First published Fri Aug 23, 2013; substantive revision Thu Apr 25, 2019

Recognition has both a normative and a psychological dimension. Arguably, if you recognize another person with regard to a certain feature, as an autonomous agent, for example, you do not only admit that she has this feature but you embrace a positive attitude towards her for having this feature. Such recognition implies that you bear obligations to treat her in a certain way, that is, you recognize a specific normative status of the other person, e.g., as a free and equal person. But recognition does not only matter normatively. It is also of psychological importance. Most theories of recognition assume that in order to develop a practical identity, persons fundamentally depend on the feedback of other subjects (and of society as a whole). According to this view, those who fail to experience adequate recognition, i.e., those who are depicted by the surrounding others or the societal norms and values in a one-sided or negative way, will find it much harder to embrace themselves and their projects as valuable. Misrecognition thereby hinders or destroys persons’ successful relationship to their selves. It has been poignantly described how the victims of racism and colonialism have suffered severe psychological harm by being demeaned as inferior humans (Fanon 1952). Thus, recognition constitutes a “vital human need” (Taylor 1992, 26).

Recognition theory is thought to be especially well-equipped to illuminate the psychological mechanisms of social and political resistance. As experiences of misrecognition violate the identity of subjects, the affected are supposed to be particularly motivated to resist, that is, to engage in a “struggle for recognition.” Therefore, at least since the 1990s, theories of recognition have enjoyed a lively academic as well as public interest. They promise to illuminate a variety of new social movements—be it the struggles of ethnic or religious minorities, of gays and lesbians or of people with disabilities. None of these groups primarily fight for a more favorable distribution of goods. Rather, they struggle for an affirmation of their particular identity and are thus thought to be engaged in a new form of politics, sometimes labeled “politics of difference” or “identity politics.” However, many accounts want to ascribe a much more fundamental role to the concept of recognition—covering the morality of human relationships in its entirety. From this more general perspective, also earlier campaigns for equal rights—be it by workers, women or African Americans—should be understood as “struggles for recognition.” To frame these political movements in terms of recognition highlights the relational character of morality—and justice: Justice is not primarily concerned with how many goods a person should have but rather with what kind of standing vis-à-vis other persons she deserves (Young 1990).

This entry will first discuss some controversies surrounding the very concept of recognition (1) before reviewing four dimensions of what is recognized (by whom and on what grounds) that have been highlighted by different theories of recognition (2). However, even in light of these differentiations some authors have expressed the fear that concentrating on the issue of recognition might supplant the central problem of (re)distribution on the political agenda (3). Finally, the often rather sanguine descriptions of recognition and its potential for emancipation (4) have been fundamentally challenged: The concern is that because the need for recognition renders persons utterly dependent on the dominating societal norms it may undermine the identity of any critic. Thus, some worry that struggles for recognition may lead to conformism and a strengthening of ideological formations (5).

1. Analyzing the Concept of Recognition

Recognition presupposes a subject of recognition (the recognizer) and an object (the recognized). Before asking what kind of subjects and objects of recognition are possible (1.2) this entry discusses the meaning of “recognition” and how it differs from neighboring concepts such as “identification” and “acknowledgment” (1.1).

1.1 Recognition and its Neighboring Concepts

Paul Ricoeur has distinguished as many as 23 different usages of the notion “to recognize” (Ricoeur 2005, 5–16) grouping them under three main categories, namely recognition as identification, recognizing oneself and mutual recognition. Many authors have challenged Ricoeur’s view by proposing a distinction between recognition (of oneself as well as of others) and “identification”: Whereas we identify an X as an X without necessarily affirming it as (and because of) X, recognition requires a positive evaluation of X. The term “acknowledgment” which some authors use interchangeably with recognition (Appiah 1992, 149) is also contested. Whereas some have argued that we acknowledge the validity of certain insights, values and norms (Ikäheimo/Laitinen 2007, 34–37), others continue to use the term “acknowledgment” with regard to persons but intend it to denote something less ambitious than the wholesale affirmation of their specific identity (Cavell 1969; Markell 2003). However, it is the meaning of mutual recognition that lies at the heart of the contemporary discussion.

Mutuality has always served as the explanatory and normative core of the concept of recognition. Most theories draw on Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel who was, in turn, heavily influenced by Johann Gottlieb Fichte (for their common roots in Jean-Jacques Rousseau see Neuhouser 2008). According to Fichte we become conscious of our own autonomy by being challenged—or as Fichte would characterize it: “called upon”—by the actions of another subject. Only by understanding that the other’s actions are intentional can we also grasp our own actions and utterances as expressions of an intentional self. This thought is most famously expressed in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit where this interpersonal encounter logically culminates in a struggle of life and death (see esp. Kojève 1947 whose reading strongly influenced Jean-Paul Sartre and Jacques Lacan; also the contributions in O’Neill 1996). Within the Phenomenology this idea is first and foremost a thesis about how we can gain self-consciousness as autonomous agents, namely only by interacting with other autonomous subjects (see in more detail 2.1 below). However, this idea also leads Hegel to consider the importance of differing forms of mutual recognition. Already in his early writings in the Jena Realphilosophie of 1805/06 Hegel expands the Fichtean motif by referring to the Hobbesian idea of a fundamental struggle—albeit not of self-interest but of recognition. In Hegel’s story of the state of nature social relationships are a (perhaps forgotten) given: A person who attacks your property does not primarily want to gain material goods. Rather, she wishes to remind you, the first possessor, that she is a person with moral standing as well who has been neglected by the act of first acquisition (Siep 1979, 39; Honneth 1992, 44–45). As becomes especially clear in the Phenomenology: By fighting against the other the subject wants to affirm her own freedom by proving that her normative status is of more importance to her than any of her (animal) desires, including—at an extreme—her desire to live. However, such fighting, expressive of autonomy, must lead to an impasse as it cannot achieve mutual recognition: either one of the subjects dies or subjects herself as a slave to the other, the superior master, and thus fails to express her autonomy. Furthermore, in this case the master does not receive adequate recognition either, because the recognizer has proven to be a “mere” slave who does not count as an autonomous and competent judge. Thus, adequate recognition can only be achieved within an institutionalized order of rights that secures genuinely mutual recognition (Williams 1997, 59–68). Hegel develops this latter thought most systematically in his mature Philosophy of Right. Here, the relationships and implicit norms of the three spheres of, first, love within the family, second, contractual respect within civil society and, third, solidarity within the state are supposed to be necessary in order to actualize individual autonomy, but not in the sense of mere “negative” but of “social” freedom. These spheres allow the subjects to feel at home within (or “reconciled” with) the ethical life of their community (which is organized as a state) because it provides the subjects with the meanings necessary for a fulfilling individual life that they can embrace (see also 2.3 below).

1.2 Possible Subjects and Objects of Recognition

It has been argued that focusing on the idea of mutuality may limit the scope of recognition too much. Rather, we should distinguish between a narrow understanding of recognition based on the feature of mutuality and a wide understanding grounded in the idea of adequate regard (Laitinen 2010). The latter reading emphasizes that by affirming a valuable feature of any entity (i.e., also of animals and even inanimate nature, not only of persons) we properly ‘recognize’ it regardless of whether the recognized object realizes this fact (or is even able to do so). Thus, the wide understanding allows for many objects of recognition that cannot themselves be subjects of recognition. However, so far this constitutes a minority position.

By contrast, because most theorists of recognition argue that recognition is a genuinely interpersonal endeavor, they conclude that only subjects of recognition can be proper objects of recognition. At its margins, this narrow understanding of mutual recognition between persons raises the question from which point onward children can start to be subjects of recognition (and whether at least some animals can qualify as such). Most theories of recognition—drawing, for example, on psychoanalytic object-relations theory (see in more detail 2.4 below)—speak of recognition in the context of the relationship between parents and babies. This suggests, of course, that human babies face the surrounding world differently than even the most developed animals do (see in more detail 2.1 below).

When it comes to the question of collective agents, there is still considerable uncertainty within the literature. In the following, this entry distinguishes between (i) groups, (ii) corporations or states and (iii) institutions more generally. (i) Most authors readily grant that (at least certain) groups of persons may be the subject and object of (mis)recognition because a group can share collective intentions as well as certain features for which it can be misrecognized (especially if these features constitute the group’s self-understanding). (ii) It is more contested whether more complex collective actors such as corporations or states—to the extent they are thought to have a legal personality—can be regarded as subjects and objects of recognition in the proper sense (see for the latter Rawls 1999, 34–35). For example, there is dissent about whether the acts of the “collective actor” are rather to be understood as resulting from the mere aggregation of individual intentions, thus signifying individual acts of (mis)recognition, or whether they display genuinely autonomous collective intentions. Philip Pettit argues for the latter position by pointing out that in order to act reliably (internally and externally) a collective agent’s decisions have to display a certain coherence over time, which is achieved by procedures (Pettit 2007, 180). Recently, there have been attempts to introduce the notion of recognition into the field of International Relations, beyond the common usage of a legal recognition of states. Often enough, it is argued, the (violent) behavior of states cannot be reductively understood as a merely instrumental striving for ever more power but should (at least also) be perceived as a struggle for recognition (see the contributions in Lindemann/Ringmar 2011, O’Neill/Smith 2012, part III, and Daase et al. 2015). Certainly, citizens frequently speak as if their state was disrespected by another state but it remains to be seen whether these citizens are in fact merely indignant about their government being disrespected, some public official or they themselves as members of the state (in more detail Iser 2015, 30–34). (iii) Finally, what about institutions more generally? A lot depends on one’s definition of institutions, which can be part of a state (for example, a state’s constitution) or transcend state borders (as the institution of the free global market). Institutions cannot as easily be described as collective actors. Still, given that they are human products, there is broad agreement that an institution (say, a constitution) can disrespect persons because institutions, besides effectively regulating behavior, always express—as well as reinforce—underlying attitudes of those who designed or keep on reproducing them. In distinguishing between a civilized society where individuals do not humiliate each other and a decent society where at least the institutions do not do so, Avishai Margalit (1996, 1–2) explicitly affirms this point. Furthermore, political resistance as a moral endeavor would prove to be unintelligible if we did not assume that political institutions (and not only the agents acting within them) could be subjects of misrecognition. But can institutions themselves be disrespected? Institutions can certainly be disregarded but it may be argued that institutions (similar to values and norms) are either “acknowledged” or not whereas it is only persons or groups subject to these institutions who can be properly “(mis)recognized” as only here (mis)recognition has consequences for the object’s self-conception.

2. Four Forms of Recognition

We can differentiate the concept of recognition according to the kind of features a person is recognized for. Most agree that only in a formal sense is recognition a vital human need or an anthropological constant. New demands of recognition always owe themselves to the historically established and changing ideas of what kind of recognition we deserve. This is illustrated by the rather recent historical development in which the premodern concept of honor (which was assigned to persons as members of a group within a hierarchical social structure) was divided into two parts: first, into the modern notion of equal respect awarded to all agents capable of autonomy and, second, into the idea of esteem due to one’s achievements. Whereas the former now guarantees a basic level of recognition for everyone, the latter creates a hitherto unknown insecurity with regard to the question of what kind of recognition one deserves (Taylor 1992, 34–35); an insecurity which, according to some authors, has led to the growing importance of intimate love and friendship within the private sphere.

Kantians—and liberals more generally—usually concentrate on the first dimension of the modern recognition order, i.e., on respect for the equal dignity of autonomous beings. Hegelian theories of recognition, by contrast, embrace a more encompassing view of recognition attempting to cover all spheres of recognition within modernity. Thus, in his classical text on the topic, “The Politics of Recognition,” Charles Taylor distinguishes three forms of recognition (Taylor 1992). Whereas a “politics of universalism” aims at the equal recognition of all persons in their common humanity, a “politics of difference”—as only one dimension of a politics of recognition (Blum 1998; Thompson 2006, 7–8)—emphasizes the uniqueness of specific (and especially cultural) features (Taylor 1992, 37) often associated with communitarianism. Finally, Taylor thematizes the recognition of concrete individuality in contexts of loving care that are of utmost importance to subjects (Taylor 1992, 37). It is these three dimensions of the modern recognition order—which reach back to Hegel’s treatment of the subject—that have been primarily analyzed in the discussion (Ikäheimo 2002). They have even been interpreted as genealogically distinct stages along which individual persons gain self-confidence, self-respect and self-esteem (Honneth 1992, ch. 5). However, some have argued that a much more fundamental form of “elementary” recognition (2.1) is underlying these modern spheres of respect (2.2), esteem (2.3) as well as love and friendship (2.4).

2.1 Elementary Recognition

Hegel’s famous idea that we gain self-consciousness only through a process of mutual recognition (see 1.1 above) has been taken up by some neo-Hegelian philosophers of mind. They make the socio-ontological claim that the world is always cooperatively (re)constructed by human agents (see Pinkard 1994, Pippin 2008, also the contributions in Ikäheimo/Laitinen 2011). Only mutual recognition that grants others the status of an epistemic authority allows us to construct a normative space of reasons: I know that the truth of my judgment depends on you being able to share it (Brandom 1994). Thus, such accounts try to explain how reason can enter the world in the first place—and therefore this kind of elementary recognition does not seem to depend on values or norms but rather be a source thereof. As early as the 1960s and 1970s, Karl-Otto Apel and Jürgen Habermas similarly developed their respective variants of discourse ethics stressing that the proper use of language already presupposes a certain form of recognition of all other speakers as equally authoritative (see on both Habermas 1991, ch. 2, for a critique of this argument Wellmer 1986, 108–111, for a good introduction Baynes 2015). However, human beings never create their world or the reasons they use from scratch. Rather, they are embedded in holistic webs of meanings which they jointly reproduce (and may hereby also redo). Theories of recognition hereby provide the ground for a critique of atomistic views of subjectivity (especially in Taylor 1989, part I).

Some have even argued that only empathy with other persons allows us to take over their perspective (Cavell 1969) which, again, seems to be a prerequisite for sharing their evaluative reasons: recognition is primary to cognition (Honneth 2005, 40–44). These ideas have gained additional currency through psychological findings suggesting that the child’s brain can only develop cognitively if she is able to be emotionally attached to her primary care-givers. Only by being interested in sharing experiences with other autonomous beings does the child gain access to the world of meaning (Tomasello 1999, Hobson 2002).

In this vein it has been argued that people come to recognize others as persons very early on. Already the baby learns to recognize her attachment figures as intelligible beings, i.e., as meaning-conferring and autonomous. Quite automatically, so the argument goes, the child then later perceives all other humans as humans. Only afterwards the subject may become blind to this “antecedent recognition” (Honneth 2005, 58). Such “forgetfulness of recognition” is supposedly caused either by reifying social practices which prompt individuals to perceive subjects merely as objects or by ideological belief systems that depict some human beings as non- or sub-human (Honneth 2005, 59–60).

In sum, this elementary form shows that recognition is not only needed for the creation and preservation of a subject’s identity, but that it also denotes a basic normative attitude. Brandom emphasizes that—besides constituting self-consciousness as an “essentially, and not just accidentally, […] social achievement […]—recognition is a normative attitude. To recognize someone is to take her to be the subject of normative statuses, that is, of commitments and entitlements, as capable of undertaking responsibilities and exercising authority” (Brandom 2007, 136, emphasis in original). Whereas Brandom concentrates on rather basic normative ascriptions, all phenomena of recognition can be described as inherently normative. In particular, there is one specific form of recognition in modernity that seems to flow quite naturally from our basic capacity of recognizing each other in the elementary form sketched so far, namely equal respect.

2.2 Respect

Ever since the idea of universal human rights has been established in modernity, assigning equal dignity or respect is commonly thought to be the central dimension of recognition. Nearly every moral philosopher writing today accepts this (Kantian) idea, even if not all embrace it in the terminology of recognition. One of the authors who explicitly does so is Thomas Scanlon. According to him, respect expresses the foundation of morality as such, because the “contractualist ideal of acting in accord with principles that others (similarly motivated) could not reasonably reject is meant to characterize the relations with others the value and appeal of which underlies our reasons to do what morality requires. This relation […] might be called a relation of mutual recognition. Standing in this relation to others is appealing in itself—worth seeking for its own sake” (Scanlon 1998, 162). For Scanlon, therefore, moral blame is especially relevant because it signifies a disturbance of this basic relationship (Scanlon 2008, cf. Wallace 2012). What is valued here, again, is autonomous agency, the capacity to respond to reasons.

Most discussions in moral and political philosophy can be seen as disputes over what it means to recognize the other as equal, i.e., what proper respect demands. Such respect (for the humanity in each person) has to be distinguished from a common usage in which “respect” denotes something quite different, namely a certain respect for the (moral) qualities of a particular person’s character or conduct (for example, in Rawls 1971, § 67; Sennett 2003). It has been proposed that the former should be termed “recognition respect” whereas the latter should be labeled “appraisal respect” (Darwall 1977). Appraisal respect resembles esteem (see 2.3 below) in that particular properties of a person are valued—and not so much the general fact that she is a person capable of autonomous agency. In the following, the term “respect” will be used to denote the attitude of “recognition respect” with regard to the equal moral standing of persons and their demands.

As we face a continuum from severe degradation to phenomena of which it is hotly contested whether they are disrespectful, quite a few theories of recognition have focused on the negative experiences of clear disrespect. In fact, the normative expectation of being treated with respect is most obvious when we look at extreme forms of humiliation in which specific (groups of) humans are symbolically and consequently also materially excluded from humanity, are treated like animals or mere objects. In response to such extreme forms of humiliation, Margalit has concluded that our primary political aim should be to strive for a decent society instead of a fully just one (Margalit 1996, 271–291) and there has been some discussion about whether recognition theory has a natural affinity with minimal or negative theories of morality (Allen 2001).

Being faced with extreme humiliation, the interplay between normative and psychological aspects becomes especially salient. Even if the victims know that their degradation is unjustified, they cannot but feel humiliated all the same. Any trust in being able to control their lives is stripped away from them. In the course of mistreatment, torture and rape the perpetrators do not only intentionally inflict pain and injury on their victims but also deride the agency of the latter. This combination undermines basic self- and world-trust (Scarry 1985; Rorty 1989, ch. 7–9; Margalit 1996, 115–119, 145).

However, even less extreme forms of mistreating persons manifest disrespect. In these cases it is not necessarily denied that those under discussion are humans, but rather that they have equal moral and/or legal standing. Instead of being approached as adults, women and people of different color, for instance, were, for the most part of history, treated like children. They were regarded as “second-class citizens” (Taylor 1992, 37) not capable of responsibly reproducing and shaping the social norms of their communities. Only equal positive rights institutionalize recognition in a publicly manifest way and thus make it easier for the individual to develop self-respect (Feinberg 1970, 251–253), “perhaps the most important primary good” (Rawls 1971, § 67).

Nonetheless, there is a certain tension between recognizing somebody as a legal rights holder and the idea of a full-fledged recognition order. The very idea of subjective rights allows persons to step out of all interpersonal relations and insist on their “right” whatever reasons might be raised against that by others (Menke 2009). Yet, in granting every subject the right to use their powers of reasons as they see fit, law recognizes their autonomous agency. It hereby takes into account the fact of reasonable pluralism. Although people might disagree with each other, toleration of the other’s dissenting opinion is then supposed to be grounded in equal respect (see Forst 2013) and not only a way of grudgingly settling for a modus vivendi. Nonetheless, theorists of recognition (within the Hegelian tradition) have warned that concentrating entirely on negative liberty without considering the wider social context in which such liberty is embedded and on which it depends might lead to social pathologies (Honneth 2014, ch. 4). With this warning they join communitarian voices. Thus, one necessary step is to secure the legitimacy of the legal order by ascribing equal democratic rights to all citizens. This recognizes them as being able to orient themselves toward the common good (and not only to their self-interest).

2.3 Esteem

The major emancipatory movements of the last two centuries—for instance the women’s or the civil rights movements in the US—fought for equal respect and rights. In contrast, in many of the contemporary social struggles persons or groups demand recognition of specific (e.g., cultural or religious) aspects of their identities which are neglected or demeaned by the dominant value and norm system of their society. It is these phenomena which have helped popularize the notions of a “politics of recognition” or “identity politics.” However, it is contested why these differences should matter normatively: Do we owe such recognition to the affected as subjects with equal moral status (a) or because we should esteem their specific properties as valuable (b)?

(a) The first reading, which claims that we owe this kind of recognition to all subjects as equally entitled, allows only for a context-sensitive form of respect. By pointing to differences disregarded so far one hopes to show that the allegedly “neutral” state (or society) is by no means neutral, but rather based on a partial (for example, male-dominated, white, heterosexual) interpretation of citizenship or just on an arbitrary privileging of specific groups. Hereby all members are discriminated who do not fit the hegemonic understanding (already Taylor 1992, 42). If one tries to cancel out these disadvantages by taking into account the differences, e.g., by means of affirmative action intended to remove injustices, this serves the higher-ranking goal of treating persons in all their particularity as of equal status (Benhabib 1992). In order to arrive at such context-sensitive laws and regulations one has to more fully include the affected groups into the process of democratic decision-making, for example, through a vitalized public sphere and formal hearings (Habermas 1994). Additionally, it has been proposed that (formerly) oppressed groups should have a veto right with regard to all those questions that particularly affect them (Young 1990, 183–191).

(b) In contrast, the second reading claims that we should value particularity in itself. Such a politics of difference is not concerned with (context-sensitive) respect, but with the esteem for specific characteristics or entire identities of individuals and—often enough—groups.

However, the idea of group identities has been hotly contested: Whereas some groups indeed want to (re)affirm their particular identity, the criticism has been voiced that such a homogenous reading of identity fails to take proper account of intersecting axes of identification (being a black, lesbian woman, for instance). The failure to admit of such heterogeneity has been suspected of legitimizing internal oppression within minority groups. According to some scholars, all identities have to be deconstructed. Again others have held onto the idea of group identities for political reasons (demanding secure exit-options for individual members) or have favored rainbow coalitions. In this context, it is also controversial whether cultures should be valued in themselves or only in their value for individuals and whether such cultural protection necessitates group rights (Kymlicka 1989, Taylor 1992, Habermas 1994, Laden/Owen 2007, Patten 2014). Finally, there seems to be an aporia as the alleged solution to equally value and promote all cultures may be no solution at all: Arguably, to esteem something without accurate knowledge or against one’s own convictions is no real esteem but rather manifests an additional insult. Therefore, Taylor urges us to be “merely” maximally open towards the alien culture and to be led by the principle that traditions with a long history most certainly contain something valuable (Taylor 1992, 68–71).

There is another group of scholars which has argued that esteem should not be awarded to groups but to individuals—and not for the latter’s wholesale identities but only for specific features. Yet, in light of the value pluralism so characteristic of modern societies, it remains unclear who could function as an impartial judge when it comes to determining what is (more) valuable and what is not. Every decision seems to run the danger of merely expressing a repressive majority opinion. Therefore, according to some accounts, esteem should play no role in public politics whatsoever: it is sufficient for individuals to be respected by all and to be esteemed by only some significant others, for example, by their family, friends or fellow members of voluntary associations (Rawls 1971, § 67; Habermas 1994, 129).

Yet, an opposing camp claims that simply neglecting the dimension of esteem does not do justice to our everyday experiences: We are not only injured by humiliating behavior, but also if strangers insult us (either in the sense of not recognizing specific features of ourselves or actively devaluing them). After all, we have a need to be esteemed by society “as such” in order to be able to appear in public without shame. Bourdieu’s social theory, for example, points to the pervasiveness of evaluative patterns and distinctions even in modern society, determining social status and class (Bourdieu 1984). In order to solve the dilemma of having to create an impartial value horizon for modern societies, in recent years some authors have proposed to focus on the notion of “achievement.” The latter is supposed to be a sufficiently formal reference point for esteeming persons. “Achievement” is not only of great significance within capitalistic societies but remains open for historically and interculturally different ideas of what kind of achievement should count as relevant (Honneth 1992, 126; 2003a, 140–142; Margalit 1996, 46–47). It is supposed to allow for individual particularity (one’s own achievement) but still to retain a common reference point (the contribution to the common good, however that may be defined). From this perspective, mass unemployment, for instance, is a social pathology because it denies this form of esteem to large parts of the population. This could only be counteracted by acknowledging activities outside of the labor market as achievements so that every citizen has the chance to see herself as a person who contributes to the flourishing of her society. Additionally, it constitutes an injustice if activities are devalued for arbitrary reasons (e.g., if specific jobs lose their status just because the ratio of women holding them increases, see Honneth 2003a, 153, or if women earn less than men for doing the same job).

Two sorts of arguments have been leveled against this idea of focusing on achievement. First, some have argued that it is impossible to find culturally neutral criteria of merit (Young 1990, 200–206). For instance, the market is not interested so much in capacities or skills, but merely in outputs demanded by others regardless of the skills involved (see Schmidt am Busch 2011, 46–47). But some will argue that the market is thus not tracking the relevant feature. If it is true that the very definition of achievement or merit will remain essentially contested, the problem that was supposed to be solved only reappears again: we can only expect such recognition from those who share with us the same standards of achievement. Second, even if the citizenry could come up with a convincing standard, there remains a “recognition gap”: not all, perhaps not even the central features that render us valuable in our own eyes can be understood as “achievements” in the sense of contributing to the common good (Iser 2008, 193).

Nonetheless, by highlighting the human dependency on evaluative horizons of esteem, many theories of recognition share important characteristics with communitarian approaches. The idea of a common, more substantial “ethical life” is especially important for those who think that we can only flourish if we live in meaning-bestowing relationships of mutual recognition. In such relationships people are supposed to experience the needs, desires and goals of their alter ego not so much as limitations but rather as furtherances of their own “social” freedom (in this vein Taylor 1992, 33–34; Neuhouser 2000, esp. ch. 1; Pippin 2008, ch. 7; Honneth 2014, chs. 3 and 6, Honneth 2015, esp. ch. I). The individual can only experience her deeds as really hers in living and acting in concert with others and feeling at home in the society’s institutions. Here recognition is not only a precondition for valuing one’s own (perhaps still individual) projects but is itself an integral part of (essentially social) endeavors. According to this picture, we face a lack of freedom where such relationships of mutual recognition are not fully realized. Thus, these accounts follow Hegel in generalizing experiences drawn from the intimate sphere of loving relationships.

2.4 Love and Friendship

Relationships of loving care are deemed important within psychologically oriented recognition theories (Benjamin 1988, Honneth 1992) because such emotionally fulfilling interactions are supposed to display the first form of recognition humans experience. The unconditional care by a parent provides the baby with the feeling of security and of being loved, and thus of being worthy of love. This world- and self-trust is taken to later enable the child to value her own projects and align the role standards that grow increasingly more complicated in the course of her development and to critically question them (Mead 1934, Habermas 1988). Most of those who endorse the relevance of love also stress the importance of the affective dimension for all subsequent forms of recognition (Honneth 2014, ch. 6.1).

Following the idea that recognition should always affirm certain aspects of the other person, there has been some controversy about what exactly we recognize in other persons when we love them or regard them as friends. After all, we seem to embrace them in their entire (and changing) personality and could not just replace them with others who may have similar characteristics. Whereas some think that we still respond to some valuable trait, namely the autonomous core of the loved one’s personality (Velleman 1999, 366–374), others think that the relationship itself creates a value that is worth caring for (Frankfurt 2004).

Furthermore, as love embraces the entire personality of individuals it has been proposed that it is this experience, anchored in early childhood, that provides subjects with a permanent motivational resource for demanding recognition for ever more aspects of their identity, and thus for further moral progress. This may, of course, in its extreme form of desiring to be recognized in all one’s features by all persons be a mere utopia (along these lines Honneth 2002, 504). Theories such as those of Emmanuel Lévinas (1961, section III) or Jacques Derrida (1990, 959) depict concrete others as demanding an infinite sensibility and care toward them. Although we often have to relativize these “demands” in light of competing claims of others and for reasons of overdemandingness (Forst 2011, 36–37), these theories generally point to the possibility of having to redraw the boundaries between different spheres of recognition. This could, for example, lead to a revised understanding of solidarity being not only a task of families or close friends but of entire societies, namely in the form of a welfare state.

Although politics might not be directly responsible for this form of recognizing concrete individuality, there are nevertheless indirect possibilities to protect and to shape its basic conditions. By means of effective law enforcement politics assures the individual that the trust (in one’s environment as well as one’s own body), acquired in intimate relations since childhood (see Taylor 1992, 36–37), is not forcibly destroyed from the outside, e.g., by maltreatment, torture or rape (some, as Owen 2007, 308, even mention natural disasters although these catastrophes do not damage interpersonal trust). Additionally, some of the social conditions that make it more challenging to succeed in intimate relations can be improved politically. This is, for example, valid for inflexible or very long working hours for parents and bad child care offers, for demands of high mobility which endanger intimate relationships, or for the cultural patterns that devalue reciprocity between partners, e.g., by favoring negligence and recklessness as “masculine.”

3. Recognition and Redistribution

Despite the differentiation of these four dimensions of recognition, in the middle of the 1990s, Nancy Fraser (but also Rorty 1999) voiced the concern that, at least in the political context of the US, the increasingly influential “identity politics” threatened to replace the issue of redistribution on the political agenda. She insisted—against Taylor and Honneth—that only recognition and redistribution taken together would allow for the right kind of justice, namely the ideal of “participatory parity” that guarantees each subject an equal participation in public life. While redistribution secures the objective condition of such an ideal, recognition safeguards its intersubjective condition (Fraser 2003a, 36). Fraser tries to illustrate the independency of recognition and redistribution by way of two examples: Whereas homosexuals suffer primarily from culturally discriminating practices of humiliation, workers are first and foremost the victims of economic exploitation. Though homosexuals also have to struggle with economic disadvantages and the achievements of the workers have been ideologically demeaned as less valuable, the real cause of the injustice in the former case lies within the cultural sphere whereas in the latter it lies within the economic sphere (Fraser 1996, ch. 1; 2003a, 50–54). Thus, Fraser categorizes different forms of injustice according to their socioeconomic roots. Her main point is, nonetheless, that in most cases of injustice we are dealing with a combination of cultural disrespect and economic exploitation. As especially fitting examples Fraser refers to groups categorized along the lines of gender or race. Thus, women and people of different color suffer not only from a discriminating status order, but also from an economy which is based on encoding unpaid housework and badly paid labor as female as well as auxiliary and superfluous work as colored. Only a two-dimensional theory such as the one she suggests can—according to Fraser—pay proper attention to practical conflicts between policies of redistribution and recognition. On the one hand, if one redistributes without considering the relations of recognition involved, the receivers might be stigmatized as “social parasites,” and thus disrespected. On the other hand, generally legitimate policies of recognition may lead to normatively undesirable side-effects by dramatically worsening the economic position of the affected persons, as measures against reification through prostitution and pornography might very well do when they render those engaged in these lines of work unemployed (Fraser 2003a, 65; see for a thorough discussion the contributions in Olsen 2008).

In light of this criticism, Axel Honneth has insisted that the concept of recognition can be applied to questions of distributive justice, but that it is important to properly differentiate between the dimensions of respect and esteem: First, our understanding of what we owe to others on account of their equal status as autonomous persons has itself been historically extended and now entails social rights. Accordingly, the affected persons can at least claim qua equal citizens—and thus in the name of a politics of respect—that amount of basic goods that is necessary for enabling them to effectively use their legal entitlements. Secondly, they can refer to the criterion of achievement which is supposed to be constitutive of capitalism—as an (also) cultural entity—in order to demand a more adequate remuneration of their work (Honneth 2003a, 151–154; see 2.3 above). Only if one understands redistribution in this way, that is, as a problem of recognition, can one—according to Honneth—explain why the affected experience outrage: namely because they deem their identity to be threatened by a perceived injustice. What counts as an injustice, therefore, depends on our reasonable expectations of recognition: Justice and recognition mutually illuminate each other.

However, Fraser has responded by arguing that most problems associated with global injustice are not primarily due to misrecognition but rather stem from systemic features of capitalism, such as when multinational enterprises relocate factories and lay off workers in order to maximize profits and share-holder interests (Fraser 2003b, 214–215, see for Honneth’s reply Honneth 2003b, 248–249). Subsequently, there has been quite some debate with regard to what extent and how fruitfully global capitalism can be explained and criticized in terms of recognition—and what role functional imperatives play within such an account (see, for example, the contributions in Schmidt am Busch/Zurn 2010, 241–318, Honneth 2014, ch. 6.2, Honneth 2015, ch. III, Jütten 2015).

4. Recognition and Emancipation

Struggles for recognition are supposed to effect moral progress toward ever more just or fulfilling relations of recognition. Sometimes such struggles are fought by violent means, which raises challenging questions of when such revolutions might be justifiable (Iser 2017, Bazargan 2018) and who can be targeted. But much more frequently, such struggles proceed in non-violent forms. Just think of the civil rights movement led by Martin Luther King in the US or the Indian liberation movement under Mahatma Gandhi. Therefore, some authors, especially those interested in social criticism, have proposed to use recognition as a new paradigm for Critical Theory (Honneth 1992, see also Iser 2008, Deranty 2009, Zurn 2015). Such a “critical theory of recognition” is supposed to evaluate whether societies provide their citizens with the necessary “primary good” of social recognition.

Because some theories of recognition are not only concerned with questions of justice but also with a formal theory of the good life designed to illuminate the social conditions of individual flourishing (or negatively, of social pathologies) this has sparked the critique that such approaches are too “sectarian” (Fraser 2003a, 30; similar Zurn 2000, 121): Any reference to the telos of a good life (or the specific idea of individuality or authenticity) proves to be a non-starter (or just eurocentric). In reply, proponents of such a broader account of social philosophy have insisted that the emphasis on a society that recognizes as many features of individuals as possible, hereby promoting their autonomy, does not prescribe how to live. It only spells out the intersubjective conditions which provide everybody with the chance to live the life they want to lead (be it autonomously chosen or not), namely in a social environment where this life is either adequately recognized or at least not looked upon derogatively (Honneth 2003a, 177).

Some authors have emphasized that speaking of recognition as a vital human need cannot mean that every struggle for recognition is (equally) justified (Alexander/Pia Lara 1996). We still require criteria to distinguish between legitimate and illegitimate struggles. Certainly, those who fight for more recognition think that they deserve it. But obviously their belief can be false if the claims are unjustified or exaggerated. As all instances of legitimate criticism remind us: Neither every negative description of a person(’s self-image) nor every challenge of her current status position—as hurtful as such “challenges” might be for the affected person—is necessarily a form of misrecognition. Quite to the contrary, only by being subject to well-meaning criticism can we improve ourselves.

Therefore, those who defend a primarily normative account of recognition (and humiliation) distance themselves from what they perceive as the problems of overly psychological approaches. On the one hand, they claim, due to adapted preferences persons might not even (emotionally) register when they are in fact treated disrespectfully. On the other hand, persons might feel slighted because they hold utterly unreasonable views in the first place, e.g., if Nazis think that they ought to be treated as super-humans or if a mediocre painter expects others to view him as a genius (Margalit 1996, 9; Fraser 2003a, 37–42; Iser 2008, 216–221).

But how do we come by the normative criteria of adequate recognition? Whereas Kantian contractualists ask themselves which standards are acceptable to all (in a hypothetical choice situation), most theorists of recognition follow a more Hegelian route. They argue that the social practices of recognition in which subjects live already provide them with all the normative resources needed to criticize and transcend these practices. Thus, Hegelian theories of recognition in all their variations choose an interpretative or—perhaps more adequately—reconstructive path: Because we are socialized into a specific recognition order we also internalize (via the exchange with and through the “view” of others) a given space of (historical) reasons that shapes our practical identity and our normative expectations springing from this identity. This is also supposed to explain the close connection between the normative and the psychological dimension of recognition: On account of our intersubjectively acquired identity we have a psychological need to be recognized as having the normative status we deem to deserve. Consequently, because it is a normatively structured need to the disappointment of which we usually react with indignation, its appropriateness can always be questioned by reference to the reasons available to us (Iser 2008, 173).

One way to make progress then is to criticize problematic ways of thinking of and relating to others’ characteristics by pointing to already established principles of recognition. This would, for example, entail arguing for women’s rights on the basis of the idea of equal dignity of all “men” or for higher wages for workers by reference to already established notions of desert. Thus, it is always possible to bring to bear aspects which were disregarded up to now by referring to the “surplus validity” of an already established abstract principle of recognition (Honneth 2003a, 186). According to this view, moral progress takes place by way of a laborious sorting out of reasons that are shown to be implausible. However, this still leaves open the question of how radical such a critique can be, i.e., whether it can only proceed in a context-dependent and piecemeal way or whether the very logic of recognition provides us with more abstract criteria of progress, such as egalitarian inclusion and the recognition of ever more aspects of individuals that fosters their autonomy (Honneth 2003a, 184–185).

Sometimes such critical reflections on one’s society are triggered by emotional impulses. Thus, the psychoanalytic tradition refers to suppressed, but unconsciously still effective drives or experiences. These approaches always search, albeit in a speculative manner, for a motive people may have to transcend the given recognition order. These drives or experiences may be described, following Freud, as libidinous energies or rather as the positively connotated recollection of a state of infant omnipotence (Whitebook 1996). In recent times, object relations theory has been used to highlight the traumatically experienced end of an original symbiosis (between a baby and her primary care-giver) which we supposedly strive to regain throughout our entire life (Benjamin 1988).

But regardless of the way subjects reach the conviction that they must claim recognition for new, so far neglected or—even worse—demeaned aspects of their identity, the following question must be asked: From where do they gain the mental strength to at least temporarily withstand the disrespect or indifference of (at least many of) their surrounding others? The assumption that without recognition by all others it is inevitable that we suffer psychological breakdown is much too strong. In spite of disrespect, the capacity for agency which is necessary for resistance may spring from three motivational sources. First, the oppressed subjects can, under certain circumstances, still draw upon the assurance that they acquired in a (more or less) happy childhood. Secondly, social movements of resistance often create enough motivational energy by recognizing each other within these movements, e.g., within the civil rights movement. As a consequence, the disrespect shown by the rest of society at least weighs less heavily. Finally, the idea that members of a better society in the future, though merely imagined, would one day grant the desired recognition, might function as a third source of the mental strength needed to endure (Mead 1934, 199).

5. Recognition as Ideology?

Some authors are not very optimistic about the prospects of emancipation through struggles of recognition. If our expectations of being recognized as X are always contingent upon the social and historical context we live in, how is moral and political progress possible at all? Is it—in view of our basic dependency on the view of others—not more likely that our striving for recognition leads to uncritical conformity instead of an emancipatory struggle for recognition? It is just this suspicion which is expressed by the French Marxist Louis Althusser. He regards recognition as the central ideological mechanism by which the state confronts its citizens with the choice between obedience and the loss of social existence (Althusser 1970, 174–176). Hereby, Althusser follows a specifically French tradition that does not primarily conceptualize recognition as the condition of intersubjective freedom, but as a source of estrangement: Already in Rousseau’s Second Discourse on Inequality (Rousseau 1755) individuals lose themselves in vain pretense, because they inauthentically attempt to please others (for a more positive reading see Neuhouser 2008). Finally, in the work of Jean-Paul Sartre individuals are reified by every kind of recognition because even the affirmation of others freezes the subjects in their present state, hereby denying their potential for change, i.e., their freedom (Sartre 1943, esp. 347–361). According to this tradition, we do not suffer primarily from the fact that we are not recognized, but rather from the fact that we are held captive within a specific pattern of socially mandated recognition (Bedorf 2010). Struggles for recognition only entangle us ever deeper in a wrong dependency on power relations the workings of which we fail to adequately grasp. Whereas left-Hegelian approaches are designed to positively overcome ideological recognition orders for the purposes of social progress (Honneth 2004), post-structuralists maintain that one should not ask which features of one’s identity should be recognized. In doing so we only remain caught within the old (ideological) categories and are forced to define clear-cut identities. Rather, one should question struggles for recognition as to whether and to what extent they increase spaces of freedom to think and act differently (Tully 2000, 469). Such work, often inspired by Michel Foucault, has also pointed to the motivational problem of all resistance to the established recognition order: How can you reject exactly those categories that constitute your identity? Does social criticism not necessary imply self-denial? Judith Butler has tried to circumvent this alleged paradox by pointing out that norms never remain valid by themselves but need constant reaffirmation. This process hereby opens up possibilities of—at least slightly—“reconfiguring” the dominant norms and changing one’s own identity (Butler 1997a, ch. 3; 1997b, 13, 40–41). Some authors even want to replace a politics of recognition with a politics of acknowledgment: an acknowledgment that we can never be sure about the changing identities (and thus normative claims) of others but have to remain open to new and unpredictable developments (Markell 2003, 180). In a similar vein, feminist thinkers have claimed that the entire idea of being recognized in one’s given identity makes it impossible for us to gain an adequate understanding of how power and agency not simply react to such an identity but rather create it as an “embodied” identity in the first place (McNay 2008, 162–197). Finally, the idea that struggles for recognition cannot only lead to further progress, but should be grounded in a belief that modernity is already the result of such progress, has been criticized for its affinity to colonial forms of thought (Allen 2016, cf. Forst 2019).

Even those who think that one can—at least conceptually—conceive of non-ideological forms of recognition have started to pay more attention to the ways in which relationships of recognition are always also relationships of power (see the contributions in van den Brink/Owen 2007). This becomes especially urgent if one realizes, as already indicated above, that values and norms—being products of human thought and attitudes—can express disrespect even if those who follow them are not really aware of this. Subjects may attempt to convey recognition within a framework that is itself disrespectful. For example, a lord in the 18th century who treated his maid according to the accepted norms of that time—for example, by treating her as if she was invisible—may not have (intentionally) disrespected her with regard to the socially valid system of norms and values. Thus, he might have been considered a “decent” lord according to prevailing standards (whereas other lords might have been described as “cruel”, etc.). However, at least some probably want to say that this lord—in another sense—did not adequately respect his maid (and that therefore the social changes since then manifest moral progress). Nonetheless, some authors regard even ideological recognition (as being, for example, a dutiful maid) as something positive insofar as it strengthens the subject’s sense of worth and is clearly superior to acts of misrecognition (Honneth 2004, 323–347). Yet, others may mourn such ideological recognition for the incapacitating effects on the recognized subjects’ will to resist. Recently, these controversies have been taken up in a fruitful dialogue between these two traditions (Bankovsky/Le Goff 2013, Honneth/Rancière 2017, Honneth 2018, esp. 211–235).

However, even if attitudes and acts of recognition are a much more ambivalent blessing than might have been presumed at first sight, recognition theory does not only illuminate the complexity of our normative thinking but also provides a strong argument that such normative considerations are an ineradicable part of our social world. The concept of recognition therefore also serves an important explanatory function.


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