a set of Unities) is an important principle and it has something to do with our concepts of color. Wittgenstein, for example, thought it was central to our having the concepts of color that we do, but he says that “we do not want to find a theory of color … but rather the logic of color concepts” (Wittgenstein 1977:43e). (We are touching on deep issues of philosophical methodology, which we are not going to settle here; see the entry analysis, which, interestingly, discusses Jackson’s analysis of color.)

There is another explanation for why Johnston’s principles (1) to (5) are important, besides their being folk beliefs. It is more plausible to see them as items of knowledge: of facts or truths, that are readily accessible to someone who has the relevant concepts. For example, once we are fluent with color names, and are competent in the exercise of color concepts, we are then in a position to come to know that Unity holds with respect to the colors. We won’t discover this, however, until we have familiarity with a wide range of colors and can see the various colors ordered in suitable arrays. Likewise, with the other items in Johnston’s list, e.g., (5), the doctrine of Revelation. Indeed, if we look at item (1), in Johnston’s list, the item he labels “Paradigms”, it explicitly states one such sort of fact: it states that there are paradigms of canary yellow, things that are canary yellow.

These considerations are not trivial, for when we examine the examples that Lewis and Jackson give of the relevant constraints on color, we find that they function as items of knowledge, rather than as mere beliefs. Indeed Lewis often refers to the folk beliefs as items of “common knowledge” (Lewis 1997). In Jackson’s case, consider what he says, concerning what he calls “the prime intuition about colour” (1998: 88): “red” denotes the property of an object putatively presented in visual experience when that object looks red. This he also calls “a subject-determining platitude for ‘red’” (1998:89). What is particularly interesting is what Jackson does with this “prime intuition”. He says that it seems trivial, but its significance is that it tells us

something important about the metaphysics of colour, when we combine it with plausible views about what is required for an experience to be the presentation of a property: a necessary condition for experience E to be the presentation of property P is that there be a causal connection in normal cases. (Jackson 1998: 89)

That is to say, in arguing to a substantive metaphysical conclusion—namely, that color is a certain microphysical property—Jackson is combining the result of his intuitions (which he claims to share with the “folk”) with a certain piece of knowledge.

A useful way of thinking of the methodology for the philosophy of color is that given by Hilbert in an early work:

[T]he question of the objectivity of color is in the end a conceptual one. To settle the question, we need to discover which way of conceptualising color allows us to account for both pre-theoretical intuitions regarding color and the wide range of known color phenomena. (Hilbert 1987: 16)

This view seems to accommodate a modified version of Johnston’s approach. It also allows the possibility that a theorist might defend a theory of color by rejecting some of the “pre-reflective intuitions”, while explaining why those intuitions might be held. A recent work that addresses some these issues is Adams 2016. Adams argues that the modern debate between certain color-eliminativists and Oxford color-dispositionalists is affected by the fact that members of each side are guided by different color-intuitions, ones that have historical sources. One does not have to agree with Adams to appreciate that he raises a serious issue for thought about the metaphysics of color.

The issues raised in this section involve complex issues of philosophical methodology, about which there is much contemporary dispute. No short discussion of such issues can hope to be comprehensive. Different philosophers hold sharply differing views about both the nature of conceptual analysis and its significance. Part of the aim of this section was to bring out that the practice of different groups of philosophers is closer than one would expect from their official views.

1.5. Color Experiences: Phenomenal Character and Intentional Content

One of the most important issues for the philosophy of color to address concerns the phenomenal character of color experiences. This issue, in turn, raises general questions of whether the experiences have representational content and if so, of what type, and questions about whether there are non-intentional aspects to the phenomenal character. The question of phenomenal character is related to what account one’s theory can give (or require) of what it is for something to look a certain color: to look blue, to look yellow, to look red, and so on. This notion plays a central role in most accounts, either in giving an account of what color is, or for raising problems that the theory needs to resolve.

The most notable example is the most common version of the dispositional account: for something to be yellow is to be such as to look yellow—to normal observers, in standard conditions (McGinn 1983; Johnston 1992 [1997]; Levin 2000). Another example is the relational view of Jonathan Cohen (2009) and Edward Averill (1992), the view that implies that colors are relational properties, defined in terms of the object’s capacity to look a certain way, in contextually defined circumstances, to contextually defined observers.

But the notion also plays a central role in theories of physicalist objectivists such as McLaughlin (2003) and Jackson (1998). According to McLaughlin, colors are the “occupants of a certain functional role-description” (2003: 479), where the functional role is specified in terms of the ways things look, that are peculiar to colors. Jackson makes crucial use of what he calls “the prime intuition about colour”: The prime intuition is simply that red is the property objects look to have when they look red (Jackson 1998: 89). Finally, both Byrne & Hilbert 2003 and Boghossian & Velleman 1991 [1997] characterize the dispute between realists and non-realists on color, to concern “certain properties that objects visually appear [i.e., look] to have” (Boghossian & Velleman 1991 [1997: 117]). As Boghossian and Velleman put it,

What philosophers want to know is whether the properties that objects thus appear to have are among the ones that they are generally agreed to have in reality. (Boghossian & Velleman 1991 [1997: 106])

The centrality of this notion raises the question of what exactly is it for something to look blue, look yellow, look pink, etc. Unfortunately, despite its apparent simplicity, this question is not easily settled. It is usual for theorists to rely upon what is called “the phenomenological use” of “looks F”, where this use can be distinguished from the perceptual-epistemic (and epistemic) and the comparative uses of the same phrase. However, different theorists take the phenomenological use in different ways. For some, it is connected with the idea that the experience or state carries representational content, while others take it to refer to non-intentional aspects of experience. And of those who connect it with representational content, there are some who hold that the content is conceptual, and others who think it is non-conceptual. Finally, it is not at all unusual for some theorists to hold that experiences have two aspects, i.e., non-intentional and intentional characteristics, and/or conceptual and non-conceptual aspects, and that “looks yellow”, say, can be used, on different occasions to refer to these different aspects. (For further discussion, see Shoemaker 1994 [1997], Chalmers 2006, Glüer 2012, the entry on the problem of perception.)

The commonest way to think of “looks blue” is to think of the phrase as having a semantic structure, with “blue” having its usual sense. This use, which is found in common practice, can be contrasted with an unstructured sense of “looks-blue”, in which the term “blue” does not make the same contribution. For X to look-blue in this sense is usually taken to mean that X causes a certain type of experience (or type of visual state), a type that is not defined by reference to the property of being blue, and whose occurrence does not require the subject to have the concept of being blue. It is often thought of in these terms: for X to look-blue to S is for X to induce in S a blue-ish-appearance—or appearing. (For further discussion, see Chisholm 1966: 95–99, Cornman 1975: 73–77.) This use of “looks” is usually introduced by philosophers for theoretical purposes, though some argue that it is implicit in the ordinary use of “looks blue”, “looks square”, etc.

Unfortunately, there is more than one way different philosophers understand the innocuous-looking structured use. Many philosophers take it as obvious that for something to look blue is for it to be represented as being blue, and that, given that this is so, it is perfectly understandable that it could look blue to me without my believing, or even being inclined to believe, that it is blue, e.g., Jackson 2000, 2007. The claim is that for X to look blue is for it to cause a visual experience or visual state that represents the object as blue. Furthermore, thinking in these representational terms explains why it is that some perceivings are veridical, and others non-veridical. In veridical cases, the representation is accurate—things are as they are represented as being—in the other case, they are not accurate.

In recent times, however, there has emerged a growing minority position that challenges this view. Martin 2002 has been the most influential, but there are many others: Snowdon 1981, Hacker 1987, McDowell 1994, Travis 2004. As Martin points out, both the view known as naïve realism, and the disjunctivist account of perceptual experiences, offer a different way of understanding “looks F”. On the disjunctivist account, we do not have to take veridical experiences and non-veridical ones as being of a uniform type: they can be subjectively indistinguishable, yet different in nature (see the entry on the disjunctivist theory of perception. On this view, in the case of veridical perceiving, we do not have an experience which represents an object as having colors, shape, size, etc. Instead we should think of these qualities as being presented to the perceiver in having the experience. On the naïve realist view, “looks blue” is still structured: the property of being blue is presented in the experience. This issue is particularly important for a theory of color, for one way of explaining the Primitivist theory is to connect it with a naïve realist view of color (see section 2.1). One might defend the Primitivist view and also claim that the primitivist properties are part of the representational content.

There is an added complication. Of those philosophers who assume that visual experiences have representational content, some, like Jackson, do so within a framework in which the content is conceptual, while others such as Tye, Byrne, and Hilbert, take it to be non-conceptual. Furthermore, there are yet others, such as Peacocke 1984/1997, who hold that there are two distinct aspects to color experiences, one non-conceptual, the other conceptual. Peacocke defends a theory in which “looks red” is confined to the conceptual, representing sense. On this account, we must distinguish between two aspects to the visual experience had, when S sees a red object, and where it looks red to her; (1) a sensational property red* is presented to S, in a region of her visual field; (2) S is in (or has) a state which represents, conceptually, to S that X (or at least something) is red.

1.6 Rival Theories of Color

There are two issues concerning color realism: (1) what sort of properties are colors? (2) do objects really possess those properties? With respect to the first question, there is deep division between different color realists (as well as between them and eliminativists). Setting out the views of major realists and eliminativists, we have the following major rival theories:

  1. Colors are “primitive” properties—simple, sui generis, qualitative properties that physical bodies possess or appear to possess: Primitivism.
  2. Colors are “hidden” properties of bodies—complex, physical properties that dispose bodies to look blue, pink, yellow, etc.: Reductive Physicalism
  3. Colors are perceiver-dependent, dispositional properties—powers to look in distinctive ways to appropriate perceivers, in appropriate circumstances: Dispositionalism
  4. Colors are subjective qualities “projected” onto physical objects and light-sources—qualities which visual experiences represent objects as having: Projectivism.
  5. Colors are subjective qualities—either qualities presented in experience or qualities of experiences: Subjectivism.
  6. Colors are “hybrid” properties: physical and phenomenological.


  1. Theories in category 3 are relational theories of color. Historically, they have been interpreted in terms of normal/standard observers, and standard viewing conditions. Recently there have developed versions of the theory which relax these requirements.
  2. This taxonomy is a first approximation. Some theorists would hold that there is more than one kind of color: dual referent theorists, e.g., Descartes (1644), D.H. Brown (2006).
  3. Subjectivist theories come in different forms: (a) dualist subjectivism, according to which subjective qualities are irreducible to physical properties; (b) subjectivist theories which allow the possibility that the subjective qualities are identical to physical properties, e.g., those of the brain.

For further details, see the supplementary document on Color Science: Some Complexities.

2. Theories of Color

In an earlier section, 1.6, the major rival theories of color were set out. They comprise varieties of color realism and color eliminativism/fictionalism. In this section, we will examine specific versions of these theories. Many of the general issues that have been touched upon will come up for discussion.

2.1 Primitivism: The Simple Objectivist View of Colors

One of the most prominent views of color is that color is an objective, i.e., mind-independent, intrinsic property, one possessed by many material objects (of different kinds) and light sources. (By “objective” here, I mean “ontologically objective”, i.e., mind-independent—see Searle 2015: 16.) This view, call it Color Objectivism, takes different forms, however. One form it takes is that colors are simple qualities, which show their natures on their face: they are sui generis, simple, qualitative, sensuous, intrinsic, irreducible properties.This view has come to be called “Color Primitivism”. Another common form is that colors are objective (mind-independent), properties of material bodies and light sources, whose natures are “hidden” from us, and require empirical investigation to discover. I shall use the term “Reductive Color Physicalism” to refer to it.

Color Primitivism comes in two forms: a realist vision and an eliminativist version. Color Primitivist Realism is the view that there are in nature colors, as ordinarily understood, i.e., colors are simple intrinsic, non-relational, non-reducible, qualitative properties. They are qualitative features of the sort that stand in the characteristic relations of similarity and difference that mark the colors; they are not micro-structural properties or reflectances, or anything of the sort. There is no radical illusion, error or mistake in color perception (only commonplace illusions): we perceive objects to have the colors that they really have. Such a view has been presented by Hacker 1987 and by J. Campbell 1994, 2005, and has become increasingly popular: McGinn 1996; Watkins 2005; Gert 2006, 2008. This view is sometimes called “The Simple View of Color” and sometimes “The Naive Realist view of Color”. Primitivist Color realism contains a conceptual (and semantic) thesis about our ordinary understanding of color, and a metaphysical thesis, namely, that physical bodies actually have colors of this sort. It is possible to accept the conceptual thesis but deny the metaphysical thesis. This gives us an eliminativist form of Color Primitivism.

One major criticism with Primitivism concerns whether the arguments for it depends on a questionable form of the doctrine of Revelation. (See Byrne & Hilbert 2007a, for an expression of this criticism, among a set of other criticisms.) In response, many authors argue that the form of Revelation set out by Johnston is too strong, and there is a more moderate form of the doctrine that is more plausible (see J. Campbell 2005; Gert 2008; Allen 2011). It is worth noting that while Johnston and others cite Bertrand Russell and Galen Strawson as advocates of the doctrine, these two authors actually say very different things, in the quotes given to illustrate the doctrine. Russell, for example, places stress on the perceiver being acquainted with instances of color. The suggestion implicit in modest versions of the doctrine is that the appeal to Revelation needs little more than that.

One of the major problem, historically, concerns whether it is possible to reconcile the putative character of the intrinsic color features with such features having a causal role in our experiences of colors. The properties that do the causing of these experiences seem to be complex, micro-structural properties of surfaces of bodies (and similar properties for seeing volume colors, diffraction colors, scattering colors, etc). This problem is addressed by Hacker in his defense of the claim that colors are intrinsic features of physical bodies. He insists that colors are properties that are used to provide causal explanations. There is no more reason to deny this, he says, than there is to deny the parallel claim for solidity and liquidity. The explanation is not vitiated by the discovery that microstructural processes are involved, any more than explanations concerning solidity and liquidity are rendered otiose by the discovery of the microstructural base for these properties. A possible criticism of this analogy would be that, in the case of solidity and liquidity, it is plausible to analyze these properties functionally: to be solid is to have some structure that is the causal basis for such and such ways of behaving. This is not the sort of analysis that the Primitivist requires (see also Campbell 1994).

The Primitivist Realist needs to have some view about how colors are related to the physical properties of material objects, e.g., spectral reflectances, that are necessary in order for us to have experiences of color. That is to say, it is vital that they have some theory on the matter. The standard view has come to be that colors are supervenient on these physical properties. On some accounts, the supervenience relations are nomological ones; on other accounts, they are metaphysical (rather than logical)—see Hacker 1987, Campbell 1994, Yablo 1995, McGinn 1996, Watkins 2005. Appeals to supervenience are fine as far as they go but, as often been pointed out, they mark the start of an explanation, rather than the end (see entry on supervenience). We need to specify which kind of supervenience is involved: nomological, logical or metaphysical (where and if the latter can be distinguished from the logical form). Secondly, we need to give some account of what it is that grounds the supervenience relation. Byrne and Hilbert, in a complex paper specifically on Primitivism (2007a), argue that appeals to both nomological and metaphysical supervenience face formidable objections.

Another major problem for the realist version of Color Primitivism is one that Hardin (2004, 2008) and Cohen (2009) have especially stressed. They draw attention to a vast range of facts concerning the variety of conditions under which objects appear to have the colors they do, and the variety of classes of observers for whom the colors appear. Since the only way to determine what primitivist color a body has is by the way it appears, this raises the question of which is the body’s real color. Normal perceivers, for example, divide into different groups on whether a body’s color is, say, unique blue, or rather, a slightly reddish-blue, an even more reddish blue, or, alternatively, a greenish blue. Cohen and Hardin argue that there is no non-arbitrary way to pick out one group of perceivers as identifying the “real” color. At most, one group is correct, but we would not know which; for all we know, none of the groups is identifying the real color. Averill (1992) presents a pair of arguments that also depend on difficulties that stem from trying to give a non-arbitrary account of normal observers and standard viewing conditions. We can easily suppose changes in either our eyes (and hence in normal observers) or in standard viewing conditions, such that some objects that previously were yellow would look red, and others would still look yellow—while remaining otherwise physically unchanged. If primitive colors are supposed to be supervenient on physical microstructures, then it is difficult to see how we could accommodate this sort of change. A possible, but radical, response to this problem is to modify the Realist position and to hold that objects can have more than one color (indeed have many colors). See Kalderon 2007 and Mizrahi 2006 for a defense of this view.

2.2 Reductive Color Physicalism

Another common form of Color Objectivism is that colors are objective (mind-independent), properties of material bodies and light sources, whose natures are “hidden” from us, and require empirical investigation to discover. This theory is commonly known as Physicalist Color Realism but I shall use the title Reductive Color Physicalism. (The properties that constitute the colors, for Color Primitivism, are “physical” in one good sense of the term.)

Perhaps the earliest defender of this second form of Color Objectivism was Thomas Reid, the eighteenth century Scottish philosopher. More recent examples are Armstrong 1969; Hilbert 1987; Matthen 1988; Jackson 1996, 1998, 2007; Tye 2000; Byrne & Hilbert 2003; and McLaughlin 2003. Reid thought that the folk did not think as philosophers such as Hume and Descartes and others said that they did. Reid wrote that:

By colour, all men who have not been tutored by modern philosophy understand, not a sensation of the mind, which can have no existence when it is not perceived, but a quality or modification of bodies, which continues to be the same whether it is seen or not. (Reid 1764: ch. 6, sect. 4 [1970: 99])

It would seem that, so far, Reid is simply displaying the common sense for which he is famous. More controversially, however, he goes on to say that when we perceive the color of body,

That idea, which we have called the appearance of colour, suggests the conception and belief of some unknown quality in the body which occasions the idea, and it is to this quality and not the idea, that we give the name of colour. (Reid 1764: ch. 6, sect. 4 [1970: 100])

On the face of it, this view of Reid seems counter-intuitive. Many of “those men not tutored by modern philosophy”, have a lot to say about colors, and would be surprised to be told that colors are unknown qualities. Red, for example, is the color used by many revolutionary parties, good for annoying bulls, my favorite color, the color of my true love’s lips, and so on. We can give paradigms of blue, red, yellow, turquoise, mauve, etc. We often say things such as “that is a better blue than this”. One suspects that they (the untutored) would be puzzled by the remark that red is some unknown quality (for more on this, see Hacker 1987: 186).

Reid’s view may be extreme but it helps us appreciate the significance of the view of a contemporary color physicalist, McLaughlin, who singles Reid out as anticipating his account of color. McLaughlin explicitly endorses this view of Reid though, in fact, his position is subtly different. He defends a functionalist analysis of color, according to which a color, say redness, is the occupant of a certain functional role:

Redness is that property which disposes its bearers to look red, to standard visual perceivers in standard conditions of visual observation, and which must (as a matter of nomological necessity) be held by everything so disposed. (McLaughlin 2003: 479)

McLaughlin adds that this proposal is intended as providing a conceptual analysis:

The proposal is intended as a functional or topic neutral analysis of the concept of redness. The role description “that property which …” is intended not only to fix the referent of the concept, but also to express a condition that is necessary and sufficient for satisfying it. Thus, if the proposal is correct, then all it takes for a property to be redness is for it to fill the redness role. (McLaughlin 2003: 479)

McLaughlin’s proposal is different, in a crucial respect, from Reid’s. It does not explicitly state that the property, which is the occupant of the functional role, is a property “unknown” to the observer. His proposal is designed to be “topic-neutral”. This means that colors could either be some complex physical properties, that could only be discovered by scientific investigation, or they could be the sort of properties described by Primitivists: sui generis, simple, intrinsic, qualitative, non-relational, non-reducible properties of physical bodies. McLaughlin argues that scientific investigation makes it highly plausible that the occupant of the role is some complex physical property—that is, that Color Physicalism is true—and that no good reason favors the Primitivist option.

McLaughlin’s topic-neutral proposal is a proposal about our ordinary understanding of color. Most Primitivists would accept this condition as capturing, at best, only one element of that understanding. (Some would say that the proposal expresses a truth that we can recognize, but it is not part of the ordinary understanding.) Other elements, they would contend, rule out the complex physical properties that McLaughlin indicates. A plausible candidate for one of these elements is the doctrine of Revelation, item (5) of the list that, as we saw, Johnston provides, in his “cluster” of core color beliefs.

  1. Revelation. The intrinsic nature of canary yellow is fully revealed by a standard visual experience as of a canary yellow thing.

This would explain the Primitivist account of the character of the colors, as being revealed in our perceptual experience. McLaughlin addresses the status of Revelation in his argument. He thinks that this doctrine, once we reflect on it, has little to recommend it. What appeal it has depends on the fact that it is easily confused with another principle, which has some intuitive appeal (though it too is false). He does not have an explicit argument against the doctrine, although he draws a consequence that he thinks we would all find unwelcome:

All we have learned, and indeed, all we can ever hope to learn by scientific investigation will contribute not one whit to our knowledge of the nature of colors themselves. For Revelation entails that there is nothing more that we can learn about the nature of colors than what visual experience teaches us. (McLaughlin 2003: 477.)

He thinks that there is a basic mistake behind the commitment to the doctrine of Revelation: the failure to distinguish colors from what it is like to see them. Revelation, he concedes, is more plausible with respect to the phenomenal character of color experiences—the what-it-is-like aspect—though, here, too, it is false.

One of the virtues of this form of Color Physicalism is that it offers a plausible explanation for the phenomenon of color constancy, the fact that there is strong tendency for the same object to look to have the same color in a wide variety of illuminations. Against this claim, however, it has been argued that other theories have the resources to explain the phenomenon (to the extent that it occurs, for which there are certain limits—see Hardin 1988, Cohen 2009, Chirimuuta 2008.)

An initial problem is “the problem of multiple realizations”: there is a wide range of different types of bodies that have colors—light sources, illuminants, surfaces (e.g., of apples, cars, cloths, paintings, …), volumes (e.g., wine, glass, atmospheres, …), bodies that scatter light, bodies that diffract light, films, and luminescent bodies. The causes of the colors objects appear to have, are many and varied. For most theorists, however, the most plausible physicalist candidates for the colors are light-related properties, e.g., capacities to emit, reflect, absorb, transmit or scatter light to varying degrees. For physical surfaces, the color is taken to be related to the object’s reflectance profile, i.e., the capacity to differentially reflect wavelengths from different regions of the incident illumination. It turns out, however, that, for each surface color, there is no single reflectance curve associated with that color, but many. The situation is similar, in the case of film colors or aperture colors. That is to say, for each color, there is a set of metamers. (Two stimuli—bodies, sources of light, etc.—that differ in their physical characteristics, but are matched in appearance under a certain illumination, by the same observer, are metamers for that observer, in that illumination. Two bodies that are metamers in one illumination need not be metamers under a different illumination, or for a different observer.)

The favored response to this problem is to say, for example, that a given color, red, say, is not a specific color reflectance, but a type of reflectance, i.e., one that is a member of a certain group. However, there are still problems. Averill (1992, 2005), for example, presents some interesting arguments, which are based on plausible conjectures about how normal observers and standard conditions might easily enough change, with consequent metameric change. The color physicalist seems to be committed to a very arbitrary grouping of reflectances into the various types.

This problem is related to one that Hardin (1988, 2004) and Cohen (2009) have drawn attention to. It has to do with the problem of identifying, in a non-arbitrary way, normal conditions, and standard observers. The objectivist account requires that we identify the “real” color for object X as a certain causal basis (e.g., the reflectance profile) for the way it appears, to normal observers and in standard conditions. The problem is that, as Hardin has persuasively pointed out, particularly, in Hardin 2004, this cannot be done except in a highly arbitrary way. Not only is there a minority of color perceivers who are anomalous (only slightly, but appreciably so) with respect to normal observers, but there is a considerable statistical spread even within the group of normal observers. For example, the reflectance profile for unique green will differ for different members of the “normal group”. One can decide, of course, on a standard and fix one reflectance profile as green, but the procedure is highly arbitrary. As we have seen, there are few interesting causal powers associated with colors apart from the way objects affect perceivers. (This argument has led to a vigorous debate in the pages of Analysis, see Byrne & Hilbert 2007b; Cohen, Hardin & McLaughlin 2006a,b; and Tye 2006a,b, 2007.)

To counter this problem, McLaughlin suggests that we extend a proposal, which Jackson and Pargetter (1987) made, originally to overcome the problem of multiple realizations. They proposed relativising the concept of color, to kinds of objects and circumstances. McLaughlin’s suggestion is that we could extend the objectivist concept of color, by relativising it to individual observers.

Another major objection to the physicalist (reductive) account concerns whether the properties can satisfy the principle of “Unity”, as described by Johnston, (see section 2.2). This principle points to the fact that the various colors, it would seem, are the kinds of properties that fit together in characteristic ways to form structured color arrays, with a distinctive 3-dimensional character, built on attributes such as hue/saturation/brightness (or hue, chroma, lightness). The principle of Unity would seem to pose a serious problem for the Color Physicalist (see Hardin 1988; Thompson 1995; Maund 1995, 2011). As McLaughlin concedes, the problem is

that no physical properties that are even remotely plausible candidates for being the properties essentially participate in these patterns of relationships. (McLaughlin 2003: 487)

His solution to the problem is that the comparative claims, e.g., about red, orange and blue—orange is more similar to red than to blue—are true in virtue of a comparative fact about the visual experiences in question.

Colors themselves participate in the similarity and difference relationships derivatively—in virtue of the participation of the visual experiences that they dispose their bearers to produce. (McLaughlin 2003: 487)

The claim, here, is that what it is like to for something to look red is more similar to what it is like for something to look orange than it is to what it is like for something to look blue. This solution, however, raises the question of what features of the experience are relevant ones, i.e., are the features which stand in the relations of similarity and difference. There seem to be two possibilities: (i) they are features of the experiences themselves; (ii) they are features presented in experience or represented in them, i.e., they are features of regions of visual fields, or of sensa, or of material objects. There are some prima facie problems which ensue. Assuming the former possibility, then our color experiences involve massive error. The judgments of similarity and difference are applied to the colors and not to our experiences. If the second possibility is adopted, i.e., it is held that there are certain features, presented in, or represented in, experience, then they stand in the relations of similarities and differences. These features are different from reflectances, so the color physicalist needs to say what they are.

Tye and Byrne and Hilbert have proposed a solution to this last problem, one that depends on exploiting the opponent-processing model of color vision (see Supplement Color Science: Some Complexities.). It is to specify the relevant groups of spectral reflectances, associated with each color, in terms of their capacity to produce suitable responses of the visual system. The argument, by Byrne and Hilbert, proceeds in two steps: (1) it is argued that color experience are characterized as having a certain representational content: they represent objects as having what Byrne and Hilbert call “hue” magnitudes; (2) the hue-magnitudes are explained in terms of being certain physical properties. As they argue, if we can give the right account of how the magnitudes contribute to the representational content, then we can explain the similarity relations among the hues and the binary/unique distinction, in terms of the content of color experience.

This proposal, in turn, has been subject to criticism from several authors, e.g., Hardin 2003, Pautz 2006, Maund 2011, and Allen 2015.

2.3 Color Eliminativism/Irrealism/Fictionalism

There is a group of views about color, which come under one or all of the labels, Color Irrealism, Color Eliminativism, Color Fictionalism. These titles are a little misleading, since some theorists also talk of there being colors in the sense of being dispositions to cause experiences of a characteristic type, and/or being (attributes in/of) sensations. Following our earlier discussion, in section 1.2, we may take it that what the color-Eliminativist is denying is that material objects and lights have colors of a certain kind: colors that we ordinarily and unreflectingly take the bodies to have. That is to say, these views are usually committed to an “Error theory” of visual color experience. Indeed the theories are often referred to as “Error theories” of color. Prominent contemporary defenders of variants of this view are Hardin (1988), Boghossian & Velleman (1989), Averill (2005), and Maund (1995, 2006, 2011). Earlier defenders were Galileo, Descartes, Locke and others.

The most general argument for Color Irrealism/Eliminativism is addressed to the ordinary conception of color (and the use of ordinary color terms.) The argument, in brief is that Color Primitivism gets it right about the kinds of properties colors are:simple, qualitative, intrinsic properties, typically possessed by surfaces of material bodies. Only, material bodies do not actually have them. Thus there are two crucial steps in the argument for Color Irrealism/Eliminativism: the first is to argue that bodies do not actually have the sort of colors described by Primitivism; the second is to argue against Reductive Color Physicalism and Color Dispostionalism. The second step is to the effect that these theories are phenomenally inadequate, as well as failing to account for a range of color phenomena.

Neither the properties posited by the Primitivist, nor those posited by the Color Physicalist, it is argued, can satisfy all the required constraints for being colors. As we saw in the last two sections, both sorts of theorists have a response to this objection. The debate between the Color Eliminativists and their opponents will thus depend on the plausibility of such responses, and counter-responses (see the earlier sections 2.1, 2.2). As far as Primitivist Realism is concerned, one central issue is this. The defense of this position, it seems, would need to appeal to some version of Naïve Realism, and/or Disjunctivism, and there are strong arguments against these accounts. For example, it is not clear how these accounts can handle the fact that many of our experiences have both veridical and illusory elements: the Muller-Lyer lines look unequal, when they are not; but they also look thin, and look to be in front of me, and look black (see the entry on perception: the disjunctivist theory of perception). Another important issue is the one Hardin (2004, 2008) and Cohen (2009) raise: that it depends on some non-arbitrary identification of standard conditions, and normal observers, one that cannot be satisfied (see section 2.1, above).

Most versions of Color Eliminativism/Irrealism commit one to an error theory of visual experience. As Boghossian and Velleman (1989 [1997: 93]) put it: “visual experience is ordinarily naively realistic, in the sense that the qualities presented in it are represented as qualities of the external world” (see also Averill 2005 and Maund 2011). This leads them to explain how this happens by adopting a Projectivist account of color experience:

The projection posited by this account has the result that the intentional content of visual experience represents external objects as possessing qualities that belong, in fact, only to regions of the visual field. By “gilding or staining all natural objects with the colors borrowed from internal sentiments”, as Hume puts it, the mind “raises in a manner a new creation”. (Boghossian & Velleman 1989 [1997: 95])

In ordinary color experience, it is implied, physical objects are represented (or presented) as having certain qualities that are illusory, and accordingly, that experience involve errors. It is important to keep in mind that such claims are not simply negative. Illusions and errors can serve positive functions. The claim that experiences represent objects as having qualities with a certain character, can explain why we form the concepts we do, why we identify and recognize objects, and so on. This means that it is still the case that there are important reasons for retaining our ordinary color concepts, even though they are not actualized. This fact motivates the thought that the proper attitude to adopt towards our color language is a fictionalist one: for many purposes we should think of the color sentences with their ordinary meaning—but treat them only as if they are true (see Gatzia 2007, 2008).

Being an error theory of visual experience, Color Eliminativism is sometimes thought to leave us with a severe problem (see Byrne & Hilbert 2007a). If there are no properties that satisfy the requirements for being colors: how did the ordinary concept develop? A plausible answer to this problem is found in the fact that the way that the concepts of color operate, to serve their various functions and roles, is through the way colors appear. For these purposes and roles, objects do not need to have colors. It will be sufficient if they appear to have them. For these purposes, it is sufficient that “it is as if they have the colors”. We should also bear in mind that errors and illusions and misrepresentations can be beneficial and not deleterious, especially if the errors are systematic. Consider, for example, the highly useful illusions that mirrors produce. Part of the point of Projectivist theories of color experience is that the errors are systematic ones. Putting it crudely, tomatoes give us, regularly the same kind of error, just as bananas give us their distinctive kind of error. Angela Mendelovici has developed an account of reliable misrepresentation. Interestingly, she argues that one of the objections to tracking theories of representation, favored by Reductive Color Physicalists, is that they cannot explain reliable misrepresentation.

Finally, the reason why color vision evolved might be quite complex. Akins and Hahn (2014) have a long, detailed, paper about the evolutionary implications of color vision. They argue the reasons often assumed doesn’t stack up: they are based on the notion that the function of color vision is “to detect the colors”. Things are far more complex, they argue.

2.4 Color Dispositionalism

Color-Dispositionalism is the view that colors are dispositional properties: powers to appear in distinctive ways to perceivers (of the right kind), in the right kind of circumstances; i.e., to cause experiences of an appropriate kind in those circumstances. Because they involve responses on the part of color-perceivers, such theories are often called “subjectivist”.

This theory takes different forms. One form it takes is that associated with people in the scientific tradition, e.g., Descartes, Boyle, Newton and Locke. This is the view that colors are secondary qualities. However, as we saw earlier, in section 1.2, this form of the dispositionalist view was part of a complex package, related to the emerging scientific world-view. For our current purposes, there are two crucial components to this package. The first is the idea that we should distinguish between two notions of color: color as a property of physical bodies, and color as it is in sensation (or, as it is sometimes described, “color-as-we-experience-it”). The second is that the secondary quality view is not thought of as capturing the common-sense, or “vulgar”, way of thinking of color. Rather, it is thought of as a revision or reconstruction of the ordinary concept.

There is a different form the dispositionalist view of colors has more recently taken, and which has many philosophical defenders, e.g., Bennett (1971), Dummett (1979), McDowell (1985), McGinn (1983), Peacocke (1984), Johnston (1992), and Levin (2000). These philosophers reject the claim that the dispositionalist view is in conflict with any commonsense view of color. It is held by some that dispositionalism can be defended as an analytic thesis, concerning the meaning of color terms; it is held, or implied, by others that possession of the concept of color is neutral on the precise nature of the colors, a nature which consists in being dispositional. One virtue of this account is that, if it is correct, there is no need to agree that science is in conflict with our intuitive notions of color, or that it shows that ordinary color talk is mistaken, or in need of reconstruction. Another virtue would be that it would explain what seems to be an important feature of color concepts, as opposed to primary quality concepts: that in order to grasp, fully, color concepts, it is necessary to have color experiences. (It is interesting that, as Adams (2016) points out, Aristotle’s account of color rejects this assumption: For Aristotle, the function of vision is to detect colors, perceiver-independent colors.)

A prominent defender of dispositionalism is Johnston (1992), whose account of the major constraints upon a theory of color we examined in an earlier section. He concedes that dispositionalism has difficulty handling the constraint imposed by commitment to the doctrine of Revelation but, he thinks, giving this up is a small price to pay. He maintains that, nevertheless, the theory can handle all the other constraints, and in so doing has major advantage over rival accounts. One of the theory’s merits is that it can account for the Principle of Unity, item (3) in his list, although as we have seen, this principle needs to be extended. Another merit of Johnston’s version of dispositionalism is that it handles what seems to be a difficulty for other versions, the problem of explaining the causal role of color in the perception of colors, that is to say, the problem of meeting constraint (2) on his list:

  1. Explanation. The fact of a surface or volume or radiant source being canary yellow sometimes causally explains our visual experience as of canary yellow things.

It has been argued that dispositionalist accounts of color cannot handle this causal requirement, e.g., Jackson 1998. Johnston’s reply to this objection is that the dispositions do not have to be thought of as bare dispositions. We can, instead, think of them as “constituted dispositions”, which are thought of as follows:

A constituted disposition is a higher-order property of having some intrinsic properties which, oddities aside, would cause the manifestation of the disposition in the circumstances of manifestation. (Johnston 1992 [1997: 147])

Thus it is part of what it is to have a constituted disposition to have some property, which is the causal ground of the manifestation of the disposition.

There have been two major objections to dispositionalism. These have been discussed (and rejected) by J. Levin (2000). One objection is that the dispositionalist theory cannot give a satisfactory account of the phenomenology of visual color experiences. Let us come back to this objection. The second major problem is that it cannot dissolve what many think is the central problem of dispositionalism, the problem of characterizing just what the colors of objects are supposed to be, “without vacuity, circularity, regress or any other such damaging vice” (Levin 2000: 162). The circularity problem reflects the way the dispositionalist thesis is usually formulated:

X is red = X has the disposition to look red to normal perceivers, in standard conditions.

If we understand the phrase “to look red”, on the right hand side, to mean “to look to be red”, then it would seem we have troubles. As Levin puts it:

If an object is red iff it’s disposed to look red (under appropriate conditions), then an object must be disposed to look red iff it’s disposed to look to be disposed to look red … and so on, ad infinitum. (Levin 2000: 163)

There is a range of techniques that Dispositionalists have devised to avoid the circularity problem. They include proposals to understand “looks red” differently from that assumed above, and proposals to characterize the disposition differently. In addition, it is sometimes argued that the circularity is benign. (For further discussion, see Levin 2000, and Byrne & Hilbert 2011.)

One particularly interesting solution to the circularity problem is that provided by Peacocke 1984/1997. Peacocke defends what he calls an “experientialist’s version” of the theory, one which requires the introduction of a third property, besides those of being red, and looking red—a sensational property, that of being red*. According to this account, the property red is explained not in terms of looking red, but in terms of causing the perceiver to have presented to him, sensational properties in a visual field. (For discussion, see Boghossian and Velleman 1989/1997)

The more pressing problem, however, for Color Dispositionalism is whether it can give an adequate account of the phenomenology of visual experience. The phenomenological problem, as McGinn describes it, is that color properties do not look much like dispositions to produce color experiences, so that an error theory of color perception comes to seem inescapable. Colors turn out not to look the way they are said dispositionally to be, “which is to say that ordinary color perception is intrinsically and massively misleading” (McGinn 1996: 537). Rather than adopting a dispositionalism with that consequence, McGinn falls back on a Primitivist view of color, a view that resists both criticisms leveled at dispostionalism.

Levin 2000 has provided a powerful reply, on behalf of the dispositionalist, to McGinn’s argument. Her challenge is complex, highlighting the assumptions that underpin McGinn’s criticism (and has a detailed discussion of the relevance of the doctrine of Revelation). An important question seems to remain, however. In McGinn’s formulation of the phenomenological problem, there are two distinct claims, each of which is crucial: (1) Colors do not look like the sorts of dispositional properties they would have to be if the dispositional thesis were correct: “Colors turn out not to look the way they are said dispositionally to be”. (2) colors look like non-dispositional properties: when we see an object as red we see it as having a simple, monadic, local property of the object’s surface.

The second claim is expanded as follows:

When we see an object as red … [the] color is perceived as intrinsic to the object, in much the same way that shape and size are perceived as intrinsic. No relation to perceivers enters into how the color appears; the color is perceived as wholly on the object, not as somehow straddling the gap between it and the perceiver. (McGinn 1996: 541–542)

One possibility that this claim raises is that even if it is true, as Levin argues, that our visual experiences are such that objects look to have dispositional properties of the sort the color-dispositionalist is committed to, it will also be the case (often at least) that the colored objects look to be manifesting that disposition. McGinn’s claim (2) may then apply to the manifestation of the disposition. If so, the dispositionalism would seem to be allied to an error theory, as he suggests.

Byrne and Hilbert (2011) provide a detailed examination of Color Dispositionalism, which they stress, can take different forms. They think that several of these forms can escape both the circularity and phenomenological problems, highlighted by McGinn, in part because they disagree with him on the phenomenology. They have different criticism of the theory: that there is no good reason for accepting the theory. They argue that the best reasons for accepting it depend on a highly implausible theory of perception.

Finally, another difficulty with dispositionalism, as it is standardly expressed, is the one that Hardin (1988/1993, 2004) has stressed. As our knowledge of color vision has grown, it has become increasingly more difficult to specify normal observers, and standard viewing conditions in any but an arbitrary way, arbitrary from the point of view of metaphysics. To be sure, there are conventional reasons for picking out some observers and some viewing conditions as special, but we can, without too much trouble, imagine these changing. And with respect to normal observers, we have found that in fact, as things stand, there is a wide range of variation among competent color perceivers. As we shall see in the following section, these considerations have led Cohen to modify the standard dispositionalist account in favor of a “more ecumenical” color relationalist theory, one that relativizes the dispositions to groups of perceivers, and types of viewing conditions.

2.5 Color Relationalism

One of the most important developments in recent philosophy of color has been the emergence of a radical relationalist view of colors. Averill (1992) proposed a relational view of color, one that involves a strong modification of the standard dispositional position. He presents two arguments against both physicalist and dispositionalist accounts, which depend on raising difficult questions for their dependence on normal observers and standard viewing conditions. In their place, he offers an account according to which colors of bodies are relational properties. In explanation, he asks us to:

Suppose that “yellow” is regarded as a relational term having two suppressed argument places, one argument takes populations as values and ties any instance of being yellow to the normal observers of a population, the other takes environments as values and ties any instance of being yellow to the optimal viewing conditions of an environment. (Averill 1992: 555)

Cohen (2004, 2009) holds a similar position, though he has produced a more general argument. For Cohen, Color Relationalism is the metaphysical thesis that colors are relational properties of a certain sort—relational with respect to perceivers and circumstances of viewing. According to Color Relationalism, there are no such properties as blue, red, yellow, orange, etc. To be more precise, there are no such properties as blue simpliciter, red simpliciter, and so on. What there are, instead, are relational properties: blue-for-perceiver A-in-circumstances C1, red-for-perceiver B-in-circumstances C2, yellow-for-perceiver D-in-circumstances C3, and so on.

At the heart of Cohen’s account is a certain argument, which he calls his “Master Argument”. This argument depends on pointing out the extent to which the colors things look to have, vary with different viewing conditions, different classes of perceivers, and different types of animals. In short, it is built upon the premise that there is a vast range of situations in which there are variations in the way something looks, either to the same subject under different viewing conditions, or to different subjects under the same conditions.

Then follows the crucial question: Can we select one amongst these perceptual variants that should be regarded as veridically representing the color of the object (where this would mean that the other variants are representing the object’s color erroneously)? It is just this question, Cohen suggests, to which it is difficult to imagine a well-motivated, principled, and non-question-begging answer, and thus leads to the formulation of the Master Argument. Given that there is no well-motivated reason for singling out any single variant (at the expense of the others), he argues, an ecumenical reconciliation of the variants is preferable to an unmotivated stipulation in favor of just one of them. He concludes: the best way to implement such an ecumenical reconciliation between apparently incompatible variants is to view them as the result of relativizing colors to different values of different parameters (Cohen 2009: 24).

The thrust of the Master Argument, powerful as it is, is largely negative. It seems to rebut all objectivist theories of color, whether the objectivist theory is one of the standard forms of color realism—physicalist realism or primitivist realism—or whether it is framed in terms of a disposition to appear, in characteristic ways, to normal perceivers in standard circumstances. On the face of it, only two candidates remain: Color Relationalism and Color Irrealism. Cohen holds that Color Relationalism provides the best solution to the problem outlined, but he concedes that Color Irrealism also offers a solution. He thinks that that view ought to be rejected, on independent grounds. The argument against Color Irrealism is that it is a “theory of last resort”, one that we should accept only after all other candidates have been rejected, when no other alternative remains. The crucial issue between these two theories, it would seem, is when Color Relationalism can account adequately for the phenomenology of visual experience. Cohen’s response to this problem is similar to that of Levin, in her defense of Color Dispositionalism (see Maund 2012).

2.6 Action-Based Theories of Color

There are other forms of color relationalism which deserve a section of their own. They tend to see colors as hybrid properties combining aspects of the perceiver’s environment and phenomenology.

One form has links to action-based theories of perception, as developed principally by the psychologist, J. J. Gibson. A leading example is the theory defended by Evan Thompson, The Ecological View of Colors. On this account, colors are taken to be dependent, in part, on the perceiver and so are not intrinsic properties of a perceiver-independent world. Being colored, instead, is construed as a relational property of the environment, connecting the environment with the perceiving animal. In the case of the color of physical surfaces, “being coloured corresponds to the surface spectral reflectance as visually perceived by the animals” (Thompson 1995: 240; see also Ch. 5, pp. 242–250).

In more detail this account is spelled out in the following way:

being coloured a particular determinate colour or shade … is equivalent to having a particular spectral reflectance, illuminance, or emittance that looks that colour to a particular perceiver in specific viewing conditions. (1995: 245)

Thompson insists that this account is to be distinguished from both a Lockean dispositionalist account and an error theory of colors. Whether it is or not will depend on what account he can give of “as visually perceived by the animal”.

Another important example of an action-based approach to perception is the theory in Noë 2004. Noë defends what he calls the enactive approach to perception. As in the case of Thompson, his theory is guided by Gibson’s work, albeit with modification. Noë sets his view of color within this account, arguing that color is a relational property, involving the object and the environment, and crucially related to perceivers. In his theory of perception, Noë emphasizes the role of perspectival properties. He distinguishes, for example, between size and perspectival size, i.e., size in the visual field or how things look with respect to size from here.

Size in the visual field is distinct property from size. It corresponds to the size of the patch that one must fit in on given plane perpendicular to the line sight in order to perfectly occlude an object from view. (Noë 2004: 83)

Actually, Noë makes a distinction between three kinds of properties. Associated with the shape (and size) of an object, say, a cube, is its visual potential:

The visual potential of a cube (at least with respect to shape) is the way its aspect changes as a result of movement (of the cube itself or of the perceiver around the cube). Any movement determines a set of changes in perceived aspect; any set of changes in perceived aspects determines equivalent classes of possible movements, (Noë 2004: 77)

Accordingly, in the case of shape and size, we can distinguish between three kinds of properties: e.g., vision-independent shape, shape’s visual potential and perspectival shape. Noë models his theory of color on the second kind of property: “colors are ways colored things change their appearances as color-critical conditions change” (Noë 2004: 141). This is an intriguing theory. What isn’t so clear is what exactly perspectival color is.

More recently, other forms of relational theories have emerged: theories defended by Brogaard (2012), Chirimuuta (2015), and Chirimuuta & Kingdom (2015). Chirimuuta advocates a version of color relationalism which she calls Color Adverbialism:

On this last account, colors are not properties of external physical objects, or of brains, or of our mental states; instead, they are properties of perceptual processes or interactions which involve objects, brains and mental states. So, according to colour adverbialism, “seeing the colours” means “seeing in a colourful way”. (Chirimuuta & Kingdom 2015: 226)

She appeals, with Kingdom, to recent research on color vision, relied to the function of color vision, to argue that it provides great difficulties for Objectivist color realism—both Primitivist and Reductionist Physicalist—(see also Akins & Hahn 2014). While they admit that anti-realism, especially the form favored by Hardin, is in a better position, they think that Color Adverbialism presents the best explanation.

Another important recent contributions to the philosophy of color is the book by Matthen (2005). In this work, Matthen articulates a theory of sense-perception in which color plays a prominent role. The work is significant for the theory of color that he presents, one that draws heavily on comparative studies of color vision among different species. Matthen replaces his earlier objectivist views on color by an account that has more in common with the ecological theory favored by Thompson. Matthen agrees with Hardin, Thompson and others that the phenomenology of color is not captured, or accounted for, by any of the standard objectivist accounts. Nevertheless, he claims to be defending a realist theory of color and to be rejecting standard irrealist theories, including Hardin’s. Matthen’s account is complex. The idea is that the senses (the visual sensory system) do categorize objects as “blue”, “yellow”, etc., but these qualities are related to actions that perceivers can perform, and in particular, to “epistemic affordances”. The sensory systems are held to be devices that are in the business of classifying distal stimuli (physical objects) as having certain properties, which stand in similarity and difference relations with each other. These categories are constructed by the system and do not, at least in the case of color, correspond to any objective properties that are independent of perceivers.


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