Ludwig Andreas Feuerbach

First published Mon Dec 9, 2013; substantive revision Wed Sep 20, 2023

For a number of years in the mid-nineteenth century, Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872) played a pivotal role in the history of post-Hegelian German philosophy, and in the emergence of various forms of naturalism, materialism, and positivism that is one of the most characteristic developments of this period (cf. Mandelbaum 1971: 3–37 and Arndt & Jaeschke 2000). As a public intellectual in Germany during the decade that culminated in the revolutionary uprising of 1848, Feuerbach embodied many of the democratic and progressive aspirations that were frustrated by its eventual failure. Thereafter, during a decade of political reaction, he was an inspiration to such populizers of scientific materialism as Carl Vogt, Jacob Moleschott, and Ludwig Büchner, whose role in the secularization of modern culture in the second half of the nineteenth century was considerable (cf. Gregory 1977). By virtue of the enduring influence of his most famous book, The Essence of Christianity, which was translated into English by George Eliot, Feuerbach has continued, since the beginning of the twentieth century, to attract the interest of theologians. The theological reception of Feuerbach has been shaped to a considerable extent by the disputed contention first expressed in the 1920s by the Neo-Orthodox theologian, Karl Barth, that Feuerbach’s atheistic account of Christianity only brought to their most logically consistent conclusion the foundational premises of the liberal Protestant theological enterprise inaugurated by Friedrich Schleiermacher at the outset of the nineteenth century. This enterprise, which Barth and a number of his contemporaries sought to repudiate, had, in the wake of Hume and Kant, shifted the starting point of theological reflection from divine revelation and metaphysics to human religious experience. In the field of religious studies (as distinct from theology), Feuerbach is often considered to have produced a classical “projection” theory of religion. Such theories seek to identify the underlying psychological and cognitive mechanisms that give rise to, and explain the persistence of, various religious beliefs and behaviors.[1]

To the extent that Feuerbach is remembered today outside the context of theology and religious studies, it is mainly as the object of Karl Marx’s criticism in his famous Theses on Feuerbach, originally penned in 1845, but first published posthumously by Friedrich Engels as an appendix to his book, Ludwig Feuerbach and the End of Classical German Philosophy (Engels 1888). These theses are often thought to represent the first cursory articulation of the theory that subsequently came to be known as historical materialism. This theory began to be spelled out in more detail by Marx and Engels in The German Ideology, a lengthy work in which they sought to distance themselves from their erstwhile Young Hegelian compatriots. Renewed philosophical attention paid to Feuerbach in the middle of the twentieth century is largely attributable to the publication for the first time, beginning in the late 1920s, of Marx’s early philosophical manuscripts, including The German Ideology, which revealed the extent of Feuerbach’s influence on Marx and Engels during the period culminating in its composition (1845–46).[2] In 1870, two years prior to his death, after having studied the first volume of Marx’s Capital (1867), Feuerbach became a member of the Social Democratic Party, some financial support from which helped him to survive the penury to which he and his family were subjected toward the end of his life. Feuerbach’s funeral procession in Nuremberg is said to have been attended by crowds waving red banners, the symbol of the worker’s movement. Nevertheless, Feuerbach’s direct public influence and popularity as a philosophical writer declined rapidly in the 1850s in approximately inverse proportion to the rising, albeit belated, influence of Schopenhauer, whose spirit of pessimistic resignation was perhaps more in tune with the prevailing historical reality.

Apart from the influences outlined above, Feuerbach’s importance for the history of modern philosophy is due to the fact that the publication of The Essence of Christianity in 1841 can be taken, as it was by Engels, to symbolically mark the end of the period of classical German philosophy that had begun sixty years earlier with the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason—though some might want to question the assumption involved in this way of putting things that classical German philosophy culminated in the Hegelian system that Engels thought of Feuerbach as having overthrown.[3] In any case, Feuerbach’s intellectual biography; his initially deep investment in, and subsequent effort to distance himself from, the Hegelian cause; and his attempt to inaugurate a new, sensualistic “philosophy of the future,” are all closely intertwined with political and intellectual developments in Germany during this period.[4] Although Feuerbach ultimately failed to adequately develop the aphoristically formulated “principles” of the new philosophy that he set out in 1843, the emphases in his later essays on corporeality, the senses, finitude, inter-subjectivity, and drive psychology nevertheless succeeded in introducing into the history of modern European thought themes developed further by Marx, Friedrich Nietzsche, Sigmund Freud, Max Scheler, Martin Buber, Karl Löwith, Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Alfred Schmidt, among others.[5]

1. Biographical Introduction

Ludwig was the fourth son of the distinguished jurist, Paul Johann Anselm Ritter von Feuerbach. His nephew, the neo-classical painter, Anselm Feuerbach, was the son of Ludwig’s older brother, also called Anselm, who was himself a classical archaeologist and aesthetician “in the spirit of Gotthold Ephraim Lessing and Johann Joachim Winckelmann”.[6] Ludwig’s father, who studied philosophy and law at Jena in the 1790s with the Kantians, Karl Reinhold and Gottlieb Hufeland, respectively, belonged to a group of distinguished northern German scholars called to Bavaria during the period of administrative reform under Maximilian Montgelas and charged with the task of modernizing the legal and educational institutions of what became in 1806 the modern kingdom of Bavaria. Other members of this group of so-called Nordlichter or “northern lights” included F.I. Niethammer, F.H. Jacobi (the godfather of Ludwig’s younger brother, Friedrich), and Friedrich Thiersch (the tutor of Ludwig’s two oldest brothers, who has sometimes been called “the Humboldt of Bavaria”). P.J.A. Feuerbach was knighted in recognition of his achievement in modernizing the Bavarian penal code, though his political influence was dramatically curtailed as a result of outspoken national-liberal criticisms of Napoleon expressed in pamphlets he published in 1813 and 1814 (cf. Tomasoni 2015: 16–25).

Raised Protestant and religiously devout in his youth, Ludwig matriculated in 1823 in the theological faculty of the University of Heidelberg, where his father hoped he would come under the influence of the late rationalist, H.E.G. Paulus. Ludwig was won over instead by the speculative theologian, Karl Daub, who had been instrumental in bringing Hegel to Heidelberg for two years in 1816, and was by this time one of the foremost theologians of the Hegelian school. By 1824, Ludwig had secured his father’s grudging permission to transfer to Berlin under the pretext of wanting to study with the theologians, Friedrich Schleiermacher and August Neander, but in fact because of his growing infatuation with Hegel’s philosophy. Feuerbach’s matriculation at Berlin was delayed because of suspicions of his involvement in the politically subversive student fraternity (Burschenschaft) movement, in which two of his older brothers were active, for which reason one of them (Karl, a talented mathematician) was imprisoned and subsequently attempted suicide. In 1825, to his father’s consternation, Ludwig transferred to the philosophical faculty, thereafter hearing within a two-year period all of Hegel’s lectures, except for those on aesthetics, repeating the lectures on logic twice.[7]

Feuerbach defended his Latin dissertation, De ratione, una, universali, infinita, at the University of Erlangen in 1828. Soon thereafter, he began to deliver lectures on the history of modern philosophy at the same university, a bastion of theological and political conservatism many of whose faculty were closely associated with the neo-Pietist Awakening. One colleague of Feuerbach’s at Erlangen was Julius Friedrich Stahl, who would go on to become a leading theorist of conservatism, and was associated by Feuerbach with the so-called “positive philosophy” of the late Schelling. Feuerbach imprudently appended to his first book, Thoughts on Death and Immortality (1830, hereafter Thoughts; see Section 2 below), which was published anonymously, but to no avail, a number of scathingly satirical and even vulgar couplets (Xenien) directed against the Pietists that effectively destroyed his prospects for an academic career.

During the 1830s, Feuerbach published three books on the history of modern philosophy, in addition to several essays and reviews. These include the History of Modern Philosophy from Bacon to Spinoza (1833), History of Modern Philosophy: Presentation, Development, and Critique of the Leibnizian Philosophy (1837), and Pierre Bayle: A Contribution to the History of Philosophy and Humanity (1838), none of which have been translated into English.[8] The first won him the praise of Edward Gans and an invitation from Leopold von Henning to contribute reviews to the Annals for Scientific Criticism, the principal journal of the Hegelian academic establishment in Berlin. In these reviews, Feuerbach defended the Hegelian philosophy vigorously against critics such as Karl Bachmann. Even after the publication of the works on Leibniz and Bayle, however, his efforts to secure an academic appointment remained unsuccessful. He was able for several decades to sustain his existence as an independent scholar in the remote Frankish village of Bruckberg by virtue of his wife, Bertha Löw, having been partial heir of a porcelain factory located there, from a modest pension due to his father’s service to Bavaria, and from publishing royalties.

The event that precipitated the gradual dissolution of the Hegelian synthesis of faith and knowledge (a process later referred to sardonically by Marx and Engels as the “putrefaction of absolute spirit”) was the publication in two volumes in 1835–36 of D.F. Strauss’s Life of Jesus Critically Examined. In this controversial work, Strauss used the tools of historical criticism he had acquired from his Tübingen teacher, F.C. Baur, to develop a compelling argument for the historical unreliability of the accounts of the life of Jesus preserved in the canonical gospels. In a relatively brief “concluding dissertation” at the end of this lengthy work of biblical criticism, Strauss appealed to Hegel’s philosophy in proposing to interpret the doctrine of the incarnation of Christ as a mythological expression of the philosophical truth of the identity of the divine spirit and the human species (conceived as the community of finite spirits existing throughout history, and not as the historical individual, Jesus of Nazareth). The appearance of Strauss’s book confirmed the suspicions of theological conservatives like E.W. Hengstenberg and Heinrich Leo that Hegel’s philosophy, despite its use of Christian terminology, is incompatible with the historical faith, and the editors of the Berlin Annals felt compelled to publicly discredit Strauss’s Hegelian credentials. It was in the wake of these events that Arnold Ruge and Theodor Echtermeyer established the Halle Annals for German Science and Art, which served for several years as the principal literary organ of the so-called Young Hegelians. Among the essays and reviews that Feuerbach began to contribute to the Halle Annals in 1838 is one entitled “Toward a Critique of the Hegelian Philosophy” (1839), in which he began to distance himself publicly from the Hegelian cause, calling for a “return to nature,” as well as for a naturalistic explanation of the mysteries of Christianity and of religion more generally.[9] Publication of the Halle Annals was suspended by the Prussian censor in 1841.

Feuerbach achieved the height of his brief literary fame with the publication, also in 1841, of The Essence of Christianity, a work that made a striking impression on a number of his contemporaries. Engels recalled the appearance of this book as having a profoundly “liberating effect” on him and Marx by “breaking the spell” of the Hegelian system and establishing the truths that human consciousness is the only consciousness or spirit that exists, and that it is ontologically dependent upon the physical existence of human beings as part of nature (Engels 1888: 12–13). In 1844, Marx wrote to Feuerbach, with reference to the latter’s Principles of the Philosophy of the Future (1843; hereafter Principles) and The Essence of Faith According to Luther (1844), that in them he had, intentionally or not, “given socialism a philosophical foundation” (GW v. 18, p. 376). In fact, Feuerbach was only then beginning to acquaint himself with socialist ideas through his reading of authors like Lorenz von Stein and Wilhelm Weitling. In the end, he declined Marx’s request for a contribution to the German-French Annals, as well as Ruge’s urging that he become more politically engaged. He came out of rural seclusion to observe, with great anticipation followed by mounting disillusionment, the events in Frankfurt in 1848, and to deliver a series of public lectures at Heidelberg beginning the same year. Rather than working to spell out in detail the “philosophy of the future” for which he himself had called in the early 1840s, Feuerbach continued to focus his attention mainly on religion in works including The Essence of Religion (1845), Lectures on the Essence of Religion (1851), and Theogony According to the Sources of Classical, Hebrew and Christian Antiquity (1857). The five years of philological labor he invested in the latter work, which he considered his crowning achievement, went largely unnoticed both by his contemporaries and by posterity.

During the 1840s, Feuerbach corresponded, and occasionally visited and maintained close personal relationships with, several leading German radicals, including, in addition to Ruge and Marx, the publishers, Otto Lüning, Otto Wigand, and Julius Fröbel; the revolutionary poet, Georg Herwegh, and his wife, Emma; Hermann Kriege, a freelance activist and early German socialist who emigrated to America; as well as the scientific materialists, Carl Vogt and Jacob Moleschott. It was in a review of a book on nutrition published by the latter figure that Feuerbach famously quipped, “Man ist, was man ißt,” making a play on words that doesn’t come through in the English expression, “You are what you eat.” The impression made by Feuerbach on several leading lights of the younger generation is reflected in Gottfried Keller’s Bildungsroman, Green Henry (1855), which features a character inspired by Feuerbach, as well as in the original dedication (to Feuerbach) of Richard Wagner’s early book, The Art-Work of the Future (1850).

Partly as the result of a global financial crisis, the porcelain factory that had supported Feuerbach’s literary existence went bankrupt in 1859. The following year he and his wife and daughter were forced to relocate to the village of Rechenberg, located then on the outskirts of Nuremberg, where Feuerbach lived out the remainder of his life in increasingly ill health. Although his productivity as a writer declined sharply during this period, he was able, in 1866, to bring out the tenth and final volume of his collected works (which had begun to appear in 1846), bearing the title, God, Freedom and Immortality from the Standpoint of Anthropology, and including a fairly substantial, though fragmentary, essay “On Spiritualism and Materialism, Especially in Relation to the Freedom of the Will”. In this essay, and in an essay on ethics that Feuerbach left incomplete at his death, we find him beginning to sketch out a moral psychology, and an eudaimonistic ethical theory, in which the concept of the “drive-to-happiness” (Glückseligkeitstrieb) plays a central role.

2. Early Idealistic Pantheism

In an essay published in 1835, Heinrich Heine observed that pantheism had by this time become “the secret religion of Germany”.[10] That Feuerbach is generally remembered as an atheist and a materialist has tended to obscure the fact that he began his philosophical career as an enthusiastic adherent of this philosophical religion, one early expression of which can be found in the Greek words “Hen kai Pan” (One and All) inscribed in 1791 by Hölderlin in Hegel’s student album from Tübingen (cf. Pinkard 2000: 32).[11] This inscription is an allusion to words uttered by Lessing after reading Goethe’s poem-fragment, “Prometheus”, and responding enthusiastically by declaring himself a Spinozist, according to the account contained in Jacobi’s famous Letters on the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785; cf. Jacobi [MPW]: 187). It was the publication of these letters that set off the original Pantheism Controversy, and had the unintended effect of leading more than one generation of young German poets and thinkers to regard Spinoza no longer as a “dead dog” and a godless atheist, but rather as the God-intoxicated sage of a pantheistic creed in which those who, like Lessing, could no longer “stomach” orthodox conceptions of the divinity that make a strict distinction between creator and creation, could seek to satisfy their spiritual aspirations. Feuerbach included several verses of the Prometheus-fragment as an epigram to his first book, in which he used the tools of Hegelian logic to develop a conception of the divinity as One and All along lines laid out by Spinoza, Giordano Bruno and Jacob Boehme. These three he hailed as ‘pious God-inspired sages’ (GTU 241/48) who set the table for the ‘feast of reconciliation’ (GTU 463/214) between nature and spirit that it is that task of the modern age to celebrate. But this reconciliation, he argued, cannot occur as long as God continues to be thought of as an individual person existing independently of the world.

That Feuerbach, unlike Strauss, never accepted Hegel’s characterization of Christianity as the consummate religion is clear from the contents of a letter he sent to Hegel along with his dissertation in 1828.[12] In this letter he identified the historical task remaining in the wake of Hegel’s philosophical achievement to be the establishment of the “sole sovereignty of reason” in a “kingdom of the Idea” that would inaugurate a new spiritual dispensation. Foreshadowing arguments put forward in his first book, Feuerbach went on in this letter to emphasize the need for “the I, the self in general, which especially since the beginning of the Christian era, has ruled the world and has thought of itself as the only spirit that exists at all [to be] cast down from its royal throne” (GW v. 17, Briefwechsel I (1817–1839), 103–08). This, he proposed, would require prevailing ways of thinking about time, death, this world and the beyond, individuality, personhood and God to be radically transformed within and beyond the walls of academia.

Feuerbach made his first attempt to challenge prevailing ways of thinking about individuality in his inaugural dissertation, where he presented himself as a defender of speculative philosophy against those critics who claim that human reason is restricted to certain limits beyond which all inquiry is futile, and who accuse speculative philosophers of having transgressed these. This criticism, he argued, presupposes a conception of reason is a cognitive faculty of the individual thinking subject that is employed as an instrument for apprehending truths. He aimed to show that this view of the nature of reason is mistaken, that reason is one and the same in all thinking subjects, that it is universal and infinite, and that thinking (Denken) is not an activity performed by the individual, but rather by “the species” acting through the individual. “In thinking”, Feuerbach wrote, “I am bound together with, or rather, I am one with—indeed, I myself am—all human beings” (GW I:18).

In the introduction to Thoughts Feuerbach assumes the role of diagnostician of a spiritual malady by which he claims that modern moral subjects are afflicted. This malady, which he does not name but might have called either individualism or egoism, he takes to be the defining feature of the modern age insofar as this age conceives of “the single human individual for himself in his individuality […] as divine and infinite” (GTU 189/10). The principal symptom of this malady is the loss of “the perception [Anschauung] of the true totality, of oneness and life in one unity” (GTU 264/66). This loss Feuerbach finds reflected in three general tendencies of the modern age: 1) the tendency to regard human history solely as the history of the opinions and actions of individual human subjects, and not as the history of humanity conceived as a single collective agent; 2) the tendency to regard nature as a mere aggregate of “countless single stars, stones, plants, animals, elements and things” (GTU 195/14) whose relations to one another are entirely external and mechanical, rather than as an organic whole the internal dynamics of which are animated by a single all-encompassing vital principle; and 3) the tendency to conceive of God as a personal agent whose inscrutable will, through which the world came into being from nothing and is continually directed, is unconstrained by rational necessity.

Feuerbach’s basic objection to the theistic conception of God and his relation to creation is that, on it, both are conceived as equally spiritless. Rather than consisting of lifeless matter to which motion is first imparted by the purposeful action of an external agent, Feuerbach argues that nature contains within itself the principle of its own development. It exercises “unlimited creative power” by ceaselessly dividing and distinguishing its individual parts from one another. But the immeasurable multiplicity of systems within systems that results from this activity constitutes a single organic totality.

Nature is ground and principle of itself, or—what is the same thing, it exists out of necessity, out of the soul, the essence of God, in which he is one with nature. (GTU 291/86)

God, on this view, is not a skilled mechanic who acts upon the world, but a prolific artist who lives in and through it.

In Thoughts, Feuerbach further argues that the death of finite individuals is not merely an empirical fact, but also an a priori truth that follows from a proper understanding of the relations between the infinite and the finite, and between essence and existence. Nature is the totality of finite individuals existing in distinction from one another in time and space. Since to be a finite individual is not to be any number of other individuals from which one is distinct, non-being is not only the condition of individuals before they have begun to exist and after they have ceased to do so, but also a condition in which they participate by being the determinate entities that they are. Thus, being and non-being, or life and death, are equally constitutive of the existence of finite entities throughout the entire course of their generation and destruction.

Everything that exists has an essence that is distinct from its existence. Although individuals exist in time and space, their essences do not. Essence in general is timeless and unextended. Feuerbach nevertheless regards it as a kind of cognitive space in which individual essences are conceptually contained. Real or three-dimensional space, within which individual things and people exist in distinction from one another and in temporal succession, he thinks of as essence “in the determination of its being-outside-of-itself” (GTU 250/55). In his being-one, Feuerbach argues, God is everything-as-one, and is, as such, the universal essence in which all finite essences are “grounded, contained and comprehended [begriffen]” (GTU 241/48).

It is by means of Empfindung or sense experience that sentient beings are able to distinguish individuals from one another, including, in some instances, individuals that share the same essence. The form of experience is temporality, which is to say that whatever is directly experienced occurs “now”, or at the moment in time to which we refer as “the present”. Experience, in other words, is essentially transitory, and its contents are incommunicable. What we experience are the perceivable features of individual objects. It is through the act of thinking that we are able to identify those features through the possession of which different individuals belong to the same species, with the other members of which they share these essential features in common.

Unlike sense experience, thought is essentially communicable. Thinking is not an activity performed by the individual person qua individual. It is the activity of spirit, to which Hegel famously referred in the Phenomenology as “‘I’ that is ‘We’ and ‘We’ that is ‘I’” (Hegel [1807] 1977: 110). Pure spirit is nothing but this thinking activity, in which the individual thinker participates without himself (or herself) being the principal thinking agent. That thoughts present themselves to the consciousness of individual thinking subjects in temporal succession is due not to the nature of thought itself, but to the nature of individuality, and to the fact that individual thinking subjects, while able to participate in the life of spirit, do not cease in doing so to exist as corporeally distinct entities who remain part of nature, and are thus not pure spirit.

A biological species is both identical with, and distinct from, the individual organisms of which it is composed. The species has no existence apart form these individual organisms, and yet the perpetuation of the species involves the perpetual generation and destruction of these particular individuals. Similarly, Spirit has no existence apart from the existence of individual self-conscious persons in whom Spirit becomes conscious of itself (i.e., constitutes itself as Spirit). Just as the life of a biological species only appears in the generation and destruction of individual organisms, so the life of Spirit involves the generation and destruction of these individual persons. Viewed in this light, Feuerbach maintains, the death of the individual is necessitated by the life of infinite Spirit.

Death is just the withdrawal and departure of your objectivity from your subjectivity, which is eternally living activity and therefore everlasting and immortal. (GTU 323/111)

Arguing thus, he urges his readers to acknowledge and accept the irreversibility of their individual mortality so that, in doing so, they might come to an awareness of the immortality of their species-essence, and thus to knowledge of their true self, which is not the individual person with whom they are accustomed to identifying themselves. They will then be in a position to recognize that, while “the shell of death is hard, its kernel is sweet” (GTU 205/20), and that the true belief in immortality is

a belief in the infinity of Spirit and in the everlasting youth of humanity, in the inexhaustible love and creative power of Spirit, in its eternally unfolding itself into new individuals out of the womb of its plenitude and granting new beings for the glorification, enjoyment, and contemplation of itself. (GTU 357/137)

In light of the emphasis placed in his later works on the pressing existential needs of the embodied individual subject, it should be noted that, during his early idealistic phase, Feuerbach was strongly committed to a theoretical ideal of philosophy according to which contemplation of, and submersion in, God is the highest ethical act of which human beings are capable. Whereas, in his later works, Feuerbach would seek to compel philosophy

to come down from its divine and self-sufficient blissfulness in thought and open its eyes to human misery, (GPZ 264/3)

here he spoke instead of

the painful whimpering of the sick and the last moans of the dying as victory songs of the species [in which it] celebrates its reality and victorious lordship over the single phenomenon. (GTU 302/ 95)

3. Feuerbach as Historian of Philosophy

The understanding of reason as one and universal that underlies the works discussed in the preceding section also informs the approach taken by Feuerbach to the history of philosophy in the three previously mentioned books, and in a series of lectures, that he produced during the 1830s.[13] In his lectures on the history of modern philosophy, Feuerbach emphasizes that philosophical reflection is an activity to which human beings are driven. The history of the philosophical systems that this activity has produced, he maintains, is conceived only subjectively, and thus inadequately, so long as it is regarded as the history of the opinions of individual thinkers. Because thinking is a species-activity, the philosophical systems that have arisen in the course of the history of philosophy should be regarded as necessary standpoints of reason itself. The Idea is not something first produced by philosophical reflection. Rather, the individual thinker, to the extent the he or she succeeds in transcending his or her individuality, comes to function as an instrument or organ through which the Idea actualizes one of its moments, which is later reproduced in the consciousness of the historian of philosophy. The activity of the Idea is experienced subjectively as inspiration (Begeisterung). In producing itself, the Idea does not pass from nonbeing into being, but rather from one state of being (being in itself) to another (being for itself). The Idea produces itself by determining itself, and human consciousness is the medium of its self-actualization.

Reason is nothing but the self-activity of the eternal, infinite idea, whether in art or religion or philosophy, but this activity is always the activity of the Idea in a particular determination and thus also at a particular time, for it is precisely according to the particular determinations of the idea that enter successively into human consciousness that we differentiate the periods and epochs of history. (VGP 11)

The emergence of new philosophical systems results, on this view, from a necessity that is both internal and external. Certain philosophical ideas are only capable of being conceived and articulated under specific historical conditions. Just as it was only possible for Christianity to appear at that point in history when the ties that bound family and nation in Greco-Roman antiquity were dissolving, so it was only possible for modern philosophy to appear under specific historical conditions. Feuerbach locates the beginning of the history of modern philosophy at the point where the modern spirit first begins to distinguish itself from the medieval spirit. The dominant principle of the medieval period was the Judeo-Christian, monotheistic principle, according to which God is conceived as an omnipotent person through an act of whose will the material world was created from nothing (ex nihilo). It is because nature, as conceived from this standpoint, is excluded from the divine substance, according to Feuerbach, that medieval thought showed so little interest in the investigation of nature. It is only where the substantiality of nature begins to be rediscovered that the spirit of modernity distinguishes itself from the medieval spirit. This occurs most clearly where matter comes to be regarded as an attribute of the divine substance, so that God is no longer conceived of as a being distinct from nature but rather as the immutable and eternal imminent cause from which the plenitude of finite shapes in nature pours forth. This happens first among the nature philosophers of the Italian Renaissance, and subsequently in the speculative reflections of Jakob Böhme and in the system of Spinoza. Indeed, it is one distinctive feature of Feuerbach’s view of the history of modern philosophy that he thinks of it as beginning, not with Descartes, but with the nature philosophers of the Italian Renaissance. Feuerbach insists upon the speculative significance of Bacon’s philosophy of nature. It is precisely in subjecting nature to experimentation, and thereby to rational comprehension, that spirit raises itself above nature. But while Feuerbach emphasizes the philosophical importance of experience in the modern rediscovery of nature, he nevertheless insists that empiricism lacks a “principle” of its own. Later he will speak of the need for an alliance between German metaphysics and “the anti-scholastic, sanguine principle of French sensualism and materialism” (VT 254–255/165, emphasis in the original).

Feuerbach’s conviction that Christian faith is inimical to reason and philosophy was strengthened by his own studies of the history of modern philosophy, especially his studies of Leibniz and Bayle. As previously noted, his monographs on these figures were written during the period of controversy following the appearance of Strauss’s Life of Jesus. Toward the end of the 1830s, the Young Hegelians were increasingly opposed on two fronts: on the one hand, by right-wing Hegelians such as Friedrich Göschel, who insisted upon the compatibility of Hegelianism and Protestant orthodoxy, and, on the other, by representatives of the so-called “Positive Philosophy”, who, taking their inspiration from the late Schelling, identified the personality of God as disclosed in the Christian revelation as the supreme metaphysical principle (cf. Breckman 1999 and Gooch 2011). It is in light of these developments that, beginning in the Leibniz monograph, Feuerbach sought increasingly to distinguish from one another, and to demonstrate the incompatibility of, what he refers to there as “the philosophical standpoint” and “the theological standpoint”, respectively. Feuerbach regards the theological standpoint as “practical” because it imagines God as a being separate from the world, upon which he acts according to purposes similar to those that guide the actions of human beings, rather than conceiving the world as a necessary, and hence rationally intelligible, consequence of the divine nature. To be sure, for Leibniz, there is nothing arbitrary about the divine will. God’s will is determined by his infinite wisdom and goodness, which compel him to choose to create the best possible world. But this attempt to synthesize rational necessity and divine sovereignty remains in Feuerbach’s view an unacceptable compromise. Like Tycho Brahe, who sought to combine the Ptolemaic and Copernican astronomies, he thinks Leibniz sought to reconcile the irreconcilable. Feuerbach took Leibniz’s theory of monads to be an original philosophical position that offers a genuinely novel conception of substance, and an alternative to the mechanistic-mathematical Cartesian account of motion, and thus constitutes an organic link in the developmental sequence of historical philosophical systems. He criticized Leibniz, however, for not having derived the unity or harmony of the monads from the nature of the monads themselves, and for appealing instead to a theological representation of God as an alien, external power who achieves this harmonization miraculously, and hence, inexplicably.

Although, considered superficially, Feuerbach’s study of Bayle is a continuation of the line of inquiry pursued in his earlier historical monographs, closer inspection confirms Rawidowicz’s observation that this book marks an important turning point in his intellectual development (Rawidowicz 1964: 62–62). The book is full of digressions that go on for many pages without making any reference to Bayle, which can produce an impression that it lacks a clearly defined focus. In fact Feuerbach is here moving toward, and building a case for, a claim that he articulates more explicitly in succeeding years, namely, that the “practical negation” of Christianity is a fait accompli insofar as the scientific, economic, aesthetic, ethical and political values and institutions that are constitutive of modern European culture are incompatible with the demands of authentic Christian faith as expressed in the Bible and in the writings of patristic and medieval authors, who are either indifferent or inimical to the scientific investigation of nature, the acquisition of wealth, the pursuit of artistic creativity as an end in itself, and attempts to establish ethical and political norms on the basis of universally valid rational principles rather than the authority of revelation or of the Church.

Although the Protestant Reformation, in its rejection of clerical celibacy, its affirmation of the vocation of the laity, and its separation of temporal and spiritual authority, resolved the contradiction between the spirit and the flesh that was characteristic of medieval Catholicism, Feuerbach argues, it failed to resolve the contradiction between faith and reason, or theology and philosophy. Bayle’s historical significance for Feuerbach consists in his uncompromising exposure of this contradiction, which, because it was so deeply rooted in Bayle’s own character, he himself could only resolve by embracing fideism. Feuerbach sought to further expose this contraction in his 1839 essay, “On Philosophy and Christianity”, in which he for the first time publicly repudiated the Hegelian claim that philosophy affirms in the form of conceptual thinking the same truths affirmed by religion in the form of sensible representations.

4. The Critique of Christianity

In a section of the preface to the second edition of The Essence of Christianity (1843) that Eliot omitted from her translation, Feuerbach reveals that he had sought in this book to achieve two things: First, to attack the Hegelian claim for the identity of religious and philosophical truth by showing that Hegel succeeds in reconciling religion with philosophy only by robbing religion of its most distinctive content. Second,

to place the so-called positive philosophy in a most fatal light by showing that the original of its idolatrous image of God [Götzenbild] is man, that flesh and blood belong to personality essentially. (WC 10–11)

Appreciation of each of these objectives requires further clarification of the historical context in which Feuerbach’s book appeared, namely one year after the ascension to the Prussian throne of the Romantic conservative, Friedrich Wilhelm IV. The new king’s inner circle of advisers consisted of devout aristocrats closely associated with the neo-Pietist Awakening, who sought to establish a German-Christian state as a bulwark against the influence of subversive ideas on the continent. 1840 also saw the death of the Prussian minister of culture, Karl vom Stein zum Altenstein, who had been a supporter of the Hegelian cause and a bearer of the hopes of the Young Hegelians both for academic advancement and for a Prussian state informed by a progressive Protestant ethos amenable to the freedom of theoretical inquiry. The wedge driven by the outcry surrounding the appearance of Strauss’s book between the right and left wings of the Hegelian camp made this “center” position increasingly untenable. The policies of Altenstein’s successor, including the appointment, in 1841, of Schelling to the chair in Berlin formerly occupied by Hegel, were aimed instead at slaying the “dragonseed” of Hegelian pantheism in the universities under Prussian jurisdiction (cf. Pinkard 2002: 317–332).

By the time Feuerbach published his most famous book, The Essence of Christianity (1841), in which he sought to develop “a philosophy of positive religion or revelation” (WC 3), he had begun to move away from his earlier idealistic pantheism.[14] That he nevertheless sought in this book to criticize both Hegelian speculative theology and the positive philosophy from “the same standpoint” taken by Spinoza in his Theologico-Political Treatise (VWR 16/9; cf. WC 10–11) has often been overlooked. At one point in the Treatise Spinoza observes that the biblical authors

imagined God as ruler, legislator, king, merciful, just, etc., despite the fact that all the latter are merely attributes of human nature and far removed from the divine nature. (Spinoza [1677] 2007: 63)

In Christianity, Feuerbach makes a similar distinction between the metaphysical and personal divine predicates. God considered as the theoretical object of rational reflection, or “God as God”, is a timeless and impassible entity that is unaffected by human suffering and ultimately indistinguishable from reason itself.

The consciousness of human nullity that is bound up with consciousness of this being is in no way a religious consciousness; it is much more characteristic of skeptics, materialists, naturalists and pantheists. (WC 89/44)

It is God’s personal predicates that concern the religious believer, for whom God exists, not as an object of theoretical contemplation, but of feeling, imagination, and prayerful supplication.

Whereas the metaphysical predicates, which “serve only as external points of support to religion” (WC 62/25), can be thought of as ones that apply to the first person of the Trinity (i.e., God in his abstract universality), the second person of the Trinity, by virtue of his having subjected himself, for the salvation of humanity, to a humble birth and an ignominious death, “is the sole, true, first person in religion” (WC 106/51). The doctrine of the Incarnation, Feuerbach argues against Hegel, is not, for the Christian believer, a symbolic representation of the eternal procession and return of infinite spirit into, and back from, its finite manifestations. It is rather “a tear of divine compassion [Mitleid]” (WC 102/50), and, as such, the act of a sacred heart that is able to sympathize with human suffering. That God was compelled by his love for humanity to renounce his divinity and become human Feuerbach takes as proof that “Man was already in God, was already God himself, before God became man” (ibid.), i.e., that belief in divine compassion involves the attribution or projection onto God of a moral sentiment that can only be experienced by a being capable of suffering, which “God as God” is not.

The Essence of Christianity is divided into two parts. In the first part, Feuerbach considers religion “in its agreement with the human essence” (WC 75). Here he argues that, when purportedly theological claims are understood in their proper sense, they are recognized as expressing anthropological, rather than theological, truths. That is, the predicates that religious believers apply to God are predicates that properly apply to the human species-essence of which God is an imaginary representation. In the second part, Feuerbach considers religion “in its contradiction with the human essence” (WC 316). Here he argues that, when theological claims are understood in the sense in which they are ordinarily taken (i.e., as referring to a non-human divine person), they are self-contradictory.[15] In early 1842, Feuerbach still preferred that his views be presented to the public under the label “anthropotheism” rather than “atheism” (GW v. 18, 164), emphasizing that his overriding purpose in negating “the false or theological essence of religion” had been to affirm its “true or anthropological essence”, i.e., the divinity of man.

Feuerbach begins The Essence of Christianity by proposing that, since human beings have religion and animals do not, the key to understanding religion must be directly related to whatever it is that most essentially distinguishes human beings from animals. This, he maintains, is the distinctive kind of consciousness that is involved in the cognition of universals.[16] A being endowed with such “species-consciousness” is able to take its own essential nature as an object of thought. The capacity for thought is conceived here as the capacity to engage in internal dialogue, and thus to be aware of oneself as containing both an I and a Thou (a generic other), so that, in the act of thinking, the human individual stands in a relation to his species in which non-human animals, and human beings qua biological organisms, are incapable of standing. When a human being is conscious of himself (or herself) as human, he is conscious of himself not only as a thinking being, but also as a willing and a feeling being.

The power of thinking is the light of knowledge [des Erkenntnis], the power of the will is the energy of character, the power of the heart is love. (WC 31/3)

These are not powers that the individual has at his or her disposal. They are rather powers that manifest themselves psychologically in the form of non-egoistic species-drives (Gattungstriebe) by which individuals periodically find themselves overwhelmed, especially those poets and thinkers in whose works the species-essence is most clearly instantiated.[17] Such manifestations include the experiences of erotic and platonic love; the drive to knowledge; the experience of being moved by the emotion expressed in music; the voice of conscience, which compels us to moderate our desires to avoid infringing on the freedom of others; compassion; admiration; and the urge to overcome our own moral and intellectual limitations. The latter urge, Feuerbach contends, presupposes an awareness that our individual limitations are not limitations of the species-essence, which functions thus as the norm or ideal toward which the individual’s efforts at self-transcendence are directed.

The individual human being is limited both physically and morally. Our physical existence is limited in time and space. We are also limited—and often painfully aware of our being so—in our intellectual and moral capacities. But I only experience as a painful limitation my inability to be and do things that others of my kind are able to be and to do, so that, in recognizing my own limitations, I simultaneously recognize that they are not limitations of the species. If they were, either I would not be aware of them at all, or I would not experience my awareness of them as painful. For example, I only reprove myself for cowardice because I am aware of the bravery of others, which I myself lack, and for my stinginess because I am aware of the generosity of others, which I myself lack. The experience of conscience—taken in the broad sense as an awareness of one’s moral and intellectual shortcomings and inadequacies—thus presupposes species-consciousness in the form of an awareness of qualities that one finds oneself lacking but can imagine oneself, under other circumstances, possessing.

Feuerbach’s central claim in The Essence of Christianity is that Christian theism is predicated upon an alienated form of human self-consciousness wherein human beings relate themselves to their own human species-essence as though it were a being distinct from themselves. Although, in developing this claim, Feuerbach was clearly influenced by Hegel’s account of Unhappy Consciousness in the Phenomenology, Ameriks’ contention that

Feuerbach’s philosophical doctrines […] can be understood as little more than a filling out of the details of Hegel’s scathing account of orthodox Christianity as a form of “unhappy consciousness” (Ameriks 2000: 259)

is problematic for several reasons. First, it overlooks the likelihood of Hegel’s having understood his analysis of Unhappy Consciousness to apply to the otherworldliness he associated with medieval Catholicism, or perhaps to otherworldly religion more generally, but not in any case to the type of Protestantism that he regarded as “the religion of the modern age” (Hegel [1807] 1977: 14), and in which he found the sacred and the secular reconciled. Second, it overlooks the fact that Feuerbach’s appropriation of themes found in Hegel’s account of Unhappy Consciousness occurs in the context of an explicit, albeit incomplete, repudiation of Hegel’s philosophy of spirit. Unlike Hegel, who conceives of Unhappy Consciousness as a moment in the development of human self-consciousness that is also a moment in the coming-to-be-for-itself of the absolute, Feuerbach has by this time reached the conclusion that one cannot distinguish absolute spirit from “subjective spirit or the essence of man” without, in the end, continuing to occupy “the old standpoint of theology” (VT 246–247). Third, it overlooks the significance of Feuerbach’s emphasis on the importance, for grasping the essence of religion, of precisely those subjective aspects of religious consciousness (imagination and feeling) that Hegel himself regarded as inessential or of secondary importance. Finally, in connection with this third point, it overlooks the significance of Feuerbach’s agreement with Spinoza against Hegel that “faith […] requires not so much truth as piety” (Spinoza [1677] 2007: 184).

In a short essay, published 1842, in which he sought to clarify the difference between his own approach to the philosophy of religion and Hegel’s, Feuerbach suggested that this difference is most evident in the relations in which each of them stands to Schleiermacher, who famously defined religion as the feeling of utter dependence. Whereas Hegel had “rebuked” Schleiermacher for abdicating the truth-claims of the Christian faith by taking the articles of faith as expressions of this feeling, Feuerbach says he does so only because Schleiermacher was prevented by his “theological prejudice” from drawing the unavoidable conclusion that, “if feeling is subjectively what religion is chiefly about, then God is objectively nothing but the essence of feeling” (B 230). These comments fail to acknowledge that, in The Essence of Christianity, Feuerbach had conceived of God as an alienated projection of the human species-essence, which was said to include not only feeling, but reason and will, as well. They nevertheless reflect Feuerbach’s generally overlooked deployment against Hegel of resources derived from the philosophies of feeling of Schleiermacher and Jacobi,[18] and they indicate the direction in which his thinking about religion continued to move after the publication of The Essence of Christianity, namely, away from an emphasis on species-consciousness conceived along Hegelian lines, and toward what Harvey has aptly referred to as the “naturalist-existentialist” themes that predominate in his later writings on religion (cf. Harvey 1995). These are discussed in Section 6 below.

5. The “New” Philosophy

In notes for lectures on the history of modern philosophy that he delivered in 1835/36, Feuerbach wrote that idealism is the “one true philosophy”, and that “what is not spirit is nothing” (VGP 139). Around the same time, he vigorously defended the “absolute method” employed by Hegel in his Logic against its critics (GW 8:73). Feuerbach himself referred to his early philosophical “standpoint” as “the standpoint of pantheistic identity” (GW 10:291). His efforts to extricate himself from this standpoint were ongoing over the course of two decades. The extent to which they ultimately succeeded is debatable. Whereas the young Marx saw Feuerbach as “the true conqueror of the old philosophy”, the neo-Kantian historian of materialism, F.A. Lange, could find in his “new” philosophy only another iteration of the philosophy of spirit, “which we encounter here in the form of a philosophy of sensuousness” that lacks materialistic bona fides (Marx 1844: 80; Lange [1866] 1974: v. 2, 522).[19]

In 1839, the same year that Feuerbach made his first public break with Hegelianism in the essay, “Toward a Critique of the Hegelian Philosophy”, he was still able to write that he missed in speculative philosophy “the element of the empirical, and in empiricism the element of speculation”, and to describe his own method as an effort to conjoin both kinds of philosophical “activity” into a form of “skepticism or critique just as much of the merely speculative as of the merely empirical” (GW 9:12). It was only in 1842, between the time of the publication of the first (1841) and second (1843) editions of The Essence of Christianity (which happens also to have been a time of draconian censorship and police surveillance) that Feuerbach became convinced of the need to make a “radical break” with the speculative philosophical tradition.[20] This prompted him to report in the preface to the second edition of his famous book that “the Idea” retained for him only a practical significance as “faith in the historical future” and in the triumph of truth and virtue. In the realm of theoretical philosophy proper, and “in complete opposition to the Hegelian philosophy,” he now considered himself a realist and a materialist (WC 15).

In two brief philosophical manifestos published in 1842 and 1843, respectively, Feuerbach sought to “deduce”, through an internal criticism of the “old” philosophy (culminating in the Hegelian system), the “principles” (Grundsätze) that would lay the foundation for a “new”, naturalistic “philosophy of the future”. After the publication of these two manifestos, however, he turned his attention back to religion, claiming in the foreword to the first volume of his collected works (1846) that it was only in his book on The Essence of Faith According to Luther (1844) that he came to appreciate the “truth and essentiality of sensuousness [Sinnlichkeit]” (GW 10:187), and thereby to overcome the “contradiction” between speculation and empiricism in which his position in The Essence of Christianity had remained mired. It is certainly the case that a number of concepts that are central to the philosophical anthropology with which Feuerbach sought to replace the “old” philosophy, including the effort to “naturalize freedom” undertaken in his final writings, were first introduced and developed in writings on religion published in the 1840s and 1850s. Because of this, it’s difficult to neatly separate a discussion of Feuerbach’s “new” philosophy from his later theorizing about religion. Be that as it may, the first of these topics will be explored in this section and the second in the succeeding section. Feuerbach’s preliminary efforts in his last active years to develop a drive psychology and to naturalize ethics will be considered briefly in the final section.

One thing that distinguishes Feuerbach’s “new” philosophy from other versions of modern empiricism and materialism is his claim to have derived the “principles” of this philosophy through a dialectical inversion of the Hegelian system. In the “Theses” Feuerbach argues that, by “positing” the human essence “outside of man” in the ethereal realm of absolute spirit, the Hegelian philosophy perpetuates the theological alienation of human beings from their own essence, which he now explicitly equates with subjective spirit. The re-appropriation of this abstracted essence by finite, corporeal human subjects cannot be achieved “positively” [auf positive Weg], but only through a “total negation” of the Hegelian philosophy that will reveal once and for all the incarnational telos of the history of philosophy and humanity (VT 247). In this way, Feuerbach thinks, the hidden “truth of Christianity” (VT 263) will finally be realized in the form of an atheistic humanism that renounces the fantastical consolations of religion in order to embrace the historical tasks of human self-realization and the creation of new political and cultural institutions that will be conducive to it.

In 1846, Feuerbach published a number of “fragments” from his unpublished papers intended to document the course of his philosophical development. One of these fragments, entitled “Doubt”, and dated 1827–28 (which is the time when Feuerbach was writing his doctoral dissertation) seems already to anticipate Feuerbach’s later critique of Hegel. In this fragment, we find him questioning the transition from the first to the second part of Hegel’s tripartite philosophical system, i.e., the transition from the Logic to the Philosophy of Nature. The conceptual process traced by Hegel in the Logic, whereby the categories of thought are successively deduced from one another, is driven by the negativity of the logical determinations of each of these categories, until the process culminates in the absolute Idea. But what negativity remains within the absolute Idea to propel the transition from thought to being, Feuerbach wonders, unless it is that the purportedly “absolute” Idea remains unrealized, and hence incomplete, until it becomes incarnate in the realm of the sensuous, i.e., nature? In that case, however, nature itself (as the realm of the sensuous) is the hidden truth of the Idea.

The speculative claim for the identity of thought and being was the cornerstone of the Hegelian philosophy in which Feuerbach finds the “old” philosophy perfected. One of the principal “theses” of the new philosophy is its repudiation of this claim. Feuerbach argues that, because the concept of pure being with which Hegel begins the Logic is an abstraction, in the end Hegel succeeds only in reconciling thought with the thought of being, rather than with being itself, which is the “other” of thought. The new philosophy affirms that being is distinct from, and prior to, thought, and that it is as various as is the panoply of individually existing beings, from which it cannot be intelligibly distinguished.

Thought comes from being, but being does not come from thought. […] The essence of being as being [i.e., in contrast to the mere thought of being] is the essence of nature. (VT 258/168)

To say that something exists in actuality is to say that it exists not only as a figment of someone’s imagination, or as a mere determination of their consciousness, but for itself, independently of consciousness. “Being is something in which not only I but also others, above all also the object itself, participate” (GPZ 304/40). In affirming the distinction between thought and being, repudiating Hegel’s critique of sense certainty, and affirming the claim that nature exists through itself, independently of thought, the new philosophy also affirms the reality of time and space, insisting that real existence is finite, determinate, corporeal existence. Whereas, in his lectures on logic and metaphysics, and in his writings from the mid-1830’s, Feuerbach had defended the Hegelian method of the logical Entwicklung or development of the various moments of the absolute Idea, he now argues that the concept of development entails or presupposes temporality, so that a non-temporal developmental process is a contradiction in terms. If speculative philosophy is the philosophy of the infinite, the new philosophy aims to disclose the truth of finitude by reversing the path taken by speculation from the infinite to the finite, and from the indeterminate to the determinate (VT 249).

Although, in the “Theses”, Feuerbach refers to “speculative philosophy” as having been inaugurated by Spinoza, revived by Schelling, and perfected by Hegel (VT 243), in Principles he locates the origin of this tradition in the Cartesian philosophy, and specifically in “the abstraction from the sensuous [Sinnlichkeit], from matter” (GPZ 275/ 13) through which the conception of the cogito first arose. Much of the content of Principles consists of a truncated survey of the history of modern philosophy that purports to trace, through several dialectical inversions, a necessary development from the rationalistic theism of Descartes and Leibniz through the pantheism of Spinoza to the idealism of Kant and Fichte, culminating in Hegel’s philosophy of identity. What this survey is primarily intended to show is that the fundamental tendency of this development has been toward the actualization and humanization of God or, alternatively, toward

the divinization of the real, of the materially existent—of materialism, empiricism, realism, humanism—[and] the negation of theology. (GPZ 285/ 22)

This survey is followed by a short “demonstration” of the historical necessity of the new philosophy, which takes the form of a critique of Hegel, and by the enumeration of several doctrines that distinguish the new philosophy from the old.

Whereas earlier rationalists had conceived of God as existing prior to, and independently of, nature, and as possessing perfect knowledge untainted by materiality; and had, further, “placed the effort and labor of abstraction and of self-liberation from the sensuous only in themselves”, Feuerbach views Hegel as having been the first to transform “this subjective activity into the self-activity of the divine being.” Thus, for Hegel, like the heroes of pagan antiquity, God (or the Idea) must “fight through virtue for his divinity”, and only comes to be for himself (or itself) at the end of a lengthy and laborious process (GPZ 296/32). This process, as it is described by Hegel at the end of the Science of Logic, involves the logical Idea

freely releas[ing] itself … [into] the externality of space and time existing absolutely on its own without the moment of subjectivity. (Hegel [1812–1816] 1969: 843)

What Feuerbach refers to as “the liberation of the absolute from matter” is achieved as spirit gradually distinguishes itself from nature before attaining to the awareness of itself as absolute. Here, Feuerbach notes, “matter is indeed posited in God, that is, it is posited as God”, and to posit matter as God is to affirm atheism and materialism, but insofar as the self-externalization of the Idea in nature is superseded in the course of the coming-to-be-for-itself of the Idea in the forms of subjective, objective and absolute spirit, this negation of “theology” (i.e., of God conceived as an immaterial being distinct from nature) is negated in turn. This is what Feuerbach seems to have in mind when he refers to Hegel’s philosophy as

the last magnificent attempt to restore Christianity, which was lost and wrecked, through philosophy … by identifying it with the negation of Christianity. (GPZ 297/34)

The new philosophy categorically affirms the embodied nature of human subjectivity and self-consciousness. Whereas the old philosophy conceived of the cogito as “an abstract and merely a thinking being to whose essence the body does not belong” (GPZ 319–320/ 54), the new philosophy affirms that, as a thinking subject, “I am a real, sensuous being and, indeed, the body in its totality is my ego, my essence itself” (ibid.). Although it is not entirely clear just what Feuerbach could mean in claiming that “the body in its totality is my ego”, elsewhere he says that to affirm that the ego is corporeal “has no other meaning than that the ego is not only active but also passive … [and that] the passivity of the ego is the activity of the object” in such a way that “the object belongs to the innermost being of the ego” (AP 150/142). Object and ego are thus, to use a Heideggerian term, gleichursprunglich or “equiprimordial”.

It is through the body that the ego is not just an ego but also an object. To be embodied is to be in the world; it means to have so many senses, i.e., so many pores and naked surfaces. The body is nothing but the porous ego. (AP 151/143)

If philosophical thought is to avoid remaining “a prisoner of the ego”, Feuerbach insists, it “must begin with its antithesis, with its alter ego” (AP 146/138). The antithesis of thought is sensation. Whereas, in thinking, it is the object that is determined by the thinking activity of the subject, in sense experience, Feuerbach insists (without much argument and with apparently little concern for problems that preoccupied the British empiricists and Kant), the consciousness of the subject is determined by the activity of the object. The object can thus be said to function as a subject in its own right. What makes it possible for the ego to posit the object is only that, in positing the object as something distinct from itself, the ego is at the same time posited by the object. If, however, the

the object is not only something posited, but also (to continue in this abstract language) something which itself posits, then it is clear that the presuppositionless ego, which excludes the object from itself and negates it, is only a presupposition of the subjective ego against which the object must protest. (AP 147/ 139)

It is not to the I, but to the not-I within the I, that real, sensuous objects are given. Memory is what first enables us to transform objects of sense experience into objects of thought, so that what is no longer present to the senses can nevertheless be recalled to consciousness. In doing so, it allows us to transcend the limitations of time and space in thought, and to construct, from a multitude of distinct sense experiences, a conception of the universe as a whole, and of our relations to the various other beings that exist in it. Feuerbach continues to affirm that, unlike the animals, “man” is a universal, cosmopolitan being. However, he now maintains that we need not ascribe to human beings any unique supersensible faculty in order to affirm this truth, since

wherever a sense is elevated above the limits of particularity and its bondage to needs, it is elevated to an independent and theoretical significance and dignity; universal sense is intelligence [Verstand]; universal sensibility, mentality [Geistigkeit]. (GPZ 336/69)

What distinguishes humans from non-human animals is thus not our possession of non-natural powers, either of reason or volition, but the fact that human beings are “absolute sensualists” whose collective powers of observation and recollection extend, in principle, to the whole of nature.

6. The Later Theory of Religion

Feuerbach is most often associated with the slogan underlying The Essence of Christianity, according to which “theology is anthropology” (insofar as the predicates attributed by Christians to God are in fact predicates of the human species-essence). In a number of works on religion published in the 1840s and 1850s, however, Feuerbach advanced explanations of the origin of religious concepts and beliefs that are strikingly different from, and apparently at odds with, the more familiar position put forward in that book. The works in which Feuerbach advanced these new theoretical initiatives include the previously referenced Luther book (1844), a short book entitled The Essence of Religion (1846), the essay, “Belief in Immortality from the Standpoint of Anthropology” (1847), the Lectures on the Essence of Religion originally delivered in 1848–9, but first published in 1851 (hereafter Lectures), and the Theogony (1857). The question of the relationship between the account of religion contained in The Essence of Christianity and the views put forward in these later writings is a complex one. The most thorough investigation of this question is to be found in Harvey (1995), where Harvey distinguishes five different “explanatory principles” employed by Feuerbach in The Essence of Christianity, among which he divides those that are conceived along Hegelian lines from those that tend instead toward the “existentialist-naturalist” themes which predominate in Feuerbach’s later writings on religion (Harvey 1995: 68–69). Harvey’s thesis is that, in his later writings, Feuerbach in fact develops an alternative, bipolar model of religion that is both incompatible with, and more compelling than, the more familiar theory presented in The Essence of Christianity. Whereas, in that work, Feuerbach had proposed that God is an alienated projection of the human species-essence to whom the “perfections” of the latter are mistakenly attributed, the new bipolar model seeks instead to explain the origin and persistence of religious beliefs and practices, Christian and non-Christian alike, in terms of their role in meeting deep-seated psychological needs resulting from the contingency and finitude of embodied human subjects seeking to preserve their existence and to expand their natural powers.

In a previously cited essay published in 1842, in which Feuerbach sought to clarify the differences between Hegel’s philosophy of religion and his own, he referred readers seeking to evaluate his argument in The Essence of Christianity to his “Critique of the So-Called Positive Philosophy”, published in the Halle Annals in December, 1838 (B 235). It was there that Feuerbach first put forward the claim that all the “determinations” (Bestimmungen) ascribed by the positive philosophy to God are determinations either of “the essence of nature” or of “the essence of man” (KPP 204). This claim is consistent with subsequent statements of Feuerbach’s, including his observation in Principles that “God, in the theological sense, is God only as long as he is conceived as a being distinguished from the being of man and nature” (GPZ 280/19). Here the suggestion seems to be that, if it can be shown that attributes ascribed by theists to God are attributes derived either from human consciousness or from nature, then it will have been shown that God has no existence apart from the existence of human consciousness and of nature. Thus, even if it is true, as Harvey is probably correct to argue, that the bipolar model of religion found in the later writings does not merely supplement, but replaces, the position taken by Feuerbach in The Essence of Christianity, these two distinct explanatory enterprises can nevertheless be understood as alternative strategies for making good on Feuerbach’s original claim that the predicates of divinity can be reduced to predicates derived either from the essence of nature or from the human essence. It should be noted that, while Harvey is correct in pointing out that the human species-essence is rarely mentioned in Feuerbach’s later writings, by 1851 Feuerbach had nevertheless still not abandoned the claim that God, conceived as a personal being distinct from nature, “is nothing other than the deified and objectified spiritual essence of man” (VWR 28/21).

As Rawidowicz (1964: 113) and Ascheri (1964: 62) have both observed, the break with the speculative tradition that Feuerbach signaled in the “Preliminary Theses” and in Principles corresponds to a noticeable change in his stance toward religion, if not in his estimation of the truth-value of traditional doctrinal claims. In his polemical essays of the late 1830s, and in The Essence of Christianity, Feuerbach had unfavorably contrasted the “egoistic”, practical standpoint of religion, which he associated with the unrestricted subjectivity of feeling (Gemüt) and imagination (Phantasie), with the impartial, theoretical standpoint of philosophy, which he associated with reason and objectivity. At the end of Principles, however, he informs his readers that the new philosophy, without ceasing to be theoretical, nevertheless has a fundamentally practical tendency, and that in this respect it “assumes the place of religion” and “is in truth itself religion” (GPZ 341/73). This line of thought is developed somewhat further in an unpublished manuscript where Feuerbach observes that, in order to replace religion, philosophy must itself become religion in the sense that “it must, in a way suited to its own nature, incorporate the essence of religion or the advantage that religion possesses over philosophy” (NV 123/148). Here, Feuerbach does not say what he takes religion’s “advantage” over philosophy to be, but in the Lectures he claims that the difference between philosophy and religion can be reduced to “the simple statement that religion is sensuous and aesthetic, while philosophy is nonsensuous and abstract” (VWR 20/13). Religion’s “advantage” over the old philosophy, then, is presumably it’s implicit acknowledgment of the “truth and essentiality of sensuousness” and of human finitude, which it is the task of the new philosophy to articulate explicitly.

When Feuerbach’s Luther book was first published in 1844, its subtitle suggested that it was conceived of as an addendum to The Essence of Christianity. Because, in the first edition of that book, Feuerbach had relied heavily on quotations from patristic and medieval works to support his claims, some theological critics had retorted that, while Feuerbach’s account of Christianity might apply to Catholicism, it did not apply to Protestantism. It was in responding to these critics that Feuerbach turned his attention to Luther, and, in doing so, introduced a number of concepts and themes that had not figured prominently in The Essence of Christianity, but which he continued to develop in his later writings, including both those devoted to religion, as well as those devoted to other topics. Foremost among these concepts and themes are Seligkeit (blessedness or perfect happiness) and the Glückseligkeitstrieb or drive-to-happiness; “human egoism” or human self-love; the feeling of dependence on nature; and the powerful, theogonic (i.e., god-originating) wish to be free from the limitations of nature by which the human drive-to-happiness is restricted.

Feuerbach begins the Luther book by conceding that no doctrine would seem more clearly to contradict the central claim advanced in The Essence of Christianity, namely, that Christians worship the human species-essence, than does Luther’s doctrine. That doctrine seems, on the contrary, to be the epitome of human self-abnegation insofar as it emphasizes the depravity and contemptibleness of human nature in contrast to the perfection and glory of the divine nature. This appearance, however, is deceptive, on Feuerbach’s account; for, while it’s true that, whatever Luther takes from human beings, he gives to God, since all that belongs to God belongs to Christ, and all that belongs to Christ belongs to the Christian, it is only on the surface that Luther’s doctrine is dehumanizing. Whereas, in The Essence of Christianity, Feuerbach had contrasted the egoism and intolerance of faith (which he associated with the false, theological essence of religion) with the altruism and universality love (which he associated with the true, human essence of religion), in the Luther book he emphasizes instead that Christian faith is faith in a God who is love. Since, however, it is human beings who are the principal object of this love, Luther’s emphasis on the comptemptability of human nature turns out to be an indirect form of human self-love or self-affirmation. The Christian believer affirms the existence of, as well as his or her confidence in, the goodness of God, who has promised him or her blessedness or freedom from the painful limitations of mortality. It is only because the Christian believer thus “completes and satisfies himself in God” (WGL 363/46) that God is credited with the possession of all that human beings lack. Luther, with his emphasis on God’s being pro nobis or “for us”, was “the first to let out the secret of the Christian faith” (WGL 366/50), which is, at bottom, the assurance

that God is by his very nature concerned with man, … that God is a being not for himself or against us, but rather for us, a good being, good to us men. (WGL 366–67/51)

From this recognition, Feuerbach goes on to develop an analysis of the divine attributes, which he interprets in this context as “means to the end of benevolence” (WGL 368/52). Here, and in Feuerbach’s later writings, the concepts of blessedness and the drive-to-happiness seem to play a role analogous to the one played by the concept of the species-essence in The Essence of Christianity. Whereas, in the latter work, divine attributes such as omniscience and perfection were said to be attributes of the human species-essence, in the section on Seligkeit toward the end of the Theogony, where Feuerbach develops a line of thought first introduced in the Luther book, many of these same attributes are said to characterize the state of blessedness itself. “God is only the foreword, blessedness the text of Christianity. Or: The mystery of divinity is first unveiled and revealed in the gospel of blessedness” (T 308). The thesis here is that the attributes of the Christian God are determined by the most fundamental wishes of the Christian believer. For example, God qua creator is first and foremost omnipotent, but omnipotence is ascribed to God only because it is necessary for God to be omnipotent in order for God to be able to exercise his benevolence toward the faithful by supplying them with what they lack, including eternal life. There is no lack that cannot be satisfied, and no ultimate harm that can befall, the person who is the object of the benevolence of an omnipotent being. On this account, the divine attributes are determined by human needs. These are determined, in turn, by the psycho-physical constitution of human beings as self-conscious subjects constrained by natural limitations from which they have an urgent wish to be liberated. In the final analysis, belief in divine omnipotence is said be motivated, not by any specific wish, but rather by “the unspecific over-all wish that there be in general no natural necessity; no limitations, no opposition to the human being and to human wishes” (WGL 372/59).

Feuerbach, whose conception of Seligkeit or blessedness seems to have been influenced by Augustine’s account of felicitas in The City of God, defines blessedness at one point as freedom from sin, sensual drives, “the oppression of matter”, death, and the limitations of nature in general (WGL 403/103). Whereas the God of Christianity had previously been identified by Feuerbach as an alienated projection of the human species-essence, here God is defined instead as the realized drive-to-happiness of the Christian believer. To say that belief in God is motivated or caused by the human drive-to-happiness is not necessarily to deny that attributes ascribed to God are attributes derived from human nature. It is, however, in any case to affirm that the ascription to God of the perfections of the human species-essence serves an underlying psychological need that is itself determined by the dependence of human beings upon nature, and their awareness of this dependence in the form of powerful hopes and fears that give rise to belief in supernatural agencies and efforts to secure their blessings.

Two years after the publication of the Luther book, Feuerbach published another short book entitled The Essence of Religion, the core ideas in which are further developed in the Lectures. Here, Feuerbach explains that, because Christians themselves do not worship such things as the sun and the moon, but instead worship “will, intelligence, consciousness as divine beings and powers” (VWR 27/20), he himself had “disregarded nature” in his account of Christianity (VWR, 26/19). This had given rise to certain unspecified but “preposterous” misunderstandings which he sought to correct by augmenting the slogan encapsulating his doctrine from “theology is anthropology” to “theology is anthropology ‘and physiology’” (VWR 28/21). This modification reflects a new emphasis in Feuerbach’s later writings on the ontological dependence of human consciousness upon the physical human organism, which itself exists only in relation to the natural order of which it is a part—a relation mediated, or, to be more precise, revealed, by the senses.

The Essence of Religion begins with the striking claims that 1) the feeling of dependence is the “ground” of religion, and that 2) the original object of this feeling, i.e., in the history of religion, is nature. Feuerbach defines the feeling of dependence as

the feeling or consciousness of man that he does not and cannot exist apart from a being that is distinct from himself, that he does not have himself to thank for his own existence. (WR 4)

This feeling can manifest itself negatively as fear, to which Feuerbach refers at one point as “a feeling of dependency on an object without which I am nothing, which has the power to destroy me” (VWR 39/31); but the feeling of dependent can also manifest itself positively in the form of celebratory joy and exaltation. Feuerbach finds both of these powerful emotions expressed in the act of sacrifice, which he takes to be the most characteristic practice of nature religions (as opposed, presumably, to prayer as the characteristic act of “spiritual”, i.e., monotheistic, religions). In addition to filling a “gap” in the argument put forward in The Essence of Christianity by emphasizing the dependence of “the human essence” upon “the essence of nature”, Feuerbach also sought in The Essence of Religion to identify features shared in common by what he calls “nature religions”, on the one hand, and “spiritual” religions like Christianity, on the other, and to clarify the relationship between these two kinds of religion. Feuerbach uses the term “nature religion” to refer both the pagan religions of classical antiquity, and the religions of various tribal peoples whose beliefs and practices were described for Feuerbach and his contemporaries by European travelers in journals such as Das Ausland, from which Feuerbach derived a number of the examples to which he refers in this book (cf. Tomasoni 1990: 10–11, 127–135).

While the feeling of dependence is said to be the “ground” of religion, what the act of sacrifice aims at, or seeks to achieve, is freedom from the restrictions of nature, or, alternatively, human independence. If blessedness is the condition of not being subjected to the restrictions imposed by nature on all finite, corporeal individuals subject to generation and corruption, then human blessedness can be regarded as the final goal (Endzweck) of religion (WR 34). The gods are the objects of worship, and the recipients of sacrifice, because they are the benefactors of human beings in the specific sense that they are imagined to have it in their power to satisfy fundamental human wishes, including the wish not to die. “Only a being who loves man and desires his happiness [Seligkeit] is an object of human worship, of religion” (VWR 71/60). The sacrificial act is motivated by the experience of need (Bedürfnis), which involves the simultaneous awareness both of one’s “non-being apart from nature”, and of one’s existence as a self-conscious being distinct from nature (WR 32). In the Lectures, Feuerbach claims that the feeling of dependence on nature is the only “truly universal” designation for the “psychological or subjective ground of religion” (VWR 39/31). This continues to be the case even after nature has ceased to be the locus of divinity, and the origin of the visible world is sought in the will of a transcendent creator who brought forth the world into being from nothing, and who is solely responsible for occurrences attributed by polytheists to a multitude of divine agencies. The objective correlates of the feeling of dependence, in the case of both polytheism and monotheism, are the really existing things and people who are the objects of various human needs, physical and psychological, at least some of which Feuerbach implicitly recognizes, especially in the Theogony, to be culturally determined.

Feuerbach’s description of the feeling of dependence as involving the awareness

that I am nothing without a not-I which is distinct from me yet intimately related to me, something other, which is at the same time my own being (VWR 350/311)

reflects his understanding of nature as the totality of “the beings [Wesen], things, [and] objects that man distinguishes from himself and his products” (WR 4). Nature, in other words, is coterminous with the non-human world, devoid of consciousness, will and sentiment. It includes such things as light, electricity, air, water, earth, and the plants and animals upon which the existence of human beings depends, but it also includes the human organism itself insofar as the effects produced by that organism are produced unconsciously and involuntary. Nature is the “cause and ground of man”; in human beings nature “becomes a personal, conscious, intelligent (verständiges) being” (VWR 29/21). To say that human beings are dependent upon nature is to say, among other things, that nature, which is devoid of consciousness and intention, is what has caused human beings to exist, and that the same physical processes that have produced the human brain have also produced human consciousness. While all organisms are dependent upon nature for their existence, human beings are distinguished from other organisms by the extent of their conscious awareness of this dependence. This awareness Feuerbach finds expressed in the earliest forms of cultic activity, including the earliest forms of nature religion focused, for example, on the changes of the seasons, and in the offering of sacrifice to divine beings associated with various aspects of the natural world. Although nature is the original object of religion, this goes unrecognized initially because human beings do not at first distinguish themselves from nature or vice versa. The forces of nature are instead personified, and naturally occurring events are attributed to the human-like motivations of spirits and gods. Religion, according to Feuerbach, exhibits the following contradiction: When it conceives of itself theistically, it mistakenly thinks of God as a thoroughly non-human being (i.e., one whose existence and attributes in no way depends on the existence and attributes of human beings), and when in conceives of itself as nature religion, it mistakenly attributes consciousness and will to what is in fact entirely non-human.

Further analysis of the feeling of the dependence leads Feuerbach to conclude that this feeling itself presupposes “egoism as the ultimate hidden ground of religion” (VWR 91–92/79). Here he reasons that, if human beings were not subject to powerful psychological drives which compel them to expand and develop their natural powers, including most fundamentally the drive-to-self-preservation, they would not experience the limitations imposed upon them by nature as painful and restricting. “Life is egoism” (EEWR 82) insofar as the fundamental drive of all living things, including the human organism, is the drive to self-preservation (Selbsterhaltungstrieb). Nevertheless, what Feuerbach calls “human egoism” doesn’t seem to be the same thing either as psychological egoism (the claim that everyone always acts from self-interest) or ethical egoism (the claim that “good” is whatever serves my own interests). Feuerbach writes that, by “human egoism” he means

man’s love for himself, that is, love of the human essence, the love that spurs him on to satisfy and develop all the impulses and tendencies without whose satisfaction and development he neither is nor can be a true, complete human being. (VWR 60–61/50)

This type of self-love, which warrants comparison with, but is not the same as, Rousseau’s amour de soi, encompasses love of one’s fellow human beings, apart from whom one cannot either cultivate or satisfy the ethical, intellectual and aesthetic impulses and capacities in which one’s essential humanity consists, and to whose well-being one’s own is thus inextricably linked.

Feuerbach’s book, Theogony according to the Sources of Classical, Hebrew and Christian Antiquity (1857), which is the product of six years of close engagement with Hebrew, Greek, and Latin texts from antiquity, exemplifies the vastness of Feuerbach’s humanistic erudition. Feuerbach considered it his “simplest, most complete, mature work” (GW 20: 292). It may not be a mere coincidence that the period of Feuerbach’s engagement in these philological labors was the same period when one of his closest correspondents was Emil Ernst Gottfried von Herder, the son of Johann Gottfried von Herder, whose introduction to the study of theology Feuerbach had read as a young man while he himself was learning Hebrew grammar in preparation for his matriculation in the theological faculty at the University of Heidelberg. Like the older Herder, who conceived of the poetry of the Hebrew Bible as a product of the genius of humanity in its childhood, Feuerbach turned to the Iliad and the Odyssey, which he thought of as the Urstätten or “original sites” of anthropology, and to the Hebrew scriptures, for clues to the origins of belief in the gods and in God. Large portions of the book consist either of 1) careful philological analyses of individual passages selected, for example, from the Iliad or the Odyssey, or from the creation accounts in Genesis, or else of a verse from Pindar or Ovid, or a passage from the New Testament; or 2) quotations from a wide range of Greco-Roman, patristic, rabbinical and medieval sources which Feuerbach cites in support of the central explanatory claim of the book. This claim is that the psychological origin of belief in the gods and in God is the powerful human wish for happiness or blessedness conceived as a state of freedom from the “limitations” (Grenze) that nature imposes on human existence, which are experienced by the human subject in the form of powerful feelings of hope and fear.

In seeking to substantiate the claim that the wish is the fundamental religious phenomenon, Feuerbach analyzes several theophanies from the Iliad in an effort to show that the gods make their appearances in the epic in response to petitions directed to them by humans. Insofar as the ends toward which the actions of the gods in the Homeric epics are directed are determined by the wishes of the mortals who invoke their blessings and curses, the gods act as the representatives or deputies of (Vertreter) of human self-love (T 12). “The wish is a slave of necessity, but a slave with the will to freedom” (T 47), and the gods are the imaginary embodiment of human freedom from the restrictions of finitude. Feuerbach arrives at this conclusion through his analysis of acts of petitionary prayer in the Iliad and their role in wish fulfillment, and cites in this context the observation of the Byzantine Homeric commentator, Eustathius of Thessalonica, that Homer allows no just request made of the gods to remain unfulfilled. In the divine-human relationship, it is the mortals who desire, strive, and will; and it is the gods who complete or bring to fruition these human intentions to the extent that the conditions for their satisfaction are beyond human control (T 19). While the wish itself is a purely subjective psychological occurrence, the completion of the action to which a wish might give rise, or the achievement of the end toward which the wish is directed, depends upon external circumstances that may or may not be conducive to the fulfillment of the wish. Anticipating a similar observation more famously made by the pioneering field anthropologist, Bronislaw Malinowski, it is under such circumstances, where failure is a distinct possibility, and a matter of urgency hangs in the balance, that the gods are invoked and their blessings sought in order to bring some human endeavor to a successful completion. The gods are beings who are able to do or know what humans would like to be able to do or know, but cannot (T 39).

Religion, on this account, does not originate, as philosophy does, from a theoretical or speculative impulse to understand the world, but rather from a practical concern to influence the course of events that transpire within it. Belief in gods thus presupposes a desire that there should exist beings capable of guaranteeing the success of human endeavors, and faith is preceded by hope in the logical order of things religious. If human beings did not have a powerful desire, say, to be liberated from bondage or to avoid death, belief in the Promised Land or in immortality would never have arisen. In biblical terms, faith in God is trust in what God promises, but what is promised by God is what is sought after or desired by human beings. The religious significance of God’s promises is contingent upon their correspondence to deep-seated human desires. Whereas, in The Essence of Religion, Feuerbach referred to the feeling of dependence as the “ground” of religion, he now attributes the psychological origin of the gods to the wish. The wish, considered as an act of striving for what remains beyond the limits of human power to achieve, is theogonic in the sense that theophanies (i.e., manifestations of the gods or of God) described in the Homeric epics and in the Bible, considered as narrative events, occur as responses to powerful human wishes or needs, or else as expressions of gratitude and celebration in response to occasions where these needs are believed to have been met through the cooperation or assistance of a divine agency (T 32). The gods owe their existence to “sensualism and materialism” insofar as they are the product of the material needs of finite, embodied human subjects.

Interesting sections of the Theogony are devoted to analyzing the role of the gods in the consecration of oaths, and to the origins of conscience in the aggrieved will-to-happiness of the other. Feuerbach attributes belief in divine justice to the wish that the person by whom one has been harmed should suffer harm themselves (T 103). He appeals to the mythological representations of the furies and of Medusa as evidence of the “sensual” origins of the voice of conscience (T 136), which presupposes a powerful, involuntary sense of sympathy with the suffering of person who has suffered, or stands to suffer from, one’s actions. It is “only in his egoism that man has a criterion for distinguishing between right and writing” (T 140). At one point in the Theogony Feuerbach defines morality (Sittlichkeit) as “the drive-to-happiness endowed with wisdom, the wise, rational, healthy, normal, justified (gerechte) self-love” (T 82).

When human beings in the course of their history acquire new and different wishes, they tend also to worship new and different divinities. Whereas the ancient Greco-Roman pagans, and even the ancient Hebrews, were mainly concerned to secure blessedness in the form of long life and temporal prosperity, the early Christians sought their blessedness in eternity or “eternal life”. Feuerbach closely associates this shift from a concern with temporal blessedness to a concern with eternal blessedness with the Christian emphasis on creation ex nihilo, which he contrasts both with the Hebrew account of creation as involving the forming and ordering of pre-existent elements, and the limitation of the Greco-Roman gods to being able to prolong the lives of mortals, and securing their blessedness in this life, without being able to confer immortality upon them. The freedom from natural necessity ascribed by early Christian thinkers to God is interpreted by Feuerbach as an expression of the wish of these Christians to be free themselves from the constraints of material existence.

7. The Naturalization of Ethics in Feuerbach’s Last Writings

As noted in the preceding section, Feuerbach’s espousal of sensuousness coincides with a movement toward nominalism that is reflected in a shift of emphasis from the human species to the individual human being in his later works on religion. One way that this shift shows itself is in a striking change in Feuerbach’s estimation of egoism. Among the many issues that remain unclear in Feuerbach’s later writings is what the expression “human essence” can mean for him once he has abandoned the species-ontology of his earlier writings and declared himself a nominalist. That pivotal question aside, it is at least clear that in Principles, and in his later writings on ethics, Feuerbach continues to emphasize the importance of inter-subjectivity and of the I-Thou relationship. However, these are no longer conceived in idealistic terms, as they had been previously, including Feuerbach’s doctoral dissertation, where he had spoken of thought as a species-activity in which the individual thinking subject participates. In his later writings on ethics, Feuerbach continues to affirm that human beings are essentially communal and dialogical beings, both with respect to our cognitive and linguistic capacities, and with respect to the range of moral sentiments we experience toward one another, but the communality in which the human essence is manifested is now said to be one that presupposes a real, “sensible” distinction between I and Thou.

Undoubtedly, the central concept in Feuerbach’s last works, which include the essay, “On Spiritualism and Materialism, Especially in Relation to the Freedom of the Will”, as well as an incomplete essay on ethics, is the concept of the Glückseligkeitstrieb or drive-to-happiness. Toward the end of the Preliminary Theses, after affirming that all science must be grounded in nature, and that doctrines not so grounded remain purely “hypothetical”, Feuerbach had gone on to note that this is especially true of the doctrine of freedom, and he had assigned to the new philosophy the task of “naturalizing freedom” (VT 262/172). This is one of the tasks to which he applies himself in “On Spiritualism and Materialism”, where he takes aim at “supernaturalistic” philosophers, among whom he counts Kant, Fichte and Hegel, who ascribe to human beings a noumenal or universal will that is “independent of all natural laws and natural causes and thus of all sensuous motivations [Triebfedern]” (SM 54). In arguing that it is possible for the will to be determined by the mere form of the moral law, independently of any sensible inclination, Kant had identified the will with pure practical reason. In doing so, Feuerbach argues, he turned the will into a mere abstraction. For Feuerbach, it makes no sense to speak of a timeless will devoid of a volitional impulse directed toward some particular object.

The concepts of drive (Trieb), happiness, sensation and will are closely interrelated in the account of agency that Feuerbach seeks to develop in these last writings. Feuerbach regards sensation as the “first condition of willing” (M 366), since without sensation there is no pain or need or sense of lack against which for the will to strive to assert itself. At one point, he defines happiness as the “healthy, normal” state of contentment or wellbeing experienced by an organism that is able to satisfy the needs and drives that are constitutive of its “individual, characteristic nature and life” (M 366). The drive-to-happiness is a drive toward the overcoming of a multitude of painful limitations by which the finite, corporeal subject is afflicted. These can include social conditions involving “political brutality and despotism” (VWR 61/50). Every particular drive is a manifestation of the drive-to-happiness, and the different individual drives are named after the different objects in which people seek their happiness (SM 70). Among the specific drives to which Feuerbach refers in his later writings are the drive-to-self-preservation, the sexual drive, the drive-to-enjoyment, the drive-to-activity and the drive-to-knowledge. Although he does not explicitly associate drives with the unconscious, Feuerbach does anticipate Nietzsche and Freud in regarding the body as the “ground” of both the will and of consciousness (SM 153), and he emphasizes that action results from the force with which a dominant drive succeeds in subduing other conflicting drives that may reassert themselves under altered circumstances (SM 91). Feuerbach also occasionally distinguishes between healthy and unhealthy drives, though he has little to say about the standard or criterion he uses for making such a distinction.

Whereas happiness involves the experience of a sense of contentment on the part of a being that is able to satisfy the drives that are characteristic of its nature, the inability to satisfy these drives results in various forms of discontent, aggravation, pain and frustration. The German word, “Widerwille”, means disgust or repugnance, but literally it involves not-wanting or, etymologically, “willing against”, and this, Feuerbach contends, is the most rudimentary form of willing.

Every malady (Übel), every unsatisfied drive, every unassuaged longing, every sense of absence [i.e., of a desired object] is an irritating or stimulating injury and negation of the drive-to-happiness innate in each living and sensing being, and the countervailing affirmation of the drive-to-happiness, accompanied by representations and consciousness, is what we call “will”. (M 367)

Freedom of the will, as Feuerbach conceives of it here, is freedom from the evils (Übeln) by which my drive-to-happiness is restricted, and is contingent upon the availability to me of the specific means required for overcoming these restrictions.

Another way that Feuerbach seeks to “naturalize freedom” is by developing a naturalistic account of conscience according to which the voice of conscience, which imposes restrictions on my own drive-to-happiness, functions in doing so as the advocate for the drive-to-happiness of “the I apart from me, the sensuous Thou” (SM 80), who has been or stands to be harmed by those actions from which I can have a moral obligation to refrain from performing. Where there is no harm or benefit, Feuerbach contends, there is no criterion for distinguishing right from wrong (SM 75–76). Feuerbach agrees with Schopenhauer in regarding compassion (Mitleid) as a basic source of moral motivation, but rejects Schopenhauer’s association of compassion with the renunciation of the will to live. The purpose of morality and law is to harmonize the drive-to-happiness of the various individual members of a moral community.

My right is the legal recognition of my own drive-to-happiness, my duty is the drive-to-happiness of the other that demands recognition from me. (SM 74)

The moral will, as Feuerbach conceives of it here, is not a disinterested will. It is rather “that will which seeks to cause no harm because it wishes to suffer no harm” (SM 80), and has come to identify its own interests with those of others. Because sympathy for the suffering of others presupposes antipathy toward my own suffering, whoever does away with self-interest (i.e., refuses to recognize moral value in actions motivated by self-interest) does away at the same time with compassion (Mitleid).


References to Feuerbach’s published writings are to the critical edition of his collected works or Gesammelte Werke (hereafter GW) edited by Werner Schuffenhauer, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1981–. Feuerbach’s writings are cited in the text using the following system of abbreviation. Page numbers refer to the relevant volume of GW as indicated below. In cases where two page numbers are separated by a slash, the second refers to the relevant translation as indicated below. Although I have made use of these translations, in many cases I have preferred to provide my own.

Feuerbach Works

  • [AP] “Einige Bemerkungen über den Anfang der Philosophie von D.J.F. Reiff” (1841) = GW, v. 9, 143–153 = “On ‘The Beginning of Philosophy,’” in FB 135–144.
  • [B] “Zur Beurteilung der Schrift Das Wesen des Christentums” (1842) = GW v. 9, 229–242. No translation available.
  • [EEWR] Ergänzungen und Erläuterungen zum “Wesen der Religion” (1846) = GW v. 10, 80–121.
  • [FB] The Fiery Brook: Selected Writings of Ludwig Feuerbach, trans. with an introduction by Z. Hanfi, Garden City, N.Y., Doubleday, 1972.
  • [GPZ] Grundsätze der Philosophie der Zukunft = GW v. 9, 264–341 = Principles of the Philosophy of the Future, trans. M. Vogel with an intro by T.E. Wartenberg, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1986.
  • [GTU] Gedanken über Tod und Unsterblichkeit aus den Papieren eines Denkers (1830), GW v. 1, 175–515 = Thoughts on Death and Immortality from the Papers of a Thinker, trans. with intro and notes by J.A. Massey, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980.
  • [GW] Feuerbach, L. (1981–), Gesammelte Werke, W. Schuffenhauer (ed.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag.
  • [KPP] Zur Kritik der “positiven Philosophie” (1839) = GW, v. 8, 181–207. No translation available.
  • [M] “Zur Moralphilosophie” (1868), W. Schuffenhauer (ed.), in Braun, 1994: 353–430. No translation available.
  • [NV] “Grundsätze der Philosophie: Notwendigkeit einer Veränderung” (date uncertain), in Feuerbach, 1996: 119–135 = “The Necessity of a Reform of Philosophy”, in FB, 145–152. This unpublished manuscript is not included in any of the volumes of GW that have appeared to date.
  • [SM] “Über Spiritualismus und Materialismus, besonders in Beziehung auf die Willensfreiheit” (1866) = GW v. 11, 53–186. No translation available.
  • [VGP] Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der neueren Philosophie, E. Thies (ed.), Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1974. This volume contains notes for lectures on the history of modern philosophy delivered by Feuerbach in Erlangen during the 1835/36 academic year.
  • [VWR] Vorlesungen über das Wesen der Religion = GW v. 6 = Lectures on the Essence of Religion, trans. R. Manheim, New York: Harper & Row, 1967.
  • [VT] “Vorläufige Thesen zur Reformation der Philosophie” (1842) = GW v. 9, 243–263.
  • [WC] Das Wesen des Christentums (1841) = GW, v. 5 = The Essence of Christianity, trans. G. Eliot with an intro by K. Barth and a foreword by H.R. Niebuhr, New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1957.
  • [WGL] Das Wesen des Glaubens im Sinne Luthers = GW, v. 9, 353–412 = The Essence of Faith According to Luther, trans. and with an introduction by M. Cherno, New York: Harper & Row, 1967.
  • [WR] Das Wesen der Religion (1846) = GW v. 10, 3–19.
  • [T] Theogonie nach den Quellen des klassischen, hebräischen und christlichen Altertums (1857) = GW v. 7.

Other References

  • Ameriks, Karl, 2000, “The Legacy of Idealism in the Philosophy of Feuerbach, Marx, and Kierkegaard”, in The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Karl Ameriks (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 258–281. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521651786.014
  • Arndt, Andreas (ed.), 2020, Ludwig Feuerbach: Das Wesen des Christentums, Klassiker Auslegen, Bd. 52, Berlin/Boston: de Gruyter.
  • Arndt, Andreas and Walter Jaeschke (eds.), 2000, Materialismus und Spiritualismus: Philosophie und Wissenschaften nach 1848, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Ascheri, Carlo, 1964, Review of Rawidowicz (1964) in Philosophische Rundschau, 11(1): 55–65.
  • Ascheri, Carlo, 1969, Feuerbachs Bruch mit der Spekulation; Einleitung zur kritischen Ausgabe von Feuerbach: Notwendigkeit einer Veränderung (1842), Frankfurt: Europäische Verlagsanstalt.
  • Bishop, Paul, 2009, “Eudaimonism, Hedonism and Feuerbach’s Philosophy of the Future”, Intellectual History Review, 19(1): 65–81. doi:10.1080/17496970902722908
  • Braun, Hans-Jürg, 1971, Ludwig Feuerbachs Lehre vom Menschen. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: F. Frommann.
  • ––– (ed.), 1990, Ludwig Feuerbach und die Philosophie der Zukunft, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag.
  • ––– (ed.), 1994, Solidarität oder Egoismus: Studien zu einer Ethik bei und nach Ludwig Feuerbach, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag.
  • Breckman, Warren, 1999, Marx, the Young Hegelians, and the Origins of Radical Social Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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