First published Mon Jun 26, 2017; substantive revision Fri Aug 6, 2021

The idea of justice occupies centre stage both in ethics, and in legal and political philosophy. We apply it to individual actions, to laws, and to public policies, and we think in each case that if they are unjust this is a strong, maybe even conclusive, reason to reject them. Classically, justice was counted as one of the four cardinal virtues (and sometimes as the most important of the four); in modern times John Rawls famously described it as ‘the first virtue of social institutions’ (Rawls 1971, p.3; Rawls, 1999, p.3). We might debate which of these realms of practical philosophy has first claim on justice: is it first and foremost a property of the law, for example, and only derivatively a property of individuals and other institutions? But it is probably more enlightening to accept that the idea has over time sunk deep roots in each of these domains, and to try to make sense of such a wide-ranging concept by identifying elements that are present whenever justice is invoked, but also examining the different forms it takes in various practical contexts. This article aims to provide a general map of the ways in which justice has been understood by philosophers, past and present.

We begin by identifying four core features that distinguish justice from other moral and political ideas. We then examine some major conceptual contrasts: between conservative and ideal justice, between corrective and distributive justice, between procedural and substantive justice, and between comparative and non-comparative justice. Next we turn to questions of scope: to who or what do principles of justice apply? We ask whether non-human animals can be subjects of justice, whether justice applies only between people who already stand in a particular kind of relationship to one another, and whether individual people continue to have duties of justice once justice-based institutions have been created. We then examine three overarching theories that might serve to unify the different forms of justice: utilitarianism, contractarianism, and egalitarianism. But it seems, in conclusion, that no such theory is likely be successful.

More detailed discussions of particular forms of justice can be found in other entries: see especially distributive justice, global justice, intergenerational justice, international distributive justice, justice and bad luck, justice as a virtue, and retributive justice.

1. Justice: Mapping the Concept

‘Justice’ has sometimes been used in a way that makes it virtually indistinguishable from rightness in general. Aristotle, for example, distinguished between ‘universal’ justice that corresponded to ‘virtue as a whole’ and ‘particular’ justice which had a narrower scope (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, chs. 1–2). The wide sense may have been more evident in classical Greek than in modern English. But Aristotle also noted that when justice was identified with ‘complete virtue’, this was always ‘in relation to another person’. In other words, if justice is to be identified with morality as such, it must be morality in the sense of ‘what we owe to each other’ (see Scanlon 1998). But it is anyway questionable whether justice should be understood so widely. At the level of individual ethics, justice is often contrasted with charity on the one hand, and mercy on the other, and these too are other-regarding virtues. At the level of public policy, reasons of justice are distinct from, and often compete with, reasons of other kinds, for example economic efficiency or environmental value.

As this article will endeavour to show, justice takes on different meanings in different practical contexts, and to understand it fully we have to grapple with this diversity. But it is nevertheless worth asking whether we find a core concept that runs through all these various uses, or whether it is better regarded as a family resemblance idea according to which different combinations of features are expected to appear on each occasion of use. The most plausible candidate for a core definition comes from the Institutes of Justinian, a codification of Roman Law from the sixth century AD, where justice is defined as ‘the constant and perpetual will to render to each his due’. This is of course quite abstract until further specified, but it does throw light upon four important aspects of justice.

1.1 Justice and Individual Claims

First, it shows that justice has to do with how individual people are treated (‘to each his due’). Issues of justice arise in circumstances in which people can advance claims – to freedom, opportunities, resources, and so forth – that are potentially conflicting, and we appeal to justice to resolve such conflicts by determining what each person is properly entitled to have. In contrast, where people’s interests converge, and the decision to be taken is about the best way to pursue some common purpose – think of a government official having to decide how much food to stockpile as insurance against some future emergency – justice gives way to other values. In other cases, there may be no reason to appeal to justice because resources are so plentiful that we do not need to worry about allotting shares to individuals. Hume pointed out that in a hypothetical state of abundance where ‘every individual finds himself fully provided with whatever his most voracious appetites can want’, ‘the cautious, jealous virtue of justice would never once have been dreamed of’ (Hume, An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, pp. 183–4). Hume also believed – and philosophical controversy on this point persists until today – that justice has no place in close personal relationships, such as the family, where (it is alleged) each identifies with the others’ interests so strongly that there is no need and no reason for anyone to make claims of personal entitlement. (See Sandel 1982 for a defence of this view; for a critique, see Okin 1989. See also the entry on feminist perspectives on reproduction and the family).

That justice is a matter of how each separate person is treated appears to create problems for theories such as utilitarianism that judge actions and policies on the basis of their overall consequences aggregated across people – assuming that these theories wish to incorporate rather than discard the idea of justice. In Section 4 below we examine how utilitarians have attempted to respond to this challenge.

Although justice is centrally a matter of how individuals are treated, it is also possible to speak of justice for groups – for example when the state is allocating resources between different categories of citizens. Here each group is being treated as though it were a separate individual for purposes of the allocation.

1.2 Justice, Charity and Enforceable Obligation

Second, Justinian’s definition underlines that just treatment is something due to each person, in other words that justice is a matter of claims that can be rightfully made against the agent dispensing justice, whether a person or an institution. Here there is a contrast with other virtues: we demand justice, but we beg for charity or forgiveness. This also means that justice is a matter of obligation for the agent dispensing it, and that the agent wrongs the recipient if the latter is denied what is due to her. It is a characteristic mark of justice that the obligations it creates should be enforceable: we can be made to deliver what is due to others as a matter of justice, either by the recipients themselves or by third parties. However it overstates the position to make the enforceability of its requirements a defining feature of justice (see Buchanan 1987). On the one hand, there are some claims of justice that seem not to be enforceable (by anyone). When we dispense gifts to our children or our friends, we ought to treat each recipient fairly, but neither the beneficiaries themselves nor anyone else can rightfully force the giver to do so. On the other hand, in cases of extreme emergency, it may sometimes be justifiable to force people to do more than justice requires them to do – there may exist enforceable duties of humanity. But these are rare exceptions. The obligatory nature of justice generally goes hand-in-hand with enforceability.

1.3 Justice and Impartiality

The third aspect of justice to which Justinian’s definition draws our attention is the connection between justice and the impartial and consistent application of rules – that is what the ‘constant and perpetual will’ part of the definition conveys. Justice is the opposite of arbitrariness. It requires that where two cases are relevantly alike, they should be treated in the same way (We discuss below the special case of justice and lotteries). Following a rule that specifies what is due to a person who has features X, Y, Z whenever such a person is encountered ensures this. And although the rule need not be unchangeable – perpetual in the literal sense – it must be relatively stable. This explains why justice is exemplified in the rule of law, where laws are understood as general rules impartially applied over time. Outside of the law itself, individuals and institutions that want to behave justly must mimic the law in certain ways (for instance, gathering reliable information about individual claimants, allowing for appeals against decisions).

1.4 Justice and Agency

Finally, the definition reminds us that justice requires an agent whose will alters the circumstances of its objects. The agent might be an individual person, or it might be a group of people, or an institution such as the state. So we cannot, except metaphorically, describe as unjust states of affairs that no agent has contributed to bringing about – unless we think that there is a Divine Being who has ordered the universe in such a way that every outcome is a manifestation of His will. Admittedly we are tempted to make judgements of what is sometimes called ‘cosmic injustice’ – say when a talented person’s life is cut cruelly short by cancer, or our favourite football team is eliminated from the competition by a freak goal – but this is a temptation we should resist.

This agency condition, however, is less restrictive than it might at first appear. It by no means excludes the possibility that agents can create injustice by omission – for example by failing to create the institutions or to enact the policies that would deliver vital resources to those who need them. Thus it is now common to speak of ‘systemic injustice’ in the case of bad outcomes that no-one intends to occur but that could be prevented by a shift in social norms or institutional practices. The agents in these cases are all those who by acting together to change these things could invert the injustice, but have so far failed to do so.

2. Justice: Four Distinctions

We have so far looked at four elements that are present in every use of the concept of justice. Now it is time to consider some equally important contrasts.

2.1 Conservative versus Ideal Justice

Philosophers writing on justice have observed that it has two different faces, one conservative of existing norms and practices, the other demanding reform of these norms and practices (see Sidgwick 1874/1907, Raphael 2001). Thus on the one hand it is a matter of justice to respect people’s rights under existing law or moral rules, or more generally to fulfil the legitimate expectations they have acquired as a result of past practice, social conventions, and so forth; on the other hand, justice often gives us reason to change laws, practices and conventions quite radically, thereby creating new entitlements and expectations. This exposes an ambiguity in what it means to ‘render each his due’. What is ‘due’ might be what a person can reasonably expect to have given existing law, policy, or social practice, or it might be what the person should get under a regime of ideal justice: this could mean what the person deserves, or needs, or is entitled to on grounds of equality, depending on which ideal principle is being invoked.

Conceptions of justice vary according to the weight they attach to each of these faces. At one extreme, some conceptions interpret justice as wholly concerned with what individuals can claim under existing laws and social conventions: thus for Hume, justice was to be understood as adherence to a set of rules that assign physical objects to individuals (such as being the first possessor of such an object) (Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, Book III, Part II). These rules can be explained by reference to the natural associations that form in people’s minds between persons and external objects, and although the system of justice as a whole can be shown to be socially useful, there are no relevant independent standards by which its principles can be assessed (Hume briskly dismissed equality and merit as principles for allocating property to persons). In similar vein, Hayek argued that justice was a property of individual behaviour, understood as compliance with the ‘rules of just conduct’ that had evolved to enable a market economy to function effectively. For Hayek, to speak of ‘social justice’ as an ideal standard of distribution was as meaningless as to speak of a ‘moral stone’ (Hayek 1976, p. 78)

At the other extreme stand conceptions of justice which posit some ideal principle of distribution such as equality, together with a ‘currency’ specifying the respect in which justice requires people to be made equally well off, and then refuse to acknowledge the justice of any claims that do not arise directly from the application of this principle. Thus claims deriving from existing law or practice are dismissed unless they happen to coincide with what the principle requires. More often, however, ideal justice is seen as proposing principles by which existing institutions and practices can be assessed, with a view to reforming them, or in the extreme case abolishing them entirely, while the claims that people already have under those practices are given some weight. Rawls, for example, whose two principles of justice count as ideal principles for this purpose, is at pains to stress that they are not intended to be applied in a way that disregards people’s existing legitimate expectations. About the ‘difference principle’, which requires social and economic inequalities to be regulated so that they work to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society, he says:

It applies to the announced system of public law and statutes and not to particular transactions or distributions, nor to the decisions of individuals and associations, but rather to the institutional background against which these transactions and decisions take place. There are no unannounced and unpredictable interferences with citizens’ expectations and acquisitions. Entitlements are earned and honored as the public system of rules declares. (Rawls 1993, p. 283)

Here we see Rawls attempting to reconcile the demands of conservative and ideal justice. Yet he does not directly address the question of what should happen when changing circumstances mean that the difference principle requires new laws or policies to be enacted: do those whose prior entitlements or expectations are no longer met have a claim to be compensated for their loss? We could call this the question of transitional justice (though this phrase is often used now in a more specific sense to refer to the process of reconciliation that may occur following civil war or other armed conflicts: see the entry on transitional justice).

2.2 Corrective versus Distributive Justice

A second important contrast, whose pedigree reaches back at least as far as Aristotle, is between justice as a principle for assigning distributable goods of various kinds to individual people, and justice as a remedial principle that applies when one person wrongly interferes with another’s legitimate holdings. Thus suppose Bill steals Alice’s computer, or sells Alice faulty goods which he claims to be in perfect order: then Alice suffers a loss, which justice demands that Bill should remedy by returning the computer or fulfilling his contract honestly. Corrective justice, then, essentially concerns a bilateral relationship between a wrongdoer and his victim, and demands that the fault be cancelled by restoring the victim to the position she would have been in had the wrongful behaviour not occurred; it may also require that the wrongdoer not benefit from his faulty behaviour. Distributive justice, on the other hand, is multilateral: it assumes a distributing agent, and a number of persons who have claims on what is being distributed. Justice here requires that the resources available to the distributor be shared according to some relevant criterion, such as equality, desert, or need. In Aristotle’s example, if there are fewer flutes available than people who want to play them, they should be given to the best performers (Aristotle, The Politics, p. 128). In modern debates, principles of distributive justice are applied to social institutions such as property and tax systems, which are understood as producing distributive outcomes across large societies, or even the world as a whole.

The conceptual distinction between distributive and corrective justice seems clear, but their normative relationship is more difficult to pin down (see Perry 2000, Ripstein 2004, Coleman 1992, chs. 16–17). Some have claimed that corrective justice is merely instrumental to distributive justice: its aim is to move from a situation of distributive injustice brought about by the faulty behaviour to one that is more nearly (if not perfectly) distributively just. But this view runs into a number of objections. One is that so long as Alice has a legitimate title to her computer, her claim of corrective justice against Bill does not depend on her having had, prior to the theft, the share of resources that distributive justice ideally demands. She might be richer than she deserves to be, yet corrective justice still require that the computer be returned to her. In other words, corrective justice may serve to promote conservative rather than ideal justice, to use the distinction introduced in 2.1. Another objection is that corrective justice requires the wrongdoer himself to restore or compensate the person he has wronged, even if the cause of distributive justice could be better served by transferring resources from a third party – giving Alice one of even-more-undeservedly-rich Charles’s computers, for example. This underlines the bilateral nature of corrective justice, and also the fact that it comes into play in response to faulty behaviour on someone’s part. Its primary demand is that people should not lose out because others have behaved wrongfully or carelessly, but it also encompasses the idea that ‘no man should profit by his own wrong’. If Alice loses her computer in a boating accident, she might, under an insurance scheme, have a claim of distributive justice to a new machine, but she has no claim of corrective justice.

If corrective justice cannot be subsumed normatively under distributive justice, we need to explain its value. What is achieved when we make Bill return the computer to Alice? Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, ch. 4) suggested that corrective justice aims to restore the two parties to a position of equality; by returning the computer we cancel both Bill’s unjustified gain and Alice’s unjustified loss. But this assumes that the computer can be returned intact. Corrective justice requires that Alice be made no worse off than she was before the theft, even if that means Bill suffering an absolute loss (e.g. by paying for a new computer if he has damaged Alice’s). Aristotle himself recognized that the idea of evening out gain and loss made no literal sense in a case where one person assaults another and has to compensate him for his injury – there is no ‘gain’ to be redistributed. It seems, then, that the value of corrective justice must lie in the principle that each person must take responsibility for his own conduct, and if he fails to respect the legitimate interests of others by causing injury, he must make good the harm. In that way, each person can plan her life secure in the knowledge that she will be protected against certain kinds of external setbacks. Philosophers and lawyers writing on corrective justice disagree about what standard of responsibility should apply – for example whether compensation is required only when one person wilfully or negligently causes another to suffer loss, or whether it can also be demanded when the perpetrator displays no such fault but is nevertheless causally responsible for the injury.

2.3 Procedural versus Substantive Justice

A third distinction that must be drawn is between the justice of the procedures that might be used to determine how benefits and burdens of various kinds are allocated to people, and the justice of the final allocation itself. It might initially seem as though the justice of a procedure can be reduced to the justice of the results produced by applying it, but this is not so. For one thing, there are cases in which the idea of an independently just outcome makes no sense. A coin toss is a fair way of deciding who starts a game, but neither the Blues nor the Reds have a claim of justice to bat first or kick off. But even where a procedure has been shaped by a concern that it should produce substantively just outcomes, it may still have special properties that make it intrinsically just. In that case, using a different procedure to produce the same result might be objectionable. In an influential discussion, John Rawls contrasted perfect procedural justice, where a procedure is such that if it is followed a just outcome is guaranteed (requiring the person who cuts a cake to take the last slice himself is the illustration Rawls provides), imperfect procedural justice, where the procedure is such that following it is likely, but not certain, to produce the just result, and pure procedural justice, such as the coin-tossing example, where there is no independent way to assess the outcome – if we call it just, it is only on the grounds that it has come about by following the relevant procedure (Rawls 1971, 1999, § 14).

Theories of justice can then be distinguished according to the relative weight they attach to procedures and substantive outcomes. Some theories are purely procedural in form. Robert Nozick distinguished between historical theories of justice, end-state theories, and patterned theories in order to defend the first against the second and third (Nozick 1974). An end-state theory defines justice in terms of some overall property of a distribution (of resources, welfare, etc.) – for example whether it is egalitarian, or whether the lowest position in the distribution is as high as it can be, as Rawls’ difference principle requires. A patterned theory looks at whether what each receives as part of a distribution matches some individual feature such as their desert or their need. By contrast, an historical theory asks about the process by which the final outcome has arisen. In Nozick’s particular case, a distribution of resources is said to be just if everyone within its scope is entitled to what they now own, having acquired it by legitimate means – such as voluntary contract or gift – from someone who was also entitled to have it, leading back eventually to a just act of acquisition – such as labouring on a plot of land – that gave the first owner his valid title. The shape of the final distribution is irrelevant: according to Nozick, justice is entirely a matter of the sequence of prior events that created it (for critical assessments of Nozick’s position, see Paul 1982, Wolff 1991, Cohen 1995, chs. 1–2).

For most philosophers, however, the justice of a procedure is to a large extent a function of the justice of the outcomes that it tends to produce when applied. For instance, the procedures that together make up a fair trial are justified on the grounds that for the most part they produce outcomes in which the guilty are punished and the innocent are acquitted. Yet even in these cases, we should be wary of assuming that the procedure itself has no independent value. We can ask of a procedure whether it treats the people to whom it is applied justly, for example by giving them adequate opportunities to advance their claims, not requiring them to provide personal information that they find humiliating to reveal, and so forth. Studies by social psychologists have shown that in many cases people care more about being treated fairly by the institutions they have to deal with than about how they fare when the procedure’s final result is known (Lind and Tyler 1988).

2.4 Comparative versus Non-Comparative Justice

Justice takes a comparative form when to determine what is due to one person we need to look at what others can also claim: to determine how large a slice of pie is rightfully John’s, we have to know how many others have a claim to the pie, and also what the principle for sharing it should be – equality, or something else. Justice takes a non-comparative form when we can determine what is due to a person merely by knowing relevant facts about that particular person: if John has already been promised the whole of the pie, then that is what he can rightfully claim for himself. Some theories of justice seem to imply that justice is always a comparative notion – for example when it is said that justice consists in the absence of arbitrary inequality – whereas others imply that it is always non-comparative. But conceptually, at least, both forms seem admissible; indeed we can find cases in which it appears we have to choose between doing justice comparatively and doing it non-comparatively (see Feinberg 1974; for a critical response, see Montague 1980). For example, we might have several candidates all of whom are roughly equally deserving of an academic honour, but the number of honours we are permitted to award is smaller than the number of candidates. If we honour some but not others, we perpetrate a comparative injustice, but if to avoid doing so we honour no-one at all, then each is treated less well than they deserve, and so unjustly from a non-comparative perspective.

Theories of justice can then be categorised according to whether they are comparative, non-comparative, or neither. Principles of equality – principles requiring the equal distribution of some kind of benefit – are plainly comparative in form, since what is due to each person is simply an equal share of the benefit in question rather than any fixed amount. In the case of principles of desert, the position is less straightforward. These principles take the form ‘A deserves X by virtue of P’, where X is a mode of treatment, and P is a personal characteristic possessed by A (Feinberg 1970). In the case of both X and P, we can ask whether they are to be identified comparatively or non-comparatively. Thus what A deserves might either be an entitlement, or an absolute amount of some benefit – ‘a living wage’, say – or it might be a share of some collective benefit, or a multiple or fraction of what others are receiving – ‘twice what B is getting’, say. Turning to P, or what is often called the desert basis, this may be a feature of A that we can identify without reference to anyone else, or it may be a comparative feature, such as being the best student in a graduating class. So desert-based claims of justice might take one of four different forms depending on whether the basis of desert and/or the deserved mode of treatment is comparative or non-comparative (see Olsaretti 2003 for essays that address this question; for a more advanced treatment, see Kagan 2012, Part III).

Among principles of justice that are straightforwardly non-comparative are ‘sufficiency’ principles which hold that what justice requires is that each person should have ‘enough’, on some dimension or other – for instance, have all of their needs fulfilled, or have a specified set of capabilities that they are able to exercise (for a general defence of sufficiency, though not one that links it specifically to justice, see Frankfurt 2015; for a critique, see Casal 2007). Such principles, however, need to be supplemented by other principles, not only to tell us what to do with the surplus (assuming there is one) once everyone has sufficient resources, but also to guide us in situations where there are too few resources to bring everyone up to the sufficiency threshold. Should we, for example, maximise the number of people who achieve sufficiency, or minimise the aggregate shortfall suffered by those in the relevant group? Unless we are prepared to say that these are not matters of justice, a theory of justice that contains only the sufficiency principle and nothing else looks incomplete.

Some theories of justice cannot readily be classified either as comparative or as non-comparative. Consider one part of Rawls’ theory of social justice, the difference principle, which as noted above requires that social and economic inequalities be arranged to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged (Rawls 1971, 1999, §12–13). Under this principle, ideally just shares are calculated by determining what each person would receive under the set of social institutions whose economic effect is to raise the worst off person to the highest possible level. This is neither a fixed amount, nor one that depends in any direct sense on what other individuals are receiving, or should receive. Applying the difference principle does require making comparisons, but these are comparisons between the effects of different social institutions – say different tax laws, or different ways of defining property rights – not between individual people and the amounts of benefit they are receiving. We might call theories of this kind ‘holistic’ or ‘systemic’.

3. The Scope of Justice

When we raise questions about the scope of justice, we are asking about when principles of justice take effect and among whom. We have already, when discussing Hume, encountered the idea that there might be circumstances in which justice becomes irrelevant – circumstances in which resources are so abundant that it is pointless to allocate individual shares, or, as Hume also believed, in which resources are so scarce that everyone is permitted to grab what he can in the name of self-preservation. But even in circumstances that are less extreme than these, questions about scope arise. Who can make claims of justice, and who might have the corresponding obligation to meet them? Does this depend on the kind of thing that is being claimed? If comparative principles are being applied, who should be counted as part of the comparison group? Do some principles of justice have universal scope – they apply whenever agent A acts towards recipient B, regardless of the relationship between them – while others are contextual in character, applying only within social or political relationships of a certain kind? The present section examines some of these questions in greater detail.

3.1 Human vs non-human animals

What does a creature have to do, or be like, to be included within the scope of (at least some) principles of justice? Most past philosophers have assumed that the line should be drawn so as to exclude all non-human animals, but more recently some have been prepared to defend ‘justice for animals’ (Nussbaum 2006, ch. 6; Garner 2013). Against this, Rawls asserts that although we have ‘duties of compassion and humanity’ towards animals and should refrain from treating them cruelly, nonetheless they are ‘outside the scope of the theory of justice’ (Rawls 1971, p. 512; Rawls 1999, p. 448). How could this claim be justified?

We can focus our attention either on individual features that humans possess and animals lack, and that might be thought relevant to their inclusion within the scope of justice, or on asymmetries in the relationship between humans and other animals. To begin with the latter, Hume claimed that the domination humans exercised over animals – such that an animal could only possess something by virtue of our permission – meant that we were ‘bound by the laws of humanity to give gentle usage to these creatures, but should not, properly speaking, lie under any restraint of justice with regard to them’ (Hume, Enquiry, p. 190). For Rawls and those influenced by him, principles of distributive justice apply among agents who are related to one another as participants in a ‘cooperative venture for mutual advantage’, and this might seem to exclude animals from the scope of such principles. Critics of this view have pointed to cases of human-animal co-operation (Donaldson and Kymlicka 2011, Valentini 2014); however these arguments focus mainly or entirely on the special case of dogs, and it seems implausible to generalise from them in an attempt to show that human-animal relationships generally have a co-operative character.

But the claim that justice only applies to participants in co-operative practices is anyway vulnerable to the objection that it risks excluding seriously disabled people, people living in isolated communities, and future generations from the scope of justice, so it does not seem compelling as a claim about justice in general (see further below). Might there be other reasons why animals cannot make claims of justice on us? Another Rawls-inspired suggestion is that animals lack the necessary moral powers, in particular the capacity to act on principles of justice themselves. They cannot distinguish what is justly owed to them from what is not; and they cannot determine what they owe to others – whether to humans or to other non-human animals – as a matter of justice. This suggestion interprets justice as involving a kind of reciprocity: an agent to whom justice is due must also in principle be an agent who could dispense justice to others, by virtue of having the relevant capacity, even if for physical reasons – such as suffering from severe disability – they cannot do so in practice.

If this suggestion is rejected, and we allow that some animals, at least, should be included within the scope of justice, we can then ask about the form that justice should take in their cases. Using the distinction drawn in 2.4 above, it appears that justice for animals must be non-comparative. For example, we might attribute rights to the animals over whom we exercise power – rights against cruel treatment, and rights to food and shelter, for instance. This would involve using a sufficiency principle to determine what animals are owed as a matter of justice. It is much less plausible to think that comparative principles might apply, such that giving special treats to one cat but not another could count as an injustice.

3.2 Relational vs Non-Relational Justice

The Rawlsian view introduced in the previous section, which holds that principles of social justice apply among people who are engaged together in a co-operative practice, is a leading example of a relational theory of justice. Other theories offer different accounts of the relevant justice-generating feature: for example, Nagel has argued that principles of distributive justice apply among people who by virtue of being citizens of the same state are required both to comply with, and accept responsibility for, the coercive laws that govern their lives (Nagel 2005). In both cases, the claim being made is that when people stand in a certain relationship to one another, they become subject to principles of justice whose scope is limited to those within the relationship. In particular, comparative principles apply within the relationship, but not beyond it. If A stands in a relationship (of the right kind) to B, then it becomes a matter of justice how A is treated relative to B, but it does not matter in the same way how A is treated relative to C who stands outside of the relationship. Justice may still require that C be given treatment of a certain kind, but that will be justice in its non-comparative guise.

Whether justice is relational in either of the ways that Rawls and Nagel suggest has large implications for its scope. In particular it bears on the question whether there is such a thing as global distributive justice, or, in contrast, whether distributive principles only apply to people who are related together as members of the same society or citizens of the same state. For example, might the global inequalities that exist between rich and poor in today’s world be unjust simply as inequalities, or are they unjust only insofar as they prevent poor people from living lives that we judge to be acceptable? (see entries on international distributive justice and global justice) So much hangs on the question whether, and if so in virtue of what, distributive justice has a relational character. What reason can be given for thinking that it does?

Suppose we have two people A and B, of whom one is significantly better off than another – has greater opportunities or a higher income, say. Why should this be a concern of justice? It seems it will not be a concern unless it can be shown that the inequality between A and B can be attributed to the behaviour of some agent, individual or collective, whose actions or omissions have resulted in A being better off than B – in which case we can ask whether the inequality between them is justifiable, say on grounds of their respective deserts. This reiterates the claim in 1.4 above that without an agent to whom the outcome can be attributed there can only be justice or injustice in a metaphorical, ‘cosmic’, sense. Relational theorists claim that when people associate with one another in the relevant way, they become agents of justice. On a small scale they can organize informally to ensure that each receives what is due to him relative to the rest. On a larger scale, distributive justice requires the creation of legal and other institutions to achieve that outcome. Moreover failure to co-ordinate their actions in this way is likely to be a source of injustice by omission.

Debates about the scope of justice then become debates about whether different forms of human association are of the right kind to create agency in the relevant sense. Take the question of whether principles of social justice should apply to market transactions. If we see the market as a neutral arena in which many individual people freely pursue their own purposes, then the answer will be No. The only form of justice that arises will be justice in the conduct of each agent, who must avoid inflicting harm on others, must fulfil her contracts, and so forth. Whereas if we see the market as governed by a humanly-constructed system of rules that the participants collectively have the power to change – by legislation, for example – then we cannot avoid asking whether the outcomes it currently produces meet relevant standards of distributive justice, whatever we take these to be. A similar issue arises in the debate about over principles of global justice referred to above: is the current world order such that it makes sense to regard humanity as a whole as a collective agent responsible for the distributive outcomes it allows to occur?

3.3 Individuals vs Institutions

Once institutions are established for the purpose (among other things) of delivering justice on a large scale, we can ask what duties of justice individual people have in consequence. Is their duty simply to support the institutions, and comply with whatever rules of conduct apply to them personally? Or do they have further duties to promote justice by acting directly on the relevant principles in their daily lives? No one doubts that some duties of justice fall directly on individuals, for example duties not to deceive or defraud when engaging in commercial transactions (and duties of corrective justice where behaviour is faulty), or duties to carry out one’s fair share of an informally organized project from which one expects to benefit, such as cleaning up the neighbourhood park. Others fall on them because they are performing a role within a social institution, for example the duty of an employer not to discriminate on grounds of race or gender when hiring workers, or the duty of a local government officer to assign public housing to those in greatest need. But what is much more in dispute is whether individual people have more extensive duties to promote social justice (for contrasting views, see Cohen 2008, ch. 3, Murphy 1998, Rawls 1993, Lecture VII, Young 2011, ch. 2).

Consider two cases: the first concerns parents who confer advantages on their children in ways that undermine fair equality of opportunity. If the latter principle of justice requires, to cite Rawls, that ‘those who have the same level of talent and ability and the same willingness to use these gifts should have the same prospects of success regardless of their social class of origin’ (Rawls 2001, p. 44) then there are myriad ways in which some parents can bestow advantages on their children that other parents cannot – financial benefits, educational opportunities, social contacts, and so forth – that are likely to bring greater success in later life. Are parents therefore constrained as a matter of justice to avoid conferring at least some of these advantages, or are they free to benefit their children as they choose, leaving the pursuit of equal opportunities entirely in the hands of the state (for a careful analysis, see Brighouse and Swift 2014)?

The second example concerns wage differentials. Might individuals whose talents can bring them high rewards in the labour market have a duty not to make use of their bargaining power, but instead be willing to work for a fair wage – which if fairness is understood in egalitarian terms might mean the same wage as everyone else (perhaps with extra compensation for those whose labour is unusually burdensome)? Rawls, as we saw above, argued that economic justice meant arranging social and economic inequalities to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged, and in formulating the principle in this way he assumed that some inequalities might serve as incentives to greater production that would also raise the position of the worst-off group in society. But if individuals were willing to forego incentives, and so economic inequalities served no useful purpose, then the arrangement that worked to the greatest benefit of the (otherwise) least advantaged would be one of strict equality. Cohen (2008) argues that Rawls’ position is internally inconsistent. As citizens designing our institutions we are supposed to be guided by the difference principle, but as private actors in the marketplace, we are permitted to ignore that principle and bargain for higher wages, even though doing so will work to the disadvantage of the worst-off group. Justice, according to Cohen, requires us to embrace an ethos of service that disdains material incentives.

Why might we hesitate before agreeing that in cases such as these, justice requires people to refrain from doing things that they are permitted to do by the public rules of their society (passing on benefits to their children; seeking higher wages)? One reason is that the refraining is only going to have a significant effect if it is practised on a large scale, and individuals have no assurance that others will follow their example; meanwhile they (or their children) will lose out relative to the less scrupulous. A connected reason has to do with publicity: it may be hard to detect whether people are following the required ethos or not (see Williams 1998). Is the person who sends her child to a private school because she claims he has special needs that the local state school cannot meet being sincere, or is she just trying to buy him comparative advantage? How can we tell whether the person who claims more money, but merely, he says, as compensation for the unusual stress that his work involves, is reporting honestly? (for Cohen’s response, see Cohen 2008, ch. 8) It appears, then, that there are principles of justice that apply to what Rawls calls ‘the basic structure of society [as] a public system of rules’ that do not apply in the same way to the personal behaviour of the individuals who live within that structure. Attending to the scope, as well as the content, of justice is important.

3.4 Recognition vs. Redistribution

Recent philosophical writing on justice has drawn attention to forms of injustice that do not involve the material treatment that people receive, either from other persons or from institutions, but the harms they suffer through failures of recognition. They are impacted by social norms and social practices that diminish their sense of agency and induce them to see themselves as of lesser value than others. Here then justice is understood as being adequately and appropriately recognized, and injustice as involving failures of recognition, or in some cases ‘misrecognition’, when a person is placed in a category or assigned an identity that is not their own. In one influential formulation of this idea, ‘it is unjust that some individuals and groups are denied the status of full partners in social interaction simply as a consequence of institutionalized patterns of cultural value in whose construction they have not equally participated and which disparage their distinctive characteristics or the distinctive characteristics assigned to them’ (Fraser in Fraser and Honneth 2003, p. 29).

What, then, does it mean to be recognized? In general it means to be viewed and treated by others in the way that is appropriate to the features that you possess, but most philosophers regard recognition as multidimensional. In particular, they distinguish between being recognized as an equal, where a person is accorded the kind of standing that gives them an equal status with other members of the relevant group, and being recognized for having characteristics, achievements or an identity that may be uniquely their own. Recognition in this second sense may involve the unequal granting of social esteem. Justice as recognition, therefore, is internally complex. At the social level, Axel Honneth distinguishes ‘three forms of social recognition, based in the sphere-specific principles of love, equal legal treatment, and social esteem’ (Fraser and Honneth 2003 p. 180)

The question that arises is how best to understand the relationship between justice of this kind and distributive justice, involving the allocation of material resources and so forth. For Honneth, justice as recognition is understood expansively so that it can also capture issues of economic justice, the thought being that the harm inflicted when, say, labour is not adequately rewarded can be understood as a failure to offer adequate recognition of the worker’s social contribution. For Nancy Fraser, by contrast, recognition and redistribution are seen as two mutually irreducible but jointly necessary conditions for social justice. Failures of recognition can be experienced by some among the economically privileged – such as ‘the African-American Wall Street banker who cannot get a taxi to pick him up’ (Fraser and Honneth 2003, p. 34). Justice as recognition requires cultural shifts in the way that different forms of identity and different types of achievement are valued that are independent of the institutional changes required to achieve distributive justice.

A particular form of recognitional injustice is epistemic injustice as diagnosed by Miranda Fricker (Fricker 2007). This occurs when someone is wronged in their capacity as a source of knowledge, and it takes two main forms: testimonial injustice and hermeneutic injustice. As Fricker explains ‘testimonial injustice occurs when prejudice causes a hearer to give a deflated level of credibility to a speaker’s word; hermeneutical injustice occurs at a prior stage when a gap in collective interpretive resources puts someone as at an unfair disadvantage when it comes to making sense of their social experiences’ (Fricker 2007, p. 1). She argues that testimonial injustice matters for two reasons. First, the person who suffers from it is less able to protect or advance their interests – for example they are less likely to be believed when having to defend themselves in court. Second, since others are unwilling to regard them as competent sources of knowledge, they may lose trust in their own capacity to know, leading in some cases to ‘prolonged self-doubt and loss of intellectual confidence’.

Hermeneutical injustice arises in the context of unequal relationships in which the subordinated party lacks the concept or concepts needed to make sense of their experience (and thereby to challenge their subordination). Fricker uses the example of a woman who suffered sexual harassment at the time before feminists had developed that concept, and so had no adequate word to describe what she was experiencing. Hermeneutical injustice matters most when it is systematic, brought about by power inequalities that leave certain groups ‘hermeneutically marginalised’. However she treats epistemic justice as a virtue that individual hearers can develop, in contrast to recognition theorists like Fraser and Honneth for whom achieving recognitional justice requires collective action to change social and cultural norms on the part of misrecognized groups.

4. Utilitarianism and Justice

Can justice be understood in utilitarian terms? This may in the first place depend on how we interpret utilitarianism. We treat it here as a normative theory whose aim is to supply a criterion – the greatest happiness principle – that can be used, directly or indirectly, both by individuals and by institutions (such as states) in deciding what to do, rather than simply as a tool for evaluating states of affairs. Utilitarianism cannot plausibly provide a theory of justice unless it is interpreted in this action-guiding way, in light of what was said above about justice and agency. We also assume that the most likely candidate will be a rule-utilitarian view that treats principles of justice as belonging to the set of rules which when followed by the relevant agents will tend to produce the greatest total utility (for different ways of formulating this view, see the entry on rule consequentialism).

4.1 Accommodating intuitions about justice

Most utilitarians have regarded it as part of their task in defending utilitarianism to show that it can both accommodate and explain much of what we intuitively believe about justice. This is certainly true of two of the greatest among them, John Stuart Mill and Sidgwick, both of whom went to considerable lengths to show that familiar principles of justice could be given a utilitarian rationale (Mill Utilitarianism, ch. 5; Sidgwick 1874/1907, Book III, ch.5). Bentham, in contrast, was more cavalier: ‘justice, in the only sense in which it has a meaning, is an imaginary personage, feigned for the convenience of discourse, whose dictates are the dictates of utility, applied to certain particular cases’ (The Principles of Morals and Legislation, pp. 125–6). If we follow the lead of Mill and Sidgwick in wishing to take seriously how justice is commonly understood, the utilitarian has two challenges to face. First he or she must show that the demands of justice as commonly understood correspond roughly to the rules that when followed by persons, or implemented by institutions, are most conducive to the greatest happiness. They need not mirror the latter exactly, because utilitarians will argue, as both Mill and Sidgwick did, that our intuitions about justice are often ambiguous or internally inconsistent, but there must be enough overlap to warrant the claim that what the utilitarian theory can accommodate and explain is indeed justice. (As Sidgwick (1874/1907, p. 264) put it, ‘we may, so to speak, clip the ragged edge of common usage, but we must not make excision of any considerable portion’.) Second, some explanation must be given for the distinctiveness of justice. Why do we have a concept that is used to mark off a particular set of requirements and claims if the normative basis for these requirements and claims is nothing other than general utility? What accounts for our intuitive sense of justice? The task confronting the utilitarian, then, is to systematize our understanding of justice without obliterating it.

By way of illustration, both Mill and Sidgwick recognize that desert, of both reward and punishment, is a key component of common understandings of justice, but they argue that if we remain at the level of common sense when we try to analyse it, we run into irresolvable contradictions. For instance, we are inclined to think that a person’s deserts should depend on what they have actually achieved – say the economic value of what they have produced – but also, because achievement will depend on factors for which the person in question can claim no credit, such as inborn talent, that their deserts should depend only on factors for which they are directly responsible, such as the amount of effort they expend. Each of these conceptions, when put into practice, would lead to a quite different schedule of rewards, and the only means to escape the impasse, these utilitarians claim, is to ask which schedule will generate most utility by directing people’s choices and efforts in the most socially productive way. Similar reasoning applies to the principles of punishment: the rules we should follow are the rules that are most conducive to the ends for which punishment is instituted, such as deterring crime.

To explain the distinctiveness of justice, Mill suggests that it designates moral requirements that, because of their very great importance to human well-being, people have a right to have discharged, and are therefore matters of perfect obligation. A person who commits an injustice is always liable to punishment of some kind, he argues. So he explains our sense of justice in terms of the resentment we feel towards someone who breaches these requirements. Sidgwick, who laid greater stress than Mill on the connection between justice and law, also underlined the relationship between justice and gratitude, on one side, and resentment, on the other, in order to capture the way in which our concern for justice seems to differ from our concern for utility in general.

4.2 Utilitarian theories of justice: three problems

Yet despite these efforts to reconcile justice and utility, three serious obstacles still remain. The first concerns what we might call the currency of justice: justice has to do with the way that tangible benefits and burdens are assigned, and not with the happiness or unhappiness that the assignees experience. It is a matter of justice, for example, that people should be paid the right amount for the jobs that they do, but, special circumstances aside, it is no concern of justice that John derives more satisfaction from his fairly-earned income than Jane does from hers (but see Cohen 1989 for a different view). There is so to speak, a division of labour, under which rights, opportunities, and material benefits of various kinds are allocated by principles of justice, while the conversion of these into units of utility (or disutility) is the responsibility of each individual recipient (see Dworkin 2000, ch. 1). Utilitarians will therefore find it hard to explain what from their point of view seems to be the fetishistic concern of justice over how the means to happiness are distributed, rather than happiness itself.

The second obstacle is that utilitarianism judges outcomes by totalling up utility levels, and has no independent concern for how that utility is distributed between persons. So even if we set aside the currency issue, utilitarian theory seems unable to capture justice’s demand that each should receive what is due to her regardless of the total amount of benefit this generates. Defenders of utilitarianism will argue that when the conduct-guiding rules are being formulated, attention will be paid to distributive questions. In particular, when resources are being distributed among people we know little about individually, there are good reasons to favour equality, since in most cases resources have diminishing marginal utility – the more of them you have, the less satisfaction you derive from additional instalments. Yet this is only a contingent matter. If some people are very adept at turning resources into well-being – they are so-called ‘utility monsters’ – then a utilitarian should support a rule that privileges them. This seems repugnant to justice. As Rawls famously put the general point, ‘each member of society is thought to have an inviolability founded on justice which….even the welfare of every one else cannot override’ (Rawls 1971, p. 28; Rawls 1999, pp. 24–25).

The third and final difficulty stems from utilitarianism’s thoroughgoing consequentialism. Rules are assessed strictly in the light of the consequences of adopting then, not in terms of their intrinsic properties. Of course, when agents follow rules, they are meant to do what the rule requires rather than to calculate consequences directly. But for a utilitarian, it is never going to be a good reason for adopting a rule that it will give people what they deserve or what they are entitled to, when desert or entitlement are created by events in the past, such as a person’s having performed a worthwhile action or entered an agreement. Backward-looking reasons have to be transmuted into forward-looking reasons in order to count. If a rule such as pacta sunt servanda (‘agreements must be kept’) is going to be adopted on utilitarian grounds, this is not because there is any inherent wrongness in defaulting on a compact one has made, but because a rule that compacts must be kept is a useful one, since it allows people to co-ordinate their behaviour knowing that their expectations about the future are likely to be met. But justice, although not always backward-looking in the sense explained, often is. What is due to a person is in many cases what they deserve for what they have done, or what they are entitled to by virtue of past transactions. So even if it were possible to construct a forward-looking rationale for having rules that closely tracked desert or entitlement as these are normally understood, the utilitarian still cannot capture the sense of justice – why it matters that people should get what is due to then – that informs our common-sense judgements.

Utilitarians might reply that their reconstruction preserves what is rationally defensible in common sense beliefs while what it discards are elements that cannot survive sustained critical reflection. But this would bring them closer to Bentham’s view that justice, as commonly understood, is nothing but a ‘phantom’.

5. Contractarianism and Justice

The shortcomings of utilitarianism have prompted several recent philosophers to revive the old idea of the social contract as a better way of bringing coherence to our thinking about justice. The idea here is not that people actually have entered a contract to establish justice, or that they should proceed to do so, but that we can understand justice better by asking the question: what principles to govern their institutions, practices and personal behaviour would people choose to adopt if they all had to agree on them in advance? The contract, in other words, is hypothetical; but the search for agreement is meant to ensure that the principles chosen would, when implemented, not lead to outcomes that people could not accept. Thus whereas a utilitarian might, under some circumstances, be prepared to support slavery – if the misery of the slaves were outweighed by the heightened pleasures of the slave-owners – contractarians claims that no-one could accept a principle permitting slavery, lest they themselves were destined to be slaves when the principle was applied.

The problem that contractarians face is to show how such an agreement is possible. If we were to ask people, in the real world, what principles they would prefer to live under, they are likely to start from a position of quite radical disagreement, given their interests and their beliefs. Some might even be willing to endorse slavery, if they were fairly certain that they would not end up as slaves themselves, or if they were sado-masochists who viewed the humiliations inflicted on slaves in a positive light. So in order to show how agreement could be achieved, contractarians have to model the contracting parties in a particular way, either by limiting what they are allowed to know about themselves or about the future, or by attributing to them certain motivations while excluding others. Since the modelling can be done differently, we have a family of contractarian theories of justice, three of whose most important members are the theories of Gauthier, Rawls and Scanlon.

5.1 Gauthier

Gauthier (1986) presents the social contract as a bargain between rational individuals who can gain through co-operating with one another, but who are competing over the division of the resulting surplus. He assumes that each is interested only in trying to maximise his own welfare, and he also assumes that there is a non-co-operative baseline from which the bargaining begins – so nobody would accept a solution that left her less well off than in the baseline condition. Each person can identify the outcome under which they fare best – their maximum gain – but they have no reason to expect others to accept that. Gauthier argues that rational bargainers will converge on the principle of Minimax Relative Concession, which requires each to concede the same relative proportion of their maximum possible gain relative to the non-co-operative baseline. Thus suppose there is a feasible arrangement whereby each participant can achieve two-thirds of their maximum gain, but no arrangement under which they all do better than that, then this is the arrangement that the principle recommends. Each person has made the same concession relative to the outcome that is best for them personally – not accepting the same absolute loss of welfare, let it be noted, but the same proportionate loss.

There are some internal difficulties with Gauthier’s theory that need to be recorded briefly (for a full discussion, see Barry 1989, esp. Part III). One is whether Minimax Relative Concession is in fact the correct solution to the bargaining problem that Gauthier introduces, as opposed to the standard Nash solution which (in a simple two-person case) selects the outcome in which the product of the two parties’ utilities is maximised (for discussion of different solutions to the bargaining problem, see the entry on contemporary approaches to the social contract, § 3.2). A second is whether Gauthier is able to justify positing a ‘Lockean’ baseline, under which each is assumed to respect the natural rights of the others, as the starting point for bargaining over the surplus – as opposed to a more conflictual ‘Hobbesian’ baseline in which individuals are permitted to use their natural powers to threaten one another in the process of establishing what each could expect to get in the absence of co-operation. But the larger question is whether a contract modelled in this way is an appropriate device for delivering principles of justice. On the one hand, it captures the idea that the practice of justice should work to everyone’s advantage, while requiring all those involved to moderate the demands they make on one another. On the other hand, it prescribes a final distribution of benefit that appears morally arbitrary, in the sense that A’s bargaining advantage over B – which stems from the fact that his maximum possible gain is greater than hers – allows him to claim a higher level of benefit as a matter of justice. This seems implausible: there may be prudential reasons to recommend a distribution that reflects the outcome that self-interested and rational bargainers would arrive at, but claims of justice need a different basis.

5.2 Rawls

John Rawls’ theory of justice is the most widely-cited example of a contractarian theory, but before outlining it, two words of caution are necessary. First, the shape of the theory has evolved from its first incarnation in Rawls (1958) through his major work A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971) and on to Rawls (1993) and Rawls (2001). Second, although Rawls has consistently claimed that the principles of justice he defends are the principles that would be selected by people in a suitably designed ‘original position’ in which they are asked to choose the social and political institutions they will live under – this is what qualifies his theory as contractarian – it is less clear how important a role the contract itself plays in his thinking. His principles, which are discussed elsewhere (see the entry on John Rawls), can be defended on their own merits as a theory of social justice for a modern liberal society, even if their contractual grounding proves to be unsound. Rawls presents the contracting parties as seeking to advance their own interests as they decide which principles to favour, but under two informational constraints. First, they are not allowed to know their own ‘conception of the good’ – what ends they personally find it most valuable to pursue – so the principles must be couched in terms of ‘primary goods’, understood as goods that it is better to have more rather than less of whatever conception of the good you favour. Second, they are placed behind a ‘veil of ignorance’ that deprives them of any knowledge of personal characteristics, such as their gender, their place in society, or the talents and skills they possess. This means that they have no basis on which to bargain for advantage, and have to consider themselves as generic persons who might be male or female, talented or untalented, and so forth. In consequence, Rawls argues, all will choose to live under impartial principles that work to no-one’s advantage in particular.

The problem for Rawls, however, is to show that the principles that would be selected in such an original position are in fact recognizable as principles of justice. One might expect the parties to calculate how to weigh the primary goods (which Rawls catalogues as ‘rights and liberties, opportunities and powers, income and wealth’) against each other, and then to choose as their social principle ‘maximise the weighted sum of primary goods, averaged across all persons’. This, however, would bring the theory very close to utilitarianism, since the natural method of weighing primary goods is to ask how much utility having a given quantity of each is likely, on average, to bring (for the claim that utilitarianism would be chosen in a Rawlsian original position, see Harsanyi 1975). Since Rawls wishes to reject utilitarianism, he has to adjust the psychology of the parties in the original position so that they reason differently. Thus he suggests that, at least in developed societies, people have special reason to prioritise liberty over the other goods and to ensure that it is equally distributed: he argues that this is essential to safeguard their self-respect. In later writing his argument is less empirical: now the parties to the contract are endowed with ‘moral powers’ that must be exercised, and it is then fairly easy to show that this requires them to have a set of basic liberties.

When he turns to the distribution of income and wealth, Rawls has to show why his choosers would pick the difference principle, which considers only the position of the worst-off social group, over other principles such as maximising average income across the whole society. In Theory of Justice he does this by attributing special psychological features to the choosers that make it appropriate for them to follow the ‘maximin’ rule for decisions under uncertainty (choose the option whose worst possible outcome is least bad for you). For example, they are said to be much more concerned to achieve the minimum level of income that the difference principle would guarantee them than to enjoy increases above that level. In his later work, he abandons this reliance on maximin reasoning and gives greater prominence to another argument hinted at in Theory. This portrays the contracting parties as starting out from the presumption that income and wealth should be distributed equally, but then recognizing that all can benefit by permitting certain inequalities to arise. When these inequalities are governed by the difference principle, they can be justified to everyone, including the worst off, thus creating the conditions for a more stable society. But we need then to ask why equal distribution should be treated as the benchmark, departures from which require special justification. When Rawls says that it is ‘not reasonable’ for any of the parties initially to expect more than an equal share (Rawls 1971, p. 150; Rawls 1999, p. 130), is this simply a corollary of their position as rational choosers behind a veil of ignorance, or has Rawls in addition endowed them with a substantive sense of justice that includes this presumption of equality?

Although Rawls throughout presents his theory of justice as contractarian, we can now see that the terms of the contract are in part determined by prior normative principles that Rawls engineers the parties to follow. So in contrast to Gauthier, it is no longer simply a case of self-interested contractors negotiating their way to an agreement. Rawls candidly admits that the contractual situation has to be adjusted so that it yields results that match our pre-existing convictions about justice. But then we may ask how much work the contractual apparatus is really doing (see Barry 1989, ch. 9 for a critical appraisal).

5.3 Scanlon

Scanlon (1998) does not attempt to deliver a theory of justice in the same sense as Rawls, but his contractarian account of that part of morality that specifies ‘what we owe to each other’ covers much of the same terrain (for an explicit attempt to analyse justice in Scanlonian terms, see Barry 1995). Like Rawls, Scanlon is concerned to develop an alternative to utilitarianism, and he does so by developing a test that any candidate moral principle must pass: it must be such that no-one could reasonably reject it as the basis for informed, unforced general agreement (see the entry on contractualism). Scanlon’s contractors are not positioned behind a veil of ignorance. They are able to see what effect adopting any proposed principle would have on them personally. If that effect is unacceptable to them, they are permitted to reject it. Each person has, so to speak, a veto on any general principle for regulating conduct. Those that survive this test are defensible as principles of justice – Scanlon concedes that there might be alternative sets of such principles appropriate to different social conditions.

It might seem, however, that giving each person a veto would lead straightforwardly to deadlock, since anyone might reject a principle under which he fared badly relative to some alternative. Here the idea of reasonable rejection becomes important. It would not, Scanlon thinks, be reasonable to reject a principle under which one does badly if the alternatives all involve someone else faring worse still. One needs to take account of other people’s reasons for rejecting these alternatives. It might then appear that Scanlon’s contractualism yields the difference principle, which requires the worst-off group in society to be as well of as they can be. But this is not the conclusion that Scanlon draws (though he acknowledges that there might be special reasons to follow Rawls in requiring basic social institutions to follow the difference principle). The claims of other groups must be considered too. If a policy greatly benefits many others, while slightly worsening the position of a few, though without leaving them very badly off, it may well not be rejectable. Scanlon’s position leaves some room for aggregation – it makes a difference how many people will be benefitted if a principle is followed – though not the simple form of aggregation that utilitarians defend.

Scanlon also says that a person can have a reason for rejecting a principle if it treats them unfairly, say by benefitting some but not others for arbitrary reasons. This presupposes a norm of fairness that the contractarian theory does not itself attempt to explain or justify. So it looks as though the purpose of the theory is to provide a distinctive account of moral reasoning (and moral motivation) but not to defend any substantive principles of distributive justice. In this respect, Scanlon’s contractualism is less ambitious than either Gauthier’s or Rawls’.

6. Egalitarianism and Justice

In the recent past, many philosophers have sought to establish a close connection between justice and equality: they ask the question ‘what kind of equality does justice require?’, and to that several competing answers have been given (see, for example Cohen 1989, Dworkin 2000, Sen 1980). But we should not be too hasty to assume that what justice demands is always equality, whether of treatment or of outcome. Perhaps it does so only in a formal sense. As we saw in sect 1.3, justice requires the impartial and consistent application of rules, from which it follows that when two people are alike in all relevant respects, they must be treated equally. But, as Aristotle among others saw, justice also involves the idea of proportional treatment, which implies recipients getting unequal amounts of whatever good is at issue (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, ch. 3). If A is twice as deserving or twice as needy as B, justice may require that she receives more than B does. So here formal equality of treatment – the same rule applied to both – leads to an unequal outcome. Again, when justice takes the conservative form of respect for existing entitlements or legitimate expectations (see para 2.1) there is no reason to anticipate that what is due to different people will be substantively the same.

6.1 Justice as Equality

So we need to ask about the circumstances in which justice requires a substantively equal distribution of advantages. One rather obvious case occurs when the members of the group within which the distribution is going to occur have no relevant distinguishing features, so there are no grounds on which some can claim greater shares of benefit than others. Suppose a group experiences a windfall gain for which no-one can claim any credit: a pot of gold somehow appears in their midst. Then unless any member can make a justice-related claim for a larger-than-equal share – say that she has special needs that she lacks sufficient resources to meet – an equal distribution of the gold is what justice demands, since any other distribution would be arbitrary. Equality here is the default principle that applies in the absence of any special claims that can be presented as reasons of justice.

Equality also acts as a default in circumstances where, although people may indeed have unequal claims to whatever good is being distributed, we have no reliable way of identifying and measuring those claims. By sharing the good equally, we can at least ensure that every claim has been partially satisfied. Thus suppose we have limited supplies of a drug that can treat malaria, and a number of patients displaying symptoms of the disease, but lacking specialised medical knowledge we cannot tell whether one person’s condition is more serious than another’s; then by sharing out the drug equally, we can guarantee that each person at least receives the highest fraction of what they really need. Any other distribution must leave at least one person with less (this of course assumes that there is no threshold amount of the drug beneath which it is ineffective; if that assumption is wrong, justice under the stated conditions might require a lottery in which the chosen ones receive threshold-size doses).

If justice requires equality only by default, it might seem to apply only in a narrow range of cases. How could egalitarian justice be made more robust? One approach involves declaring a wider range of factors irrelevant to just distribution. Thus one formulation of the principle holds that no-one should be worse-off than anyone else as a result of their ‘morally arbitrary’ characteristics, where a characteristic is morally arbitrary when its possessor cannot claim credit for having it. This captures a widespread intuition that people should not be advantaged or disadvantaged by virtue of their race or gender, but extends it (more controversially) to all personal features with a genetic basis, such as natural talents and inborn dispositions. In doing so, it discounts most claims of desert, since when people are said to deserve benefits of various kinds, it is usually for performing actions or displaying qualities that depend upon innate characteristics such as strength or intelligence. In the following section, we will see how egalitarian theories of justice have tried to incorporate some desert-like elements by way of response. But otherwise justice as equality and justice as desert appear to be in conflict, and the challenge is to show what can justify equal treatment in the face of inequalities of desert.

A second approach answers this challenge by explaining why it is positively valuable to afford people equal treatment even if they do display features that might appear to justify differential treatment. A prominent advocate of this approach is Dworkin, who argues that fundamental to justice is a principle of equal concern and respect for persons, and what this means in more concrete term is that equal resources should be devoted to the life of each member of society (Dworkin 2000). (The reference to membership here is not redundant, because Dworkin understands egalitarian justice as a principle that must be applied within sovereign states specifically – so in the terms of 3.2, this is a relational view of justice.) The thought is that showing persons equal respect may sometimes require us to afford them equal treatment, even in the face of relevant grounds for discrimination. Thus we insist on political equality – one person, one vote – even though we know that there are quite large differences in people’s competence to make political decisions.

6.2 Responsibility-sensitive egalitarianism

As noted above, justice as simple equality of treatment seems open to the objection that it fails to acknowledge the agency of the recipients, who may have acted in ways that appear to qualify them to receive more (or less) of whatever benefit is being distributed. To answer this objection, several recent philosophers have presented alternative versions of ‘responsibility-sensitive egalitarianism’ – a family of theories of justice that treat equal distribution as a starting point but allow for departures from that baseline when these result from the responsible choices made by individuals (see Knight and Stemplowska 2011 for examples). These theories differ along several dimensions: the ‘currency of justice’ used to define the baseline of equality, the conditions that must be fulfilled for a choice to qualify as responsible, and which among the consequences that follow from a choice should count when the justice of an outcome is being assessed (it may in particular appear unjust to allow people to suffer the full consequences of bad choices that they could not reasonably have anticipated). The label that is often used to describe a sub-class of these theories is ‘luck egalitarianism’. According to luck egalitarians, justice requires that no-one should be disadvantaged relative to others on account of ‘brute’ bad luck, whereas inequalities that arise through the exercise of personal responsibility are permissible (for a full discussion of luck egalitarianism, see the entry on justice and bad luck). ‘Brute’ luck is interpreted widely to include not only external circumstances such as one person’s initially having access to more resources than another, but also internal factors such as possessing natural abilities or disabilities, or having involuntarily acquired expensive tastes. All such inequalities are to be ironed out by redistribution or compensation, while people’s choices about how to use the assets they are granted should be respected, even if this leads to significant inequality in the long run.

Luck egalitarianism has proved surprisingly influential in recent debates on justice, despite the evident difficulties involved in, for example, quantifying ‘brute luck disadvantage’ in such a way that a compensatory scheme could be established. There are, however, a number of problems it has to face. By giving scope to personal responsibility, it seeks to capture what is perhaps the most attractive part of the conventional idea of desert – that people should be rewarded for making good choices and penalised for making bad ones – while filtering out the effects of having (undeserved) natural talents. But in reality the choices that people make are influenced by the talents and other qualities that they happen to have already. So if we allow someone to reap advantages by, for example, devoting long hours to learning to play the piano at a high level, we must recognize that this is a choice that she would almost certainly not have made unless early experiment showed that she was musically gifted. We cannot say what she would have chosen to do in a counterfactual world in which she was tone deaf. There seems then to be no coherent half-way house between accepting full-blooded desert and denying that people can justly claim relative advantage through the exercise of responsibility and choice (see further Miller 1999, ch. 7) .

A second problem is that one person’s exercise of responsibility may prove advantageous or disadvantageous to others, even though they have done nothing to bring this change about, so from their point of view it must count as ‘brute’ luck. This will be true, for example, in any case in which people are competing to excel in some field, where successful choices made by A will worsen the comparative position of B, C, and D. Or again, if A acts in a way that benefits B, but does nothing comparable to improve the position of C and D, then an inequality is created that counts as ‘brute bad luck’ from the perspective of the latter. One of the most influential exponents of luck egalitarianism seems to have recognized the problem in a late essay: ‘unlike plain egalitarianism, luck egalitarianism is paradoxical, because the use of shares by people is bound to lead to a distribution flecked by luck’ (Cohen 2011, p. 142).

6.3 Relational Egalitarianism

We have seen that equality can sometimes be understood as required by justice; but it can also be valued independently. Indeed there can be circumstances in which the two values collide, because what justice demands is inequality of outcome. The kind of inequality that is independently valuable is social equality, best understood as a property of the relationships that prevail within a society: people regard and treat each other as social equals, and the society’s institutions are designed to foster and reflect such attitudes. A society of equals contrasts with one in which people belong to different ranks in a social hierarchy, and behave towards one another as their relative ranking prescribes. Different reasons can be given for objecting to social inequality, and conversely for valuing social equality (see Scanlon 2003).

Those who find equality valuable for reasons other than reasons of distributive justice are often described as ‘relational egalitarians’ (see Anderson 1999, Wolff 1998, Fourie, Schuppert and Wallimann-Helmer 2015). It is tempting to regard relational egalitarianism as a rival theory of justice to the luck egalitarian theory outlined in §6.2, but it may be more illuminating to see it instead as providing an alternative account of why we should care about limiting material inequality. Thus, faced with a world like the one we currently inhabit in which income differences are very large, justice theorists are likely to criticize these inequalities on grounds that they are not deserved, or arise from brute luck, etc., whereas relational egalitarians will say that they create a divided society in which people are alienated from each other, and cannot interact in a mutually respectful way. Relational equality does not address issues of distribution directly, and so cannot function as a theory of justice itself, but it can provide grounds for preferring one theory of justice to its rivals – namely that implementing that particular theory is more likely to create or sustain a society of equals.

7. Conclusion

We saw at the beginning of this article that justice can take a number of different forms, depending on the practical context in which it is being applied. Although we found common elements running through this diversity of use – most readily captured in Justinian’s ‘suum cuique’ formula – these were formal rather than substantive. In these circumstances, it is natural to look for an overarching framework into which the various contextually specific conceptions of justice can all be fitted. Three such frameworks were examined: utilitarianism, contractarianism and egalitarianism. None, however, passed what we might call the ‘Sidgwick/Rawls test’, namely that of incorporating and explaining the majority at least of our considered convictions about justice – beliefs that we feel confident in holding about what justice requires us to do in a wide and varied range of circumstances (for Rawls’ version of the test see the entry on reflective equilibrium). So unless we are willing to jettison many of these convictions in order to uphold one or other general framework, we will need to accept that no comprehensive theory of justice is available to us; we will have to make do with partial theories – theories about what justice requires in particular domains of human life. Rawls himself, despite the bold title of his first book (A Theory of Justice), came to recognize that what he had outlined was at best a theory of social justice applied to the basic institutional structure of a modern liberal state. Other forms of justice – familial, allocative, associational, international – with their associated principles would be applicable in their respective domains (for an even more explicitly pluralist account of justice, see Walzer 1983; for a fuller defence of a contextual approach to justice, see Miller 2013, esp. ch. 2).

One way to loosen up our thinking about justice is by paying greater attention to the history of the concept. We can learn a great deal by reading what Aristotle, or Aquinas, or Hume, has to say about the concept, but as we do so, we also see that elements we would expect to find are missing (there is nothing about rights in Aristotle, for example), while others that we would not anticipate are present. This may in some part be due to the idiosyncrasies of each thinker, but more importantly it reflects differences in the form of social life in which each was embedded – its economic, legal and political structure, especially. Various attempts have been made to write histories of justice that are more than just catalogues of what individual thinkers have said: they aim to trace and explain systematic shifts in the way that justice has been interpreted (for contrasting examples, see MacIntyre 1988, Fleischacker 2004, Johnston 2011). These should not be read as enlightenment stories in which our understanding of justice steadily improves as the centuries roll by. MacIntyre’s view, for example, is that modern liberal societies cannot sustain the practices within which notions of justice find their proper home. We can get a better grasp of what justice means to us by seeing the various conceptions that compete for our attention as tied to aspects of our social world that did not exist in the past, and are equally liable to disappear in the future.


  • Anderson, Elizabeth, 1999, “What is the Point of Equality?” Ethics, 109: 287–337.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Roger Crisp, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • –––, The Politics, translated by Thomas Sinclair, Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1962.
  • Barry, Brian, 1989, Theories of Justice, Hemel Hempstead: Harvester-Wheatsheaf.
  • –––, 1995, Justice as Impartiality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, The Principles of Morals and Legislation, ed. Laurence Lafleur, New York: Hafner Press, 1948.
  • Brighouse, Harry and Adam Swift, 2014, Family Values: the ethics of parent-child relationships, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Buchanan, Allen, 1987, “Justice and Charity,” Ethics, 97: 558–75.
  • Casal, Paula, 2007, “Why Sufficiency Is Not Enough,” Ethics, 117: 296–326.
  • Cohen, G.A., 1989, “On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice,” Ethics, 99: 906–44.
  • –––, 1995, Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2008, Rescuing Justice and Equality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2011, “Fairness and Legitimacy in Justice, and: Does Option Luck ever Preserve Justice?” in On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice and Other Essays in Political Philosophy, edited by Michael Otsuka, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Coleman, Jules, 1992, Risks and Wrongs, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Donaldson, Sue and Will Kymlicka, 2011, Zoopolis: a political theory of animals rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 2000, Sovereign Virtue: the theory and practice of equality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Feinberg, Joel, 1970, “Justice and Personal Desert,” in Doing and Deserving: essays in the theory of responsibility, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1974, “Noncomparative Justice,” Philosophical Review, 83: 297–338.
  • Fleischacker, Samuel, 2004, A Short History of Distributive Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Fourie, Carina, Fabian Schuppert and Ivo Wallimann-Helmer (eds.), 2015, Social Equality: on what it means to be equals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Frankfurt, Harry, 2015, On Inequality, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Fraser, Nancy and Axel Honneth, 2003, Redistribution or Recognition? : a political-philosophical exchange, London: Verso.
  • Fricker, Miranda, 2007, Epistemic Injustice; power and the ethics of knowing, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Garner, Robert, 2013, A Theory of Justice for Animals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gauthier, David, 1986, Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Harsanyi, John, 1975, “Can the Maximin Principle Serve as a Basis for Morality? A Critique of John Rawls’s Theory,” American Political Science Review, 69: 594–606.
  • Hayek, Friedrich, 1976, Law, Legislation and Liberty (Volume II: The Mirage of Social Justice), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge, revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978.
  • –––, An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals in Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Johnston, David, 2011, A Brief History of Justice, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Kagan, Shelly, 2012, The Geometry of Desert, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Knight, Carl and Zofia Stemplowska (eds.), 2011, Responsibility and Distributive Justice, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lind, E. Allan and Tom Tyler, 1988, The Social Psychology of Procedural Justice, New York and London: Plenum Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1988, Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, London: Duckworth.
  • Mill, John Stuart, Utilitarianism in Utilitarianism, On Liberty, Representative Government, ed. A.D. Lindsay, London: Dent, 1964.
  • Miller, David, 1999, Principles of Social Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2013, Justice for Earthlings: essays in political philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Montague, Phillip, 1980, “Comparative and Non-Comparative Justice,” Philosophical Quarterly, 30: 131–40.
  • Murphy, Liam, 1998, “Institutions and the Demands of Justice,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27, 251–91.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 2005, “The Problem of Global Justice,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 33, 113–47.
  • Nozick, Robert, 1974, Anarchy, State and Utopia, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Nussbaum, Martha, 2006, Frontiers of Justice: disability, nationality, species membership, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Okin, Susan, 1989, Justice, Gender, and the Family, New York: Basic Books.
  • Olsaretti, Serena (ed.), 2003, Justice and Desert, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Paul, Jeffrey (ed.), 1982, Reading Nozick : essays on Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Perry, Stephen, 2000, “On the Relationship between Corrective and Distributive Justice,” in Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence, Fourth Series, edited by Jeremy Horder, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Raphael, D. D., 2001, Concepts of Justice, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Rawls, John, 1958, “Justice as Fairness,” Philosophical Review, 67: 164–94.
  • –––, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1993, Political Liberalism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1999, A Theory of Justice, revised edition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2001, Justice as Fairness: a restatement, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ripstein, Arthur, 2004, “The Division of Responsibility and the Law of Tort,” Fordham Law Review, 72: 1811–44.
  • Sandel, Michael, 1982, Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Scanlon, T. M., 1998, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2003, “The Diversity of Objections to Inequality,” in The Difficulty of Tolerance: essays in political philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sen, Amartya, 1980, “Equality of What?” in Tanner Lectures on Human Values, Volume 1, ed. S. McMurrin, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1874/1907, The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan.
  • Valentini, Laura, 2014, “Canine Justice: An Associative Account,” Political Studies, 62: 37–52.
  • Walzer, Michael, 1983, Spheres of Justice: a defence of pluralism and equality, New York: Basic Books.
  • Williams, Andrew, 1998, “Incentives, Inequality, and Publicity,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27: 225–47.
  • Wolff, Jonathan, 1991, Robert Nozick : property, justice and the minimal state, Cambridge: Polity.
  • –––, 1998, “Fairness, Respect and the Egalitarian Ethos,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27: 97–122.
  • Young, Iris Marion, 2011, Responsibility for Justice, New York: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2021 by
David Miller <david.miller@nuffield.ox.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free