First published Tue Mar 27, 2001; substantive revision Mon Apr 26, 2021

This article is concerned with social and political equality. In its prescriptive usage, ‘equality’ is a highly contested concept. Its normally positive connotation gives it a rhetorical power suitable for use in political slogans (Westen 1990). At least since the French Revolution, equality has served as one of the leading ideals of the body politic; in this respect, it is at present probably the most controversial of the great social ideals. There is controversy concerning the precise notion of equality, the relation of justice and equality (the principles of equality), the material requirements and measure of the ideal of equality (equality of what?), the extension of equality (equality among whom?), and its status within a comprehensive (liberal) theory of justice (the value of equality). This article will discuss each of these issues in turn.

1. Defining the Concept

‘Equality’ is a contested concept: “People who praise it or disparage it disagree about what they are praising or disparaging” (Dworkin 2000, p. 2). Our first task is therefore to provide a clear definition of equality in the face of widespread misconceptions about its meaning as a political idea. The terms ‘equality’ (Greek: isotes; Latin: aequitas, aequalitas; French: égalité; German Gleichheit), ‘equal’, and ‘equally’ signify a qualitative relationship. ‘Equality’ (or ‘equal’) signifies correspondence between a group of different objects, persons, processes or circumstances that have the same qualities in at least one respect, but not all respects, i.e., regarding one specific feature, with differences in other features. ‘Equality’ must then be distinguished from ‘identity’, which refers to one and the same object corresponding to itself in all its features. For the same reason, it needs to be distinguished from ‘similarity’ – the concept of merely approximate correspondence (Dann 1975, p. 997; Menne 1962, p. 44 ff.; Westen 1990, pp. 39, 120). Thus, to say that men are equal, for example, is not to say that they are identical. Equality implies similarity rather than ‘sameness’.

Judgements of equality presume a difference between the things compared. According to this definition, the notion of ‘complete’ or ‘absolute’ equality may be seen as problematic because it would violate the presumption of a difference. Two non-identical objects are never completely equal; they are different at least in their spatiotemporal location. If things do not differ they should not be called ‘equal’, but rather, more precisely, ‘identical’, such as the morning and the evening star. Here usage might vary. Some authors do consider absolute qualitative equality admissible as a borderline concept (Tugendhat & Wolf 1983, p. 170).

‘Equality’ can be used in the very same sense both to describe and prescribe, as with ‘thin’: “you are thin” and “you are too thin”. The approach taken to defining the standard of comparison for both descriptive and prescriptive assertions of equality is very important (Oppenheim 1970). In the descriptive case, the common standard is itself descriptive, for example when two people are said to have the same weight. In the prescriptive use, the standard prescribes a norm or rule, for example when it is said people ought to be equal before the law. The standards grounding prescriptive assertions of equality contain at least two components. On the one hand, there is a descriptive component, since the assertions need to contain descriptive criteria, in order to identify those people to which the rule or norm applies. The question of this identification – who belongs to which category? – may itself be normative, as when we ask to whom the U.S. laws apply. On the other hand, the comparative standards contain something normative – a moral or legal rule, such as the U.S. laws – specifying how those falling under the norm are to be treated. Such a rule constitutes the prescriptive component (Westen 1990, chap. 3). Sociological and economic analyses of (in-)equality mainly pose the questions of how inequalities can be determined and measured and what their causes and effects are. In contrast, social and political philosophy is in general concerned mainly with the following questions: what kind of equality, if any, should obtain, and with respect to whom and when? Such is the case in this article as well.

‘Equality’ and ‘equal’ are incomplete predicates that necessarily generate one question: equal in what respect? (Rae 1980,p. 132 f.) Equality essentially consists of a tripartite relation between two (or several) objects or persons and one (or several) qualities. Two objects A and B are equal in a certain respect if, in that respect, they fall under the same general term. ‘Equality’ denotes the relation between the objects compared. Every comparison presumes a tertium comparationis, a concrete attribute defining the respect in which the equality applies – equality thus referring to a common sharing of this comparison-determining attribute. This relevant comparative standard represents a ‘variable’ (or ‘index’) of the concept of equality that needs to be specified in each particular case (Westen 1990, p. 10); differing conceptions of equality here emerge from one or another descriptive or normative moral standard. There is another source of diversity as well: As Temkin (1986, 1993, 2009) argues, various different standards might be used to measure inequality, with the respect in which people are compared remaining constant. The difference between a general concept and different specific conceptions (Rawls 1971, p. 21 f.) of equality may explain why some people claim ‘equality’ has no unified meaning – or is even devoid of meaning. (Rae 1981, p. 127 f., 132 f.)

For this reason, it helps to think of the idea of equality or inequality, in the context of social justice, not as a single principle, but as a complex group of principles forming the basic core of today’s egalitarianism. Different principles yield different answers. Both equality and inequality are complex and multifaceted concepts (Temkin 1993, chap. 2). In any real historical context, it is clear that no single notion of equality can sweep the field (Rae 1981, p. 132). Many egalitarians concede that much of our discussion of the concept is vague, but they believe there is also a common underlying strain of important moral concerns implicit in it (Williams 1973). Above all, it serves to remind us of our common humanity, despite various differences (cf. 2.3. below). In this sense, egalitarianism is often thought of as a single, coherent normative doctrine that embraces a variety of principles. Following the introduction of different principles and theories of equality, the discussion will return in the last section to the question how best to define egalitarianism and its core value.

2. Principles of Equality and Justice

Equality in its prescriptive usage is closely linked to morality and justice, and distributive justice in particular. Since antiquity equality has been considered a constitutive feature of justice. (On the history of the concept, cf. Albernethy 1959, Benn 1967, Brown 1988, Dann 1975, Thomson 1949.) People and movements throughout history have used the language of justice to contest inequalities. But what kind of role does equality play in a theory of justice? Philosophers have sought to clarify this by defending a variety of principles and conceptions of equality. This section introduces four such principles, ranging from the highly general and uncontroversial to the more specific and controversial. The next section reviews various conceptions of the ‘currency’ of equality. Different interpretations of the role of equality in a theory of justice emerge according to which of the four principles and metrics have been adopted. The first three principles of equality hold generally and primarily for all actions upon others and affecting others, and for their resulting circumstances. From the fourth principle onward, i.e., starting with the presumption of equality, the focus will be mainly on distributive justice and the evaluation of distribution.

2.1 Formal Equality

When two persons have equal status in at least one normatively relevant respect, they must be treated equally with regard in this respect. This is the generally accepted formal equality principle that Aristotle articulated in reference to Plato: “treat like cases as like” (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, V.3. 1131a10–b15; Politics, III.9.1280 a8–15, III. 12. 1282b18–23). The crucial question is which respects are normatively relevant and which are not. Some authors see this formal principle of equality as a specific application of a rule of rationality: it is irrational, because inconsistent, to treat equal cases unequally without sufficient reasons (Berlin 1955–56). But others claim that what is at stake here is a moral principle of justice, one reflecting the impartial and universalizable nature of moral judgments. On this view, the postulate of formal equality demands more than consistency with one’s subjective preferences: the equal or unequal treatment in question must be justifiable to the relevantly affected parties, and this on the sole basis of a situation’s objective features.

2.2 Proportional Equality

According to Aristotle, there are two kinds of equality, numerical and proportional (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1130b–1132b; cf. Plato, Laws, VI.757b–c). A way of treating others, or a distribution arising from it, is equal numerically when it treats all persons as indistinguishable, thus treating them identically or granting them the same quantity of a good per capita. That is not always just. In contrast, a way of treating others or a distribution is proportional or relatively equal when it treats all relevant persons in relation to their due. Just numerical equality is a special case of proportional equality. Numerical equality is only just under special circumstances, namely when persons are equal in the relevant respects so that the relevant proportions are equal. Proportional equality further specifies formal equality; it is the more precise and comprehensive formulation of formal equality. It indicates what produces an adequate equality.

Proportional equality in the treatment and distribution of goods to persons involves at least the following concepts or variables: Two or more persons \((P_1, P_2)\) and two or more allocations of goods to persons \((G)\) and \(X\) and \(Y\) as the quantity in which individuals have the relevant normative quality \(E\). This can be represented as an equation with fractions or as a ratio. If \(P1\) has \(E\) in the amount of \(X\) and if \(P_2\) has \(E\) in the amount \(Y\), then \(P_1\) is due \(G\) in the amount of \(X'\) and \(P_2\) is due \(G\) in the amount of \(Y'\), so that the ratio \(X/Y = X'/Y'\) is valid. (For the formula to be usable, the potentially large variety of factors involved have to be both quantifiable in principle and commensurable, i.e., capable of synthesis into an aggregate value.)

When factors speak for unequal treatment or distribution, because the persons are unequal in relevant respects, the treatment or distribution proportional to these factors is just. Unequal claims to treatment or distribution must be considered proportionally: that is the prerequisite for persons being considered equally.

This principle can also be incorporated into hierarchical, inegalitarian theories. It indicates that equal output is demanded with equal input. Aristocrats, perfectionists, and meritocrats all believe that persons should be assessed according to their differing deserts, understood in the broad sense of fulfillment of some relevant criterion. Reward and punishment, benefits and burdens, should be proportional to such deserts. Since this definition leaves open who is due what, there can be great inequality when it comes to presumed fundamental (natural) rights, deserts, and worth -– this is apparent in both Plato and Aristotle.

Aristotle’s idea of justice as proportional equality contains a fundamental insight. The idea offers a framework for a rational argument between egalitarian and non-egalitarian ideas of justice, its focal point being the question of the basis for an adequate equality (Hinsch 2003). Both sides accept justice as proportional equality. Aristotle’s analysis makes clear that the argument involves those features that decide whether two persons are to be considered equal or unequal in a distributive context.

On the formal level of pure conceptual explication, justice and equality are linked through these formal and proportional principles. Justice cannot be explained without these equality principles, which themselves only receive their normative significance in their role as principles of justice.

Formal and proportional equality is simply a conceptual schema. It needs to be made precise – i.e., its open variables need to be filled out. The formal postulate remains empty as long as it is unclear when, or through what features, two or more persons or cases should be considered equal. All debates over the proper conception of justice – over who is due what – can be understood as controversies over the question of which cases are equal and which unequal (Aristotle, Politics, 1282b 22). For this reason, equality theorists are correct in stressing that the claim that persons are owed equality becomes informative only when one is told what kind of equality they are owed (Nagel 1979; Rae 1981; Sen 1992, p. 13). Every normative theory implies a certain notion of equality. In order to outline their position, egalitarians must thus take account of a specific (egalitarian) conception of equality. To do so, they need to identify substantive principles of equality, which are discussed below.

2.3 Moral Equality

Until the eighteenth century, it was assumed that human beings are unequal by nature. This postulate collapsed with the advent of the idea of natural right, which assumed a natural order in which all human beings were equal. Against Plato and Aristotle, the classical formula for justice according to which an action is just when it offers each individual his or her due took on a substantively egalitarian meaning in the course of time: everyone deserved the same dignity and respect. This is now the widely held conception of substantive, universal, moral equality. It developed among the Stoics, who emphasized the natural equality of all rational beings, and in early New Testament Christianity, which envisioned that all humans were equal before God, although this principle was not always adhered to in the later history of the church. This important idea was also taken up both in the Talmud and in Islam, where it was grounded in both Greek and Hebraic elements. In the modern period, starting in the seventeenth century, the dominant idea was of natural equality in the tradition of natural law and social contract theory. Hobbes (1651) postulated that in their natural condition, individuals possess equal rights, because over time they have the same capacity to do each other harm. Locke (1690) argued that all human beings have the same natural right to both (self-)ownership and freedom. Rousseau (1755) declared social inequality to be the result of a decline from the natural equality that characterized our harmonious state of nature, a decline catalyzed by the human urge for perfection, property and possessions (Dahrendorf 1962). For Rousseau (1755, 1762), the resulting inequality and rule of violence can only be overcome by binding individual subjectivity to a common civil existence and popular sovereignty. In Kant’s moral philosophy (1785), the categorical imperative formulates the equality postulate of universal human worth. His transcendental and philosophical reflections on autonomy and self-legislation lead to a recognition of the same freedom for all rational beings as the sole principle of human rights (Kant 1797, p. 230). Such Enlightenment ideas stimulated the great modern social movements and revolutions, and were taken up in modern constitutions and declarations of human rights. During the French Revolution, equality, along with freedom and fraternity, became a basis of the Déclaration des droits de l’homme et du citoyen of 1789.

The principle that holds that human beings, despite their differences, are to be regarded as one another’s equals, is often also called ‘human equality’ or ‘basic equality’ or ‘equal worth’ or ‘human dignity’ (William 1962, Vlastos 1962, Kateb 2014, Waldron 2017, Rosen 2018). Whether these terms are synonyms is a matter of interpretation, but “they cluster together to form a powerful body of principle” (Waldron 2017, p. 3).

This fundamental idea of equal respect for all persons and of the equal worth or equal dignity of all human beings (Vlastos 1962) is widely accepted (Carter 2011, but see also Steinhoff 2015). In a period in which there is not agreement across the members of a complex society to any one metaphysical, religious, or traditional view (Habermas 1983, p. 53, 1992, pp. 39–44), it appears impossible to peacefully reach a general agreement on common political aims without accepting that persons must be treated as equals. As a result, moral equality constitutes the ‘egalitarian plateau’ for all contemporary political theories (Kymlicka 1990, p. 5).

Fundamental equality means that persons are alike in important relevant and specified respects alone, and not that they are all generally the same or can be treated in the same way (Nagel 1991). In a now commonly posed distinction, stemming from Dworkin (1977, p. 227), moral equality can be understood as prescribing treatment of persons as equals, i.e., with equal concern and respect, and not the often implausible principle of providing all persons with equal treatment. Recognizing that human beings are all equally individual does not mean treating them uniformly in any respects other than those in which they clearly have a moral claim to be treated alike.

Disputes arise, of course, concerning what these claims amount to and how they should be resolved. Philosophical debates are concerned with the kind of equal treatment normatively required when we mutually consider ourselves persons with equal dignity. The principle of moral equality is too abstract and needs to be made concrete if we are to arrive at a clear moral standard. Nevertheless, no conception of just equality can be deduced from the notion of moral equality. Rather, we find competing philosophical conceptions of equal treatment serving as interpretations of moral equality. These need to be assessed according to their degree of fidelity to the deeper ideal of moral equality (Kymlicka 1990, p. 44).

2.4 Presumption of Equality

Many conceptions of equality operate along procedural lines involving a presumption of equality. More materially concrete, ethical approaches, as described in the next section below, are concerned with distributive criteria – the presumption of equality, in contrast, is a formal, procedural principle of construction located on a higher formal and argumentative level. What is at stake here is the question of the principle with which a material conception of justice should be constructed, particularly once the approaches described above prove inadequate. The presumption of equality is a prima facie principle of equal distribution for all goods politically suited for the process of public distribution. In the domain of political justice, all members of a given community, taken together as a collective body, have to decide centrally on the fair distribution of social goods, as well as on the distribution’s fair realization. Any claim to a particular distribution, including any existing distributive scheme, has to be impartially justified, i.e., no ownership should be recognized without justification. Applied to this political domain, the presumption of equality requires that everyone should get an equal share in the distribution unless certain types of differences are relevant and justify, through universally acceptable reasons, unequal shares. (With different terms and arguments, this principle is conceived as a presumption by Benn & Peters (1959, 111) and by Bedau (1967, 19); as a relevant reasons approach by Williams (1973); as a conception of symmetry by Tugendhat (1993, 374; 1997, chap. 3); as default option by Hinsch (2002, chap. 5); for criticism of the presumption of equality, cf. Westen (1990, chap. 10).) This presumption results in a principle of prima facie equal distribution for all distributable goods. A strict principle of equal distribution is not required, but it is morally necessary to justify impartially any unequal distribution. The burden of proof lies on the side of those who favor any form of unequal distribution. (For a justification of the presumption in favor of equality s. Gosepath 2004, II.8.; Gosepath 2015.)

The presumption of equality provides an elegant procedure for constructing a theory of distributive justice (Gosepath 2004). One has only to analyze what can justify unequal treatment or unequal distribution in different spheres. To put it briefly, the following postulates of equality are at present generally considered morally required.

Strict equality is called for in the legal sphere of civil freedoms, since – putting aside limitation on freedom as punishment – there is no justification for any exceptions. As follows from the principle of formal equality, all citizens must have equal general rights and duties, which are grounded in general laws that apply to all. This is the postulate of legal equality. In addition, the postulate of equal freedom is equally valid: every person should have the same freedom to structure his or her life, and this in the most far-reaching manner possible in a peaceful and appropriate social order.

In the political sphere, the possibilities for political participation should be equally distributed. All citizens have the same claim to participation in forming public opinion, and in the distribution, control, and exercise of political power. This is the postulate – requiring equal opportunity – of equal political power sharing. To ensure equal opportunity, social institutions have to be designed in such a way that persons who are disadvantaged, e.g. have a stutter or a low income, have an equal chance to make their views known and to participate fully in the democratic process.

In the social sphere, equally gifted and motivated citizens must have approximately the same chances to obtain offices and positions, independent of their economic or social class and native endowments. This is the postulate of fair equality of social opportunity. Any unequal outcome must nevertheless result from equality of opportunity, i.e., qualifications alone should be the determining factor, not social background or influences of milieu.

The equality required in the economic sphere is complex, taking account of several positions that – each according to the presumption of equality – justify a turn away from equality. A salient problem here is what constitutes justified exceptions to equal distribution of goods, the main subfield in the debate over adequate conceptions of distributive equality and its currency. The following factors are usually considered eligible for justified unequal treatment: (a) need or differing natural disadvantages (e.g. disabilities); (b) existing rights or claims (e.g. private property); (c) differences in the performance of special services (e.g. desert, efforts, or sacrifices); (d) efficiency; and (e) compensation for direct and indirect or structural discrimination (e.g. affirmative action).

These factors play an essential, albeit varied, role in the following alternative egalitarian theories of distributive justice. These offer different accounts of what should be equalized in the economic sphere. Most can be understood as applications of the presumption of equality (whether they explicitly acknowledge it or not); only a few (like strict equality, libertarianism, and sufficiency) are alternatives to the presumption.

3. Conceptions of Distributive Equality: Equality of What?

Every effort to interpret the concept of equality and to apply the principles of equality mentioned above demands a precise measure of the parameters of equality. We need to know the dimensions within which the striving for equality is morally relevant. What follows is a brief review of the seven most prominent conceptions of distributive equality, each offering a different answer to one question: in the field of distributive justice, what should be equalized, or what should be the parameter or “currency” of equality?

3.1 Simple Equality and Objections to Equality in General

Simple equality, meaning everyone being furnished with the same material level of goods and services, represents a strict position as far as distributive justice is concerned. It is generally rejected as untenable.

Hence, with the possible exception of Babeuf (1796) and Shaw (1928), no prominent author or movement has demanded strict equality. Since egalitarianism has come to be widely associated with the demand for economic equality, and this in turn with communistic or socialistic ideas, it is important to stress that neither communism nor socialism – despite their protest against poverty and exploitation and their demand for social security for all citizens – calls for absolute economic equality. The orthodox Marxist view of economic equality was expounded in the Critique of the Gotha Program (1875). Marx here rejects the idea of legal equality, on three grounds. First, he indicates, equality draws on a limited number of morally relevant perspectives and neglects others, thus having unequal effects. In Marx’s view, the economic structure is the most fundamental basis for the historical development of society, and is thus the point of reference for explaining its features. Second, theories of justice have concentrated excessively on distribution instead of the basic questions of production. Third, a future communist society needs no law and no justice, since social conflicts will have vanished.

As an idea, simple equality fails because of problems that are raised in regards to equality in general. It is useful to review these problems, as they require resolution in any plausible approach to equality.

(i) We need adequate indices for the measurement of the equality of the goods to be distributed. Through what concepts should equality and inequality be understood? It is thus clear that equality of material goods can lead to unequal satisfaction. Money constitutes a typical, though inadequate, index; at the very least, equal opportunity has to be conceived in other terms.

(ii) The time span needs to be indicated for realizing the desired model of equal distribution (McKerlie 1989, Sikora 1989). Should we seek to equalize the goods in question over complete individual lifetimes, or should we seek to ensure that various life segments are as equally provisioned as possible?

(iii) Equality distorts incentives promoting achievement in the economic field, and the administrative costs of redistribution produce wasteful inefficiencies (Okun 1975). Equality and efficiency need to be balanced. Often, Pareto-optimality is demanded in this respect, usually by economists. A social condition is Pareto-optimal or Pareto-efficient when it is not possible to shift to another condition judged better by at least one person and worse by none (Sen 1970, chap. 2, 2*). A widely discussed alternative to the Pareto principle is the Kaldor-Hicks welfare criterion. This stipulates that a rise in social welfare is always present when the benefits accruing through the distribution of value in a society exceed the corresponding costs. A change thus becomes desirable when the winners in such a change could compensate the losers for their losses, and still retain a substantial profit. In contrast to the Pareto-criterion, the Kaldor-Hicks criterion contains a compensation rule (Kaldor 1939). For purposes of economic analysis, such theoretical models of optimal efficiency make a great deal of sense. However, the analysis is always made relative to a starting situation that can itself be unjust and unequal. A society can thus be (close to) Pareto-optimality – i.e., no one can increase his or her material goods or freedoms without diminishing those of someone else – while also displaying enormous inequalities in the distribution of the same goods and freedoms. For this reason, egalitarians claim that it may be necessary to reduce Pareto-optimality for the sake of justice, if there is no more egalitarian distribution that is also Pareto-optimal. In the eyes of their critics, equality of whatever kind should not lead to some people having to make do with less, when this equalizing down does not benefit any of those who are in a worse position.

(iv) Moral objections: A strict and mechanical equal distribution between all individuals does not sufficiently take into account the differences among individuals and their situations. In essence, since individuals desire different things, why should everyone receive the same goods? Intuitively, for example, we can recognize that a sick person has other claims than a healthy person, and furnishing each with the same goods would be mistaken. With simple equality, personal freedoms are unacceptably limited and distinctive individual qualities insufficiently acknowledged; in this way they are in fact unequally regarded. Furthermore, persons not only have a moral right to their own needs being considered, but a right and a duty to take responsibility for their own decisions and the resulting consequences.

Working against the identification of distributive justice with simple equality, a basic postulate of many present-day egalitarians is as follows: human beings are themselves responsible for certain inequalities resulting from their free decisions; aside from minimum aid in emergencies, they deserve no recompense for such inequalities (but cf. relational egalatarians, discussed in Section 4). On the other hand, they are due compensation for inequalities that are not the result of self-chosen options. For egalitarians, the world is morally better when equality of life conditions prevail. This is an amorphous ideal demanding further clarification. Why is such equality an ideal, and what precise currency of equality does it involve?

By the same token, most egalitarians do not advocate an equality of outcome, but different kinds of equality of opportunity, due to their emphasis on a pair of morally central points: that individuals are responsible for their decisions, and that the only things to be considered objects of equality are those which serve the real interests of individuals. The opportunities to be equalized between people can be opportunities for well-being (i.e. objective welfare), or for preference satisfaction (i.e., subjective welfare), or for resources. It is not equality of objective or subjective well-being or resources themselves that should be equalized, but an equal opportunity to gain the well-being or resources one aspires to. Such equality depends on their being a realm of options for each individual equal to the options enjoyed by all other persons, in the sense of the same prospects for fulfillment of preferences or the possession of resources. The opportunity must consist of possibilities one can really take advantage of. Equal opportunity prevails when human beings effectively enjoy equal realms of possibility.

(v) Simple equality is very often associated with equality of results (although these are two distinct concepts). However, to strive only for equality of results is problematic. To illustrate the point, let us briefly limit the discussion to a single action and the event or state of affairs resulting from it. Arguably, actions should not be judged solely by the moral quality of their results, as important as this may be. One must also consider the way in which the events or circumstances to be evaluated have come about. Generally speaking, a moral judgement requires not only the assessment of the results of the action in question (the consequentialist aspect) but, first and foremost, the assessment of the intention of the actor (the deontological aspect). The source and its moral quality influence the moral judgement of the results (Pogge 1999, sect. V). For example, if you strike me, your blow will hurt me; the pain I feel may be considered bad in itself, but the moral status of your blow will also depend on whether you were (morally) allowed such a gesture (perhaps through parental status, although that is controversial) or even obliged to execute it (e.g. as a police officer preventing me from doing harm to others), or whether it was in fact prohibited but not prevented. What is true of individual actions (or their omission) has to be true mutatis mutandis of social institutions and circumstances like distributions resulting from collective social actions (or their omission). Social institutions should therefore be assessed not only on the basis of information about how they affect individual quality of life. A society in which people starve on the streets is certainly marked by inequality; nevertheless, its moral quality, i.e., whether the society is just or unjust with regard to this problem, also depends on the suffering’s causes. Does the society allow starvation as an unintended but tolerable side effect of what its members see as a just distributive scheme? Indeed, does it even defend the suffering as a necessary means, as with forms of Social Darwinism? Or has the society taken measures against starvation which have turned out to be insufficient? In the latter case, whether the society has taken such steps for reasons of political morality or efficiency again makes a moral difference. Hence even for egalitarians, equality of results is too narrow and one-sided a focus.

(vi) Finally, there is a danger of (strict) equality leading to uniformity, rather than to a respect for pluralism and democracy (Cohen 1989; Arneson 1993). In the contemporary debate, this complaint has been mainly articulated in feminist and multiculturalist theory. A central tenet of feminist theory is that gender has been and remains a historically variable and internally differentiated relation of domination. The same holds for so-called racial and ethnic differences, which are often still conceived of as marking different values. The different groups involved here rightly object to their discrimination, marginalization, and domination, and an appeal to equality of status thus seems a solution. However, as feminists and multiculturalists have pointed out, equality, as usually understood and practiced, is constituted in part by a denial and ranking of differences; as a result it seems less useful as an antidote to relations of domination. “Equality” can often mean the assimilation to a pre-existing and problematic ‘male’ or ‘white’ or ‘middle class’ norm. In short, domination and a fortiori inequality often arises out of an inability to appreciate and nurture differences, not out of a failure to see everyone as the same. To recognize these differences should however not lead to an essentialism grounded in sexual or cultural characteristics. There is a crucial debate between those who insist that sexual, racial, and ethnic differences should become irrelevant, on the one hand, and those believing that such differences, even though culturally relevant, should not furnish a basis for inequality: that one should rather find mechanisms for securing equality, despite valued differences. Neither of these strategies involves rejecting equality. The dispute is about how equality is to be attained (McKinnon 1989, Taylor 1992).

Proposing a connection between equality and pluralism, Michael Walzer’s theory (1983) aims at what he calls “complex equality”. According to Walzer, relevant reasons can only speak in favor of distributing specific types of goods in specific spheres, not in several or all spheres. Against a theory of simple equality promoting equal distribution of dominant goods, which underestimates the complexity of the criteria at work in each given sphere, the dominance of particular goods needs to be ended. For instance, purchasing power in the political sphere through means derived from the economic sphere (i.e., money) must be prevented. Walzer’s theory of complex equality is not actually aimed at equality per se, but at the separation of spheres of justice; the theory’s designation is misleading. Any theory of equality should, however, as per Walzer, avoid monistic conceptions and recognize instead the complexity of life and the plurality of criteria for justice.

The preceding considerations yield the following desideratum: instead of simple equality, a more complex equality needs to be conceptualized. That concept should resolve the problems discussed above through a distinction of various classes of goods, a separation of spheres, and a differentiation of relevant criteria.

3.2 Libertarianism

Libertarianism and economic liberalism represent minimalist positions in relation to distributive justice. Citing Locke, they both postulate an original right to freedom and property, thus arguing against redistribution and social rights and for the free market (Nozick 1974; Hayek 1960). They assert an opposition between equality and freedom: the individual (natural) right to freedom can be limited only for the sake of foreign and domestic peace. For this reason, libertarians consider maintaining public order the state’s only legitimate duty. They assert a natural right to self-ownership (the philosophical term for “ownership of oneself” – i.e., one’s will, body, work, etc.) that entitles everybody to hitherto unowned bits of the external world by means of mixing their labor with it. All individuals can thus claim property if “enough and as good” is left over for others (Locke’s proviso). Correspondingly, they defend market freedoms and oppose the use of redistributive taxation schemes for the sake of egalitarian social justice. A principal objection to libertarian theory is that its interpretation of the Lockean proviso – nobody’s situation should be worsened through an initial acquisition of property – leads to an excessively weak requirement and is thus unacceptable (Kymlicka 1990, pp.108–117). However, with a broader and more adequate interpretation of what it means for one a situation to be worse than another, it is much more difficult to justify private appropriation and, a fortiori, all further ownership rights. If the proviso recognizes the full range of interests and alternatives that self-owners have, then it will not generate unrestricted rights over unequal amounts of resources. Another objection is that precisely if one’s own free accomplishment is what is meant to count, as the libertarians argue, success should not depend strictly on luck, extraordinary natural gifts, inherited property, and status. In other words, equal opportunity also needs to at least be present as a counterbalance, ensuring that the fate of human beings is determined by their decisions and not by unavoidable social circumstances. Equal opportunity thus seems to be the frequently vague minimal formula at work in every egalitarian conception of distributive justice. Many egalitarians, however, wish for more – namely, an equality of (at least basic) life conditions.

In any event, with a shift away from a strictly negative idea of freedom, economic liberalism can indeed itself point the way to more social and economic equality. For with such a shift, what is at stake is not only assuring an equal right to self-defense, but also furnishing everyone more or less the same chance to actually make use of the right to freedom (e.g. Van Parijs 1995, Steiner 1994, Otsuka 2005). In other words, certain basic goods need to be furnished to assure the equitable or “fair value of the basic liberties” (Rawls 1993, pp. 356–63).

3.3 Utilitarianism

It is possible to interpret utilitarianism as concretizing moral equality – and this in a way meant to offer the same consideration to the interests of all human beings (Kymlicka 1990, pp. 31f., Hare 1981, p. 26, Sen 1992, pp. 13f.). From the utilitarian perspective, since everyone counts as one and no one as more than one (Bentham), the interests of all should be treated equally without consideration of contents of interest or an individual’s material situation. For utilitarianism, this means that all enlightened personal interests have to be fairly aggregated. The morally proper action is the one that maximizes utility (Hare 1984). This conception of equal treatment has been criticized as inadequate by many opponents of utilitarianism. At least in utilitarianism’s classical form – so the critique reads – the hoped for moral equality is flawed, because all desires are taken up by the utilitarian calculation, including “selfish” and “external” preferences (Dworkin 1977, p. 234) that are meant to all have equal weight, even when they diminish the ‘rights’ and intentions of others. This conflicts with our everyday understanding of equal treatment. What is here at play is an argument involving “offensive” and “expensive” taste: a person cannot expect others to sustain his or her desires at the expense of their own (Kymlicka 1990, p. 40 f.). Rather, according to generally shared conviction, equal treatment consistently requires a basis of equal rights and resources that cannot be taken away from one person, whatever the desire of others. In line with Rawls (1971, pp. 31, 564, cf. 450), many hold that justice entails according no value to interests insofar as they conflict with justice. According to this view, unjustified preferences will not distort the mutual claims people have on each other. Equal treatment has to consist of everyone being able to claim a fair portion, and not in all interests having the same weight in disposal over my portion. Utilitarians cannot admit any restrictions on interests based on morals or justice. As long as utilitarian theory lacks a concept of justice and fair allocation, it must fail in its goal of treating everyone as equals. As Rawls (1971, pp. 27) also famously argues, utilitarianism that involves neglecting the separateness of persons does not contain a proper interpretation of moral equality as equal respect for each individual.

3.4 Equality of Welfare

The concept of welfare equality is motivated by an intuition that when it comes to political ethics, what is at stake is individual well-being. The central criterion for justice must consequently be equalizing the level of welfare. But taking welfare as what is to be equalized leads to difficulties resembling those of utilitarianism. If one contentiously identifies subjective welfare with preference satisfaction, it seems implausible to count all individual preferences as equal, some – such as the desire to do others wrong – being inadmissible on grounds of justice (the offensive taste argument). Any welfare-centered concept of equality grants people with refined and expensive taste more resources – something distinctly at odds with our moral intuitions (the expensive taste argument) (Dworkin 1981a). However, satisfaction in the fulfillment of desires cannot serve as a standard, since we wish for more than a simple feeling of happiness. A more viable standard for welfare comparisons would seem to be success in the fulfillment of preferences. A fair evaluation of such success cannot be purely subjective, but requires a standard of what should or could have been achieved. This itself involves an assumption regarding just distribution, so it cannot stand as an independent criterion for justice. Another serious problem with any welfare-centered concept of equality is that it cannot take account of either desert (Feinberg 1970) or personal responsibility for one’s own well-being, to the extent this is possible and reasonable.

3.5 Equality of Resources

Represented above all by both Rawls and Dworkin, resource equality avoids such problems (Rawls 1971; Dworkin 1981b). It holds individuals responsible for their decisions and actions, but not for circumstances beyond their control, such as race, sex, skin-color, intelligence, and social position, thus excluding these as distributive criteria. Equal opportunity is insufficient because it does not compensate for unequal innate gifts. What applies for social circumstances should also apply for such gifts, as both are purely arbitrary from a moral point of view.

According to Rawls, human beings should have the same initial expectations of “basic goods,” i.e., all-purpose goods; this in no way precludes ending up with different quantities of such goods or resources, as a result of personal economic decisions and actions. When prime importance is accorded an assurance of equal basic freedoms and rights, inequalities are just when they fulfill two provisos: on the one hand, they have to be linked to offices and positions open to everyone under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; on the other hand, they have to reflect the famous ‘difference principle’ in offering the greatest possible advantage to the least advantaged members of society (Rawls 1993, p. 5 f.; 1971, § 13). Otherwise, the economic order requires revision. Due to the argument of the moral arbitrariness of talents, the commonly accepted criteria for merit (like productivity, working hours, effort) are clearly relativized. The difference principle only allows the talented to earn more to the extent this raises the lowest incomes. According to Rawls, with regard to the basic structure of society, the difference principle should be opted for under a self-chosen “veil of ignorance” regarding personal and historical circumstances and similar factors: the principle offers a general assurance of not totally succumbing to the hazards of a free market situation; and everyone does better than with inevitably inefficient total equal distribution, whose level of well-being is below that of those worst off under the difference principle.

Since Rawls’ Theory of Justice is the classical focal point of present-day political philosophy, it is worth noting the different ways his theory claims to be egalitarian. First, Rawls upholds a natural basis for equal human worth: a minimal capacity for having a conception of the good and a sense of justice. Second, through the device of the “veil of ignorance,” people are conceived as equals in the “original position.” Third, the idea of sharing this “original position” presupposes the parties having political equality, as equal participants in the process of choosing the principles by which they would be governed. Fourth, Rawls proposes fair equality of opportunity. Fifth, he maintains that all desert must be institutionally defined, depending on the goals of the society. No one deserves his or her talents or circumstances, which are products of the natural lottery. Finally, the difference principle tends toward equalizing holdings. However, it is important to keep in mind, as Scheffler (2003) has pointed out, that the main focus of Rawls’ theory is justice as such; it is only secondarily about an egalitarian conception of justice. In addition, since the primary subject is the basic structure, pure procedural justice has priority over distributive or allocative justice Equality is not the only or single value for Rawls.

Dworkin’s equality of resources (1981b), on the other hand, is concerned with equality as such. His theory stakes a claim to being even more ‘ambition- and endowment-insensitive’ than Rawls’ theory. Unequal distribution of resources is considered fair only when it results from the decisions and intentional actions of those concerned. Dworkin proposes a hypothetical auction in which everyone can accumulate bundles of resources through equal means of payment, so that in the end no one is jealous of another’s bundle (the envy test). The auction-procedure also offers a way to precisely measure equality of resources: the measure of resources devoted to a person’s life is defined by the importance of the resources to others (Dworkin 1981b, p. 290). In the free market, how the distribution then develops depends on an individual’s ambitions. The inequalities that thus emerge are justified, since one has to take responsibility for how one’s choices turn out (i.e., one’s “option luck”) in the realm of personal responsibility. In contrast, unjustified inequalities based on different innate provisions and gifts, as well as on brute luck, should be compensated for through a fictive differentiated insurance system: its premiums are established behind Dworkin’s own “veil of ignorance,” in order to then be distributed in real life to everyone and collected in taxes. For Dworkin, this is the key to the natural lottery being balanced fairly, preventing a “slavery of the talented” through excessive redistribution.

3.6 Responsibility and Luck-Egalitarianism

Only some egalitarians hold inequality to be bad per se. Most of today’s egalitarians are pluralistic, recognizing other values besides equality. So called luck-egalitarians regard the moral significance of choice and responsibility as one of the most important values besides equality (for an overview over the debate see Lippert-Rasmussen 2015). They hold that it is bad – unjust or unfair – for some to be worse off than others through no fault or choice of their own (Temkin 1993, 13) and therefore strive to eliminate involuntary disadvantages, for which the sufferer cannot be held responsible (Cohen 1989, 916).

The principle of responsibility provides a central normative vantage point for deciding on which grounds one might justify which inequality. The positive formulation of the responsibility principle requires an assumption of personal responsibility and holds that inequalities which are the result of self-chosen options are just. (See above all Dworkin, 1981b, p. 311; contra: Anderson, 1999.) Unequal portions of social goods are thus fair when they result from the decisions and intentional actions of those concerned. Individuals must accept responsibility for the costs of their decisions. Persons are themselves responsible for certain inequalities that result from their voluntary decisions, and they deserve no compensation for such inequalities, aside from minimal provisions in cases of dire need (see below). In its negative formulation, the responsibility principle holds that inequalities which are not the result of self-chosen options are to be rejected as unjust; persons disadvantaged in this way deserve compensation. That which one can do nothing about, or for which one is not responsible, cannot constitute a relevant criterion. Still, the initial assumption remains an ascription of responsibility, and each individual case requires close scrutiny: one is responsible and accountable unless there is an adequate reason for being considered otherwise (but cf. Stemplowska 2013 for a different interpretation)..

If advantages or disadvantages that are due to arbitrary and unearned differences are unfair, this holds for social circumstances as well as natural endowments. The reasons favoring an exclusion of features like skin-color, size, sex, and place of origin as primarily discriminative apply equally to other natural human qualities, like intelligence, appearance, physical strength, and so forth. The kind and the extent of one’s natural abilities are due to a lottery of nature; considered from a moral standpoint, their distribution is purely arbitrary (Rawls, 1971, § 48). To sum up: natural and social endowment must not count, and personal intentions and voluntary decisions should count. Thus, a given social order is just when it equalizes as much as possible, and in a normatively tenable way, all personal disadvantages for which an individual is not responsible, and accords individuals the capacity to bear the consequences of their decisions and actions, as befits their capacity for autonomy.

Objections to all versions of “brute-luck egalitarianism” come from two sides. Some authors criticize its in their view unjustified or excessively radical rejection of merit: The luck-egalitarian thesis of desert only being justifiably acknowledged if it involves desert “all the way down” (Nozick 1974, p. 225) not only destroys the classical, everyday principle of desert, since everything has a basis that we ourselves have not created. In the eyes of such critics, along with the merit-principle this argument also destroys our personal identity, since we can no longer accredit ourselves with our own capacities and accomplishments. (Cf. the texts in Pojman & McLeod 1998, Olsaretti 2003.) Other authors consider the criterion for responsibility to be too strong, indeed inhuman (or “harsh”) in its consequences, since human beings responsible for their own misery would (supposedly) be left alone with their misery (Anderson 1999, also MacLeod 1998, Scheffler 2003, Wolff 1998, Fleurbaey 1995, Voigt 2007, Eyal 2017, Olsaretti 2009, Stemplowska 2009). However, pluralistic egalitarians should be able to argue that there are special cases, in which people are so badly off that they should be helped, even if they got into the miserable situation through their own fault. But even when people are in terrible situations, which did not arise through their own fault (‘bad brute luck’) – for instance, when they are disabled from birth – and egalitarians therefore have reasons to help them, these reasons are supposedly stigmatizing, since in these cases the principles of distribution would be based on pity. In these cases, political institutions have to take certain decisions – for example, in which category a particular case of distress should be placed – and gather relevant information on their citizens. Against such a procedure, one could object that it subjects the citizens to the tutelage of the state and harms their private sphere (Anderson 1999, also Hayek 1960: 85–102).

3.7 Equality of Opportunity for Welfare or Advantage

Approaches based on equality of opportunity can be read as revisions of both welfarism and resourcism. Ranged against welfarism and designed to avoid its pitfalls, they incorporate the powerful ideas of choice and responsibility into various, improved forms of egalitarianism. Such approaches are meant to equalize outcomes resulting from causes beyond a person’s control (i.e., beyond circumstances or endowment), but to allow differential outcomes that result from autonomous choice or ambition. But the approaches are also aimed at maintaining the insight that individual preferences have to count, as the sole basis for a necessary linkage back to the individual perspective: otherwise, there is an overlooking of the person’s value. In Arneson’s (1989, 1990) concept of equal opportunity for welfare, the preferences determining the measure of individual well-being are meant to be conceived hypothetically – i.e., a person would decide on them after a process of ideal reflection. In order to correspond to the morally central vantage of personal responsibility, what should be equalized are not enlightened preferences themselves, but rather real opportunities to achieve or receive a good, to the extent that it is aspired to. G.A. Cohen’s (1989, p. 916 f.) broader conception of equality of access to advantage attempts to integrate the perspectives of welfare equality and resource equality through the overriding concept of advantage. For Cohen, there are two grounds for egalitarian compensation. Egalitarians will be moved to furnish a paralyzed person with a compensatory wheelchair independently of the person’s welfare level. This egalitarian response to disability overrides equality of (opportunity to) welfare. Egalitarians also favor compensation for phenomena such as pain, independent of any loss of capacity – for instance by paying for expensive medicine. But, Cohen claims, any justification for such compensation has to invoke the idea of equality of opportunity to welfare. He thus views both aspects, resources and welfare, as necessary and irreducible. Much of Roemer’s (1998) more technical argument is devoted to constructing the scale to calibrate the extent to which something is the result of circumstances. An incurred adverse consequence is the result of circumstances, not choice, precisely to the extent that it is a consequence that persons of one or another specific type can be expected to incur.

3.8 Capabilities Approaches

Theories that limit themselves to the equal distribution of basic means, in the hope of doing justice to the different goals of all human beings, are often criticized as fetishistic, because they focus on means as opposed to what individuals gain with these means (Sen 1980). The value that goods have for someone depends on objective possibilities, the natural environment, and individual capacities. Hence, in contrast to the resourcist approach, Amartya Sen proposes orientating distribution around “capabilities to achieve functionings,” i.e., the various things that a person manages to do orbe in leading a life (Sen 1992). In other words, evaluating individual well-being has to be tied to a capability for achieving and maintaining various precious conditions and “functionings” constitutive of a person’s being, such as adequate nourishment, good health, the ability to move about freely or to appear in public without shame. The real freedom to acquire well-being is also important here, a freedom represented in the capability to oneself choose forms of achievement and the combination of “functionings.” For Sen, capabilities are thus the measure of an equality of capabilities human beings enjoy to lead their lives. A problem consistently raised with capability approaches is the ability to weigh capabilities in order to arrive at a metric for equality. The problem is intensified by the fact that various moral perspectives are blended in the concept of capability (Cohen 1993, p. 17–26, Williams 1987). Martha Nussbaum (1992, 2000) has linked the capability approach to an Aristotelian, essentialistic, “thick” theory of the good – a theory meant to be, as she puts it, “vague,” incomplete, and open-ended enough to leave place for individual and cultural variation. On the basis of such a “thick” conception of necessary and universal elements of a good life, certain capabilities and functionings can be designated as foundational. In this manner, Nussbaum can endow the capability approach with a precision that furnishes an index of interpersonal comparison, but at the risk of not being neutral enough regarding the plurality of personal conceptions of the good, a neutrality normally required by most liberals (most importantly Rawls 1993; but see Robeyns 2009 for a different take on the comparison with Rawls). For further discussion, see the entry on the capability approach.

4. Relational Equality

Since the late 1990s, social relations egalitarianism has appeared in philosophical discourse as an increasingly important competitor to distribuitivist accounts of justice, especially its luck egalitarian versions (cf. Lippert-Rassmussen 2018). Proponents of social relations egalitarianism include Anderson (1999), Miller (1997), Scanlon (1996, 2018), Scheffler (2003, 2005, 2015), Wolff (1998, 2010) and Young (1990). Negatively, they are united in a rejection of the view that justice is a matter of eliminating differential luck. Positively, they claim that society is just if, and only if, individuals within it relate to one another as equals. Accordingly, the site of justice (i.e. that to which principles of justice apply) is society, not distributions. Relational Egalitarianism has a certain overlap with many theories of recognition and non-domination. Certain status differences are at the core of their objections, like those stigmatizing differences in status, whereby the badly off are caused to experience themselves as inferior, and are treated as inferiors, or when inequalities create objectionable relations of power(Honneth/Fraser 2003) and domination (Pettit 2001).

What does it mean that (and when do) individuals within a society relate to one another as equals? Racial discrimination, for example, is a paradigmatic instance of this condition?s violation. But once we move beyond a handful of such examples things become much less clear.

These claims to social and political equality exclude all unequal, hierarchical forms of social relationships, in which some people dominate, exploit, marginalize, demean, and inflict violence upon others:

As a social ideal, it holds that a human society must be conceived of as a cooperative arrangement among equals, each of whom enjoys the same social standing. As a political ideal, it highlights the claims that citizens are entitled to make on one another by virtue of their status as citizens, without any need for a moralized accounting of the details of their particular circumstances. (Scheffler 2003, p. 22)

However, forms of differentiation that do not violate moral equality (see above) are not per se excluded from social equality, if they are compatible with the recognition of the equal social status of concerned parties, as with differences relating to merit, need, and, if appropriate, race, gender, and social background (as in cases of affirmative action or fair punishment).

Where there is social equality, people feel that each member of the community enjoys an equal standing with all the rest that overrides their unequal ratings along particular dimensions. (Miller, 1997, p. 232)

Thus the question has to be answered whether – and if so, why – other dimensions, such as a person’s natural talents, creativity, intelligence, innovative skills or entrepreneurial ability, can be the basis for legitimate inequalities.

Relational egalitarians need a certain conception of what an equal standing in society amounts to and implies in terms of rights and goods. One way to offer such an account would be to rely (like Anderson 1999) on the capabilities approach (§3.8) and sufficitarianism (§6.2.): In a democratic community that preserves the free and equal status of persons, at least three sets of conditions have to be fulfilled.

First, certain political conditions are necessary to allow citizens to participate as equals in democratic deliberation. These include, among others, the capabilities to vote, hold office, assemble, petition the government, speak freely, and move about freely (Rawls 1999, p.53). The principle of democratic equality (as asked for by Anderson 1999) requires us to eliminate social hierarchies that prevent a democratically organized society, a society in which we cooperate and decide upon state action as equals. Persons morally owe each other the capabilities and conditions to live as equals in a democratic community (Christiano 2008, Kolodny 2014). Democracy can be interpreted as realizing public equality in collective decision-making.

Second, to participate as an equal in civil society, certain civil conditions must obtain. These include the conditions that make it robustly likely that injustices such as marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism (Anderson 1999 with reference to Young 1990), or domination (Pettit 2001) can be to avoided. Third, certain social conditions and personal capabilities have to obtain that enable people to enjoy equal standing in society. Citizens need, in this regard, adequate nutrition, shelter, clothing, education, and medical care. This last point leads into the debate over whether a relational egalitarian conception of social justice yields intrinsic and instrumental reasons of justice to care about distributive inequality in socially produced goods, despite its emphasis on just social relationships and not the distribution of goods per se (Schemmel 2011, Elford 2017).

5. Equality Among Whom?

Justice is primarily related to individual actions. Individual persons are the primary bearers of responsibility (the key principle of ethical individualism). This raises two controversial issues in the contemporary debate.

One could regard the norms of distributive equality as applying to groups rather than individuals. It is often groups that rightfully raise the issue of an inequality between themselves and the rest of society, as with women and racial and ethnic groups. The question arises of whether inequality among such groups should be considered morally objectionable in itself, or whether even in the case of groups, the underlying concern should be how individuals (as members of such groups) fare in comparative terms. If there is a worry about inequalities between groups of individuals, why does this not translate into a worry about inequalities between members of the group?

A further question concerns whether the norms of distributive equality (whatever they are) apply to all individuals, regardless of where (and when) they live. Or rather, do they only hold for members of communities within states and nations? Most theories of equality deal exclusively with distributive equality among people in a single society. There does not, however, seem to be any rationale for that limitation. Can the group of the entitled be restricted prior to the examination of concrete claims? Many theories seem to imply this, especially when they connect distributive justice or the goods to be distributed with social cooperation or production. For those who contribute nothing to cooperation, such as the disabled, children, or future generations, would have to be denied a claim to a fair share. The circle of persons who are to be the recipients of distribution would thus be restricted from the outset. Other theories are less restrictive, insofar as they do not link distribution to actual social collaboration, yet nonetheless do restrict it, insofar as they bind it to the status of citizenship. In this view, distributive justice is limited to the individuals within a society. Those outside the community have no entitlement to social justice. Unequal distribution among states and the social situations of people outside the particular society could not, in this view, be a problem of social distributive justice (Nagel 2005). Yet here too, the universal morality of equal respect and the principle of equal distribution demand that all persons consider one another as prima facie equally entitled to the goods, unless reasons for an unequal distribution can be advanced. It may be that in the process of justification, reasons will emerge for privileging those who were particularly involved in the production of a good, but there is no prima facie reason to exclude from the outset other persons, such as those from other countries, from the process of distribution and justification (Pogge 2002). That may seem most intuitively plausible in the case of natural resources (e.g. oil) that someone discovers by chance on or beneath the surface of his or her property. Why should such resources belong to the person who discovers them, or on whose property they are located? Nevertheless, in the eyes of many if not most people, global justice, i.e., extending egalitarian distributive justice globally, demands too much from individuals and their states (Miller 1998; but cf. Caney 2005). Alternatively, one might argue that there are other ‘special relations’ between members of one society that do not exist between members of different societies. Nationalism is an example for such a (controversial) thesis that may provide a case for a kind of local equality (Miller 1995). For further discussion, see the entry on global justice.

Another issue is the relationship between generations. Does the present generation have an egalitarian obligation towards future generations regarding equal living conditions? One argument in favor of this conclusion might be that people should not end up unequally well off as a result of morally arbitrary factors. However, the issue of justice between generation is notoriously complex (Temkin 1992). For further discussion, see the entry on intergenerational justice.

6. The Value of Equality: Why Equality?

Does equality play a major role in a theory of justice, and if so, what is this role? A conception of justice is egalitarian when it views equality as a fundamental goal of justice. Temkin has put it as follows:

… an egalitarian is any person who attaches some value to equality itself (that is, any person that cares at all about equality, over and above the extent it promotes other ideals). So, equality needn’t be the only value, or even the ideal she values most… . Egalitarians have the deep and (for them) compelling view that it is a bad thing – unjust and unfair – for some to be worse off than others through no fault of their own. (Temkin 1986, p. 100, cf. 1993, p. 7)

In general, the focus of the modern egalitarian effort to realize equality is on the possibility of a good life, i.e., on an equality of life prospects and life circumstances – interpreted in various ways according to various positions in the “equality of what” debate (see above).

6.1. Kinds of Egalitarianism

It is apparent that there are three sorts of egalitarianism: intrinsic, instrumental and constitutive. (For a twofold distinction cf. Parfit 1997, Temkin 1993, p. 11, McKerlie, 1996, p. 275.)

Intrinsic egalitarians view equality as a good in itself. As pure egalitarians, they are concerned solely with equality, most of them with equality of social circumstances, according to which it is intrinsically bad if some people are worse off than others through no fault of their own. But it is in fact the case that people do not always consider inequality a moral evil. Intrinsic egalitarians regarde quality as desirable even when the equalization would be of no use to any of the affected parties, such as when equality can only be produced through depressing the level of well being of everyone’s life. But something can only have an intrinsic value when it is good for at least one person, when it makes one life better in some way or another.

The following “leveling-down” objection indicates that doing away within equality in fact ought to produce better circumstances; it is otherwise unclear why equality should be desired. (For such an objection, cf. Nozick 1974, p. 229, Raz 1986, chap. 9, p. 227, 235, Temkin 1993, pp. 247–8.) Sometimes inequality can only be ended by depriving those who are better off of their resources, rendering them as poorly off as everyone else. (For anyone looking for a drastic literary example, Kurt Vonnegut’s 1950 science-fiction story Harrison Bergeron is recommended.) This would have to be an acceptable approach according to the intrinsic conception. But would it be morally good if, in a group consisting of both blind and sighted persons, those with sight were rendered blind because the blind could not be offered sight? That would be morally perverse. Doing away with inequality by bringing everyone down contains – so the objection goes – nothing good. Such leveling-down objections would of course only be valid if there were indeed no better and equally egalitarian alternatives available, but there are nearly always such alternatives: e.g. those who can see should have to help the blind, financially or otherwise. When there are no alternatives, in order to avoid such objections, intrinsic egalitarianism cannot be strict, but needs to be pluralistic. Then intrinsic egalitarians could say there is something good about the change, namely greater equality, although they would concede that much is bad about it. Pluralistic egalitarians do not have equality as their only goal; they also admit other values and principles, above all the principle of welfare, according to which it is better when people are doing better. In addition, pluralistic egalitarianism should be moderate enough to not always grant equality victory in the case of conflict between equality and welfare. Instead, they must accept reductions in equality for the sake of a higher quality of life for all (as with Rawls’ difference principle).

At present, many egalitarians are ready to concede that equality in the sense of equality of life circumstances has no compelling value in itself, but that, in a framework of liberal concepts of justice, its meaning emerges in pursuit of other ideals, like universal freedom, the full development of human capacities and the human personality, the mitigation of suffering and defeat of domination and stigmatization, the stable coherence of modern and freely constituted societies, and so forth (Scanlon 1996, 2018). For those who are worse off, unequal circumstances often mean considerable (relative) disadvantages and many (absolute) evils; as a rule, these (relative) disadvantages and (absolute) evils are the source of our moral condemnation of unequal circumstances. But this does not mean that inequality as such is an evil. Hence, the argument goes, fundamental moral ideals other than equality stand behind our aspiring for equality. To reject inequality on such grounds is to favor equality either as a byproduct or as a means, and not as a goal or intrinsic value. In its treatment of equality as a derived virtue, the sort of egalitarianism – if the term is actually suitable – here at play is instrumental.

As indicated, there is also a third, more suitable approach to the equality ideal: a constitutive egalitarianism. According to this approach, to the aspiration to equality is rooted in other moral grounds, namely because certain inequalities are unjust. Equality has value, but this is an extrinsic value, since it derives from another, higher moral principle of equal dignity and respect. But it is not instrumental for this reason, i.e., it is not only valued on account of moral equality, but also on its own account. (For the distinction between the origin of a value and the kind of value it is, cf. Korsgaard 1996.) Equality stands in relation to justice as does a part to a whole. The requirement of justification is based on moral equality, and in certain contexts, successful justification leads to the above-named principles of equality, i.e., formal, proportional equality and the presumption of equality. Thus, according to constitutive egalitarianism, these principles and the resulting equality are required by justice, and by the same token constitute social justice.

It is important to further distinguish two levels of egalitarianism and non-egalitarianism, respectively. On a first level, a constitutive egalitarian presumes that every explication of the moral standpoint is incomplete without terms such as ‘equal,’ ‘similarly,’ etc. In contrast, a non-egalitarianism operating on the same level considers such terms misplaced or redundant. On a second level, when it comes to concretizing and specifying conceptions of justice, a constitutive egalitarian gives equality substantive weight. On this level, more and less egalitarian positions can be found, according to the chosen currency of equality (the criteria by which just equality is measured) and according to the reasons for unequal distributions (exemptions of the presumption of equality) that the respective theories regard as well grounded. Egalitarianism on the second level thus relates to the kind, quality and quantity of things to be equalized. Because of such variables, a clear-cut definition of second level egalitarianism cannot be formulated. In contrast, non-egalitarians on this second level advocate a non-relational entitlement theory of justice.

6.2 Equality vs. Priority or Sufficiency

Alongside the often-raised objections against equality mentioned in the section on “simple equality” (3.1. above) there is a different and more fundamental critique formulated by first level non-egalitarians: that equality does not have a foundational role in the grounding of claims to justice. While the older version of a critique of egalitarianism comes mainly from the conservative end of the political spectrum, thus arguing in general against “patterned principles of justice” (Nozick 1974, esp. pp. 156–157), the critique’s newer version also often can be heard in progressive circles (Walzer 1983, Raz 1986, chap. 9, Frankfurt 1987, 1997, Parfit 1997, Anderson 1999). This first-level critique of equality poses the basic question of why justice should in fact be conceived relationally and (what is here the same) comparatively. Referring back to Joel Feinberg’s (1974) distinction between comparative and non-comparative justice, non-egalitarians object to the moral requirement to treat people as equals, and the many demands for justice emerging from it. They argue that neither the postulate nor these demands involve comparative principles, let alone any equality principles. They reproach first-level egalitarians for a confusion between “equality” and “universals.” As the non-egalitarians see things, within many principles of justice – at least the especially important ones – the equality-terminology is redundant. Equality is thus merely a byproduct of the general fulfillment of actually non-comparative standards of justice: something obscured through the unnecessary insertion of an expression of equality (Raz 1986, p. 227f.). At least the central standards of dignified human life are not relational but “absolute.” As Harry Frankfurt puts it: “It is whether people have good lives, and not how their lives compare with the lives of others” (Frankfurt 1997, p. 6). And again: “The fundamental error of egalitarianism lies in supposing that it is morally important whether one person has less than another regardless of how much either of them has” (Frankfurt 1987, p. 34).

From the non-egalitarian perspective, what is really at stake in helping those worse off and improving their lot is humanitarian concern, a desire to alleviate suffering. Such concern is not understood as egalitarian, as it is not focused on the difference between the better off and the worse off as such (whatever the applied standard), but on improving the situation of the latter. Their distress constitutes the actual moral foundation. The wealth of those better off only furnishes a means that has to be transferred for the sake of mitigating the distress, as long as other, morally negative consequences do not emerge in the process. The strength of the impetus for more equality lies in the urgency of the claims of those worse off, not in the extent of the inequality. For this reason, instead of equality the non-egalitarian critics favor one or another entitlement theory of justice, such as Nozick’s (1974) libertarianism (cf. 3.2. above) and Frankfurt’s (1987) doctrine of sufficiency, according to which “What is important from the moral point of view is not that everyone should have the same but that each should have enough. If everyone had enough, it would be of no moral consequence whether some had more than others” (Frankfurt 1987, p. 21).

Parfit’s (1997) priority view accordingly calls for a focus on improving the situation of society’s weaker and poorer members, and indeed all the more urgently the worse off they are, even if they can be less helped than others in the process. Parfit (1995) distinguishes between egalitarianism and prioritarianism. According to prioritarians, benefiting people is more important the worse off those people are. This prioritising will often increase equality, but they are two distinct values, since in an important respect equality is a relational value while priority is not. However, egalitarians and prioritarians share an important feature, in that both hold that the best possible distribution of a fixed sum of goods is an equal one. It is thus a matter of debate whether prioritarianism is a sort of egalitarianism or a (decent) inegalitarianism. In any case, entitlement-based non-egalitarian arguments can practically result in an equality of outcome as far-reaching as egalitarian theories. Hence the fulfillment of an absolute or non-comparative standard for everyone (e.g. to the effect that nobody should starve) frequently results in a certain equality of outcome, where such a standard comprises not only a decent but a good life. Consequently, the debate here centers on the basis – is it equality or something else? – and not so much on the outcome – are persons or groups more or less equal, according to a chosen metric? Possibly, the difference lies even deeper, in their respective conceptions of morality in general.

Egalitarians can respond to the anti-egalitarian critique by conceding that it is the nature of some (however certainly far from all) essential norms of morality and justice to be concerned primarily with the adequate fulfillment of the separate claims of individuals. However, whether a claim can itself be considered suitable can be ascertained only by asking whether it can be agreed on by all those affected in hypothetical conditions of freedom and equality. (See, e.g., Casal 2007 for a deeper discussion and critique of the doctrine of sufficiency.) This justificatory procedure is more necessary if it is less evident that what is at stake is actually suffering, distress, or an objective need. In the view of the constitutive egalitarians, all the judgments of distributive justice should be approached relationally, by asking which distributive scheme all concerned parties can universally and reciprocally agree to. As described at some length in the pertinent section above, many egalitarians argue that a presumption in favor of equality follows from this justification requirement. In the eyes of such egalitarians, this is all one needs for the justification and determination of the constitutive value of equality.

Secondly, even if – for the sake of argument – the question is left open as to whether demands for distribution according to objective needs (e.g. alleviating hunger) involve non-comparative entitlement-claims, it is nonetheless always necessary to resolve the question of what needy individuals are owed. And this is tied in a basic way to the question of what persons owe one another in comparable or worse situations, and how scarce resources (money, goods, time, energy) must be invested in light of the sum total of our obligations. While the claim on our aid may well appear non-relational, determining the kind and extent of the aid must always be relational, at least in circumstances of scarcity (and resources are always scarce). Claims are either “satiable” (Raz 1986, p. 235) – i.e., an upper limit or sufficiency level can be indicated, after which each person’s claim to X has been fulfilled – or they are not. For insatiable claims, to stipulate any level at which one is or ought to be sufficiently satisfied is arbitrary. If the standards of sufficiency are defined as a bare minimum, why should persons be content with that minimum? Why should the manner in which welfare and resources are distributed above the poverty level not also be a question of justice? If, by contrast, we are concerned solely with claims that are in principle “satiable,” such claims having a reasonable definition of sufficiency, then these standards of sufficiency will most likely be very high. In Frankfurt’s definition, for example, sufficiency is reached only when persons are satisfied and no longer actively strive for more. Since people find themselves ourselves operating, in practice, in circumstances far beneath such a high sufficiency level, they (of course) live under conditions of (moderate) scarcity. Then the above mentioned argument holds as well – namely, that in order to determine to what extent it is to be fulfilled, each claim has to be judged in relation to the claims of all others and all available resources. In addition, the moral urgency of lifting people above dire poverty cannot be invoked to demonstrate the moral urgency of everyone having enough. In both forms of scarcity – i.e., with satiable and insatiable claims – the social right or claim to goods cannot be conceived as something absolute or non-comparative. Egalitarians may thus conclude that distributive justice is always comparative. This would suggest that distributive equality, especially equality of life-conditions, should play a fundamental role in any adequate theory of justice in particular, and of morality in general.


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