Absolute and Relational Space and Motion: Classical Theories

First published Mon Jul 19, 2021

Since antiquity, natural philosophers have struggled to comprehend the nature of three tightly interconnected concepts: space, time, and motion. A proper understanding of motion, in particular, has been seen to be crucial for deciding questions about the natures of space and time, and their interconnections. Since the time of Newton and Leibniz, philosophers’ struggles to comprehend these concepts have often appeared to take the form of a dispute between absolute conceptions of space, time and motion, and relational conceptions. This article guides the reader through some of the history of these philosophical struggles. Rather than taking sides in the (alleged) ongoing debates, or reproducing the standard dialectic recounted in most introductory texts, we have chosen to scrutinize carefully the history of the thinking of the canonical participants in these debates – principally Descartes, Newton, Leibniz, Mach and Einstein. Readers interested in following up either the historical questions or current debates about the natures of space, time and motion will find ample links and references scattered through the discussion and in the Other Internet Resources section below.

1. Introduction

Things change. This is a platitude but still a crucial feature of the world, and one which causes many philosophical perplexities – see for instance the entry on Zeno’s paradoxes. For Aristotle, motion (he would have called it ‘locomotion’) was just one kind of change, like generation, growth, decay, fabrication and so on. The atomists held on the contrary that all change was in reality the motion of atoms into new configurations, an idea that was not to begin to realize its full potential until the Seventeenth Century, particularly in the work of Descartes. (Of course, modern physics seems to show that the physical state of a system goes well beyond the geometrical configuration of bodies. Fields, while perhaps determined by the states of bodies, are not themselves configurations of bodies if interpreted literally, and in quantum mechanics bodies have ‘internal states’ such as particle spin.)

Not all changes seem to be merely the (loco)motions of bodies in physical space. Yet since antiquity, in the western tradition, this kind of motion has been absolutely central to the understanding of change. And since motion is a crucial concept in physical theories, one is forced to address the question of what exactly it is. The question might seem trivial, for surely what is usually meant by saying that something is moving is that it is moving relative to something, often tacitly understood between speakers. For instance: the car is moving at 60mph (relative to the road and things along it), the plane is flying (relative) to London, the rocket is lifting off (the ground), or the passenger is moving (to the front of the speeding train). Typically the relative reference body is either the surroundings of the speakers, or the Earth, but this is not always the case. For instance, it seems to make sense to ask whether the Earth rotates about its axis West-East diurnally or whether it is instead the heavens that rotate East-West; but if all motions are to be reckoned relative to the Earth, then its rotation seems impossible.

But if the Earth does not offer a unique frame of reference for the description of motion, then we may wonder whether any arbitrary object can be used for the definition of motions: are all such motions on a par, none privileged over any other? It is unclear whether anyone has really consistently espoused this view: Aristotle, perhaps, in the Metaphysics. Descartes and Leibniz are often thought to have done so; however, as we’ll see, those claims are suspect. Possibly Huygens, though the most recent and thorough reconstruction of his position (Stan 2016) indicates not. Mach at some moments perhaps. If this view were correct, then the question of whether the Earth or heavens rotate would be ill-formed, those alternatives being merely different but equivalent expressions of the facts.

However, suppose that, like Aristotle, you take ordinary language accurately to reflect the structure of the world. Then you could recognize systematic everyday uses of ‘up’ and ‘down’ that require some privileged standards – uses that treat things closer to a point at the center of the Earth as more ‘down’ and motions towards that point as ‘downwards’. Of course we would likely explain this usage in terms of the fact that we and our language evolved in a very noticeable gravitational field directed towards the center of the Earth; but for Aristotle, as we shall see, this usage helped identify an important structural feature of the universe, which itself was required for the explanation of weight. Now a further question arises: how should a structure, such as a preferred point in the universe, which privileges certain motions, be understood? What makes that point privileged? One might expect that Aristotle simply identified it with the center of the Earth, and so relative to that particular body; however, we shall soon see that he did not adopt that tacit convention as fundamental. So the question arises of whether the preferred point is somewhere picked out in some other way by the bodies in the universe – the center of the heavens perhaps? Or is it picked out quite independently of the arrangements of matter?

The issues that arise in this simple theory help to frame the debates between later physicists and philosophers concerning the nature of motion; in this article, we will focus on the theories of Descartes, Leibniz, and Newton. In the companion entry on absolute and relational space and motion: post-Newtonian theories, we study the approaches followed by Mach, Einstein, and certain contemporary researchers. We will see that similar concerns pervade all these works: is there any kind of privileged sense of motion: a sense in which things can be said to move or not, not just relative to this or that reference body, but ‘truly’? If so, can this true motion be analyzed in terms of motions relative to other bodies – to some special body, or to the entire universe perhaps? (And in relativity, in which distances, times and measures of relative motion are frame-dependent, what relations are relevant?) If not, then how is the privileged kind of motion to be understood, as relative to space itself – something physical but non-material – perhaps? Or can some kinds of motion be best understood as not being spatial changes – changes of relative location or of place – at all?

2. Aristotle

To see that the problem of the interpretation of spatiotemporal quantities as absolute or relative is endemic to almost any kind of mechanics one can imagine, we can look to one of the simplest theories – Aristotle’s account of natural motion (e.g., On the Heavens I.2). According to this theory it is because of their natures, and not because of ‘unnatural’ forces, that that heavy bodies move down, and ‘light’ things (air and fire) move up; it is their natures, or ‘forms’, that constitute the gravity or weight of the former and the levity of the latter. This account only makes sense if ‘up’ and ‘down’ can be unequivocally determined for each body. According to Aristotle, up and down are fixed by the position of the body in question relative to the center of the universe, a point coincident with the center of the Earth. That is, the theory holds that heavy bodies naturally move towards the center, while light bodies naturally move away.

Does this theory involve absolute or merely relative quantities? It depends on the nature of the center. If the center were identified with the center of the Earth, then the theory could be taken to eschew absolute quantities: it would simply hold that the natural motions of any body depend on its position relative to another, namely the Earth. But Aristotle is explicit that the center of the universe is not identical with, but merely coincident with the center of the Earth (e.g., On the Heavens II.14): since the Earth itself is heavy, if it were not at the center it would move there! So the center is not identified with any body, and so perhaps direction-to-center is an absolute quantity in the theory, not understood fundamentally as direction to some body (merely contingently as such if some body happens to occupy the center). But this conclusion is not clear either. In On the Heavens II.13, admittedly in response to a different issue, Aristotle suggests that the center itself is ‘determined’ by the outer spherical shell of the universe (the aetherial region of the fixed stars). If this is what he intends, then the natural law prescribes motion relative to another body after all – namely up or down with respect to the mathematical center of the stars.

It would be to push Aristotle’s writings too hard to suggest that he was consciously wrestling with the issue of whether mechanics required absolute or relative quantities of motion, but what is clear is that these questions arise in his physics and his remarks impinge on them. His theory also gives a simple model of how they arise: a physical theory of motion will say that ‘under such-and-such circumstances, motion of so-and-so a kind will occur’ – and the question of whether that kind of motion makes sense in terms of the relations between bodies alone arises automatically. Aristotle may not have recognized the question explicitly, but we see it as one issue in the background of his discussion of the center of the universe.

3. Descartes

The issues are, however, far more explicit in the entry on Descartes’ physics; and since the form of his theory is different, the ‘kinds of motion’ in question are quite different – as they change with all the different theories that we discuss. For Descartes argued in his 1644 Principles of Philosophy (see Book II) that the essence of matter is extension (i.e., size and shape), because any other attribute of bodies could be imagined away without imagining away matter itself. But he also held that extension constitutes the nature of space, and hence he concluded that space and matter are one and the same thing. An immediate consequence of the identification is the impossibility of the vacuum; if every region of space is a region of matter, then there can be no space without matter. Thus Descartes’ universe is ‘hydrodynamical’ – completely full of mobile matter of different sized pieces in motion, rather like a bucket full of water and lumps of ice of different sizes, which has been stirred around. Since fundamentally the pieces of matter are nothing but extension, the universe is in fact nothing but a system of geometric bodies in motion without any gaps.[1]

3.1 The Nature of Motion

The identification of space and matter poses a puzzle about motion: if the space that a body occupies literally is the matter of the body, then when the body – i.e., the matter – moves, so does the space that it occupies. Thus it doesn’t change place, which is to say that it doesn’t move after all! Descartes resolved this difficulty by taking all motion to be the motion of bodies relative to one another, not a literal change of space.

Now, a body has as many relative motions as there are bodies, but it does not follow that all are equally significant. Indeed, Descartes uses several different concepts of relational motion. First there is ‘change of place’, which is nothing but motion relative to this or that arbitrary reference body (II.13). In this sense no motion of a body is privileged, since the speed, direction, and even curve of a trajectory depends on the reference body, and none is singled out. Next, he discusses motion in ‘the ordinary sense’ (II.24). This is often conflated with mere change of arbitrary place, but strictly it differs because according to the rules of ordinary speech one correctly attributes motion only to bodies whose motion is caused by some action, not to arbitrary relative motion. (For instance, a person sitting on a speeding boat is ordinarily said to be at rest, since ‘he feels no action in himself’.) This distinction is important in some passages, but arguably not in those that we discuss. Finally, he defined motion ‘properly speaking’ (II.25) to be ‘the transference of one part of matter or of one body, from the vicinity of those bodies immediately contiguous to it and considered as at rest, into the vicinity of [some] others.’[2] Since a body can only be touching one set of surroundings, Descartes argued (questionably) that this standard of motion was unique.

What we see here is that Descartes, despite holding motion to be the motion of bodies relative to one another, also held there to be a privileged sense of motion; in a terminology sometimes employed by writers of the period (see Rynasiewicz 2019, §3), he held there to be a sense of ‘true motion’, over and above the merely relative motions. In logical terms we can make the point this way: while moves-relative-to is a two-place predicate, moves-properly-speaking is a one-place predicate. (And this, even though it is defined in terms of relative motion: let contiguous-surroundings be a function from bodies to their contiguous surroundings, then x moves-properly-speaking is defined as x moves-relative-to-contiguous-surroundings(x).)

This example illustrates why it is crucial to keep two questions distinct: on the one hand, is motion to be understood in terms of relations between bodies or by invoking something additional, something absolute; on the other hand, are all relative motions equally significant, or is there some ‘true’, privileged notion of motion? Descartes’ views show that eschewing absolute motion is logically compatible with accepting true motion; which is of course not to say that his definitions of motion are themselves tenable.

3.2 Motion and Dynamics

There is an interpretational tradition which holds that Descartes only took the first, ‘ordinary’ sense of motion seriously, and introduced the second notion to avoid conflict with the Catholic Church. Such conflict was a real concern, since the censure of Galileo’s Copernicanism took place only 11 years before publication of the Principles, and had in fact dissuaded Descartes from publishing an earlier work, The World. Indeed, in the Principles (III.28) he is at pains to explain how ‘properly speaking’ the Earth does not move, because it is swept around the Sun in a giant vortex of matter – the Earth does not move relative to its surroundings in the vortex.

The difficulty with the reading, aside from the imputation of cowardice to the old soldier, is that it makes nonsense of Descartes’ mechanics, a theory of collisions. For instance, according to his laws of collision if two equal bodies strike each other at equal and opposite velocities then they will bounce off at equal and opposite velocities (Rule I). On the other hand, if the very same bodies approach each other with the very same relative speed, but at different speeds then they will move off together in the direction of the faster one (Rule III). But if the operative meaning of motion in the Rules is the ordinary sense, then these two situations are just the same situation, differing only in the choice of reference frame, and so could not have different outcomes – bouncing apart versus moving off together. It seems inconceivable that Descartes could have been confused in such a trivial way.[3]

Thus Garber (1992, Chapter 6–8) proposes that Descartes actually took the unequivocal notion of motion properly speaking to be the correct sense of motion in mechanics. Then Rule I covers the case in which the two bodies have equal and opposite motions relative to their contiguous surroundings, while Rule VI covers the case in which the bodies have different motions relative to those surroundings – one is perhaps at rest in its surroundings. That is, exactly what is needed to make the rules consistent is the kind of privileged, true, sense of motion provided by Descartes’ second definition. Insurmountable problems with the rules remain, but rejecting the traditional interpretation and taking motion properly speaking seriously in Descartes’ philosophy clearly gives a more charitable reading.

4. Newton

Newton articulated a clearer, more coherent, and more physically plausible account of motion that any that had come before. Still, as we will see, there have been a number of widely held misunderstandings of Newton’s views, and it is not completely clear how best to understand the absolute space that he postulated.

4.1 Newton Against the Cartesian Account of Motion – The Bucket

In an unpublished essay – De Gravitatione (Newton, 2004) – and in a Scholium to the definitions given in his 1687 Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, Newton attacked both of Descartes’ notions of motion as candidates for the operative notion in mechanics. (Newton’s critique is studied in more detail in the entry Newton’s views on space, time, and motion.)[4]

The most famous argument invokes the so-called ‘Newton’s bucket’ experiment. Stripped to its basic elements one compares:

  1. a bucket of water hanging from a cord as the bucket is set spinning about the cord’s axis, with
  2. the same bucket and water when they are rotating at the same rate about the cord’s axis.

As is familiar from any rotating system, there will be a tendency for the water to recede from the axis of rotation in the latter case: in (i) the surface of the water will be flat (because of the Earth’s gravitational field) while in (ii) it will be concave. The analysis of such ‘inertial effects’ due to rotation was a major topic of enquiry of ‘natural philosophers’ of the time, including Descartes and his followers, and they would certainly have agreed with Newton that the concave surface of the water in the second case demonstrated that the water was moving in a mechanically significant sense. There is thus an immediate problem for the claim that proper motion is the correct mechanical sense of motion: in (i) and (ii) proper motion is anti-correlated with the mechanically significant motion revealed by the surface of the water. That is, the water is flat in (i) when it is in motion relative to its immediate surroundings – the inner sides of the bucket – but curved in (ii) when it is at rest relative to its immediate surroundings. Thus the mechanically relevant meaning of rotation is not that of proper motion. (You may have noticed a small lacuna in Newton’s argument: in (i) the water is at rest and in (ii) in motion relative to that part of its surroundings constituted by the air above it. It’s not hard to imagine small modifications to the example to fill this gap.)

Newton also points out that the height that the water climbs up the inside of the bucket provides a measure of the rate of rotation of bucket and water: the higher the water rises up the sides, the greater the tendency to recede must be, and so the faster the water must be rotating in the mechanically significant sense. But suppose, very plausibly, that the measure is unique, that any particular height indicates a particular rate of rotation. Then the unique height that the water reaches at any moment implies a unique rate of rotation in a mechanically significant sense. And thus motion in the sense of motion relative to an arbitrary reference body is not the mechanical sense, since that kind of rotation is not unique at all, but depends on the motion of the reference body. And so Descartes’ change of place (and for similar reasons, motion in the ordinary sense) is not the mechanically significant sense of motion.

4.2 Absolute Space and Motion

In our discussion of Descartes we called the sense of motion operative in the science of mechanics ‘true motion’, and the phrase is used in this way by Newton in the Scholium. Thus Newton’s bucket shows that true (rotational) motion is anti-correlated with, and so not identical with, proper motion (as Descartes proposed according to the Garber reading); and Newton further argues that the rate of true (rotational) motion is unique, and so not identical with change of place, which is multiple. Newton proposed instead that true motion is motion relative to a temporally enduring, rigid, 3-dimensional Euclidean space, which he dubbed ‘absolute space’. Of course, Descartes also defined motion as relative to an enduring 3-dimensional Euclidean space; the difference is that Descartes’ space was divided into parts (his space was identical with a plenum of corpuscles) in motion, not a rigid structure in which (mobile) material bodies are embedded. So according to Newton, the rate of true rotation of the bucket (and water) is the rate at which it rotates relative to absolute space. Or put another way, Newton effectively defines the 1-place predicate x moves-absolutely as x moves-relative-to absolute space; both Newton and Descartes offer competing 1-place predicates as analyses of x moves-truly.

4.2.1 Absolute Space vs. Galilean Relativity

Newton’s proposal for understanding motion solves the problems that he posed for Descartes, and provides an interpretation of the concepts of constant motion and acceleration that appear in his laws of motion. However, it suffers from two notable interpretational problems, both of which were pressed forcefully by Leibniz (in the Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, 1715–1716) – which is not to say that Leibniz himself offered a superior account of motion (see below).[5] First, according to this account, absolute velocity is a well-defined quantity: more simply, the absolute speed of a body is the rate of change of its position relative to an arbitrary point of absolute space. But the Galilean relativity of Newton’s laws (see the entry on space and time: inertial frames) means that the evolution of a closed system would have been identical if it had been moving at a different (constant) overall velocity: as Galileo noted in his (see the entry on Galileo Galilei), an experimenter cannot determine from observations inside his cabin whether his ship is at rest in harbor or sailing smoothly. Put another way, according to Newtonian mechanics, in principle Newton’s absolute velocity cannot be experimentally determined.

So in this regard absolute velocity is quite unlike acceleration (including rotation). Newtonian acceleration is understood in absolute space as the rate of change of absolute velocity, and is, according to Newtonian mechanics, generally measurable; for instance by measuring the height that the water ascends the sides of the bucket.[6] Leibniz argued (rather inconsistently, as we shall see) that since differences in absolute velocity are unobservable, they are not be genuine differences at all; and hence that Newton’s absolute space, whose existence would entail the reality of such differences, must also be a fiction. Few philosophers today would immediately reject a quantity as unreal simply because it was not experimentally determinable, but this fact does justify genuine doubts about the reality of absolute velocity, and hence of absolute space.

4.2.2 The Ontology of Absolute Space

The second problem concerns the nature of absolute space. Newton quite clearly distinguished his account from Descartes’ – in particular with regards to absolute space’s rigidity versus Descartes’ ‘hydrodynamical’ space, and the possibility of the vacuum in absolute space. Thus absolute space is definitely not material. On the other hand, presumably it is supposed to be part of the physical, not mental, realm. In De Gravitatione, Newton rejected both the traditional philosophical categories of substance and attribute as suitable characterizations. Absolute space is not a substance for it lacks causal powers and does not have a fully independent existence, and yet it is not an attribute since it would exist even in a vacuum, which by definition is a place where there are no bodies in which it might inhere. Newton proposes that space is what we might call a ‘pseudo-substance’, more like a substance than property, yet not quite a substance.[7] In fact, Newton accepted the principle that everything that exists, exists somewhere – i.e., in absolute space. Thus he viewed absolute space as a necessary consequence of the existence of anything, and of God’s existence in particular – hence space’s ontological dependence. Leibniz was presumably unaware of the unpublished De Gravitatione in which these particular ideas were developed, but as we shall see, his later works are characterized by a robust rejection of any notion of space as a real thing rather than an ideal, purely mental entity. This is a view that attracts even fewer contemporary adherents, but there is something deeply peculiar about a non-material but physical entity, a worry that has influenced many philosophical opponents of absolute space.[8]

5. Newtonian Absolute Space in the Twentieth Century

This article is largely a historical survey of prominent views. However, it is hard to fully understand those debates without knowing something about scientific and mathematical developments have changed recent understanding of the issues. In particular, a spacetime approach can clarify the situation with which the interlocutors were wrestling, and help clarify their arguments. This is a point widely recognized in the secondary literature, and indeed colors much of what is said there (for good and bad, as we shall touch on later). So a short digression into these matters is important for engaging the literature responsibly; that said, while §7 presupposes this section, the reader only interested in §6 could skip this section.

5.1 The Spacetime Approach

After the development of relativity theory (a topic that we address in the companion article), and its interpretation as a spacetime theory, it was realized that the notion of spacetime had applicability to a range of theories of mechanics, classical as well as relativistic. In particular, there is a spacetime geometry – ‘Galilean’ or ‘neo-Newtonian’ spacetime (the terms are interchangeable) – for Newtonian mechanics that solves the problem of absolute velocity; an idea exploited by a number of philosophers from the late 1960s onwards (e.g., Stein 1968, Earman 1970, Sklar 1974, and Friedman 1983). For details the reader is referred to the entry on spacetime: inertial frames, but the general idea is that although a spatial distance is well-defined between any two simultaneous points of this spacetime, only the temporal interval is well-defined between non-simultaneous points. Thus things are rather unlike Newton’s absolute space, whose points persist through time and maintain their distances: in absolute space the distance between p-now and q-then (where p and q are points) is just the distance between p-now and q-now. However, Galilean spacetime has an ‘affine connection’ which effectively specifies for every point of every continuous curve, the rate at which the curve is changing from straightness at that point; for instance, the straight lines are picked out as those curves whose rate of change from straightness is zero at every point.[9]

Since the trajectories of bodies are curves in spacetime, the affine connection determines the rate of change from straightness at every point of every possible trajectory. The straight trajectories thus defined can be interpreted as the trajectories of bodies moving inertially (i.e., without forces), and the rate of change from straightness of any trajectory can be interpreted as the acceleration of a body following that trajectory. That is, Newton’s First Law can be given a geometric formulation as ‘bodies on which no net forces act follow straight lines in spacetime’; similarly, the Second Law can be formulated as ‘the rate of change from straightness of a body’s trajectory is equal to the forces acting on the body divided by its mass’. The significance of this geometry is that while acceleration is well-defined, velocity is not – in accordance with the empirical determinability of acceleration (generally though not universally) but not of velocity, according to Newtonian mechanics. Thus Galilean spacetime gives a very nice interpretation of the choice that nature makes when it decides that the laws of mechanics should be formulated in terms of accelerations not velocities. (In fact, there are complications here: in light of Newton’s Corollary VI mentioned above, one might wonder whether even Galilean spacetime is the appropriate spacetime structure for Newtonian mechanics. Saunders (2013), for example, argues that in fact only a yet more impoverished spacetime structure – ‘Newton-Huygens spacetime’ – is needed.)

5.2 Substantivalism

Put another way, one can define the predicate x accelerates as trajectory(x) has-non-zero-rate-of-change-from-straightness, where trajectory maps bodies onto their trajectories in Galilean spacetime. And this predicate, defined this way, applies to the water in Newton’s bucket if and only if it is rotating, according to Newtonian mechanics formulated in terms of the geometry of Galilean spacetime; it is the mechanically relevant sense of accelerate in this theory. But this theoretical formulation and definition have been given in terms of the geometry of spacetime, not in terms of the relations between bodies; acceleration is ‘absolute’ in the sense that there is a preferred (true) sense of acceleration in mechanics and which is not defined in terms of the motions of bodies relative to one another. Note that this sense of ‘absolute’ is broader than that of motion relative to absolute space, which we defined earlier. In the remainder of this article we will use it in this new broader sense. The reader should be aware that the term is used in many ways in the literature, and such equivocation often leads to significant misunderstanding.

If any of this analysis of motion is taken literally then one arrives at a position regarding the ontology of spacetime rather like that of Newton’s regarding space: it is some kind of ‘substantial’ (or maybe pseudo-substantial) thing with the geometry of Galilean spacetime, just as absolute space possessed Euclidean geometry. This view regarding the ontology of spacetime is usually called ‘substantivalism’ (Sklar, 1974). The Galilean substantivalist usually sees themselves as adopting a more sophisticated geometry than Newton but sharing his substantivalism (though there is plenty of room for debate on Newton’s exact ontological views; see DiSalle, 2002, and Slowik 2016). The advantage of the more sophisticated geometry is that although it allows the absolute sense of acceleration apparently required by Newtonian mechanics to be defined, it does not allow one to define a similar absolute speed or velocity – x accelerates can be defined as a 1-place predicate in terms of the geometry of Galilean spacetime, but not x moves in general – and so the first of Leibniz’s problems is resolved. Of course we see that the solution depends on a crucial shift from speed and velocity to acceleration as the relevant senses of ‘motion’: from the rate of change of position to the rate of rate of change.

While this proposal solves the first kind of problem posed by Leibniz, it seems just as vulnerable to the second. While it is true that it involves the rejection of absolute space as Newton conceived it, and with it the need to explicate the nature of an enduring space, the postulation of Galilean spacetime poses the parallel question of the nature of spacetime. Again, it is a physical but non-material something, the points of which may be coincident with material bodies. What kind of thing is it? Could we do without it? As we shall see below, some contemporary philosophers believe so.

6. Leibniz

There is a ‘folk-reading’ of Leibniz that one often finds either explicitly or implicitly in the philosophy of physics literature which takes account of only some of his remarks on space and motion. For instance, the quantities captured by Earman’s (1999) ‘Leibnizian spacetime’ do not do justice to Leibniz’s view of motion (as Earman acknowledges). But it is perhaps most obvious in introductory texts (e.g., Huggett 2000). According to this view, the only quantities of motion are relative quantities, relative velocity, acceleration and so on, and all relative motions are equal, so there is no true sense of motion. However, Leibniz is explicit that other quantities are also ‘real’, and his mechanics implicitly – but obviously – depends on yet others. The length of this section is a measure, not so much of the importance of Leibniz’s actual views, but the importance of showing what the prevalent folk view leaves out regarding Leibniz’s views on the metaphysics of motion and interpretation of mechanics. (For further elaboration of the following points the reader is referred to the entry on Leibniz’s philosophy of physics.)

That said, we shall also see that no one has yet discovered a fully satisfactory way of reconciling the numerous conflicting things that Leibniz says about motion. Some of these tensions can be put down simply to his changing his mind (see Cover and Hartz 1988 or Arthur 2013 for explications of how Leibniz’s views on space developed). However, we will concentrate on the fairly short period in the mid 1680–90s during which Leibniz developed his theory of mechanics, and was most concerned with its interpretation. We will supplement this discussion with the important remarks that he made in his Correspondence with Samuel Clarke around 30 years later (1715–1716); this discussion is broadly in line with the earlier period, and the intervening period is one in which he turned to other matters, rather than one in which his views on space were evolving dramatically.

6.1 The Ideality of Space

Arguably, Leibniz’s views concerning space and motion do not have a completely linear logic, starting from some logically sufficient basic premises, but instead form a collection of mutually supporting doctrines. If one starts questioning why Leibniz held certain views – concerning the ideality of space, for instance – one is apt to be led in a circle. Still, exposition requires starting somewhere, and Leibniz’s argument for the ideality of space in the Correspondence with Clarke is a good place to begin. But bear in mind the caveats made here – this argument was made later than a number of other relevant writings, and its logical relation to Leibniz’s views on motion is complex.

Leibniz (LV.47 – this notation means Leibniz’s Fifth letter, section 47, and so on) says that (i) a body comes to have the ‘same place’ as another once did, when it comes to stand in the same relations to bodies we ‘suppose’ to be unchanged (more on this later); (ii) that we can define ‘a place’ to be that which any such two bodies have in common (here he claims an analogy with the Euclidean/Eudoxan definition of a rational number in terms of an identity relation between ratios); and finally that (iii) space is all such places taken together. However, he also holds that properties are particular, incapable of being instantiated by more than one individual, even at different times; hence it is impossible for the two bodies to be in literally the same relations to the unchanged bodies. Thus the thing that we take to be the same for the two bodies – the place – is something added by our minds to the situation, and only ideal. As a result, space, which is constructed from these ideal places, is itself ideal: ‘a certain order, wherein the mind conceives the application of relations’.

Contrast this view of space with those of Descartes and of Newton. Both Descartes and Newton claim that space is a real, mind-independent entity; for Descartes it is matter, and for Newton a ‘pseudo-substance’, distinct from matter. And of course for both, these views are intimately tied up with their accounts of motion. Leibniz simply denies the mind-independent reality of space, and this too is bound up with his views concerning motion.[10]

6.2 Force and the Nature of Motion

So far (apart from that remark about ‘unchanged’ bodies) we have not seen Leibniz introduce anything more than relations of distance between bodies, which is certainly consistent with the folk view of his philosophy. However, Leibniz sought to provide a foundation for the Cartesian/mechanical philosophy in terms of the Aristotelian/scholastic metaphysics of substantial forms (here we discuss the views laid out in Sections 17–22 of the 1686 Discourse on Metaphysics and the 1695 Specimen of Dynamics, both in Garber and Ariew 1989). In particular, he identifies primary matter with what he calls its ‘primitive passive force’ of resistance to changes in motion and to penetration, and the substantial form of a body with its ‘primitive active force’. It is important to realize that these forces are not mere properties of matter, but actually constitute it in some sense, and further that they are not themselves quantifiable. However, because of the collisions of bodies with one another, these forces ‘suffer limitation’, and ‘derivative’ passive and active forces result.[11] Derivative passive force shows up in the different degrees of resistance to change of different kinds of matter (of ‘secondary matter’ in scholastic terms), and apparently is measurable. Derivative active force, however, is considerably more problematic for Leibniz. On the one hand, it is fundamental to his account of motion and theory of mechanics – motion fundamentally is possession of force. But on the other hand, Leibniz endorses the mechanical philosophy, which precisely sought to abolish Aristotelian substantial form, which active force represents. Leibniz’s goal was to reconcile the two philosophies, by providing an Aristotelian metaphysical foundation for modern mechanical science; as we shall see, it is ultimately an open question exactly how Leibniz intended to deal with the inherent tensions in such a view.

6.2.1 Vis Viva and True Motion

The texts are sufficiently ambiguous to permit dissent, but arguably Leibniz intends that one manifestation of derivative active force is what he calls vis viva – ‘living force’. Leibniz had a famous argument with the Cartesians over the correct definition of this quantity. Descartes defined it as size times speed – effectively as the magnitude of the momentum of a body. Leibniz gave a brilliant argument (repeated in a number of places, for instance Section 17 of the Discourse on Metaphysics) that it was size times speed2 – so (proportional to) kinetic energy. If the proposed identification is correct then kinetic energy quantifies derivative active force according to Leibniz; or looked at the other way, the quantity of virtus (another term used by Leibniz for active force) associated with a body determines its kinetic energy and hence its speed. As far as the authors know, Leibniz never explicitly says anything conclusive about the relativity of virtus, but it is certainly consistent to read him (as Roberts 2003 does) to claim that there is a unique quantity of virtus and hence ‘true’ (as we have been using the term) speed associated with each body. At the very least, Leibniz does say that there is a real difference between possession and non-possession of vis viva (e.g., in Section 18 of the Discourse) and it is a small step from there to true, privileged speed. Indeed, for Leibniz, mere change of relative position is not ‘entirely real’ (as we saw for instance in the Correspondence) and only when it has vis viva as its immediate cause is there some reality to it.[12] An alternative interpretation to the one suggested here might say that Leibniz intends that while there is a difference between motion/virtus and no motion/virtus, there is somehow no difference between any strictly positive values of those quantities.

It is important to emphasize two points about the preceding account of motion in Leibniz’s philosophy. First, motion in the everyday sense – motion relative to something else – is not real. Fundamentally motion is possession of virtus, something that is ultimately non-spatial (modulo its interpretation as primitive force limited by collision). If this reading is right – and something along these lines seems necessary if we aren’t simply to ignore important statements by Leibniz on motion – then Leibniz is offering an interpretation of motion that is radically different from the obvious understanding. One might even say that for Leibniz motion is not movement at all! (We will leave to one side the question of whether his account is ultimately coherent.) The second point is that however we should understand Leibniz, the folk reading simply does not and cannot take account of his clearly and repeatedly stated view that what is real in motion is force not relative motion, for the folk reading allows Leibniz only relative motion (and of course additionally, motion in the sense of force is a variety of true motion, again contrary to the folk reading).

6.3 Motion and Dynamics

However, from what has been said so far it is still possible that the folk reading is accurate when it comes to Leibniz’s views on the phenomena of motion, the subject of his theory of mechanics. The case for the folk reading is in fact supported by Leibniz’s resolution of the tension that we mentioned earlier, between the fundamental role of force/virtus (which we will now take to mean mass times speed2) and its association with Aristotelian form. Leibniz’s way out (e.g., Specimen of Dynamics) is to require that while considerations of force must somehow determine the form of the laws of motion, the laws themselves should be such as not to allow one to determine the value of the force (and hence true speed). One might conclude that in this case Leibniz held that the only quantities which can be determined are those of relative position and motion, as the folk reading says. But even in this circumscribed context, it is at best questionable whether the interpretation is correct.

6.3.1 Leibniz’s Mechanics

Consider first Leibniz’s mechanics. Since his laws are what is now (ironically) often called ‘Newtonian’ elastic collision theory, it seems that they satisfy both of his requirements. The laws include conservation of kinetic energy (which we identify with virtus), but they hold in all inertial frames, so the kinetic energy of any arbitrary body can be set to any initial value. But they do not permit the kinetic energy of a body to take on any values throughout a process. The laws are only Galilean relativistic, and so are not true in every frame. Furthermore, according to the laws of collision, in an inertial frame, if a body does not collide then its Leibnizian force is conserved while if (except in special cases) it does collide then its force changes. According to Leibniz’s laws one cannot determine initial kinetic energies, but one certainly can tell when they change. At the very least, there are quantities of motion implicit in Leibniz’s mechanics – change in force and true speed – that are not merely relative; the folk reading is committed to Leibniz simply missing this obvious fact.

6.3.2 The Equivalence of Hypotheses

That said, when Leibniz discusses the relativity of motion – which he calls the ‘equivalence of hypotheses’ about the states of motion of bodies – some of his statements do suggest that he was confused in this way. For another way of stating the problem for the folk reading is that the claim that relative motions alone suffice for mechanics and that all relative motions are on a par is a principle of general relativity, and could Leibniz – a mathematical genius – really have failed to notice that his laws hold only in special frames? Well, just maybe. On the one hand, when he explicitly articulates the principle of the equivalence of hypotheses (for instance in Specimen of Dynamics) he tends to say only that one cannot assign initial velocities on the basis of the outcome of a collision, which requires only Galilean relativity. However, he confusingly also claimed (On Copernicanism and the Relativity of Motion, also in Garber and Ariew 1989) that the Tychonic and Copernican hypotheses were equivalent. But if the Earth orbits the Sun in an inertial frame (Copernicus), then there is no inertial frame according to which the Sun orbits the Earth (Tycho Brahe), and vice versa: these hypotheses are simply not Galilean equivalent (something else Leibniz could hardly have failed to realize). So there is some textual support for Leibniz endorsing general relativity for the phenomena, as the folk reading maintains.

A number of commentators have suggested solutions to the puzzle of the conflicting pronouncements that Leibniz makes on the subject: Stein 1977 argues for general relativity, thereby imputing a misunderstanding of his own laws to Leibniz; Roberts 2003 argues for Galilean relativity, thereby discounting Leibniz’s apparent statements to the contrary. Jauernig 2004 and 2008 points out that in the Specimen, Leibniz claims that all motions are composed of uniform rectilinear motions: an apparently curvilinear motion is actually a series of uniform motions, punctuated by discontinuous collisions. This observation allows one to restrict the scope of claims of the kind ‘no motions can be attributed on the basis of phenomena’ to inertial motions, and so helps read Leibniz as more consistently advocating Galilean relativity, the reading Jauernig favors (see also Huggett’s 2006 ‘Can Spacetime Help Settle Any Issues in Modern Philosophy?’, in the Other Internet Resources, which was inspired by Jauernig’s work). Note that even in a pure collision dynamics the phenomena distinguish a body in uniform rectilinear motion over time, from one that undergoes collisions changing its uniform rectilinear motion over time: the laws will hold in the frame of the former, but not in the frame of the latter. That is, apparently contrary to what Jauernig says, Leibniz’s account of curvilinear motion does not collapse Galilean relativity into general relativity. In that case, Leibniz’s specific claims of the phenomenal equivalence of Copernican and Tychonic hypotheses still need to be accommodated.

6.4 Where Did the Folk Go Wrong?

So the folk reading simply ignores Leibniz’s metaphysics of motion, it commits Leibniz to a mathematical howler regarding his laws, and it is arguable whether it is the best rendering of his pronouncements concerning relativity; it certainly cannot be accepted unquestioningly. However, it is not hard to understand the temptation of the folk reading. In his Correspondence with Clarke, Leibniz says that he believes space to be “something merely relative, as time is, … an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions” (LIII.4), which is naturally taken to mean that space is at base nothing but the distance and temporal relations between bodies. (Though even this passage has its subtleties, because of the ideality of space discussed above, and because in Leibniz’s conception space determines what sets of relations are possible.) And if relative distances and times exhaust the spatiotemporal in this way, then shouldn’t all quantities of motion be defined in terms of those relations?

We have seen two ways in which this would be the wrong conclusion to draw. Force seems to involve a notion of speed that is not identified with any relative speed. And (unless the equivalence of hypotheses is after all a principle of general relativity), the laws pick out a standard of constant motion that need not be any constant relative motion. Of course, it is hard to reconcile these quantities with the view of space and time that Leibniz proposes – what is speed in size times speed2 or constant speed if not speed relative to some body or to absolute space? Given Leibniz’s view that space is literally ideal (and indeed that even relative motion is not ‘entirely real’) perhaps the best answer is that he took force and hence motion in its real sense not to be determined by motion in a relative sense at all, but to be primitive monadic quantities. That is, he took x moves to be a 1-place predicate, but he believed that it could be fully analyzed in terms of strictly monadic predicates: x moves iff x possesses-non-zero-derivative-active-force. And this reading explains just what Leibniz took us to be supposing when we ‘supposed certain bodies to be unchanged’ in the construction of the idea of space: that they had no force, nothing causing, or making real any motion.

6.5 Leibniz’s Response to Newton’s Scholium

It’s again helpful to compare Leibniz with Descartes and Newton, this time regarding motion. Commentators often express frustration at Leibniz’s response to Newton’s arguments for absolute space: “I find nothing … in the Scholium that proves or can prove the reality of space in itself. However, I grant that there is a difference between an absolute true motion of a body and a mere relative change …” (LV.53). Not only does Leibniz apparently fail to take the argument seriously, he then goes on to concede the step in the argument that seems to require absolute space! But with our understanding of Newton and Leibniz, we can see that what he says makes perfect sense (or at least that it is not as disingenuous as it is often taken to be).

Newton argues in the Scholium that true motion cannot be identified with the kinds of motion that Descartes considers; but both of these are purely relative motions, and Leibniz is in complete agreement that merely relative motions are not true (i.e., ‘entirely real’). Leibniz’s ‘concession’ merely registers his agreement with Newton against Descartes on the difference between true and relative motion; he surely understood who and what Newton was refuting, and it was a position that he had himself, in different terms, publicly argued against at length. But as we have seen, Leibniz had a very different analysis of the difference to Newton’s; true motion was not, for him, a matter of motion relative to absolute space, but the possession of quantity of force, ontologically prior to any spatiotemporal quantities at all. There is indeed nothing in the Scholium explicitly directed against that view, and since it does potentially offer an alternative way of understanding true motion, it is not unreasonable for Leibniz to claim that there is no deductive inference from true motion to absolute space.

7. ‘Not-Newton’ versus ‘Be-Leibniz’

7.1 Non Sequiturs Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

The folk reading which belies Leibniz has it that he sought a theory of mechanics formulated in terms only of the relations between bodies. As we’ll see in the companion article, in the Nineteenth Century, Ernst Mach indeed proposed such an approach, but Leibniz clearly did not; though certain similarities between Leibniz and Mach – especially the rejection of absolute space – surely helps explain the confusion between the two. But not only is Leibniz often misunderstood, there are influential misreadings of Newton’s arguments in the Scholium, influenced by the idea that he is addressing Leibniz in some way. Of course the Principia was written 30 years before the Correspondence, and the arguments of the Scholium were not written with Leibniz in mind, but Clarke himself suggests (CIV.13) that those arguments – specifically those concerning the bucket – are telling against Leibniz. That argument is indeed devastating to the parity of all relative motions, but we have seen that it is highly questionable whether Leibniz’s equivalence of hypotheses amounts to such a view. That said, his statements in the first four letters of the Correspondence could understandably mislead Clarke on this point – it is in reply to Clarke’s challenge that Leibniz explicitly denies the parity of relative motions. But, interestingly, Clarke does not present a true version of Newton’s argument – despite some involvement of Newton in writing the replies. Instead of the argument from the uniqueness of the rate of rotation, he argues that systems with different velocities must be different because the effects observed if they were brought to rest would be different. This argument is of course utterly question begging against a view that holds that there is no privileged standard of rest (the view Clarke mistakenly attributes to Leibniz)!

As we discuss further in the companion article, Mach attributed to Newton the fallacious argument that because the surface of the water curved even when it was not in motion relative to the bucket, it must be rotating relative to absolute space. Our discussion of Newton showed how misleading such a reading is. In the first place he also argues that there must be some privileged sense of rotation, and hence not all relative motions are equal. Second, the argument is ad hominem against Descartes, in which context a disjunctive syllogism – motion is either proper or ordinary or relative to absolute space – is argumentatively legitimate. On the other hand, Mach is quite correct that Newton’s argument in the Scholium leaves open the logical possibility that the privileged, true sense of rotation (and acceleration more generally) is some species of relative motion; if not motion properly speaking, then relative to the fixed stars perhaps. (In fact Newton rejects this possibility in De Gravitatione (1962) on the grounds that it would involve an odious action at a distance; an ironic position given his theory of universal gravity.)

7.2 The Best Explanation Argument Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

The kind of folk-reading of Newton that underlies much of the contemporary literature replaces Mach’s interpretation with a more charitable one: for instance, Dasgupta 2015, is a recent influential presentation of the following dialectic, and its relation to symmetry arguments. According to this reading, Newton’s point is that his mechanics – unlike Descartes’ [special character:mdash] could explain why the surface of the rotating water is curved, that his explanation involves a privileged sense of rotation, and that absent an alternative hypothesis about its relative nature, we should accept absolute space. But our discussion of Newton’s argument showed that it simply does not have an ‘abductive[special character:rsquo], ‘best explanation’ form, but shows deductively, from Cartesian premises, that rotation is neither proper nor ordinary motion.

That is not to say that Newton had no understanding of how such effects would be explained in his mechanics. For instance, in Corollaries V and VI to the Definitions of the Principles he states in general terms the conditions under which different states of motion are not – and so by implication are – discernible according to his laws of mechanics. Nor is it to say that Newton’s contemporaries weren’t seriously concerned with explaining inertial effects. Leibniz, for instance, analyzed a rotating body (in the Specimen). In short, parts of a rotating system collide with the surrounding matter and are continuously deflected, into a series of linear motions that form a curved path. (Though the system as Leibniz envisions it – comprised of a plenum of elastic particles of matter – is far too complex for him to offer any quantitative model based on this qualitative picture. So he had no serious alternative explanation of inertial effects.)

7.3 Substantivalism and The Best Explanation Argument

7.3.1 The Rotating Spheres

Although the argument is then not Newton’s, it is still an important response to the kind of relationism proposed by the folk-Leibniz, especially when it is extended by bringing in a further example from Newton’s Scholium. Newton considered a pair of identical spheres, connected by a cord, too far from any bodies to observe any relative motions; he pointed out that their rate and direction of rotation could still be experimentally determined by measuring the tension in the cord, and by pushing on opposite faces of the two globes to see whether the tension increased or decreased. He intended this simple example to demonstrate that the project he intended in the Principia, of determining the absolute accelerations and hence gravitational forces on the planets from their relative motions, was possible. However, if we further specify that the spheres and cord are rigid and that they are the only things in their universe, then the example can be used to point out that there are infinitely many different rates of rotation all of which agree on the relations between bodies. Since there are no differences in the relations between bodies in the different situations, it follows that the observable differences between the states of rotation cannot be explained in terms of the relations between bodies. Therefore, a theory of the kind attributed to the folk’s Leibniz cannot explain all the phenomena of Newtonian mechanics, and again we can argue abductively for absolute space.[13]

This argument is not Newton’s, neither the premises nor conclusion, and must not be taken as a historically accurate reading, However, that is not to say that the argument is fallacious, and indeed many have found it attractive, particularly as a defense not of Newton’s absolute space, but of Galilean spacetime. That is, Newtonian mechanics with Galilean spacetime can explain the phenomena associated with rotation, while theories of the kind proposed by Mach cannot explain the differences between situations allowed by Newtonian mechanics; but these explanations rely on the geometric structure of Galilean spacetime – particularly its affine connection, to interpret acceleration. And thus – the argument goes – those explanations commit us to the reality of spacetime: a manifold of points whose properties include the appropriate geometric ones. This final doctrine, of the reality of spacetime with its component points or regions, distinct from matter, with geometric properties, is what we earlier identified as ‘substantivalism’.

7.3.2 Relationist Responses

There are two points to make about this line of argument. First, the relationist could reply that they need not explain all situations which are possible according to Newtonian mechanics, because that theory is to be rejected in favor of one which invokes only distance and time relations between bodies, but which approximates to Newton’s if matter is distributed suitably. Such a relationist would be following Mach’s proposal, which we will discuss in the sequel article. Such a position would be satisfactory only to the extent that a suitable concrete replacement theory to Newton’s theory is developed; Mach never offered such a theory, but recently more progress has been made (again, see the companion article for discussion).

Second, one must be careful in understanding just how the argument works, for it is tempting to gloss it by saying that in Newtonian mechanics the affine connection is a crucial part of the explanation of the surface of the water in the bucket, and if the spacetime which carries the connection is denied, then the explanation fails too. But this gloss tacitly assumes that Newtonian mechanics can only be understood in a substantial Galilean spacetime; if an interpretation of Newtonian mechanics that does not assume substantivalism can be constructed, then all Newtonian explanations can be given without postulating a connection in an ontologically significant sense. Both Sklar (1974) and van Fraassen (1970) have made proposals along these lines.

Sklar proposes interpreting ‘true’ acceleration as a primitive quantity not defined in terms of motion relative to anything, be it absolute space, a connection or other bodies. (Ray 1991 points out the family resemblance between this proposal and Leibniz’s suggestion that vis viva addresses Newton’s Scholium arguments.) Van Fraassen proposes formulating mechanics as ‘Newton’s Laws hold in some frame’, so that the form of the laws and the contingent relative motions of bodies – not absolute space or a connection, or even any instantaneous relations – pick out a standard of true motion, namely with respect to such an ‘inertial frame’. These proposals aim to keep the full explanatory resources of Newtonian mechanics, and hence admit ‘true acceleration’, but deny any relations between bodies and spacetime itself. Like the actual Leibniz, they allow absolute quantities of motion, but claim that space and time themselves are nothing but the relations between bodies.

Some may question how the laws can be such as to privilege frames without prior spacetime geometry. In reply, Huggett 2006 proposes that the laws be understood as a Humean ‘best system’ (see the entry on laws of nature) for a world of bodies and their relations; the laws don’t reflect prior geometric structure, but systematic regularities in patterns of relative motions. For obvious reasons, this proposal is called ‘regularity relationism’. (Several authors have developed a similar approach to a variety of physical theories: for instance, Vassallo & Esfeld 2016.) This approach is committed to the idea that in some sense Newton’s laws are capable of explaining all the phenomena without recourse to spacetime geometry; that the connection and the metrical properties are explanatorily redundant. This idea is also at the core of the ‘Dynamical Approach’, discussed in the companion article.

Another approach is to consider fully spatiotemporal relations. For instance, Maudlin 1993 discusses the possibility of a ‘Newtonian relationism’ which adds cross-temporal distance relations, i.e., distances between bodies at distinct moments of time. With such distances, relationists can capture (almost) the full structure of Newtonian space, and time, including the affine structure required for Newton’s first and second laws.

8. Beyond Newton

In sum: we have seen how historical authors, from Aristotle through to Newtonian and Leibniz, tackled the puzzles of motion and change in physical theorising. In a sequel entry on absolute and relational space and motion: post-Newtonian theories, we will see how post-Newtonian authors, from Mach through to Einstein and other contemporary physicists and philosophers, have brought new conceptual and technical resources to bear on (arguably) the selfsame issues. The sequel also includes a longer conclusion, reflecting on the themes running through both articles.

For now we will just note that we have focussed on authors who made contributions to the science of mechanics, and so a significant philosophical lacuna is a discussion of Kant’s views on space and motion. For recent treatments, see Friedman 2013 and Stan 2015.


Works cited in text

  • Aristotle, 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Arthur, R.T., 2013, “Leibniz’s theory of space,” Foundations of Science, 18(3), pp.499–528.
  • Biener, Z., 2017, “De Gravitatione Reconsidered: The Changing Significance of Experimental Evidence for Newton’s Metaphysics of Space,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 55(4), pp.583–608.
  • Brill, D. R. and Cohen, J., 1966, “Rotating Masses and their effects on inertial frames,” Physical Review 143: 1011–1015.
  • Dasgupta, S., 2015, “Substantivalism vs relationalism about space in classical physics,” Philosophy Compass, 10(9), pp.601–624.
  • Descartes, R., 1983, Principles of Philosophy, R. P. Miller and V. R. Miller (trans.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Earman, J., 1970, “Who’s Afraid of Absolute Space?,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 48: 287–319.
  • Friedman, M., 2013, Space in Kantian idealism. Space: A History (Oxford Philosophical Concepts), A. Janiak (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1983, Foundations of Space-Time Theories: Relativistic Physics and Philosophy of Science, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Garber, D., 1992, Descartes’ Metaphysical Physics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Garber, D. and J. B. Rauzy, 2004, “Leibniz on Body, Matter and Extension,” The Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 78: 23–40.
  • Hartz, G. A. and J. A. Cover, 1988, “Space and Time in the Leibnizian Metaphysic,” Noûs, 22: 493–519.
  • Huggett, N., 2012, “What Did Newton Mean by ‘Absolute Motion’,” in Interpreting Newton: Critical Essays, A. Janiak and E. Schliesser (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge Univ Press, 196–218.
  • –––, 2006, “The Regularity Account of Relational Spacetime,” Mind, 115: 41–74.
  • –––, 2000, “Space from Zeno to Einstein: Classic Readings with a Contemporary Commentary,” International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 14: 327–329.
  • Janiak, A., 2015, Space and motion in nature and Scripture: Galileo, Descartes, Newton. Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 51, pp.89–99.
  • Jauernig, A., 2008, “Leibniz on Motion and the Equivalence of Hypotheses,” The Leibniz Review, 18: 1–40.
  • –––, 2004, Leibniz Freed of Every Flaw: A Kantian Reads Leibnizian Metaphysics, Ph.D. Dissertation, Princeton University.
  • Leibniz, G. W., 1989, Philosophical Essays, R. Ariew and D. Garber (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co.
  • Leibniz, G. W., and Samuel Clarke, 1715–1716, “Correspondence”, in The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, Together with Extracts from Newton’s “Principia” and “Opticks”, H. G. Alexander (ed.), Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1956.
  • Maudlin, T., 1993, “Buckets of Water and Waves of Space: Why Space-Time is Probably a Substance,” Philosophy of Science, 60: 183–203.
  • Newton, I. and I. B. Cohen, 1999, The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, I. B. Cohen and A. M. Whitman (trans.), Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Pooley, O., 2002, The Reality of Spacetime, D. Phil. thesis, Oxford: Oxford University.
  • Ray, C., 1991, Time, Space and Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
  • Roberts, J. T., 2003, “Leibniz on Force and Absolute Motion,” Philosophy of Science, 70: 553–573.
  • Rynasiewicz, R., 2019, “Newton’s Scholium on Time, Space, Place and Motion,” in The Oxford Handbook of Newton, E. Schliesser and C. Smeenk (eds.), published online 8 January 2019. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199930418.013.28 [Preprint available online]
  • –––, 1995, “By their Properties, Causes, and Effects: Newton’s Scholium on Time, Space, Place, and Motion – I. The Text,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 26: 133–153.
  • Sklar, L., 1974, Space, Time and Spacetime, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Slowik, E., 2016, Deep Metaphysics of Space, Cham, Switzerland: Springer.
  • Stan, M., 2015, “Absolute Space and the Riddle of Rotation: Kant’s Response to Newton”. Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, vol. 7, Daniel Garber and Donald Rutherford (eds.), pp. 257–308. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stan, M., 2016, “Huygens on Inertial Structure and Relativity,” Philosophy of Science, 83(2), pp.277-298.
  • Stein, H., 1977, “Some Philosophical Prehistory of General Relativity,” in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 8: Foundations of Space-Time Theories, J. Earman, C. Glymour and J. Stachel (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • –––, 1967, “Newtonian Space-Time,” Texas Quarterly, 10: 174–200.
  • Van Fraassen, B. C., 1970, An introduction to the philosophy of time and space, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Vassallo, A. and M. Esfeld, 2016, “Leibnizian relationalism for general relativistic physics,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part B: Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics, 55. pp. 101–107.

Notable Philosophical Discussions of the Absolute-Relative Debates

  • Barbour, J. B., 1982, “Relational Concepts of Space and Time,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 33: 251–274.
  • Belot, G., 2000, “Geometry and Motion,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 51: 561–595.
  • Butterfield, J., 1984, “Relationism and Possible Worlds,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 35: 101–112.
  • Callender, C., 2002, “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics,” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, P. Machamer (ed.), Cambridge: Blackwell, pp. 173–198.
  • Carrier, M., 1992, “Kant’s Relational Theory of Absolute Space,” Kant Studien, 83: 399–416.
  • Dasgupta, S., 2015, “Substantivalism vs Relationalism About Space in Classical Physics”, Philosophy Compass 10, pp. 601–624.
  • Dieks, D., 2001, “Space-Time Relationism in Newtonian and Relativistic Physics,” International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 15: 5–17.
  • DiSalle, R., 2006, Understanding Space-Time, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Disalle, R., 1995, “Spacetime Theory as Physical Geometry,” Erkenntnis, 42: 317–337.
  • Earman, J., 1986, “Why Space is Not a Substance (at Least Not to First Degree),” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 67: 225–244.
  • –––, 1970, “Who’s Afraid of Absolute Space?,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 48: 287–319.
  • Earman, J. and J. Norton, 1987, “What Price Spacetime Substantivalism: The Hole Story,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 38: 515–525.
  • Hoefer, C., 2000, “Kant’s Hands and Earman’s Pions: Chirality Arguments for Substantival Space,” International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 14: 237–256.
  • –––, 1998, “Absolute Versus Relational Spacetime: For Better Or Worse, the Debate Goes on,” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 49: 451–467.
  • –––, 1996, “The Metaphysics of Space-Time Substantialism,” Journal of Philosophy, 93: 5–27.
  • Huggett, N., 2000, “Reflections on Parity Nonconservation,” Philosophy of Science, 67: 219–241.
  • Le Poidevin, R., 2004, “Space, Supervenience and Substantivalism,” Analysis, 64: 191–198.
  • Malament, D., 1985, “Discussion: A Modest Remark about Reichenbach, Rotation, and General Relativity,” Philosophy of Science, 52: 615–620.
  • Maudlin, T., 1993, “Buckets of Water and Waves of Space: Why Space-Time is Probably a Substance,” Philosophy of Science, 60: 183–203.
  • –––, 1990, “Substances and Space-Time: What Aristotle would have Said to Einstein,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 21(4): 531–561.
  • Maudlin, T., 2012, Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Mundy, B., 1992, “Space-Time and Isomorphism,” Proceedings of the Biennial Meetings of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1: 515–527.
  • –––, 1983, “Relational Theories of Euclidean Space and Minkowski Space-Time,” Philosophy of Science, 50: 205–226.
  • Nerlich, G., 2003, “Space-Time Substantivalism,” in The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics, M. J. Loux (ed.), Oxford: Oxford Univ Press, 281–314.
  • –––, 1996, “What Spacetime Explains,” Philosophical Quarterly, 46: 127–131.
  • –––, 1994, What Spacetime Explains: Metaphysical Essays on Space and Time, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1973, “Hands, Knees, and Absolute Space,” Journal of Philosophy, 70: 337–351.
  • Pooley, O., 2013 “Substantivalism and Relationalism About Space and Time”, in R. Batterman (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Physics, OUP.
  • Rynasiewicz, R., 2000, “On the Distinction between Absolute and Relative Motion,” Philosophy of Science, 67: 70–93.
  • –––, 1996, “Absolute Versus Relational Space-Time: An Outmoded Debate?,” Journal of Philosophy, 93: 279–306.
  • Teller, P., 1991, “Substance, Relations, and Arguments about the Nature of Space-Time,” Philosophical Review, 363–397.
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Carl Hoefer’s research for this entry was supported by his employer, ICREA (Pg. Lluís Companys 23, 08010 Barcelona, Spain), and by Spanish MICINN grant FFI2016-76799-P.

Copyright © 2021 by
Carl Hoefer <carl.hoefer@ub.edu>
Nick Huggett <huggett@uic.edu>
James Read <james.read@philosophy.ox.ac.uk>

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