Possible Objects

First published Fri Apr 15, 2005; substantive revision Tue Feb 15, 2022

Deep theorizing about possibility requires theorizing about possible objects. One popular approach regards the notion of a possible object as intertwined with the notion of a possible world. There are two widely discussed types of theory concerning the nature of possible worlds: actualist representationism and possibilist realism. They support two opposing views about possible objects. Examination of the ways in which they do so reveals difficulties on both sides. There is another popular approach, which has been influenced by the philosophy of Alexius Meinong. The Meinongian approach is relevant to theorizing about possible objects because it attempts to construct a general theory of objects other than ordinary concrete existing objects. Independently of the debate about the nature of possible worlds or about Meinongianism, it is not always as straightforward as it may at first appear to determine whether putative possible objects are indeed possible. Another category of object similar to that of a possible object is the category of a fictional object. Although initially attractive, the idea that fictional objects are possible objects should not be accepted blindly. An important instance of theoretical usefulness of possible objects is their central role in the validation of two controversial theorems of a simple quantified modal logic.

1. What They Are

Possible objects—possibilia (sing. possibile)—are objects that are possible. What it is to be an object—which is a basic and universal metaphysical category—will not be discussed but will be simply assumed as understood. What it is to be possible is the focus. Possibility of an object should be understood in tandem with another notion, namely, actuality. The two notions are related at least in the following way: (i) every actual object is a possible object. A more controversial relation between the two notions is expressed as follows: (ii) not every possible object is an actual object, that is, some possible object is a non-actual object.

There is a wide-spread conservative view on objects, which says that any object is an actual object. In other words, the adjective ‘actual’ is redundant, for it excludes no object. From this it follows that non-actual possible objects are not objects, that is, they are nothing. Thus on this view, the adjective ‘possible’ is equivalent to ‘actual’ when applied to objects and (ii) is false. This makes the notion of a possible object, or equivalently the notion of an actual object, uninteresting. The notion of an object is the basic notion and does all the work. There is another conservative view on objects, which does not deal in actuality or possibility directly. It deals in existence instead. It is the view that any object is an existing object. On this view, the following analog of (ii) is false: not every object is an existing object, that is, some object is a non-existing object. This view makes the notion of an existing object equivalent to that of an object; existence adds nothing to objecthood. If we combine talk of actuality and talk of existence, we obtain five alternative conservative views with varying degrees of conservatism:

(1) Any object is an actual existing object;

(2) Any object is an actual object, that is, it is either an actual existing object or an actual non-existing object;

(3) Any object is an existing object, that is, it is either an actual existing object or a non-actual existing object;

(4) Any object that is actual is an existing object;

(5) Any object that exists is an actual object.

(1) is a stronger claim than the other four. (2) and (3) are stronger than (5) and (4), respectively. (1)-(3) give characterizations of all objects, whereas (4) and (5) are more limited in scope. When the verb ‘exists’ is understood with the most comprehensive domain of discourse (assuming the availability of such a domain), (5) is known as actualism. If the domain of discourse for ‘exists’ is stipulated to consist only of actual objects, (5) is trivial and compatible with possibilism, the position which says that some object is outside the domain consisting of all actual objects; cf. (ii). Most of those who advertise their positions as actualist hold not only (5) with the most comprehensive domain of discourse in mind but also (1), and therefore (2)-(4) as well. There are some theorists who hold (5), or at least do not deny (5), but deny (1). They do so by denying (3), that is, by maintaining that some object is a non-existing object. Such a view is one version of Meinongianism. But let us start with actualism and possibilism.

We shall first examine possibilism. It is superficially the most commonsensical position. It is superficially commonsensical to hold that some objects are not actual: e.g., Santa Claus, the Fountain of Youth. If we understand this view in terms of existence, that is, as the claim that there are—that is, there exist—some objects that are not actual, we have possibilism. As we have noted, ‘exist’ here should not mean “actually exist” but should be understood with a larger domain of discourse in mind. Such a domain is the domain containing not only actual objects but also non-actual possible objects as genuine objects. To flesh out the idea of such a domain as proposed by the best-known version of possibilism, it is necessary to start with the idea of a possible world. After we articulate and examine possibilism as couched in the possible-worlds framework, we shall discuss versions of actualism also couched in the possible-worlds framework. We shall then examine other theories outside the possible-worlds framework.

2. Possible Worlds

According to the framework of possible worlds, all alethic modal statements involving possibility are existential quantifications over possible worlds and all alethic modal statements involving actuality are singular statements about a particular possible world, namely, the actual world (Kripke 1959, 1963a, 1963b). For example, to say that Julius Caesar was possibly not assassinated is to say that Julius Caesar was not assassinated at some possible world, and to say that Julius Caesar was actually assassinated is to say that Julius Caesar was assassinated at the actual world. Likewise with existence: to say that Julius Caesar possibly existed is to say that Julius Caesar existed at some possible world, and to say that Julius Caesar actually existed is to say that Julius Caesar existed at the actual world. Assuming that the actual world is a possible world, it follows that if Julius Caesar actually existed, he possibly existed.

In general, any object that actually exists possibly exists. Assuming that actuality (of an object) is nothing but actual existence and possibility (of an object) is nothing but possible existence, this grounds the plausible conceptual connection between actuality and possibility noted earlier: (i) every actual object is a possible object. The overall philosophical merit of the possible-worlds framework cannot be judged without close scrutiny of its metaphysical foundations. Specifically, the two key questions which need to be asked are: “What are possible worlds in general?” and “What is the actual world in particular?” Metaphysical theorizing about possible worlds goes back at least to Leibniz, but the contemporary theorizing is pursued largely on two distinct fronts; possibilist realism and actualist representationism.

2.1 Possibilist Realism

Possibilist realism takes non-actual possible objects to be (real, genuine) objects; it takes their metaphysical status to be on a par with that of actual objects. When possibilist realists assert, “Non-actual possible objects exist”, their word ‘exist’ has the same linguistic meaning as when actualists assert, “Actual objects exist”. Possibilist realists believe that some domains of discourse with respect to which ‘exist’ may be understood include more than actual objects, whereas actualists deny it. Thus according to possibilist realism, to call an object non-actually possibly existent is merely to deny its inclusion in a particular realm—call it ‘actuality’—and affirm its inclusion in some other realm. That other realm is no less a realm of existence than actuality is a realm of existence. All realms of existence are metaphysically on a par with one another. Every token use of the existence predicate is to be understood with respect to some realm of existence, either explicitly or implicitly.

What distinguishes actuality from all other realms? The leading answer is due to David Lewis, who is the proponent of the best-known version of possibilist realism, namely, modal counterpart theory. Lewis’s view on actuality is known as the indexical theory of actuality (Lewis 1970). The basic idea is that actuality for us is the realm which includes us, and more generally, actuality for x is the realm which includes x. But there are many different realms which include us: this room, this building, this town, this continent, this planet, this galaxy, this minute, this hour, this day, this month, this year, this century, etc. So, to fix our actuality as a unique realm which includes us, Lewis takes the largest spatiotemporal whole which includes us. More precisely, actuality for us is the maximal spatiotemporally related whole of which we are (mereological) part. In general, actuality for x is the maximal spatiotemporally related whole of which x is part. For anything to exist non-actually-for-x but possibly is for it to be part of some realm outside actuality for x, that is, to be part of some maximal spatiotemporally related whole of which x is not part. Note that this is a reductionist view of existence, both actual and non-actual possible. Existence is first relativized to a maximal spatiotemporally related whole, and then existence in such a whole is defined reductively in terms of (mereological) parthood. Lewis characterizes possible worlds as maximal spatiotemporally related wholes. Actuality is the actual world, and all other maximal spatiotemporally related wholes are non-actual possible worlds.

A possible object is simply a part of a maximal spatiotemporally related whole (Lewis 1986). (Strictly speaking Lewis prefers to say “analogically spatiotemporal” instead of “spatiotemporal” but we shall let that pass.) By most criteria, Lewis’s possible worlds, hence also his possible objects, fall under the label ‘concrete’ rather than ‘abstract’. Every non-actual possible object (apart from pure Cartesian egos, perhaps) is a spatiotemporal object and bears no spatiotemporal relation to any actual object, or to any possible object exiting at any possible world at which it does not exist. This makes non-actual possible objects as real as non-actual possible worlds. It is worth while to remind ourselves that this does not make it automatically true to say that non-actual possible objects exist, even if we accept non-actual possible worlds. Whether it is true to say so depends on the domain of discourse with respect to which the existence predicate is to be understood.

2.1.1 Modal Counterpart Theory

On Lewis’s modal counterpart theory, every possible object is confined to one possible world. Indeed, Lewis defines a possible object as an object all of whose parts exist at some single possible world (Lewis 1986: 211). This conception of a possible object forces Lewis to resort to his counterpart theoretic account of modality de re (Lewis 1968). According to any possible-worlds theory of modality, to say that you could have been the leader of a religious cult is to say that at some possible world you are the leader of a religious cult. According to Lewis, to say that at a possible world you are the leader of a religious cult is to say that at that possible world there is a counterpart of you, that is, someone who resembles you to sufficient degrees in relevant respects, who is the leader of a religious cult. The counterpart relation is a similarity relation in most cases (but arguably not in all cases). As such, it is not an equivalence relation. This affords Lewis ample theoretical maneuverability but at the same time causes him some theoretical trouble. For example, as Lewis himself admits, his counterpart theoretic account of modality either yields the consequence that every actual object necessarily exists or yields the consequence that some actual object is not identical to itself (Lewis 1983: 32). There is also a famous complaint voiced by Saul Kripke (Kripke 1972: 344–45, note 13). It in effect says that whether someone other than you is the leader of a religious cult at some possible world is irrelevant to whether you could have been the leader of a religious cult. Lewis’s reply to this is that the de re character of the possibility is preserved by the stipulation that the person who is the cult leader is the counterpart of you, rather than the counterpart of someone else, at an appropriate possible world. For an attempt to avoid counterparts and still retain a broadly Lewisian realistic framework, see McDaniel 2004.

A significantly different counterpart theory is proposed by Delia Graff Fara (Fara 2008, 2012). Fara analyzes modality de re in terms of sortal sameness rather than similarity. She clearly distinguishes sortal sameness (e.g., “is the same boat as”) from identity (“is identical with”), and this qualifies her analysis as a version of counterpart theory: a given boat is F at a world if and only if at that world something that is the same boat as--rather than identical with--that given boat is F. This also somewhat alleviates Kripke’s famous complaint against counterpart theory. Suppose that a boat B is actually made up of a hunk of wood W and a small plank P is a proper part of W. It is intuitively sensible to hold that B is identical with W, that B could have lacked P as a part, and that W could not have lacked P as a part. But this intuitive view appears internally incoherent. If B is identical with W and W could not have lacked P as a part, then it appears that B also could not have lacked P as a part; in other words, B without P appears to be an impossible object. On Fara’s analysis, B could have lacked P if and only if at some possible world, some x is such that x is the same boat as B and x lacks P, and W could have lacked P if and only if at some possible world, some y is such that y is the same hunk of wood as W and y lacks P. Since y may not be the same boat as x (e.g., y may not be a boat at all), there is not even an appearance of inconsistency with the latter lacking (a counterpart of) P and the former not lacking it. Thus, even if B is identical with W and W could not have lacked P, B could have lacked P, i.e., B without P is a possible object even though W without P is not. Whereas Lewis invokes similarity, which is relative to contextually shifting respects, Fara invokes sortal sameness, which is less shifty. Fara’s counterpart theory also interestingly avoids denying the necessity of identity.

Independently of his counterpart theory, Lewis’s definition of a possible object has some peculiar consequences, given that existence in general is understood as bearing of the part-of relation to the whole that constitutes the domain of discourse. Take any two possible worlds w1 and w2. Lewis wants to assert that both w1 and w2 exist in some sense. So for the assertion to be true, it must be true relative to a domain of discourse which contains as a sub-domain some whole of which both w1 and w2 are part. Not both are part of a single possible world or of its part. The smallest whole of which they both are part is the (mereological) sum of w1 and w2. So, some domain D containing such a sum as a sub-domain must count as an acceptable domain of discourse for the evaluation of an existence claim. Consider a proper part p1 of w1 and a proper part p2 of w2. Let Gerry be the sum of p1 and p2. Then it is true to say that Gerry exists when the domain of discourse is D. So, there is a sense in which Gerry exists. In fact it is the same sense in which w1 and w2 exist. But Gerry is not a possible object, according to Lewis’s conception, for Gerry does not have all of its parts at a single possible world. This is peculiar. Gerry is an object which exists in the same sense in which possible worlds exist but Gerry is not a possible object. Since—as sanctioned by the universality of mereological summation, which Lewis accepts—Gerry is an object, Gerry is an impossible object. But there is nothing impossible about Gerry any more than there is about the sum of w1 and w2. Perhaps the sum of w1 and w2 is an impossible object, too. But this idea flouts the initially plausible principle of recombination for possibility of objects, which says that if x is a possible object and y is a possible object independent of x, then the totality consisting exactly of x and y is a possible object. Defenders of Lewis’s theory may take this to mean that the principle of recombination, despite its initial plausibility, is to be rejected. There is another unexpected consequence of Lewis’s theory. If the sum of w1 and w2 is an impossible object, then the sum of all possible worlds is an impossible object, for the former is part of the latter and no impossible object is part of a possible object. But this makes the domain in which all possible worlds reside, or “logical space”, an impossible object. This appears unwelcome. Lewis does consider an alternative conception of a possible object, which says that a possible object is an object every part of which exists at some possible world or other (Lewis 1986: 211). This allows a possible object to have parts at different possible worlds. Lewis, who accepts the universality of mereological summation, does not deny that possible objects in this sense are as real as possible objects in his preferred sense. He however dismisses them as unimportant on the ground that we do not normally name them, speak of them, or quantify over them. But given that sets of possible worlds and sets of possible objects figure in important philosophical discussions concerning the identity of propositions and properties, these sets seem important. If the sum of the members of an important set is important, then Lewis’s dismissal appears hasty. Again, defenders of Lewis may stand this line of reasoning on its head and conclude that the sum of the members of an important set is not always important.

A useful overview of various issues concerning Lewis’s possibilist realism, as well as actualist representationism, is found in Divers 2002, which is the first systematic attempt to defend parts of Lewis’s theory since Lewis 1986. Cameron 2012 presents a defense of Lewis’s reductive analysis of modality. Loux 1979 is the standard anthology of classical writings in modal metaphysics in 1963–79.

2.1.2 Modal–Dimensionalism

Lewis’s is the most developed version of possibilist realism based on possible worlds. As a result, discussion of possibilist realism almost always focuses exclusively on Lewis’s version. There are, however, other versions of possible-worlds-based possibilist realism, and one of them deserves a brief mention. Assume that the universe is spread out in three-dimensional space and persists through one-dimensional time. The non-Lewisian version of possibilist realism in question may then be called ‘modal–dimensionalism’. It says that in addition to the four physical (spatiotemporal) dimensions, the universe has modal dimensions. Possible worlds are points in modal space as defined by the modal axes just as physical spatiotemporal points are points in physical spacetime as defined by the four physical spatiotemporal axes, and possible objects “persist” through possible worlds. A version of modal–dimensionalism is what W. V. Quine argued against when he took himself to be arguing against a typical possibilist realism (Quine 1976), and it is arguably the view many possible-worlds theorists adumbrated, however vaguely and inchoately, as the representative possibilist realist theory before Lewis forcefully articulated his own version.

Modal–dimensionalism differs from Lewis’s theory in a number of important respects but the most striking is the absence of counterpart theory. Modal–dimensionalism eschews counterparts and proposes that to say that you are the leader of a religious cult at a possible world is to say that you yourself exist at that world and are the leader of a religious cult at that world. Another difference between modal–dimensionalism and Lewis’s theory is that unlike the latter, the former avoids the mereological conception of the existence of a possible object at a possible world. According to modal–dimensionalism, just as a temporally or spatially persisting object is (arguably) not part of the temporal or spatial points or regions at which it exists, a modally persisting object is not part of the possible worlds at which it exists. Modal–dimensionalism also differs from Lewis’s theory in not being a thoroughly reductionist theory. It does not analyze the notion of a possible world in mereological terms but leaves it as largely primitive (Yagisawa 2002, 2010, 2017). This enables modal–dimensionalists to allow the possibility of there being no concrete object, whereas on Lewis’ theory, if there is no concrete object, there is no possible world. For a different attempt to reconcile possibilist realism with the possibility of the non-existence of anything concrete, see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2004.

Though free from some difficulties inherent in Lewis’s theoretical machinery, modal–dimensionalism has its own obstacles to overcome, not the least of which is to make substantive sense of the idea of an object’s persisting not just in physical space and time but in modal space. One idea is to mimic the “endurantist” approach to temporal persistence and say that a possible object persists through many possible worlds by having all of its parts existing at each of those worlds. Another idea is to mimic the “perdurantist” approach to temporal persistence and say that a possible object persists through many possible worlds by having different parts (world stages) at different possible worlds and being the modal-dimensional “worm” consisting of those world stages. Note that this does not make the object mereological part of a possible world at which it exists. It only makes each of the object’s world stages part of the object. Lewis, in contrast, has it that a possible object has all of its parts at a single possible world (where they are mereological part of that world) and therefore does not persist through different worlds at all. Despite these differences, Lewis, speaking of the “perdurantist” version of modal–dimensionalism, says that it is but a notational variant of his own theory. He then proceeds to criticize it (Lewis 1968: 40–2). Lewis formulates his opposition to modal–dimensionalism more carefully in Lewis 1986: 213–20. Achille Varzi derives Lewis’s theory from a theory similar to modal–dimensionalism (Varzi 2001). Unlike modal–dimensionalism, the theory he uses follows Lewis and defines the existence of a possible object at a possible world in terms of the object being mereological part of the world. Varzi notes some differences between this theory and Lewis’s. Vacek 2017 defends modal-dimensionalism from some objections.

2.1.3 Specificity Problem

It is well known that Quine fiercely objects against the ontology of non-actual possible objects. Referring to an unoccupied doorway, he asks whether the possible fat man in the doorway and the possible bald man in the doorway are one possible man or two possible men (Quine, 1948). The point of this rhetorical question is that there is no serious issue here because we have no non-trivial criterion of identity for non-actual possible objects. No respectable ontology should embrace objects for which we have no non-trivial criterion of identity. Quine encapsulates this in his famous slogan: “No entity without identity”. Actual ordinary mid-sized objects have vague boundaries, so the sorites argument may be used to show that we have no coherent non-trivial criterion of identity for them. Quine’s slogan then appears to apply to such objects. Some take this to be good reason against the ontology of actual ordinary mid-sized objects, whereas others take this to be good reason against Quine’s slogan. Whatever the ultimate fate of Quine’s slogan may be, there is an objection against possibilist realism which, while not explicitly invoking Quine’s slogan, is at least Quinean in spirit. It goes as follows:

Lewis’s possibilist realism faces the problem of specifying non-actual possible objects. Take Vulcan, the innermost planet between Sun and Mercury erroneously believed to exist by some astronomers in the nineteenth century, when the universe was assumed to be Newtonian. Vulcan is not actually between Sun and Mercury or actually anywhere at all. Vulcan also does not actually have any mass, shape, or chemical composition. Still it is possible that Vulcan be a unique planet between Sun and Mercury and have a particular mass m, a particular shape s, and a particular chemical composition c. Or so it seems. It is also possible, it seems, that Vulcan be a unique planet between Sun and Mercury and have a slightly different particular mass m′, a slightly different particular shape s′, and a slightly different particular chemical composition c′, where the slight differences in question lie within the range of deviations the original astronomers would have tolerated. So at some possible world w Vulcan is a unique planet between Sun and Mercury and has m, s, and c, and at some possible world w′ Vulcan is a unique planet between Sun and Mercury and has m′, s′, and c′. Clearly w and w′ are different worlds. On Lewis’s theory, every possible object exists at only one world. So either the planet in question at w is not Vulcan or the planet at w′ is not Vulcan. Whichever planet that is not Vulcan is Vulcan’s counterpart at best. Is either planet Vulcan? If so, which one? If neither is, where is Vulcan? What possible world hosts Vulcan? There seems to be no non-arbitrary way to answer these questions within Lewis’s theory.

The modal-dimensionalist version of possibilist realism is capable of offering the ready answer, “The planet at w and the planet at w′ are both (world stages of) Vulcan”, but faces an only slightly different challenge of its own. It seems intuitive to say that there is a possible world at which Vulcan exists between Sun and Mercury and some remote heavenly body distinct from Vulcan but qualitatively identical with it in relevant respects (such as mass, shape, size, chemical composition, etc.) also exists. Let w1 be such a world and call Vulcan’s double at w1 ‘Nacluv’. Thus at w1, Vulcan and Nacluv exist, Vulcan is between Sun and Mercury, and Nacluv is somewhere far away. It is possible for Vulcan and Nacluv to switch positions. So there is a possible world, w2, which is exactly like w1 except that at w2 Nacluv is between Sun and Mercury and Vulcan is far away. Since Vulcan and Nacluv are two distinct objects, w1 and w2 are two distinct worlds. But this difference seems empty. Given that w1 and w2 are exact qualitative duplicates of each other, on what ground can we say that the object between Sun and Mercury at w1 and far away at w2 is Vulcan and the object far away at w1 and between Sun and Mercury at w2 is Nacluv, rather than the other way around? It is unhelpful to say that Vulcan and Nacluv are distinguished by the fact that Vulcan possesses Vulcan’s haecceity and Nacluv does not. An object’s haecceity is the property of being that very object (Kaplan 1975, Adams 1979, Lewis 1986: 220–48). Since what is at issue is the question of which object is Vulcan, it does not help to be told that Vulcan is the object possessing the property of being that very object, unless the property of being that very object is clarified independently. To say that it is the property of being that very object which is Vulcan is clearly uninformative. It is not obvious that there is any way to clarify it independently.

Alternatively, one might choose to insist that if anything at any possible world is Vulcan, it has to possess at that world the properties relevant to the introduction of the name ‘Vulcan’, such as being the heavenly body with such-and-such mass and orbit and other astrophysical characteristics and being between Sun and Mercury in a Newtonian universe. This is supported by descriptionism concerning the semantics of proper names, according to which ‘Vulcan’ is a proper name which is semantically equivalent to a definite description (‘the heavenly body with such-and-such mass and ...’). But forceful criticisms of descriptionism for proper names were launched in the early 1970s (Donnellan 1972, Kripke 1972). Kripke’s criticism has been especially influential. The kernel of Kripke’s criticism rests on the intuitive idea that a sentence containing a referring proper name expresses a singular proposition about the referent independently of any qualitative characterization of the referent but that a corresponding sentence containing a description does not so express a singular proposition. If Kripke’s criticism applies to ‘Vulcan’, it is difficult to defend descriptionism for ‘Vulcan’. But ‘Vulcan’ and other apparent proper names of non-actual possible objects may not be as readily amenable to the Kripkean considerations as proper names of actual objects are. The so-called “problem of empty names” is the problem of providing a semantic theory for “empty names” like ‘Vulcan’ as non-descriptional designators. For some recent contributions to the project of solving this problem, see Braun 1993, 2005, Everett & Hofweber 2000, Brock 2004, Piccinini & Scott 2010, Cullison & Caplan 2011, Kripke 2013.

2.2 Actualist Representationism

According to actualist representationism, which is also known under Lewis’s tendentious label ersatzism, a possible world is an actual maximally consistent representation of how the universe could possibly have been, and the actual world is the representation of how the universe actually is. A representation r is maximally consistent if and only if r is consistent and for any representation r′, either r & not-r′ is not consistent or r & r′ is not consistent (assuming the appropriate conceptions of the negation and conjunction of representations). Different actualist representationists employ different actual items to play the role of the maximally consistent representations, such as sentences, propositions, states of affairs, properties, etc. (Adams 1974, Armstrong 1989, Bigelow and Pargetter 1990, Carnap 1947, Cresswell 1972, Forrest 1986, Hintikka 1962, Jeffrey 1965, Lycan 1979, Lycan & Shapiro 1986, Plantinga 1974, 1987, Prior & Fine 1977, Quine 1968, Roper 1982, Skyrms 1981, Stalnaker 1976). Note that the notion of consistency of a representation is not ultimately eliminated in actualist representationism. Most actualist representationists accept consistency as a modal notion, for they doubt it can be reduced to a non-modal notion, such as a proof-theoretic notion or a model-theoretic notion. If those actualist representationists are right and consistency is indeed a modal notion, then actualist representationism is not a reductionist theory of modality. This, however, should not automatically be taken to be a serious challenge to actualist representationism, for a thoroughly reductionist theory of modality may or may not be feasible. Not even every possibilist realist believes in thorough reduction; cf. modal–dimensionalists.

It is important to note that according to most versions of actualist representationism, the universe, as it (actually) is, is not the actual world. Since the actual world is a possible world and every possible world is a representation, the actual world is a representation. The universe, as it (actually) is, is not a representation but includes all representations, along with everything else. But it does not include non-actual possible objects. The universe includes all and only those objects which exist.

In actualist representationism, existence is conceptually prior to actual existence. This is in concert with the priority of the truth of any proposition P over the actual truth of P. P is actually true if and only if P is true at the actual world, which in turn is so if and only if the actual world represents P as true. And by definition, the actual world is the possible world which represents P as true if and only if P is true. Likewise, for an object to exist at the actual world is for the actual world to represent it as existing; the actual world represents an object as existing if and only if the object exists. Actual existence is thus reducible to existence simpliciter.

Non-actual possible existence is defined as existence at some possible world other than the actual world, which in turn is defined in terms of existence simpliciter as follows: x exists at a possible world w not identical with the actual world if and only if x would exist if w were actual, that is, if the universe were as w represents it to be. According to this picture, non-actual possible existence is not a special mode of existence completely separate from actual existence. It is not existence simpliciter, but instead “would-be” existence simpliciter on a counterfactual supposition. There is no room for non-actual possible objects in this picture. Many representations which are possible worlds other than the actual world include representations of the existence of non-actual possible objects, but non-actual possible objects are not mereological part of those possible worlds. Neither are they set-theoretic members, or constituents in any other sense, of those possible worlds. For them to exist at those possible worlds is for the worlds to say (represent) that they exist; nothing more, nothing less. This is a non-realist picture of the existence of the non-actual. Non-actual possible objects are thus nothing at all. This is the conservative view (1).

Let us examine how actualist representationists handle apparent modal truths asserting the possibility of non-actual objects. There are two types of such truth and the first type is easy to handle. It is possible that Julius Caesar (congenitally) had a sixth finger on his right hand (whereas, we assume, he actually had only five fingers). This possibility only calls for a possible world to represent Julius Caesar as having had a sixth finger on his right hand, which may easily be done by means of, say, the (interpreted English) sentence, ‘Julius Caesar had a sixth finger on his right hand’.

2.2.1 Nesting Problem

The second type of apparent modal truth, however, is more challenging. Julius Caesar could have had a sixth right finger which was never burnt but which could have been burnt. This involves a nested possibility, which is troublesome to actualist representationism (McMichael 1983). To reveal the nesting clearly, let us articulate the possibility in question in a more pedantic and rigorous way. The following is possible: Julius Caesar had a sixth right finger such that (a) it was never burnt, and (b) the following is possible: it was burnt. The trouble for actualist representationism is that there is no obvious way to make sense of the pronoun ‘it’ in (b). The possibility of Julius Caesar having had a sixth right finger which was never burnt is, as before, easily representable by, say, the sentence, ‘Julius Caesar had a sixth right finger which was never burnt’. This means that the pronoun ‘it’ in (a) is unproblematic; it is replaceable by ‘Julius Caesar’s sixth right finger’. How about the pronoun ‘it’ in (b)? It should designate the sixth right finger Julius Caesar is said to have had within the scope of the first possibility operator. It should therefore be bound by the appropriate existential quantifier, just like the pronoun ‘it’ in (a). But unlike the pronoun ‘it’ in (a), the pronoun ‘it’ in (b) occurs separated from the quantifier by the intervening second possibility operator, ‘the following is possible’. This “quantifying in” from outside the possibility operator forces the sentence representing the possibility specified in (b) to retain the pronoun ‘it’: ‘it was burnt’. Thus, unlike the pronoun ‘it’ in (a), the pronoun ‘it’ in (b) is not eliminable in the representation of the possibility in question. But no part of the representation that is the possible world in question, or any other possible world, may serve as the object which the pronoun ‘it’ in (b) designates, as the pronoun needs to designate something that is said to be a human finger but no part of any such representation is said to be a human finger. Notice that Lewis has no corresponding difficulty here. On his theory, the modal statement in question is true if and only if at some possible world there is a counterpart of Julius Caesar who had a sixth right finger f such that f was never burnt and at some possible world there is a counterpart of f which was burnt. Julius Caesar, his counterpart, and the counterpart’s sixth finger f are all real objects, and the pronoun ‘it’ in (b) designates f. (Note that the pronoun ‘it’ in (b) does not designate the counterpart of f any more than ‘it’ in (a) does.)

One way to handle this without postulating a non-actual possible object is to say that there was an actual finger belonging to someone else and that it could have belonged to Julius Caesar’s right hand as his extra finger (congenitally). If this sounds biologically too bizarre, actualist representationists may say instead that there are actual elementary particles none of which was part of Julius Caesar’s body but which collectively could have constituted his sixth right finger. This is along the lines of David Kaplan’s possible automobile (Kaplan 1973: 517, note 19) and Nathan Salmon’s Noman (Salmon 1981: 39, footnote 41). Kaplan imagines a complete set of automobile parts laid out on a factory floor ready for assembly. If the parts are assembled, a particular automobile will be created; if not, not. Suppose that the parts are destroyed before they are assembled. Then the particular automobile which would have been created if the parts had been assembled is in fact not created. It is a non-actual possible automobile. Salmon, taking a cue from Kripke’s suggestion of the necessity of origin (Kripke 1972), imagines a particular human egg and a particular human sperm which could merge into a particular human zygote and develop into a particular human being. Suppose that the egg and the sperm in fact fail to merge, hence fail to develop into a human being. The particular human being, Noman, who would have been created if the egg and the sperm had merged and developed normally is in fact not created. Noman is a non-actual possible human being. These lines of thought afford actualist representationists a powerful means to accommodate many apparently recalcitrant modal truths about non-actual possible objects, provided that these non-actual possible objects can be individuated uniquely by means of actually existing potential parts or origin. In fact, it may even be taken further to afford actualist representationists a way to maintain that Kaplan’s automobile is not only possible but is an actual object after all. This can be done by not only individuating Kaplan’s automobile uniquely by means of the collection of the automobile parts but also identifying it with the collection. Call Kaplan’s automobile ‘k’. Suppose that k is identical with the collection. Then there exists an actual object, namely k, which actually is not an automobile but is a collection of automobile parts and which is possibly an automobile. That is, k is represented as an unassembled collection of automobile parts by the actual world and is represented as an automobile by some possible world. Similarly, actualist representationists may identify Noman with the collection of the egg and the sperm. Noman is an actual object which actually is not a human being but is a collection of an egg and a sperm and which is possibly a human being. The case of Julius Caesar’s sixth finger can be handled likewise. There exists an actual object which actually is not a finger but is a (widely scattered) collection of particles and which is possibly Julius Caesar’s sixth right finger.

But now consider the planet Vulcan. There is no collection of actual particles which were supposed to constitute Vulcan. So, if Vulcan is a non-actual possible object, which it apparently is, it seems possible for Vulcan to exist and not be constituted by any actual particles differently located and arranged. Likewise, it seems perfectly possible that Julius Caesar had a sixth finger which was not constituted by any actually existing particles and satisfied (a) and (b). Despite initial plausibility, actualist representationists may choose to deny such a possibility. To do so is, in effect, to commit oneself to the position that the universe, as it actually is, already contains maximally possible constituents of any possible state of the universe, that is, it is impossible for the universe to contain even a single constituent object not already in the universe as it actually is. To make this plausible is not an easy task. If, on the other hand, actualist representationists choose not to deny the possibility in question, they appear to have to say that Julius Caesar’s entirely new sixth finger is not an object but is possibly an object. But then the problem is to make sense of the finger’s being nothing yet possibly something. How can there be a true predication of any kind, including “is possibly an object”, of nothing? (Oliver & Smiley 2013 offers the beginning of a partial answer to this question.)

2.2.2 Essence Solution

Alvin Plantinga is responsible for a widely-discussed actualist representationist response to this problem. He invokes unactualized individual essences (Plantinga 1974, 2003). Every object is said to have an individual essence. An individual essence of a given object is a property which that object necessarily has and everything else necessarily lacks. Moreover, and this is crucial to the solution of the problem at hand, individual essences are independent of the objects which have them, whether the objects are actual or non-actual. That is, an individual essence can exist without being an individual essence of any existing object. The problematic pronoun ‘it’ in (b) is then said to designate such an individual essence, and the rest of the characterization of the possibility in question is appropriately and systematically reinterpreted. For example, ‘it was burnt’ in (b) is reinterpreted to mean that the individual essence in question is an individual essence of something that was burnt.

One difficulty with this view is the failure to produce a single plausible example of such an essence. We saw that possibilist realism faces the problem of specifying non-actual possible objects. Plantinga’s version of actualist representationism faces its own version of the Quinean challenge, namely, the problem of specifying the individual essences which are supposed to replace non-actual possible objects. What individual essence did Julius Caesar have? What readily comes to mind is the property of being Julius Caesar. As Ruth Barcan Marcus and Kripke have forcefully argued (Barcan 1947, Marcus 1961, Kripke 1972), identity is necessary; that is, if an object x is identical with an object y, it is necessarily the case that x is identical with y. Given this, it is easy to see that Julius Caesar necessarily had the property of being Julius Caesar and everything other than Julius Caesar necessarily lacks it. However, it is implausible to suggest that this property is independent of Julius Caesar. Our canonical specification of it by means of the noun phrase ‘the property of being Julius Caesar’ certainly is not independent of our canonical specification of Julius Caesar by means of the name ‘Julius Caesar’, and this does not seem to be an accidental fact merely indicative of the paucity of our language devoid of deep metaphysical underpinnings. Kaplan’s automobile and Salmon’s Noman merely push the dependence of the individual essence to the level of the constituent parts or origin of the object of which it is an individual essence. This difficulty is magnified when we ask for a specification of an individual essence of Vulcan or Julius Caesar’s entirely new finger. For more on individual essence, see Adams 1981, McMichael 1983, Fine 1985, Menzel 1990, Lycan 1994, Linsky & Zalta 1994, Plantinga 2003.

2.2.3 Other Solutions

Theodore Sider proposes a different solution to the nesting problem (Sider 2002). According to his proposal, we should not regard different non-actual possible worlds as achieving their representation more or less independently of one another. Instead, we should regard all possible worlds as representations which are given all at once in concert with one another so that cross references to non-actual possible objects by different possible worlds are guaranteed from the outset.

Reina Hayaki proposes yet another solution (Hayaki 2003). When we say that Julius Caesar had an unburnt sixth right finger at some possible world w1, we take w1 to represent Julius Caesar as having an unburnt sixth right finger. When we say further that that finger at w1 was burnt at a different possible world w2, we should likewise take w2 to represent that finger as having been burnt. According to Hayaki, this requires a hierarchical arrangement of possible worlds in which the representation of the finger by w2 is parasitic on the representation by w1.

Other solutions to the nesting problem include the claim that despite strong appearance to the contrary, there are no modal statements about objects which do not actually exist; see Adams 1981, Fitch 1996.

3. Without Possible Worlds

Some important theories concerning possible objects and related issues do not invoke possible worlds as a theoretical cornerstone. Most prominent among them are so-called Meinongian theories. But before turning to them, let us briefly take note of two non-Meinongian approaches outside the framework of possible worlds: Kit Fine’s and Michael Jubien’s.

Like Plantinga, Fine takes individual essences seriously but he regards the notion of necessity as prior to the notion of a possible world, and the notion of an individual essence as prior to the notion of necessity (Fine 1994, 1995a, 1995b, 2000). Fine’s modal theory is based on the broadly Aristotelian idea that alethic modality stems from natures of things. Understanding of actual or non-actual possible objects should therefore be firmly grounded on understanding of natures of things. Fine believes that ‘There is a possible object x’ is reducible to ‘Possibly there is an object x’ (Prior and Fine 1977: 130–9, Fine 1979, 1981, 2003). For a similar reductive proposal, see Peacocke 1978, 2002. For some difficulties with such a project, see Hazen 1976.

Jubien builds his modal theory out of properties and their relations (Jubien 1996, 2009). The possibility of Julius Caesar’s having had an entirely new sixth right finger satisfying (a) and (b) is analyzed roughly as follows: the property of being a particular sixth finger on Julius Caesar’s right hand is simultaneously compatible with the properties of existing, being composed of non-actual stuff, and being never burnt, and also simultaneously compatible with the properties of existing, being composed of non-actual stuff, and being burnt. The underlying idea is to start with the ontology of stuff and use properties and relations, including modal properties and relations, as the fundamental metaphysical items to account for all statements about objects, including all modal statements about possible objects. It specifically avoids talk of non-actual possible objects. It, however, does not avoid talk of non-actual possible stuff. So it does embrace the ontology of the non-actual possible in a broad sense.

3.1 Subsistence vs. Existence

Alexius Meinong’s theory of objects has had much influence on some contemporary theorists, resulting in a variety of proposals. These proposals are known broadly as Meinongian. According to Meinong, a subject term in any true sentence stands for an object (Meinong 1904). So the subject term in the sentence, ‘The sixth right finger of Julius Caesar is a finger’, stands for an object, assuming that the sentence is true. (Such an assumption is strongly disputed in Salmon 1987.) Even though the exact respects in which contemporary Meinongian proposals are Meinongian and the extent of their Meinongianism differ from one proposal to another, all of them inherit this claim by Meinong in some form. They are thus united in resisting Bertrand Russell’s criticism of Meinong, which mandates analyzing sentences containing a definite description, like the one above concerning the sixth right finger of Julius Caesar, as general statements rather than singular statements (Russell 1905); see 3.1.2 for a particularly famous piece of Russell’s criticism and how two leading Meinongian theories handle it.

Meinong distinguishes two ontological notions: subsistence and existence. Subsistence is a broad ontological category, encompassing both concrete objects and abstract objects. Concrete objects are said to exist and subsist. Abstract objects are said not to exist but to subsist. The talk of abstract objects may be vaguely reminiscent of actualist representationism, which employs representations, which are actual abstract objects. At the same time, for Meinong, the nature of an object does not depend on its being actual. This seems to give objects reality that is independent of actuality. Another interesting feature of Meinong’s theory is that it sanctions the postulation not only of non-actual possible objects but also of impossible objects, for it says that ‘The round square is round’ is a true sentence and therefore its subject term stands for an object. This aspect of Meinong’s theory has been widely pointed out, but non-trivial treatment of impossibility is not confined to Meinongianism (Lycan & Shapiro 1986). For more on Meinong’s theory, see Chisholm 1960, Findlay 1963, Grossmann 1974, Lambert 1983, Zalta 1988: sec.8. For some pioneering work in contemporary Meinongianism, see Castañeda 1974, Rapaport 1978, Routley 1980. We shall examine the theories of two leading Meinongians: Terence Parsons and Edward Zalta. We shall take note of some other Meinongians later in the section on fictional objects, as their focus is primarily on fiction. Parsons and Zalta not only propose accounts of fictional objects but offer comprehensive Meinongian theories of objects in general.

3.1.1 Theory of Non-Existent Objects

Quine thought it curious that the ontological problem was so simple as to be put in three monosyllables: “What is there?” He famously answered this simple question equally simply: “Everything” (Quine 1948). Parsons rejects Quine’s claim that every object exists, and asserts that some objects do not exist. Parsons proposes a theory of all objects, both existent and non-existent (Parsons 1980). He uses the word ‘actual’ as a synonym for ‘existent’, so he rejects (1), (2), and (3), but accepts (4) and (5) as trivialities. It would be a mistake to classify him as an actualist simply because he accepts (5). On the contrary, he has much in common with possibilists in claiming that some objects are not actual, that is, in denying (2). He, however, admits only one sense of existence and claims that some objects do not exist in that sense. If this sole sense of existence corresponds to the possibilist conception of existence relativized to any domain of discourse smaller than the largest available domain, then Parsons is in agreement with possibilists. But if it corresponds to the possibilist conception of existence relativized to the largest available domain, then Parsons’ ontology goes beyond that of possibilists. There is good evidence that the latter is the case, for Parsons’ ontology, as a typically Meinongian ontology, includes the round square and other impossible objects, which the possibilist ontology does not include. Lewis’s discussion (Lewis 1990) of how the non-Meinongian should understand “noneism”, which is the view that some things do not exist, held by another Meinongian, Richard Routley (later Richard Sylvan), is helpful in this connection. For differences between Routley’s theory and Parsons’, see Parsons 1983. A sympathizer of Routley, Graham Priest, uses dialetheism (the thesis that some contradictions are true) and paraconsistent logic, along with the (possible- and impossible-) worlds framework, to bolster noneism (Priest 2005, 2016).

Parsons’ theory is based on the Meinongian distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties. Nuclear properties include all ordinary properties, such as being blue, being tall, being kicked by Socrates, being a mountain, and so on. Extra-nuclear properties include ontological properties such as existence and being fictional, modal properties such as being possible, intentional properties such as being thought of by Socrates, and technical properties such as being complete. See Parsons 1980: 24–27, 166–74 for more on nuclear and extra-nuclear properties and a test for distinguishing between them. Parsons’ theory can be encapsulated in the following two principles:

(P1) No two objects have exactly the same nuclear properties;

(P2) For any set of nuclear properties, some object has all the nuclear properties in the set and no other nuclear properties.

Take the set of nuclear properties, {being golden, being a mountain}. By (P1) and (P2), some unique object has exactly the two nuclear properties in the set. That object is the golden mountain. Take another set of nuclear properties, {being square, being round}, and the two principles give us the round square. Both of these objects are radically incomplete; they have no weight, height, shape, or size, for example. The need for distinguishing nuclear properties from extra-nuclear properties is readily seen by considering the set, {being golden, being a mountain, being existent}. If (P2) is to apply to such a set, it should yield an object having the three properties in the set. Such an object is golden, a mountain, and existent, that is, it is a golden mountain which exists. So it should be true that a golden mountain exists, but it is in fact not true. Parsons defines a possible object as an object such that it is possible that there exist an object having all of its nuclear properties. On this conception, all existing objects are possible objects, some golden mountains are possible objects, and the round square is not a possible object. It is worth noting that in Parsons’ theory, negation needs to be handled delicately (Parsons 1980: 19–20, 105–06, Zalta 1988: 131–34). Take the set, {being round, being non-round}. By (P2), we have an object, x, which is round and non-round. So, x is non-round. If we can infer from this that it is not the case that x is round, then we should be entitled to say that x is round and it is not the case that x is round, which is a contradiction. Thus, we should not be allowed to infer ‘It is not the case that x is round’ from ‘x is non-round’.

If Julius Caesar’s entirely new right finger satisfying (a) and (b) is to be a Meinongian object of Parsons’ theory, the best candidate appears to be a non-existent incomplete object corresponding to the set of properties, {being a finger, belonging to Julius Caesar’s right hand, being never burnt}. This set includes neither the property of being constituted by particles which do not (actually) exist nor the property of being possibly burnt. Both of these properties are extra-nuclear properties, hence ineligible to be included in a set to which (P2) applies. So (P2) does not confer them on the object corresponding to the set. How then does the object come to have the properties? It is not obvious how this question should be answered (Parsons 1980: 21, note 4, where Parsons says, “The present theory is very neutral about de re modalities”), but we should at least note that on Parsons’s theory, objects are allowed to have properties not included in their corresponding sets of nuclear properties: e.g., the round square, whose corresponding set only includes roundness and squareness, has the property of being non-existent and the property of being incomplete. Also, Parsons allows nuclear properties which are “watered-down” versions of extra-nuclear properties. So the set may include the “watered-down” versions of the two extra-nuclear properties in question and that may be enough. For more on these and related issues in Parsons’ theory, see Howell 1983, Fine 1984.

3.1.2 Theory of Encoding

Zalta’s theory is based on the distinction made by Meinong’s student, Ernst Mally, between two kinds of predication: exemplification and encoding (Mally 1912, Zalta 1983, 1988). The idea is to maintain the Meinongian claim that the round square is a genuine object while avoiding contradicting oneself. Russell argues that since the round square is round and square, and since if an object is square it is not the case that it is round, it follows that the round square is such that both it is round and it is not the case that it is round, which is a contradiction. Parsons avoids the contradiction by refusing the inference from ‘x is square’ to ‘it is not the case that x is round’, where ‘x’ ranges over all objects. In contrast, Zalta accepts the inference for all objects and avoids the contradiction by refusing to interpret the predication, ‘is round and square’, of the round square as exemplification. He instead interprets it as encoding; the round square encodes roundness and squareness. Encoding squareness is not incompatible with encoding roundness, even though exemplifying squareness is incompatible with exemplifying roundness. Predication as understood as encoding follows a different logic from predication as understood as exemplification. The crux of Zalta’s theory is encapsulated in the following two principles:

(Z1) Objects which could sometimes have a spatial location do not, and cannot, encode properties;

(Z2) For any condition on properties, some object that could never have a spatial location encodes exactly those properties which satisfy the condition.

Some object is the round square, for, by (Z2), among objects which could never have a spatial location is an object which encodes roundness and squareness. The noun phrase, ‘the round square’, unambiguously denotes such a necessarily non-spatial object. Other noun phrases of the same kind include those which denote numbers, sets, Platonic forms, and so on. There are, however, many noun phrases which are ambiguous. They allow an interpretation under which they denote an object that is necessarily non-spatial, and also allow an interpretation under which they denote an object that is possibly spatial and possibly non-spatial. The phrase, ‘the golden mountain’, is an example. The golden mountain in one sense is an object which is necessarily non-spatial and which encodes goldenness and mountainhood. The golden mountain in the other sense is an object which actually is non-spatial but could be spatial. When we say that the golden mountain in the second sense is golden, it means that necessarily if the golden mountain is spatial, it is golden. Since, by (Z1), such an object cannot encode properties, all predications in the preceding sentence have to be understood as exemplification. Similarly with Julius Caesar’s entirely new finger satisfying (a) and (b).

Zalta endorses the claim that some objects are non-actual possible objects, so he appears to side with possibilists. But he defines a non-actual possible object as an object which could have a spatial location but does not (Zalta 1988: 67). So the claim means for Zalta that some objects could have a spatial location but do not. This is compatible with actualism, provided that all such objects are actual in the sense of actually existing (Linsky & Zalta 1994, also Williamson 1998, 2002, 2013; it is noteworthy that Timothy Williamson independently argues for what he calls necessitism, which says [in a nutshell] that every possible object is a necessary object). If we understand Zalta’s theory this way, we have the following actualist picture: all objects are actual and existing, some objects are necessarily non-spatial, and other objects are possibly spatial and possibly non-spatial. (For an alternative interpretation of Zalta’s formal theory, according to which some objects do not exist, see Zalta 1983: 50–52, 1988: 102–04, Linsky & Zalta 1996: note 8.) Among the latter type of objects are those which are actually spatial but possibly not, like you and me, and those which are possibly spatial but actually not, like the golden mountain in the appropriate sense. The distinction between the golden mountain in this (exemplification) sense and the golden mountain in the other (encoding) sense is key to overcoming some objections (Linsky & Zalta 1996). See Bennett 2006 for the claim that the Linsky-Zalta view is not actualist, and Nelson & Zalta 2009 for a response. Hayaki 2006 critiques both Linsky-Zalta and Williamson.

If we confine our attention to necessarily non-spatial objects, a definition of a possible object which corresponds to Parsons’ definition is easily available to Zalta: a possible (necessarily non-spatial) object is a (necessarily non-spatial) object such that some object could exemplify exactly the properties it encodes. In this sense, some object which encodes goldenness and mountainhood, among other properties, is a possible object but the object which encodes squareness and roundness is not. Julius Caesar’s entirely new finger satisfying (a) and (b) can be treated in the same way as the golden mountain. Complications similar to those which arise for Parsons’ theory do not arise for Zalta’s theory, for all properties are equally subject to encoding, including those properties Parsons regards as extra-nuclear. For a comparison of the two-kinds-of-property approach and the two-kinds-of-predication approach, see Rapaport 1985.

4. Unicorns

If anything is a non-actual possible object, a unicorn is. Or so it appears. But Kripke vigorously argues against such a view in the 1980 version of Kripke 1972: 24, 156–58. His argument starts with the assumption that the unicorn is (intended to be) an animal species if anything. This excludes the possibility that a horse with a horn artificially attached to its forehead is a unicorn. Kripke assumes obviously that there are actually no unicorns and that unicorns are purely mythical creatures. Also assumed is the absence in the relevant myth of any specification of the genetic structure, evolutionary history, or other potentially defining essential features of the unicorn. (Possession of a horn is not a defining essential feature of the unicorn any more than having tawny stripes is a defining feature of the tiger.) The myth describes the unicorn only in stereotypical terms: looking like a horse, having a horn protruding from its forehead, etc. Suppose that there are objects with all such stereotypical features of the unicorn. This seems perfectly possible and Kripke accepts such a possibility. But he rejects its sufficiency for establishing the possibility of unicorns. Suppose that among the objects with the stereotypical unicorn features, some have a genetic makeup, an evolutionary history, or some other potentially defining essential unicorn characteristic which is radically different from the corresponding characteristic had by the others with the same stereotypical unicorn features. Which ones among those with the stereotypical unicorn features would then be real unicorns and which ones fool’s unicorns (à la fool’s gold)? There is no fact of the matter. Given that the unicorn is an animal species, not everything that looks and behaves like a unicorn is guaranteed to be a unicorn. To be a unicorn, an object has to possess the defining essential characteristics of the unicorn. But there are no defining characteristics of the unicorn; the myth does not specify them, and the universe does not instantiate them. This surprising argument has convinced many philosophers of the impossibility of unicorns, but others have raised doubt by arguing that the notion of a biological kind, such as a species, is far more malleable than Kripke assumes (Dupré 1993).

The line of argument Kripke uses, if successful, is applicable to all non-actual natural kinds and their analogs (except for natural-kind analogs of Kaplan’s automobile or Salmon’s Noman). It is unclear that it or something like it is successfully applicable to individuals like Vulcan, but if it is, then we must say that such individuals are impossible objects. Some theorists liken Vulcan to fictional objects, as we will see in the next section, and some theorists argue that fictional objects are impossible objects (Kaplan 1973, 1980 version of Kripke 1972: 157–58, Fine 1984: 126–28, Yagisawa 2010: 271–77). If Vulcan is an impossible object, the problem of uniquely specifying Vulcan, as opposed to Nacluv, becomes less urgent, for it is not evident that we should be able to specify an impossible object uniquely and non-trivially.

5. Fictional Objects

Let us shift our attention from mythological creatures to fictional objects. Fictional objects include fictional characters but not all fictional objects are fictional characters. Sherlock Holmes is a fictional object and a fictional character. His liver is a fictional object but not a fictional character. It may be tempting to think that fictional objects are non-actual possible objects, even though it is obvious that not all non-actual possible objects are fictional objects.

There are two main problems with the claim that fictional objects are possible objects. One is the problem of impossible fictional objects. Some fictional objects are ascribed incompatible properties in their home fiction by their original author (usually inadvertently). This seems to be sufficient for them to have those properties according to their home fiction, for what the author says in the fiction (inadvertently or not) seems to hold the highest authority on truth in that fiction. On the assumption that a fictional object has a given property if it has that property according to its home fiction, those fictional objects are impossible objects, for no possible object has incompatible properties. The other problem is the failure of uniqueness. It may be viewed as the problem of meeting the Quinean demand for clear identity conditions. Holmes is a particular fictional object. So if we are to identify Holmes with a possible object, we should identify Holmes with a particular possible object. But there are many particular possible objects that are equally suited for the identification with Holmes. One of them has n-many hairs, whereas another has (n+1)-many hairs. No fictional story about a particular fictional object written or told by a human being is detailed enough to exclude all possible objects but one to be identified with that fictional object, unless it is a fiction about an actual object or a non-actual possible object analogous to Kaplan’s automobile or Salmon’s Noman.

Strangely enough, there is also a problem with the claim that fictional objects are non-actual objects. That is, there is some plausible consideration in support of the claim that fictional objects are actual objects. We make various assertions about fictional objects outside the stories in which they occur and some of them are true: for example, that Sherlock Holmes is admired by many readers of the Holmes stories. The simplest and most systematic explanation appears to be to postulate Holmes as an actual object possessing the properties such true assertions ascribe to him. Fictional objects may then be said to be theoretical objects of literary criticism as much as electrons are theoretical objects of physics. This type of view enjoys surprisingly wide acceptance. (Searle 1974, van Inwagen 1977, 1983, Fine 1982, Salmon 1998, Thomasson 1999). The theorists in this camp, except van Inwagen (van Inwagen 2003: 153–55), also think that fictional objects are brought into existence by their authors as actual objects. Even if this type of view is to be followed, it must still be denied that Holmes is actually a detective, for if we enumerate all individuals who are actually detectives, Holmes will not be among them. By the same token, Holmes is not actually a resident of Baker Street or even a human being. Though actual, Holmes is actually hardly any of those things Conan Doyle’s stories describe him as being. Holmes must not be a concrete object at all but instead an abstract object which has the property of being a detective according to Doyle’s stories, the property of being a resident of Baker Street according to Doyle’s stories, and so on.

Meinongian theories overcome the problems of impossibility and non-uniqueness in a straightforward way. According to Parsons’ theory, a fictional object x which originates in a certain story is the object that has exactly the nuclear properties F such that according to the story, Fx (Parsons 1980: 49–60, 228–23). A fictional object to which the story ascribes incompatible properties is simply an impossible object, but such an object is harmless because it does not exist. As for the problem of non-uniqueness, Sherlock Holmes is not identified as a complete object. Instead Holmes is said to be the object having just the nuclear properties Holmes has according to the stories. There is no number n such that Holmes has exactly n-many hairs according to the stories. So Parsons’ Holmes does not have n-many hairs, for any n. It is an incomplete object.

Zalta offers a similar picture of fictional objects which is subsumed under his general theory of encoding. According to him, a fictional object x which originates in a certain story is the object that encodes exactly the properties F such that according to the story, Fx (Zalta 1988: 123–29). Zalta’s treatment of the problem of impossibility is similar to Parsons’. A fictional object to which the story ascribes incompatible properties is an object which encodes those properties, among others. Such an object is harmless because it does not exemplify the incompatible properties. Zalta’s solution to the problem of non-uniqueness is equally similar to Parsons’. Sherlock Holmes, for Zalta, is simply an incomplete object which does not encode the property of having exactly n-many hairs, for any n.

Though not meant to be a fictional object, Vulcan may be given the same treatment as explicitly fictional objects. According to Parsons, the word ‘Vulcan’ is ambiguous. In one sense, it is the name of a fictional object which originates in a false astronomical story. In the other sense, it does not refer to anything. Zalta does not recognize Parsons’ second sense and simply regards ‘Vulcan’ as the name of a fictional object.

For another Meinongian approach to fictional objects, see Castañeda 1979. Charles Crittenden offers a view in a Meinongian spirit but with a later-Wittgensteinian twist (Crittenden 1991). Like Parsons, Crittenden maintains that some objects do not exist and that fictional objects are such objects. Following later Wittgenstein, however, he sees no need to go beyond describing the “language game” we play in our fictional discourse and dismisses all metaphysical theorizing. Robert Howell criticizes Parsons’ theory, among others, and recommends an approach which construes fictional objects as non-actual objects in fictional worlds, where fictional worlds include not just possible but impossible worlds (Howell 1979). Nicholas Wolterstorff argues for the view that fictional objects are kinds (Wolterstorff 1980). For criticism of this view, see Walton 1983. Van Inwagen 2003 contains useful compact discussions of some Meinongian and non-Meinongian theories of fictional objects.

Gregory Currie denies that fictional names like ‘Sherlock Holmes’ are proper names or even singular terms (Currie 1990). He claims that sentences of fiction in which ‘Sherlock Holmes’ occurs should be regarded as jointly forming a long conjunction in which every occurrence of ‘Sherlock Holmes’ is replaced with a variable bound by an initial existential quantifier in the way suggested by Frank Ramsey (Ramsey 1931).

Kendall Walton urges that we should take seriously the element of make-believe, or pretense, inherent in the telling of a fictional story by the author and the listening to it by the audience (Walton 1990, also Evans 1982: 353–68, Kripke 2013). According to this pretense theory, the pretense involved in the language game of fictional discourse shields the whole language game from a separate language game aimed at non-fictional reality, and it is in the latter language game that we seek theories of objects of various kinds as real objects. If this is right, any search for the real ontological status of fictional objects appears to be misguided. For the view that the pretense theory is compatible with a theory of fictional objects as real objects, see Zalta 2000.

6. Quantified Modal Logic

One important theoretical use of non-actual possible objects is to bolster the most straightforward quantified modal logic (Scott 1970, Parsons 1995). If we add a modal sentential operator meaning “it is possible that” or “it is necessary that” to classical first-order quantificational logic, along with appropriate axioms and an appropriate rule of inference catering to the added operator, the resulting system yields a sentence meaning the following as a theorem:

If it is possible that something is F, then something is such that it is possible that it is F.

The formal logical sentence with this meaning is known as the Barcan Formula, after Ruth C. Barcan, who published the first systematic treatment of quantified modal logic, in which she postulated the formula as an axiom (Barcan 1946), and who has published under the name ‘Ruth Barcan Marcus’ since 1950. If we read ‘F’ as meaning “non-identical with every actual object”, the Barcan Formula says that if it is possible that something is non-identical with every actual object, then something x is such that it is possible that x is non-identical with every actual object. The antecedent is plausibly true, for there could have been more objects than the actual ones. But if so, the consequent is true as well, assuming the truth of the Barcan Formula. But no actual object is non-identical with every actual object, for every actual object is identical with itself, an actual object. Assuming the necessity of identity, if an object y is identical with an object z, it is not possible that y is non-identical with z. So, no actual object is such that it is possible that it is non-identical with every actual object. Therefore, any object x such that it is possible that x is non-identical with every actual object must be a non-actual possible object.

The converse of the Barcan Formula is also a theorem along with the Barcan Formula in classical logic augmented with a possibility or necessity operator, and is as interesting. The Converse Barcan Formula, as it is known, says the following:

If something is such that it is possible that it is F, then it is possible that something is F.

The ontology of non-actual possible objects is an integral part of the possibilist view that quantifiers in quantified modal logic range over all possible objects, non-actual as well as actual. This possibilist view validates the Converse Barcan Formula. If we read ‘F’ as meaning “does not exist”, the Converse Barcan Formula says that if something x is such that it is possible that x does not exist, then it is possible that something does not exist. The antecedent is plausibly true, for any one of us, actual people, could have failed to exist. But if so, the consequent is true as well, assuming the truth of the Converse Barcan Formula. But on actualist representationism, no possible world contains a representation which says that something does not exist, for it is contradictory provided that ‘something’ means “some existing thing”. So if the consequent is to be true on actualist representationism, ‘something’ should not mean “some existing thing” but rather should mean “some thing, irrespective of whether it exists”. That is, the existential quantifier in the consequent needs to have a free range independently of the possibility operator in whose scope it occurs, which is hard to fathom on actualist representationism but which the possibilist view allows. The consequent does not even appear to be threatened with contradiction if we assume the possibilist view and let the existential quantifier range over all possible objects, including non-actual ones.

In classical logic, the domain for quantification is assumed to be non-empty and every individual constant is assumed to refer to something in the domain. In free logic, neither of these assumptions is made. Thus free logic appears to be particularly suited to theorizing about non-existent objects; see Lambert 1991, Jacquette 1996. For a criticism of the free-logical approach to fictional discourse, see Woods 1974: 68–91. Interestingly, the Barcan Formula and the Converse Barcan Formula are not derivable in free logic.

Marcus herself proposes the substitutional reading of quantification to skirt the need for non-actual possible objects (Marcus 1976), and later suggests combining it with objectual quantification over actual objects (Marcus 1985/86).

Williamson 2013 contains a detailed and useful discussion of the Barcan Formula and the Converse Barcan Formula.

Williamson 2013 also proposes that we should replace the possibilism-actualism distinction in favor of the distinction between necessitism (necessarily everything is necessarily something) and contingentism, which is the negation of necessitism. Necessitism entails that everything necessarily exists. Possibilism holds that some things are contingent existents, like you and me. Intuitively contingentism seems correct; it seems that you and I fail to exist at some possible worlds. But according to necessitism, such worlds are worlds where you and I do not exist as concrete objects but do exist as abstract objects. Williamson defends his proposal by arguing that the possibilism-actualism distinction is a distinction between a logical falsity and a logical triviality and that it neglects impossibilia. Menzel 2020 gives a critical examination of Williamson’s proposal. Also see Cameron 2016.


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