Justice as a Virtue

First published Fri Mar 8, 2002; substantive revision Fri Aug 7, 2020

The notion of justice as a virtue began in reference to a trait of individuals, and to some extent remains so, even if today we often conceive the justice of individuals as having some (grounding) reference to social justice. But from the start, the focus on justice as a virtue faced pressures to diffuse, in two different ways.

First, “justice as a virtue” is ambiguous as between individual and social applications. Rawls and others regard justice as “the first virtue of social institutions” (1971, p. 3), but Rawls is not the first to think of justice as a virtue of social institutions or societies — Plato was there long before him. However, justice as a virtue of societies, polities, and their institutions is addressed elsewhere, so the focus in this essay will be on justice as a virtue in individuals. That said, individuals typically live as members of political communities, so the societal dimension of justice as a virtue will never be long out of view (Woodruff 2018).

Second, from the start the effort to analyze the virtue of justice has led to attempts to formalize the requirements (or norms) of justice, and at times the latter project has threatened to swallow the first in ways that make thinking of a virtue of justice gratuitous or otiose. We might be tempted to think that the virtue of justice consists simply in compliance with the norms of justice our theory specifies: a just person will be one who complies with the norms of justice, whether those are narrowly interpersonal or more broadly social or political in scope. In this way the virtue becomes subsidiary to norms of justice independently specified (Anderson 2010, p. 2; LeBar 2014). Doing so threatens to lose the force that the notion of virtue had in the earliest thinking about justice.

A further complication is that even the idea of justice as a virtue of individuals seems ambiguous in regard to scope. Plato in the Republic treats justice as an overarching virtue of both individuals and societies, so that almost every issue he (or we) would regard as ethical comes in under the notion of justice. But in later usages justice covers only part of individual morality, and we don’t readily think of someone as unjust if they lie or neglect their children — other epithets more readily spring to mind. Individual justice first and most readily regards moral issues having to do with distributions of goods or property. It is, we say, unjust for someone to steal from people or not to give them what he owes them, and it is also unjust if someone called upon to distribute something good (or bad or both) among members of a group uses an arbitrary or unjustified basis for making the distribution. Discussion of justice as an individual virtue often centers on questions, therefore, about property and other distributable goods, though the broader sense broached by Plato never entirely disappears. Still there is disagreement over whether the broader distributive questions associated with political morality have subordinated or obscured the earlier Greek concerns with justice as a virtue of individual character (Hursthouse 1999, pp. 5–6; Coope 2007; Lu 2017).

1. History

1.1 Ancient

Philosophical discussion of justice begins with Plato, who treats the topic in a variety of dialogues, most substantially in Republic. There Plato offers the first sustained discussion of the nature of justice (dikaiosune) and its relation to happiness, as a departure from three alternatives receiving varying degrees of attention. First, there is a traditionalist conception of justice (speaking the truth and paying your debts). Second, Plato has Socrates rebut the Sophist conception of justice which built on a distinction between nature (phusis) and convention (nomos) As Plato has this conception articulated by Thrasymachus in Book I, justice is simply the “advantage of the stronger,” not tracking anything like the sort of value attributed to it by traditionalists. Finally, Plato has Socrates confront a conventionalist conception of justice that anticipates modern contractarian views, in which justice — forbearing preying on others in exchange for not being preyed on by them — is a “second-best alternative,” not as good as being able to prey at will upon others, but better than being the prey of others. These last two challenges give rise to the central question of the book: to whose advantage is justice? Would we really be better off being unjust if we could get away with it? Plato’s negative answer to that question is the project of the balance of the work.

Plato’s method involves the provocative idea that justice in the city (polis) is the same thing as justice in the individual, just “writ large.” There are good reasons to worry about that assumption (Williams 1973; Keyt 2006). But in Plato’s sociology of the city, there are three classes engaged in a kind of division of labor. There is a guardian class which rules, a class of “auxiliaries” that provide the force behind the ruling, and the class of merchants that produce to satisfy the needs and desires of the city. Similarly, the psyche of the individual has three parts: a reasoning part to rule, a “spirited” part to support the rule of reason, and an appetitive part. Plato finds justice in the city to consist in each part “having and doing its own,” and since the smaller is just like the larger, justice in the individual consists in each part of the psyche doing its own work. (This grounds the idea, later enshrined by Justinian, that justice is “giving every man his due;” Justinian I.i). Further, Plato argues, justice is a master virtue in a sense, because in both the city and the psyche, if each part is doing its own job, both city and psyche will also have wisdom, courage, and moderation or self-discipline. This conception of justice sustains the contrast with the conventionalist view advocated by the Sophists. On the other hand, at least initially it leaves it an open question whether the just individual refrains from such socially proscribed actions as lying, killing, and stealing. Plato eventually seeks to show that someone with a healthy, harmonious soul wouldn’t lie, kill, or steal, but it is not clear that argument succeeds, nor, if it does, that that is the right understanding of why we ought not to lie, kill, or steal (Sachs 1963; LeBar 2013, ch. XII).

Plato gives a somewhat different treatment of justice in Crito, in which Socrates’ eponymous friend attempts to persuade Socrates to accept his (Crito’s) offer to bribe a way out of the death sentence Socrates is waiting to have executed. Here Plato’s arguments first associate the just life with the good life, thus the life Socrates has most reason to live. And justice, he then argues, requires not only not inflicting wrong or injury on others, even in response to wrongs from them, but fulfilling one’s agreements, and — in particular — abiding by one’s (tacit or explicit) agreement to abide by the laws of the city unless one can persuade it to change them. Of course, justice cannot require one to abide by laws that require one to act unjustly, as Socrates’ own case (as characterized in Apology) shows (Kraut 1984).

It is worth noting (as Johnston 2011 observes) that even if Plato’s is the first philosophical discussion of justice, a concern with what an individual is due as a matter of justice is a driving issue in Homer’s Iliad, though there is no counterpart concern there with justice as a property of a society or tribe. So even Plato’s philosophical concerns are building on well-established questions about what justice requires of us in our treatment of one another.

Aristotle does not see the virtue of justice in quite the comprehensive sense Plato does; he treats it as a virtue of character (in the entirety of one of the ten books of the Nicomachean Ethics, also common to the Eudemian Ethics), and as a virtue of constitutions and political arrangements (in Politics). The question naturally arises as to the relation between these forms of justice. Aristotle seems to think they are closely related, without being synonymous applications of the same concept. As the latter is a conception of political justice, we will focus here on the former. Justice as a personal virtue follows Aristotle’s model for virtues of character, in which the virtue lies as an intermediate or mean between vices of excess and defect (Nicomachean Ethics V). While he grants that there is a “general” sense of justice in which justice is coincident with complete virtue, there is a “particular” sense in which it is concerned with not overreaching (pleonexia). It is not clear, however, exactly how Aristotle understands this arrangement, or the nature of the vices of excess and defect which this “particular” justice is to counteract. One very plausible reading has it that justice is opposed to a desire for maldistribution of “goods of fortune” such as money, fame, or honor (Williams 1980; Curzer 1995). On another it is opposed to an insufficient attention to others’ rights (Foot 1988, p. 9). On still another it focuses on the goods of others, or common goods (O’Connor 1988; Miller 1995).

These issues remain open in part because Aristotle seems most interested in establishing a conception of the formal structure of “particular” justice, which seems to reflect a conception of desert. He distinguishes between justice in distribution and justice in rectification. The former, he claims, adheres to a kind of proportionality, in which what each deserves is proportional to the relationship between the contributions. If A contributes twice as much as B (of whatever the metric of merit is relevant in some particular case), then A’s return ought also to be twice B’s. This conception of distributive justice obviously lends itself to “goods of fortune” — and to some goods, like wealth, more obviously than others — but it need not in principle be confined to such goods, although the examples Aristotle provides suggest such applications. Similarly, justice in rectification involves a sort of “arithmetical proportion.” If C defrauds D by amount X, then justice requires depriving C of X and restoring X to D, as a matter of reestablishing a kind of equality between them. These structural devices are elegant and attractive, but they leave open a number of questions (LeBar, forthcoming). First, as indicated, to what are we to suppose they apply? Second, in what way do they figure into the nature of the person who is just in the particular sense? (That is, how are they related to justice as a virtue?) Does a model of particular justice as a virtue fit the general model of virtue as a mean, and if so, what sort of mean is it? Aristotle seems torn between a conception of justice as a virtue in his distinctive understanding of what a virtue is — with a requirement that one have all the virtues to have any (Nicomachean EthicsVI.13), and rooted in the doctrine of the mean — and justice as having the form of a formal normative structure, to which the virtue threatens to become subsidiary. All this is to leave aside questions of the relation between this “particular” sense of justice and political justice, and the role of the virtue of justice in the individual as it contributes to justice in the polis.

Epicurus’ conception of the role of justice was more central to his eudaimonism perhaps than its counterpart in Plato and Aristotle, but that reflects in part his distinctive understanding of eudaimonia, or happiness. For Epicurus this consisted in ataraxia — tranquility, or freedom from disturbance. Given that the good life is the life without disturbance, justice plays a key instrumental role. One might, Epicurus thinks, withdraw entirely from human society to avoid disturbance, but the alternative is to live socially under terms which secure the avoidance of disturbance. This is the structure of the ideal Epicurean community, in which each forbears aggression (Armstrong 1997, Thrasher 2013). Justice is a matter of keeping agreements generally, and in particular the agreement not to harm or transgress social norms.

In this way Epicurus offers a conception of the virtue of justice that harmonizes both its personal and its political dimensions. The personal virtue consists in the motivation to abide by a contract not to aggress or harm others. The political virtue inheres in a polity in which such norms regulate the conduct of its citizens, and these two dimensions of justice as a virtue reinforce each other.

The other great ethical tradition of antiquity (Stoicism) had remarkably little to say about justice (Annas 1993, p. 311), so we pass on to the medieval and modern periods.

1.2 Medieval and Modern

The legacy of the ancients — Aristotle in particular — continued into the medieval period, notably in the work of Thomas Aquinas, who appropriated much of Aristotle’s philosophy while setting it into a Christian theological framework. As in Aristotle, virtue and virtues are prominent parts of his ethical theory. And, like Aristotle justice is an important virtue, though for Aquinas it less important than the virtue of charity, a Christian virtue that did not appear among the virtues recognized by Aristotle. There are other elements of his account that situate it in an interesting way in the transition from ancient eudaimonist accounts of virtue, to virtue as it appears in the modern era, before it recedes from prominence in ethical theory.

But to the extent Christian writers allied themselves with Plato and Aristotle, they were downplaying another central element in Christian thought and morality, the emphasis on agapic love. Such love seems to be a matter of motivationally active feeling rather than of being rational, and some writers on morality (eventually) allowed this side of Christianity to have a major influence on what they had to say about virtue.

Significant elements of the Aristotelian account of justice reappear in Aquinas’. First, justice is first and foremost a virtue of character rather than institutions, although Aquinas draws a distinction among such virtues not found in Aristotle. For Aquinas, justice as a virtue is a matter of perfection of the will, rather than the passions (ST II-II 58.4). Aquinas offers no account of justice as a virtue of societies or institutions, though he interprets the “general” sense of justice he borrows from Aristotle as being a matter of individual willing and action for the common good. “Particular” justice, which as in Aristotle’s account is most of his focus, has to do with relationships -- in particular but not limited to exchange -- between individuals as individuals (ST II-II 58.8).

Second, Aquinas grounds the norms for these exchanges in the ancient formula of Justinian, which hearkens back to Plato: justice is giving each his own. But his interpretation of this formula situates him astride a deep but subtle divide between ancient and modern thought. To some extent this effect is an upshot of his inheriting not only the Greek eudaimonist tradition, but also a Roman jurisprudential tradition in which notions like standing and right as claim (rather than, say, fairness) had begun to emerge (Porter 2016, p. 143). As a result, Aquinas’ synergistic account has some novel complications.

One major complication, relative to the ancient accounts, is that what is ours by right is a recognition of a kind of status, as an effect of the order among people ordained by God (ST I-II 100.8). As Jean Porter points out, this establishes a normative standard for justice that does not grow out of the agent’s own perfection or eudaimonia (Porter 2016, p. 157). There are two significant follow-on implications.

First, the fabric of the eudaimonist approach to practical reasoning and life — inherited from the Greeks — begins to fray. For better or worse, on the Greek eudaimonist views (including here Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and Epicurus) our reasons for action arise from our interest in a happy life. If the reason-giving nature of others arises from a different source, as this reading of Aquinas suggests, then practical reason seems to have a duality of ultimate sources, with the complications that kind of duality brings.

Second, this is the first step in the diminution of the theoretical significance of the virtues — a process that will not begin to be reversed until the middle of the 20th century. On Aristotle’s view, for example, the virtuous person sees reasons for acting that the non-virtuous do not (and that arguably are not there to be seen absent the effects of virtue — LeBar 2013; Berryman 2019). Virtue is no longer the normative epicenter of the theory, as it was for the Greeks. To the extent that this aspect of Aquinas’s view has virtue responsive to value or reasons that is accounted for in some way other than the work of virtue, it is the leading edge of process that will result in a much-reduced role for virtue in later ethical accounts

Hume is an excellent exemplar of this point, in both the Treatise and the Enquiries. Virtue, Hume maintains, is a matter of “some quality or character,” produced in one by “durable principles of the mind” (T III.iii.I, p. 575). We deem such qualities virtues not, as on the ancient Greek view, because they conduce to the happiness of the person who has them, but because they have a “tendency to the good of mankind” or society. (T III.iii.I). This service renders them pleasing to our “moral tastes:” our approbation, Hume tells us, has its source in “view of a character, which is naturally fitted to be useful to others, or to the person himself, or which is agreeable to others, or to the person himself” (T III.iii.I, 591). We can think of that as the criterion some quality of character must have to be deemed a virtue. In consequence, what counts as virtuous is an upshot of, and not the source of, the normative foundations of this view.

By Hume’s time the content of justice as a virtue has shifted as well. In Hume’s treatment, the focus of justice is property — relations of “mine and thine.” It is a “cautious, jealous” virtue in the sense that it is focused on the sorts of exclusionary powers that are characteristic of property rules and relations. We may always be aspiring for more but justice aims at the preservation and security of what one has already (E III.1, p. 184). So the virtue of justice, as Hume thinks of it, will in the main consist of a quality in one which disposes one to observe and uphold these rules.

What Hume wants to show is, first, that we can have such a disposition or quality (that is, that it is possible for us to have a quality or character to observe the rules of justice), and, second, that such a quality would count as a virtue, given his criteria. His approach to these questions in the Treatise is framed by a problem he has set up himself. To appreciate that problem, we have to step back to Hume’s broader view about moral motivation. Hume had argued that moral principles “are not conclusions of our reason” (T III.i.I); instead, they are “more properly felt than judg’d of” (T III.i.II). Morality, and virtue, is a matter of sentiments or passions. Why? Hume marshals a number of arguments to this effect which are not relevant to our purposes. The basic reason is that the functional roles of reason and the passions are markedly different, in Hume’s view. The task of reason is to discover truth or falsehood, in “relations of ideas” or “matters of facts” (T III.i.I); as such, it utterly lacks the capacity to move us to action. Only the passions can do that (T II.iii.III). The passions, on the other hand, have no representational content whatsoever; they are “original existences” (T II.iii.III; III.i.I). Virtue is paradigmatically a practical matter: it is a property of what we do, and to act we must be motivated. That means any successful account of virtue must find it in our passions, not in any aspect of our reason (T III.i.I). So far so good.

However, when we come to justice, we look in vain for a passion that can supply motive power for us to act justly. If anything, our natural motives move us away from justice (T III.ii.II). Self-love requires “correcting and restraining” (T III.ii.I). And only a passion can do that. But which? Hume himself dismisses the possibilities of public or private beneficence or universal love. In the end he concludes that there is no natural passion to explain it. Instead, it is in a certain crucial sense artificial (T III.ii.VI). Under certain conditions, given that we are sensible of the advantages of living in human society, our self-love or self-interest may be given an “alteration of its direction,” and induce us to respect the rules of justice. These Hume thinks of primarily as involving honesty and “particular” property rules (T III.ii.II). That “alteration” needs explanation.

Two facts about the conditions in which we act — one about us, one about our environment — set this alteration in motion. First, Hume maintains, we are limited in our generosity or benevolence. And second, we live in conditions of scarcity (T III.ii.II). We have to work to make a go of it, and we cannot count on others to do so for us. We need control of our world to meet our needs, but we are vulnerable to the selfishness and predation of others.

The solution, Hume argues, is that we naturally fall into a “convention” by which we observe that rules of property — the observance of which is key to the virtue of justice — is good for all of us. This convention is no formal agreement; Hume argues that it cannot be something like the product of promise or compact (T III.ii.II). Instead, “it arises gradually, and acquires force by a slow progression, and by our repeated experience of the inconveniences of transgressing it” (T III.ii.II, p. 490). Much as two men pulling the oars in a boat together need no explicit agreement to find they prosper by such an arrangement, so do we generally. (Wilson 2018 explores support for Hume’s hypothesis through work in experimental economics.) So in the end it is self-interest that drives us to comply with the requirements of justice, though Hume adds that sympathy with the public interest induces our endorsement of it once justice has become established. This endorsement, however, is reserved for a scheme of property rules taken generally; as Hume observes, individual instances of compliance may frequently be “contrary to public interest,” though such compliance is still required of us. Hume believes the benefit of the system overall, both to society and to individual, requires that rules not admit of exceptions (T III.ii.II, E Appendix III, §256). Self-interest accounts for the possibility of our being motivated to act as the virtue of justice requires, and both the utility and the agreeableness, both to ourselves and others, of a resulting social order with respected property rules, leads to our approbation of that motivation as a virtue.

In fact, this point — that “public utility is the sole origin of justice” — is the point of Hume’s discussion of justice in the Enquiries (III.I, ¶145). Scarcity imposes a need for us to distinguish mine from thine, and we have not sufficient generosity in our natures to do without property rules (as we might, say, in our families). And once again Hume argues that our recognition of the utility and necessity of justice provides “entire command over our sentiments” (E III.II, ¶163).As David Johnston observes (Johnston 2011, p. 138), Hume’s understanding of the value of justice as instrumental in the promotion of utility marks a sharp shift from earlier understandings which invoked various forms of reciprocity in understanding that value.

Such a sentimentalist account of justice is also found in Adam Smith; in fact, a focus on the sentiments almost completely swamps concern for virtue. Our judgments of virtue and vice, he says, are compounded by consideration of two different “relations” in a sentiment: “the cause or object which excites or causes it, and … the end which it proposes” (TMS II.i.introduction). His focus on those two “relations” obviates any independent discussion of virtue per se. He does however explicitly countenance a virtue of justice, developed in contrast with the virtue of beneficence. In Smith, even more clearly than in Hume, one can see that this virtue consists in conformity to “rules” or “laws” of justice that appear to exist antecedently to the realization of the virtue itself, unlike ancient accounts. Smith indicates that justice merits resentment when absent, that it may be “extorted by force,” and that in the main it requires forbearing from harming others.. Smith calls justice a “negative virtue” in this respect: often all it requires is that we sit still and do nothing (Smith 1759, II.ii.I.5, 9). It is essential to the subsistence of society, Smith tells us (Smith 1759, II.ii.3.3-4), but — in contrast to Hume — is not reducible in its motivational basis to regard for society. Instead, our just concern for “multitudes” is compounded of our concern for individuals, which arises from “fellow-feeling,” which is yet short of “love, esteem, and affection” (Smith 1759, II.ii.3.7).

In Kant, finally, along with a movement away from sentimentalism we see the completion of the distinction between justice as a virtue and justice as a norm to which a virtue may or may not correspond. While Kant has a theory (or “doctrine”) of virtue, he distinguishes that theory precisely against a counterpoised theory of justice. The two are complementary elements in the “metaphysics of morals.” Moreover, the doctrine of justice itself has two parts, roughly corresponding to the distinction present since Plato’s work, between the role of justice in the individual and the role of justice in the state. Kant calls these “private right” and “public right,” respectively. But right in either case is not how Kant at least conceives of virtue; instead, right is a “condition” that can obtain between the moral agents comprising a moral or legal community, in virtue of their principles of choice in acting (Kant 1797). Little remains here of the notion of justice as a virtue of individuals as it began with the ancient Greeks.

2. Social Psychology and Justice

20th-century developmental psychology drew deeply on the Kantian legacy. Piaget (1932/1948) treated moral development as principally involving increasing cognitive sophistication. More particularly, Piaget saw that sophistication as a matter of taking more and more general or universal views of moral issues, and endorsed the Kantian and rationalist idea that morality rests on and can be justified in terms of considerations of justice. Piaget saw a “law of evolution” in moral development, from an understanding of rules (including moral rules) as being “heteronomous” impositions of authority, to which one is objectively responsible, to a grounding in mutual respect, accompanied by subjective responsibility to others (Piaget 1932/1948, p. 225). This transition is fostered through social interaction, and attention to norms of equality and reciprocity replace those of mere obedience.

Educational psychologist Lawrence Kohlberg was inspired by Piaget to propose a conception of moral development that postulated six stages of human moral development. In his earliest work, Kohlberg identified the highest stage of such development with a concern for justice and human rights based on universal principles. Concern for relationships and for individual human well-being was embedded in a framework of conformity to social norms, at lower stages of the process. Moreover, he saw the ordering of the different stages in Piagetian fashion as basically reflecting differences in rational understanding: those whose moral thinking involved the invoking of universal principles of justice and rights were thought to show a more advanced cognitive development than those whose moral thought appeals primarily to the importance of relationships and of human well-being or suffering. The paradigm of moral development involves judgments that are “reversible,” in the sense that each party to the issue can accept the correct judgment by reversing his or her perspective and taking up the viewpoint of the other (Kohlberg 1981). The sophisticated moral reasoner will engage in a process of “moral musical chairs,” taking up the positions of the parties to the conflict successively. It is, on this version of Kohlberg’s thought, that formal feature of the deliberative process that is characteristic of greatest moral development. As his research and thought progressed, however, Kohlberg increasingly acknowledged that these formal features were less characteristic of overall moral development and thought than of the deployment of specifically justice-based concepts. In fact, Kohlberg was impressed by the work of Rawls, and thought that the nature of Rawls’ “original position of equality” exemplified the kind of reversibility that is paradigmatic of the highest form of moral thought (Kohlberg 1981, p. 204). However, his approach treats utilitarianism as less cognitively advanced (more primitive) than rationalist views like Kant’s, and utilitarians (like R.M. Hare) naturally called into question the objectivity and intellectual fairness of Kohlberg’s account.

More significantly, perhaps, the evidence for Kohlberg’s stage sequence was drawn from studies of boys, and when one applies the sequence to the study of young girls, it turns out that girls on average end up at a less advanced stage of moral development than boys do. In her 1982 book In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women’s Development, Carol Gilligan responded to Kohlberg’s views by questioning whether a theory of moral development based solely on a sample of males could reasonably be used to draw conclusions about the inferior moral development of women. Gilligan argued that her own studies of women’s development indicated that the moral development of girls and women proceeds and ends in a different fashion from that of boys and men, but that that proves nothing about inferiority or superiority: it is merely a fact of difference. In particular, Gilligan claimed that women tend to think morally in terms of connection to others (relationships) and in terms of caring about (responsibility for) those with whom they are connected; men, by contrast and in line with Kohlberg’s studies, tend to think more in terms of general principles of justice and of individual rights against (or individual autonomy from) other people. But Jean Hampton, among others, responded that Gilligan’s critique was itself a distortion, and that concerns for justice and individual rights are as significant for and in the moral lives of women as for men (Hampton 1993).

In recent years, a variety of social sciences have intensified investigation into aspects of our natures that are plausibly important for a virtue of justice. For example, Widlok 2018 surveys cross-cultural anthropological work examining the development of “ethical skill” in rightful and just sharing practices.

3. Justice as a Virtue of Societies

For a variety of reasons, many ethical thinkers have thought that justice cannot be based in sentiment but requires a more intellectually constructive rational(ist) basis, and in recent times this view of the matter seems to have been held, most influentially, by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice. Rawls makes clear his belief in the inadequacy of benevolence or sympathetic human sentiment in formulating an adequate conception of social justice. He says in particular that sentiment leaves unanswered or indeterminate various important issues of justice that a good theory of justice ought to be able to resolve.

Rawls’s positive view of justice is concerned primarily with the justice of institutions or (what he calls) the “basic structure” of society: justice as an individual virtue is derivative from justice as a social virtue defined via certain principles of justice. The principles, famously, are derived from an “original position” in which (very roughly) rational contractors under a “veil of ignorance” decide how they wish to commit themselves to being governed in their actual lives. Rawls deliberately invokes Kantian rationalism (or anti-sentimentalism) in explaining the intellectual or theoretical motivation behind his construction, and the two principles of justice that he argues would be agreed upon under the contractual conditions he specifies represent a kind of egalitarian political liberalism. Roughly, those principles stress (equality of) basic liberties and opportunities for self-advancement over considerations of social welfare, and the distribution of opportunities and goods in society is then supposed to work to the advantage of all (especially the worst-off members of society). He also says that the idea of what people distributively deserve or merit is derivative from social justice rather than (as with Aristotle and/or much common-sense thinking) providing the basis for thinking about social justice.

According to Rawls, individual justice is theoretically derivative from social justice because the just individual is to be understood as someone with an effective or “regulative” desire to comply with the principles of justice. However, it is not merely social justice that Rawls understands in (predominantly) rationalist fashion. When he explains how individuals (within a just society) develop a sense and/or the virtue of justice, he invokes the work of Piaget. Rawls lays more stress than Piaget does on the role our affective nature (sympathy and the desire for self-mastery) plays in the acquisition of moral virtue. But, like Piaget, he stresses the need for a sufficiently general appreciation and rational understanding of social relations as the grounding basis of a sense of duty or of justice and he explicitly classifies his account of moral development as falling within the “rationalist tradition.”

4. Justice and Other Virtues

Few would doubt that justice is a virtue of character. But there are other moral virtues. How is justice related to them? Is it more important? Even in Republic, in which Plato makes justice a “master virtue” of sorts, there are other virtues (wisdom, courage, and self-discipline), and elsewhere (notably Gorgias) Plato makes self-discipline (sophrosune) the “master virtue,” so it is not clear that justice has any sort of priority over these other virtues. Likewise, though the texts we have show Aristotle devoting more space to justice, it is not clear that the particular form of the virtue of justice has any sort of pre-eminence. On the other hand, Cicero claims that justice is the “crowning glory” of the virtues (De Officiis I.7). If we take virtue of character to have the moral centrality the ancients (perhaps in contrast to the moderns), how much importance should we accord to justice among the virtues?

Aquinas cites Cicero as a target in developing a sophisticated view of the relationships among the virtues (ST II-II 58.12). On Aquinas’ view, Cicero is half right, for Aquinas distinguishes between virtues as responsive to appetites of our animal nature (moral virtues) and as responsive to appetites of our intellect (virtues of the will). He takes it that justice is preeminent over the moral virtues because it inheres in the rational part of the soul, and because its object is more noble (the good of others, or the common good, rather than the individual good). On that point he can agree with Cicero. However, these virtues themselves are not as excellent as the theological virtues, of which the greatest is love (or charity -- caritas; ST II-II 23.6). There are several arguments for this claim but it is grounded in Paul’s admonition to the Corinthians, that love is the greatest among the virtues of faith and hope (1 Corinthians 13:13).

In recent decades there have been secular challenges to the primacy of justice among virtues. Recall that Carol Gilligan had argued for a “different voice” for women in coming to grips with moral problems. Instead of a rights-based understanding of morality that gave special consideration to the individual, women saw relationships between people as primary (Gilligan 1983, pp. 19, 29). Kohlberg had offered a thought experiment about a man (“Heinz”) tempted to steal a life-saving drug to save his sick wife (Kohlberg 1981, p. 12). Whereas boys are more likely to think of Heinz’ dilemma in terms of what is the right thing to do, girls, Gilligan argues, see the world as “a world of relationships and psychological truths where an awareness of the connection between people gives rise to a recognition of responsibility for one another” (Gillian 1983, p. 30). Gilligan carefully frames this contrast as one between voices, not a matter of ranking of dispositions or virtues, but her work can and did provide a basis for making that sort of assessment between virtues, one on which (as in Aquinas’ case) love and care for others turns out to be more important than considerations of justice.

In some ways, Nel Nodding’s pioneering work in laying out an “ethic of care” takes such a step. Following Gilligan, she sees much ethical theory as missing a feminine voice, one which grounds moral concern for the concrete other in caring for them and their needs, and thus as relational rather than individualistic (Noddings 1983, 1999). Yet some caution is required before seeing her as taking up something like a Thomistic stance on the priority of love over justice. For one thing, to a significant degree she wants to emphasize the importance of the concrete and particular as opposed to the abstract and general (or the reliance on universal principles) in thinking and acting morally. But that is an emphasis which animates some particularistic forms of virtue ethics, and does not distinguish justice from love or other virtues. Moreover, where she explicitly argues that care “‘picks up’ where justice leaves off” (Noddings 1999, p. 12), she is thinking of justice as a property of institutions (e.g. Rawls’ theory of justice as fairness), and institutional implementations of those theories, not a virtue of character. She is clearly concerned about the limits of “rights-talk,” but that at least historically has not been a prominent part in thinking about justice as a virtue of character. Thus she does not clearly take a side in this matter.

Like Noddings, Virginia Held frames much of the point of the ethics of care against a historical theoretical backdrop of attention to justice (Held 1995, 2004, 2006). To some extent, like Noddings, for Held the relevant notion of justice is not a virtue of character but a concern with fairness, equality, and individual rights, or perhaps more generally impartial universal principles (Held 2004, p. 144; 2006, p. 14). In fact, Held more clearly poses an ethics of care as an alternative to virtue ethics (Held 2004, 143; 2006, 14). This is for two reasons. First, virtue ethical theories focus on dispositions and traits of individuals, whereas an ethics of care focuses on relations between individuals. Second, an ethics of care sees people as partially constituted by their relations with others, as opposed to the individualism characteristic of virtue ethics. Held does not think an ethics of care can do without a concern for justice as a value, however (Held 1995, 129). More generally, she believes, caring provides a “wider network” within which concerns for justice and virtue (as well as utility) should be fitted (2004, 147; 2006, 72). Margaret McLaren (2001), on the other hand, responds on the basis of commonalities between care ethics and virtue ethics that care ethics actually is most attractive when situated as an ethics of virtue. Marilyn Friedman (1987) similarly seems accepting of the general framework of virtue ethics, and of crucial places for virtues of both caring and justice within such a framework, responsive to different degrees and in different ways to gender differences she believes actually do hold, though not falling along a caring/justice fault line.

Michael Slote also accepts care ethics as well-situated as a virtue ethical theory, but argues for the necessity of conceiving such a theory as “agent-based” -- holding that motivation or motives are “the ultimate bases for evaluation of action, institutions, laws, and societies” (Slote 1998, p. 173). As he has developed his view, empathic motivation has come to take an increasing role (Slote 2010, p. 124). As with Noddings and Held, for Slote the relevant questions about justice are about forms of social organization, the allocation of rights, and so on. If there is a vestige of the Platonic/Justinian model of justice as a virtue, it would appear to figure in only as a rationale for the shape of some social policies reflecting e.g. social (or perhaps global) distributive justice. But empathy is the focal normative concern throughout. The justice of a society constitutively depends on the motives of the individuals who make it up (Slote 1998, p. 187; 2010, p. 128). If the relevant motives are caring or empathic ones, then Slote’s analysis would seem to collapse the distinction between caring and justice as virtues of individual character (or motivation). That is, individuals would count as just exactly to the degree that their motivations are empathic, and they thus contribute to the laws, policies, institutions, and so on in ways that are reflective of similar motivations across society. But that is just to say that they are caring motivations as well.

A somewhat different feminist critique of a focus on a virtue of justice comes from Robin Dillon. Like Slote, her concern is more with social institutions, structures, and hierarchies than with traits of character, and in fact these priorities lead her to be critical of virtue ethical theories which, she believes, cannot ask the right questions about virtues and vices (Dillon 2012, p. 86). However, she does accept the point that character traits matter, though she believes attending to the vices that allow and support social structures that allow for oppression and domination is more pertinent to feminist moral philosophy.

Lisa Tessman, on the other hand, accepts the basic framework of Aristotelian thinking about virtues of character, and with it the virtue of justice (Tessman 2005). However, she argues that oppressive social conditions can interfere in ways Aristotle did not anticipate with the formation of virtues of character and consequently (given Aristotle’s framework) with prospects for happiness (eudaimonia). One point of amendment, then, to Aristotelian thought is to recognize that oppressive social conditions may make other traits — traits that are important for liberatory struggle — into virtues. Another, congruent with other lines of feminist critique, is that Aristotle is insufficiently appreciative of the need for sensitivity to and response to suffering, so that something like the kind of supplementation recommended by care ethics is appropriate. A different model of response to the development of the virtue of justice specifically under non-ideal or unjust social conditions, one modeled on Kohlberg’s original architectonic understanding of the virtue, is defended by Jon Garthoff (Garthoff 2018).

Finally, in recent work Talbot Brewer has argued that a “revisionist” version of Aristotelian virtue ethics does a better job than competitors (including Kantian and contractualist theories) at recognizing the “irreplaceable value” of each human being (Brewer 2018). Brewer believes that a robust conception of the virtue of justice does important work for such a theory, not just focusing on distribution and allocation, but more generally establishing the space for virtuous recognition of ways that others can demand that we treat them (Brewer 2018, p. 25). Still, Brewer invokes Aquinas to argue that such justice is not enough, that that what is required is a recognition of a virtue of love to unify and perfect the other virtues of character.

5. Recent Developments

While Rawls’ work has sparked an explosion of work in distributive justice and social justice more generally, in recent years a variety of strategies to return to a focus on justice as a personal virtue has emerged. These strategies vary across both dimensions we have considered, taking with various degrees of seriousness the connection between institutional and personal forms of justice, and focusing on the latter as a virtue, among (and like) other virtues.

One such strategy is that of Jon Drydyk, who builds on the “capability approach” to human welfare to make a case for a capabilities-based account of the justice of individual agents, in particular as against an “Aristotelian” approach that stresses justice as a matter of response to merit. Acting justly involves “striving to reduce and remove inequalities in people’s capabilities to function in ways that are elemental” to a truly human life (Drydyk 2012, pp. 31, 33). This is a “subsidiary” virtue account, in that we begin with a prior conception of the content of the requirements of justice, and conform the virtue to this conception. However, Drydyk emphasizes justice as a virtue of individuals, rather than institutions or societies. Drydyk’s strategy offers a counterpoint both to the Rawlsian way of thinking about just societies and to the ancient Greek way of thinking about justice as a virtue of individuals.

John Hacker-Wright argues that what is needed to replace a “legalistic” concern with moral status (as on modern liberal conceptions of justice) is instead an ethic of virtue with a different conception of the virtue of justice. Instead of a concern for the resolution of claims in something like reciprocal, contractual relations, Hacker-Wright’s conception of the virtue of justice is a matter of sensitivity to “vulnerability of value” in things, animate and otherwise. Thus, the threat of unjust — vicious -- wronging hangs not only over people who are sufficiently cognitively impaired so as not to perceive insults, but also corpses, animals, and even rare and valuable rock formations (p. 463). This counts as a sense of justice in that, on Hacker-Wright’s view it is not merely that we can act wrongly or viciously toward such entities, but (following Midgley 1983) that they can be wronged by us by our doing so. However, while Hacker-Wright claims that on a virtue ethic “The character of the agent is recognized as ineliminable in picking out facts as they figure in our moral deliberation,” this does not strictly speaking seem to be true, as prior to virtue there is value which it is up to the just or virtuous person to respond with sensitivity (Hacker-Wright 2007, pp. 461, 463, 464).

David Schmidtz and John Thrasher suggest rethinking the relationship between social justice and individual justice (Schmidtz and Thrasher 2014). Turning Plato’s account of justice in Republic on its head, they depict justice as a bridge between a virtue of the soul and of the polis: because we are essentially social, we need community, and justice is a matter of harmony with the community. On their view this is (largely) a matter of compliance with rules and institutions that enable people to live in harmony and flourish together.

An alternative proposal for thinking of the justice as a personal virtue ties it intimately to the experiences we have as emotional creatures. On this approach, instead of justice standing as distinct from “natural virtues” motivated by passions (as on Hume’s account), or needing to be replaced by sentimentally-driven attitudes such as care or compassion, justice is to be seen as a virtue largely constituted by emotion (Solomon 1994, Roberts 2010). The virtue amounts to a stable disposition of character to respond in the relevant ways to instances of injustice, perhaps consisting in those occasions in which one does not receive his or her due, and on the other hand to be disposed to a “will to give each his due” (Roberts 2010, p. 38). For Roberts, this is a will to realize “objective justice,” and as on other recent accounts, the virtue (and the passion) are theoretically subsidiary to this primary notion of “objective justice.”

There are also recent ventures in the spirit of the ancient Greek thinking about the individual virtue of justice. Rasmussen and Den Uyl (2005) argue for two interpersonal senses of justice (pp. 160-63). One is the familiar Aristotelian virtue. The second is a “metanormative” principle governing the institutions and legal frameworks in which individual agents (just and otherwise) live their lives and exercise their practical agency. The second of these senses of interpersonal justice does not draw its content from the exercise of virtue, but rather makes a place for it. The former does depend on virtue overall (including the exercise of practical wisdom) for its demands, but these are construed broadly in the traditional way of rendering to each his due. Bloomfield (2011) similarly suggests extending the Aristotelian virtue of justice, but in an inward direction, arguing that self-respect is necessary for happiness, and treating oneself fairly requires treating oneself fairly, as one treats others fairly, as a property of justice as individuals.

On the other hand, Wolterstorff (2008) argues that the eudaimonism of Greek thought prevents a proper appreciation for the nature and significance of justice and rights. Whether there is theoretical space remaining for a virtue of justice is not a question Wolterstorff considers, but he does believe there is no hope for an adequate grip on justice in an Aristotelian or Stoic framework.

Recent thinkers have grappled with the question of priority between formal principle and virtue that vexed Aristotle, and offered solutions that for the most part subordinate the virtue of justice to the prior notion of the justice of distributions, as Aristotle himself seems to have suggested. Bernard Williams claims explicitly that this is so (Williams 1980, p. 197), as does David Wiggins, in an attempt to bring a “pre-liberal,” Aristotelian conception of justice to bear on modern liberal conceptions, a la Kant and Rawls (Wiggins 2004). To do so, Wiggins distinguishes three senses of justice: (A) a matter of outcomes or states of affairs in which each gets what is due; (B) a disposition to promote justice (A); (C) a condition of the polis in virtue of which (A) is realized. Wiggins claims that the proper outcome of this collision of conceptions is one that recognizes a form of logical priority of justice (A) over justice (B) (p. 489). At the same time, against Williams he insists that the normative demands of justice (A) are “comprehensible” only within the perspective of a person with justice (B). And in fact he claims that a necessary condition on acts and outcomes satisfying the norms of justice (A) is that they be recognized to be so by those with the virtue of justice (B). Wiggins’ thinking here is not transparent, but perhaps the thought is that the logical point is purely formal: someone with justice (B) must, in act or judging justly, be responding to some norm which counts as justice (A). But, as merely formal, that tells us nothing about the substantive content of that norm. To get that, we have ineliminable need to refer to the judgment of the person with justice (B). That marks a way perhaps of restoring Aristotle’s focus on virtue in coming to understand the virtue of justice.

LeBar (2013, 2014) takes a similar tack in attempting to incorporate Kantian and post-Kantian insights into just demands on the treatment of others into an Aristotelian virtue framework. On his view, there is no way to specify the contents of the demands of justice, or to spell out its norms, independently of the wider possession and exercise of the virtues, including the virtue of practical wisdom. At the same time, what the virtuous and just person sees, in inhabiting a social world with equals in moral standing, are the norms which have become associated with the liberal conception: the standing to obligate others and hold them accountable, for example.

Finally, all of these are Western treatments of an individual virtue of justice. May Sim (Sim 2007, 2018) makes the case that there are informative parallels between the Confucian treatment of the virtues (in particular, yi) and the virtue of justice as adumbrated in Plato and Aristotle.

6. Conclusion

There are many different conceptions of the virtue of justice, and only some of them are distinctively virtue ethical. Many non-virtual ethical approaches put forward theories of virtue, and what distinguishes them from virtue ethics is that the given theory of virtue comes later in the order of explanation, rather than itself serving as the basis for understanding (all of) morality. This is especially the case with justice, where (as we have seen) it is naturally tempting to account for the norms of justice first and derive an account of the virtue in light of those norms. The question of the priority of norms of justice or the virtue of justice is likely to continue to generate exploration and debate, as is the question of how our lives as social and political animals contributes to understanding the virtue of justice. These vexed questions have inspired a profusion of views and no doubt will continue to do so.


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