Kant’s Aesthetics and Teleology

First published Sat Jul 2, 2005; substantive revision Fri Jul 15, 2022

Kant’s views on aesthetics and teleology are most fully presented in his Critique of Judgment (Kritik der Urteilskraft, now often translated Critique of the Power of Judgment), published in 1790.[1] This work is in two parts, preceded by a long introduction in which Kant explains and defends the work’s importance to his critical system overall. In the first part, the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment”, Kant discusses aesthetic experience and judgment, in particular of the beautiful and the sublime, and also artistic creation; in the second part, the “Critique of Teleological Judgment”, he discusses the role of teleology (that is, appeal to ends, purposes or goals) in natural science and in our understanding of nature more generally. The Critique of Judgment was the third and last of Kant’s three Critiques, the other two being the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, with a second edition in 1787), which deals with metaphysics and epistemology, and the Critique of Practical Reason of 1788, which, alongside his Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals of 1785, deals with ethics.

Although interest in the Critique of Judgment has increased substantially over the last several decades, it has received less attention than the other two Critiques. One reason is that the areas of aesthetics and natural teleology have traditionally been considered less philosophically central than those of ethics, metaphysics and epistemology. Another is that it raises an interpretive problem which has no analogue in the case of the other Critiques: that is, how to make sense of the work as a whole given the seeming disparity of the two parts, not only with each other, but also with the “faculty of judgment” which is the work’s ostensible focus. However, Kant’s aesthetic theory has always been extremely influential within philosophical aesthetics and the philosophy of art, and since the late 1970s there has been a rapidly expanding literature on Kant’s aesthetics within Anglo-American Kant interpretation. (Some of the growth in the literature up to 2008 is documented in Guyer 2009.) Kant’s views on natural teleology, very much neglected in comparison to his aesthetics, started to receive more attention in the early 1990s, and there has been increased interest, during the last two decades in particular, both in Kant’s view of teleology in its own right, and in its potential relevance to contemporary philosophy of biology and to other areas in philosophy. Moreover, again since the 1990s, more attention has been directed towards the project of interpreting the Critique of Judgment as a coherent whole. With increased focus on its general philosophical underpinnings, the third Critique has come to be seen not only as significant within the disciplines of aesthetics and philosophy of biology, but also as playing an important systematic role with respect to Kant’s epistemology, metaphysics and ethics, and indeed, as relevant to contemporary discussions in these, and related, areas.

Kant’s aesthetics and teleology together comprise a very wide field, and this article cannot cover all the relevant topics, nor take account of all the relevant literature, especially given the recent expansion of scholarly interest in the third Critique. I mention here three more specific limitations. First, although Kant wrote on aesthetics and teleology throughout his career, this article considers only Kant’s Critique of Judgment (along with the so-called “First Introduction”, an earlier version of the Introduction that was not published during Kant’s lifetime but that is included with the most recent English translations of the Critique of Judgment). Second, this article is concerned primarily with the interpretive and philosophical issues raised by Kant’s writings on these topics, as opposed to historical questions regarding their origin and reception. Third, the article focusses primarily on those issues that have attracted most attention in the Anglo-American analytic tradition; this is reflected in the bibliography, which is largely restricted to works in English, and more specifically works written from an analytic perspective. For some references to Kant’s writings on aesthetics and teleology other than the Critique of Judgment, see under Primary Sources in the Bibliography. Some suggestions for secondary literature dealing with the history and reception of Kant’s aesthetics and teleology, and for secondary literature in English from a less analytic perspective, are given under Secondary Sources in the Bibliography.

1. The Faculty of Judgment and the Unity of the Third Critique

Kant’s account of aesthetics and teleology is ostensibly part of a broader discussion of the faculty or power of judgment [Urteilskraft], which is the faculty “for thinking the particular under the universal” (Introduction IV, 5:179). Although the Critique of Pure Reason includes some discussion of the faculty of judgment, defined as “the capacity to subsume under rules, that is, to distinguish whether something falls under a given rule” (A132/B171), it is not until the Critique of Judgment that he treats judgment as a full-fledged faculty in its own right, with its own a priori principle, and, accordingly, requiring a “critique” to determine its scope and limits.

Kant describes judgment in the Critique of Judgment as having two roles or aspects, “determining” [bestimmend] and “reflecting” [reflektierend] (Introduction IV, 5:179 and FI V, 20:211). Judgment in its determining role subsumes given particulars under concepts or universals which are themselves already given. This role coincides with the role assigned to the faculty of judgment in the Critique of Pure Reason; it also appears to correspond to the activity of imagination in its “schematism” of concepts. Judgment in this role does not operate as an independent faculty, but is instead governed by principles of the understanding. The more distinctive role assigned to judgment in the Critique of Judgment is the reflecting role, that of “finding” the universal for the given particular (Introduction IV, 5:179). Kant’s recognition of judgment as a faculty in its own right, and hence of the need for a Critique not just for theoretical and practical reason but also for judgment, appears to be connected with his ascription to judgment of a reflecting, in addition to a merely determining, role.

Judgment as reflecting, or reflective judgment [reflektierende Urteilskraft], is assigned various different roles within Kant’s system. Kant describes it as responsible for various cognitive tasks associated with empirical scientific enquiry, in particular, the classification of natural things into a hierarchical taxonomy of genera and species, and the construction of systematic explanatory scientific theories. Kant also suggests that it has a more fundamental role to play in making cognition possible, in particular that it enables us to regard nature as empirically lawlike (see especially Introduction V, 5:184), and, even more fundamentally, that it is responsible for the formation of all empirical concepts (see especially FI V, 20:211–213).

But reflective judgment is also described as responsible for two specific kinds of judgments: aesthetic judgments (judgments about the beautiful and the sublime) and teleological judgments (judgments which ascribe ends or purposes to natural things, or which characterize them in purposive or functional terms). These, along with associated topics, are discussed respectively in Section I, the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment, ” and Section II, the “Critique of Teleological Judgment. ” The discussion of the role of judgment in empirical scientific enquiry is confined to a few sections of the Introduction and First Introduction.

Although reflective judgment is exercised in both aesthetic and teleological judgment, Kant assigns a special role to its exercise in the aesthetic case, and specifically in judgments of beauty (Introduction VIII, 193; FI XI, 243–244). More specifically, he says, it is in judgments of beauty (as opposed to the sublime), and even more specifically, judgments about the beauty of nature (as opposed to art), that “judgment reveals itself as a faculty that has its own special principle” (FI XI, 244). The especially close connection between judgments of beauty and the faculty of judgment is reflected in Kant’s view that the feeling of pleasure in a beautiful object is felt in virtue of an exercise of reflective judgment (Introduction VII, FI VIII).

Much of Kant’s aesthetics and theory of teleology is developed without any explicit reference to the faculty of judgment, and the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” makes no mention of reflective judgment as it figures in empirical scientific enquiry (in fact, the term “reflective judgment” does not appear in the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” at all). The only suggestion in the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” of an important role for the faculty of judgment in Kant’s aesthetics is in the Deduction of Taste, where he describes the principle of taste as the “subjective principle of judgment in general” (§35, 286) and suggests that the relation of aesthetic judgment specifically to the faculty of judgment in general is crucial for the legitimacy of judgments of beauty (§38, 290). Accordingly, much of the secondary literature on Kant’s aesthetics has treated it in isolation from the more general account of judgment in which it is embedded, and the same is true, perhaps to an even greater extent, in the case of Kant’s teleology. Conversely, discussions of Kant’s “theory of judgment” have typically taken little or no account of Kant’s treatment of judgment in the third Critique, suggesting thereby that Kant’s views on judgment are exhausted by his account of cognitive (in particular non-aesthetic) judgments in the Critique of Pure Reason and the Logic. (The article “Kant’s Theory of Judgment” in the present Encyclopedia [Hanna 2004 [2018]] is one example.)

However, since the late 1980s philosophers working on Kant have become increasingly interested in the notion of judgment in the third Critique. One way in which this interest has been pursued is through an exploration of the relation of Kant’s notion of judgment in the third Critique to his account of cognition in the Critique of Pure Reason and the Logic. Longuenesse (1993 [1998]) maintains that there is a close connection between the “capacity to judge” [Vermögen zu urteilen] in that work and the faculty of judgment in the Critique of Judgment, a connection which she summarizes by describing the faculty of judgment as the “actualization” of the capacity to judge in relation to sensory perceptions (1993 [1998: 8]). According to Longuenesse, the activity of reflective judgment corresponds to the “comparison, reflection and abstraction” which Kant describes in the Logic (§6, 9:94–95) as responsible for the formation of empirical concepts, and which she understands as, in turn, a necessary condition of the application of the pure concepts of understanding to the manifold of sensible intuition (1993 [1998: 163–166 and 195–197]). Longuenesse’s view on this point is endorsed and elaborated in Allison 2001: ch. 1.

Another manifestation of interest in the notion of judgment has been the exploration of connections between Kant’s account of aesthetic experience and judgment in the third Critique and his theory of cognitive judgments in the first Critique. Bell (1987) and Ginsborg (1990a) both argue that, for Kant, the possibility of aesthetic experience to be, in some sense, a condition of the possibility of cognitive judgment; Makkreel (1990), from a more Continental, and specifically hermeneutical perspective, also argues for deep connections between Kant’s aesthetics and his account of cognition. Kukla (2006) collects together a number of essays exploring the relation between Kant’s aesthetics and his theory of cognition; the introduction to Kukla 2006 offers some historical perspective on the increased interest in Kant’s aesthetics as playing a systematic role in Kant’s epistemological program. Hughes (2007: ch. 5) argues that Kant’s views in the Critique of Judgment are necessary for a full understanding of Kant’s account of synthesis in the first Critique and for the Transcendental Deduction of the categories in the first Critique. Ginsborg (2006) and Geiger (2020) both argue for a connection between the possibility of aesthetic judgment and that of the acquisition of empirical concepts. Breitenbach (2021) proposes that aesthetic judgment and cognitive judgment share a “common core” of imaginative reflection which helps account for scientific creativity. Makkai (2021: ch. 1), while sympathetic to the idea that Kant’s aesthetics makes a contribution to his view of cognition, argues that several attempts to make out the connection, including those of Bell (1987) and Allison (2001), rest on a mistaken construal of Kant’s notion of judgment. Rather than endorsing the idea that aesthetic judgment is somehow presupposed by cognition, she proposes that they are parallel, both having a basis in reflective judgment (Makkai 2021: ch. 4).

An important reason why commentators have been interested in Kant’s account of judgment in the Critique of Judgment is as a potential solution to the question of what unifies the various parts of the Critique of Judgment, and, in particular, what connects the discussion of aesthetics in the first half of the book with that of teleology in the second half of the book. Until the 1980s, many commentators were skeptical that there was any real philosophical connection between the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” (Part I) and the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” (Part II); for expressions of this view see for example Schopenhauer (1819/1859 [1969: vol. I, 531]), Marc-Wogau (1938: 34n.), and Beck (1969: 497). But since then there has been much more interest in understanding the work as a unified whole, where this involves recognizing connections, not only between the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” and the “Critique of Teleological Judgment”, but also between those two sections and the Introduction (and First Introduction) to the Critique of Judgment as a whole. (The decision by the editors of the present Encyclopedia to treat the seemingly disparate topics of Kant’s aesthetics and Kant’s teleology in a single article represents one illustration of this general orientation towards the unity of the work.)

One way in which commentators have tried to find unity in the Critique of Judgment is by connecting Kant’s aesthetics with his discussions, in the Introduction and First Introduction, of the search for a system of empirical concepts and laws. Examples of this approach include Ginsborg (1990a), Hughes (2007), Zuckert (2007a), and Geiger (2020). Another, potentially complementary, way is to find connections between his theory of beauty and his views on biology in the Critique of Teleological Judgment. Zumbach (1984: 51–53) suggests that works of art are analogous to organisms; Makkreel (1990: ch. 5) sees the connection as turning on the idea of pleasure as the feeling of mental life. Aquila (1992) draws a connection between the internal structure of organisms as one in which the whole determines the parts, and the internal structure of a judgment of beauty as one in which a feeling of pleasure rather than a concept serves as a predicate. Ginsborg (1997a) connects Kant’s aesthetics and his biological views in terms of the idea of purposiveness construed as normativity: the normativity in the functioning of organisms parallels the normative claim to universal agreement made by a judgment of beauty. Zuckert (2007a) offers an especially detailed account of the connection, also emphasizing the notion of purposiveness, but construing it as unity in diversity, which is manifested in beautiful objects and organisms alike. Geiger (2020) suggests that organisms play a special role as objects of aesthetic judgment, and suggests that our aesthetic judgments about organisms are closely allied to our sorting of nature into kinds and hence our acquisition of empirical concepts.

A contrasting approach to the unity of the Critique of Judgment goes by way of Kant’s moral teleology, and invokes Kant’s claim that the Critique of Judgment is intended to bridge the gulf between nature and freedom (Introduction II and III, 175–177). This approach is implicit in many discussions of the relevance of Kant’s aesthetics to his account of morality (see Section 2.8), which in turn can be connected to his theory of teleology through the idea that the human being, as a free and rational agent, is the “ultimate purpose” [Endzweck] of nature (see Section 3.6). Gardner (2016) offers an explicit defence of this kind of approach, drawing on the idea that aesthetic experience reveals the suitability of nature for human moral agency; this idea is also emphasized in Wicks (2007). Savile (2021) invokes a related idea and ascribes it to Kant under the label of “aesthetic humanism”. Vaccarino Bremner (forthcoming) develops this kind of approach in detail by focussing on Kant’s idea of culture, which Kant identifies as the ultimate purpose [letzter Zweck] of nature (5:429), and which, on her view, mediates between nature itself and the final purpose [Endzweck] of nature, that is the human being as a moral agent.

The theme of the unity of the Critique of Judgment is closely related to that of the role of the Critique of Judgment in Kant’s overall philosophical system. Pollok (2017: ch. 9) offers some brief but suggestive remarks on that topic; Huseyinzadegan (2018) addresses both the internal unity of the Critique of Judgment and its relation to Kant’s Opus Postumum.

2. Aesthetics

An aesthetic judgment, in Kant’s usage, is a judgment which is based on feeling, and in particular on the feeling of pleasure or displeasure. According to Kant’s official view there are three kinds of aesthetic judgment: judgments of the agreeable, judgments of beauty (or, equivalently, judgments of taste), and judgments of the sublime. However, Kant often uses the expression “aesthetic judgment” in a narrower sense which excludes judgments of the agreeable, and it is with aesthetic judgments in this narrower sense that the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is primarily concerned. Such judgments can either be, or fail to be, “pure”; while Kant mostly focusses on the ones which are pure, there are reasons to think that most judgments about art (as opposed to nature) do not count as pure, so that it is important to understand Kant’s views on such judgments as well.

The “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is concerned not only with judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, but also with the production of objects about which such judgments are appropriately made; this topic is discussed under the headings of “fine art” or “beautiful art” [schöne Kunst] and “genius”.

The most distinctive part of Kant’s aesthetic theory, and the part which has aroused most interest among commentators, is his account of judgments of beauty, and, more specifically, pure judgments of beauty. (Following Kant’s own usage, the expression “judgment of beauty” without qualification will refer, in what follows, to pure judgments of beauty.) The most important elements of this account are sketched here in Section 2.1 and Section 2.2, and which correspond roughly to the “Analytic of the Beautiful” and the “Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments” respectively. Section 2.3 and Section 2.4 are concerned, respectively, with interpretative issues that have arisen in connection with the account, and with criticisms which have been made of it.

Other elements of Kant’s theory are sketched in the remainder of the section. Section 2.5 is concerned with judgments of beauty that are not pure, in particular judgments of “adherent” as opposed to “free” beauty; Section 2.6 with beautiful art and genius; Section 2.7 with judgments of the sublime; Section 2.8 with the relation between aesthetics and morality; and Section 2.9 with other implications of Kant’s aesthetic theory.

2.1 What is a Judgment of Beauty?

The first section of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment”, the “Analytic of the Beautiful”, aims to analyse the notion of a judgment of beauty or judgment of taste, describing the features which distinguish judgments of beauty from judgments of other kinds, notably cognitive judgments (which include judgments ascribing goodness to things), and what he calls “judgments of the agreeable”. Kant is not explicit about the pretheoretical conception of judgments of beauty which is the subject of his analysis, and there is room for controversy about what does and does not count as a judgment of beauty in Kant’s sense. Not every predicative use of the word “beautiful” signals the making of a judgment of beauty, at least in the paradigmatic sense with which Kant is concerned (for a useful discussion, see Savile 1993: ch. 1). For example, at §8 Kant denies that the judgment that roses in general are beautiful is a judgment of beauty or judgment of taste proper: it is not an “aesthetic” but an “aesthetically grounded logical judgment”. There is also room for debate about whether the intuitive notion of a judgment of beauty, for Kant, allows for negative judgments of beauty (see Section 2.3.6 below). However, at a first approximation, we can say that it is the mental activity or content typically expressed by, or manifested in, a sincere utterance of “that’s beautiful” in reference to a perceptually presented object.

Kant analyses the notion of a judgment of beauty by considering it under four headings, or “moments”, as sketched below:

2.1.1 First Moment (§§1–5)

Judgments of beauty are based on feeling, in particular feelings of pleasure (Kant also mentions displeasure, but this does not figure prominently in his account; for more on this point, see Section 2.3.6 below). The pleasure, however, is of a distinctive kind: it is disinterested, which means that it does not depend on the subject’s having a desire for the object, nor does it generate such a desire. The fact that judgments of beauty are based on feeling rather than “objective sensation” (e.g., the sensation of a thing’s colour) distinguishes them from cognitive judgments based on perception (e.g., the judgment that a thing is green). But the disinterested character of the feeling distinguishes them from other judgments based on feeling. In particular, it distinguishes them from (i) judgments of the agreeable, which are the kind of judgment expressed by saying simply that one likes something or finds it pleasing (for example, food or drink), and (ii) judgments of the good, including judgments both about the moral goodness of something and about its goodness for particular non-moral purposes.

2.1.2 Second Moment (§§6–9)

Judgments of beauty have, or make a claim to, “universality” or “universal validity”. (Kant also uses the expression “universal communicability”; this has been taken by many commentators as equivalent to “universal validity” but recently this has been questioned; see Section 2.3.8.) That is, in making a judgment of beauty about an object, one takes it that everyone else who perceives the object ought also to judge it to be beautiful, and, relatedly, to share one’s pleasure in it. But the universality is not “based on concepts”. That is, one’s claim to agreement does not rest on the subsumption of the object under a concept (in the way, for example, that the claim to agreement made by the judgment that something is green rests on the ascription to the object of the property of being green, and hence its subsumption under the concept green). It follows from this that judgments of beauty cannot, despite their universal validity, be proved: there are no rules by which someone can be compelled to judge that something is beautiful (Kant expands on this point in §§32–33). More strongly, judgments of beauty are not to be understood as predicating the concept beauty of their objects: as he puts it later, “beauty is not a concept of the object” (§38, 290). Still later, in the “Antinomy of Taste”, Kant seems to go back on this strong claim by saying that a judgment of beauty rests on an “indeterminate concept” (§57, 341); however, by “concept” here he diverges from the standard use of the term “concept” as referring to a kind of representation which can figure in cognition.

The fact that judgments of beauty are universally valid constitutes a further feature (in addition to the disinterestedness of the pleasure on which they are based) distinguishing them from judgments of agreeable. For in claiming simply that one likes something, one does not claim that everyone else ought to like it too. But the fact that their universal validity is not based on concepts distinguishes judgments of beauty from non-evaluative cognitive judgments and judgments of the good, both of which make a claim to universal validity that is based on concepts.

2.1.3 Third Moment (§§10–17)

Unlike judgments of the good, judgments of the beautiful do not presuppose an end or purpose [Zweck] which the object is taken to satisfy.[2] (This is closely related to the point that their universality is not based on concepts). However, they nonetheless involve the representation of what Kant calls “purposiveness” [Zweckmässigkeit]. Because this representation of purposiveness does not involve the ascription of an purpose (in an expression widely used by commentators, it is “purposiveness without a purpose”), Kant calls the purposiveness which is represented “merely formal purposiveness” or “the form of purposiveness”. He describes it as perceived both in the object itself and in the activity of imagination and understanding in their engagement with the object. (For more on this activity, see the discussion of the “free play of the faculties” in Section 2.2; for more on the notion of purposiveness, see Section 3.1.) The Third Moment, in particular §14, is the main evidence for Kant’s supposed formalism in aesthetics; for more on Kant’s formalism, see Section 2.4.

2.1.4 Fourth Moment (§18–22)

Judgments of beauty involve reference to the idea of necessity, in the following sense: in taking my judgment of taste to be universally valid, I take it, not that everyone who perceives the object will share my pleasure in it and (relatedly) agree with my judgment, but that everyone ought to do so. I take it, then, that my pleasure stands in a “necessary” relation to the object which elicits it, where the necessity here can be described (though Kant himself does not use the term) as normative. But, as in the case of universal validity, the necessity is not based on concepts or rules (at least, not concepts or rules that are determinate, that is, of a kind which figure in cognition; as noted earlier in this section, Kant describes it, in the Antinomy of Taste, as resting on an “indeterminate concept”). Kant characterizes the necessity more positively by saying that it is “exemplary”, in the sense that one’s judgment itself serves as an example of how everyone ought to judge (§18, 237). He also says that it is based on a “common sense” (sensus communis), defined as a subjective principle which allows us to judge by feeling rather than concepts (§20).

2.2 How are Judgments of Beauty Possible?

Running through Kant’s various characterizations of judgments of beauty is a basic dichotomy between two apparently opposed sets of features. On the one hand, judgments of beauty are based on feeling, they do not depend on subsuming the object under a concept (in particular, the concept of a purpose that such an object is supposed to satisfy), and they cannot be proved. This combination of features seems to suggest that judgments of beauty should be assimilated to judgments of the agreeable. On the other hand, however, judgments of beauty are unlike judgments of the agreeable in not involving desire for the object; more importantly and centrally, they make a normative claim to everyone’s agreement. These features seem to suggest that they should be assimilated, instead, to objective cognitive judgments.

In claiming that judgments of beauty have both sets of features, Kant can be seen as reacting equally against the two main opposing traditions in eighteenth-century aesthetics: the “empiricist” tradition of aesthetics represented by Hume, Hutcheson and Burke, on which a judgment of taste is an expression of feeling without cognitive content, and the “rationalist” tradition of aesthetics represented by Baumgarten and Meier, on which a judgment of taste consists in the cognition of an object as having an objective property. Kant’s insistence that there is an alternative to these two views, one on which judgments of beauty are both based on feeling and make a claim to universal validity, is probably the most distinctive aspect of his aesthetic theory. But this insistence confronts him with the obvious problem of how the two features, or sets of features, are to be reconciled. As Kant puts it:

how is a judgment possible which, merely from one’s own feeling of pleasure in an object, independent of its concept, judges this pleasure as attached to the representation of the same object in every other subject, and does so a priori, i.e., without having to wait for the assent of others?(§36, 288)

The argument constituting Kant’s official answer to this question (the “Deduction of Taste”) is presented in the section entitled “Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments”, in particular in sections §§31–39, with the core of the argument given at §38. It is also prefigured in the “Analytic of the Beautiful”, in particular at §9 and §22, although the argument of §22, which appeals to the notion of a “common sense”, takes a somewhat different form from the presentation in the “Deduction of Taste” proper.

The argument in all of its appearances relies on the claim, introduced in §9, that pleasure in the beautiful depends on the “free play” or “free harmony” of the faculties of imagination and understanding. In the Critique of Pure Reason, imagination is described as “synthesizing the manifold of intuition” under the governance of rules that are prescribed by the understanding: the outcome of this is cognitive perceptual experience of objects as having specific empirical features. The rules prescribed by the understanding, are, or correspond to, particular concepts that are applied to the object. For example, when a manifold is synthesized in accordance with the concepts green and square, the outcome is a perceptual experience in which the object is perceived as green and square. But now in the Critique of Judgment, Kant suggests that imagination and understanding can stand in a different kind of relationship, one in which imagination’s activity harmonizes with the understanding but without imagination’s being constrained or governed by understanding. In this relationship, imagination and understanding in effect do what is ordinarily involved in the bringing of objects under concepts, and hence in the perception of objects as having empirical features: but they do this without bringing the object under any concept in particular. So, rather than perceiving the object as green or square, the subject whose faculties are in free play responds to it perceptually with a state of mind which is non-conceptual, and specifically a feeling of disinterested pleasure. It is this kind of pleasure which is the basis for a judgment of taste.

Kant appeals to this account of pleasure in the beautiful in order to argue for its universal validity or universal communicability: to argue, that is, that a subject who feels such a pleasure, and thus judges the object to be beautiful, is entitled to demand that everyone else feel a corresponding pleasure and thus agree with her judgment of taste. For, he claims, the free play of the faculties manifests the subjective condition of cognition in general (see for example §9, 218; §21, 238; §38, 290). We are entitled to claim that everyone ought to agree with our cognitions: for example, if I perceptually cognize an object as being green and square, I am entitled to claim that everyone else ought to cognize it as green and square. But in order for this demand for agreement to be possible, he suggests, it must also be possible for me to demand universal agreement for the subjective condition of such cognitions. If I can take it that everyone ought to share my cognition of an object as green or square, then I must also be entitled to take it that everyone ought to share a perception of the object in which my faculties are in free play, since the free play is no more than a manifestation of what is in general required for an object’s being cognized as green or square in the first place.

The most serious objection to the argument can be put in the form of a dilemma; see for example Guyer (1979 [1997: 264]), Meerbote (1982: 81ff.), Allison (2001: 184–192), Rind (2002). Either the free play of the faculties is involved in all cognitive perceptual experience, or it is not. If it is, then it would seem, counterintuitively, that every object should be perceived as beautiful. (Because of this consequence of grasping the first horn, the dilemma is sometimes characterized instead as Kant’s “everything is beautiful” problem.) But if it is not, then the central inference does not seem to go through. From the fact that I can demand agreement for the state of my faculties in experiencing an object as, say, green or square, it does not follow that I can demand agreement for a state in which my faculties are in free play, since the possibility of experiencing the free play would seem to require something over and above what is required for cognition alone.

Most defenders of the argument have grasped the second horn of the dilemma. One such defence, originally proposed by Ameriks in his 1982 (subsequently incorporated into Ameriks 2003), relies on an understanding of judgments of taste as objective, and hence as making a claim to universal agreement which is akin to that made by cognitive judgments. (For more on the objectivity of taste, see Section 2.3.5). Another, offered by Allison, rejects the objection as presupposing an overly strong interpretation of what the Deduction is intended to accomplish. The objection tells against the Deduction only if it is construed as entitling us to claim universal agreement for particular judgments of taste; but, as Allison reads it, the Deduction is intended only to establish that such claims can, in general, be legitimate (Allison 2001: ch. 8; see especially 177–179). A similar position is taken by Kalar (2006: 134). However, some commentators have taken this kind of defence to be inadequate, holding that the argument must establish not only a general entitlement to demand agreement for judgments of beauty, but an entitlement in each particular case (Savile 1987, Chignell 2007).

Another, less commonly accepted, option for defending the argument would be to grasp the first horn, accepting that, on Kant’s account, every object can legitimately be judged to be beautiful. Gracyk (1986) argues, independently of the argument of the Deduction, that this is Kant’s view, and it might also be noted that, if judgments of beauty are not objective, there can be no feature of an object which rules it out as a candidate for being legitimately found beautiful. Commentators who emphasize this point include Ginsborg (2017) and Breitenbach (2021).

A number of commentators have taken the dilemma, or considerations related to it, to be fatal to Kant’s view that judgments of beauty make a legitimate claim to universal validity: see for example Meerbote 1982, cited above, and Guyer (1979: 284–288; although Guyer offers a more positive assessment, see his 2003b: 60n15). Others have argued that Kant’s view can be saved by drawing on considerations not mentioned in the official argument of the Deduction. As noted below (Section 2.8), Kant draws a close connection between our capacity for aesthetic judgment and our nature as moral beings, and even though Kant himself does not appeal to this connection in the deduction of taste, some commentators, including Elliott (1968), Crawford (1974), Kemal (1986) and Savile (1987), have taken moral considerations to constitute the ultimate ground of the legitimacy of judgments of beauty. Another strategy drawing on considerations outside the Deduction itself has been to appeal to Kant’s theory of aesthetic ideas (see Section 2.6), which is ostensibly part of his theory of art, rather than his core theory of taste. This strategy is adopted in Savile 1987 and Chignell 2007; Chignell’s view differs from Savile’s in that it does not make any appeal to moral considerations. Finally, some commentators have held that while the argument of the official Deduction at §38 is unsuccessful in avoiding the dilemma, the version of the argument offered at §21, which appeals to the notion of a “common sense”, is more effective; see in particular Rind (2002) and Kalar (2006: ch. 5).

The assessment of the objection, and of Kant’s Deduction of Taste more generally, is complicated by a number of more fundamental interpretive issues, which are discussed in the next section.

2.3 Judgments of Beauty: Interpretive Issues

This section describes eight issues which have arisen in connection with Kant’s account of pure judgments of taste, and which are relevant to the assessment of his argument for the possibility of such judgments. Although these issues are central to understanding the core of Kant’s view, readers seeking a more general survey of Kant’s aesthetics can omit this section.

2.3.1 Pleasure and judgment

What is the relation between the pleasure which is felt in an object experienced as beautiful, and the judgment that the object is beautiful, that is, the judgment of taste? Kant describes the judgment of taste as “based on” a feeling of pleasure, and as claiming that everyone ought to share the subject’s feeling of pleasure, or, as he puts it, as claiming the “universal communicability” of the pleasure. This seems to imply that the pleasure is distinct from the act of judging, and more specifically that the pleasure precedes the judging: we first feel pleasure, and then claim, perhaps based on characteristics of the pleasure (such as its disinterestedness), that the pleasure is universally communicable and hence that the object is beautiful. But in the crucial section §9 of the Critique of Judgment, Kant appears to reject that implication: rather than the pleasure preceding the judging, he says, the “merely subjective (aesthetic) judging of the object” both “precedes” and “is the ground of” the pleasure (218). Since §9 is specifically addressed to the issue “whether in a judgment of taste the feeling of pleasure precedes the judging of the object or the judging precedes the pleasure”, a problem whose answer is “the key to the critique of taste and hence deserves full attention” (216), commentators have taken very seriously the task of reconciling §9 with Kant’s other characterizations of the judgment of taste.

There has been much discussion, beginning in the 1970s, of this basic issue. Donald Crawford addressed the apparent paradox by distinguishing the “judging” of the object which, according to §9, precedes the pleasure in it, from the judgment of taste proper, which is based on the pleasure (1974: 69–74). A very influential approach along these lines was developed in detail by Guyer (1979), who draws on passages elsewhere in the text to defend the view that a judgment of taste results from two distinct acts of reflective judgment, the first identifiable with the free play of the faculties and resulting in a feeling of pleasure, the second an act of reflection on the pleasure which results in the claim that the pleasure is universally communicable. (See especially 97–105 and 133–141.) A difficulty with that approach, however, recognized by Guyer, is that it conflicts with another passage at §9, in which Kant describes the pleasure as consequent on the universal communicability of the subject’s mental state in the given representation (§9, 5:217). This implies that the act of judging which precedes the pleasure must be one in which the subject takes her state of mind to be universally communicable, requiring us to identify it with the judgment of taste proper rather than with an activity of the faculties prior to that judgment.

An alternative approach to §9, which attempts to accommodate the problematic passage without emendation, was offered in Ginsborg 1991. On this “one-act” approach the act of judging something to be beautiful is a single, self-referential act of judging which claims its own universal validity with respect to the object and which is phenomenologically manifested as a feeling of pleasure. The free play of the faculties on this approach is identical with the judging of the object to be beautiful and in turn with the feeling of pleasure: the pleasure does not precede the judging of the object to be beautiful, and is “consequent” on it only in the sense that we feel pleasure “in virtue” of the judgment. In its identification of the pleasure and the judgment the view is like that of Aquila (1982, see especially 107) and, more recently, Wicks (2007: 43–45), although neither Aquila nor Wicks explicitly endorses the apparent consequence, that the pleasure or judgment must involve a claim to its own universal communicability.

Since then several commentators have read the relevant paragraphs of §9 as requiring some kind of “two-acts” view and, at the very least, as distinguishing the free play of the faculties and pleasure in the beautiful from the judgment of taste proper. This requires addressing the textual difficulty just mentioned. Guyer himself proposes disregarding the problematic passage at 5:217, since he takes it to indicate the intrusion of an earlier, incompatible theory (1979 [1997: 139–140]; for a detailed discussion, see Guyer 1982); Allison suggests instead that the passage be amended so that the pleasure is understood as consequent on a “universally communicable” mental state, rather than on the state’s universal communicability (2001: 115).

Objections to the one-act approach have been raised by a number of commentators, in particular Allison, who partly endorses Ginsborg’s criticisms of Guyer, but raises difficulties for her reading of §9 (2001: 113–115) and, in particular, rejects the self-referential understanding of judgments of beauty as “inherently implausible” (2001: 115). Allison objects also that the one-act view fails to accommodate judgments of the ugly; for more on Kant’s views on the ugly, see Section 2.3.6. Criticisms of Ginsborg’s one-act approach are also to be found in Pippin (1996), Ameriks (1998), Palmer (2008), Vandenabeele (2008), Sweet (2009), Guyer (2017a), Makkai (2010 and 2021), and Berger (forthcoming); Ginsborg replies to Guyer’s criticism in her 2017.

Commentators have suggested a number of models for the feeling of pleasure and its relation to the judgment of beauty that combine features of both the one-act and the two-act view. Béatrice Longuenesse offers a view which is in partial agreement with Ginsborg’s in that it understands pleasure in the beautiful proper as felt in virtue of the subject’s awareness of the universal communicability of her mental state in the presented object (thus, like the one-act approach, requiring no emendation of §9). However, rather than understand the pleasure as awareness of its own universal communicability, Longuenesse takes it to be awareness of a prior, and independent, feeling of pleasure elicited by the free play of the faculties, so that there are two distinct feelings of pleasure involved in judging an object to be beautiful (2003: 152–155; 2006: 203–208). Sethi (2019 and forthcoming) likewise proposes that there are two distinct feelings, but denies that they are both feelings of pleasure: as on Ginsborg’s view, the pleasure is felt in virtue of the subject’s claim to the universal communicability of her feeling, but the feeling for which she claims universal communicability is not a feeling of pleasure but an antecedent, sui generis, feeling of the harmony of the faculties. Hughes (2017) argues for a single feeling associated with the judgment of beauty, but one which has a dual intentional directedness: towards the object and to the activity of the faculties in judging the object. Some commentators have endorsed a one-act approach while, unlike Ginsborg, rejecting the identification of the pleasure and the judgment: these include, for example Zuckert (2007a: §§1–2 of ch. 8) and Pollok (2017: ch. 9). Berger (forthcoming) defends a two-acts view, but her view differs from Guyer’s in that the second act is not one of reflection on the pleasure but rather of subsumption of the pleasure under the concept of beauty.

2.3.2 The free play of imagination and understanding

Kant’s notion of the free play of the faculties (sometimes referred to as the “harmony of the faculties”, or, more accurately the “free harmony” of the faculties) is probably the most central notion of his aesthetic theory. But what is it for the faculties of imagination and understanding to be in “free play”? Kant describes the imagination and understanding in this “free play” as freely harmonizing, without the imagination’s being constrained by the understanding as it is in cognition. Imagination in the free play, he says, conforms to the general conditions for the application of concepts to objects that are presented to our senses, yet without any particular concept being applied, so that imagination conforms to the conditions of understanding without the constraint of particular concepts. Given Kant’s view that concepts are, or at least correspond to, rules by which imagination “synthesizes” or organizes the data of sense-perception, this amounts to saying that imagination functions in a rule-governed way but without being governed by any rule in particular. The free play thus manifests, in Kant’s terms, “free lawfulness” or “lawfulness without a law”. But there is an apparent paradox in these characterizations which is left unaddressed by Kant’s own, largely metaphorical, explanations. It is left to commentators to try to explain how such an activity is intelligible and why, if it is indeed intelligible, it should give rise to, or be experienced as, a feeling of pleasure.

Some commentators try to make sense of the free play by appealing to the phenomenology of aesthetic experience, for example to the kind of experience involved in appreciating an abstract painting, where the subject might imaginatively relate the various elements of the painting to one another and perceive them as having an order and unity which is non-conceptual; see for example Bell (1987: 237) and Crowther (1989: 56). (Filieri 2021 illustrates the free play through the example of an artwork which is representational rather than abstract.) Others try to find a place for it in the context of Kant’s theory of the imagination as presented in the Critique of Pure Reason. Two contrasting accounts along these lines are offered by Guyer, who identifies the free play with the first two stages of the “three-fold synthesis” described by Kant in the first edition Transcendental Deduction (Guyer 1979 [1997: 75–76]), and of Makkreel (1990: 49–58), for whom the free play is an activity of schematizing pure concepts without the involvement of empirical concepts.

Ginsborg (1997a) offers an alternative view of the free play derived from her “one-act” reading of the judgment of taste (see Section 2.3.1), on which what it is for the imagination and understanding to be in free play just is for the subject to be in a perceptual state of mind which involves a nonconceptual claim to its own universal validity with respect to the object perceived. Zinkin (2006) explains the free play in terms of the common sense (sensus communis) invoked by Kant at §20, which she understands as an intensive form of sensibility, in contrast to the extensive forms of sensibility represented by space and time. (For more on the common sense, see Section 2.3.7.) Gorodeisky (2011) criticizes “extra-aesthetic” approaches to the free play which attempt to relate the activity of the faculties in the free play too closely to their activity in cognition, failing to do justice to their distinctly aesthetic character; Ostaric 2017 makes a related complaint. Williams 2022 proposes that the free play is to be understood in terms of how attention is guided: in cognition, our attention is guided by cognitive interest, in aesthetics the subject is guided only by the interests of the imagination, so that the subject has the freedom to let her attention roam.

As with the deduction of taste (see Section 2.2), a number of commentators have looked to Kant’s doctrine of aesthetic ideas (officially part of his account of fine art) to make sense of the free play of the faculties; examples include Rueger and Evren (2005), Kalar (2006), and Chignell (2007). A particularly detailed and thorough treatment of this approach is offered in Rogerson (2008; for an earlier and briefer treatment, see Rogerson 2004).

The question of how to understand the free play is complicated by a more general interpretive issue concerning the status of Kant’s “transcendental psychology”: this issue affects not only the interpretation of the free play in the third Critique, but also the appeal to activities of imagination and understanding in Kant’s account of the conditions of cognition in the first Critique, in particular in the Metaphysical Deduction and the Transcendental Deduction. Many commentators assume, whether tacitly or explicitly, that the free play of imagination and understanding represents a natural psychological process, taking place in time and thus subject to natural causal laws. But it is hard to reconcile this understanding of the free play with Kant’s appeal to it to justify the legitimacy of judgments of beauty, and more generally his claim to be offering a transcendental account of judgments of beauty, one which shows such judgments to be founded on an a priori principle. Guyer’s approach to the free play, from his 1979 onwards, has been thoroughly naturalistic; in his 2008 he offers a very explicit defence of this approach, arguing that we should reject Kant’s claim to establish an a priori or transcendental principle justifying judgments of beauty, and instead regard Kant’s theory of aesthetics as a contribution to the empirical psychology of taste. While this kind of view is rarely explicitly endorsed, many commentators do in fact offer accounts of the free play which at least resemble empirical psychological accounts, raising the question of how Guyer’s conclusion is to be avoided.

The views touched on in this section represent only a sampling of the various accounts of the free play which have been offered. A useful survey is offered by Guyer (2006), who classifies various accounts under three heads: “precognitive”, according to which the play of the faculties is a preconceptual state, falling short of cognition (for example his own 1979 account),; “multicognitive”, in which the free play represents the playful application of a multiplicity of concepts, and thus a kind of cognitive excess (for example Allison 2001); and “metacognitive”, in which the manifold is represented as having a unity which goes beyond what is required for cognition; Guyer’s own view in his 2006, in contrast to that of his 1979, favours the latter approach. Guyer (2009) discusses a further variety of approaches; more recent discussions include Gorodeisky (2010, 2011), Matherne (2014), Küplen (2015), Ostaric (2017), and Filieri (2021).

2.3.3 The intentionality of the pleasure

Does the feeling of pleasure in a judgment of taste have intentional content? According to Guyer, the answer is no (see especially 1979 [1997: 88–97]). Although Kant sometimes describes the pleasure as awareness of the free play of the faculties, Guyer takes the relation between the free play and the feeling of pleasure to be merely causal. The pleasure is “opaque”, or lacks intentional content: while one can come to recognize that one’s feeling of pleasure is due to the free play, this is not because the pleasure makes one immediately aware of it, but rather because reflection on the causal history of one’s pleasure can lead one to conclude that it was not sensory or due to the satisfaction of a desire and hence (by elimination) must have been due to the free play.

While some commentators have shared Guyer’s view that the pleasure is “opaque”, and hence that having a feeling of pleasure does not enable us to know what kind of pleasure we are feeling (see, e.g., Matherne 2019: 9–10), others have argued for the intentionality of the pleasure, holding that the pleasure is intentionally directed towards the object, or towards its formal structure (Aquila 1982) or that it makes us aware of the free play (Allison 2001, in particular 53–54 and 122–123). Hughes (2017) argues that it is intentionally directed both to the object perceived as beautiful, and to the activity of the faculties in their free play. Zuckert (2002) argues that, for Kant, pleasure in general, and not just pleasure in the beautiful, is intentional, in that it makes us aware of our wanting to continue in our mental state (that of feeling of the pleasure); Zuckert develops the argument further in her 2007a, ch. 6. Cvejić (2021) agrees with Zuckert that pleasure is intentional, but argues that the intentionality is of a distinctive kind, characteristic only of feelings, and unlike the intentionality of cognitive representations. A. Cohen (2020) also argues that pleasure in the beautiful, and feelings more generally for Kant, are intentional, but she denies that the intentionality is intrinsic, taking it, rather, to be derived from our reflective interpretation of those feelings. Cohen’s view is discussed in Merritt 2021 and Eran 2021.

2.3.4 The character of the claim to agreement

What kind of claim to agreement is made by a judgment of taste? Kant seems to suggest that a judgment of taste demands agreement in the same way that an objective cognitive judgment demands agreement (see, e.g., Introduction VII, 191 and §6, 211): just as, in claiming that a perceived object is green or square, I take it that everyone else ought to share my judgment that the object is green or square, so, in judging an object to be beautiful, I claim that all other perceivers of the object should find it beautiful too. But even if this is granted, one might still raise questions about the character of the demand, either because there are in turn questions to be raised about what it is for a cognitive judgment to claim agreement, or because it is not clear that the claim can in fact be the same, given that in the aesthetic case one is claiming that others share one’s feeling, as opposed to demanding that they apply the same concept to the object. Guyer (1979) argues that the claim should be understood as a rational expectation or ideal prediction rather than as a normative demand: someone who judges an object to be beautiful is claiming that under ideal circumstances everyone will share her pleasure (1979 [1997: 123–130 and 144–147]). Savile (1987) and Chignell (2007) follow Guyer in understanding the claim in this way; Harbin (2020), while not endorsing the “ideal prediction” interpretation proposed by Guyer, agrees with him in rejecting the view that judgments of beauty make a genuinely normative claim on others’ agreement; Feloj (2020) holds a similar view. Harbin’s argument is challenged in Dunn 2020.

Guyer’s understanding of the claim to agreement made by a judgment of beauty has been criticized by a number of commentators, including Rogerson (1982), Ginsborg (1990a: ch. 2), Rind (2002), and Kalar (2006: ch. 1). A basic difficulty is that it apparently fails to do justice to the normative language used by Kant to describe the demand: for example that anyone who declares something to be beautiful holds that everyone ought to [sollen] give his approval to the object and likewise declare it beautiful (§19, 5: 237). (Chaouli 2017 surveys the various normative terms used by Kant in this connection and discusses their significance; see ch. 3, 51–53.) Rogerson proposes instead that a judgment of beauty makes a moral demand on others to appreciate the object’s beauty, so that the “ought” is to be understood as rational, and more specifically moral, rather than merely predictive. The other critics mentioned take the “ought”, and the corresponding claim to agreement to be non-moral, yet still genuinely normative as opposed to predictive; a view of this kind is assumed, with varying degrees of explicitness, by a number of other commentators, including Allison (2001, see especially 159 and 178–179; 2006, 132).

But this approach, which is perhaps closest to the letter of Kant’s text, raises a question: what kind of normativity is this, if not that associated with morality or, more generally, practical rationality? It is tempting to assimilate it to cognitive or epistemic normativity, where this in turn might be understood as the normativity involved in the putative principles that one ought to believe what is true, or, alternatively, what is justified in light of the evidence. However this appears to conflict with Kant’s commitment to the subjectivity and (relatedly) nonconceptuality of judgments of taste. To avoid the conflict, while preserving the link Kant seems to assert between the normativity of aesthetic judgment and that of cognitive judgment, we need an understanding of the normativity such that it is a necessary condition of cognition that we be able to make such normative demands for agreement, yet without the normativity’s simply being identified with the cognitive or epistemic normativity associated with truth and justification. Ginsborg (2006) identifies it with what she calls the “primitive” normativity required for empirical conceptualization: our grasp of empirical concepts depends on the possibility of making such primitively normative claims, but they do not in turn presuppose cognition, which leaves open the possibility that such a claim is implicit in aesthetic experience and judgment.

Granted, pace Guyer, that the claim is normative without being moral, further questions can be raised about its strength and character. Moran (2012) understands the demand as reflecting a sense of obligation or requirement, distinct from moral obligation, but stronger than that present in the case of empirical cognitive judgment. He reads Kant as drawn towards a view on which the beautiful object itself makes an unconditional demand on the viewer’s attention (of a kind made vivid in the narrator’s vow to the hawthorns in Proust’s In Search of Lost Time), although he also takes Kant’s denial of the objectivity of taste to debar him from endorsing such a view. A similar suggestion is made in Makkai (2010): she takes Kant to hint at the idea that the beautiful object is found to deserve, or call for, recognition as beautiful, where this implies a claim on the viewer which goes beyond any claim implicit in an objective judgment. Roughly, on the view suggested by Moran and Makkai, the claim implicit in a judgment of beauty is not merely the conditional claim that others, if they perceive the object, ought to judge it to be beautiful; it is the unconditional claim that others ought to perceive it and, in so doing, judge it to be beautiful. The idea that Kant takes us to be subject to a demand to attend to beautiful objects is also put forward in Kalar 2006, but Kalar understands that demand as one of two distinct normative demands made in the judgment of beauty: a non-moral demand to feel pleasure in the given object, and a further moral demand to attend to the object (2006: 2). Makkai (2021) develops further the view that the object has a claim on us (although she does not see it as a moral claim); Lopes (2021) seems also to assume such a claim.

2.3.5 Is beauty objective?

Should judgments of beauty be regarded as objective? Ameriks has argued (1982, 1983, 1998, 2000) that in spite of Kant’s claim that judgments of beauty are “subjectively grounded”, they are nonetheless objective in the same sense that judgments of colour and other secondary qualities are objective. Similar views are proposed in Savile 1981 and Kulenkampff 1990; see also the references offered by Ameriks at (2003: 307n.1). The claim is challenged by Ginsborg (1998), who defends the subjectivity of taste on the grounds that Kant does not allow that we can make judgments of beauty on the basis of hearsay, but must “subject the object to our own eyes” (§8, 5:215–216); a similar point is made in Hopkins 2001, and there is further discussion of aesthetic testimony in Gorodeisky 2009. Ameriks responds to Ginsborg’s challenge in his 1998; the objectivity of taste is defended further in Makkai 2010. Ginsborg offers further defence of the subjectivity of taste in her 2017; her approach is challenged in chapter 3 of Makkai 2021.

The question of whether Kant should be interpreted as committed to the objectivity of taste is closely related to the question of whether there can be erroneous judgments of taste; for some discussion see T. Cohen (1982: 222–226) and Allison (2001: 107–108). It is also related to the question of aesthetic normativity (see Section 2.3.4 above) and to that of the “autonomy of taste” (the supposed independence of our judgments of taste both from testimony and from the judgments of experts), which is discussed in Matherne 2019.

2.3.6 Negative judgments of beauty

Kant’s discussion of judgments of beauty focusses almost exclusively on the positive judgment that an object is beautiful, and relatedly, of the feeling of pleasure in a beautiful object. He has very little to say about the judgment that an object is not beautiful, or about the displeasure associated with judging an object to be ugly. (As noted in Section 2.7 below, he does take the appreciation of the sublime to involve a kind of displeasure, but this seems to be a different kind from the displeasure that might be involved in judging something to be ugly.) Does his treatment allow for negative judgments of beauty, either that an object is not beautiful or that it is ugly? Shier (1998) argues that it does not, but this has been challenged by Allison (2001), who takes it to be a criterion for a satisfactory interpretation of Kant’s theory of taste that it allow for negative judgments of beauty (2001: 72; see also 184–186). Others who have emphasized the need to consider the role of the ugly in Kant’s account of aesthetics include Hudson (1991), Wenzel (1999) and Küplen (2015).

It is useful, in considering this topic, to distinguish the question of how we can judge that something is not beautiful, from that of how we can judge it to be ugly. The former question can be seen an aspect of a more general problem about how we can make judgments in which ascriptions of beauty figure in embedded contexts, for example as the antecedents of conditionals; this is akin to what is often referred to as the Frege-Geach problem for expressivist accounts of normative discourse. The second question is more specific and can be framed in terms of aesthetic experience: can Kant allow for an experience of displeasure in the ugly, and if he can, is it symmetrical with pleasure in the beautiful?

Some commentators, for example Brandt (1994), Ginsborg (2003: 175–177), and Guyer (2005b: ch. 6), have denied that there is such a thing, for Kant, as pure displeasure in the ugly, or, correlatively a pure judgment of ugliness. Guyer argues that while there is displeasure in the ugly it always involves an interest; Ginsborg allows also for disinterested judgments of ugliness, but denies that these involve a characteristic feeling of displeasure; rather, we judge that something is ugly if it lacks beauty in a context where beauty is expected. More generally, on her view, aside from cases where the judgment is based on perception of an object as harmful or disgusting, judgments of the ugly depend on recognition of the context in which the object is presented; Gracyk defends a similar point, using it to argue that “ugly” objects are those which resist unification and are thus less pleasurable to perceive than other objects (1986: 55). Guyer’s view is criticized in McConnell 2008, which offers a useful survey of previous discussions of the issue, and (partly drawing on Gracyk 1986) provides a defence of pure judgments of ugliness which appeals to Kant’s theory of aesthetic ideas. A. Cohen (2013) suggests that there can be both impure and pure judgments of ugliness, arguing for the possibility of a “foul play” of the faculties in which the play of imagination and understanding is hindered rather than facilitated and stand in reciprocal disharmony.

2.3.7 What is the “common sense”?

In the Fourth Moment of the Analytic of the Beautiful, at §20, Kant claims that judgments of taste rely on a “subjective principle” which “determines only by feeling rather than concepts”, and that such a principle must be regarded as a “common sense” (sensus communis) (§20, 238). He goes on at §21, in an argument often regarded as anticipating the Deduction of Taste at §38, to argue that we must assume a “common sense” as a condition of the universal communicability of cognition. But in order to make sense of the argument, we must be able to understand Kant’s notion of a “common sense”, and this proves to be challenging. In particular, if the common sense introduced at §20 is a principle for judging by feeling, then—assuming, with most commentators, that what Kant means by “feeling” is the feeling of pleasure—it seems implausible to suppose that it is a condition for claiming the universal communicability or universal validity of our cognitive judgments. For it seems that we do not need to feel pleasure in order to determine, in the case of a cognitive judgment, whether it is one that everyone else should share. This raises the question whether the notion of “common sense”—to which Kant also returns in §40—is in fact univocal, or whether, as proposed by Allison (2001: 153–154), there are two different species of common sense: one required for the universal communicability of judgments of beauty, and one required for the universal communicability of cognition.

A second question associated with the notion of a common sense, raised by Guyer (1979 [1997: 249–250]) and discussed recently in Matherne 2019, is that of its ontological status, given that Kant refers to it variously as as a “feeling”, a “principle” and a “faculty”.

A third question, discussed in detail by Guyer (1979 [1997: 264–273]) and Matherne (2019) is raised by Kant himself in §22: whether the common sense, understood as a principle or standard, is regulative or constitutive. This question, which Kant leaves unanswered, is especially puzzling because it appears from §21 that Kant already takes himself to have established that the common sense is a condition of the universal communicability of cognition.

Following Guyer’s own assessment of the common sense as an “unnecessary detour” (1979 [1997: 274]) in the overall argument of the Deduction, many commentators have disregarded the common sense in their discussions of Kant’s theory of taste. Recently, however, there has been much more attention to the notion of the common sense. Matherne (2019), who follows Allison in distinguishing an aesthetic from a cognitive common sense, takes aesthetic common sense as something that we acquire (thus as regulative rather than constitutive), and invokes it to help make sense of Kant’s view that taste is autonomous. Makkai (2021: ch. 4) examines and rejects Allison’s distinction between an aesthetic and cognitive common sense, arguing that §21 points to a parallel between cognition and taste in that both require a feeling of “what…calls for judging” or “what matters” (159). Sethi (forthcoming) also rejects the distinction, pointing out that the need for it is premised on the assumption that the “feeling” invoked at §20 must be a feeling of pleasure, and arguing (drawing in part on Sethi 2019) that the feeling of the free play of the faculties is not a feeling of pleasure (see Section 2.3.1). She takes the common sense to be necessary for empirical concept-acquisition, so that the notion of common sense plays a crucial role in accounting for the relation between taste and cognition.

2.3.8 Universal validity and universal communicability

Kant describes judgments of beauty both as “universally valid” and as “universally communicable”. Many commentators have treated these expressions as more or less equivalent, and Guyer (1979 [1997: 251–252]) points out several passages where Kant seems to use them interchangeably. (For the most part, this article follows this way of understanding the expressions.)

However, several commentators have argued recently that it is important to distinguish these two notions. The universal communicability of a judgment of beauty is not just a matter of its claiming universal validity, but has to do with the possibility of literally communicating our feeling in the object; for example bringing it about that another person can share it. Commentators who have emphasized this distinction include Makkai (2021: ch. 2), Vaccarino Bremner (forthcoming), and Sethi (forthcoming).

2.4 Judgments of Beauty: Some Criticisms

As noted at the end of Section 2.2, Kant’s account of judgments of beauty has been criticized on the grounds that the argument for their universal validity, that is the Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments, is unsuccessful. Criticisms have also been raised against various aspects of Kant’s characterization of judgments of beauty in the Analytic of the Beautiful. Objections have been raised in particular to Kant’s view that judgments of beauty are disinterested, and to his supposed commitment to aesthetic formalism (the view that all that matters for aesthetic appreciation is the abstract formal pattern manifested by the object, that is, the way in which its elements are interrelated in space and/or time). For discussion of the questions of disinterestedness and formalism, see Guyer (1979 [1997: chs. 5 and 6]), and Allison (2001: chs. 4 and 5); Zuckert offers a sympathetic reading of Kant’s formalism (2007a: 182–189). Kant’s formalism was particularly influential, via the influence of Hanslick, in musical theory; for discussion see Kivy (2009: ch. 2). Discussions of this topic often note that although the Analytic of the Beautiful puts forward a formalist view, Kant’s treatment of aesthetic ideas (discussed in Section 2.6) is more congenial to an expressivist view of art.

Typically objections to Kant’s view of pleasure as disinterested appeal to the apparently obvious fact that we do in fact take an interest in the preservation of beautiful objects (see for example Crawford 1974: 53). A different kind of objection, based on an appeal to the cognitive role of aesthetic judging, is made in Pillow 2006.

Kant has also been criticized for a view that is taken to be a consequence of the thesis that judgments of beauty are disinterested, namely the view that aesthetic experience requires a special attitude of “psychical distance” or “detachment” from the object appreciated: this criticism is generally taken to be implicit in Dickie’s well-known (1964) discussion of the “myth of the aesthetic attitude”. Zangwill (1992) argues that this criticism is misplaced.

Kant’s view that the pleasure in a beautiful object is non-conceptual has been taken to commit him to the supposedly objectionable view that the capacity to make conceptual distinctions can play no role in the appreciation of beauty. This criticism, made by Wollheim (1980) (invoking the idea that aesthetic appreciation demands an “empty cognitive stock”) is addressed in Janaway 1997. Relatedly, it has been objected that Kant does not allow room for reason-giving, and more generally, criticism in aesthetics; that objection is addressed in Crawford 1970 and (on lines suggested by Crawford) in Wilson 2007. Further defence and explication of a Kantian approach to art criticism is offered in Tuna 2016.

Baz (2005) criticizes Kant for his apparent view that the value of beauty lies in its relation to cognition, rather than the beautiful object’s mattering for its own sake; Hughes (2006) offers a response.

2.5 Free and Adherent Beauty

This article so far has been concerned primarily with pure judgments of beauty. But Kant also allows for judgments of beauty which are not pure. Judgments of beauty can fail to be pure in two ways.

  1. They can be influenced by the object’s sensory or emotional appeal, that is, they can involve “charm” [Reiz] or emotion [Rührung] (§13).
  2. They can be contingent on a certain concept’s applying to the object, so that the object is judged, not as beautiful tout court, but as beautiful qua belonging to this or that kind.

The second kind of impurity is discussed in §16 in connection with a distinction between “free” [frei] beauty and “adherent” or “dependent” [anhängend] beauty.

One reason to think that the distinction is important is that Kant seems to suggest that all judgments of beauty about representational art are judgments of adherent rather than of free beauty, and hence that they are all impure. (This is questioned by Tuna (2018), who holds that works of art which result from genius can be regarded as instances of free rather than adherent beauty.) While some art works can be “free beauties”, the examples Kant gives are all of non-representational art: “designs a la grecque, foliage for borders or on wallpaper…fantasias in music”, and indeed, Kant adds, all music without a text (§16, 229). It might be supposed from this that Kant’s core account of judgments of beauty is only peripherally applicable to art, which would make it largely irrelevant to the concerns of contemporary aesthetics. However, this consequence is debatable. For example, Allison argues that judgments of adherent beauty contain, as a component, a pure judgment of beauty. The purity of this core judgment is not undermined by its figuring in a more complex evaluation which takes into account the object’s falling under a concept (2001: 140–141).

Kant’s suggestion that representational art has “adherent” rather than “free” beauty, and that judgments about such art fail to be pure, might also invite the objection that Kant takes nonrepresentational art to be superior to representational art, so that, say, wallpaper designs are aesthetically more valuable than the ceiling of the Sistine Chapel. This objection is challenged by Schaper (1979: ch. 4, reprinted in Guyer 2003a) and by Guyer (2005b: chs. 4 and 5). Tuna (2018) adopts a different approach to the underlying problem by arguing that works of art, if they are works of genius, should not be viewed as cases of adherent beauty in the first place.

Further discussions of the distinction between free and adherent beauty include Scarre (1981), Lorand (1989), Gammon (1999), Guyer (2002a), Kalar (2006: 82–89), Zuckert (2007a: 202–212), and Rueger (2008). Clewis (2018) provides useful historical context for the distinction.

2.6 Art, Genius and Aesthetic Ideas

While Kant attaches special importance to the beauty of nature (see, e.g., FI XI, 20:244), he also makes clear that judgments of beauty may be made also about “fine” or “beautiful” art [schöne Kunst]. In the course of his treatment of beautiful art in §§43–54 he discusses fine art in relation to the production of human artifacts more generally (§43), compares fine art to the “arts” of entertaining (telling jokes, decorating a table, providing background music) (§44), and makes some remarks about the relation between the beauty of art and that of nature, claiming in particular that fine art must “look to us like nature” in that it must seem free and unstudied (§45). Kant also offers a typology of the various fine arts (§51) and a comparison of their respective aesthetic value (§53), with poetry at the top and music—at least as far as the “cultivation of the mind” is concerned—at the bottom. Kant’s remarks about music in §§51–54 suggest that music might not even qualify as beautiful, as opposed to merely agreeable, art. This is seemingly in tension with Kant’s reference to music without words as an example of “free beauty” (§16, 5:229).

Of particular interest, within Kant’s account of fine art, is his discussion of how beautiful art objects can be produced (§§46–50). The artist cannot produce a beautiful work by learning, and then applying, rules which determine when something is beautiful; for no such rules can be specified (see the sketch of the Second Moment in Section 2.1 above). But, Kant makes clear, the artist’s activity must still be rule-governed, since “every art presupposes rules” (§46, 307) and the objects of art must serve as models or examples, that is, they must serve as a “standard or rule by which to judge” (§46, 308). Kant’s solution to this apparent paradox is to postulate a capacity, which he calls “genius”, by which “nature gives the rule to art” (§46, 307). An artist endowed with genius has a natural capacity to produce objects which are appropriately judged as beautiful, and this capacity does not require the artist him- or herself to consciously follow rules for the production of such objects; in fact the artist himself does not know, and so cannot explain, how he or she was able to bring them into being. “Genius” here means something different from brilliance of intellect. For example, Newton, for all his intellectual power, does not qualify as having genius, because he was capable of making clear, both to himself and others, the procedures through which he arrived at his scientific discoveries (§47, 308–309).

A further point of interest in Kant’s discussion of art is his claim that beauty is the “exhibition” [Darstellung, also translated “presentation”] (§49, 314) or “expression” (§51, 319) of aesthetic ideas. Kant describes an aesthetic idea as

a representation of the imagination that occasions much thinking, though without it being possible for any determinate thought, i.e., concept, to be adequate to it. (§49, 314)

Such ideas, he says, are a “counterpart” to rational ideas, that is, representations which cannot be exemplified in experience or by means of imagination (ibid.). While part of Kant’s point here is to contrast aesthetic and rational ideas, it is clear that he sees the role of aesthetic ideas as mediating between rational ideas on the one hand, and sensibility and imagination on the other. A work of art expresses or exhibits an aesthetic idea in so far as it succeeds in giving sensible form to a rational idea. Thus aesthetic ideas “seek to approximate to an exhibition” of rational ideas. For example, the poet

ventures to make sensible rational ideas of invisible beings, the realm of the blessed, the realm of hell, eternity, creation etc., as well as to make that of which there are examples in experience, e.g., death, envy, and all sorts of vices, as well as love, fame, etc., sensible beyond the limits of experience, with a completeness which goes beyond anything of which there is an example in nature. (ibid.)

One question raised in connection with Kant’s account of fine art concerns the relative importance, for Kant, of artistic and natural beauty. Guyer (1987) takes Kant to be committed to the primacy of natural beauty, and argues that that commitment is defensible; Kemal (1986) offers grounds for holding that, in spite of appearances, it is artistic beauty which is primary for Kant. (The reprint of Guyer 1987 as ch. 7 of Guyer 1993 includes a postscript challenging Kemal’s arguments.) Other commentators who have argued for the primacy of artistic over natural beauty include Rueger (2007) and Ostaric (2010). Friedlander (2015: ch. 3) maintains that neither has primacy over the other. Another question is whether Kant has a single account of beauty which is intended to apply to both natural objects and works of art; Reiter and Geiger (2018) and Halper (2020) argue, although on different grounds, that Kant has two different accounts for nature and art respectively.

Commentators have also discussed Kant’s ranking of the fine arts, and particularly of the low ranking he accords to music; on the latter topic, see for example Weatherston (1996), Parret (1998b), Kivy (2009: ch. 2), Tuna (2018), and Küplen (2021). Kant’s views on music have sometimes been criticized as incoherent; Matherne (2014) offers a explicit defence.

Kant’s theory of aesthetic ideas has been regarded by many commentators as peripheral to his aesthetic theory, but a number of commentators have argued that it is necessary in order to make sense of the core of Kant’s view of pure judgments of taste; see for example Savile (1987), Rogerson (2004 and 2008), Rueger and Evren (2005), Kalar (2006), and Chignell (2007). More recently, the topic of aesthetic ideas has received considerable attention in its own right. One issue concerns the role of aesthetic ideas in the beauty of nature, as opposed to that of art. While aesthetic ideas are discussed only in the sections of the Critique of Judgment which deal with artistic beauty, and not in the “Analytic of the Beautiful”, which deals with beauty more generally, Kant remarks parenthetically that natural as well as artistic beauty is the expression of aesthetic ideas (§51, 321). How are we to conceive of the aesthetic ideas expressed by nature? Reiter (2018) and Reiter and Geiger (2018) propose an interpretation in terms of the notion of an “aesthetic normal idea” introduced by Kant in the Third Moment, at §17, 233, which they relate to a notion of “ideal form” that was current in art theory at Kant’s time.

A related issue concerns the scope of aesthetic ideas. Matherne (2013) challenges interpretations on which aesthetic ideas can present or express only moral or rational concepts, arguing that they can also present empirical concepts and human emotions. Reiter and Geiger (2018) also propose expanding the scope of what can be presented in an aesthetic idea, arguing that, insofar as aesthetic ideas present the rational idea of humanity in our person, they show the “range and variety of human freedom”. Vaccarino Bremner (2021) suggests a different way of broadening the scope of aesthetic ideas, arguing that they do not just present or express concepts, but call for us to revise them.

Traditionally, Kant’s aesthetics has been seen as most readily applicable to art of his time and (because of his apparent formalism) to abstract art of the modernist period. Costello (2013) argues for the applicability of Kant’s theory of aesthetics to conceptual art. For further recent discussions of the applicability of Kant’s aesthetics to contemporary art, including conceptual and post-conceptual art, see the essays collected in Cazeaux 2021.

2.7 The Sublime

Kant distinguishes two notions of the sublime: the mathematically sublime and the dynamically sublime. In the case of both notions, the experience of the sublime consists in a feeling of the superiority of our own power of reason, as a supersensible faculty, over nature (§28, 261).

In the case of the mathematically sublime, the feeling of reason’s superiority over nature takes the form, more specifically, of a feeling of reason’s superiority to imagination, conceived of as the natural capacity required for sensory apprehension, including the apprehension of the magnitudes of empirically given things. We have this feeling when we are confronted with something that is so large that it overwhelms imagination’s capacity to comprehend it. In such a situation imagination strives to comprehend the object in accordance with a demand of reason, but fails to do so.

Just because there is in our imagination a striving to advance to the infinite, while in our reason there lies a claim to absolute totality, as to a real idea, the very inadequacy of our faculty for estimating the magnitude of the things in the sensible world [viz., imagination] awakens the feeling of a supersensible faculty in us. (§25, 250)

The fact that we are capable, through reason, of thinking infinity as a whole, “indicates a faculty of the mind which surpasses every standard of sense” (§26, 254). While Kant’s discussion of the mathematically sublime mentions the Pyramids in Egypt and St. Peter’s Basilica in Rome (§26, 252), it is not clear that these are intended as examples of the sublime; and Kant claims explicitly that the most appropriate examples are of things in nature. More specifically, they must be natural things the concept of which does not involve the idea of a purpose (§26, 252–253): this rules out animals, the concept of which is connected with the idea of biological function, but it apparently includes mountains and the sea (§26, 256).

In the case of the dynamically sublime, the feeling of reason’s superiority to nature is more direct than in the mathematical case. Kant says that we consider nature as “dynamically sublime” when we consider it as “a power that has no dominion over us” (§28, 260). We have the feeling of the dynamically sublime when we experience nature as fearful while knowing ourselves to be in a position of safety and hence without in fact being afraid. In this situation

the irresistibility of [nature’s] power certainly makes us, considered as natural beings, recognize our physical powerlessness, but at the same time it reveals a capacity for judging ourselves as independent of nature and a superiority over nature…whereby the humanity in our person remains undemeaned even though the human being must submit to that dominion. (§28, 261–262)

Kant’s examples include overhanging cliffs, thunder clouds, volcanoes and hurricanes (§28, 261).

The feeling associated with the sublime is a feeling of pleasure in the superiority of our reason over nature, but it also involves displeasure. In the case of the mathematically sublime, the displeasure comes from the awareness of the inadequacy of our imagination; in the dynamical case it comes from the awareness of our physical powerlessness in the face of nature’s might. Kant is not consistent in his descriptions of how the pleasure and the displeasure are related, but one characterization describes them as alternating: the “movement of the mind” in the representation of the sublime

may be compared to a vibration, i.e., to a rapidly alternating repulsion from and attraction to one and the same object. (§27, 258)

Kant also describes the feeling of the sublime as a “pleasure which is possible only by means of a displeasure” (§27, 260) and as a “negative liking” (General Remark following §29, 269). He also appears to identify it with the feeling of respect, which in his practical philosophy is associated with recognition of the moral law (§27, 257).

Judgments of the sublime are like judgments of beauty in being based on feeling, more specifically on pleasure or liking. They are also like judgments of beauty in claiming the universal validity of the pleasure, where that claim is understood as involving necessity (everyone who perceives the object ought to share the feeling) (§29, 266). But as we have seen, the pleasure is different in that it involves a negative element. The following differences should also be noted:

  1. (particularly emphasized by Kant) In making a judgment of the sublime, we regard the object as “contrapurposive”, rather than purposive, for the faculties of imagination and judgment (§23, 245). While judgments of the sublime do involve the representation of purposiveness, the purposiveness differs from that involved in a judgment of beauty in two ways.
    1. It is not the object, but the aesthetic judgment itself which is represented as purposive.
    2. The aesthetic judgment is represented as purposive not for imagination or judgment, but for reason (§27, 260) or for the “whole vocation of the mind” (§27, 259).
  2. The claim to universal validity made by a judgment of the sublime rests, not on the universal validity of the conditions of cognition, but rather on the universal validity of moral feeling (§29, 255–256).
  3. While we can correctly call objects beautiful, we cannot properly call them sublime (§23, 245); sublimity strictly speaking “is not contained in anything in nature, but only in our mind” (§28, 264). This means, according to Kant, that there is no need for a deduction of the sublime.
  4. While judgments of beauty involve a relation between the faculties of imagination and understanding, the faculties brought into relation in a judgment of the sublime are imagination and reason (§29, 266).

The importance of the sublime within Kant’s aesthetic theory is a matter of dispute. In the Introductions to the Critique of Judgment, Kant has a great deal to say about the beautiful, but mentions the sublime only fleetingly (FI XII, 249–250) and in the Analytic of the Sublime itself he notes that

the concept of the sublime in nature is far from being as important and rich in consequences as that of its beauty

and that the

theory of the sublime is a mere appendix to the aesthetic judging of the purposiveness of nature. (§23, 246)

Kant’s views about the sublime also appear to be less historically distinctive than his views about the beautiful, showing in particular the influence of Burke. On the other hand, Kant’s account of the sublime has been influential in literary theory (see Section 2.9 below), and the sublime also plays a significant role in Kant’s account of the connection between aesthetic judgment and morality. Commentators who have emphasized the importance of the sublime in connection with moral feeling include Clewis (2009) and Matherne (forthcoming); the latter explores in particular the experience of the sublime as enabling the perception of our own freedom.

One focus of debate regarding the sublime concerns whether sublimity, according to Kant, is restricted to objects of nature, or whether there can also be sublime art; Abaci (2008) defends Kant’s restriction of sublimity to nature; Clewis (2010) defends the opposite view. For discussion of the Kantian sublime as it might apply to specific works of art, see chs. 6 and 7 of Lyotard 1988 [1991] (on Barnett Newman’s paintings as an instance of the Kantian sublime) and Myskja 2002 (which brings Kant’s notion of the sublime to bear on Samuel Beckett’s novel Molloy). Zuckert 2021 offers a clear and helpful discussion of Lyotard’s view of Kant’s account of the sublime in application to art.

An orthogonal question concerns the proper object of a judgment of the sublime (whether of nature or art). We might suppose that it is the physical object occasioning the feeling of the sublime, for example St. Peter’s in Rome, or an erupting volcano. But, as we saw above, Kant says that sublimity does not belong to objects but is “only in our mind” (§28, 264). Commentators have suggested various candidates for what is properly called sublime, including rational ideas, human reason, and the feeling of pleasure which constitutes our experience of the sublime; for discussion, see Moore (2018).

A good overview of Kant’s theory of the sublime and its connection with Kant’s aesthetic theory more generally is provided in Crowther 1989; other useful expositions include Guyer (1993: ch. 7), Matthews (1996), Budd (1998), and Allison (2001: ch. 13). The more recent overview in Merritt 2018 offers a helpful account of the historical sources of Kant’s theory, including Stoicism..

2.8 Aesthetics and Morality

The connection between aesthetic judgment and moral feeling is a persistent theme in the Critique of Judgment. As noted in Section 2.3.4 above, some commentators take the demand for universal validity made by a judgment of beauty to amount to a moral demand, so that Kant’s argument for the universal validity of such judgments depends on an appeal to morality. A more common view, however, is to see judgments of beauty not as grounded in morality, but rather, along with judgments of the sublime, as contributing to an account of moral feeling, and hence of how morality is possible for human beings (for a clear statement of the contrast between these views, see the introduction to Guyer 1993).

The idea that aesthetic judgment plays a role in grounding the possibility of morality for human beings is suggested at a very general level in the Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, where Kant describes the faculty of judgment as bridging “the great gulf” between the concept of nature and that of freedom (IX, 195). While Kant says that the concept or principle of judgment which mediates the transition between nature and freedom is that of the “purposiveness of nature”, which could simply be understood as referring to nature’s scientific comprehensibility (see Section 3.2 below), he also associates judgment in this context with the feeling of pleasure and displeasure, making clear that it is not only judgment in the context of empirical scientific enquiry, but also aesthetic judgment, which plays this bridging role.

The “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” mentions a number of more specific connections between aesthetics and morality, including the following:

  1. Aesthetic experience serves as a propadeutic for morality, in that “the beautiful prepares us to love something, even nature, without interest; the sublime, to esteem it, even contrary to our (sensible) interest” (General Remark following §29, 267).
  2. The demand for universal agreement in judgments of the sublime rests on an appeal to moral feeling (§29, 265–266)
  3. Taking a direct interest in the beauty of nature indicates “a good soul” and a “mental attunement favorable to moral feeling” (§42, 298–299).
  4. Beauty serves as the “symbol” of morality (§59, passim), in that a judgment of beauty “legislates for itself” rather than being “subjected to a heteronomy of laws of experience” (§59, 353); relatedly, feelings of pleasure in the beautiful are analogous to moral consciousness (§59, 354; see also General Comment following §91, 482n.).
  5. Beauty gives sensible form to moral ideas (§60, 356); this is related both to the view that there is an analogy between the experience of beauty and moral feeling (see (ii) above), and to the view that beauty is the expression of aesthetic ideas (see Section 2.6). Because of this, the development of moral ideas is the “true propadeutic” for taste (§60, 356).

There is an influential discussion of beauty as the symbol of morality in T. Cohen (1982). Much of Guyer’s work on the third Critique subsequent to his 1979 has emphasized the connection between aesthetics and morality, and in particular the role of aesthetics in supporting the human moral vocation. As noted in Section 1, a number of commentators have seen unity of the Critique of Judgment in terms of moral teleology, and their work offers further discussion of the relation between aesthetics and morality; see Section 1 for references.

2.9 The Broader Significance of Kant’s Aesthetics

Kant himself clearly takes his aesthetic theory to be of central importance for the understanding of the so-called “faculty of judgment” generally (see Section 1 above): this implies that he takes it to be of importance for understanding empirical scientific enquiry, and in particular for our understanding of biological phenomena. As noted in Section 2.8 above, there are also significant connections between Kant’s views on aesthetics and his views on ethics, and, as noted in Section 1, a number of commentators have, in addition, laid special weight on the connection between Kant’s aesthetics and his views on empirical cognition. Some commentators have also drawn on Kant’s aesthetic theory to illuminate specific aspects of Kant’s views on cognition; for example, Heidemann (2016) draws on Kant’s aesthetic theory to defend the view that Kant’s theory of cognition is nonconceptualist.

Many philosophers have seen Kant’s aesthetics as having significance for domains of philosophical enquiry outside both aesthetics and the study of Kant. An important example is Cavell (1976: ch. 3), who connects the subjective universality which Kant ascribes to judgments of beauty with the appeal made, in ordinary language philosophy, to “what we should say” (see especially 94–96). This connection is explored further in Baz (2016) and Makkai (2021), both of which draw on Cavell for their understanding of the philosophical significance of Kant’s account of judgments of beauty. Somewhat relatedly, Bell (1987) draws a connection between Kant’s view of aesthetic judgment and Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations; Ginsborg 2011 invokes Kant’s aesthetic theory as a basis for a response to the skepticism about rules and meaning which Saul Kripke attributes to Wittgenstein (Kripke 1982).

In an influential discussion, Arendt (1982) applies Kant’s theory of aesthetic judgment within the sphere of political philosophy; relatedly, Fleischacker (1999) draws connections between aesthetic judgment for Kant and moral and political judgment generally.

The implications of Kant’s aesthetic theory for the philosophy of mathematics and the philosophy of science have been explored in Breitenbach 2013 and Breitenbach 2018 respectively; Breitenbach argues that, although Kant does not explicitly claim that mathematical proofs or scientific theories can be beautiful, we can nonetheless, on a Kantian view, feel pleasure in both. As noted in Section 1, Breitenbach (2021) also argues that the imaginative reflection characteristic of aesthetic experience also characterizes creativity in scientific cognition.

Kant’s aesthetic theory has been extensively discussed within literary theory, where there has been particular emphasis on Kant’s theory of the sublime. See for example Weiskel (1976) and Hertz (1978), both of which interpret Kant’s account of the sublime in psychoanalytic terms, as well as the discussions of the Kantian sublime in de Man (1990) and Lyotard (1991 [1994]). Kant’s aesthetic theory more generally is discussed in Derrida (1975 [1981] and 1978 [1987]); while the work of Derrida and other deconstructionists has been largely ignored or dismissed by commentators within the analytic tradition of philosophy, it has been influential among literary theorists.

3. Teleology

While Kant’s ethical theory makes frequent reference to the ends or purposes adopted by human beings, the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” is concerned with the idea of ends or purposes in nature. (For the terms “end” and “purpose” as translations of the German Zweck, see footnote 2.) Among the most striking elements of Kant’s account of natural teleology are (i) his claim, in the “Analytic of Teleological Judgment”, that organisms must be regarded by human beings in teleological terms, i.e., as “natural purposes”, and (ii) his attempt, in the “Dialectic of Teleological Judgment”, to reconcile this teleological conception of organisms with a mechanistic account of nature. These are described here in Section 3.3 and Section 3.4, respectively. Prior to this, Section 3.1 outlines Kant’s notions of purpose and purposiveness in general and Section 3.2 sketches nature’s “purposiveness for our cognitive faculties”, i.e., its amenability to empirical scientific enquiry. The discussion of biological teleology and its relation to mechanism in Sections 3.3 and 3.4 is followed by two sections dealing with further aspects of Kant’s teleology: Section 3.5 deals with Kant’s view that nature as a whole may be regarded as a system of purposes, and Section 3.6 with the implications of this teleological view of nature for morality and religion. Section 3.7 returns to Kant’s biological teleology, considering briefly its implications for contemporary biological thought.

3.1 The Notion of Purposiveness

The notions of purpose or end [Zweck] and of purposiveness [Zweckmässigkeit] are defined by Kant in the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment”, in a section entitled “On Purposiveness in General” (§10). A purpose is “the object of a concept, in so far as the concept is seen as the cause of the object”, and purposiveness is “the causality of a concept with respect to its object” (§10, 220). But Kant often uses the terms “purpose” and “purposive” in ways that are related to, but do not quite fit, these definitions. In particular “purpose” is sometimes used to apply to the concept rather than the corresponding object (e.g., Introduction IV, 180), and “purposiveness” is usually used to denote, not the causality of the concept, but the property in virtue of which an object counts as a purpose (e.g., FI IX, 234). Kant also characterizes “purposiveness” as the “lawfulness of the contingent as such” (FI VI, 217; see also FI VIII, 228, Introduction V, 184, and §76, 404).

Kant’s initial definition at §10 suggests that the paradigm of a purpose is a human artifact, since this typically comes into being as a result of the artisan’s having a concept of the object he or she plans to produce, a concept which is thus causally efficacious in producing its object. Such an object is the result of design. But Kant goes on to claim that something can qualify as a purpose, or as purposive, not only if it is in fact brought about as a result of design, but if we can conceive its possibility only on the assumption that it was produced according to design:

an object or a state of mind or even an action… is called purposive merely because its possibility can only be explained and conceived by us in so far as we assume at its ground a causality in accordance with purposes. (§10, 220)

Kant thinks that this is the case in particular for organisms, which are “natural purposes” (see Section 3.3 below). But the notion of purposiveness also applies more broadly, and Kant distinguishes various different kinds of purposiveness applying not only to organisms and artifacts, but also to beautiful objects, to nature as a whole (both in so far as it is comprehensible to human beings, and in so far as it is a system of purposes standing in purposive relations to one another), to the functioning of our cognitive faculties in aesthetic appreciation and empirical scientific enquiry, to geometrical figures, and even to objects that are useful or agreeable to human beings.

Because Kant’s terminology is not always consistent, it is difficult to provide a definitive characterization of the various types of purposiveness. However, the following simplified scheme may serve as a guide. The notion of purposiveness is divided in the first instance into subjective and objective purposiveness. Both kinds of purposiveness are in turn divided into formal and material (or real). The most important kinds of purposiveness for the concerns of the Critique of Judgment are (i) subjective formal purposiveness and (ii) objective material purposiveness. Subjective formal purposiveness corresponds both to the “aesthetic” purposiveness displayed by beautiful objects (or by the activity of our cognitive faculties in the perception of them) and to the “logical” purposiveness displayed by nature as a whole in so far as it is comprehensible to human beings (see Section 3.2). Objective material purposiveness corresponds to the purposiveness displayed both by organisms qua “natural purposes” (see Section 3.3) and by arrangements of natural things or processes which stand to one another in means-end relations (see Section 3.5). But Kant also allows for subjective material purposiveness, which is the kind of purposiveness exhibited by an agreeable object, i.e., one which pleases our senses (FI VIII, 224); and for objective formal purposiveness, which is exhibited by geometrical figures in virtue of their fruitfulness for solving mathematical problems (§62).

A further important distinction is that between objective material purposiveness which is inner, and objective material purposiveness which is merely outer or relative; this distinguishes the kind of purposiveness possessed by organisms from that in virtue of which one natural thing or process stands in a means-end relation to another. Kant also claims in one passage (FI XII, 249–250) that the distinction between inner and relative purposiveness applies to subjective as well as objective purposiveness, serving to separate the beautiful from the sublime.

The distinctions among these various kinds of purposiveness are treated in detail by Marc-Wogau (1938) and Tonelli (1958).

Commentators have disagreed about whether there is any underlying philosophical unity to Kant’s notion of purposiveness, and, in particular, whether the notion of purposiveness which figures in the aesthetic context is the same as that which figures in Kant’s account of organisms. Guyer takes Kant to be operating with two different senses of “purposiveness”, one applying to artifacts (and, presumably, organisms), the other applying to objects of aesthetic appreciation. While purposiveness in the former sense corresponds to Kant’s account of purposiveness at §10 in terms of the notion of design, the notion of purposiveness as it applies to beautiful objects does not involve the idea of real or apparent design, but simply that of the satisfaction of an aim or objective (1979 [1997: 190ff]; see also 1993: 417n.39).

An opposing view is defended in Ginsborg 1997b, which draws on Kant’s characterization of purposiveness as the “lawfulness of the contingent as such” (FI VI, 20:217; see also FI VIII, 20:228; Introduction V, 5:184; and §76, 5:404) to argue for a univocal conception on which purposiveness is understood as normative lawfulness. Zuckert also lays emphasis on Kant’s identification of purposiveness as the “lawfulness of the contingent” (2007a: 5–7), but rejects Ginsborg’s view that this in turn amounts to normative lawfulness as such (2007a: 84n28); on her view, the lawfulness of the contingent is to be understood as “the unity of the diverse” (2007a: 5) or the “form of unity of diversity as such” (2007a: 15). The normative conception of purposiveness is also criticized by Teufel (2011), who argues that Kant held an etiological and non-teleological conception of purposiveness: on Teufel’s view, an ascription of purposiveness to an object makes an ontological claim to the effect that the object is the outcome of a rational, conceptually guided process. Breitenbach (2017) and Fisher (forthcoming) agree with Ginsborg in emphasizing Kant’s characterization of purposiveness in terms of the lawfulness of the contingent, but without endorsing Ginsborg’s interpretation of the lawfulness as normative.

3.2 Nature’s Purposiveness for Our Cognitive Faculties

Kant claims in the Introductions to the Critique of Judgment that it is an a priori principle of reflecting judgment that nature is “purposive for our cognitive faculties” or “purposive for judgment”. This principle is, in the terminology of the Critique of Pure Reason, regulative rather than constitutive. We cannot assert that nature is, as a matter of objective fact, purposive for our cognitive faculties, but it is a condition of the exercise of reflecting judgment that we assume nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties. The assumption that nature is purposive for our cognitive faculties is not, strictly speaking, part of teleology, since the purposiveness at issue is subjective, and teleological judgments are concerned only with objective purposiveness (see, e.g., FI VII, 20:221). But it is nonetheless relevant to Kant’s teleology, since our entitlement to ascribe objective purposiveness to natural things, in particular to organisms, derives from our more fundamental entitlement to regard nature as (subjectively) purposive for our cognitive faculties (FI VI, 20:218; Introduction VIII, 5:193–194).

Kant characterizes the principle of nature’s purposiveness in a variety of different ways which he seems to treat as interchangeable even though they do not, on the face of it, come to the same thing. The variety of characterizations stems in part from the variety of different tasks he seems to ascribe to reflecting judgment itself. In addition to being responsible for aesthetic judgments, and to supplying the concept of purposiveness which is required for teleological judgments, reflecting judgment seems to be ascribed the following cognitive tasks: the classification of natural things into a hierarchy of genera and species; the construction of explanatory scientific theories in which more specific natural laws are represented as falling under higher and more general laws; the representation of nature as empirically lawlike überhaupt; and the formation of empirical concepts überhaupt. Because the principle of nature’s purposiveness is, in effect, the principle that nature is amenable to the activity of reflecting judgment itself, it seems to allow of being formulated in a corresponding variety of ways, that is, as a principle of nature’s taxonomic systematicity, of its explanatory systematicity, of its empirical lawlikeness, and of its empirical conceptualizability.

Kant’s discussion of the principle of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties, and his related earlier discussion (in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason) of the regulative principle of nature’s systematicity, have, together, been seen as very important for the understanding of Kant’s views on empirical science. Moreover, to the extent that the principle is seen as required not only for the construction of systematic scientific theories, but also for the recognition of nature’s empirical lawlikeness or (even more fundamentally) for the possibility of any empirical concept-formation at all, it takes on great importance for an understanding of Kant’s views on empirical cognition generally. However, Kant’s discussion of the principle has been thought to pose a number of serious interpretative and philosophical difficulties, including the following:

  1. How are the various formulations of the principle related? Kant seems to regard them as amounting to the same, and thus to be committed to the view that if nature is empirically conceptualizable at all, we must also recognize the empirical regularities it manifests as lawlike, and the corresponding concepts and laws must fall under a systematic hierarchy. But it is not clear how such a view is to be justified. It seems quite conceivable that natural things could be conceptualizable (say, under familiar concepts like dog or granite) without those concepts in turn figuring in a systematic hierarchy. Relatedly, it also seems conceivable that we could apply such concepts to natural things without being able to detect any lawlike connections among the corresponding properties, let alone connections which in turn allow of being incorporated into an overarching system of empirical laws.
  2. Regardless of how one understands the task of reflecting judgment, and the content of the corresponding principle, why is it a condition of the successful exercise of reflecting judgment that we assume that nature is suitable for reflecting judgment? Why can’t we pursue our attempts, say, to arrive at a systematic hierarchy of natural concepts and laws, without assuming in advance that nature will favour our efforts?
  3. If the principle is indeed required, as Kant suggests it is, for the empirical conceptualization of nature and for the recognition of nature as empirically lawlike, then it would seem to be a condition of the possibility of experience. But then why is it regulative rather than constitutive? Relatedly, how are we to reconcile the respective roles of the pure concepts of the understanding (in particular the concept of causality) on the one hand, with the principle of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties on the other? If Kant has already shown, in the Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason, that nature is subject to causal laws, then why is there any need for a further principle to account for the recognition of nature as empirically lawlike?

Much of the discussion of these and related questions was stimulated by Buchdahl, who argues (1969a,b) that the principle of causality in the Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason is insufficient to account for nature’s subordination to particular causal laws and that, in addition, a principle of systematicity is required to account for nature’s empirical lawlikeness. A similar view is developed by Philip Kitcher (1986); for a somewhat revised view, see his 1994. Guyer (1990b) follows McFarland (1970) in ascribing less cognitive significance to the principle of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties, holding that it is required only to provide us with rational motivation for attempts at systematizing nature; see also Guyer (1990c, 1979 [1997: ch. 2], and 2003c). Other influential discussions from the late 1980s and early 1990s include Horstmann (1989), Brandt (1989), Butts (1990), Friedman (1992b and 1992a: ch. 5), Patricia Kitcher (1990: ch. 8; 1992), Walker (1990), and Brittan (1992). Friedman’s view is notable in taking a top-down approach to the systematicity of nature, on which empirical laws of nature (such as the laws of chemistry) can be justified a priori through a top-down approach illustrated by Kant’s justification of Newton’s law of universal gravitation in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Some of the literature from this period, especially the views of Philip Kitcher and Buchdahl, is discussed in Ginsborg 2018a.

A number of commentators have taken Kant’s views on the principle of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties to be fundamental for understanding Kant’s views on the possibility of empirical knowledge. Floyd (1998) and Allison (2001: ch. 1) claim that the principle represents Kant’s answer to Hume’s problem of induction; Ginsborg (1990a: ch. 4; 1990b) takes it to be a condition of empirical conceptualization and hence of all empirical judgment, not just of judgments based on inductive inference; Patricia Kitcher (1990: ch. 8; 1992) also argues for a close connection between Kant’s views on the systematicity of nature and empirical concept-formation. An even stronger view is suggested by Abela (2006), who takes it to be required as a condition for empirical truth, which he sees as required in turn for the possibility of any object-directed representation. Geiger (2009) also holds that the principle is required for all empirical cognition (see also Geiger 2003), but argues that it is in the “Critique of Teleological Judgment”, and not in the Introductions to the Critique of Judgment (nor in the Appendix to the Dialectic of the first Critique), that Kant offers his fullest argument for its necessity. Other commentators who take the principle of nature’s purposiveness to be a condition of empirical cognition in general include Teufel (2017).

The idea that the assumption of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties is a condition of empirical concept-formation is potentially helpful in addressing the problem of the unity of the Critique of Judgment (see Section 1), given that the free play of imagination and understanding characteristic of judgments of beauty is often seen as closely related to the activity of imagination which allows us to categorize objects as having general features and falling into kinds. More generally, the question of how to relate the principle of nature’s purposiveness for our cognitive faculties to the activity of the cognitive faculties in aesthetic judgment has been discussed by a number of commentators; see, for example, Ginsborg (1990b), Pippin (1996), Allison (2001: ch. 2), Guyer (2003b), Baz (2005), Caranti (2005), Hughes (2006; 2007: ch. 7), Gentry (2018) and Geiger (2020).

3.3 Organisms as Natural Purposes

In §§64–65 of the Analytic of Teleological Judgment, Kant introduces the notion of a “natural purpose” or “natural end” [Naturzweck] and argues both that “organized beings”, that is, plants and animals, instantiate the concept of a natural purpose and also that they are the only beings in nature that do so (§65, 376). (Kant sometimes says that they are natural purposes, and sometimes only that they must be “regarded” or “considered” as natural purposes.) Organized beings (or, to use the more modern term, “organisms”) are, or must be considered as, purposes because we can conceive of their possibility only on the assumption that they were produced in accordance with design. They thus meet the definition of “purpose” given at §10. (In the terms introduced in Section 3.1, they display “inner objective material purposiveness”.) But they are, or must be considered, as products of nature rather than products of conscious design.

What makes an organism qualify as a natural purpose is that it is “both cause and effect of itself” (§64, 371). Kant gives a preliminary explanation of this idea at §64 by calling attention to three respects in which an organism, such as a tree, stands in a causal relation to its own existence. First, in producing offspring which resemble it, a tree “produces itself as far as its species is concerned”, so that the species of the tree maintains itself in existence. Second, a tree preserves itself as an individual by taking in nourishment from outside and converting it into the kind of organic substance of which it, itself, is made. Third, and most important, the various parts of a tree mutually maintain one another in existence and hence maintain the whole tree in existence. For example, while the leaves are produced by the tree as a whole and depend on it for their growth and maintenance, they are in turn necessary for the growth and maintenance of the other parts of the tree, for example the trunk and roots. Kant also mentions a number of further phenomena illustrating the way in which an organism is “cause and effect” of itself, in particular the capacity of certain organisms to regenerate missing parts, and more generally the capacity of organisms to repair damage to themselves.

Kant goes into more detail about the notion of a natural purpose in §65, where he specifies two conditions something must meet in order to be a natural purpose. The first, that the “parts are possible…only through their relation to the whole” (§65, 373), is a condition on something’s being, not only a natural purpose, but a purpose tout court. It thus applies not only to living things but also to artifacts, such as watches, in which each part is there for the sake of its relation to the whole, and is thus in a sense there only on account of its relation to the whole. The second condition, which applies only to purposes which are natural, is that “the parts of the thing…are reciprocally cause and effect of their form” (ibid.). (This corresponds to the third of the features to which Kant drew our attention in the example of the tree at §64.) This condition is not met by artifacts, a point which Kant illustrates by appeal to the example of a watch, whose parts, unlike the parts of a plant or animal, do not produce one another or maintain one another in existence.

Kant is concerned, then, to emphasize both an analogy and a disanalogy between organisms and artifacts. As in the case of artifacts, we can make sense of organisms (that is, understand their structure and workings) only by appeal to teleological notions. We make sense of an organism by coming to understand what the functions of its various parts are (e.g., by coming to understand that the function of the heart is to pump blood round the body, or that the heart is there “in order to” pump blood round the body) just as we make sense of an artifact such as a watch by coming to understand the functions of its parts (e.g., that a particular wheel is there in order to turn the hour hand). But organisms are unlike artifacts in that they are not produced or maintained by an external cause, but instead have the self-producing and self-maintaining character that is revealed in the kinds of vital properties (reproduction of young, capacity to nourish themselves, reciprocal dependence of parts, capacity for self-repair) which Kant illustrates with the example of the tree.

The question of how the natural character of organisms can be reconciled with their status as purposes, and hence of the very coherence of the notion of a “natural purpose”, is indirectly addressed by Kant in the Dialectic of Teleological Judgment in the form of a question about how we are to reconcile the apparently conflicting demands of mechanistic and teleological explanation with regard to living things (see Section 3.4 below). But it can also be raised in a more direct form. How is it possible to regard one and the same object both as a purpose (hence as something which has been produced as a result of conscious design), and as natural (hence—on the face of it—something which has not been produced as a result of conscious design)? To say that we regard it only as if it were designed does not on its own dispose of the question, for it is not clear what it is to regard something that is not designed “as if” it were designed: if we are not ascribing to organisms the property of being artifacts, then in what respect can we coherently regard them as similar to artifacts?

Ginsborg (2001) attempts to resolve the problem of coherence by appeal to a conception of purposiveness as normativity (see Section 3.1 above), arguing that organisms can be regarded as subject to normative standards without supposing that they were designed to accord with those standards. Alternative solutions are offered by Kreines (2005), who agrees that the notion of a purpose has normative content but denies that organisms for Kant are in fact purposes, and by Beisbart (2009), who argues that the appeal to normativity is unnecessary for making sense of organisms as natural purposes, since we can conceive of a natural object as artefact-like by conceiving of its parts as produced reciprocally by one another and by the whole (in the way illustrated by Kant through the example of the tree at §64). Gambarotto (2018: 14–22) addresses the problem by denying that Kant’s notion of a natural purpose is coherent; Kant, according to Gambarotto, holds an “unstable” view, because he was unable to free the notion of teleology from that of intention.

While much discussion of Kant’s biological teleology has focussed on the Dialectic of Teleological Judgment, rather than the Analytic, there is an excellent discussion of the Analytic of Teleological Judgment in McLaughlin (1990: ch. 1), which sets Kant’s view of organisms in the context of eighteenth-century biology. Huneman 2007 is a useful collection of articles which also set Kant’s views on organisms in historical context. Other discussions of the Analytic’s treatment of organisms as natural purposes include Zumbach (1984), Illetterati (2014), Šustar (2014), and Goy (2014b). Fricke (1990), Guyer (2003b), and Steigerwald (2006) relate Kant’s view of organisms as natural purposes to his views about reflective judgment more generally. Breitenbach (2014) argues that the ascription of purposiveness to organisms is a matter of our regarding organic natural processes as analogous to reason’s intentional activity. An interesting question is raised by the fact that Kant’s conception of an organism appears to come apart from the idea of a living thing, since Kant describes “life” as belonging only to beings with desires. Does Kant, then, not count plants as living things? Nunez (2021) addresses this question by suggesting that, in a sense, plants have desires even though they are not conscious.

Guyer (2001a) discusses the apparent threat posed by organisms to Kant’s conception of natural science as unified; a similar problem is raised in Zammito (2012: 123). Breitenbach (2017) argues that the threat is illusory, since the laws under which we unify nature include teleological principles.

While Kant’s account of organisms as natural purposes is often discussed in the context of Kant’s account of natural science or of eighteenth-century biology, some commentators explore its implications for Kant’s moral teleology and views on rational freedom; see for example N. Fisher (2019) and Ostaric (2021).

3.4 Mechanism and Teleology

The same considerations which lead Kant to claim, in the Analytic, that we must regard organisms as purposes, lead him to claim, in the Dialectic, that their production cannot be mechanically explained and that they must instead be accounted for in terms which ultimately make reference to teleology. In a well-known passage he declares that it is

absurd for human beings…to hope that there may yet arise a Newton who could make conceivable even so much as the production of a blade of grass according to natural laws which no intention has ordered. (§75, 400)

The mechanical inexplicability of organisms leads to an apparent conflict, which Kant refers to as an “antinomy of judgment”, between two principles governing empirical scientific enquiry. On the one hand, we must seek to explain everything in nature in mechanical terms; on the other, some objects in nature resist mechanical explanation and we need to appeal to teleology in order to understand them (§70, 387).

The question of how Kant resolves the Antinomy is controversial. At least part of Kant’s solution consists in the claim that both principles are merely “regulative” rather than “constitutive”, that is, that they do not state how nature really is, but only present principles which we must follow in investigating nature. Kant develops this solution in detail by arguing that both the need for mechanistic explanation for nature as a whole, and the specific need to regard some products of nature (specifically, organisms) in teleological terms, are due to peculiarities of our human cognitive faculties. The core of this argument is given in §77, where Kant differentiates two kinds of understanding, the “discursive” understanding of human beings, and a contrasting “intuitive” understanding which (although Kant does not say so explicitly) might be ascribed to God. While a being with a discursive understanding cannot understand how an organism could come about in ways that do not involve teleological causation, this does not mean this could not be understood by an intuitive understanding, and hence that the production of organisms is impossible without such causation.

This argument on its own is not sufficient to address the question of how the principles are to be reconciled in scientific enquiry, that is, how we are to seek a mechanical explanation of organisms (as required by the first principle) while still acknowledging that we cannot understand them except by appeal to purposes. Kant’s ostensible answer to this question is that we must “subordinate” mechanism to teleology (§78, 414). Even in the case of organisms, we must pursue the search for mechanical explanation as far as possible, yet while still recognizing the need for an ultimate appeal to purposes. The subordination of mechanism to teleology is clarified in §§80–81, in the “Methodology of Teleological Judgment”, where Kant connects his views to some of the biological controversies of the day, regarding both the origin of the various species of plants and animals, and the origin of individual plants and animals belonging to already existing species. In the case of the origin of species, Kant tentatively endorses a view which allows the natural development of higher species out of lower ones, but which denies the possibility that the lower species in turn could develop out of unorganized matter as such. The view is “mechanical” to the extent that it understands the development of one species from another as a natural law-governed process which does not require special appeal to an purpose in the case of each new species; but the mechanism is “subordinated to teleology” in the sense that the starting-point of the process, namely matter which itself has organization and life, is intelligible only by appeal to purposes (§80). In the case of the origin of particular organisms, Kant endorses a view (epigenesis) on which the emergence of an apparently new plant or animal is not just the expansion or unfolding of one which already existed in miniature (as on the preformationist view), but a natural process whereby a new living thing comes into being. At the same time, he denies that a living thing can come to be out of non-living matter: the matter from which the embryo develops must already be teleologically organized. The view is “mechanical” in the sense that it denies that each living thing was produced, like an artifact, in accordance with a specific intention, and allows instead that once matter is endowed with life and organization it has the power to produce other living things. But again, as in the case of the origin of species, this “mechanism” depends on living matter, whose possibility we can understand only in teleological terms.

It is difficult to understand the implications of Kant’s discussion of mechanism and teleology without knowing what he means by “mechanism”, and unfortunately this is very hard to determine from the text. Many commentators have taken the notion of mechanism to be equivalent to the notion of causality in time which figures in the Critique of Pure Reason, so that the principle of mechanism is equivalent to the causal principle which Kant takes himself to have proved in the Second Analogy. If the notion of mechanism is understood in this way, then Kant’s solution to the antinomy of teleological judgment is radically at odds with his views in the Critique of Pure Reason, since it involves the claim that the principle of mechanism is merely regulative as opposed to constitutive. McLaughlin (1989, 1990), and following him Allison (1992), reject this reading, instead taking the notion of mechanism in the relevant sense to correspond to a more specific type of causality, namely the causality by which the parts of a thing determine the whole rather than the whole’s determining the parts; this view is also taken by Zanetti (1993). Ginsborg (2001) offers a third proposal, on which a thing can be explained “mechanically” if its existence can be accounted for in terms of the intrinsic powers of the matter out of which it comes to be. The topic of mechanism in the context of the Critique of Judgment is discussed further in Breitenbach (2008) and Geiger (2017).

A related interpretative issue concerns the grounds on which organisms resist mechanical explanation, and hence need to be understood teleologically. Many commentators, including McLaughlin (1990), Allison (1992), and Guyer (2001a, 2003b), take organisms to be mechanically inexplicable in virtue of the self-maintaining and self-producing character which distinguishes them from artifacts (see Section 3.3). On this approach, organisms have to be explained teleologically because, in contrast to machines, their parts cannot exist independently of the whole to which they belong. Against this, Ginsborg (2004) argues that the self-maintaining character of organisms is irrelevant to their mechanical inexplicability in the relevant sense. Kant’s point in emphasizing the contrast between organisms and machines is not to show that organisms require teleological explanation (since machines such as clocks are no less in need of such explanation), but on the contrary to show that, as natural objects rather than artefacts, they are not to be explained in terms of a designer’s intentions. The disagreement is discussed further in Breitenbach 2006, Watkins 2009, and McLaughlin 2014, all of which engage with the related issue of how the Antinomy is resolved.

There is a very helpful overview of the Antinomy of Teleological Judgment in chapter 4 of Quarfood 2004 which includes many references to relevant secondary literature. More recent discussions of the Antinomy include, in addition to the articles mentioned in the previous paragraph, Quarfood 2006, Breitenbach 2008, Quarfood 2014, Nuzzo 2009, Huneman 2014, and Shimony 2018: the latter three articles deal specifically with Kant’s distinction between discursive and intuitive understanding in §§76–77.

3.5 Nature as a System of Purposes

Kant is concerned with the role of teleology in our understanding not only of individual organisms, but also of other natural things and processes, and of nature as a whole. Experience presents us with many cases in which features of a living thing’s environment, both organic and inorganic, are beneficial or indeed necessary to it: for example rivers are helpful to the growth of plants, and thus indirectly to human beings, because they deposit soil and thus create fertile land (§63, 367); grass is necessary for cattle and other herbivorous animals, which in turn provide food for carnivores (§63, 368). Kant makes the negative point (a version of which he had earlier argued at length in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God of 1763) that we can understand these arrangements without appeal to purposes. We can account for the origin of rivers mechanically, and even though grass must be regarded as an purpose on account of its internal organization, we do not need to appeal to its usefulness to other living things in order to comprehend it. However, he does hold that the natural objects figuring in these useful arrangements have a type of purposiveness, namely outer or relative purposiveness. They can be counted as purposive in this relative sense as long as the thing to whose existence they contribute is a living thing, and hence has inner purposiveness (this condition is stated most clearly at §82, 425).

The idea of the outer or relative purposiveness of one natural thing for another, which is made possible by the idea of a natural purpose, in turn makes possible the idea of nature as a system of purposes, where everything in nature is teleologically connected to everything else through relations of outer purposiveness. Kant puts this by saying that the concept of a natural purpose “necessarily leads to the idea of all of nature as a system in accordance with the rule of purposes” (§67, 379), but he also puts the point more weakly by saying that the step from the idea of a natural purpose to that of nature as a whole as a system of purposes is one which we “may” [dürfen] make (§67, 380). This does not mean that we are entitled, still less required, to ascribe an intentional cause to purposive arrangements in nature, but it does allow us to think of them as standing not only in a mechanical, but also in a teleological order. The thought of such a teleological order in turn leads to two further ideas: the idea of the ultimate purpose [letzter Zweck] of nature, which is something within nature for whose sake all other things within nature exist (§82, 426ff), and the idea of the final purpose [Endzweck] of nature, which is something outside of nature for whose sake nature as a whole exists (§67, 378f.; §84, 434ff.). While experience does not allow us to identify either nature’s ultimate purpose or its final purpose, Kant argues on a priori grounds that the final purpose of nature can only be man considered as a moral subject, that is, considered as having the supersensible ability to choose purposes freely (§84, 435). To consider man in this way is to conceive him as noumenon, rather than as part of nature. But human beings are capable of realizing their noumenal freedom only in virtue of their capacity, as natural beings, to set themselves purposes and to use nature to fulfil them. Kant calls the development of this capacity “culture”, and takes it to require the acquisition both of specific abilities (“culture of skill”) and of the ability to make choices without being influenced by the inclinations to enjoyment stemming from our animal nature (“culture of discipline”). Culture is the ultimate purpose of nature because it prepares man for what he must do in order to be the final purpose of nature (§83, 431).

Kant’s views about the teleology of nature are discussed in Guyer 2001b and 2014 and Watkins 2014; the latter offers a very helpful discussion of Kant’s justification for the extension of his views about teleology in individual organisms to nature as a whole. See also A. Cohen’s (2006) discussion of the relation between Kant’s views on the generation of organisms and his conception of the final purpose of nature. N. Fisher (2019) understands human freedom as an example of the “teleological lawgiving” responsible for the purposiveness of both organisms individually and nature as a whole, and uses this as the basis for an interpretation of Kant’s argument that the final purpose of nature is human beings insofar as they are free.

3.6 Teleology, Morality and Religion

Part of Kant’s aim in the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” is to clarify the relation of natural teleology to religion, and to argue in particular against “physicoteleology”, that is, the attempt to use natural teleology to prove the existence of God. (The topic of physicotheology was of concern to Kant throughout his career: Kant proposes a “revised physicotheology” in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God (1763), and offers a more far-reaching criticism of physicotheology in the Critique of Pure Reason, at A620/B648ff.) Appeal to natural teleology may justify the assumption of an intelligent cause of nature, but it cannot justify the assumption that this cause has wisdom, let alone that it is infinite in every respect, and in particular supremely wise (§85, 441). For this we need to appeal, not to natural, but to moral, teleology, and in particular to the idea (itself belonging not to natural, but to moral teleology) of man as final purpose of nature. The idea of nature as purposively directed towards the existence of rational beings under moral laws allows us to conceive of an author of nature who is not merely intelligent, but also has the other attributes associated with the traditional idea of God, for example omniscience, omnipotence and wisdom (which includes omnibenificence and justice) (§86, 444). We have to assume the existence of a being with these attributes if we ourselves are to adopt the purpose required by the moral law, a purpose which Kant calls the “highest good” and which is discussed in his moral writings.

Although natural teleology cannot prove the existence of God, it nonetheless has a positive role to play with respect to religion and morality, in that it leads us to ask what the final purpose of nature is, and relatedly, to inquire into the attributes of God as author of nature. Thus, as Kant puts it, it “drives us to seek a theology” (§85, 440), and thus serves as a preparation or “propadeutic” to theology (§85, 442). Kant also claims that “if the cognition of natural purposes is connected with that of the moral purpose” then “it is of great significance for assisting the practical reality of the idea [of God]” (§88, 456). The positive role of natural teleology in establishing religion and morality has been emphasized by Guyer (see especially 2000, 2001b, 2002a), who takes the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” to provide an important argument from natural teleology to morality.

A different kind of connection between Kant’s natural teleology and his views about morality is suggested in Kain 2009, which interprets Kant’s biological theories as supporting his view that all members of the human species (including infants and the severely disabled) have moral status.

The connection between teleology and morality is often thought to be central to making sense of the Critique of Judgment as a unified work; see Section 1.

3.7 Relevance of Kant’s Natural Teleology to Contemporary Biological Theory

Kant’s writings on natural teleology take for granted the biological theories of his time, which were very different from those of the present day. While theorists at the time that Kant was writing were prepared to consider the possibility that present-day species evolved out of earlier and more primitive forms of life—and even out of mere matter as such—they had no inkling of Darwin’s theory of natural selection, nor of Mendel’s laws of inheritance. Moreover, it was widely assumed that living beings were made of a different kind of matter from that found elsewhere in the universe; and while some biological theorists rejected this “vitalist” assumption there was, as yet, no experimental evidence against it. Kant himself follows Blumenbach in assuming a distinctive kind of living matter which can be understood only in teleological terms. It might seem implausible, then, that Kant’s views could have any relevance to contemporary biological thought.

However, there are reasons to think that contemporary biological theory is no less committed to teleology than its eighteenth-century counterpart, in particular through biologists’ use of functional language in their characterizations of the parts and behaviour of organisms. Kant can thus be seen as addressing a problem which is also of concern to present-day philosophers of biology: how to make sense of the idea that biological entities and processes can have purposes or functions without presupposing the existence of a divine designer. A number of interpreters have recently drawn on Kant to propose a solution to the problem, although without necessarily agreeing on what a Kantian solution amounts to. Examples of explicitly “Kantian” approaches to teleology include ch. 3 of Quarfood 2004, Walsh 2006, A. Cohen 2007, Breitenbach 2009, and Ginsborg 2014. McLaughlin’s (2001) book on functional explanation, while not explicitly proposing a Kantian approach, draws on Kant at several points. A different suggestion regarding the relevance of Kant’s views to contemporary biology is offered by Roth (2014), who argues that Kant’s anti-reductionism regarding organisms—that they cannot be understood as composed out of pre-existing parts—offers a model for contemporary molecular biology.

The view that Kant’s theory is relevant to the contemporary debate about biological functions is challenged forcefully in Zammito 2006.


A. Primary Sources

The two most important sources for Kant’s views on aesthetics and teleology, Critique of Judgment and “First Introduction”, are both published in the standard German edition of Kant’s works, the so-called Academy edition:

  • Kritik der Urteilskraft, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Volume 5, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1902–.
  • “Erste Einleitung”, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Volume 20, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1902–.

Page references given in this article follow the pagination of the Academy edition, which is indicated in the margins of the two most recent English-language editions (see below). Unless otherwise stated, all references are to the Critique of Judgment. References to the First Introduction are introduced by the abbreviation “FI”. Quotations follow the Cambridge translation (see below), with occasional divergences.

The two most recent English-language editions of the Critique of Judgment are to be preferred over earlier translations. The recent translations are:

  • Critique of Judgment, Werner Pluhar (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987.
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment (The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant), Paul Guyer (ed.), Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.

The earlier translations are those of J.H. Bernard (London: Macmillan, 1892; revised edition 1914) and J.C. Meredith (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1952); the edition just cited is a combination of translations of the two main sections of the work that were published separately in 1911 and 1928 respectively.

Both the Hackett and the Cambridge editions include the First Introduction, and both provide further bibliographical references (the Hackett edition has a good bibliography of secondary literature up to 1987). The Hackett edition is more readable, and contains explanatory notes which will be useful to the less specialized reader. The Cambridge edition contains excellent editorial notes aimed at a more specialized readership, and includes copious references to other relevant writings by Kant.

There are substantial differences among the various available English-language editions, in particular in the translation of certain frequently occurring terms, and these differences are reflected in variations in the terminology used in the secondary literature. Some issues regarding the translation of the text are discussed in section IV of the Editor’s Introduction to the Cambridge edition and in Ginsborg (2002).

Turning now to other primary sources: there is a considerable amount of material on aesthetics, reflecting Kant’s views at various stages of his philosophical development, in the lectures and reflections on logic and anthropology. For more details on relevant material from these texts, the reader is referred to the endnotes of the Cambridge edition of the Critique of Judgment. Kant’s early work, Observations on the Sublime and the Beautiful (1764), has, in spite of its title, very little bearing on Kant’s aesthetic theory, and is more a work in popular anthropology.

While Kant’s most systematic and mature discussion of teleology is in the Critique of Judgment, there is also extensive discussion of the topic in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God (1763), included in Theoretical Philosophy 1755–1770 (The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant), translated and edited by David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992). Kant also discusses teleology in two essays about race, “Determination of the Concept of a Human Race” (1785) and “On the Use of Teleological Principles in Philosophy” (1788); both are included in Anthropology, History, and Education (The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant), edited by Gunter Zöller and Robert B. Louden.

B. Secondary Sources

There is a large and ever-increasing secondary literature on Kant’s aesthetics and teleology. The list of references below is not intended as a comprehensive bibliography. Previous editions of this entry recommended Wenzel 2009 and Henning 2009 as sources of further references in Kant’s aesthetics and teleology respectively; the author is not aware of comparable sources which cover more recent literature.

This article has not addressed the historical origin or reception of Kant’s views on aesthetics and teleology, so I mention here some readings which might serve as points of departure for the reader interested in these areas. The introduction to the Cambridge edition of the Critique of Judgment provides a useful discussion of the historical sources of the work as a whole. For a more extended account, see Zammito’s (1992) book on the origin of the Critique of Judgment. More recent work on the historical origins of Kant’s aesthetics more specifically includes Zuckert 2007b and Rueger 2009, both of which emphasize Kant’s relation to his rationalist predecessors, and Guyer 2008, which explores the influence on Kant of earlier writers on aesthetics in the empiricist tradition. Regarding the reception of Kant’s aesthetics, Guyer 2017b offers a brief but illuminating discussion of Kant’s importance to Anglo-American aesthetic theory, as illustrated by the prevalence of articles about Kant that have appeared in the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism since its founding in 1941.

Marino and Terzi 2020 discuss the reception of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment in the twentieth century with an emphasis on the Continental tradition and references to American pragmatism, with figures like Hermann Cohen, Cassirer, Adorno, Arendt, Deleuze, Derrida, Lyotard, Eco, and Cavell.

Regarding the historical background to Kant’s views on natural teleology, specifically regarding the biology of his time, McLaughlin 1990 remains an excellent guide; further work on this topic includes M. Fisher 2014, Goy 2014a, Zuckert 2014a. The reception of Kant’s biological work is discussed in Lenoir’s influential 1980, which argues that Kant’s ideas played a major role in shaping German biology in the 1790s. Lenoir’s view is challenged in Richards 2000 and in Zammito 2012, which is also a useful source of references to literature on the topic; Zammito’s (2018) study of the origin of German biology contains a wealth of information about the history and reception of Kant’s views on biology. Huneman (2006) discusses the influence of Kant’s views on French biology in the nineteenth century.

This article, and much of the literature referred to, approaches Kant’s views largely from the perspective of the analytic tradition in philosophy. English-language treatments of Kant’s aesthetics which accommodate more of a “continental” perspective include Makkreel (1990), Pillow (2000), and Gasché (2002). See also the references given in the final paragraph of section 2.9.

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Work on the original (2005) version of this article was supported by the American Council of Learned Societies and by the Max Planck Institute for the History of Science. Work on the subsequent (2013) version was carried out in part with the support of a fellowship at the Wissenschaftskolleg zu Berlin. I am grateful to Janum Sethi for her help with that version.

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