First published Tue Feb 1, 2011; substantive revision Mon Apr 20, 2020

Discrimination is prohibited by six of the core international human rights documents. The vast majority of the world’s states have constitutional or statutory provisions outlawing discrimination (Osin and Porat 2005). And most philosophical, political, and legal discussions of discrimination proceed on the premise that discrimination is morally wrong and, in a wide range of cases, ought to be legally prohibited. However, co-existing with this impressive global consensus are many contested questions, suggesting that there is less agreement about discrimination than initially meets the eye. What is discrimination? Is it a conceptual truth that discrimination is wrong, or is it a substantive moral judgment? What is the relation of discrimination to oppression and exploitation? What are the categories on which acts of discrimination can be based, aside from such paradigmatic classifications as race, religion, and sex? These are some of the contested issues.

1. The Concept of Discrimination

What is discrimination? More specifically, what does it mean to discriminate against some person or group of persons? It is best to approach this question in stages, beginning with an answer that is a first approximation and then introducing additions, qualifications, and refinements as further questions come into view.

1.1 A First Approximation

In his review of the international treaties that outlaw discrimination, Wouter Vandenhole finds that “[t]here is no universally accepted definition of discrimination” (2005: 33). In fact, the core human rights documents fail to define discrimination at all, simply providing non-exhaustive lists of the grounds on which discrimination is to be prohibited. Thus, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights declares that “the law shall prohibit any discrimination and guarantee to all persons equal and effective protection against discrimination on any ground such as race, color, sex, language, religion, political or other opinion, national or social origin, property, birth or other status” (Article 26). And the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights declares, “The enjoyment of the rights and freedoms set forth in this Convention shall be secured without discrimination on any ground such as sex, race, color, language, religion, political or other opinion, national or social origin, association with a national minority, property, birth or other status” (Article 14). Left unaddressed is the question of what discrimination itself is.

Standard accounts hold that discrimination consists of actions, practices, or policies that are—in some appropriate sense—based on the (perceived) social group to which those discriminated against belong and that the relevant groups must be socially salient in that they structure interaction in important social contexts (cf. Lippert-Rasmussen 2006: 169, and Holroyd 2018: 384). Thus, groups based on race, religion and gender qualify as potential grounds of discrimination in any modern society, but groups based on the length of a person’s toenails would typically not qualify. However, Eidelson has challenged the social salience requirement (2015: 28–30), and a sound understanding of what makes discrimination wrongful might depend on how the challenge is resolved. Eidelson’s view is examined in section 4.1 below. In the meantime, the analysis of discrimination presented here will proceed on the basis of the social salience requirement.

Discrimination against persons, then, is necessarily oriented toward them based on their membership in a certain type of social group. But it is also necessary that the discriminatory conduct impose some kind of disadvantage, harm, or wrong on the persons at whom it is directed. In this connection, consider the landmark opinion of the U.S. Supreme Court in Brown v. Board of Education, holding that de jure racial segregation in public schools is unconstitutional. The Court writes, “Segregation with the sanction of law … has a tendency to [retard] the educational and mental development of negro children and to deprive them of some of the benefits they would receive in a racial[ly] integrated school system” (1954: 495). Thus, the court rules that segregation amounts to illegal discrimination against black children because it imposes on them educational and psychological disadvantages.

Additionally, as Brown makes clear, the disadvantage imposed by discrimination is to be determined relative to some appropriate comparison social group. This essential reference to a comparison group explains why duties of non-discrimination are “duties to treat people in certain ways defined by reference to the way that others are treated” (Gardner 1998: 355). Typically, the relevant comparison group is part of the same society as the disadvantaged group, or at least it is governed by the same overarching political structure. In Brown, the relevant comparison group consisted of white citizens. Accordingly, it would be mistaken to think that the black citizens of Kansas who brought the lawsuit were not discriminated against because they were treated no worse than blacks in South Africa were being treated under apartheid. Blacks in South Africa were not the proper comparison class.

The appropriate comparison class is determined by normative principles. American states are obligated to provide their black citizens an education that is no worse than what they provide to their white citizens; any comparison with the citizens or subjects of other countries is beside the point. It should also be noted that, whether or not American states have an obligation to provide an education to any of their citizens, if such states provide an education to their white citizens, then it is discriminatory for the states to fail to provide an equally good education to their black citizens. And if states do have an obligation to provide an education to all their citizens, then giving an education to whites but not blacks would constitute a double-wrong against blacks: the wrong of discrimination, which depends on how blacks are treated in comparison to whites, and the wrong of denying blacks an education, which does not depend on how whites are treated.

Discrimination is necessarily comparative, and the Brown case seems to suggest that what counts in the comparison is not how well or poorly a person (or group) is treated on some absolute scale, but rather how well she is treated relative to some other person. But an important element of the court’s reasoning in Brown suggests that the disadvantage or wrong imposed by a discriminatory act can encompass more than the harmful downstream causal consequences of the act. Thus, the Court famously writes, “Separate educational facilities are inherently unequal” (1954: 495). The Court can be construed as saying that, apart from the harmful educational and psychological consequences for black children, the Jim Crow segregation of public schools stamps those children with a badge of inferiority and thereby treats them unfavorably in comparison to white children.

It is important to recognize that discrimination, in the morally and socially relevant sense, is not simply differential treatment. Differential treatment is symmetrical: if blacks are treated differently from whites, then whites must be treated differently from blacks. But it is implausible to hold that Jim Crow and South Africa’s apartheid system discriminated against whites. The system arguably held back economic progress for everyone in the South, but that point is quite different from the implausible claim that everyone was a victim of discrimination. Accordingly, it is better to think of discrimination in terms of disadvantageous treatment rather than simply differential treatment. Discrimination imposes a disadvantage on certain persons relative to others, and those who are treated more favorably are not to be seen as victims of discrimination.

An act can both be discriminatory and, simultaneously, confer an absolute benefit on those discriminated against, because the conferral of the benefit might be combined with conferring a greater benefit on the members of the appropriate comparison group. In such a case, the advantage of receiving an absolute benefit is, at the same time, a relative disadvantage or deprivation. For example, consider the admissions policy of Harvard University in the early twentieth century, when the university had a quota on the number of Jewish students. Harvard was guilty of discriminating against all Jewish applicants on account of their religion. Yet, the university still offered the applicants something of substantial value, viz., the opportunity to compete successfully for admission. What made the university’s offer of this opportunity discriminatory was that the quota placed (potential and actual) Jewish applicants at a disadvantage, due to their religion, relative to Christian ones.

One might think that it downplays the harm done by discrimination to say that the disadvantage it imposes only need be a relative disadvantage. However, the Brown case shows how the imposition of even a “merely” relative disadvantage can have extremely bad and unjust consequences for persons, especially when the relevant comparison class consists of one’s fellow citizens. Disadvantages relative to fellow citizens, when those disadvantages are severe and concern important goods such as education and social status, can make persons vulnerable to domination and oppression at the hands of their fellow citizens (Anderson 1999). The domination and oppression of American blacks by their fellow citizens under Jim Crow was made easier by the relative disadvantage imposed on blacks when it came to education. Norwegians might have had an even better education than southern whites, but Norwegians posed little threat of domination to southern whites or blacks, because they lived under an entirely separate political structure, having minimal relations to American citizens. Matters are different in today’s globalized world, where an individual’s disadvantage in access to education relative to persons who live in other countries could pose a threat of oppression. Accordingly, one must seriously consider the possibility that children from poor countries are being discriminated against when they are unable to obtain the education routinely available to children in affluent societies.

The relative nature of the disadvantage that discrimination imposes explains the close connection between discrimination and inequality. A relative disadvantage necessarily involves an inequality with respect to persons in the comparison class. Accordingly, antidiscrimination norms prohibit certain sorts of inequalities between persons in the relevant comparison classes (Shin 2009). For example, the U.S. Civil Rights Act of 1866 requires that all citizens “shall have the same right, in every State and Territory in the United States, to make and enforce contracts, to sue, be parties, and give evidence, to inherit, purchase, lease, sell, hold, and convey real and personal property, and to full and equal benefit of all laws and proceedings for the security of person and property, as is enjoyed by white citizens” (Civil Rights Act 1866). And the international convention targeting discrimination against women condemns “any distinction, exclusion or restriction made on the basis of sex which has the effect or purpose of impairing or nullifying the recognition, enjoyment or exercise by women … on a basis of equality of men and women, of human rights and fundamental freedoms” (CEDAW, Article 1).

To review: as a reasonable first approximation, we can say that discrimination consists of acts, practices, or policies that impose a relative disadvantage on persons based on their membership in a salient social group. But notice that this account does not make discrimination morally wrong as a conceptual matter. The imposition of a relative disadvantage might, or might not, be wrongful. In the next section, we will see how the idea of moral wrongfulness can be introduced to form a moralized concept of discrimination.

In recent years, some thinkers have rejected the view that discrimination is an essentially comparative concept that looks to how certain persons are treated relative to others. For example, Réaume argues against the view by invoking the “leveling-down objection.” She points out that, if there is an inequality in the distribution of some benefit between two persons or groups, then we need to ask “whether leveling up or leveling down are, other things held constant, regarded as equally attractive solutions” (2013: 8). The comparative view seems to entail that the two solutions are equally attractive, but, Réaume points out, plaintiffs in discrimination cases who are demanding equal treatment “rarely put their claim this way” (8) and would not be satisfied with the leveling-down solution: “they ask to vote as well, not that voting be abolished, or that a pension scheme include them, not that it be repealed.” Réaume continues, “To level down would deprive everyone of something all are properly entitled to, and thus exacerbate rather than solve the problem” (11).

Nonetheless, the leveling-down objection is problematic. That plaintiffs in discrimination cases do not ask that voting be abolished only shows that they know that they would be better off with everyone having the right to vote than with no one having it. Moreover, although leveling down would, in typical cases, deprive everyone of something to which all are entitled, it does not follow that leveling down would constitute discrimination. The universal denial of the franchise would be a wrong, but not the wrong of discrimination. Denial of the franchise amounts to discrimination only when it is selectively directed at some salient group within the adult population. Accordingly, Lippert-Rasmussen seems to be right when he explains, “Unlike other prima facie morally wrong acts, such as lying, hurting, or manipulating, one cannot discriminate against some unless there are others who receive (or who would receive) better treatment at one’s hands …. I can rebut an accusation of having discriminated against someone by saying that I would have treated anyone else at least as badly in that situation” (2014: 16).

1.2 The Moralized Concept

The concept of discrimination is inherently normative to the extent that the idea of disadvantage is a normative one. But it does not follow from this point that discrimination is, by definition, morally wrong. At the same time, many—or even most—uses of the term ‘discrimination’ in contemporary political and legal discussions do employ the term in a moralized sense. Wasserman is using this moralized sense, when he writes that “[t]o claim that someone discriminates is … to challenge her for justification; to call discrimination ‘wrongful’ is merely to add emphasis to a morally-laden term” (1998: 805). We can, in fact, distinguish a moralized from a non-moralized concept of discrimination. The moralized concept picks out acts, practices or policies insofar as they wrongfully impose a relative disadvantage on persons based on their membership in a salient social group of a suitable sort. The non-moralized concept simply dispenses with the adverb ‘wrongfully’.

Accordingly, the sentence ‘Discrimination is wrong’ can be either a tautology (if ‘discrimination’ is used in its moralized sense) or a substantive moral judgment (if ‘discrimination’ is used in its non- moralized sense). And if one wanted to condemn as wrong a certain act or practice, then one could call it ‘discrimination’ (in the moralized sense) and leave it at that, or one could call it ‘discrimination’ (in the non-moralized sense) and then add that it was wrongful. In contexts where the justifiability of an act or practice is under discussion and disagreement, the moralized concept of discrimination is typically the key one used, and the disagreement is over whether the concept applies to the act. Because of its role in such discussion and disagreement, the remainder of this article will be concerned with the moralized concept of discrimination, unless it is explicitly indicated otherwise.

There is an additional point that needs to be made in connection with the wrongfulness of discrimination in its moralized sense. It is not simply that such discrimination is wrongful as a conceptual matter. The wrongfulness of the discrimination is tied to the fact that the discriminatory act is based on the victim’s membership in a salient social group. An act that imposes a relative disadvantage or deprivation might be wrong for a variety of reasons; for example, the act might violate a promise that the agent has made. The act counts as discrimination, though, only insofar as its wrongfulness derives from a connection of the act to the membership in a certain group(s) of the person detrimentally affected by the act. Accordingly, we can refine the first-approximation account of discrimination and say that the moralized concept of discrimination is properly applied to acts, practices or policies that meet two conditions: a) they wrongfully impose a relative disadvantage or deprivation on persons based on their membership in some salient social group, and b) the wrongfulness rests (in part) on the fact that the imposition of the disadvantage is on account of the group membership of the victims.

2. Types of Discrimination (in its Moralized Sense)

Legal thinkers and legal systems have distinguished among a bewildering array of types of discrimination: direct and indirect, disparate treatment and disparate impact, intentional and institutional, individual and structural. It is not easy to make sense of the morass of categories and distinctions. The best place to start is with direct discrimination.

2.1 Direct Discrimination

Consider the following, clear instance of direct discrimination. In 2002, several men of Roma descent entered a bar in a Romanian town and were refused service. The bar employee explained his conduct by pointing out to them a sign saying, “We do not serve Roma.” The Romanian tribunal deciding the case ruled that the Roma men had been the victims of unlawful direct discrimination (Schiek, Waddington, & Bell 2007: 185). The bar’s policy, as formulated in its sign, explicitly and intentionally picked out the Roma qua Roma for disadvantageous treatment. It was those two features—explicitness and intention—that made the Roma case a paradigmatic example of direct discrimination. Such examples of discrimination are cases in which the agent acts with the aim of imposing a disadvantage on persons for being members of some salient social group. In the Roma case, the bartender and bar owner aimed to exclude Roma for being Roma, and so both the owner’s policy and the bartender’s maxim of action explicitly referred to the exclusion of Roma. It is clear that the policy of the bar was wrong, but the question of what makes the policy and other instances direct discrimination wrongful will be put on hold until section 4.1 below.

In some cases, a discriminator will adopt a policy that, on its face, makes no explicit reference to the group that he or she aims to disadvantage. Instead, the policy employs some facially-neutral surrogate that, when applied, accomplishes the discriminator’s hidden aim. For example, during the Jim Crow era, southern states used literacy tests for the purpose of excluding African-Americans from the franchise. Because African-Americans were denied adequate educational opportunities and because the tests were applied in a racially-biased manner, virtually all of the persons disqualified by the tests were African-Americans, and, in any given jurisdiction, the vast majority of African-American adults seeking to vote were disqualified. The point of the literacy tests was precisely such racial exclusion, even though the testing policy made no explicit reference to race.

Notwithstanding the absence of an explicit reference to race in the literacy tests themselves, their use was a case of direct discrimination. The reason is that the persons who formulated, voted for, and implemented the tests acted on maxims that did make explicit reference to race. Their maxim was something along the lines of: ‘In order to exclude African-Americans from the franchise and do so in a way that appears consistent with the U.S. Constitution, I will favor a legal policy that is racially-neutral on its face but in practice excludes most African-Americans and leaves whites unaffected.’ As with the Roma case, there were agents whose aim was to disadvantage persons for belonging to a certain social group.

However, it is too simple to say that direct discrimination simply is intentional discrimination. Lippert-Rasmussen rightly points out that there can be cases of direct discrimination not involving the intention to disadvantage anyone on account of her group membership (2014: 59–60). A disadvantage might, instead, be imposed as a result of a general indifference toward the interests and rights of the members of a certain group. Thus, an employer might use hiring criteria that unfairly disadvantages women, not because the employer intends to disadvantage women, but because the criteria are easy to use and he simply does not care that women are unfairly disadvantaged as a result. Such instances of discrimination might not have the paradigmatic status that an example like the Roma case has, but they should be counted as forms of direct discrimination, because the disadvantageous treatment derives from an objectionable mental state of the agent. The same goes for disadvantageous treatment that is the product of bias against a certain group, even when the bias does not involve an intention to treat the group disadvantageously. A paternalistic employer might intend to help women by hiring them only for certain jobs in his company, but, if the employer is motivated by unwarranted views about the capabilities of women, he is guilty of direct discrimination.

Acts of direct discrimination can be unconscious in that the agent is unaware of the discriminatory motive behind them. It is plausible to think that in many societies, unconscious prejudice is a factor in a significant range of discriminatory behavior, and a viable understanding of the concept of discrimination must be able to accommodate the possibility. In fact, there is growing evidence that unconscious discrimination exists (Jost et al. 2009; Payne and Cameron 2010; and Brownstein and Saul 2016). And as Wax has noted, even the intention to disadvantage persons on account of their group affiliation can be unconscious (2008: 983).

2.2 Indirect Discrimination

Under many legal systems, an act that imposes a disproportionate disadvantage on the members of a certain group can count as discriminatory, even though the agent has no intention to disadvantage the members of the group and no other objectionable mental state, such as indifference or bias, motivating the act. This form of discriminatory conduct is called “indirect discrimination” or, in the language of American doctrine, “disparate impact” discrimination. Thus, the European Court of Human Rights (ECHR) has held that “[w]hen a general policy or measure has disproportionately prejudicial effects on a particular group, it is not excluded that this may be considered as discriminatory notwithstanding that it is not specifically aimed or directed at that group” (Shanaghan v. U.K. 2001: para. 129).

It should be noted that the ECHR says that policies with disproportionate effects may be discriminatory even if that is not the aim of the policies. So what criterion determines when a policy with disproportionately worse effects on a certain group actually counts as indirect discrimination? There is no agreed upon answer.

The ECHR has laid down the following criterion: a policy with disproportionate effects counts as indirect discrimination “if it does not pursue a legitimate aim or if there is not a reasonable relation of proportionality between means and aim” (Abdulaziz et al. v. U.K., 1985: para. 721). The Human Rights Committee of the United Nations has judged that a policy with disproportionate effects is discriminatory “if it is not based on objective and reasonable criteria” (Moucheboeuf 2006: 100). Under the British Race Relations Act, such a policy is discriminatory if the policymaker “cannot show [the policy] to be justifiable irrespective of the … race … of the person to whom it is applied” (Osin and Porat 2005: 900). And in its interpretation of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, the U.S. Supreme Court has held that, in judging whether the employment policies of private businesses are (indirectly) discriminatory, “[i]f an employment practice which operates to exclude Negroes cannot be shown to be related to job performance, the practice is prohibited” (Griggs v. Duke Power 1971: 431). Despite the differences, these criteria have a common thought behind them: a disproportionately disadvantageous impact on the members of certain salient social groups must not be written off as morally or legally irrelevant or dismissed as mere accident, but rather stands in need of justification. In other words, the impact must not be treated as wholly inconsequential, as if it were equivalent, for example, to a disproportionate impact on persons with long toe nails. Toe-nail group impact would require no justification, because it would simply be an accidental and morally inconsequential feature of the act, at least in all actual societies. In contrast, the thought behind the idea of indirect discrimination is that, if an act has a disproportionately disadvantageous impact on persons belonging to certain types of salient social groups, then the act is morally wrong and prohibited by anti-discrimination law unless it can meet some suitable standard of justification.

To illustrate the idea of indirect discrimination, we can turn to the U.S. Supreme Court case, Griggs v. Duke Power (1971). A company in North Carolina used a written test to determine promotions. The use of the test had the result that almost all black employees failed to qualify for the promotions. The company was not accused of direct discrimination, i.e., there was no claim that a racially discriminatory attitude was behind the decision of the company to use the written test. But the court found that the test did not measure skills essential for the jobs in question and that the state of North Carolina had a long history of deliberately discriminating against blacks by, among other things, providing grossly inferior education to them. The state had only very recently begun to rectify that situation. In ruling for the black plaintiffs, the court reasoned that the policy of using the test was racially discriminatory, because of the test’s disproportionate racial impact combined with the fact that it was not necessary to use the test to determine who was best qualified for promotion.

2.3 Organizational, Institutional, and Structural Discrimination

In many cases, acts of discrimination are attributed to collective agents, rather than to natural persons acting in their individual capacities. Accordingly, corporations, universities, government agencies, religious bodies, and other collective agents can act in discriminatory ways. This kind of discrimination can be called “organizational,” and it cuts across the direct-indirect distinction. Confusion sometimes arises when it is mistakenly believed that organizations cannot have intentions and that only indirect discrimination is possible for them. As collective agents, organizations do have intentions, and those intentions are a function of who the officially authorized agents of the institution are and what they are trying to do when they act as their official powers enable them. Suppose that the Board of Trustees of a university votes to adopt an admissions policy that (implicitly or explicitly) excludes Jews, and the trustees vote that way precisely because they believe that Jews are inherently more dishonest and greedy than other people. In such a cases, the university is deliberately excluding Jews and is guilty of direct discrimination. Individual trustees acting in their private capacity might engage in other forms of discriminatory conduct; for example, they might refuse to join clubs that have Jewish members. Such a refusal would not count as organizational discrimination. But any discriminatory acts attributable to individual board members in virtue of some official power that they hold would count as organizational discrimination.

Structural discrimination—sometimes called “institutional” (Ture and Hamilton 1992 [1967]: 4)—should be distinguished from organizational: the structural form concerns the rules that constitute and regulate the major sectors of life such as family relations, property ownership and exchange, political powers and responsibilities, and so on (Pogge 2008: 37). It is true that when such rules are discriminatory, they are often—though not always—the deliberate product of some collective or individual agent, such as a legislative body or executive official. In such cases, the agents are guilty of direct discrimination. But the idea of structural discrimination is an effort to capture a wrong distinct from direct discrimination. Thus, Fred Pincus writes that “[t]he key element in structural discrimination is not the intent but the effect of keeping minority groups in a subordinate position” (1994: 84). What Pincus and others have in mind can be explained in the following way.

When the rules of a society’s major institutions reliably produce disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes for the members of certain salient social groups and the production of such outcomes is unjust, then there is structural discrimination against the members of the groups in question, apart from any direct discrimination in which the collective or individual agents of the society might engage. This account does not mean that, empirically speaking, structural discrimination stands free of direct discrimination. It is highly unlikely that the reliable production of unjust and disproportionately disadvantageous effects would be a chance occurrence. Rather, it is (almost) always the case that, at some point(s) in the history of a society in which there is structural discrimination, important collective agents, such as governmental ones, intentionally created rules with the aim of disadvantaging the members of the groups in question. It is also likely that some collective and individual agents continue to engage in direct discrimination in such a society. But by invoking the idea of structural discrimination and attributing the discrimination to the rules of a society’s major institutions, we are pointing to a form of discrimination that is conceptually distinct from the direct discrimination engaged in by collective or individual agents. Thus understood, structural discrimination is, as a conceptual matter, necessarily indirect, although, as an empirical matter, direct discrimination is (almost) always part of the story of how structural discrimination came to be and continues to exist.

Also note that the idea of structural discrimination does not presuppose that, whenever the rules of society’s major institutions consistently produce disproportionately disadvantageous results for a salient group such as women or racial minorities, structural discrimination thereby exists. Because our concern is with the moralized concept of discrimination, one might think that disproportionate outcomes, by themselves, entail that an injustice has been done to the members of the salient group in question and that structural discrimination thereby exists against the group. However, on a moralized concept of structural discrimination, the injustice condition is distinct from the disproportionate outcome condition. Whether a disproportionate outcome is sufficient for concluding that there is an injustice against the members of the group is a substantive moral question. Some thinkers might claim that the answer is affirmative, and such a claim is consistent with the moralized concept of structural discrimination. However, the claim is not presupposed by the moralized concept, which incorporates only the conceptual thesis that a pattern of disproportionate disadvantage falling on the members of certain salient groups does not count as structural discrimination unless the pattern violates sound principles of distributive justice.

3. Challenging the Concept of Indirect Discrimination

The distinction between direct and indirect discrimination plays a central role in contemporary thinking about discrimination. However, some philosophers hold that talking about indirect discrimination is confused and misguided. For these philosophers, direct discrimination is the only genuine form of discrimination. Examining their challenge to the very concept of indirect discrimination is crucial in developing a philosophical account of what discrimination is.

3.1 Is Indirect Discrimination Really Discrimination?

Young argues that the concept of discrimination should be limited to “intentional and explicitly formulated policies of exclusion or preference.” She holds that conceiving of discrimination in terms of the consequences or impact of an act, rather than in terms of its intent, “confuses issues” by conflating discrimination with oppression. Discrimination is a matter of the intentional conduct of particular agents. Oppression is a matter of the outcomes routinely generated by “the structural and institutional framework” of society (1990: 196).

Cavanagh holds a position similar to Young’s, writing that persons “who are concerned primarily with how things like race and sex show up in the overall distributions [of jobs] have no business saying that their position has anything to do with discrimination. It is not discrimination they object to, but its effects; and these effects can equally be brought about by other causes” (2002: 199). On Cavanagh’s view, then, if one finds it inherently objectionable for political officeholders to be predominantly male, then one can sensibly charge that such a disproportion is unjust but cannot coherently claim that it is, in itself, discriminatory.

Along the same lines, Eidelson contends that “‘indirect’ discrimination is not usefully thought of as a distinct form of discrimination at all, except as a piece of legal jargon” (2015: 19). He writes, “Precisely because the connotation of ‘discrimination’ as an act … in which an agent is sensitive to some feature of the discriminatee, and engages in some manner of differential treatment, is inescapable, describing indirect discrimination as discrimination is a serious obstacle to clear communication” (56).

The arguments of Cavanagh, Eidelson and Young raise a question that is not easy to answer, viz., why can indirect and direct discrimination be legitimately considered as two subcategories of one and the same concept? In other words, what do the two supposed forms of discrimination really have in common that make them forms of the same type of moral wrong? Direct discrimination is essentially a matter of the reasons or motives that guide the act or policy of a particular agent, while indirect discrimination is not about such reasons or motives. Even conceding that acts or policies of each type can be wrong, it is unclear that the two types are each species of one and the same kind of moral wrong, i.e., the wrong of discrimination. And if cases of direct discrimination are paradigmatic examples of discrimination, then a serious question arises as to whether the concept of discrimination properly applies to the policies, rules, and acts that are characterized as “indirect” discrimination.

Moreover, there is a crucial ambiguity in how discrimination is understood that lends itself to conflating direct discrimination with the phenomena picked out by ‘indirect discrimination’. Direct discrimination involves the imposition of disadvantages “based on” or “on account of” or “because of” membership in some salient social group. Yet, these phrases can refer either to a) the reasons that guide the acts of agents or to b) factors that do not guide agents but do help explain why the disadvantageous outcomes of certain acts and policies fall disproportionately on certain salient groups (Cf. Shin 2010). In the Roma case, the disadvantage was “because of” ethnicity in the former sense: the ethnicity of the Roma was a consideration that guided the acts of the bar owner and bartender. In the Griggs case, the disadvantage was “because of race” in the latter sense: race did not guide the acts of the company but neither was it an accident that the disadvantages of the written test fell disproportionately on blacks. Rather, race, in conjunction with the historical facts about North Carolina’s educational policies, explained why the disadvantage fell disproportionately on black employees.

The thought that the policy of the company in Griggs is a kind of discrimination, viz., indirect discrimination, seems to trade on the ambiguity in the meanings of the locutions ‘based on’, ‘because of’, ‘on account of’, and so on. The state of North Carolina’s policy of racial segregation in education imposed disadvantages based on/because of/on account of race, in one sense of those terms. The company’s policy of using a written test imposed disadvantages based on/because of/on account of race, in a different sense. Even conceding that both the state and the company wronged blacks on the basis of their race, it appears that the two cases present two different kinds of wrong.

Nonetheless, the idea of indirect discrimination can help to highlight how the wrongful harms of direct discrimination are capable of ramifying via acts and policies that are not directly discriminatory and would be entirely innocent but for the link between them and acts of direct discrimination. In the Griggs case, direct discrimination had harmed blacks by putting them at an educational disadvantage. Even if the direct discrimination had ceased at some prior point, the policy of the company enabled the educational disadvantage to branch into an employment disadvantage, thereby amplifying and perpetuating the wrongful harms of the original direct discrimination. The language of indirect discrimination can spotlight the link between the two forms of disadvantage and capture the idea that the wrongful harms of direct discrimination should not be allowed to extend willy-nilly across time and domains of life via otherwise innocent acts.

However, it is also true that the idea of indirect discrimination is typically understood in a broader way that does not require any connection to direct discrimination. Accordingly, in his discussion of how persons adhering to certain religious beliefs or practices might be put at an unjust disadvantage by an employer’s dress code, Jones writes, “Indirect discrimination law aims … to eliminate inequalities of opportunity arising from religion or belief” (170). For example, if a code excludes a form of dress that persons adhering to a particular religion regard as theologically-favored, such as head coverings or veils, then the British law of indirect discrimination requires that the company grant an exemption to those persons, unless it can show that the code is a proportionate means for achieving a legitimate aim. On Jones’s view, the law thereby counters, albeit in a limited way, an unjust burden placed on certain religious adherents and promotes equal employment opportunity.

The critics of the idea of indirect discrimination think that Jones is conflating distinct wrongs: the right of equal opportunity can be violated by discrimination, but it can also be violated by other sorts of wrongs. Even if certain dress codes violate the right and do so in a way that tracks a particular religious identity, it does not follow that the codes are cases of wrongful discrimination. But Jones can respond that, as long as the wrongful treatment tracks salient social categories, differentially disadvantaging persons belonging to such a category, then characterizing the treatment as discrimination is in order.

Still, critics will contend that the concept of indirect discrimination is problematic, because its use mistakenly presupposes that the wrongfulness of discrimination can lie ultimately in its effects on social groups. Certainly, bad effects can be brought about by discriminatory processes, but critics argue that the wrongfulness lies in what brings about the effects, i.e., in the unfairness or injustice of those acts or policies that generate the effects, and does not reside in the effects themselves. Addressing this argument requires a closer examination of why discrimination is wrong, the topic of section 4. Before turning to that section, it would be helpful to address a suspicion that might arise in the course of pondering whether indirect discrimination really is a form of discrimination.

3.2 Is the Dispute Merely Terminological?

One might suspect that any disagreement over whether indirect discrimination is really a form of discrimination is only a terminological one, devoid of any philosophical substance and capable of being adequately settled simply by the speaker stipulating how she is using the term ‘discrimination’ (Cavanagh 2002: 199). One side in the disagreement could, then, stipulate that, as it is using the term, ‘discrimination’ applies only to direct discrimination, and the other side could stipulate that ‘discrimination’, as it is using the term, applies to direct and indirect discrimination alike. However, the choice of terminology is not always philosophically innocent or unproblematic. A poor choice of terminology can lead to conceptual confusions and fallacious inferences. Cavanagh argues that precisely these sorts of infelicities are fostered when ‘discrimination’ is used to refer to a wrong that essentially depends on certain effects being visited upon the members of a social group (2002: 199). Moreover, the critics and the defenders of the term ‘indirect discrimination’ presumably agree with one another that the concept of discrimination possesses a determinate meaning that either admits, or does not admit, of an indirect form of discrimination. So it seems that the disagreement over indirect discrimination has philosophical significance.

The possibility should be acknowledged that the concept of discrimination is insufficiently determinate to dictate an answer to the question of whether there can be an indirect form of discrimination. In that case, any disagreement over the possibility of such discrimination would be devoid of philosophical substance and should be settled by speaker stipulation. However, it would be hasty to arrive at the conclusion that there is no answer before a thorough examination of the concept of discrimination is completed and some judgment is made about what the best account is of the concept. And a thorough examination must take up the question of why discrimination is wrong.

4. Why Is Discrimination Wrong?

In examining the question of why discrimination is wrongful, let us begin with direct discrimination and then turn to the indirect form. This approach will help shed some light on whether the wrongs involved in the two forms are sufficiently analogous to consider them as two types of one and the same kind of wrong.

4.1 The Wrongs of Direct Discrimination

Specifying why direct discrimination is wrongful has proved to be a surprisingly controversial and difficult task. There is general agreement that the wrong concerns the kind of reason or motive that guides the action of the agent of discrimination: the agent is acting on a reason or motive that is in some way illegitimate or morally tainted. But there are more than a half-dozen distinct views about what the best principle is for drawing the distinction between acts of direct discrimination (in the moralized sense) and those acts that are not wrongful even though the agent takes account of another’s social group membership.

One popular view is that direct discrimination is wrong because the discriminator treats persons on the basis of traits that are immutable and not under the control of the individual possessing them. Thus, Kahlenberg asserts that racial discrimination is unjust because race is such an immutable trait (1996: 54–55). And discrimination based on many forms of disability would seem to fit this view. But Boxill rejects the view, arguing that there are instances in which it is justifiable to treat persons based on features that are beyond their control (1992: 12–17). Denying blind people a driver’s license is not an injustice to them. Moreover, Boxill notes that, if scientists developed a drug that could change a person’s skin color, it would still be unjust to discriminate against people because of their color (1992: 16). Additionally, a paradigmatic ground of discrimination, a person’s religion, is not an immutable trait, nor are some forms of disability. Thus, there are serious problems with the popular view that direct discrimination is wrong due to the immutable nature of the traits on the basis of which the discriminator treats the persons whom he wrongs.

A second view holds that direct discrimination is wrong because it treats persons on the basis of inaccurate stereotypes. When the state of Virginia defended the male-only admissions policy of the Virginia Military Institute (VMI), it introduced expert testimony that there was a strong correlation between sex and the capacity to benefit from the highly disciplined and competitive educational atmosphere of the school: those who benefited from such an atmosphere were, for the most part, men, while women had a strong tendency to thrive in a quite different, cooperative educational environment. This defense involved the premise that the school’s admissions policy was not discriminatory because the policy relied on accurate generalizations about men and women. And in its ruling against VMI, the Supreme Court held that a public policy “must not rely on overbroad generalizations about the different talents, capacities, or preferences of males and females” (U.S. v. Virginia 1996: 533). But the Court went on to argue that “generalizations about ‘the way women are’, estimates of what is appropriate for most women, no longer justify denying opportunity to women whose talent and capacity place them outside the average description” (550; ital. in original).

The Court’s reasoning implies that, even if gender were a very good predictor of the qualities needed to benefit from and be successful at the school, VMI’s admissions policy would still be discriminatory (Schauer 2003: 137–141). Accordingly, on the Court’s view, direct discrimination based on largely accurate gender generalizations can still be wrongful. For example, consider a fire department whose policy is to reject all women applicants for the job of fire fighter, on the grounds that the vast majority of persons having the requisite physical strength for the job are men and that the policy saves the department the time and expense of testing persons unlikely to meet the requirement. Even if the gender generalization underlying the policy is accurate, it is clear that the policy amounts to wrongful discrimination against women, depriving them of their right to equal employment opportunity. Thus, the wrongfulness cannot be explained simply by saying that the generalization is inaccurate.

A third view is that direct discrimination is wrong because it is an arbitrary or irrational way to treat persons. In other words, direct discrimination imposes a disadvantage on a person for a reason that is not a good one, viz., that the person is a member of a certain salient social group. Accordingly, Cotter argues that such discrimination treats people unequally “without rational justification” (2006: 10). Kekes expresses a similar view in condemning race-based affirmative action as “arbitrary” (1995: 200), and, in the same vein, Flew argues that racism is unjust because it treats persons on the basis of traits that “are strictly superficial and properly irrelevant to all, or almost all, questions of social status and employability” (1990: 63–64).

However, many thinkers reject this third view of the wrongness of direct discrimination. Gardner argues that there is no “across-the-board-duty to be rational, so our irrationality as such wrongs no one.” Additionally, Gardner contends that “there patently can be reasons, under some conditions, to discriminate on grounds of race or sex,” even though the conduct in question is wrongful (1998: 168). For example, a restaurant owner might rationally refuse to serve blacks if most of his customers are white racists who would stop patronizing the establishment if blacks were served (1998: 168 and 182). The owner’s actions would be wrong and would amount to a rational form of discrimination. Additionally, Wasserstrom argues that the principle that persons ought not to be treated on the basis of morally arbitrary features cannot grasp the fundamental wrong of direct racial discrimination, because the principle is “too contextually isolated” from the actual features of a society in which many people have racist attitudes (1995: 161). For Wasserstrom, the wrong of racial discrimination cannot be separated from the fact that such discrimination manifests an attitude that the members of certain races are intellectually and morally inferior to the rest of the population.

A fourth view is that direct discrimination is wrong because it fails to treat individuals based on their merits. Thus, Hook argues that hiring decisions based on race, sex, religion and other social categories are wrong because such decisions should be based on who “is best qualified for the post” (1995: 146). In a similar vein, Goldman argues that discriminatory practices are wrong because “the most competent individuals have prima facie rights to positions” (1979: 34).

Opponents of this merit-based view note that it is often highly contestable who the “best qualified” really is, because the criteria determining qualifications are typically vague and do not come with weights attached to them (Wasserman 1998: 807). Additionally, Cavanagh suggests that “hiring on merit has more to do with efficiency than fairness” (2002: 20). Cavanagh also notes that a merit principle cannot explain what is distinctively wrong about an employer who discriminates against blacks because the employer thinks that they are morally or intellectually inferior. The merit approach “makes [the employer’s] behavior look the same as any other way of treating people … non-meritocratically” (2002: 24–25).

A fifth view, defended by Arneson and Lippert-Rasmussen, explains the wrongfulness of discrimination in terms of a certain consequentialist moral theory. The theory rests on the principle that every action ought to maximize overall moral value and incorporates the idea that benefits accruing to persons who are at a lower level of well-being count more toward overall moral value than benefits to those at a higher level. Additionally, the view holds that benefits to persons who are more deserving of them count more than benefits to those who are less deserving (Arneson 1999: 239–40 and Lippert-Rasmussen 2014: 165–83). This approach holds that discrimination is wrong because it violates a rule that would be part of the social morality that maximizes overall moral value. Thus, Arneson writes that his view “can possibly defend nondiscrimination and equal opportunity norms as part of the best consequentialist public morality” (2013: 99). However, for many thinkers, the view will fail to adequately capture a key aspect of discrimination, viz., that discrimination is not simply wrong but that it is a wrong to the persons who are discriminated against. One might argue in defense of Arneson that those who are victimized by discrimination can claim that they deserve the opportunity that is denied them, but philosophers like Cavanagh, who object to the merit approach, will have the same objections to such a defense (Cavanagh 2002: 20 and 24–25).

A sixth view, developed by Moreau, regards direct discrimination as wrong because it violates the equal entitlement each person has to freedom. In particular, she contends that “the interest that is injured by discrimination is our interest in … deliberative freedoms: that is, freedoms to have our decisions about how to live insulated from the effects of normatively extraneous features of us, such as our skin color or gender” (2010: 147). Normatively extraneous features are “traits that we believe persons should not have to factor into their deliberations …as costs.” For example, “people should not be constrained by the social costs of being one race rather than another when they deliberate about such questions as what job to take or where to live” (2010: 149).

Yet, it is unclear that Moreau’s account gets to the bottom of what is wrong with discrimination. One might object, following the criticisms leveled by Wasserstrom and Cavanagh at the arbitrariness and merit accounts, respectively, that the idea of a normatively extraneous feature is too abstract to capture what makes racial discrimination a paradigmatic form of direct discrimination. There are reasons that justify our belief “that persons should not have to factor [race] into their deliberations …as costs,” and those reasons seem to be connected to the idea that racial discrimination treats persons of a certain race as having a diminished or degraded moral status as compared to individuals belonging to other races. The wrong of racial and other forms of discrimination seems better illuminated by understanding it in terms of such degraded status than in terms of the idea of normatively extraneous features.

A seventh view, developed by Hellman, holds that “discrimination is wrong because it is demeaning” (2018: 99). On her account, an act that is demeaning in the relevant way is one that “expresses that a person or group is of lower [moral] status” and is performed by an agent who has “sufficient social power for the expression to have force” (2018: 102). For example, it is demeaning, she argues, for an employer to require female employees to wear cosmetics because such a requirement “conveys the idea that a woman’s body is for adornment and enjoyment by others” (2008: 42). Shin proposes a similar account in his discussion of equal protection, arguing that “to characterize an action as unequal treatment is to register a certain objection as to what, in view of its rationale, the action expresses” (2009: 170). Offending actions are ones that treat a person “as though that individual belonged to some class of individuals that was less entitled to right treatment than anyone else” (2009:169). And this seventh view of what makes discrimination wrongful is reflected in the legal case Obergefell v. Hodges, decided by the U.S. Supreme Court and declaring unconstitutional laws prohibiting same-sex marriage. In his opinion for the Court, Justice Kennedy wrote that “the necessary consequence [of such laws] is to put the imprimatur of the State itself on an exclusion that soon demeans or stigmatizes those whose own liberty is then denied. Under the Constitution, same-sex couples seek in marriage the same legal treatment as opposite-sex couples, and it would disparage their choices and diminish their personhood to deny them this right” (2015: Slip Opinion at 19).

Closely related to Hellman’s account is an eighth view, holding that direct discrimination is wrong on account of its connection to prejudice, where prejudice is understood as an attitude that regards the members of a salient group, qua members, as not entitled to as much respect or concern as the members of other salient groups. Prejudice can involve feelings of hostility, antipathy, or indifference, as well as a belief in the inferior morals, intellect, or skills of the targeted group. Returning to the case of the Roma who were excluded by the policy of a bar, we could say that the policy was discriminatory because it was the expression of prejudice against the Roma, whereas a bar’s policy of excluding men from the women’s restroom would fail to be discriminatory because it would not be an expression of prejudice.

Ely defends a version of this eighth view, holding that discriminatory acts are those that are motivated by prejudice (1980: 153–159). Dworkin has formulated an alternative version, arguing that discriminatory acts are those that could be justified only if some prejudiced belief were correct. The absence of a “prejudice-free justification” thus makes a law or policy discriminatory (1985: 66).

The eighth view, along with the accounts of Hellman and Shin, rest on the intuitively attractive idea that the wrongfulness of direct discrimination is tied to its denial of the equal moral status of persons. The idea is at the center of Eidelson’s account, which holds that “acts of discrimination are intrinsically wrong when and because they manifest a failure to show the discriminatees the respect that is due them as persons” (2015: 7). Eidelson then disaggregates two dimensions of personhood: all persons are 1) “of [intrinsic] value and equally so” and 2) “autonomous agents” (2015: 79), shaping their own lives through their choices. Discrimination can violate either or both of these dimensions, leading Eidelson to describe his account as a “pluralistic view” (2015: 19; cf. Beeghly on “hybrid” theories, 2018: 95). Thus, a physician who refuses to treat would-be patients due to their race fails to recognize and appropriately respond to their equal intrinsic value, and a fire department that automatically rejects women who apply to be fire fighters violates the women’s autonomy by failing to make reasonable efforts to determine whether they have endeavored to develop the requisite physical strength.

Eidelson’s account explicitly dispenses with the social salience requirement, instead requiring only that the discriminator be responding to some perceived difference of whatever kind between the victim and other people. However, it is not clear that this approach can draw a viable line between wrongful acts of discrimination, on the one hand, and wrongful acts not helpfully characterized as “discrimination,” on the other. Murderers fail to respect the personhood of their victims, and most murders involve some perception of difference between the victim and others. But murders are typically regarded as acts of discrimination only when they are “hate crimes” connected to the victim’s membership in some salient social group. So Eidelson’s account seems overinclusive. Yet, Eidelson can reply that any account that incorporates the social salience requirement will be underinclusive, because it will fail to count as discrimination the actions of an employer who hires workers on the basis of hair color in a society where hair color is not socially salient (2018: 28–30).

At this point, we should step back and ask: Why do we need the (moralized) idea of discrimination in the first place? What is the value of having it? For Eidelson, its value seems to reside in picking out certain wrongs, quite apart from any connection those wrongs might, or might not, have to socially systemic injustices. But we have concepts for murder and other wrongs against personhood, and, if we abstract from socially systemic considerations, the fact that the wrongs involve distinguishing among persons does not appear to carry much moral significance in typical cases. If I steal from you rather than your neighbor because you have taken fewer precautions against theft, then I have wrongfully shown disrespect for your autonomy, but my having discriminated between you and your neighbor seems beside the point, morally speaking.

For defenders of the social salience requirement, the value of the idea of discrimination is that it can be used to pick out and highlight injustices that track socially salient categories. And a strong reason for having a concept that captures such injustices is that they are the among the most widespread and serious over the course of history (see section 6 below). From this perspective, Eidelson’s hypothetical case of the idiosyncratic employer who discriminates on the basis of hair color should not dictate how the core of the moralized concept of discrimination is constructed or construed but rather should be regarded as peripheral to the central reason for having a concept of discrimination. Additionally, as we will see in the next section, this perspective casts light on why the idea of indirect discrimination is a valuable part of our moral thinking.

4.2 The Wrongs of Indirect Discrimination

The most egregious forms of indirect discrimination are typically structural, due to the pervasive impact of a society’s basic institutions on the life-prospects of its members (Rawls 1971: 7). Indirect discrimination is structural when the rules and norms of society consistently produce disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes for the members of a certain group, relative to the other groups in society, the outcomes are unjust to the members of the disadvantaged group, and the production of the outcomes is to be explained by the group membership of those individuals. Cass Sunstein nicely captures the wrong of this form of indirect discrimination in the course of explaining his antidiscrimination principle, which he calls the “anticaste principle.” He writes, “The motivating idea [for the anticaste principle] is that without good reason, social and legal structures should not turn differences that are both highly visible and irrelevant from the moral point of view into systematic social disadvantages. A systematic disadvantage is one that operates along standard and predictable lines in multiple and important spheres of life” (1994: 2429). In a similar vein, Catharine MacKinnon finds structural discrimination against women to be intolerable because it consists of “the systematic relegation of an entire group of people to a condition of inferiority” (1987: 41).

Two related wrongs belonging to structural discrimination can be distinguished. First is the wrong that consists of society’s major institutions imposing, without adequate justification, relative disadvantages on persons belonging to certain salient social groups. Accordingly, it is wrong for society’s basic rules to deny to women or to racial or religious minorities opportunities for personal freedom, development, and flourishing equal to those that men or racial and religious majorities enjoy. Second is the wrong of placing the members of a salient social group in a position of vulnerability to exploitation and domination as a result of the denial of equal opportunities and the imposition of other kinds of relative disadvantage. Accordingly, it is wrong for a society to make women vulnerable to sexual exploitation and domination at the hands of men by the imposition of various economic and social disadvantages relative to men.

In contrast, the wrongs of non-structural forms of indirect discrimination seem to be dependent on structural (or direct) discrimination. Consider the Griggs case. The company’s promotion policy was not part of the wrong involved in society’s basic institutions imposing relative disadvantages on blacks. But the policy did have some connection to structural racial discrimination and to the widespread direct discrimination against blacks that existed prior to and contemporaneous with the policy. The policy helped to perpetuate the unjust disadvantages that were due to such structural and direct discrimination, even though the policy was not needed to serve any legitimate business purpose, and that was why the policy was wrong. Or at least that is what the proponents of the idea of indirect discrimination appear to have in mind when they talk about non-structural forms of indirect discrimination.

Are the wrongs of indirect discrimination sufficiently similar to the wrongs of direct discrimination that it is reasonable to say that they are, in fact, two different types of one and the same wrong? We have seen that the accounts of the wrong of direct discrimination are many and various. But abstracting from those differences, critics of the idea of indirect discrimination might argue that discrimination is essentially a process-based wrong, rather than an outcome-based one, and that only direct discrimination is process-based. In other words, only with direct discrimination is there a defect in how some outcome is brought about, rather than in what the outcome itself is. On this view, discriminating against people is similar to having someone who has been bribed serve as a judge in an ice-skating competition: just as the biased judging taints the process by which places are awarded in the competition, discrimination taints the process by which opportunities and other social goods get distributed among the members of society.

However, one can understand indirect discrimination as involving process-based wrongs, although the wrongs do not necessarily occur at the retail level of the practical reasoning of specific agents. Consider the structural form of indirect discrimination. Disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes do not, by themselves, amount to structural discrimination, even when those outcomes fall on the shoulders of the members of a salient social group such as women or racial or religious minorities. There must also be a linkage between membership in the group and the disadvantageous outcomes: group membership must help explain why the disproportionately disadvantageous outcomes fall where they do. This explanation will proceed at the wholesale level of macro-social facts about the population and the various groups that constitute it. But the requirement of a linkage shows that how the disproportionate outcomes are brought about is essential to the existence of structural discrimination. There must be social processes at work that, as Sunstein puts its, “turn differences that are both highly visible and irrelevant from the moral point of view into systematic social disadvantages” (1994: 2429). It is true that the differences do not need to be literally visible; they need only be socially salient. But the main point is that there is something morally wrong with social processes that consistently but avoidably turn such differences into relative disadvantages for the members of salient groups, such as women or racial or religious groups. A parallel is thereby established with direct discrimination, in which there is something morally wrong with a practical-reasoning process that treats sex, race, or religion as grounds for treating persons as having a degraded or diminished moral status.

With the non-structural form of indirect discrimination, the parallel to the wrong of direct discrimination is even stronger, because the morally flawed process does occur at the retail level. In Griggs, the company’s decision to use certain exams to determine promotions contributed to the unjust disadvantages suffered by blacks from structural and direct discrimination. Yet, the use of the exams was apparently not necessary to determine who could best perform the jobs in question or to meet any other legitimate purpose of the business. It is plausible to say, then, that the company’s decision process wrongly counted for nothing the promotion policy’s contribution to the perpetuation and even exacerbation of unjust disadvantages from which blacks already suffered. This process-based wrong is at the level of a specific agent, albeit a collective agent. The difference with direct discrimination is that it is a moral failure of omission, i.e., failing to take appropriate account of the impact of the promotion policy on blacks, rather than a failure of commission, such as deliberately excluding blacks from better-paying positions. In either case, though, an agent has engaged in a morally flawed process of practical reasoning in which the flaw concerns the role that considerations of salient group membership play.

There is a case to be made, then, that the wrongs of indirect discrimination, structural and non-structural, are importantly parallel to those of direct discrimination. The case will look less convincing to Eidelson (2015: 28–30) and others who think of (moralized) discrimination as fundamentally a retail-level wrong with no necessary connection to socially-salient groups. For those thinkers, it might be an injustice if the basic structure of a society operates so that certain socially-salient groups lack equality of opportunity, but the injustice is not necessarily a matter of discrimination. Yet, for thinkers who would contend that the value of the idea of discrimination derives from the fact that it can pick out systemic wrongs linked in a certain way to socially-salient groups, then direct and indirect discrimination represent distinct but parallel versions of the same type of wrong, and the term ‘indirect discrimination’ is not simply “a piece of legal jargon” (Eidelson 2015: 19) but a valuable term in our moral lexicon.

5. Which Groups Count?

According to the account on offer in this entry, discrimination wrongfully imposes relative disadvantages or deprivations on persons based on their membership in some salient social group. But which salient groups count for the purpose of determining whether an act is an act of discrimination? This question is at the heart of many heated political and legal disputes, such as the controversies over the rights of gays and trans persons. The question is also central to a matter that is less politically prominent than such disputes but which has important political and philosophical implications. The question is whether or not the members of socially dominant groups can, in principle, be victims of discrimination. It is sometimes said that, in the United States and other Western countries, whites cannot really be discriminated against on account of their race, because whites are the socially dominant racial group whose members are systematically advantaged by their being white. Thus, in his account of racial discrimination, Scanlon acknowledges that his view entails that, in the U.S., at least, whites can discriminate against blacks but not vice-versa. He holds that discrimination is “unidirectional, [applying] only to actions that disadvantage members of a group that has been subject to widespread denigrations and exclusion.” This implication derives from his claim that it is “crucial to racial discrimination … that the prejudicial judgments it involves are not just the idiosyncratic attitudes of a particular agent but are widely shared in the society in question and commonly expressed and acted on in ways that have serious consequences” (2008: 73–74). The idea that discrimination is unidirectional is also implied by Fiss’s understanding of discrimination in terms of “the perpetual subordination” of “specially disadvantaged groups …[whose] political power is severely circumscribed” (1976: 154–155).

Although is it undeniable that the members of socially dominant groups typically enjoy a host of unfair advantages, it might be a mistake to hold that such persons cannot be victims of discrimination. Belief in the moral inferiority of the members of other racial groups is not exclusive to dominant groups. Although he subsequently repudiated the view, Malcolm X famously regarded whites as a race of devils, and the belief was not some idiosyncrasy of his but rather a doctrine of the Nation of Islam. Moreover, subordinate group members are sometimes in position to deny members of a dominant group employment or other valuable opportunities. When such opportunities are denied based on a belief in the moral inferiority of the dominant group, it would seem that the dominant group members have been discriminated against.

Scanlon and others might argue that the unidirectional view fits better than a bidirectional one with the main reason for having a concept of discrimination, viz., to pick out systemic injustices linked to membership in a socially salient group. The discriminatory actions of dominant group members typically combine to create such injustices, while actions of subordinate group members wrongly disfavoring on the basis of prejudiced attitudes persons in the dominant group fail to combine in that way.

However, history shows that there are certain kinds of social identities on whose basis persons have often been condemned as moral inferiors and victimized by serious systemic injustice. Those identities are tied to race, religion, race, nationality, ethnicity, and sexual orientation, among other social categories incorporated into reasonable antidiscrimination principles. Wrongs done to persons in a dominant group on the ground that their group consists of morally inferior beings is not the same as the discriminatory wrongs that combine to create serious systemic injustice, but there is more than a passing resemblance between the two sets of wrongs. And shifts in the relative power positions of groups in a society can readily transmute wrongs against a dominant group into ones against a subordinate group, especially when the wrongs are driven by beliefs about groups moral inferiority/superiority. Perhaps, then, we should say that the central cases of discrimination are ones perpetrated against subordinate group members but that dominant groups members can also be discriminated against, even though wrongs of the latter sort do not typically combine to form systemic injustices at the broad social level.

Perhaps the most heated of contemporary debates over the question of which social groups count for purposes of determining whether or not an act is an act of discrimination are those concerning sexual orientation and gender presentation. Many persons hold the view that it is discrimination whenever LGBTQ persons are denied the same set of legal rights and powers that heterosexual and cis-gender persons have, but others reject such a view. Philosophers and political theorists can be found on both sides of this divide, although the predominant view among such thinkers is that it is discriminatory to deny LGBTQ persons the same legal rights and powers that others enjoy (Macedo 1996; Corvino 2017; Mikkola 2018; Brief of Philosophy Professors 2019, and, dissenting, Finnis 1997 and Anderson and Girgis 2017). These debates are ultimately ones of moral principle, resting on the question of whether government wrongs LGBTQ persons if it denies them any such rights or powers. The concept of discrimination cannot, by itself, settle the question, because the concept only tells us that it is properly applied to the imposition of wrongful disadvantages on account of salient group membership. The concept does not specify whether it is wrongful to impose disadvantages on persons on account of their sexual orientation, gender presentation, or any other particular social category. Substantive moral reasoning is needed to address the matter (see section 8 below).

6. What Good is the Concept of Discrimination?

The concept of discrimination picks out a kind of moral wrong that is a function of the salient social group membership of the person wronged: persons are treated as though they had diminished or degraded moral status on account of their group membership, or they are, because of their group membership and the relative disadvantages that they suffer due to that membership, made vulnerable to domination and oppression. But why have such a concept? Why not simply have the concepts of domination, oppression, and degrading treatment, abstracting from whether or not the reasons for such wrongs involve group membership?

Until the middle of the 19th century, critical moral reflection and discussion proceeded largely without the concept of discrimination. But over the course of the first half of the 20th century, moral reflection became increasingly sensitive to the fact that many, even most, of the large-scale injustices in history had a group-based structure: certain members of society were identified by others as belonging to a particular salient group; the group members were consistently denigrated and demeaned by the rest of society and by its official organs; and many serious relative disadvantages connected to this denigration and demeaning, such as material deprivation and extreme restrictions on liberty, were imposed on the members of the denigrated group. It is this historical reality, apparently deeply rooted in human social life and in the tendency of humans to form in-groups and out-groups, that gives the concept of discrimination its point and its usefulness. The concept highlights the group-structure of those unjust deprivations and restrictions.

At the same time, the group structure of these injustices does not mean that the group as such is the party that is wronged; rather, the wrongs are ultimately wrongs to the individual persons making up the group. Accordingly, the concept of discrimination has become a useful tool for representing many serious wrongs, while avoiding the implication that these wrongs are ultimately done to the groups as such.

However, this understanding of the significance of the concept of discrimination is challenged by Young, who claims that the concept is inadequate for capturing group-based wrongs. She argues that the concept “tends to present the injustices groups suffer as aberrant, the exception rather than the rule.” Accordingly, she contends that “[i]f one focuses on discrimination as the primary wrong that groups suffer, then the more profound wrongs of exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism, and violence that we still suffer go undiscussed and unaddressed.” (1990: 196–97)

Nonetheless, contra Young’s understanding, discrimination against the members of a group can be, and often is, systemic. The reason is that wrongs against individuals on account of their group membership, especially when perpetrated by members of dominant groups, are often not aberrant but form broad social patterns. Accordingly, the idea of discrimination can capture the systemic wrongs to which Young refers, while preserving the key moral thought that the wrongs are done to individuals. Thus, discrimination typically involves exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness and so on, where those wrongs are perpetrated against individuals and, at the same time, track salient social categories.

Yet, Young is right insofar as she is claiming that systemic wrongs can persist even as direct discrimination recedes: indirect discrimination can, as we have seen, amplify and perpetuate the wrongful harms of diminishing direct discrimination. Additionally, Young correctly suggests that the idea of discrimination is too weak to adequately capture certain sorts of extreme systemic maltreatment and abuse. When disadvantageous treatment exceeds a certain level of severity, it is no longer suitable simply to speak of discrimination. Enslavement and genocide are forms of wrongful discrimination, but because of the extremity of the mistreatment they involve, it would be morally obtuse to characterize them as discrimination and leave the matter at that. Clear-headed moral thinking demands that their extremity be registered in how they are characterized, and the idea of discrimination is not, by itself, equipped for the task. Accordingly, the invention of the term ‘genocide’ by Raphael Lemkin (1944 [1973: 79]) and the opprobrium that later attached to it were important steps forward in understanding the distinctions among the different ways in which humans abuse one another on the basis of the salient groups to which they belong.

7. Intersectionality

Kimberlé Crenshaw (1998 [1989]) introduced the idea of intersectionality in her account of the distinctive form of discrimination faced by black women. Intersectionality refers to the fact that one and the same person can belong to several distinct groups, each of whose members are victimized by widespread discrimination. This overlapping membership can generate experiences of discrimination that are very different from those of persons who belong to just one, or the other, of the groups. Thus, Crenshaw argues that “any analysis that does not take intersectionality into account cannot sufficiently address the particular manner in which Black women are subordinated” (1998: 315).

Crenshaw’s idea of intersectionality applies beyond race and gender to cover any social groups against which discrimination is directed: discrimination is inflected in different ways depending on the particular combination of social groups to which those persons discriminated against belong. And one implication of intersectionality is that the disadvantages suffered by some persons who are discriminated against on account of belonging to a certain group might be offset, partially or fully, by advantages those same persons gain by being discriminated in favor of due to their belonging to other groups. As Crenshaw notes, women who are wealthy and white are “race- and class-privileged,” even as they are disadvantaged by their gender (1998: 314).

The idea of intersectionality threatens to destabilize the concept of discrimination. The idea highlights what is problematic about any account of discrimination that abstracts from how different salient identities converge to shape the experiences of persons. But, taken to the hilt, the idea of intersectionality might appear to undermine any feasible account of discrimination. Reflection on Crenshaw’s own intersectional account illustrates the point: she examines the intersection of race and gender but abstracts from other salient social identities, such as disability status, sexual orientation, and religion. Any of those additional identities can and do converge with race and gender to form distinctive experiences of discrimination, and so abstracting from those identities seems problematic from the perspective that the idea of intersectionality opens to us. Yet, no feasible treatment can take into account all of those identities and the many more socially salient identities that persons have in contemporary societies.

Nonetheless, judgments about discrimination can and do reveal genuine wrongs that persons suffer due to their salient group membership and expose actual patterns of disadvantage and deprivation that amount to systemic injustices against the members of certain salient groups. It is not necessary to take account of everything relevant to a phenomenon in order to understand and represent important aspects of it. Thus, notwithstanding the complications introduced by intersectionality, judgments about direct and indirect discrimination can tell us something important about who is wrongfully disfavored, and who is wrongfully favored, by the actions of individual and collective agents and by the rules of society’s major institutions.

8. Religious Liberty and Antidiscrimination Laws

Like the right against discrimination, the right of religious liberty is enshrined in many domestic and international legal documents. Yet, the two rights often seem to be in conflict with each other. For claims of religious liberty are frequently made by persons who wish to engage in activities that appear to amount to discrimination. Of particular importance are cases in which religious institutions and religiously-motivated individuals claim to be exempt from the requirements of antidiscrimination laws.

Claims of religious exemption to antidiscrimination laws have recently become the center of political and legal controversy in the U.S. as a result of the Obergefell case, in which the Supreme Court found a constitutional right to same-sex marriage. However, questions regarding the legal and moral validity of religious exemptions to such laws extend well beyond the issue of same-sex marriage. Moreover, many liberal thinkers who support antidiscrimination laws balk at the idea that the laws ought to be applied willy-nilly to all religious institutions and religiously-motivated persons (Barry 2001: 174–76; Eisgruber and Sager 2007: 65; Greenawalt 1998: 118; Nussbaum 1999: 114; Galston 2002: 111; Laborde 2017: 175–90).

In the Hosanna-Tabor case (2012), the U.S. Supreme Court unanimously held that, under the Constitution, there was a “ministerial exception” immunizing religious organizations from lawsuits brought against them by employees claiming that they had been illegally discriminated against by the organization. The exception applies in the paradigmatic case to employees who perform religious functions, such as ministers and priests, but the Court in Hosanna-Tabor ruled that the exception also applied in the case of a church employee whose job was the teaching of secular subjects. The employee had brought her lawsuit under a statute prohibiting employment discrimination on the basis of disability. The Court held that the church was immune to the suit.

Chambers rejects the ministerial exception, even when it is limited to employees who perform spiritual functions. Accordingly, she argues that the Roman Catholic Church should be legally prohibited, on the ground of “the fundamental value of gender equality” (2008: 141), from ordaining only men. She points to the harms suffered by women who wish to become priests but also the damage done to children who are taught by their Church that “women are not fit to lead their fellow worshippers” (141). And Chambers contends that “gender equality is … of sufficient importance to merit [legal] intervention” (144) in a religious organization’s choice of spiritual leaders.

By contrast, Laborde contends that “the government cannot [legitimately] force the Roman Catholic Church to ordain female clergy, as long as the established doctrine of the church is that only men can be priests” (2017: 180). She argues that, if a certain group is a voluntary association “that individuals join to pursue a conception of the good that is central to their identity,” then the group has a valid claim to “some immunity from the reach of antidiscrimination legislation” (174). Such immunity enables the members “to live with integrity,” i.e., to live in accordance with “their deep commitments and beliefs” (174). Laborde adds that any group claiming an exemption from antidiscrimination law can be legitimately required to openly profess the discriminatory doctrine that is the basis for its claim.

At the same time, Laborde rejects the scope of the ministerial exception as presented in Hosanna-Tabor. She contends that the Court’s ruling grants religious groups “an exorbitant right” (177) that exceeds their valid moral claim to choose their own leaders and members. Contra the ruling, Laborde does not think that the claim holds against the teachers of secular subjects at church schools or any other employees whose jobs do not consist in religious work. Laborde agrees with the Court that the secular judiciary should not address theological questions, but she rejects the Court’s view that it is beyond the jurisdiction of the judiciary to examine whether a proffered non-discriminatory theological reason for an employment decision is merely a pretext for some hidden discriminatory motive.

Watson and Hartley also reject Chamber’s view that the Catholic Church should be legally forced to ordain women, arguing that her view does not hold for a pluralist society in which a church that refuses to ordain women is “one among many” (2018: 123), and “varied views about sex and gender” (124) are held across the society’s religious institutions. Watson and Hartley write that the doctrine of the male-only priesthood “is not benign when it comes to the status of women as free and equal citizens, but its affect is blunted in the background culture by various other views ” (124).

Claims for religious exemptions from antidiscrimination laws have also been made, not just by organizations, but by individuals acting on the basis of their faith. Watson and Hartley consider a case in which a wedding vendor refuses her services to same-sex couples, invoking her religious belief that same-sex relationships are inherently sinful (cf. Masterpiece Cakeshop: 2018). The vendor claims an exemption from a law that prohibits discrimination on the basis of sexual orientation. Watson and Hartley argue that such an exemption is illegitimate, even if same-sex couples can avail themselves of the services of other vendors in the area. The vendor’s claim to an exemption is a violation of the reciprocal respect that each citizen owes their fellow citizens, because the vendor is asking government to act in a way that cannot be justified to persons in same-sex relationships as equal citizens. In the view of Watson and Hartley, the claim to an exemption rests on the premise that same-sex relationships are inherently inferior to heterosexual ones. They argue that such a premise is not admissible as a valid reason for the policies of government, which, as a matter of justice, must justify its actions to all its citizens in a way that respects their equality. And it is not reasonable to think that anyone in a same-sex relationship can accept the premise of inferiority. More generally, Watson and Hartley contend that “allowing public discrimination on the basis of factors such as sexual orientation, sex, or race creates a kind of second-class citizenship” (2018: 117-118), which violates the demands of justice.

Vallier develops an approach that is more accommodating of religious exemptions. He writes that exemptions are justified “in a wide array of cases,” perhaps including that of “bakers [of wedding cakes] who wish to deny service to homosexual couples on religious grounds” (2016: 17). Vallier explains that the bakers have a reason, from their point of view, to oppose an antidiscrimination law that protects same-sex couples. Moreover, the reason is both intelligible to any reasonable member of the public, and, because the reason is rooted in “projects and principles that possess great normative weight” (14) for the bakers, it is sufficient from their perspective to reject the law as applied to them. On Vallier’s account, the bakers, then, merit an exemption, as long as the exemption “does not impose significant costs on other parties that require redress” (3).

Vallier understands that many people will argue that the exemption does in fact impose significant harms on same-sex couples denied services afforded heterosexual couples, but he responds to that argument by citing “more traditional liberal views” on which “a denial of service will not count as harmful because, in nearly all of the relevant cases, gay and lesbian couples have dozens of affordable alternative venues to purchase wedding cakes” (18).

Watson and Hartley reject the “more traditional liberal views”on the ground that, even if there are alternative venues at which same-sex couples can be served, the couples are still treated as second-class citizens, because they are denied on grounds of the alleged inferiority of their partnership the full range of services offered to the public. Vallier might reply that equal citizenship is secured as long as the couples have alternative venues, but it is not clear how convincing such a reply is, given his admission that the actions of the bakers “can stigmatize homosexual couples through their denial of service” (17). It would seem that the stigma amounts to a stamp of inferiority, publicly-enacted through exclusionary actions and affixed to persons in same-sex partnerships, regardless of the availability to them of alternative venues.

At the same time, Vallier might argue that his analysis of the case of the bakers is on all fours with Watson and Hartley’s account of the male-only priesthood case, in which they contend that an exemption is legitimate: the effect of the bakers’ views on same-sex couples, he might say, “is blunted in the background culture by various other views” (Watson and Hartley 2018: 124) and by the availability of alternative venues for the couples.

However, Watson and Hartley would reply that there is an important distinction between a church, which is a “private association, composed of individuals who affirm, roughly, the same doctrine,” while a bake shop is a “business of public accommodation” (125). Yet, the question arises: If the social effects on gender inequality of the Catholic Church’s male-only priesthood can be sufficiently blunted by the background culture, why are the parallel effects of anti-gay bake shops on the equal citizenship of gays not likewise blunted?

It seems that, for Watson and Hartley, the decisive consideration in the bake shop/wedding vendor cases is not a matter of causal effects on society but rather of how persons are treated in the public sphere, where citizens owe one another treatment as free and equal persons. Watson and Hartley regard the bake shop and all other commercial enterprises that offer goods and services to the general public as belonging to the public sphere, and they contend that the denial of services on grounds of sexual orientation violates what citizens owe one another in that sphere, because such a denial constitutes treating citizens in same-sex partnerships as inferior to citizens in heterosexual ones.

Vallier’s view requires a different account of what citizens owe each other. The “more traditional liberal views” to which he refers contend that commercial enterprises should be placed in the private sphere and that antidiscrimination laws applying to privately-owned businesses are thereby illegitimate (see Epstein 1995 and the Civil Rights Cases 1883). But Vallier does not appear to embrace that aspect of the traditional liberal views, instead arguing that the disparaging treatment of gays by the bakers is made permissible (in part) by the fact that gays can receive service at other bake shops. The underlying premise appears to be that it is not really a duty of citizens to treat one another as equals, even in the public sphere. For if the bakers did have a duty to treat all of their fellow citizens, including gays, as equals in that sphere, then the bakers could not be relieved of the duty on the ground that there were other citizen-bakers who did treat gays as equals. I am not morally licensed to treat you with disrespect if only there are many others who treat you respectfully. So the disagreement between Vallier and Watson/Hartley seems to come down to the issue of exactly what duties citizens owe one another, which in turn rests on the large question of what a society of free and equal citizens would look like.

9. Conclusion

The concept of discrimination provides a way of thinking about a certain kind of wrong that can be found in virtually every society and era. The wrong involves a group-based structure that works in combination with relative deprivations built around the structure. The deprivations are wrongful because they treat persons as having a degraded moral status, but also because the deprivations tend to make members of the group in question vulnerable to domination and oppression at the hands of those who occupy positions of relative advantage. It is true that there has been confusion attending the concept of discrimination, and there will long be debates about the best way to understand and apply it. However, the concept has proved to be a useful one for representing in thought and combating in action a kind of wrong that is deeply entrenched in human social relations.


Legal Cases and Documents

  • Abdulaziz et al. v. U.K. European Court of Human Rights, App. No. 9214/80; decided 28 May 1985. [Available online]
  • Brief of the Philosophy Professors as Amici Curiae in Support of the Employees, Bostock v. Clayton County, No. 17-1618. 2019. [Available online]
  • Brown v. Board of Education 347 U.S. 483 (1954). [Available online]
  • Civil Rights Act of 1866. [Available online]
  • Civil Rights Cases 109 U.S. 3 (1883). [Available online]
  • Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (CEDAW). [Available online]
  • Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination (CERD). [Available online]
  • European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights. [Available online]
  • Griggs v. Duke Power 401 U.S. 424 (1974). [Available online]
  • Hosanna-Tabor v. EEOC 565 U.S. 1. (2012). [Available online]
  • Obergefell v. Hodges 576 U.S. ___ (2015). [Available online]
  • Shanaghan v. U.K. European Court of Human Rights, App. No. 37715/97; decided 4 May 2001. [Available online]
  • United States v. Virginia 518 U.S. 515 (1996), [Available online]


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