Herbert Marcuse

First published Wed Dec 18, 2013; substantive revision Wed Apr 10, 2019

Herbert Marcuse (1898–1979) was one of the most prominent members of the Frankfurt School or The Institute for Social Research (Institute für Sozialforschung) in Frankfurt am Main. The Frankfurt School was formed in 1922 but went into exile in the United States in the early 1930s during the reign of the Third Reich. Although most of his colleagues returned to Germany after World War II, Marcuse remained in the United States.

The Frankfurt School has had an enormous impact on philosophy as well as social and political theory in the United States and around the world. In the 1960s Marcuse ascended to prominence and became one of the best known philosophers and social theorists in the world. He was often referred to as the Guru of the New Left (a title which he rejected). During the late 1970s through the 1990s, Marcuse’s popularity began to wane as he was eclipsed by second and third generation critical theorists, postmodernism, Rawlsian liberalism, and his former colleagues Theodor Adorno and Walter Benjamin. In recent years there has been a new surge of interest in Marcuse.

1. Biography

Herbert Marcuse was born on July 19, 1898 in Berlin. His mother was born Gertrud Kreslawsky and his father was a well-off businessman, Carl Marcuse. According to Marcuse, his childhood was that of a typical German upper-middle class youth whose Jewish family was well integrated into German society (Kellner 1984: 13). Marcuse’s formal education began at the Mommsen Gymnasium and continued at the Kaiserin-Augusta Gymnasium in Charlottenburg from 1911–1916. In 1916 Marcuse was called to military service. It was in the military where his political education began, although during this period his political involvement was brief. The experience of war and the German Revolution led Marcuse to a study of Marxism as he tried to understand “the dynamics of capitalism and imperialism, as well as the failure of the German Revolution” (Kellner 1984: 17). Marcuse also wanted to learn more about socialism and the Marxian theory of revolution so that he may understand his own inability to identify with any of the major Left parties at that time (Kellner 1984: 17). However, this study of Marxism would be brief. In 1918 Marcuse was released from military service.

In 1919 he entered Humboldt University in Berlin and took courses for four semesters. In 1920 he transferred to Freiburg to concentrate on German literature and to take courses in philosophy, politics, and economics. This period of study culminated in a doctoral dissertation entitled Der deutsche Künstlerroman (The German Artist-Novel), which was accepted in 1922 (Kellner 1984: 18). This work would be the first in a life-long engagement with aesthetics for Marcuse.

After the acceptance of his dissertation Marcuse returned to Berlin where “his father provided him with an apartment and a share in a publishing and antiquarian book business” (Wiggershaus 1994: 96). Marcuse worked mainly as a catalogue researcher and bibliographer, and published a Schiller bibliography in 1925 (Kellner 1984: 32–33). In 1924 Marcuse married his first wife, Sophie.

While in Berlin, Marcuse began reading Martin Heidegger’s newly published Being and Time with a friend in 1927. Although Marcuse was already a student of philosophy, his interest in philosophy had remained second to his interest in German literature up to this point. The excitement caused by Being and Time would lead Marcuse to a life-long serious engagement with philosophy. According to Douglas Kellner, this move from a primary concern with art to a deeper engagement with philosophy suggests that Marcuse was a bit skeptical about the power of art as a “cognitive source of knowledge and as an instrument of personal liberation and social change” (Kellner 1984: 36–37). The impact of Heidegger was so great that Marcuse returned to Freiburg in 1928 to study philosophy with Heidegger and Edmund Husserl. While in Freiburg Marcuse worked as Heidegger’s assistant and began work on his second dissertation, Hegel’s Ontologie und die Grundlegung einer Theorie der Geschichtlichkeit (Hegel’s Ontology and the Theory of Historicity) (1932 [1987]). Although this dissertation was never approved by Heidegger (and according to Marcuse, perhaps not read), it was published in 1932.

In 1932 Marcuse and Heidegger parted ways due to the latter’s developing interest in National Socialism, although Heidegger didn’t officially join the Nazi Party until 1933. As the Nazis soared to power and anti-Semitism began to spread, it became clear to Marcuse that he “would never be able to qualify for a professorship under the Nazi regime” (Kellner 1984: 92). Given his situation, Marcuse began to inquire about employment with the Institute for Social Research in Frankfurt. After an interview, a letter of support from Edmund Husserl, and a word of support from a member of the Institute (Leo Lowenthal), Marcuse was hired (Wiggershaus 1994: 104; Kellner 1984: 92)

Due to Nazi activity, Marcuse never actually worked in Frankfurt. Anticipating the fascist takeover, the Institute deposited their endowment in Holland. A branch office was established in Geneva where Marcuse began his work with the Institute. He would go to Paris for a short time and then finally in July 1934 to New York. From 1934–1942 Marcuse worked at the Institute’s branch at Columbia University. In 1942 he moved to Washington D.C. to work first with the Office of War Information and then with the Office of Strategic Services. Later Marcuse would teach at Brandeis University and then the University of California, San Diego. He became a United States citizen in 1940 and remained in the United States until his death in 1979.

2. The Aesthetic Dimension

The bookends of Marcuse’s literary, philosophical, and political life are works on aesthetics. In 1922 he completed a doctoral dissertation entitled Der deutsche Künstlerroman (The German Artist-Novel). In 1978, one year before his death he published The Aesthetic Dimension: Toward A Critique of Marxist Aesthetics. Between these two works are several smaller works on aesthetics. However, even the works that do not deal directly with aesthetics still contain (we might say) an aesthetic dimension. It is not possible to discuss the role of aesthetics in all of Marcuse’s works. Therefore, the role of aesthetics in Marcuse’s critical theory in general will be discussed. There are three key works on aesthetics which were written at different times that reveal the overall point of Marcuse’s aesthetic theory.

Even in his youth, Marcuse had a love for the classics of German and world literature (Marcuse 2007a: 4). After serving military duty and after his brief period of political engagement Marcuse returned to his literary studies. However, in the aftermath of his reading of Marxism, Marcuse’s literary studies had a decisive political orientation. He was interested in the revolutionary and transformative function of art.

This turn to art and literature was a return to an earlier love with a new mission. This new mission was of course inspired by his encounter with Marxism and the crisis of Marxism. The turn toward literature was also a quest for revolutionary subjectivity. Put another way, from the beginning to the end of his literary career Marcuse looked for spaces of a critical consciousness that had not been completely whittled down by the oppressive and repressive forces of capitalism. Revolution and social change demands a space for thought and action that make resistance to the status quo possible. Well before he began to use the term “the Great Refusal”, he was in search of such.

In his dissertation of 1922, The German Artist-Novel, the artist represents a form of radical subjectivity. Marcuse makes a distinction between epic poetry and the novel in this work. Epic poetry deals with the origin and development of a people and culture while the novel does not focus on the form of life of a people and their development, but rather, on a sense of longing and striving (Marcuse 2007a: 72). The novel indicates alienation from social life. The details of Marcuse’s argument will not be addressed here. The point is to show that there is a certain orientation of thought in Marcuse’s 1922 dissertation that is motivated by his encounter with Marxism and will stay with him as his project becomes more philosophical. In short, the artist experiences a gap between the ideal and the real. This ability to entertain, at least theoretically, an ideal form of existence for humanity, while at the same time living in far less than ideal conditions, produces a sense of alienation in the artist. This alienation becomes the catalyst for social change. This function of art stays with Marcuse and will be developed further as he engages with psychoanalysis and philosophy.

As a dialectical thinker, Marcuse was also able to see both sides of the coin. That is, while art embodied revolutionary potential, it was also produced, interpreted, and distributed in a repressive society. In an oppressive/repressive society the forces of liberation and the forces of domination do not develop in isolation from each other. Instead, they develop in a dialectical relationship where one produces the conditions for the other. This can be seen throughout almost all of Marcuse’s writings and will be pointed out at different points in this essay. The task here is to take a look at how this dialectic of liberation and domination occurs within the context of Marcuse’s aesthetic theory. This should not be taken to mean that there will never be a point in time when human beings are liberated from the forces of domination. This simply means that if an individual group seeks liberation, their analysis or critique of society must come to terms with how things actually work at that moment in that society if any form of liberation is possible. As Marcuse saw it, there is a form of ideology that serves domination and creates the conditions for liberation at the same time. This will be discussed later. Also, there is a form of liberation that lends itself to be co-opted by the forces of domination.

Just as art embodied the potential for liberation and the formation of radical subjectivity, it was also capable of being taken up by systems of domination and used to further or maintain domination. This is the theme of Marcuse’s 1937 essay “The Affirmative Character of Culture”. Culture, which is the domain of art, develops in tension with the overall structure of a given society. The values and ideals produced by culture call for the transcending of oppressive social reality. Culture separates itself from the social order. That is, the social realm or civilization is characterized by labor, the working day, the realm of necessity, operational thought, etc. (Marcuse 1965: 16). This is the realm of real material and social relations as well as the struggle for existence. The cultural realm or civilization is characterized by intellectual work, leisure, non-operational thought, and freedom (Marcuse 1965: 16). The freedom to think and reflect that is made possible at the level of culture makes it possible to construct values and ideals that pose a challenge to the social order. This is the emancipatory function of art. However, art itself does not bring about liberation; it must be translated into political activity. Nevertheless, art is important because it opens up the space for thinking that may then produce revolution.

The separation between culture and society does not suggest a flight from social reality. Instead, it represents an alien or critical space within social reality. The ideals produced by culture must work within society as transformative ideas. In “The Affirmative Character of Culture”, Marcuse, in good dialectical fashion, shows how culture separates itself from society or civilization and creates the space for critical thought and social change but then succumbs to the oppressive demands of bourgeois society. It does this by “separating ‘culture’ from the everyday world” (Marcuse 2007a: 23). In affirmative culture art becomes the object of spiritual contemplation. The demand for happiness in the real world is abandoned for an internal form of happiness, the happiness of the soul. Hence, bourgeois culture creates an interior of the human being where the highest ideals of culture can be realized. This inner transformation does not demand an external transformation of the real world and its material conditions.

In such a society the cultivation of the soul becomes an important part of one’s education. The belief that the soul is more important than the body and material needs leads to political resignation insofar as freedom becomes internal. “The soul takes flight at the hard truth of theory, which points up the necessity of changing as impoverished form of existence” (Marcuse 2007b: 222). Hence, the soul accepts the facts of its material existence without fighting to change these facts. Affirmative culture with its idea of the soul has used art to erase radical subjectivity.

In his last book The Aesthetic Dimension (1978), Marcuse continues his attempt to rescue the radical transformative nature of art. In this text he takes a polemical stance against the problematic interpretation of the function of art by orthodox Marxists. These Marxists claimed that only proletarian art could be revolutionary. Marcuse attempts to establish the revolutionary potential of all art by establishing the autonomy of authentic art. Marcuse states: “It seems that art as art expresses a truth, an experience, a necessity which, although not in the domain of radical praxis, are nevertheless essential components of revolution” (Marcuse 1978: 1). It is the experience that art tries to express that Marcuse will focus on and it is this which separates him from orthodox Marxists.

It must be remembered that for Marcuse and the Frankfurt School there was no evidence that the proletariat would rise up against their oppressors. In addition to developing theories that disclosed the social and psychological mechanisms at work in society that made the proletariat complicit in their own domination, Marcuse saw possibilities for revolution in multiple places. Some of this will be discussed later. The student revolts of the 1960s confirmed much of the direction of Marcuse’s critical theory from early on. That is, the need for social change includes class struggle but cannot be reduced to class struggle. There is a multiplicity of social groups in our society that seek social change for various reasons. There are multiple forms of oppression and repression that make revolution desirable. Hence, the form of art produced, and its revolutionary vision, may be determined by a multiplicity of oppressed/repressed subject positions.

Orthodox Marxism focused on the proletariat by excluding all other possible sites for revolution. For this reason, orthodox Marxism itself becomes a form of ideology and produces a reified state of affairs. In orthodox Marxist aesthetics

The subjectivity of individuals, their own consciousness and unconscious tends to be dissolved into class consciousness. Thereby, a major prerequisite of revolution is minimized, namely, the fact that the need for radical change must be rooted in the subjectivity of individuals themselves, in their intelligence, and their passions, their drives and their goals. (Marcuse 1978: 3–4)

In orthodox Marxism, radical subjectivity was reduced to one social group, the proletariat. Marcuse greatly expands the space where radical subjectivity can emerge. Marcuse argues that “liberating subjectivity constitutes itself in the inner history of the individuals” (Marcuse 1978: 5). Each subject as distinct from other subjects represents a particular subject position. For example; white female, working class, mother of two, born in the mid-west, etc. However, with each distinct feature of the individual subject corresponds a structural position. That is, in a given society, gender, race, class, level of education etc., are interpreted in certain ways. Experiences and the opportunities provided by them are often affected by subject and structural position and produce what Marcuse calls “the inner history of the individual” (Marcuse 1978: 5).

Given that there are many subject positions that are positions of repression and dehumanization, radical subjectivity and art may come from any of these positions. Economic class is just one structural position among many. Hence, it is not only the proletariat who may have an interest in social change.

3. The Search for a Philosophical Foundation for Marxism and the Radical Subject

3.1 Phenomenological Marxism

Inspired by his reading of Heidegger’s Being and Time, and having already been influenced by Marxism during his military days, Marcuse went to Freiberg to study with Heidegger in 1928. Between 1928 and 1932 he attempted to develop what has been called Heideggerian or phenomenological Marxism. This project was Marcuse’s response to what has been called the “crisis of Marxism.”

By the early twentieth century it appeared to be the case that the proletarian revolution predicted by Marx was not going to happen. Europe had witnessed several failed attempts at a revolution. The Bolshevik Revolution of 1917 was not lead by the proletariat and it simply produced a different form of totalitarianism.

Marcuse undoubtedly accepted Rosa Luxemburg’s trenchant critique of the authoritarian implications of Lenin’s vanguardism. In fact, most European socialists viewed Lenin’s voluntarism as inappropriate for Western and Central Europe, where a more advanced and experienced proletariat existed. (Wolin 2005: xiv)

This situation produced the political crisis of Marxism.

The political crisis of Marxism was entangled with its epistemological crisis (Wolin 2005: xiv). The epistemological crisis was the result of the scientific reductionism of Marxism which was encouraged by Engels and Karl Kautsky (Marcuse 2005: xiv). So-called scientific Marxism is a non-philosophical, mechanistic form of Marxist theory that teaches the inevitable, automatic collapse of capitalism. This form of theory ends up being non-revolutionary to the extent that the “subjective factor of working class consciousness is down played” (Marcuse 2005: xiv). The Second International produced a form of positivism that eliminated the dialectical approach of Marxism and erased the role of human subjectivity. That is, if the collapse of capitalism was inevitable because of the effects of certain natural laws and not due to the conscious, intentional efforts of the proletariat, then there is no need to work toward the development of revolutionary consciousness.

Marcuse’s entire project can be seen as an attempt to rescue radical, socially transformative subjectivity. He gravitates toward Marxism because Marxism is an attempt to rescue subjectivity or humanity from the reifying, oppressive forces of capitalism. Unfortunately, the Marxism of the Second International also erased human subjectivity as this form of Marxism became mechanistic in nature. It is in this context, where subjectivity and human agency are being whittled down, that Marcuse turns to Heidegger for a possible solution. Marcuse saw in Marx and Heidegger “a demand for radical action” (Wolin 2001: 146).

For Marx, it took the form of “praxis,” “revolutionary, practical-critical activity.” On the basis of authentic temporality, Dasein, too, demanded a radical response to the realities of alienated social existence. (Wolin 2001: 147)

For Marcuse, radical action was needed to overcome the oppressive, repressive, and reified structure of advanced industrial society. He saw common ground between Marx and Heidegger regarding this problem. At this point in his career, Marcuse read the oppressive structure of advanced industrial society through three lenses, the Marxian lens of alienation, The Lukácsian lens of reification, and the Heideggerian lens of inauthenticity. Although Marx’s 1844 Manuscripts which includes a discussion of alienation were not yet available to Marcuse when he went to Freiburg, Marx’s theory of alienation is implicit in various places in volume one of Capital where he discusses the reduction of social relations between persons to the relations between things while the relations between things are treated as social relations.

Thus, Marcuse believed that Heidegger’s Being and Time represented a potentially valuable ally in the struggle against the reified social continuum of advanced industrial society. He conjectured that Heidegger’s philosophy of existence possessed the conceptual means required to counteract an inverted social world in which, according to Marx, “social relations between men assume…the fantastic form of a relation between things.” In part, Marcuse read Heidegger’s philosophy as an ontologically veiled critique of reification: an indictment of the way in which oppressive social circumstances militate against the possibility of human self-realization. It seemed that, like the critical Marxists Lukács and Korsch, Heidegger strove to surmount the fetishization of appearances that characterized the shadow-world of bourgeois immediacy. Like Lukács and Korsch, in Being and Time Heidegger strove concertedly to break with the deterministic worldview of bourgeois science, in which human being or Dasein was degraded to the status of a ”thing among things.“ After all, this was the main point behind Heidegger’s critique of Vorhandenheit or being present-at-hand as a mode of inauthenticity. (Wolin 2005: xiv–xv).

Marcuse’s reading of Marx, Heidegger, Lukács, Korsch, and even Max Weber is based on his quest for radical or revolutionary subjectivity. Like Horkheimer and Adorno, Marcuse saw western society as moving in the direction of a totally administered society. His later notion of one-dimensionality was developed via his critique of such a society. However, he eventually became disillusioned with Heidegger.

Even while under Heidegger’s influence Marcuse was never a mere Heideggerian. He recognized early on that Heidegger’s philosophy had certain limitations. He would eventually discover that Heidegger’s philosophy was not all that concrete. While Heidegger’s philosophy explicated the ontological structure of Dasein in its everydayness, it never dwelled at the ontic level. At the ontological level Heidegger merely examined the fundamental structures of Dasein. That is, Dasein in general carries out its life within a certain universal structure which is constituted by modes of existence such as fallenness, idle talk, boredom, care, being toward death, etc. What has been disclosed here are mere universal conditions or modes of existence in which Dasein happens and experiences happenings. However, these modes of existence are experienced in different ways, at different times, and with different levels of intensity by different individuals.

At the end of the day, Marcuse sees that Heidegger avoids the type of analyses that would reveal systems of oppression and domination from which many human beings suffer. The modes of existence for Dasein have a social, historical, and political context that shape the way they are experienced. For example, Dasein has a race, gender, class, etc. These particular features come with specific social interpretations which affect Dasein’s life’s prospects. According to Marcuse, Heidegger’s Dasein is a sociologically and biologically neutral category (Marcuse 2005b: 167). Heidegger gives no account of the multiple forms of oppression and domination present in advanced industrial societies nor the way that individuals respond to these forms of oppression and domination. In a 1977 interview conducted by Frederick A. Olafson, Marcuse raises the following criticism of Heidegger:

How does the individual situate himself and see himself in capitalism—at a certain stage of capitalism, under socialism, as a member of this or that class, and so on? This entire dimension is absent. To be sure, Dasein is constituted in historicity, but Heidegger focuses on individuals purged of the hidden and not so hidden injuries of their class, their work, their recreation, purged of the injuries they suffer from their society. There is no trace of the daily rebellion, of the striving for liberation. The Man (the anonymous anyone) is no substitute for the social reality (Marcuse 2005b: 169)

Hence, Heidegger’s concrete philosophy is not so concrete as he defines human beings and their historicity in such a way that omits the real, concrete struggles in which social actors find themselves. In the same interview quoted above, Marcuse claims that he and others realized that “Heidegger’s concreteness was to a great extent a phony, false concreteness,” removed from reality (Marcuse 2005b: 166)

We can see now that the very thing that drew Marcuse to Heidegger’s philosophy was missing. Heidegger’s philosophy failed to provide Marcuse with a concrete philosophical foundation for Marxism as well as a theory of the radical act or radical subjectivity. Heidegger’s interest with Nazism made it easy for Marcuse to leave Heidegger in 1932. This move was also made easy by the publication of Marx’s 1844 Manuscripts first published in 1932.

Although Marcuse breaks with Heidegger in 1932, for some scholars the break is not all that clear. Martin Jay claims that when Marcuse joined the Institute, the influence of Horkheimer was so great that Marcuse “abandoned Heidegger’s vocabulary, as the impact of phenomenology on his thinking began to recede” (Jay 1973: 76). However, in a letter to Horkheimer on May 13, 1935, Adorno strongly suggests that Marcuse was still a Heideggerian (Marcuse/Kellner 1998: 16 n.22). One must, however, maintain some level of suspicion of Adorno’s claim since he and Marcuse were engaged in competition for Horkheimer’s favor. Nevertheless, the question of Marcuse’s Heideggerianism is still of interests for Marcuse scholars. For example, Richard Wolin writes: “In Marcuse’s postwar writings, the Heideggerian dimension is muted but nevertheless traceable” (Wolin 2001: 167).

Does Marcuse continue to employ Heideggerian ideas in a new language? Is Marcuse’s critique of one-dimensionality nothing more than a Heideggerian critique of inauthenticity? Both terms refer to “a mass society of blind conformity” (Wolin 2001: 168). Wolin also raises the question of parallels between Heidegger’s ontological elitism and Marcuse’s notion of an “educational dictatorship” (Wolin 2001: 172). The issue of an educational dictatorship occurs in Eros and Civilization (1955) as well as in “Repressive Tolerance” (1965) and reflects Marcuse’s pessimism about the development of radical consciousness in the working class. The problem of some form of intellectual elitism is not only found in Heidegger but in Marxism itself. One need only think about Lenin’s notion of the Vanguard. However, whether the source be Heidegger or certain Marxists, the wave toward elitism, in one form or another, remains a problem in Marcuse’s work.

3.2 Philosophical Anthropology and Radical Subjectivity

In 1932 Marcuse published one of the first reviews of the newly published 1844 Manuscripts entitled “Neue Quellen zur Grundlegung des historischen Materialismus” (New Sources on the Foundation of Historical Materialism). According to Marcuse, the 1844 Manuscripts had the possibility to accomplish two things.

These manuscripts could put the discussion about the origins and original meaning of historical materialism, and the entire theory of “scientific socialism,” on a new footing. They also make it possible to pose the question of the actual connections between Marx and Hegel in a more fruitful way. (Wolin 2001: 86)

However, these manuscripts also provided Marcuse with the necessary theoretical tools needed for developing a critical, philosophical anthropology that would aid him in the development of his own brand of critical theory.

In this context, “anthropology” does not refer to the study of past cultures, as it often does in the United States. Instead, it refers to the German idea of anthropology which is more of a philosophical and social scientific examination of human nature. The 1844 Manuscripts are important for Marcuse because in them Marx provides a philosophical foundation for his later critique of political economy as well as an action-theoretic, philosophical anthropology. Philosophical categories such as labor, objectification, alienation, sublation, property, and others all explored in Hegel’s philosophy were scrutinized dialectically by Marx (Kellner 1984: 79).

In a nutshell, what Marcuse sees in the 1844 Manuscripts is an analysis of the social conditions for a communist revolution. The revolution itself requires the development of radical subjectivity. Radical subjectivity refers to the development of a form of self-consciousness that finds present social and economic conditions intolerable. The radical act is a refusal of these conditions and an orientation toward social transformation. To make sense of Marcuse’s position we must ask: what are these intolerable conditions and how are they produced? Philosophical anthropology and radical subjectivity are connected here insofar as the intolerable conditions that must be overcome by revolution or the radical act represent social distortions of the human essence. It is Marx and Hegel who provided Marcuse with a philosophical anthropology that discloses human essence and the social mechanisms by which it is distorted. The key category here is that of “alienation” which cannot be understood without examining the role of labor and objectification.

According to Marcuse, Hegel, and Marx, human beings develop through a self-formative process wherein the external world (nature) is appropriated and transformed according to human needs. Labor is one of the main areas for this self-formative activity. The idea that labor is an essential part of a self-formative process is what distinguishes Marx from the classical economists such as Smith, Ricardo, etc. In classical economics, labor is simply the means by which individuals make provisions for themselves and their families. In these theories labor is not viewed as that activity by which the human subject is constituted. The Marxian view of labor as a self-formative process is what makes possible the Marxian theory of alienation and revolution.

Marcuse argues that in the 1844 Manuscripts Marx shows how the role of labor as a self-realization or self-formative process gets inverted. Instead of having his or her subjectivity affirmed, the individual becomes an object that is now shaped by external, alien forces. Hence, Marx’s theory makes a transition from an examination of the self-formative process of labor to a critique of the forms of alienation caused by the historical facticity of capitalism. Within the historical facticity of capitalism

this fact appears as the total inversion and concealment of what critique had defined as the essence of man and human labor. Labor is not “free activity” or the universal and free self-realization of man, but his enslavement and loss of reality. The worker is not man in the totality of his life-expression, but something unessential [ein Unwesen], the purely physical subject of “abstract” activity. The objects of labor are not expressions and confirmations of the human reality of the worker, but alien things, belonging to someone other than the worker—“commodities.” (Marcuse 2005b: 104)

Marcuse will spend the rest of his life carrying out the investigations started in these early works. What distinguishes his project from Marx’s is the way in which each will deal with the problem of concealment mentioned in the above quote. Marx will develop two different but related approaches. His critique of political economy is an attempt to disclose the inner logic of capitalism (how it works) as well as the contradictions that will lead to the collapse of capitalism. The second approach is to work out a theory of revolution which presupposes the awakening of self-consciousness in the working class. In both approaches concealment will give way to disclosure and social transformation. We saw earlier that Marx’s predictions did not come true on either account. This failure in part led to what has been called the crisis of Marxism to which the birth of the Frankfurt School was a response. Marcuse’s work will go through many phases as he tries to unlock the key to revolutionary action. The next key move for him is to engage in a deeper study of Hegel as a source for critical social theory.

3.3 Negative (Dialectical) Thinking and Social Change

In 1941 Marcuse’s studies of Marx and Hegel culminated in a book entitled Reason and Revolution: Hegel and the Rise of Social Theory (1941 [1983]). This book accomplished several things. First, it disclosed the role of Hegel’s most critical, revolutionary, and emancipatory concepts in the development of Marx’s critical philosophy. Secondly, it rescued Hegel from the charge that his social and political philosophy was conservative and legitimated the oppressive Prussian state. The third great accomplishment, or at least goal, embodies the first two accomplishments and is perhaps the most important for the formation of Marcuse’s form of critical theory. The Hegelian/Marxian notion of dialectic or what Marcuse will call negative thinking becomes a central element in Marcuse’s critical theory. In part, Reason and Revolution is not an attempt to rescue Hegel, but rather, an attempt to rescue dialectical or negative thinking. Marcuse makes this clear in a new preface to the 1960 edition of the book. The new preface entitled “A Note on Dialectic” can actually stand on its own as a guide to reading and understanding Marcuse. Marcuse begins with the claim that this book is an attempt to rescue a form of thinking or a mental faculty which is in danger of being obliterated (Marcuse 1960: vii).

The purpose of dialectical or negative thinking is to expose and then overcome by revolutionary action the contradictions by which advanced industrial societies are constituted. The problem of concealment occurs here because not only does society produce contradictions and the forms of domination that come with them, but also produces the social and psychological mechanisms that conceal these contradictions. An example of a social contradiction is the co-existence of the growth of national wealth and poverty at the same time. Those who own, control, and influence the means of production (the minority) grow richer while the workers (the majority) grow poorer. The idea that the unbridled attempt by the rich to become richer will somehow allow their wealth to trickle down so that all will benefit has been proven false as the gap between the rich and poor continues to grow. However, the trickle down ideology is still very effective. The capitalist belief that unbridled competition is good for everyone conceals the goal of purging society of competition by allowing large corporations to buy out their competition.

In this situation, the worker does not become a free and rational subject through her labor, but rather, an object to be used by the economic system, a system that is a human creation, but over which the worker has no control. In the capitalist system, the worker is used as an object for the sake of production while not reaping the full benefits of production. In such a situation the worker is not able to actualize his or her potential as a free and rational human being but is instead reduced to a life of toil for the sake of survival. The existence of the worker erases her essence. The task of dialectical thinking is to bring this situation to consciousness. Once this situation is brought to consciousness it can be resolved through revolutionary practice. Thus, Kellner writes:

The central concepts presented are precisely those of the book’s title, “reason” and “revolution”. Reason distinguishes between existence and essence through conceptualizing unrealized potentialities, norms and ideals that are to be realized in social practice. If social conditions prevent their realization, reason calls for revolution. (Kellner 1984: 131)

Marcuse’s concept of essence is not transcendental but historical. That is, there is no human essence apart from historical context. Within the context of historical happening, within material existence, what the human being could potentially be is already present. For example, it seems logical to assert that no human being would want to spend his or her entire life engaged in alienating labor just to remain in poverty. Nevertheless, this is precisely the situation in which many human beings find themselves. However, essence is embedded in this historical appearance insofar as the potential for the worker to be free from exploitation and alienating toil is present as a real possibility that need only be actualized. In the society wherein the worker works there is enough wealth (produced by the worker) to free the worker of endless toil. In an essay entitled “The Concept of Essence” Marcuse writes: “Materialist theory thus transcends the given state of fact and moves toward a different potentiality, proceeding from immediate appearance to the essence that appears in it. But here appearance and essence become members of a real antithesis arising from the particular historical structure of the social process of life” (Marcuse 1968b: 67).

The above passage is crucial for understanding the theme of Reason and Revolution and Marcuse’s famous later work One-Dimensional Man (1964) (which will be discussed later). His concept of essence is not static or transcendental. Essence presents itself as the possibility of a free non-alienating, non-repressive form of life within a particular historical, social/political structure. Appearance (the present order of things) is in contradiction to the very possibilities that are produced by the present social reality. For example, the capitalist mode of production has made it possible for all members of our society to live non-alienating and fruitful lives. However, many are still in poverty. Dialectical or negative thinking sees this contradiction and attempts to negate such circumstances.

The concept of negation is best understood by distinguishing between two levels of negation in capitalist societies. The concept of negation employed by Marcuse is actually a critical response to a prior form of negation. This prior form of negation will be referred to as negation1 and the response to it as negation2. Negation1 is the negation of human essence or freedom by an oppressive, repressive socio/economic system. Here the potential for liberation, self-development, self-determination, the good life, etc. are all erased by various forms of domination. Hence, the human individual is negated. Negation2 refers to the development of critical, revolutionary consciousness that seeks to negate these oppressive social structures. The goal of negation2 is liberation (Farr 2009: 85–86).

There are many other features of Reason and Revolution that are worth discussing here, especially Marcuse’s critique of positivism. However, these issues will come up again in other works that will be discussed later. Suffice it to say that at this point Marcuse presents negative thinking as an alternative to what he will later call one-dimensional thinking. It is through negative thinking and revolution that liberation becomes possible. In the next section we will examine another possibility for liberation.

4. Psychoanalysis and Utopian Vision

4.1 The Historical and Social Nature of Human Drives

Psychoanalysis was an essential theoretical tool for the Frankfurt School from the beginning. When Max Horkheimer took over as director in 1931, he had already been influenced by psychoanalysis (Abromeit 2011: 192–195). Soon after becoming director he brought Psychoanalyst Erich Fromm on board. The initial goal was to use psychoanalytic theory to understand the psyche of the working class. That is, the goal was to understand why those who would benefit most from a revolution of social change seemed to resist it. Marcuse did not engage psychoanalysis until later. Although he made the same use of psychoanalysis as his colleagues, Marcuse also developed his own unique approach to interpreting psychoanalytic theory. While Eros and Civilization is a work on Freud and is replete with the language of psychoanalysis, it is as Marxian as it is Freudian. The name Marx it not mentioned in the text, and rarely are Marxian categories be introduced. Nevertheless, the Freudian categories are bent toward a Marxist/Marxian type of analysis of advanced industrial societies.

Although Marcuse had read Freud in the 1920s and 1930s, his serious engagement did not begin until the 1950s. Marcuse was invited to give a series of lectures in 1950–51 by the Washington School of Psychiatry. The result of this engagement was one of Marcuse’s most famous books, Eros and Civilization: A Philosophical Inquiry into Freud. Marcuse’s book is a response to the pessimism of Freud’s Civilization and its Discontents (1930 [1961]). Freud’s book paints a bleak picture of the evolution of civilization as the evolution of greater and greater repression from which there seems to be no escape. The death and life instincts are engaged in a battle for dominance with no clear winner in sight. According to Marcuse, Freud fails to develop the emancipatory possibility of his own theory. Marcuse’s task is two-fold. First, he must show that human instincts or drives are not merely biological and fixed, but also social, historical, and malleable. Secondly, he must show that repressive society also produces the possibility of the abolition of repression (Marcuse 1955: 5).

That the instincts can be repressed already suggests that society and its form of organization play a role in shaping the instincts. If this is the case, the instincts cannot be fixed. As society and its mechanisms of repression change, so does the instincts. Marcuse claims that:

The vicissitudes of the instincts are the vicissitudes of the mental apparatus in civilization. The animal drive become human instincts under the influence of the external reality. (Marcuse 1955: 11–12)

In this transformation of the animal drives into human instincts there is a transformation of the pleasure principle into the reality principle (Marcuse 1955: 12). In Civilization and its Discontents Freud claimed it was the program of the pleasure principle that decided the purpose of life (Freud 1961 [1930]: 25). However, the external world does not conform to the dictates of the pleasure principle and is even hostile toward it. Hence, the pleasure principle reverts, turns inward, is repressed.

For Marcuse, liberation means a freeing up of the pleasure principle. However, he realizes that if human beings are to co-exist, some degree of repression is necessary. That is, if one acted simply according to the demands of the pleasure principle, this would lead to an infringement on the freedom of others. Hence, there has to be a mutual limiting of freedom and happiness if we are to co-exist. It is with regards to this problem that Marcuse comes up with one of his most creative modifications of Freud’s theory.

4.2 Repression

Marcuse introduces two new terms to distinguish between the biological vicissitudes of the instincts and the social. Basic repression refers to the type of repression or modification of the instincts that is necessary “for the perpetuation of the human race in civilization” (Marcuse 1955: 35). At this level, repression does not lend itself to domination or oppression. Surplus repression, on the other hand, refers to “the restrictions necessitated by social domination” (Marcuse 1955: 35). The purpose of surplus repression is to shape the instincts in accordance with the present “performance principle” which is “the prevailing form of the reality principle” (Marcuse 1955: 35).

It is in this idea of the performance principle where Marx and Freud meet.

The performance principle, which is that of an acquisitive and antagonistic society in the process of constant expansion, presupposes a long development during which domination has been increasingly rationalized: control over social labor now reproduces society on a large scale and under improving conditions. For a long way, the interests of domination and the interests of the whole coincide: the profitable utilization of the productive apparatus fulfills the needs and faculties of individuals. For the vast majority of the population, the scope and mode of satisfaction are determined by their own labor; but their labor is work for an apparatus which they do not control, which operates as an independent power to which individuals must submit if they want to live. And it becomes the more alien the more specialized the division of labor becomes. Men do not live their own lives but perform pre-established functions. While they work, they do not fulfill their own needs and faculties but work in alienation. (Marcuse 1955: 45)

Marcuse’s point here is that while work is necessary for the maintenance of life, in our society there has been a transition from the basic amount of work needed to maintain life to what we might call surplus work. There is a distinction here between the work that is needed for one’s satisfaction and work that is needed for the apparatus. The worker has no control insofar as he has no say in what his wages will be and cannot determine the amount of work that is needed to meet his needs. Work in a capitalist society extends itself beyond what is required for the satisfaction of the worker to what will maximize profit for the capitalist. The “pre-established function” of the worker is to produce commodities and maximize profit for the capitalist. The worker must work to live but the conditions under which she works is determined by the apparatus.

Being used by the apparatus requires conformity with the apparatus. This is what Marcuse means by the performance principle. Members of society must perform according to the dictates of their pre-established function. This performance requires the restriction of the libido. The worker must be manipulated in such a way so that these restrictions seem to function as rational, external objective laws which are then internalized by the individual. The desires of the individual must conform to the desires of the apparatus. The individual must define himself as the apparatus defines all humanity. As Marcuse puts it, “he desires what he is supposed to desire” (Marcuse 1955: 46).

Although Marcuse’s theory of repression and the recognition of two forms of repression is a useful theoretical tool for understanding why we have not entered a revolutionary period, it falls short of explaining how desires are manipulated in such a way that one-dimensional identities are formed. One of the most interesting and fruitful criticisms of what is now called the “repression hypothesis” (Foucault 1976 [1990]: 17–49). For Foucault, forms of subjectivity or identity are not a result of the repression of some primordial desire. Rather, identities are formed through power and certain discursive practices. Further, in the process of identity-formation, knowledge is not repressed but rather, called forth or produced. In his critique of Marcuse, Foucault writes:

I would also distinguish myself from para-Marxist like Marcuse who give the notion of repression an exaggerated role—because power would be a fragile thing if its only function were to repress, if it worked only through the mode of censorship, exclusion, blockage and repression, in the manner of a great Superego, exercising itself only in a negative way. If, on the contrary, power is strong this is because, as we are beginning to realize, it produces effects at the level of desire—and also at the level of knowledge. Far from preventing knowledge, power produces it. (Foucault 1980: 59)

4.3 Eros and Logos

Chapter Five of Eros and Civilization entitled “Philosophical Interlude” occurs as a bit of a rupture in the text. After discussing the Freudian theory of the instincts for four chapters, Marcuse takes a break from Freud and engages philosophy instead. However, this break is consistent with the purpose of the book. One of Marcuse’s main concerns in all of his work is the rationalization of domination. This was a major theme in One-Dimensional Man. This chapter also gives us a clue as to why Freud is so important for critical theory. Freud is put in opposition to the entire western philosophical tradition. The problem with the western philosophical tradition is that it constructs a view of rationality that is in compliance with the oppressive function of rationality or the form of rationality that supports domination. For example, the Kantian notion of moral duty for the sake of duty subordinates happiness to duty. Although Kant provides good reasons for this, he does not adequately address the need for happiness. According to Kant following, the moral law makes one worthy of happiness perhaps in the afterlife, but there is no real concern for happiness in the present world.

Marcuse’s criticism of western philosophy is very similar to recent criticisms by feminists and Africana philosophers. That is, philosophy tends to treat human beings as pure, abstract consciousness. The body and the passions are to be subdued by reason or Logos. Marcuse does not intend to subjugate Logos (reason) to Eros (desire). He simply wants to return Eros to its proper place as equal to Logos. It is Freud who recognizes the central role of Eros as a motivating factor in human action.

4.4 The Ideology of Scarcity

One of the most important features of Marcuse’s work is his dialectical analysis of western society. In his work he tries to bring attention to the co-existence of possibilities for liberation and the further development of mechanisms of domination. Our society produces the necessary conditions for freedom while at the same time producing greater oppression.

The very progress of civilization under the performance principle has attained a level of productivity at which the social demands upon instinctual energy to be spent in alienated labor could be considerably reduced (Marcuse 1955: 129)

The capitalist performance principle (the maximization of production and profit) has actually created the preconditions for a qualitatively different and non-repressive form of life. However, we have not entered into this new form of life as more repression is demanded.

Individual workers continue to engage in alienating labor although their labor has produced enough wealth to sustain them without ongoing toil. The problem is that the capitalist system is structured in such a way that all of the wealth goes to the minority who own or control the means of production. Although wealth is socially produced, its ownership and use is restricted to a few individuals. Hence the concept of scarcity has become obsolete and is used in an ideological sense to control the worker. The inhibitions and forms of repression that the worker must impose on himself so that he may direct his libidinal energy toward work goes beyond producing the goods that he needs for survival and instead produces extreme wealth for the capitalist. It is here where Marcuse, relying on his distinction between basic and surplus repression, goes beyond Freud. Regarding Freud’s metapsychology Marcuse says:

For his metapsychology, it is not decisive whether the inhibitions are imposed by scarcity or by the hierarchical distribution of scarcity, by the struggle for existence or by the interest in domination. (Marcuse 1955: 134)

Marcuse’s point is that in advanced industrial societies there is no longer a problem with acquiring the resources needed for existence or even the optimum life for members of those societies. The problem is with the fair and just distribution of resources. The very existence of the concept of scarcity in this age functions ideologically and supports the domination of the worker by the capitalist.

4.5 Fantasy, Utopia, and the Rationality of Gratification

While the first half of Eros and Civilization does not sound any more optimistic than the conclusion of Freud’s Civilization and its Discontents, it does move from diagnosis to prognosis or from critique to hope. At the diagnostic level, Marcuse examines the form of social pathology that permeates advanced industrial societies. The conclusion is that capitalism demands a level of surplus repression that supports the development of the death instinct and social domination. However, repression is never complete. Even Freud was aware of the incompleteness of repression in a 1915 essay simply entitled “Repression”. Both Freud and Marcuse recognize that repressed instincts never go away, but continue to assert themselves in one way or another. The erotic drive, which is the builder of culture, continues to assert itself in its conflict with the death instinct. According to Marcuse, the erotic drive for happiness and pleasure lives on in fantasies, art, and utopian visions.

The second half of Eros and Civilization is devoted to the work of fantasy and the imagination. Marcuse builds a case for the emancipatory function of the imagination by reconstructing Freud, Kant, Schiller, and others. His main point is that through the imagination we can envision a better world. This is not a blind utopian vision insofar as the resources for creating a qualitatively better form of life already exists. At the prognostic level, Marcuse argues for a fusion of Logos and Eros. This fusion he refers to as the “rationality of gratification” (Marcuse 1955: 224). Here, the struggle for existence is based on co-operation and free development and fulfillment of needs.

Although Eros and Civilization is one of Marcuse’s more optimistic works and offered a new and radical interpretation of Freud, it is not without controversy. Marcuse’s attempt to make Freud’s drive theory central to an emancipatory critical theory drew criticisms from several sources. I will discuss the response by some feminists in a later section.

In an Epilogue to Eros and Civilization entitled “Critique of Neo-Freudian Revisionism”, Marcuse accuses several prominent psychoanalysts of revising Freud’s work in such a way that it is purged of its critical implications. These revisionists use psychoanalysis to develop a conformist psychology rather than a critical one. This led to an open debate between Marcuse and a former member of the Institute, Erich Fromm. The debate took place in the mid 1950s in the journal Dissent. Marcuse believed that Fromm and others had rejected some of Freud’s key insights such as his libidinal theory, the death instinct, the Oedipus complex, the primal horde of patricides, etc.

The essential problem for Marcuse, was that as the years went by, Fromm moved further and further away from the instinctual basis of human personality. He had instead embraced “positive thinking which leaves the negative where it is—predominant over human existence” (Friedman 2013: 195).

Fromm’s approach differed from Marcuse’s insofar as he was more concerned with the role that society played in shaping one’s character. This different approach does not mean that Fromm has become less critical. Fromm is perhaps correct in his claim that Marcuse misread him. Given Fromm’s continued commitment to Marxism, it is not likely that he would reduce psychoanalysis to a conformist psychology. What appears to be positive thinking in Fromm’s work is really not far from what Marcuse was after himself in Eros and Civilization. That is, Fromm, in a way that differed from Marcuse, was attempting to rescue Eros, the builder of culture from the oppressive forces of capitalism. The Fromm/Marcuse debate represents an unfortunate moment in the history of critical theory where two major thinkers spoke right past each other.

5. One-Dimensional Thinking and the Democratic Rejection of Democracy

The first chapter of One-Dimensional Man begins with the following sentence:

A comfortable, smooth, reasonable, democratic unfreedom prevails in advanced industrial civilization, a token of technical progress. (Marcuse 1964: 1)

One-Dimensional Man is a further analysis of the worry at the center of Reason and Revolution, the whittling down of critical or negative thinking. As we saw earlier, negative thinking is two-dimensional as it sees the contradictions by which society is constituted, and it is aware of forces of domination. The person who thinks critically demands social change. One-dimensional thinking does not demand change nor does it recognize the degree to which the individual is a victim of forces of domination in society.

The idea of a democratic unfreedom refers to the free acceptance of oppression and surplus repression. In One-Dimensional Man and in Eros and Civilization, Marcuse makes a decisive move beyond Marx and Freud in his explanation of the containment of social change. He uses Freud to go beyond Marx insofar as Freud helps us understand the psychological mechanisms at work in individuals who accept surplus repression. However, he goes beyond Freud insofar as Freud’s theory of the super ego is obsolete. That is, in Freud’s theory, the super ego develops through the internalization of the values of some authority figure. According to Marcuse, the authority figure is no longer needed. The super ego has become depersonalized and is no longer fed by authority figures such as the father, ministers, teachers, the principle, etc. He writes:

But these personal father-images have gradually disappeared behind the institutions. With the rationalization of the productive apparatus, with the multiplication of functions, all domination assumes the form of administration. (Marcuse 1955: 98)

Marcuse’s point is that domination no longer requires force or the presence of an authority figure. The function of one-dimensional thinking is to produce a one-dimensional society by whittling down critical, two-dimensional consciousness. This is accomplished in several ways which will simply be listed here.

  1. The system must make the citizens think that they are freer than they really are.
  2. The system must provide the citizens with enough goods to keep them pacified.
  3. The citizens must identify with their oppressors.
  4. Political discourse must be eliminated.

There is not enough space here to examine each of these. One example should suffice. It was shown earlier that the purpose of dialectical or negative thinking was to reveal social contradictions and demand the overcoming of those contradictions through social change. One-dimensional thinking smoothes over these contradictions and makes them invisible. A form of ideology is put in place where the oppressed identifies with the oppressor. People feel a sense of unity simply because they watch the same TV programs, or support the same sport teams. In politics, vague terms are used such as "the American people" or "the American way of life" to hide the very different ways that people in America actually experience America. The American way of life differs greatly between rich and poor Americans.

Another example of one-dimensional thinking is the subject of Marcuse’s famous and controversial essay “Repressive Tolerance”. Here, Marcuse shows how terms, ideas, or concepts that have their origin in struggles for liberation can be co-opted and used to legitimate oppression. The concept of tolerance was once used as a critical concept by marginalized social groups. According to Marcuse, the term is now used by the Establishment to legitimate its own oppressive views and policies. It is the idea of pure tolerance or tolerance for the sake of tolerance that ignores the real concrete social conflict out of which the concept emerged. Rather than pure tolerance, Marcuse calls for “discriminating tolerance” (Marcuse 1968a: 123).

6. The Dialectic of Technology

In their famous book Dialectic of Enlightenment Marcuse’s colleagues Max Horkheimer and Theodor Adorno attempted to demonstrate that the Enlightenment embodied a tension between its own project of liberation and its own new mechanisms of oppression and domination. For Marcuse, modern technology (a product of the Enlightenment) embodies a similar tension. The question for him was “what role does technology play in the project of human emancipation?” The technological boom has been supported by the idea that there is some fundamental connection between technological development and the human quest for liberation and a better life. However, we were disabused of this idea by Freud and many others. The question now is “does technological advance lead to more repression and domination?”

Marcuse’s critical theory is always dialectical, as he examines forms of oppression and domination while also, at the same, looking for the potential for liberation. In an essay entitled “Some Social Implications of Modern Technology” written in 1941, Marcuse makes an important distinction between technology and technics. He would continue to employ some version of this distinction for the rest of his life when writing about technology. In this essay he says:

In this article, technology is taken as a social process in which technics proper (that is, the technical apparatus of industry, transportation, communication) is but a partial factor. We do not ask for the influence or effect of technology on human individuals. For they are themselves an integral part and factor of technology, not only as the men who invent or attend to machinery but also as the social groups which direct its application and utilization. Technology, as a mode of production, as the totality of instruments, devices and contrivances which characterize the machine age is thus at the same time a mode of organization and perpetuating (or changing) social relationships, a manifestation of prevalent thought and behavior patterns, an instrument for control and domination. Technics by itself can promote authoritarianism as well as liberty, scarcity as well as abundance, the extension as well as the abolition of toil. (Marcuse 1998)

On the basis of the above passage it may sound as if technics is neutral as it can promote either oppression or liberation. However, this is not the case. Marcuse makes this clear in another essay entitled “The Problem of Social Change in the Technological Society” written twenty years later. Also, in a 1960 essay entitled “From Ontology to Technology”, using the term “technicity” instead of “technics” he again rejects the neutrality of technics or technicity. By “technics”, Marcuse means the devices or instruments that are used to transform nature in the service of human beings.

Technics is the methodological negation of nature by human thought and action. In this negation, natural conditions and relations become instrumentalities for the preservation, enlargement, and refinement of human society. (Marcuse 2011: 45)

By “Technology”, Marcuse means the mode of production or the totality of instruments, devices, etc.

If technology refers to a mode of production or totality of instruments, then as such it is situated within a certain ideological structure, indeed, it is a form of ideology which determines the form of machinery for a particular form of production as well as that form of production itself. Here, “ideology” simply refers to a belief system or a way of thinking which would include the telos or purpose of all social thought and action.

At the level of technics, a machine can be considered neutral only as pure matter, but in a technological society no such machine exists, hence, technics is not neutral. Every machine is constituted within a web of social, political, economic meaning, an ensemble of social relations. Technics exists within a certain mode of production as well as in certain relations of production. Every technical item is given a mission and is to further the goals of the present reality principle or capitalist performance principle. There is a dialectic involved here insofar as even if modern technology has its origin in a repressive, oppressive, capitalist reality principle, this same technology carries within itself other possibilities.

Marcuse believed that it was possible to conceive of technology under an entirely new reality principle. In the capitalist system, technics and its governing technological ideology is based on the performance principle of competition and production and must serve the goals set by this performance principle. Even if scarcity is no longer a real problem, the idea and fear of scarcity are taken up and put to work for the ideology of production for the sake of production and competition for the sake of competition. We are never told that at this moment we have the necessary resources to end world hunger. Instead, we are told that more and more technological progress will end the problem of scarcity.

According to Marcuse, the use that is made of technology is ideologically shaped by the present reality principle. It is this oppressive/repressive reality principle that shapes the telos of technological development. Hence, neither technology nor technics can be neutral because the entire meaning and purpose of such has its birth within a reality and performance principle that as Marcuse has reminded us, does not have the liberation and happiness of all human beings as its goal. The entire technological and technical apparatus is given its form and mission by the ruling class.

According to Marcuse, a new sensibility, that is, a reshaping of human relationships with each other as well as with nature would usher in a new reality principle. With this new reality principle would come a new mission or telos for technology. Under this new reality principle it would be unthinkable to associate technological progress with the building of bombs and more sophisticated instruments of death.

7. The Specter of Liberation: The Great Refusal and the New Sensibility

Although the form of critique in some of Marcuse’s works and the use of concepts such as one-dimensionality may cause one to read a bit of pessimism into Marcuse’s texts, nothing could be more problematic than such a reading. The social reality in advanced industrial societies is that very sophisticated systems of domination are in place and they are capable of transforming themselves to meet the challenge of any movement for liberation. However, as Marx and Engels warned in The Communist Manifesto, “A specter is haunting Europe—the specter of communism” (Marx and Engels 1848 [1964]: 55). For Marcuse, the specter of liberation haunted advanced industrial societies. One might even say that Marcuse’s own critical theory was haunted by the specter of liberation. That is, at one level Marcuse engaged in a critique of oppressive social structures so that the door for revolution and liberation could be opened. At another level, Marcuse modified his theory to make room for various form of resistance that he saw developing in oppressive societies. Marcuse was at once a teacher of revolutionary consciousness and a student.

Although he was called the guru of the student movements in the 1960s, he rejected this title because he was also learning from these movements. The hope for revolution lay within individuals who in their very being have grown weary with their own repression. The student movements of the 60s were not based on class struggle, but rather, a rejection of their own repression as well as a growing lack of tolerance for war and waste. In the Preface to An Essay on Liberation while reflecting on the student revolt of 1968, Marcuse says:

In proclaiming the “permanent challenge,” (la contestation permanente), the “permanent education,” the Great Refusal, they recognized the mark of social repression, even in the most sublime manifestations of traditional culture, even in the most spectacular manifestations of technical progress. They have again raised a specter (and this time a specter which haunts not only the bourgeoisie but all exploitative bureaucracies): the specter of a revolution which subordinates the development of productive forces and higher standards of living to the requirements of creating solidarity for the human species, for abolishing poverty and misery beyond all national frontiers and spheres of interest, for the attainment of peace. (Marcuse 1969: ix–x)

The student protests of the 1960s were a form of Great Refusal, a saying “NO” to multiple forms of repression and domination. This Great Refusal demands a new/liberated society. This new society requires what Marcuse calls the new sensibility which is an ascension of the life instincts over the aggressive instincts (Marcuse 1969: 23). This idea of a new sensibility is yet another move beyond Marxism insofar as it requires much more than new power relations. It requires the cultivation of new forms of subjectivity. Human subjectivity in its present form is the product of systems of domination. We rid society of its systems of domination by ridding it of the forms of subjectivity formed by those systems and replacing them with new forms of subjectivity. This is why Marcuse was so interested in the feminist movement. He saw in this movement the potential for radical social change. The process of rethinking femininity and masculinity could be the beginning of redefining male subjectivity so that it develops in a way that males become less aggressive.

The cultivation of a new sensibility would transform the relationship between human beings and nature as well as the relationships among human beings. The new sensibility is the medium of social change that mediates between the political practice of changing the world and one’s own drive for personal liberation (Marcuse 2007: 234).

8. Marcuse and Feminism

Marcuse’s search for a form of radical subjectivity that could serve as an impetus for revolution or social transformation led him down a path not traveled by his Frankfurt School colleagues. Indeed, one of the criticisms of Marcuse is that he gave in to pessimism and gave up on the working class as revolutionary subject. For Marcuse, we must look to “the substratum of the outcasts and outsiders, etc,” for any social change (MacIntyre 1970: 87).

One of the social movements that Marcuse turns to is the feminist movement. On March 7, 1974 Marcuse gave a paper at Stanford University entitled, “Marxism and Feminism”. In it he states:

I believe the women’s liberation movement today is, perhaps the most important and potentially the most radical political movement that we have. (Marcuse 2005a: 165)

For Marcuse, the women’s liberation movement was important not only for the liberation of women, but also for the liberation of all oppressed people in our society. His hope was that the struggle for the liberation of women would create a new type of performance principle and aid in the cultivation of a new sensibility. In short, certain feminine qualities would replace brutish, violent, masculine qualities. Marcuse actually advocated a form of androgyny.

One of the main criticisms of Marcuse’s attitude toward feminism is that he simply reinforces gendered stereotypes as he falls back into essentialism. Nina Power has recently defended Marcuse against this charge. Her argument is similar to the one that Marcuse made in an interview with Brian Magee in 1978. Power and Marcuse both argue that although so-called feminine categories are social constructs, they still can be universalized in such a way that all human beings develop a new sensibility. Power states that:

Feminist socialism would universalize these so-called feminine characteristics so that they were no longer specifically “feminine” at all but would characterize all culture, culminating in androgyny. Residual aggression would be channeled into “the destruction of the ugly destructiveness of capitalism,” in Marcuse’s rather neat phrase. “Feminism is a revolt against decaying capitalism” and will ultimately have to develop its “own morality”. (Power 2013: 79)

Feminists such as Jessica Benjamin and Nancy Chodorow have pointed out a particular weakness in Marcuse’s critical theory that was never addressed by Marcuse himself. For both thinkers, Marcuse’s reliance on Freud’s drive theory as that which might produce the need for social change is inadequate because he fails to account for the intersubjective development of the individual.


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Other Works Cited

  • Freud, Sigmund, 1915 [1949], “Repression” in Sigmund Freud: Collected Papers Vol. IV, Ernest Jones (trans.), London: The Hogarth Press and the Institute of Psycho-Analysis.
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  • Marx, Karl and Friedrich Engels, 1848 [1964], The Communist Manifesto, Samuel Moore (trans.), New York: Washington Square Press.
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Arnold Farr <arnold.farr@uky.edu>

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