Moore’s Moral Philosophy

First published Wed Jan 26, 2005; substantive revision Mon Mar 22, 2021

G.E. Moore’s Principia Ethica of 1903 is often considered a revolutionary work that set a new agenda for 20th-century ethics. This historical view is, however, somewhat overstated. In metaethics Moore’s non-naturalist realism was close to that defended by Henry Sidgwick and other late 19th-century philosophers such as Hastings Rashdall, Franz Brentano, and J.M.E. McTaggart; in normative ethics his ideal consequentialism likewise echoed views of Rashdall, Brentano, and McTaggart. But Principia Ethica presented its views with unusual force and vigor. In particular, it made much more of the alleged errors of metaethical naturalism than Sidgwick or Rashdall had, saying they vitiated most previous moral philosophy. For this reason, Moore’s work had a disproportionate influence on 20th-century moral philosophy and remains the best-known expression of a general metaethical view also shared by later writers such as H.A. Prichard, W.D. Ross, and C.D. Broad.

1. Non-naturalism and the Open-Question Argument

Moore’s non-naturalism comprised two main theses. One was the realist thesis that moral and more generally normative judgements – like many of his contemporaries, Moore did not distinguish the two – are true or false objectively, or independently of any beliefs or attitudes we may have. The other was the autonomy-of-ethics thesis that moral judgements are sui generis, neither reducible to nor derivable from non-moral, for example scientific or metaphysical, judgements; they express a distinctive kind of objective truth. Closely connected to his non-naturalism was the epistemological view that our knowledge of moral truths is intuitive, in the sense that it is not arrived at by inference from non-moral truths but rests on our recognizing certain moral propositions as self-evident, by a kind of direct or immediate insight.

Moore expressed the realist side of his non-naturalism by saying that fundamental moral judgements ascribe the property of goodness or badness to states of affairs, though especially in Principia Ethica he tended not to distinguish moral concepts and moral properties. Like others of his time, he seems to have taken the realist view that moral judgements are objectively true for granted; he certainly did not defend it extensively against anti-realist alternatives. Thus the first sentence of Principia Ethica refers casually, and without any sense of controversy, to the “truth” of some ethical judgements (1903: 1/1993: 53). In this he was doubtless influenced by the grammar of moral judgements, which have a standard subject-predicate form, as in “x is good.” But it may also be relevant that, at least early on, the only version of subjectivism he seems to have been aware of was the naturalist view that to say “x is good” is to report some psychological fact such as that you approve of x or that most people in your society do. In his later book Ethics he argued, among other things, that this view does not allow for moral disagreement, since, for example, my report that I approve of x and your report that you disapprove of it can both be true (1912: 100–03/1947: 62–64/1965: 42–43). Late in his life he encountered the non-cognitivist emotivism of C.L. Stevenson, which says that moral judgements express rather than report feelings and therefore can conflict (Stevenson 1942). He initially conceded, surprisingly, that Stevenson’s anti-realist view had as good a claim as his own to be true (1942: 544–45), but shortly after he reverted to his earlier non-naturalism, saying he could not imagine what had induced him to consider abandoning it (Ewing 1962: 251).

Especially in Principia Ethica, Moore spent much more time defending his other non-naturalist thesis, about the autonomy of ethics, which he expressed by saying the property of goodness is simple and unanalyzable, and in particular unanalyzable in non-moral terms. This meant the property is “non-natural,” or distinct from any of the natural properties studied by science, though he also thought it distinct from metaphysical properties. Views that denied this thesis committed what he called “the naturalistic fallacy” (1903: 10/1993: 62), which he found in hedonists such as Jeremy Bentham, evolutionary ethicists such as Herbert Spencer, and metaphysical ethicists such as T.H. Green. His main argument against their view was what has come to be known as the “open-question argument,” though he actually stated in two slightly different ways. Consider a particular naturalist claim, such as that “x is good” is equivalent to “x is pleasant” or “x is pleasure.”If this claim were true, he argued, the judgement “Pleasure is good” would be equivalent to “Pleasure is pleasure,” yet surely someone who asserts the former means to express more than that uninformative tautology. Alternatively, if this naturalist claim were true, “x is pleasant but x is not good” would be self-contradictory. Once it was established that x is pleasant, the question whether it is good would then be closed, or not worth considering, whereas, he argued, it remains open. The same argument can be mounted against any other naturalist proposal: even if we have determined that something is what we desire to desire or is more evolved, the question whether it is good remains open, in the sense of not being settled by the meaning of the word “good.” We can ask whether what we desire to desire is good, and likewise for what is more evolved, more unified, or whatever (1903: 10–17/1993: 62–69). Sidgwick had used one form of this argument against Bentham and Spencer, but only in passing (1907: 26n, 109); Moore developed it a greater length and made it central to his metaethics. And though he applied it specifically to “good,” it can equally well be used about other moral or normative concepts such as “ought” and “duty.”

The open-question argument was extensively discussed in 20th-century metaethics and met with several objections. One said the argument’s persuasiveness depends on the “paradox of analysis”: that any definition of a concept will, if it is successful, appear uninformative. If an analysis does capture all its target concept’s content, the sentence linking the two will be a tautology; but this is hardly a reason to reject all analyses (Langford 1942). Here it can be replied that in other cases accepting a definition leads us to see that the sentence affirming it, while initially seeming informative, in fact is not; thus “a bachelor is an unmarried man” is not informative. This does not happen, however, in the case of “good.” Even if we agree that only pleasure is good, no amount of reflection will make us think “Pleasure is good” is equivalent to “Pleasure is pleasure”; Ross, for one, gave this response (1930: 92–94). Another objection, made from the 1970s on and very influential, says that while the open-question argument may show that the concept “good” is distinct from any non-moral concept, it cannot support a similar conclusion about the property of goodness. (Recall that Moore tended not to distinguish concepts from properties.) Empirical science, the objection runs, uncovers many non-analytic property-identities, for example, that the property of being water is identical to the property of being H2O even though the concepts “water” and “H2O” are distinct. By analogy, the property of goodness could be identical to that of being pleasant even if “good” and “pleasant” have different meanings (e.g. Brink 1989: Ch. 6). Moore’s mistake, then, was to think that what may indeed hold for the concept “good” also holds for the property of goodness. Again, however, it can be replied that natural-kind properties such as being water have special features that allow non-analytic identities but that aren’t had by ethical properties such as goodness, for which such identities are impossible. More specifically, it can be argued, the property of being water is the property of having that underlying structure, whichever it is, the explains the behaviour of the stuff found in lakes, rivers, and streams; when this structure turns out to be H2O, the latter property “fills a gap” in the former and makes the two identical (Parfit 2011, vol. 2: 298–303, 329–38; also Gampel 1996). But this explanation does not extend to the case of goodness, which is not a higher-level property with any gap that needs filling. To be good is not to have whatever other property plays some functional role; it is just to be good. It follows that if goodness is analytically distinct from any natural property, it is metaphysically distinct from it too.

It is worth noting, however, that Moore did not explain his open-question argument in the way many later non-cognitivists, who likewise endorsed the argument, would. Following Hume, they held that moral judgements are intrinsically motivating, so that sincerely accepting “x is good” requires a commitment or at least some motivation to pursue x if that is possible (e.e. Hare 1952: 81–93; Hare 1963: 22–29). But then no analysis of “good” in purely natural terms can succeed, since it cannot capture the term’s action-guiding force; nor can an evaluative conclusion be validly inferred from premises none of which have that force. Whatever the merits of this Humean explanation, Moore himself did not give it. The question whether moral judgements are intrinsically motivating is not one on which he expressed clear views or which he apparently thought important. In Principia Ethica he remarked in passing that we “hardly ever” think something good without having some attitude of will towards it, but he denied that this is true universally (1903: 131, 135–6/1993: 181–82, 186). Whether it is true universally, and what might follow if it is, is not something he seems to have thought it worth considering further.

2. Metaethical Innovations

The main elements of Moore’s non-naturalism – moral realism and the autonomy of ethics – had been defended earlier by Sidgwick and others and were reasonably well known when Moore wrote. This is reflected in the initial reviews of Principia Ethica, many of which questioned its claims to metaethical originality (see Welchman 1989). But Moore did add two metaethical innovations. One was his view that the fundamental moral concept is “good” (plus its contrary “bad”), which he expressed by saying that goodness is simple and unanalyzable, even in moral terms. This had not been Sidgwick’s view. For him the central moral concept was “ought,” and he defined good in terms of ought, more specifically, as what one ought to desire (1907: 112). Principia Ethica took the exactly opposite view, defining ought in terms of good, so “one ought to do x” literally means “x will produce the most good possible” (1903: 25, 146–48/1993: 76–77, 196–98). But Moore was quickly persuaded by Bertrand Russell that this view is vulnerable to his own open-question argument, since in saying “one ought to do what will produce the most good” we do not mean “what will produce the most good will produce the most good” (Russell 1904: 330). In later work such as Ethics he therefore held that ought is a distinct moral property from good (1912: 173, 180–81/1947: 107–08, 112–13/1965: 73, 76–77; also 1942: 558–59), and in an uncompleted Preface to a planned second edition of Principia Ethica he allowed that it would not affect the essence of his non-naturalism if good were defined in moral terms, say, as what one ought to desire (1993: 5, 14–15). But he continued to prefer the view that good is a simple concept, not definable in deontic terms (1942: 574–77), and there was vigorous debate on this topic in this general period, with Brentano, Broad, and A.C. Ewing defending reductive analyses similar to Sidgwick’s while Ross preferred a non-reductive view like Moore’s. On the Moorean view judgements about the goodness of states of affairs are not shorthand for judgements about how we ought or have reason to respond to those states; they are independent judgements that explain, synthetically but as following “from the very nature” of goodness, why we ought so to respond.

Moore’s second innovation was his view that the intrinsic value of a state of affairs can depend only on its intrinsic properties, ones it has apart from any relations to other states. Earlier writers had distinguished between goodness as an end, which they also called intrinsic or ultimate goodness, and goodness as a means, and had said the former cannot rest just on a state’s causally producing goods external to itself. But they seemed to allow that goodness as an end can depend on other relational properties; thus they talked as if a belief’s being true, which is necessary for its being knowledge, can increase its value, while a pleasure’s being that of a bad person can make it worse. Moore did not explicitly state his more restrictive view that intrinsic goodness can depend only on intrinsic properties until “The Conception of Intrinsic Value” of 1922, but it nonetheless guided Principia Ethica at two points. One was the book’s specific formulation of its principle of organic unities, discussed below. The other was its testing for a state’s intrinsic value by the “method of isolation,” which involves asking whether a universe containing only that state and no other would be good (1903: 91, 93, 95, 187–88, 208/1993: 142, 145, 147, 236–37, 256); the point of this method is precisely to insulate judgements of intrinsic value from facts about a state’s external relations by ensuring that there are none such. Moore’s strict view was shared by some later writers such as Ross (1930: 75), while others argued that a better theory of value results if intrinsic goodness is allowed to depend on some relational properties (e.g. Ewing 1947: 114). But Moore was the first to raise this issue clearly.

These two innovations, though not trivial, do not affect the core of a non-naturalist metaethics. Some critics, however, charge that Moore did change that view fundamentally, and for the worse. They say Sidgwick’s non-naturalism was comparatively modest, holding only that there are truths about what people ought or have reason to do that we can know by reflection. Moore, the objection runs, supplemented this modest view with an extravagant metaphysics of non-natural properties inhabiting a dubious supersensible realm and a mysterious faculty of intuition that acquaints us with them. These additions opened non-naturalism to entirely avoidable objections and led, regrettably, to its widespread rejection by later philosophers (e.g. Mackie 1976: 323; Shaver 2000: 263–65; Phillips 2011: 29–30).

These charges are, however, hard to sustain. Principia Ethica actually downplayed the metaphysical side of its non-naturalism, saying that goodness has “being” but does not “exist”, as numbers, too, have being but do not exist; in particular, goodness does not exist in any “supersensible reality,” because there is no such reality (1903: 110–12, 123–25/1993: 161–63, 174–76). What exactly Moore meant by these claims is unclear, but it’s at least possible to read them as suggesting a non-metaphysical moral realism like those defended more recently by Nagel (1986), Scanlon (1998, 2014), and Parfit (2011, vol. 2: 464–87 ). Nor did his explicit talk of properties mark a significant departure from Sidgwick. This is partly because he did not clearly distinguish concepts and properties, and partly because if Sidgwick thought people ought to pursue pleasure, he would surely have to grant that pleasure has the property of being something people ought to pursue. The question is how ontologically robust Moore’s talk of a property of goodness was, and given his denial that such goodness exists the answer is uncertain. The distinction between more and less metaphysical forms of non-naturalism is not one he clearly addressed.

Moore was similarly modest in his moral epistemology, saying several times, as Sidgwick also had, that by calling our knowledge of basic moral truths “intuitive” he meant only that it is not derived by inference from other knowledge; he likewise denied that moral intuition is infallible, saying that in whatever way we can cognize a true proposition, we can cognize a false one (1903: viii. x/1993: 34, 36). He did sometimes make bald assertions of self-evidence, as in his claim in Principia Ethica that it is “obvious” that the chief intrinsic goods are aesthetic appreciation and personal love (1903: 188/1993: 237) or in Ethics that it is “self-evident” that what is right is always what most promotes the good (1912: 1809–81/1947: 112–13/1965: 76–77), and some critics have found this baldness troubling. But the contrast with earlier non-naturalists such as Sidgwick should again not be overdrawn. Sidgwick arguably, too, gave most weight to intuitions about abstract moral principles (1907: 379–84), including one close to that which Moore cited in Ethics, and appealed to more concrete judgements only in ad hominem arguments against opponents. And Moore often argued in more complex ways. In Principia Ethica he defended his claim that beauty on its own is good by appealing to intuitions about a specific beautiful world, containing mountains, rivers, and sunsets (1903: 83–85/1993: 135–36), and criticized the view that only pleasure is good by arguing that it conflicts with several concrete things we believe, such as that there are bad pleasures (1903: 95/1993:146–47) and that a life of intensely pleasurable but illusory experiences would not be best (1903: 197–98/1993: 246–47; compare 1912: 52–53, 237–39/1947: 34, 146–47/1965: 22, 102). Moore likewise insisted that before we make judgements of self-evidence we must make sure that the propositions we are considering are clear (1903: viii/1993: 34); failure to do so, he argued, explains many of the existing disagreements about ethics. And he took note of common opinions to the extent of trying to explain away contrary views when he found them. Overall his approach to establishing moral truths was close to Sidgwick’s, appealing to intuitive judgements that can be made at different levels of generality and that must be brought into a coherent whole, though with the primary emphasis on abstract judgements. This is not to say his non-naturalism was beyond objection. Any such view holds that there are truths independent of natural and logical ones and knowable by some non-empirical means, and many find this pair of claims problematic. But Moore’s version of the view was arguably no more objectionable than others. If Sidgwick’s non-naturalism did not involve a problematic metaphysics and epistemology, neither did Moore’s; if Moore’s was hopelessly extravagant, so was a supposedly more modest one like Sidgwick’s.

A final important feature of Moore’s metaethics was its reductionism about normative concepts. Like Sidgwick, the Moore of Principia Ethica held that there is just one basic normative concept, though he thought it was good rather than ought; like Ross, the later Moore held that there are just two. But this conceptual reductionism, which was common throughout the period from Sidgwick to Ross, Broad, and Ewing, contrasts with the plurality of concepts recognized in much present-day ethics. First, Moore and his contemporaries took as basic only the “thin” concepts good and ought rather than “thick” moral concepts such as courage and generosity; the latter, they held, combined a thin concept with some more or less determinate descriptive content. They were also reductive about the thin concepts. They did not distinguish between moral oughts and prudential or rational ones, holding that there is only the single, moral ought; this is why for them egoism was a view about morality, not a challenge to it from outside the moral realm. Nor did they recognize different types of value. For them goodness was a property only of states of affairs and not, as some Kantians hold, of persons and other objects. They likewise did not accept the late 20th-century idea that there is a distinct concept of “well-being,” or of what is “good for” a person; instead, they often defined a person’s good as what is simply good and located in his life (e.g. Sidgwick 1907: 112; Moore 1903: 98–99/1993: 150–51). Nor did they distinguish between moral and non-moral goodness, holding that the former is just ordinary goodness when possessed by certain objects, such as traits of character (e.g. Ross 1930: 155). The result was that all normative judgements can be expressed using at most the two concepts “good” and “ought,” which are therefore the only ones one needed. To some this conclusion will mean that Moore and his contemporaries ignored important conceptual distinctions; to others it will mean they avoided pointless conceptual debates. But it did free them to discuss substantive questions about what is in fact good and right. On this topic Moore’s views, though not entirely novel, were again both striking and strikingly stated.

3. Impersonal Consequentialism

Moore’s normative view again comprised two main theses. One was impersonal consequentialism, the view that what is right is always what produces the greatest total good impartially considered, or counting all goods equally. The other was the ideal or perfectionist thesis that what is good is not only or primarily pleasure or the satisfaction of desires but certain states whose value is independent of people’s attitudes to them. Moore recognized several such states, but in Principia Ethica he famously said that “by far the most valuable things…are certain states of consciousness, which may roughly be described as the pleasures of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects” (1903: 188/1993: 237). According to his ideal consequentialism, what is right is in large part what most promotes loving personal relationships and aesthetic appreciation for all persons everywhere.

Principia Ethica took the consequentialist part of this view to be analytically true, since it defined the right as what most promotes the good. But once Moore abandoned this definition, he had to treat the consequentialist principle as synthetic and he did so in Ethics, which allowed that deontological views that say some acts that maximize the good are wrong are coherent. But even there he did not argue at length for consequentialism, simply announcing that it is self-evident (1912: 180–81/1947: 112–13/1965: 76–77). This in part reflected a common assumption of his time, when a majority of moral philosophers accepted some form of consequentialism. But it may also be relevant that the only alternative he seems to have considered was an absolute deontology like Kant’s, which says that some acts such as killing and lying are wrong no matter what their consequences (1903: 106/1993: 157; 1912: 175–81/1947: 109–13/1965: 74–77). His major ethical works did not consider a moderate deontology such as would later be developed by Ross (1930), in which deontological prohibitions against killing and lying often outweigh considerations of good consequences but can themselves be outweighed if enough good is at stake. It is not clear what Moore’s response to such a moderate deontology would have been.

Principia Ethica also took the impartialism of its view to be analytic, and in particular claimed that ethical or rational egoism, which says each person should pursue only his own good, is self-contradictory. (Despite his interest in personal love, Moore never considered the intermediate view that Broad (1971)) would call self-referential altruism, according to which each person should care more about the good of those close to him, such as his family and friends.) Sidgwick had claimed that if a rational egoist confines himself to saying that each person’s pleasure is good for him, or from his point of view, he cannot be argued out of his position (1907: 420–21). But Moore argued that the concept of agent-relative goodness invoked here is unintelligible (1903: 97–102/1993: 148–53), and that conclusion does follow from his view that goodness is simple and unanalyzable. If goodness is a simple property, how can a state such as person A’s pleasure have this property “from one point of view” but not “from another”? (Compare squareness. An object cannot be square from one point of view but not from another; it either is square or is not.) All that talk of the good “for” a person can pick out, he urged, is what is simply good and located in that person; and simple goodness gives everyone equally reason to pursue it. In Ethics Moore abandoned this argument, saying that egoism cannot be proven false by any argument, even though he thought its falsity is self-evident (1912: 228–32/1947: 141–43/1965: 98–100). But it is not clear how he could make this concession if he still held, as he preferred to, that goodness is a simple property. Perhaps he was tacitly allowing, as he would in the uncompleted draft Preface to Principia Ethica (1993: 5, 14–15), that it would not centrally damage his position if good were analyzed in terms of ought, as it had been by Sidgwick. There is no contradiction in saying that what each person ought to desire is different, say, just his own pleasure. But if all oughts derive from a simple property of goodness, as Moore always preferred to hold, all oughts must be impartial.

In applying this view, Moore gave it the form of what today is called “indirect” or “two-level” (Hare 1981) consequentialism. In deciding how to act, we should not try to assess individual acts for their specific consequences; instead, we should follow certain general moral rules, such as “Do not kill” and “Keep promises,” which are such that adhering to them will most promote the good through time. This policy will sometimes lead us not to do the act with the best individual outcome, but given our general propensity to error the policy’s consequences will be better in the long run than trying to assess acts one by one; however well-meaning, the latter attempt will be counterproductive (1903: 149–70/1993: 198–219. This indirect consequentialism had again been defended earlier, by Sidgwick and John Stuart Mill, but Moore gave it a very conservative form, urging adherence to the rules even in the face of apparently compelling evidence that breaking them now would be optimific. Principia Ethica made the surprising claim that the relevant rules will be the same given any commonly accepted theory of the good, for example, given either hedonism or Moore’s own ideal theory (1903: 158/1993: 207). This claim of extensional equivalence for different consequentialist views was not new; T.H. Green, F.H. Bradley, and McTaggart had all suggested that hedonism and ideal consequentialism have similar practical implications. But Moore was surely expressing the more plausible view when in Ethics he doubted that pleasure and ideal values always go together (1912: 234–39/1947: 144–47/1965: 100–02), and even when he accepted the equivalence claim he remained intensely interested in what he called “the primary ethical question of what is good in itself” (1903: 158, 26, 77/1993: 207, 78, 128). Like Green, Bradley, and McTaggart, he thought the central philosophical question is what explains why good things are good, i.e., which of their properties make them good. That was the subject of his most brilliant piece of ethical writing, Chapter 6 of Principia Ethica on “The Ideal.”

4. The Ideal

One of this chapter’s larger aims was to defend value-pluralism, the view that there are many ultimate goods. Moore thought one bar to this view is the naturalistic fallacy. He assumed, plausibly, that philosophers who treat goodness as identical to some natural property will usually make this a simple property, such as just pleasure or just evolutionary fitness, rather than a disjunctive property such as pleasure-or-evolutionary-fitness-or-knowledge. But then any naturalist view pushes us toward value-monism, or toward the view that only one kind of state is good (1903: 20; 1993: 72). Once we reject naturalism, however, we can see what Moore thought is self-evident: that there are irreducibly many goods. Another bar to value-pluralism is excessive demands for unity or system in ethics. Sidgwick had used such demands to argue that only pleasure can be good, since no theory with a plurality of ultimate values can justify a determinate scheme for weighing them against each other (1907: 406). But Moore, agreeing here with Rashdall, Ross, and others, said that “to search for ‘unity’ and ‘system,’ at the expense of truth, is not, I take it, the proper business of philosophy” (1903: 222/1993: 270). If intuition reveals a plurality of ultimate goods, an adequate theory must recognize that plurality.

According to a famous part of Principia Ethica, one of those goods is the existence of beauty. Arguing against Sidgwick’s view that all goods must be states of consciousness (1907: 113–15), Moore asked readers to imagine a beautiful world with no minds in it: is this world’s existence not better than that of a horribly ugly world (1903: 83–85/1993: 135–36)? In answering yes, he anticipated some strands in present-day environmental ethics, which likewise hold that there can be value in features of the natural environment apart from any awareness of them. But he did not insist on this view. Later in Principia Ethica he said that beauty on its own at most has little and may have no value (1903: 202, 203/1993: 250, 251), and in Ethics he implicitly denied that beauty on its own has value. There he held, as Sidgwick had, that all intrinsic goods involve some state of consciousness and perhaps even of pleasure (1912: 239–41, 249/1947: 147–49, 153/1965: 103–04, 107). But his first book had defended the contrary view.

Moore also gave some weight to the hedonic states of pleasure and pain. He thought the former a very minor good, saying pleasure on its own at most has limited and may have no value, but he thought pain a very great evil, which there is a serious duty to prevent (1903: 212–13, 222–23/1993: 260–61, 270–71) His view therefore involved a value-asymmetry, with pain a much greater evil than pleasure is a good. This had not been the traditional view; most hedonists had held that a pleasure of a given intensity is exactly as good as a pain of the same intensity is evil (e.g. Sidgwick 1907: 413). But Moore thought it intuitively compelling that the pain is worse; if that makes the theory of value less systematic, so much the worse for system.

While many ideal consequentialists have treated knowledge as intrinsically good, in some cases supremely so, Principia Ethica did not, saying knowledge is a necessary component of the larger good of appreciating existing beauty but has little or no value in itself (1903: 199/1993: 248). Again Ethics may have reversed this view, citing knowledge several times as one ideal good that may be added to the hedonists’ good of pleasure (1912: 237, 247/1947 146, 152/1965: 102, 106). But Moore never saw any intrinsic value in achievement, for example in business or politics, or indeed in any active changing of the world. As John Maynard Keynes said, his chief goods were states of mind that “were not associated with action or achievement or with consequence. They consisted in timeless, passionate states of contemplation and communion, largely unattached to ‘before and after’” (Keynes 1949: 83).

The first of these goods was the appreciation of beauty, which for Moore combined the cognition of beautiful qualities with an appropriately positive emotion toward them, such as enjoyment or admiration. We listen to music, for example, hear beautiful qualities in it, and are pleased by or admire those qualities. But the value here is entirely contemplative; Moore saw no separate worth in what the romantics had especially valued, the active creation of beauty. He might say that an artist must understand and love his work’s beauty if he is to create it, perhaps even more than someone who merely enjoys it, but the value in his work is still not distinctively creative. In characterizing this good Moore gave a further reductive analysis, this time of beauty as “that of which the admiring contemplation is good in itself” (1903: 201–02/1993: 249–50). Beauty too, then, was not a distinct normative concept but analyzable in terms of goodness. He did not notice, however, that this definition seems again to open him to an open-question argument, since it reduces the claim that it is good to contemplate beauty to the near-tautology that it is good to contemplate what it is good to contemplate.

Though Moore in Principia Ethica thought beauty good in itself, he did not insist on this view when valuing the appreciation of beauty; the latter might be good even if the former was not. But he still thought the existence of beauty makes a significant difference to value. More specifically, he thought the admiring contemplation of beauty that actually exists and causes your contemplation is significantly better than an otherwise similar contemplation of merely imagined beauty, and better by more than can be attributed to the existence of the beauty on its own. This view involved an application of his “principle of organic unities,” which is one of his main contributions and says the value of a whole need not equal the sum of the values its parts would have on their own (1903: 27–29/1993: 78–80). If state x on its own has value a and state y on its own has value b, the whole combining them by relation R need not have value a + b; it may have more and it may have less. This principle had been accepted by Idealists such as Bradley, who gave it a characteristically anti-theoretical formulation. They held that if x and y combine to form the whole x-R-y, their values, like their very identities, are dissolved in that larger whole, whose value cannot be computed from the values of its parts. It was Moore’s contribution to accept the principle in a way that rejected this anti-theoretical interpretation and allowed computation, though exactly how it did so depended on his strict view that intrinsic value can depend only on intrinsic properties.

This view implies that when x and y enter into the relation R that constitute the whole x-R-y, their own values cannot be changed by those relations. Moore recognized this, saying, “The part of a valuable whole retains exactly the same value when it is, as when it is not, a part of that whole” (1903: 30/1993: 81). Any additional value in the whole x-R-y must therefore be attributed to it as an entity distinct from its parts, and with the relations between those parts internal to it. Moore called this additional value the value of a whole “as a whole,” and said it needed to be added to the value in the parts to arrive at the whole’s value “on the whole” (1903: 214–16/1993: 263–64). Thus, if x and y have values a and b on their own, and x-R-y has value c “as a whole,” the value of x-R-y “on the whole” is a + b + c. (The value of the whole is therefore not equal to the sum of the values of its parts, but is equal to a sum of which those values are constituents.) This “holistic” formulation of the principle of organic unities is not the only possible one. We could relax the conditions on intrinsic value so it can be affected by external relations and say that when x and y enter into a whole their own values change, so that, say, x’s value becomes a + c. This “variability” formulation can always reach the same final conclusions as the holistic one, since whatever positive or negative value the latter finds in the whole as a whole the former can add to one or other of the parts. But the two formulations locate the additional value in different places, and sometimes one and sometimes the other gives what seems the intuitively better explanation of an organic value (Hurka 1998). Moore, however, was forced by his strict view of intrinsic goodness to use only the holistic formulation. In the aesthetic case, he held that the admiring contemplation of beauty considered apart from the existence of its object always has the same (moderate) value a, while the existence of beauty always has the same (minimal) value b. But when the two are combined so a person admiringly contemplates beauty that exists and causes his contemplation, the resulting whole has the significant additional value c as a whole. The existence of the beauty is therefore necessary for the significant value c, but that value is not intrinsic to it, belonging instead to the larger whole of which it is part.

Moore made several other uses of the principle of organic unities, including in response to an argument of Sidgwick’s for hedonism. Sidgwick had claimed that there would be no value in a world without consciousness and, more specifically, pleasure, and had concluded that pleasure must therefore be the only good (1907: 113, 399–401). Given Principia Ethica’s view about the value of beauty, Moore there rejected the premise of Sidgwick’s argument, but he also argued that, even granting this premise, Sidgwick’s conclusion does not follow. It may be that pleasure is a necessary condition for any value, but that once pleasure is present, other states such as the awareness of beauty or personal love increase the value of the resulting whole even though alone they have no worth (1903: 92–94/1993: 144–45; also 1912: 240–46/1947: 148–51/1965: 103–06). And of course this was precisely his later view. Another application of the principle was in explicating claims about desert. Moore endorsed the retributive view that when a person is morally vicious it is good if he is punished, and he expressed this view by saying that although the person’s vice is bad and his suffering pain is bad, the combination of vice and pain in the same life is good as a whole, and sufficiently so to make the situation on the whole better than if there were vice and no pain (1903: 214–15/1993: 263–64). This is in fact a point where Moore’s holistic formulation of the principle is positively appealing. The alternative variability view must say that when a person is vicious, his suffering pain switches from being purely bad to being purely good. But this implies that the morally appropriate response to deserved suffering is simply positive, for example simple joy, which does not seem right; the better response mixes satisfaction that justice is being done with sorrow at the infliction of pain, as Moore’s holistic view implies.

Moore’s other chief good of personal love also involved admiring contemplation, but now of objects, namely persons, that are not just beautiful but also intrinsically good (1903: 203/1993: 251). Since for Moore the main intrinsic goods were mental qualities, such love involved primarily the admiring contemplation of another’s good states of mind. In so characterizing love Moore was applying one of four recursive principles he used to generate higher-level intrinsic goods and evils from an initial base-set of goods and evils. The first principle says that if state x is intrinsically good, admiringly contemplating, or loving, x for itself is also intrinsically good (1903: 203–04, 217/1993: 251–53, 265). Thus, if person A’s admiringly contemplating beauty is good, person B’s admiringly contemplating A’s admiration is a further good, as is C’s admiration of B’s admiration, and so on. A second principle says that if x is intrinsically evil, hating x for itself is intrinsically good (1903: 217/1993 265); thus, B’s feeling compassionate pain at A’s pain is good. And two final principles say that loving for itself what is evil, as in sadistic pleasure in another’s pain, and hating for itself what is good, as in envious pain at his pleasure, are evil (1903: 208–10, 211–12/1993: 257–58, 259–60). Though Moore stated these four principles separately, they all make morally appropriate attitudes to intrinsic goods and evils, ones whose orientation matches their objects’ values, additional such goods and morally inappropriate attitudes additional evils. The principles were by no means unique to him; they had been defended earlier by Rashdall and Brentano and would be defended later by Ross. But Moore’s formulation was in two respects distinctive. Rashdall and Ross called the higher-level values they generated virtues and vices, as it is indeed plausible to do; surely benevolence and compassion are virtuous and sadism vicious. But Moore preferred to define the virtues instrumentally, as traits that cause goods and prevent evils, and said that as such they lack intrinsic worth (1903: 172–77/1993: 220–26). Rashdall and especially Ross also held that virtue is the greatest intrinsic good and vice the greatest evil. In contrast, Moore suggested that the value of an appropriate or inappropriate attitude is often less than the value of its object; thus compassion for another’s pain, though good, is not as good as the pain is evil, so the combination of one person’s pain and another’s compassion for it has on balance negative value. “We have no reason,” he wrote, “to maintain the paradox that an ideal world would be one in which vice and suffering must exist in order that it may contain the goods consisting in the appropriate emotion towards them. … we cannot admit the actual validity of any of the arguments commonly used in Theodicies; no such argument succeeds in justifying the fact that there does exist even the smallest of the many evils which this world contains” (1903: 220/1993: 268)

The recursive principles are clearly relevant to personal love, whose core involves positive concern for another’s good. But Moore’s particular application of the principles led to a curiously restricted picture of what love is. First, as in the aesthetic case, he took the main valuable attitude to be contemplative, involving the admiration of another’s already existing good qualities rather than any active engagement with them. This applied even to the love of another’s physical beauty. Though he thought this a central part of love (1903: 203–04/1993: 252), he took it to involve mere passive admiration of another’s beauty, as it were from the other side of the room. There was no desire to possess or interact physically with the other’s beauty, that is, no active eroticism; he actually held that sexual arousal, and especially arousal by another’s arousal, involves love of the ugly or evil and so is evil (1903: 209–10/1993: 257–58). The same point applied more generally: the loving attitude was one of appreciating goods in another’s life rather than of acting to produce or to help her achieve them. One did not do anything for or with a loved one; one simply admired her. (In an 1899 paper presented to the Apostles society at Cambridge he had said, “Love of others is a thing of very great value, and it may be very strong although it does not lead to any action. There is, indeed, no reason why it should” (quoted in Levy 1979: 203).Though he presented personal love as an additional good to aesthetic appreciation, he characterized it in an essentially aesthetic way. Moreover, his list of the goods one is to appreciate or comment in a loved one was also truncated. It did not include pleasure or happiness, since that was not a significant good, nor even knowledge or achievement. Instead, it centered on the other’s admiring contemplation of beauty (1903: 204/1993: 252–53), as if the supreme expression of love were “What excellent taste in pictures you have.” Finally, he took the qualities one appreciates in a loved one to be simply and therefore impartially good. This meant his account had no room for the special attachment to or heightened concern for an individual that many take to be central to personal love. If I love a friend for qualities x, y, and z, and a new person comes along with the same qualities to a slightly higher degree, then, on Moore’s theory, I should admire the new person’s qualities more and therefore love them more; I should trade up to a better beloved. This is at odds with the loyalty, or attachment to individuals, that many think essential to love. This is not to say that a more adequate account of love cannot be constructed with the same basic structure as Moore’s; it can. It will hold that personal love involves a wider range of positive attitudes, including actively promoting as well as contemplating, to a wider range of goods, including happiness, knowledge, and achievement, where those goods in a loved one’s life have greater value from a lover’s point of view than do the similar states of strangers, which makes loving them more appropriate and therefore intrinsically better. But Moore was prevented from giving this account by other features of his view, such as his general emphasis on contemplative forms of love, his restricted list of initial goods, and his strict impartialism about value.

5. Influence

Despite not always containing entirely new ideas, Moore’s ethical writings, and especially Principia Ethica, were extremely influential, both outside and within philosophy. Outside philosophy one influence was through the literary and artistic figures in the Bloomsbury Group, such as Keynes, Lytton Strachey, and Leonard and Virginia Woolf, several of whom had come to know Moore while members with him of the Apostles. They were most impressed by the last chapter of Principia Ethica, whose identification of aesthetic appreciation and personal love as the highest goods very much fit their predilections. Keynes said the book’s publication was for them “the opening of a new heaven on a new earth” and its theory of the good became for a time their “religion” (1949: 82) Many of them – the gay men in particular – sexualized Moore’s account of love, adding an erotic element not present in his formulations. But according to Keynes (though Leonard Woolf (1960: 146–49) disagreed), they tended to ignore the impartial consequentialism within which he embedded those goods, concentrating on pursuing them just within their own lives rather than encouraging their wider spread in society. The novels of E.M. Forster, another Cambridge Apostle, contain several figures representing Moorean ideas, for example the Schlegel sisters in Howards End (Sidorsky 2007). An important element in Principia Ethica’s extra-philosophical appeal was its brash iconoclasm, its claiming, however inaccurately, to sweep away all past moral philosophy. This tone entirely fit its time, when the death of Queen Victoria had led many in Britain to think a new, more progressive age was dawning.

The book’s influence within philosophy was even greater. On the normative side, views close to its ideal consequentialism remained prominent and even dominant, at least in Britain, until the 1930s, though it is hard to know how far this is attributable to Moore himself since similar views had been widely accepted before him. In metaethics his non-naturalism likewise remained dominant for several decades, though here Moore played a larger role, especially for later writers, in part because of his general philosophical eminence and in part because of the vigor with which he presented the view. By talking explicitly of non-natural properties he at least seemed to give non-naturalism a more robust metaphysical side than predecessors such as Sidgwick had, and he defended the view more emphatically, in particular by putting more weight on the open-question argument. When Sidgwick noticed Bentham or Spencer equating goodness with a natural property such as pleasure, he thought it a minor slip that ought in charity to be ignored; Moore deemed it a decisive error that vitiated the philosopher’s entire system. By so emphasizing the two elements of non-naturalism – its realism and its commitment to the autonomy of ethics – Moore helped initiate a sequence of developments in 20th-century metaethics.

The first reaction to non-naturalism, other than simple acceptance, came from philosophers who endorsed the autonomy of ethics but, sometimes under the influence of logical positivism, rejected its moral realism, holding instead that there are no facts other than natural ones and no modes of knowing other than the empirical and the strictly logical. They therefore developed various versions of non-cognitivism, which hold that moral judgements are not true or false but express attitudes, as in emotivism (Ayer 1936; Stevenson 1944), or issue something like imperatives, as in prescriptivism (Hare 1952; Hare 1963). Unlike the subjective naturalism Moore criticized in Ethics, these views allow moral disagreement, since attitudes and imperatives can oppose each other, for example positive versus negative. They also, their later proponents held, give a better explanation of the open-question argument, since they find a distinctive emotive or action-guiding force in moral concepts and judgements that is not present in non-moral ones; that is why, it was said, the moral is neither reducible to nor derivable from the non-moral. Non-cognitivism can also explain, some said, why morality matters to us as it does. Non-naturalism implies that moral judgements concern a mysterious type of property, but why should facts about that property be important to us or influence our behavior? If moral judgements express deep-seated attitudes, however, the question answers itself.

A later reaction, starting around the mid-century, rejected both non-naturalism and non-cognitivism and explored versions of naturalism, including a neo-Aristotelian version that grounds all ethical demands in a conception of human flourishing, or of the development of a human nature understood in quasi-biological terms (Anscombe 1958; Foot 2001); this view implicitly denies the autonomy of ethics. Here a specifically ant-Moorean claim was that predicative uses of “good,” as in Moore’s “aesthetic appreciation is good,” are ungrammatical, since the only legitimate uses of the word in English are attributive, as in “good knife,” “good pickpocket,” and, most relevantly to the neo-Aristotelian view, “good human being” (Geach 1956; also Thomson 1997). But, despite being made at the high-water mark of ordinary-language philosophy, this claim about English grammar seems plainly false: the language has always allowed predicative uses of “good,” from the King James translation of Genesis – “God saw the light, that it was good” (cited in Butchvarov 1989: 17) – to everyday phrases such as “It is good that …” Moore’s moral philosophy cannot credibly be dismissed as resting on a crude linguistic error (see also e.g. Pigden 1990; Zimmerman 1999; Kraut 2011: 173–83). One strand in this later reaction, like others influenced by Wittgenstein, rejected the calculating side of Moore’s consequentialism, which identifies right and wrong acts by adding up the goods and evils in their consequences. Moral judgements, some argued, can’t be codified or theorized in this way but instead call for ethically trained and sensitive insight into particular situations as particular (e.g. McDowell 1979). Even apart from that there was, in many circles, skepticism about the supposed extravagance and dogmatism of Moore’s substantive claims about the good – such as his specific valuing of aesthetic appreciation and personal love – and a preference for the allegedly more modest view that what is good in people’s lives is just the fulfilment of whatever desires they have. By the 1960s, it seems fair to say, many of Moore’s views were thought deeply problematic and his moral philosophy as a whole was not considered an especially live option. It was still thought important to read Principia Ethica, or at least its first chapter, as having initiated the sequence of developments that led to the then-current views. But from the standpoint of many of those views, Moore’s general approach to ethics was at key points misguided.

Fifty-plus years later the philosophical climate is more favorable to Moore. A number of philosophers now defend metaethical non-naturalism (e.g. Shafer-Landau 2003; Huemer 2006), either in versions they say are ontologically minimalist (Nagel 1986; Scanlon 1998, 2014; Parfit 2011, vol. 2: 464–87) or in ones they present as more robust (Enoch 2011), but all embracing some account of normative truth that separates it sharply from non-normative, for example scientific, truth. In addition, and of necessity, these current versions of non-naturalism share something close to Moore’s moral epistemology, his view that normative truths are known by a kind of direct insight or intuition, though the present-day views are often more explicitly fallibilist and coherentist than his sometimes appeared to be. Still, for many philosophers, Moore’s version of non-naturalist realism remains the best-known or canonical one. In normative ethics, too, there is increasing sympathy for accounts of the good with an ideal or perfectionist content and admiration for particular features of Moore’s own account, such as his valuing of personal love, his recursive principles (Hurka 2001) and his principle of organic unities. Moorean ideas are by no means the only ones alive in present-day moral philosophy; there are many alternatives, including many that reject, for example, his consequentialism and impartialism. One especially relevant strand in the recent literature, dating from the 1980s, says ethics needs the non-Moorean concept of “good for” mentioned above, which is associated with “well-being” and “prudential value” and also distinct from the agent-relative goodness Sidgwick used to state egoism. Here one view proposes to use this alternative concept in addition to the Moorean “good,” so what is simply good is wholly or at least largely what is good “for” individuals (e.g. Sumner 1996). Another, more radical view wants “good for” to entirely replace Moore’s “good,” so the former is the only ethically significant evaluative concept (e.g. Kraut 2007; Kraut 2011). (The argument here is not, as in Geach, that the Moorean “good” is ungrammatical; it is that, though linguistically unimpeachable, it makes no useful contribution to ethical thought.) But there have also been defences, against these views, of Moore’s “simply good” and his reductive or “locative” account of “good for” (e.g. McDaniel 2014; Rowland 2016; Tucker 2018; Hurka 2021). Often what present-day philosophers take from Moore is just an individual idea or argument rather than his theory as a whole (Regan 2003 is an exception). But whereas in the early 20th century Moore’s approach to ethics, and especially his metaethics, was dominant, at least in British moral philosophy, and whereas in the mid-century it was widely dismissed, it now represents, at several points, a valuable contributor to many lively ongoing debates.


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Special Issues

  • Ethics, 113/3 (2003): special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.
  • Journal of Value Inquiry, 37/3 (2003): special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.
  • Southern Journal of Philosophy, 41 (2003) Supplement: special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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