Abstract Objects

First published Thu Jul 19, 2001; substantive revision Mon Aug 9, 2021

One doesn’t go far in the study of what there is without encountering the view that every entity falls into one of two categories: concrete or abstract. The distinction is supposed to be of fundamental significance for metaphysics (especially for ontology), epistemology, and the philosophy of the formal sciences (especially for the philosophy of mathematics); it is also relevant for analysis in the philosophy of language, the philosophy of mind, and the philosophy of the empirical sciences. This entry surveys (a) attempts to say how the distinction should be drawn and (b) some of main theories of, and about, abstract objects.

1. Introduction

The abstract/concrete distinction has a curious status in contemporary philosophy. It is widely agreed that the ontological distinction is of fundamental importance, but as yet, there is no standard account of how it should be drawn. There is a consensus about how to classify certain paradigm cases. For example, it is usually acknowledged that numbers and the other objects of pure mathematics, like pure sets, are abstract (if they exist), whereas rocks, trees, and human beings are concrete. In everyday language, it is common to use expressions that refer to concrete entities as well as those that apparently refer to abstractions such as democracy, happiness, motherhood, etc. Moreover, formulations of mathematical theories seem to appeal directly to abstract entities, and the use of mathematical expressions in the empirical sciences seems indispensable to the formulation of our best empirical theories (see Quine 1948; Putnam 1971; and the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics). Finally, apparent reference to abstract entities such as sets, properties, concepts, propositions, types, and possible worlds, among others, is ubiquitous in different areas of philosophy.

Though there is a pervasive appeal to abstract objects, philosophers have nevertheless wondered whether they exist. The alternatives are: platonism, which endorses their existence, and nominalism, which denies the existence of abstract objects across the board. (See the entries on nominalism in metaphysics and platonism in metaphysics.) But the question of how to draw the distinction between abstract and concrete objects is an open one: it is not clear how one should characterize these two categories nor is there a definite list of items that fall under one or the other category (assuming neither is empty).

The first challenge, then, is to articulate the distinction, either by defining the terms explicitly or by embedding them in a theory that makes their connections to other important categories more explicit. In the absence of such an account, the philosophical significance of the contrast remains uncertain, for the attempt to classify things as abstract or concrete by appeal to intuition is often problematic. Is it clear that scientific theories (e.g., the general theory of relativity), works of fiction (e.g., Dante’s Inferno), fictional characters (e.g., Bilbo Baggins) or conventional entities (e.g., the International Monetary Fund or the Spanish Constitution of 1978) are abstract?

It should be stressed that there may not be one single “correct” way of explaining the abstract/concrete distinction. Any plausible account will classify the paradigm cases in the standard way or give reasons for proceeding otherwise, and any interesting account will draw a clear and philosophically significant line in the domain of objects. Yet there may be many equally interesting ways of accomplishing these two goals, and if we find ourselves with two or more accounts that do the job rather well, there may be no point in asking which corresponds to the real abstract/concrete distinction. This illustrates a general point: when technical terminology is introduced in philosophy by means of examples, but without explicit definition or theoretical elaboration, the resulting vocabulary is often vague or indeterminate in reference. In such cases, it usually is pointless to seek a single correct account. A philosopher may find herself asking questions like, ‘What is idealism?’ or ‘What is a substance?’ and treating these questions as difficult questions about the underlying nature of a certain determinate philosophical category. A better approach may be to recognize that in many cases of this sort, we simply have not made up our minds about how the term is to be understood, and that what we seek is not a precise account of what this term already means, but rather a proposal for how it might fruitfully be used for philosophical analysis. Anyone who believes that something in the vicinity of the abstract/concrete distinction matters for philosophy would be well advised to approach the project of explaining the distinction with this in mind.

So before we turn to the discussion of abstract objects in earnest, it will help if we clarify how some of the key terms will be used in what follows.

1.1 About the Expression ‘Object’

Frege famously distinguished two mutually exclusive ontological domains, functions and objects. According to his view, a function is an ‘incomplete’ entity that maps arguments to values, and is denoted by an incomplete expression, whereas an object is a ‘complete’ entity and can be denoted by a singular term. Frege reduced properties and relations to functions and so these entities are not included among the objects. Some authors make use of Frege’s notion of ‘object’ when discussing abstract objects (e.g., Hale 1987). But though Frege’s sense of ‘object’ is important, it is not the only way to use the term. Other philosophers include properties and relations among the abstract objects. And when the background context for discussing objects is type theory, properties and relations of higher type (e.g., properties of properties, and properties of relations) may be all be considered ‘objects’. This latter use of ‘object’ is interchangeable with ‘entity.’[1] Throughout this entry, we will follow this last usage and treat the expressions ‘object’ and ‘entity’ as having the same meaning. (For further discussion, see the entry on objects.)

1.2 About the Abstract/Concrete Distinction

Though we’ve spoken as if the abstract/concrete distinction must be an exhaustive dichotomy, we should be open to the possibility that the best sharpening of it will entail that some objects are neither abstract nor concrete. Holes and shadows, if they exist, do not clearly belong in either category; nor do ghosts, Cartesian minds, fictional characters,[2] immanent universals, or tropes. The main constraint on an account of the distinction is that it draws a philosophically significant line that classifies at least many of the standard examples in the standard ways. It is not a constraint that everything be shoehorned into one category or the other.

Finally, some philosophers see the main distinction not as between abstract and concrete objects but as between abstract objects and ordinary objects, where the distinction is a modal one – ordinary objects are possibly concrete while abstract objects (like the number 1) couldn’t be concrete (Zalta 1983, 1988). In any case, in the following discussion, we shall assume that the abstract/concrete distinction is a division among existing objects, and that any plausible explanation of the distinction should aim to characterize a distinction among such objects.

2. Historical Remarks

2.1 The Provenance of the Distinction

The contemporary distinction between abstract and concrete is not an ancient one. Indeed, there is a strong case for the view that, despite occasional exceptions, it played no significant role in philosophy before the 20th century. The modern distinction bears some resemblance to Plato’s distinction between Forms and Sensibles. But Plato’s Forms were supposed to be causes par excellence, whereas abstract objects are generally supposed to be causally inert. The original ‘abstract’/‘concrete’ distinction was a distinction among words or terms. Traditional grammar distinguishes the abstract noun ‘whiteness’ from the concrete noun ‘white’ without implying that this linguistic contrast corresponds to a metaphysical distinction in what these words stand for. In the 17th century, this grammatical distinction was transposed to the domain of ideas. Locke speaks of the general idea of a triangle which is “neither Oblique nor Rectangle, neither Equilateral, Equicrural nor Scalenon [Scalene]; but all and none of these at once,” remarking that even this idea is not among the most “abstract, comprehensive and difficult” (Essay, IV.vii.9). Locke’s conception of an abstract idea as one that is formed from concrete ideas by the omission of distinguishing detail was immediately rejected by Berkeley and then by Hume. But even for Locke there was no suggestion that the distinction between abstract ideas and concrete or particular ideas corresponds to a distinction among objects. “It is plain, …” Locke writes, “that General and Universal, belong not to the real existence of things; but are Inventions and Creatures of the Understanding, made by it for its own use, and concern only signs, whether Words or Ideas” (III.iii.11).

The abstract/concrete distinction in its modern form is meant to mark a line in the domain of objects or entities. So conceived, the distinction becomes a central focus for philosophical discussion primarily in the 20th century. The origins of this development are obscure, but one crucial factor appears to have been the breakdown of the allegedly exhaustive distinction between mental and material objects, which had formed the main division for ontologically-minded philosophers since Descartes. One signal event in this development is Frege’s insistence that the objectivity and aprioricity of the truths of mathematics entail that numbers are neither material beings nor ideas in the mind. If numbers were material things (or properties of material things), the laws of arithmetic would have the status of empirical generalizations. If numbers were ideas in the mind, then the same difficulty would arise, as would countless others. (Whose mind contains the number 17? Is there one 17 in your mind and another in mine? In that case, the appearance of a common mathematical subject matter would be an illusion.) In The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884), Frege concludes that numbers are neither external concrete things nor mental entities of any sort.

Later, in his essay “The Thought” (1918), Frege claims the same status for the items he calls thoughts—the senses of declarative sentences—and also, by implication, for their constituents, the senses of subsentential expressions. Frege does not say that senses are abstract. He says that they belong to a third realm distinct both from the sensible external world and from the internal world of consciousness. Similar claims had been made by Bolzano (1837), and later by Brentano (1874) and his pupils, including Meinong and Husserl. The common theme in these developments is the felt need in semantics and psychology, as well as in mathematics, for a class of objective (i.e., non-mental) non-physical entities. As this new realism was absorbed into English-speaking philosophy, the traditional term ‘abstract’ was enlisted to apply to the denizens of this third realm. In this vein, Popper (1968) spoke of the ‘third world’ of abstract, objective entities, in the broader sense that includes cultural products such as arguments, theories, and works of art.

As we turn to an overview of the current debate, it is therefore important to remember that the use of the terms platonist (for those who affirm the existence of abstract objects) and nominalist (for those who deny existence) is somewhat lamentable, since these words have established senses in the history of philosophy. These terms stood for positions that have little to do with the modern notion of an abstract object. Modern platonists (with a small ‘p’) need not accept any of the distinctive metaphysical and epistemological doctrines of Plato, just as modern nominalists need not accept the distinctive doctrines of the medieval nominalists. Moreover, the literature also contains mention of anti-platonists, many of whom see themselves as fictionalists about abstracta, though this doesn’t help if it turns out that the best analysis of fictions is to regard them as abstract objects. So the reader should therefore be aware that terminology is not always well-chosen and that the terms so used sometimes stand for doctrines that are more restricted than the traditional doctrines that go by the same name. Henceforth, we simply use platonism for the thesis that there exists at least one abstract object, and nominalism for the thesis that the number of abstract objects is exactly zero (Field 1980).

2.2 An Initial Overview of the Contemporary Debate

Before we survey the various proposals for drawing the abstract/concrete distinction, we should briefly say why the distinction has been thought to matter. Among philosophers who take the distinction seriously, it is generally supposed that while concrete objects clearly exist, abstract entities are problematic in distinctive ways and deny the existence of abstract entities altogether. In this section we briefly survey the arguments for nominalism and the responses that platonists have offered. If the abstract objects are unified as a class, it is because they have some feature that generates what seems to be a distinctive problem—a problem that nominalists deem unsolvable and which platonists aim to solve. Before we ask what the unifying feature might be, it may therefore help to characterize the various problems it has been thought to generate.

The contemporary debate about platonism developed in earnest when Quine argued (1948) that mathematical objects exist, having changed his mind about the nominalist approach he had defended earlier (Goodman & Quine 1947). Quine’s 1948 argument involves three key premises, all of which exerted significant influence on the subsequent debate: (i) mathematics is indispensable for empirical science; (ii) we should be ontologically committed to the entities required for the truth of our best empirical theories (all of which should be expressible in a first-order language); and (iii) the entities required for the truth on an empirical theory are those in the range of the variables bounded by its first-order quantifiers (i.e., the entities in the domain of the existential quantifier ‘\(\exists x\)’ and the universal quantifier ‘\(\forall x\)’). He concluded that in addition to the concrete entities contemplated by our best empirical science, we must accept the existence of mathematical entities, even if they are abstract (see also Quine 1960, 1969, 1976).

Quine’s argument initiated a debate that is still alive. Various nominalist responses questioned one or another of the premises in his argument. For instance, Field (1980) challenged the idea that mathematics is indispensable for our best scientific theories—i.e., rejecting (i) above—and thus faced the task of rewriting classical and modern physics in nominalistic terms in order to sustain the challenge. Others have taken on the somewhat less daunting task of accepting (i) but rejecting (ii) and (iii); they’ve argued that even if our best scientific theories, in regimented form, quantify over mathematical entities, this doesn’t entail a commitment to mathematical entities (see Azzouni 1997a, 1997b, 2004; Balaguer 1996, 1998; Maddy 1995, 1997; Melia 2000, 2002; Yablo 1998, 2002, 2005, 2009; Leng 2010.) Colyvan (2010) coined the expression ‘easy-roaders’ for this second group, since they avoided the ‘hard road’ of paraphrasing our best scientific theories in non-mathematical terms.

By contrast, some mathematical platonists (Colyvan 2001; Baker 2005, 2009) have refined Quine’s view by advancing the so-called ‘Enhanced Indispensability Argument’ (though see Saatsi 2011 for a response). Some participants describe the debate in terms of a stalemate they hope to resolve (see Baker 2017, Baron 2016, 2020, Knowles & Saatsi 2019, and Martínez-Vidal & Rivas-de-Castro 2020, for discussion).[3]

Aside from the debate over Quine’s argument, both platonism and nominalism give rise to hard questions. Platonists not only need to provide a theory of what abstract objects exist, but also an account of how we cognitively access and come to know non-causal, abstract entities. This latter question has been the subject of a debate that began in earnest in Benacerraf (1973), which posed just such a dilemma for mathematical objects. Benacerraf noted that the causal theory of reference doesn’t seem to make it possible to know the truth conditions of mathematical statements, and his argument applies to abstract entities more generally. On the other hand, nominalists need to explain the linguistic uses in which we seem to appeal to such entities, especially those uses in what appear to be good explanations, such as those in scientific, mathematical, linguistic, and philosophical pursuits (see Wetzel 2009, 1–22, for a discussion of the many places where abstract types are used in scientific explanations). Even though nominalists argue that there are no abstracta, the very fact that there is disagreement about their existence suggests that both platonists and nominalists acknowledge the distinction between the abstract and concrete to be a meaningful one.

On the platonist side, various proposals have been raised to address the challenge of explaining epistemic access to abstract entities, mostly in connection with mathematical objects. Some, including Gödel (1964), allege that we access abstract objects in virtue of a unique kind of perception (intuition). Maddy (1990, 1997) developed two rather different ways of understanding our knowledge of mathematics in naturalistic ways. Other platonists have argued that abstract objects are connected to empirical entities, either via abstraction (Steiner 1975; Resnik 1982; Shapiro 1997) or via abstraction principles (Wright 1983; Hale 1987); we’ll discuss some of these views below. There are also those who speak of existent and intersubjective abstract entities as a kind of mental representation (Katz 1980).

A rather different line of approach to the epistemological problem was proposed in Linsky & Zalta 1995, where it is suggested that one shouldn’t attempt to explain knowledge of abstracta on the same model that is used to explain knowledge of concrete objects. They argue that not only a certain plenitude principle for abstract objects (namely, the comprehension principle for abstract objects put forward in Zalta 1983, 1988—see below) yields unproblematic ‘acquaintance by description’ to unique abstract objects but also that their approach actually comports with naturalist beliefs. Balaguer (1995, 1998) also suggests that a plenitude principle is the best way forward for the platonist, and that our knowledge of the consistency of mathematical theories suffices for knowledge of mathematical objects. And there are views that conceive of abstract objects as constituted by human—or, in general, intelligent—subjects, or as abstract artifacts (see Popper 1968; Thomasson 1999).

A number of nominalists have been persuaded by Benacerraf’s (1973) epistemological challenge about reference to abstract objects and concluded that sentences with terms making apparent reference to them—such as mathematical statements—are either false or lack a truth value. They argue that those sentences must be paraphrasable without vocabulary that commits one to any sort of abstract entity. These proposals sometimes suggest that statements about abstract objects are merely instrumental; they serve only to help us establish conclusions about concrete objects. Field’s fictionalism (1980, 1989) has been influential in this regard. Field reconstructed Newtonian physics using second-order logic and quantification over (concrete) regions of space-time. A completely different tactic for avoiding the commitment to abstract, mathematical objects is put forward in Putnam (1967) and Hellman (1989), who separately reconstructed various mathematical theories in second-order modal logic. On their view, abstract objects aren’t in the range of the existential quantifier at the actual world (hence, we can’t say that they exist), but they do occur in the range of the quantifier at other possible worlds, where the axioms of the mathematical theory in question are true.

These nominalistic approaches must contend with various issues, of course. At the very least, they have to successfully argue that the tools they use to avoid commitments to abstract objects don’t themselves involve such commitment. For example, Field must argue that space-time regions are concrete entities, while Putnam and Hellman must argue that by relying on logical possibility and modal logic, there is no commitment to possible worlds considered as abstract objects. In general, any nominalist account that makes essential use of set theory or model-theoretic structures must convincingly argue that the very use of such analytic tools doesn’t commit them to abstract objects. (See Burgess & Rosen 1997 for a systematic survey of different proposals about the existence of abstract objects.)

Another nominalistic thread in the literature concerns the suggestion that sentences about (posited) abstract objects are quasi-assertions, i.e., not evaluable as to truth or falsehood (see Yablo 2001 and Kalderon 2005). Still others argue that we should not believe sentences about abstracta since their function, much like the instrumentalism discussed earlier, is to ensure empirical adequacy for observational sentences (Yablo 1998). This may involve differentiating between apparent content, which involves posited abstract objects, and real content, which only concerns concrete objects (Yablo 2001, 2002, 2010, 2014). (For more on these fictionalist accounts, see Kalderon 2005, Ch. 3, and the entry on fictionalism.)

A final group of views in the literature represents a kind of agnosticism about what exists or about what it is to be an object, be it abstract or concrete. These views don’t reject an external material world, but rather begin with some question as to whether we can have experience, observation, and knowledge of objects directly, i.e., independent of our theoretical frameworks. Carnap (1950 [1956]), for example, started with the idea that our scientific knowledge has to be expressed with respect to a linguistic framework and that when we wish to put forward a theory about a new kind of entity, we must have a linguistic framework for talking about those entities. He then distinguished two kinds of existence questions: internal questions within the framework about the existence of the new entities and external questions about the reality of the framework itself. If the framework deals with abstract entities such as numbers, sets, propositions, etc., then the internal question can be answered by logical analysis of the rules of the language, such as whether it includes terms for, or implies claims that quantify over, abstract objects. But, for Carnap, the external question, about whether the abstract entities really exist, is a pseudo-question and should be regarded as nothing more than the pragmatic question of whether the framework is a useful one to adopt, for scientific or other forms of enquiry. We’ll discuss Carnap’s view in more detail in subsection 3.7.1.

Some have thought that Carnap’s view offers a deflationist view of objects, since it appears that the existence of objects is not language independent. After Carnap’s seminal article, several other deflationist approaches were put forward (Putnam 1987, 1990; Hirsch 2002, 2011; Sider 2007, 2009; Thomasson 2015), many of them claiming to be a vindication of Carnap’s view. However, there are deflationist proposals that run counter to Carnap’s approach, among them, deflationary nominalism (Azzouni 2010) or agnosticism about abstract objects (Bueno 2008a, 2008b, 2020). Additionally, philosophers inspired by Frege’s work have argued for a minimal notion of an object (Rayo 2013, Rayo 2020 [Other Internet Resources]; and Linnebo 2018). We’ll discuss some of these in greater detail below, in subsection 3.7.2. A final agnostic position that has emerged is one that rejects a strict version of platonism, but suggests that neither a careful analysis of mathematical practice (Maddy 2011), nor the enhanced version of the indispensability argument (Leng 2020) suffice to decide between nominalism and moderate versions of platonism. Along these lines, Balaguer (1998) concluded that the question doesn’t have an answer, since the arguments for ‘full-blooded’ platonism can be matched one-for-one by equally good arguments by the anti-platonist.

For additional discussion about the basic positions in the debate about abstract and concrete objects, see Szabó 2003 and the entries on nominalism in metaphysics and platonism in metaphysics, nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics and platonism in the philosophy of mathematics.

3. What is an Abstract Object?

As part of his attempt to understand the nature of possible worlds, Lewis (1986a, 81–86) categorizes different ways by which one can draw the abstract/concrete distinction.[4] These include: the way of example (which is simply to list the paradigm cases of abstract and concrete objects in the hope that the sense of the distinction will somehow emerge); the way of conflation (i.e., identifying abstract and concrete objects with some already-known distinction); the way of negation (i.e., saying what abstract objects are by saying what they are not, e.g., non-spatiotemporal, non-causal, etc.); and the way of abstraction (i.e., saying that abstract objects are conceptualized by a process of considering some known objects and omitting certain distinguishing features). He gives a detailed examination of the different proposals that typify these ways and then attempts to show that none of them quite succeeds in classifying the paradigms in accord with prevailing usage. Given the problems he encountered when analyzing the various ways, Lewis became pessimistic about our ability to draw the distinction cleanly.

Despite Lewis’s pessimism about clarifying the abstract/concrete distinction, his approach for categorizing the various proposals, when extended, is a useful one. Indeed, in what follows, we’ll see that there are a number of additional ways that categorize attempts to characterize the abstract/concrete distinction and theorize about abstract objects. Even if there is no single, acceptable account, these various ways of drawing the distinction and theorizing about abstract objects do often cast light on the questions we’ve been discussing, especially when the specific proposals are integrated into a supplementary (meta-)ontological project. For each method of drawing the distinction and specific proposal adopting that method acquires a certain amount of explanatory power, and this will help us to compare and contrast the various ideas that are now found in the literature.

3.1 The Way of Example and the Way of Primitivism

According to the way of example, it suffices to list paradigm cases of abstract and concrete entities in the hope that the sense of the distinction will somehow emerge. Clearly, a list of examples for each category would be a heuristically promising start in the search for some criterion (or list of criteria) that would be fruitful for drawing the distinction. However, a simple list would be of limited significance since there are too many ways of extrapolating from the paradigm cases to a distinction that would cover the unclear cases, with the result that no clear notion has been explained.

For example, pure sets are paradigm examples of abstract entities. But the case of impure sets is far from clear. Consider the unit set whose sole member is Joe Biden (i.e., {Joe Biden}), the Undergraduate Class of 2020 or The Ethics Committee, etc. They are sets, but it is not clear that they are abstract given that Joe Biden, the members of the class and committee are concrete. Similarly, if one offers the characters of Sherlock Holmes stories as examples to help motivate the primitive concept abstract object, then one has to wonder about the object London that appears in the novels.

The refusal to characterize the abstract/concrete distinction while maintaining that both categories have instances might be called the way of primitivism, whenever the following condition obtains: a few predicates are distinguished as primitive and unanalyzable, and the explanatory power rests on the fact that other interesting predicates can be defined in terms of the primitives and that interesting claims can be judged true on the basis of our intuitive understanding of the primitive and defined notions. Thus, one might take abstract and concrete as primitive notions. It wouldn’t be an insignificant result if one could use this strategy to explain why abstract objects are necessarily existent, causally ineffiacious, non-spatiotemporal, intersubjective, etc. (see Cowling 2017: 92–97).

But closer inspection of this method reveals some significant concerns. To start with, when a distinction is taken as basic and unanalyzable, one typically has to offer some intuitive instances of the primitive predicates. But it is not always so easy to do this. For example, when mathematicians take set and membership as primitives and then assert some principles of set theory, they often illustrate their primitives by offering some examples of sets, such as The Undergraduate Class of 2020 or The Ethics Committee, etc. But these, of course, aren’t quite right, since the members of the class and committee may change while the class and committee remain the same, whereas if the members of a set change, one has a different set. A similar concern affects the present proposal. If one offers sets or the characters of the Sherlock Holmes novels as examples to help motivate the primitive concept abstract object, then one has to wonder about impure sets such as the unit set whose sole member is Aristotle (i.e., \(\{\textrm{Aristotle}\}\)) and the object London that appears in the novels.

3.2 The Way of Conflation

According to the way of conflation, the abstract/concrete distinction is to be identified with one or another metaphysical distinction already familiar under another name: as it might be, the distinction between sets and individuals, or the distinction between universals and particulars. There is no doubt that some authors have used the terms in this way. (Thus Quine 1948 uses ‘abstract entity’ and ‘universal’ interchangeably.) This sort of conflation is however rare in recent philosophy.

3.3 The Way of Abstraction

Another methodology is what Lewis calls the way of abstraction. According to a longstanding tradition in philosophical psychology, abstraction is a distinctive mental process in which new ideas or conceptions are formed by considering the common features of several objects or ideas and ignoring the irrelevant features that distinguish those objects. For example, if one is given a range of white things of varying shapes and sizes; one ignores or abstracts from the respects in which they differ, and thereby attains the abstract idea of whiteness. Nothing in this tradition requires that ideas formed in this way represent or correspond to a distinctive kind of object. But it might be maintained that the distinction between abstract and concrete objects should be explained by reference to the psychological process of abstraction or something like it. The simplest version of this strategy would be to say that an object is abstract if it is (or might be) the referent of an abstract idea; i.e., an idea formed by abstraction. So conceived, the way of abstraction is wedded to an outmoded philosophy of mind.

It should be mentioned, though, that the key idea behind the way of abstraction has resurfaced (though transformed) in the structuralist views about mathematics that trace back to Dedekind. Dedekind thought of numbers by the way of abstraction. Dedekind suggested that when defining a number-theoretic structure, “we entirely neglect the special character of the elements, merely retaining their distinguishability and taking into account only the relations to one another” (Dedekind 1888 [1963, 68]). This view has led some structuralists to deny that numbers are abstract objects. For example, Benacerraf concluded that “numbers are not objects at all, because in giving the properties (that is, necessary and sufficient) of numbers you merely characterize an abstract structure—and the distinction lies in the fact that the ‘elements’ of the structure have no properties other than those relating them to other ‘elements’ of the same structure” (1965, 70). We shall therefore turn our attention to a variant of the way of abstraction, one that has led a number of philosophers to conclude that numbers are indeed abstract objects.

3.4 The Way of Abstraction Principles

In the contemporary philosophical literature, a number of books and papers have investigated a form of abstraction that doesn’t depend on mental processes. We may call this the way of abstraction principles. Wright (1983) and Hale (1987) have developed an account of abstract objects on the basis of an idea they trace back to certain suggestive remarks in Frege (1884). Frege notes (in effect) that many of the singular terms that appear to refer to abstract entities are formed by means of functional expressions. We speak of the shape of a building, the direction of a line, the number of books on the shelf. Of course, many singular terms formed by means of functional expressions denote ordinary concrete objects: ‘the father of Plato’, ‘the capital of France’. But the functional terms that pick out abstract entities are distinctive in the following respect: where \(f(a)\) is such an expression, there is typically an equation of the form:

\[ f(a)\! =\! f(b) \text{ if and only if } Rab \]

where \(R\) is an equivalence relation, i.e., a relation that is reflexive, symmetric and transitive, relative to some domain. For example:

The direction of \(a\) = the direction of \(b\) if and only if \(a\) is parallel to \(b\)

The number of \(F\text{s}\) = the number of \(G\text{s}\) if and only if there are just as many \(F\text{s}\) as \(G\text{s}\)

These biconditionals (or abstraction principles) appear to have a special semantic status. While they are not strictly speaking definitions of the functional expression that occurs on the left hand side, they would appear to hold in virtue of the meaning of that expression. To understand the term ‘direction’ is (in part) to know that the direction of \(a\) and the direction of \(b\) are the same entity if and only if the lines \(a\) and \(b\) are parallel. Moreover, the equivalence relation that appears on the right hand side of the biconditional would appear to be semantically and perhaps epistemologically prior to the functional expressions on the left (Noonan 1978). Mastery of the concept of a direction presupposes mastery of the concept of parallelism, but not vice versa.

The availability of abstraction principles meeting these conditions may be exploited to yield an account of the distinction between abstract and concrete objects. When ‘\(f\)’ is a functional expression governed by an abstraction principle, there will be a corresponding kind \(K_{f}\) such that:

\(x\) is a \(K_{f}\) if and only if, for some \(y\), \(x\! =\! f(y)\).

For example,

\(x\) is a cardinal number if and only if for some concept \(F\), \(x\) = the number of \(F\text{s}\).

The simplest version of the way of abstraction principles is then to say that:

\(x\) is an abstract object if (and only if) \(x\) is an instance of some kind \(K_{f}\) whose associated functional expression ‘\(f\)’ is governed by a suitable abstraction principle.

The strong version of this account—which purports to identify a necessary condition for abstractness—is seriously at odds with standard usage. Pure sets are usually considered paradigmatic abstract objects. But it is not clear that they satisfy the proposed criterion. According to a version of naïve set theory, the functional expression ‘set of’ is indeed characterized by a putative abstraction principle.

The set of \(F\text{s}\) = the set of \(G\text{s}\) if and only if, for all \(x\), \(x\) is \(F\) if and only if \(x\) is \(G\).

But this principle, which is a version of Frege’s Basic Law V, is inconsistent and so fails to characterize an interesting concept. In contemporary mathematics, the concept of a set is not introduced by an abstraction principle, but rather axiomatically. Though attempts have been made to investigate abstraction principles for sets (Cook 2003), it remains an open question whether something like the mathematical concept of a set can be characterized by a suitably restricted abstraction principle. (See Burgess 2005 for a survey of recent efforts in this direction.) Even if such a principle is available, however, it is unlikely that the epistemological priority condition will be satisfied. That is, it is unlikely that mastery of the concept of set will presuppose mastery of the equivalence relation that figures on the right hand side. It is therefore uncertain whether the way of abstraction principles will classify the objects of pure set theory as abstract entities (as it presumably must).

On the other hand, as Dummett (1973) has noted, in many cases the standard names for paradigmatically abstract objects do not assume the functional form to which the definition adverts. Chess is an abstract entity, but we do not understand the word ‘chess’ as synonymous with an expression of the form ‘\(f(x)\)’, where ‘\(f\)’ is governed by an abstraction principle. Similar remarks would seem to apply to such things as the English language, social justice, architecture, and Charlie Parker’s musical style. If so, the abstractionist approach does not provide a necessary condition for abstractness as that notion is standardly understood.

More importantly, there is some reason to believe that it fails to supply a sufficient condition. A mereological fusion of concrete objects is itself a concrete object. But the concept of a mereological fusion is governed by what appears to be an abstraction principle:

The fusion of the \(F\text{s}\) = the fusion of the \(G\text{s}\) if and only if the \(F\text{s}\) and \(G\text{s}\) cover one another,

where the \(F\text{s}\) cover the \(G\text{s}\) if and only if every part of every \(G\) has a part in common with an \(F\). Similarly, suppose a train is a maximal string of railroad carriages, all of which are connected to one another. We may define a functional expression, ‘the train of \(x\)’, by means of an ‘abstraction’ principle: The train of \(x\) = the train of \(y\) if and only if \(x\) and \(y\) are connected carriages. We may then say that \(x\) is a train if and only if for some carriage \(y\), \(x\) is the train of \(y\). The simple account thus yields the consequence that trains are to be reckoned abstract entities.

It is unclear whether these objections apply to the more sophisticated abstractionist proposals of Wright and Hale, but one feature of the simple account sketched above clearly does apply to these proposals and may serve as the basis for an objection to this version of the way of abstraction principles. The neo-Fregean approach seeks to explain the abstract/concrete distinction in semantic terms: We said that an abstract object is an object that falls in the range of a functional expression governed by an abstraction principle, where ‘\(f\)’ is governed by an abstraction principle when that principle holds in virtue of the meaning of ‘\(f\)’. This notion of a statement’s holding in virtue of the meaning of a word is notoriously problematic (see the entry the analytic/synthetic distinction). But even if this notion makes sense, one may still complain: The abstract/concrete distinction is supposed to be a metaphysical distinction; abstract objects are supposed to differ from concrete objects in some important ontological respect. It should be possible, then, to draw the distinction directly in metaphysical terms: to say what it is in the objects themselves that makes some things abstract and others concrete. As Lewis writes, in response to a related proposal by Dummett:

Even if this … way succeeds in drawing a border, as for all I know it may, it tells us nothing about how the entities on opposite sides of that border differ in their nature. It is like saying that snakes are the animals that we instinctively most fear—maybe so, but it tells us nothing about the nature of snakes. (Lewis 1986a: 82)

The challenge is to produce a non-semantic version of the abstractionist criterion that specifies directly, in metaphysical terms, what the objects whose canonical names are governed by abstraction principles all have in common.

One response to this difficulty is to transpose the abstractionist proposal into a more metaphysical key (see Rosen & Yablo 2020). The idea is that each Fregean number is, by its very nature, the number of some Fregean concept, just as each Fregean direction is, by its very nature, at least potentially the direction of some concrete line. In each case, the abstract object is essentially the value of an abstraction function for a certain class of arguments. This is not a claim about the meanings of linguistic expressions. It is a claim about the essences or natures of the objects themselves. (For the relevant notion of essence, see Fine 1994.) So for example, the Fregean number two (if there is such a thing) is, essentially, by its very nature, the number that belongs to a concept \(F\) if and only if there are exactly two \(F\text{s}\). More generally, for each Fregean abstract object \(x\), there is an abstraction function \(f\), such that \(x\) is essentially the value of \(f\) for every argument of a certain kind.

Abstraction functions have two key features. First, for each abstraction function \(f\) there is an equivalence relation \(R\) such that it lies in the nature of \(f\) that \(f(x)\! =\! f(y)\) iff \(Rxy\). Intuitively, we are to think that \(R\) is metaphysically prior to \(f\), and that the abstraction function \(f\) is defined (in whole or in part) by this biconditional. Second, each abstraction function is a generating function: its values are essentially values of that function. Many functions are not generating functions. Paris is the capital of France, but it is not essentially a capital. The number of solar planets, by contrast, is essentially a number. The notion of an abstraction function may be defined in terms of these two features:

\(f\) is an abstraction function if and only if
  1. for some equivalence relation \(R\), it lies in the nature of \(f\) that \(f(x)\! =\! f(y)\) if and only if \(Rxy\); and
  2. for all \(x\), if \(x\) is a value of \(f\), then it lies in the nature of \(x\) that there is (or could be) some object \(y\) such that \(x\! =\! f(y)\).

We may then say that:

\(x\) is an abstraction if and only if, for some abstraction function \(f\), there is or could be an object \(y\) such that \(x\! =\! f(y)\),

and that:

\(x\) is an abstract object if (and only if) \(x\) is an abstraction.

This account tells us a great deal about the distinctive natures of these broadly Fregean abstract objects. It tells us that each is, by its very nature, the value of a special sort of function, one whose nature is specified in a simple way in terms of an associated equivalence relation. It is worth stressing, however, that it does not supply much metaphysical information about these items. It doesn’t tell us whether they are located in space, whether they can stand in causal relations, and so on. It is an open question whether this somewhat unfamiliar version of the abstract/concrete distinction lines up with any of the more conventional ways of drawing the distinction outlined above. An account along these lines would be at odds with standard usage, but may be philosophically interesting all the same. In any case, the problem remains that this metaphysical version of the way of abstraction principles leaves out paradigmatic cases of abstract objects such as the aforementioned game of chess.

3.5 The Ways of Negation

According to the way of negation, abstract objects are defined as those which lack certain features possessed by paradigmatic concrete objects. Many explicit characterizations in the literature follow this model. Let us review some of the options.

3.5.1 The Combined Criterion of Non-Mental and Non-Sensible

According to the account implicit in Frege’s writings:

An object is abstract if and only if it is both non-mental and non-sensible.

Here the first challenge is to say what it means for a thing to be ‘non-mental’, or as we more commonly say, ‘mind-independent’. The simplest approach is to say that a thing depends on the mind when it would not (or could not) have existed if minds had not existed. But this entails that tables and chairs are mind-dependent, and that is not what philosophers who employ this notion have in mind. To call an object ‘mind-dependent’ in a metaphysical context is to suggest that it somehow owes its existence to mental activity, but not in the boring ‘causal’ sense in which ordinary artifacts owe their existence to the mind. What can this mean? One promising approach is to say that an object should be reckoned mind-dependent when, by its very nature, it exists at a time if and only if it is the object or content of some mental state or process at that time. This counts tables and chairs as mind-independent, since they might survive the annihilation of thinking things. But it counts paradigmatically mental items, like a purple afterimage of which a person \(X\) may become aware, as mind-dependent, since it presumably lies in the nature of such items to be objects of conscious awareness whenever they exist. However, it is not clear that this account captures the full force of the intended notion. Consider, for example, the mereological fusion of \(X\)’s afterimage and \(Y\)’s headache. This is surely a mental entity if anything is. But it is not necessarily the object of a mental state. (The fusion can exist even if no one is thinking about it.) A more generous conception would allow for mind-dependent objects that exist at a time in virtue of mental activity at that time, even if the object is not the object of any single mental state or act. The fusion of \(X\)’s afterimage and \(Y\)’s headache is mind-dependent in the second sense but not the first. That is a reason to prefer the second account of mind-dependence.

If we understand the notion of mind-dependence in this way, it is a mistake to insist that abstract objects be mind-independent. To strike a theme that will recur, it is widely supposed that sets and classes are abstract entities—even the impure sets whose urelements are concrete objects. Any account of the abstract/concrete distinction that places set-theoretic constructions like \(\{\textrm{Alfred}, \{\textrm{Betty}, \{\textrm{Charlie}, \textrm{Deborah}\}\}\}\) on the concrete side of the line will be seriously at odds with standard usage. With this in mind, consider the set whose sole members are X’s afterimage and Y’s headache, or some more complex set-theoretic object based on these items. If we suppose, as is plausible, that an impure set exists at a time only when its members exist at that time, this will be a mind-dependent entity in the generous sense. But it is also presumably an abstract entity.

A similar problem arises for so-called abstract artifacts, like Jane Austen’s novels and the characters that inhabit them. Some philosophers regard such items as eternally existing abstract entities that worldly authors merely describe but do not create. But of course the commonsensical view is that Austen created Pride and Prejudice and Elizabeth Bennett, and there is no good reason to deny this (Thomasson 1999; cf. Sainsbury 2009). If we take this commonsensical approach, there will be a clear sense in which these items depend for their existence on Austen’s mental activity, and perhaps on the mental activity of subsequent readers.[5] These items may not count as mind-dependent in either of the senses canvassed above, since Pride and Prejudice can presumably exist at a time even if no one happens to be thinking at that time. (If the world took a brief collective nap, Pride and Prejudice would not pop out of existence.) But they are obviously mind-dependent in some not-merely-causal sense. And yet they are still presumably abstract objects. For these reasons, it is probably a mistake to insist that abstract objects be mind-independent. (For more on mind-dependence, see Rosen 1994, and the entry platonism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Frege’s proposal in its original form also fails for other reasons. Quarks and electrons are usually considered neither sensible nor mind-dependent. And yet they are not abstract objects. A better version of Frege’s proposal would hold that:

An object is abstract if and only if it is both non-physical and non-mental.

Two remarks on this last version are in order. First, it opens the door to thinking that besides abstract and concrete entities (assuming that physical objects, in a broad sense, are concrete), there are mental entities that are neither concrete nor abstract. As mentioned above (section 1.2), there is no need to insist that the distinction is an exhaustive one. Second, while the approach may well draw an important line, it inherits one familiar problem, namely, that of saying what it is for a thing to be a physical object (Crane and Mellor 1990; for discussion, see the entry on physicalism). In one sense, a physical entity is an entity in which physics might take an interest. But physics is saturated with mathematics, so in this sense a great many paradigmatically abstract objects—e.g. \(\pi\)—will count as physical. The intended point is that abstract objects are to be distinguished, not from all of the objects posited by physics, but from the concrete objects posited by the physics. But if that is the point, it is unilluminating in the present context to say that abstract objects are non-physical.

3.5.2 The Non-Spatiality Criterion

Contemporary purveyors of the way of negation typically amend Frege’s criterion by requiring that abstract objects be non-spatial, causally inefficacious, or both. Indeed, if any characterization of the abstract deserves to be regarded as the standard one, is this:

An object is abstract if and only if it is non-spatial and causally inefficacious.

This standard account nonetheless presents a number of perplexities.

First of all, one must consider whether there are abstract objects that have one of the two features but not the other. For example, consider an impure set, such as the unit set of Plato (i.e., \(\{\textrm{Plato}\}\)). It has some claim to being abstract because it is causally inefficacious, but some might suggest that it has a location in space (namely, wherever Plato is located). Or consider a work of fiction such as Kafka’s The Metamorphosis. It, too, has some claim to being abstract because it (or at least its content) is non-spatial. But one might suggest that works of fiction as paradigmatic abstract objects seem to have causal powers, e.g., powers to affect us.

In the remainder of this subsection, we focus on the first criterion in the above proposal, namely, the non-spatial condition. But it gives rise to a subtlety. It seems plausible to suggest that, necessarily, if something \(x\) is causally efficacious, then (since \(x\) is a cause or has causal powers) \(x\), or some part of \(x\), has a location in time. So if something has no location in time, it is causally inefficacious. The theory of relativity implies that space and time are nonseparable, i.e., combined into a single spacetime manifold. So the above proposal might be restated in terms of a single condition: an object is abstract if and only if it is non-spatiotemporal. Sometimes this revised proposal is the correct one for thinking about abstract objects, but our discussion in the previous section showed that abstract artifacts and mental events may be temporal but non-spatial. Given the complexities here, in what follows we use spatiotemporality, spatiality, or temporality, as needed.

Some of the archetypes of abstractness are non-spatiotemporal in a straightforward sense. It makes no sense to ask where the cosine function was last Tuesday. Or if it makes sense to ask, the sensible answer is that it was nowhere. Similarly, for many people, it makes no good sense to ask when the Pythagorean Theorem came to be. Or if it does make sense to ask, the only sensible answer for them is that it has always existed, or perhaps that it does not exist ‘in time’ at all. It is generally assumed that these paradigmatic ‘pure abstracta’ have no non-trivial spatial or temporal properties; that they have no spatial location, and they exist nowhere in particular in time.

Other abstract objects appear to stand in a more interesting relation to spacetime. Consider the game of chess. Some philosophers will say that chess is like a mathematical object, existing nowhere and ‘no when’—either eternally or outside of time altogether. But the most natural view is that chess was invented at a certain time and place (though it may be hard to say exactly where or when); that before it was invented it did not exist at all; that it was imported from India into Persia in the 7th century; that it has changed over the years, and so on. The only reason to resist this natural account is the thought that since chess is clearly an abstract object—it’s not a physical object, after all!—and since abstract objects do not exist in space and time—by definition!—chess must resemble the cosine function in its relation to space and time. And yet one might with equal justice regard the case of chess and other abstract artifacts as counterexamples to the hasty view that abstract objects possess only trivial spatial and temporal properties.

Should we then abandon the non-spatiotemporality criterion? Not necessarily. Even if there is a sense in which some abstract entities possess non-trivial spatiotemporal properties, it might still be said that concrete entities exist in spacetime in a distinctive way. If we had an account of this distinctive manner of spatiotemporal existence characteristic of concrete objects, we could say: An object is abstract (if and) only if it fails to exist in spacetime in that way.

One way to implement this approach is to note that paradigmatic concrete objects tend to occupy a relatively determinate spatial volume at each time at which they exist, or a determinate volume of spacetime over the course of their existence. It makes sense to ask of such an object, ‘Where is it now, and how much space does it occupy?’ even if the answer must sometimes be somewhat vague. By contrast, even if the game of chess is somehow ‘implicated’ in space and time, it makes no sense to ask how much space it now occupies. (To the extent that this does make sense, the only sensible answer is that it occupies no space at all, which is not to say that it occupies a spatial point.) And so it might be said:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it fails to occupy anything like a determinate region of space (or spacetime).

This promising idea raises several questions. First, it is conceivable that certain items that are standardly regarded as abstract might nonetheless occupy determinate volumes of space and time. Consider, for example, the various sets composed from Peter and Paul: \(\{\textrm{Peter}, \textrm{Paul}\},\) \(\{\textrm{Peter}, \{\textrm{Peter}, \{\{\textrm{Paul}\}\}\}\},\) etc. We don’t normally ask where such things are, or how much space they occupy. And indeed many philosophers will say that the question makes no sense, or that the answer is a dismissive ‘nowhere, none’. But this answer is not forced upon us by anything in set theory or metaphysics. Even if we grant that pure sets stand in only the most trivial relations to space, it is open to us to hold, as some philosophers have done, that impure sets exist where and when their members do (Lewis 1986a). It is not unnatural to say that a set of books is located on a certain shelf in the library, and indeed, there are some theoretical reasons for wanting to say this (Maddy 1990). On a view of this sort, we face a choice: we can say that since impure sets exist in space, they are not abstract objects after all; or we can say that since impure sets are abstract, it was a mistake to suppose that abstract objects cannot occupy space.

One way to finesse this difficulty would be to note that even if impure sets occupy space, they do so in a derivative manner. The set \(\{\textrm{Peter}, \textrm{Paul}\}\) occupies a location in virtue of the fact that its concrete elements, Peter and Paul, together occupy that location. The set does not occupy the location in its own right. With that in mind, it might be said that:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it either fails to occupy space at all, or does so only in virtue of the fact some other items—in this case, its urelements—occupy that region.

But of course Peter himself occupies a region in virtue of the fact that his parts—his head, hands, etc.—together occupy that region. So a better version of the proposal would say:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it either fails to occupy space at all, or does so of the fact that some other items that are not among its parts occupy that region.

This approach appears to classify the cases fairly well, but it is somewhat artificial. Moreover, it raises a number of questions. What are we to say about the statue that occupies a region of space, not because its parts are arrayed in space, but rather because its constituting matter occupies that region? And what about the unobserved electron, which according to some interpretations of quantum mechanics does not really occupy a region of space at all, but rather stands in some more exotic relation to the spacetime it inhabits? Suffice it to say that a philosopher who regards ‘non-spatiality’ as a mark of the abstract, but who allows that some abstract objects may have non-trivial spatial properties, owes us an account of the distinctive relation to spacetime, space, and time that sets paradigmatic concreta apart.

Perhaps the crucial question about the ‘non-spatiality’ criterion concerns the classification of the parts of space itself. If they are considered concrete, then one might ask where the spatiotemporal points or regions are located. And a similar question arises for spatial points and regions, and for temporal instants or intervals. So, the ontological status of spatiotemporal locations, and of spatial and temporal locations, is problematic. Let us suppose that space, or spacetime, exists, not just as an object of pure mathematics, but as the arena in which physical objects and events are somehow arrayed. It is essential to understand that the problem is not about the numerical coordinates that represent these points and regions (or instants and intervals) in a reference system; the issue is about the points and regions (or instants and intervals). Physical objects are located ‘in’ or ‘at’ regions of space; as a result, they count as concrete according to the non-spatiality criterion. But what about the points and regions of space itself? There has been some debate about whether a commitment to spacetime substantivalism is consistent with the nominalist’s rejection of abstract entities (Field 1980, 1989; Malament 1982). If we define the abstract as the ‘non-spatial’, this debate amounts to whether space itself is to be reckoned ‘spatial’. To reject that these points, regions, instants, and intervals, are concrete because they are not located, entails featuring them as abstract. However, to think about them as abstract sounds a bit weird, given their role in causal processes. Perhaps, it is easier to treat them as concrete if we want to establish that concrete entities are spatiotemporal—or spatial and temporal.

The philosopher who believes that there is a serious question about whether the parts of space-time count as concrete would thus do well to characterize the abstract/concrete distinction in other terms. Still—as mentioned above—the philosopher who thinks that it is defensible that parts of space are concrete might use non-spatiality to draw the distinction if she manages to provide a way of accounting for how impure sets relate to space differs from the way concreta do.

3.5.3 The Causal Inefficacy Criterion

According to the most widely accepted versions of the way of negation:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it is causally inefficacious.

Concrete objects, whether mental or physical, have causal powers; numbers and functions and the rest make nothing happen. There is no such thing as causal commerce with the game of chess itself (as distinct from its concrete instances). And even if impure sets do in some sense exist in space, it is easy enough to believe that they make no distinctive causal contribution to what transpires. Peter and Paul may have effects individually. They may even have effects together that neither has on his own. But these joint effects are naturally construed as effects of two concrete objects acting jointly, or perhaps as effects of their mereological aggregate (itself usually regarded as concretum), rather than as effects of some set-theoretic construction. Suppose Peter and Paul together tip a balance. If we entertain the possibility that this event is caused by a set, we shall have to ask which set caused it: the set containing just Peter and Paul? Some more elaborate construction based on them? Or is it perhaps the set containing the molecules that compose Peter and Paul? This proliferation of possible answers suggests that it was a mistake to credit sets with causal powers in the first place. This is good news for those who wish to say that all sets are abstract.

(Note, however, that some writers identify ordinary physical events—causally efficacious items par excellence—with sets. For David Lewis, for example, an event like the fall of Rome is an ordered pair whose first member is a region of spacetime, and whose second member is a set of such regions (Lewis 1986b). On this account, it would be disastrous to say both that impure sets are abstract objects, and that abstract objects are non-causal.)

The biggest challenge to characterizing abstracta as causally inefficacious entities is that causality itself is a notoriously problematic and difficult to define idea. It is undoubtedly one of the most controversial notions in the history of thought, with all kinds of views having been put forward on the matter. Thus, causally efficacious inherits any unclarity that attaches to causality. So, if we are to move the discussion forward, we need to take the notion of causation—understood as a relation among events—as sufficiently clear, even though in fact it is not. Having acknowledged this no doubt naïve assumption, several difficulties arise for the suggestion that abstract objects are precisely the causally inefficacious objects.

The idea that causal inefficacy constitutes a sufficient condition for abstractness is somewhat at odds with standard usage. Some philosophers believe in ‘epiphenomenal qualia’: objects of conscious awareness (sense data), or qualitative conscious states that may be caused by physical processes in the brain, but which have no downstream causal consequences of their own (Jackson 1982; Chalmers 1996). These items are causally inefficacious if they exist, but they are not normally regarded as abstract. The proponent of the causal inefficacy criterion might respond by insisting that abstract objects are distinctively neither causes nor effects. But this is perilous. Abstract artifacts like Jane Austen’s novels (as we normally conceive them) come into being as a result of human activity. The same goes for impure sets, which come into being when their concrete urelements are created. These items are clearly effects in some good sense; yet they remain abstract if they exist at all. It is unclear how the proponent of the strong version of the causal inefficacy criterion (which views causal inefficacy as both necessary and sufficient for abstractness) might best respond to this problem.

Apart from this worry, there are no decisive intuitive counterexamples to this account of the abstract/concrete distinction. The chief difficulty—and it is hardly decisive—is rather conceptual. It is widely maintained that causation, strictly speaking, is a relation among events or states of affairs. If we say that the rock—an object—caused the window to break, what we mean is that some event or state (or fact or condition) involving the rock caused the break. If the rock itself is a cause, it is a cause in some derivative sense. But this derivative sense has proved elusive. The rock’s hitting the window is an event in which the rock ‘participates’ in a certain way, and it is because the rock participates in events in this way that we credit the rock itself with causal efficacy. But what is it for an object to participate in an event? Suppose John is thinking about the Pythagorean Theorem and you ask him to say what’s on his mind. His response is an event—the utterance of a sentence; and one of its causes is the event of John’s thinking about the theorem. Does the Pythagorean Theorem ‘participate’ in this event? There is surely some sense in which it does. The event consists in John’s coming to stand in a certain relation to the theorem, just as the rock’s hitting the window consists in the rock’s coming to stand in a certain relation to the glass. But we do not credit the Pythagorean Theorem with causal efficacy simply because it participates in this sense in an event which is a cause.

The challenge is therefore to characterize the distinctive manner of ‘participation in the causal order’ that distinguishes the concrete entities. This problem has received relatively little attention. There is no reason to believe that it cannot be solved, though the varieties of philosophical analysis for the notion of causality make the task full of pitfalls. Anyway, in the absence of a solution, this standard version of the way of negation must be reckoned a work in progress.

3.5.4 The Discernibility / Non-Duplication Criteria

Some philosophers have supposed that, under certain conditions, there are numerically different but indiscernible concrete entities, i.e., that there are distinct concrete objects \(x\) and \(y\) that exemplify the same properties. If this can be sustained, then one might suggest that distinct abstract objects are always discernible or, in a weaker formulation, that distinct abstract objects are never duplicates.

Cowling (2017, 86–89) analyzes whether the abstract/concrete distinction thus rendered is fruitful, though criteria in this line are normally offered as glosses on the universal/particular distinction. As part of his analysis, he deploys two pairs of (not uncontroversial) distinctions: (i) between qualitative and non-qualitative properties, and (ii) between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. Roughly, a non-qualitative property is one that involves specific individuals (e.g., being the teacher of Alexander the Great, being Albert Einstein, etc.), while qualitative properties are not (e.g., having mass, having a shape, having a length, etc.). Intrinsic properties are those an object has regardless of what other objects are like and regardless of its relationships with other objects (e.g., being made of copper). By contrast, an object’s extrinsic properties are those that depend on other entities (e.g., being the fastest car).[6]

With these distinctions in mind, it seems impossible that there be distinct abstract entities which are qualitatively indiscernible; each abstract entity is expected to have a unique, distinctive qualitative intrinsic nature (or property), which is giving reason for its metaphysical being. This wouldn’t be the case for any concrete entity given the initial assumption in this section. Therefore, the following criterion of discernability could be pondered:

\(x\) is an abstract object iff it is impossible for there to be an object which is qualitatively indiscernible from \(x\) but distinct from \(x\).

However, one can develop a counterexample to the above proposal, by considering two concrete objects that are indiscernible with respect to their intrinsic qualitative properties. Cowling (2017) considers the case of a possible world with only two perfectly spherical balls, \(A\) and \(B\), that share the same intrinsic qualitative properties and that are floating at a certain distance from each other. So \(A\) and \(B\) are distinct concrete objects but indiscernible in terms of their intrinsic qualitative properties.[7] But Lewis has pointed out that “if two individuals are indiscernible then so are their unit sets” (1986a, 84). If this is correct, \(\{A\}\) and \(\{B\}\) would be indiscernible, but (at least for some philosophers) distinct abstract objects, contrary to the discernibility criterion.[8] It is possible to counter-argue that we could happily accept impure sets as concrete; after all, it was always a bit unclear how they should be classified. Obviously, this has the problematic consequence of having some sets—pure sets—as abstract and other sets—impure sets—as concrete. But the idea that abstract objects have distinctive intrinsic natures allows one to establish a criterion less strong than that of discernibility; if an entity has a distinctive intrinsic nature, it cannot have a duplicate. So, the next criterion of non-duplication can be put forward:

\(x\) is an abstract object iff it is impossible for there to be an object which is a duplicate of \(x\) but distinct from \(x\).

But there is a more serious counterexample to this criterion, namely, immanent universals. These are purportedly concrete objects, for they are universals wholly present where their instances are. But this criterion renders them abstract. Take the color scarlet; it is a universal wholly present in every scarlet thing. Each of the scarlets in those things is an immanent universal. These are non-duplicable, but at least according to Armstrong (1978, I, 77, though see 1989, 98–99), they are paradigmatically concrete: spatiotemporally located, causally efficacious, etc. Despite how promising they initially seemed, the criteria of discernibility and non-duplicability do not appear to capture the abstract/concrete distinction.

3.6 The Way of Encoding

One of the most rigorous proposals about abstract objects has been developed by Zalta (1983, 1988, and in a series of papers). It is a formal, axiomatic metaphysical theory of objects (both abstract and concrete), and also includes a theory of properties, relations, and propositions. The theory explicitly defines the notion of an abstract object but also implicitly characterizes them using axioms.[9] There are three central aspects to the theory: (i) a predicate \(E!\) which applies to concrete entities and which is used to define a modal distinction between abstract and ordinary objects; (ii) a distinction between exemplifying relations and encoding properties (i.e., encoding 1-place relations); and (iii) a comprehension schema that asserts the conditions under which abstract objects exist.

(i) Since the theory has both a quantifier \(\exists\) and a predicate \(E!\), Zalta offers two interpretations of his theory (1983, 51–2; 1988, 103–4). On one interpretation, the quantifier \(\exists\) simply asserts there is and the predicate \(E!\) asserts existence. On this interpretation, a formula such as \(\exists x \neg E!x\), which is implied by the axioms described below, asserts “there is an object that fails to exist”. So, on this interpretation, the theory is Meinongian because it endorses non-existent objects. But there is a Quinean interpretation as well, on which the quantifier \(\exists\) asserts existence and the predicate \(E!\) asserts concreteness. On this interpretation, the formula \(\exists x \neg E!x\) asserts “there exists an object that fails to be concrete”. So, on this interpretation, the theory is Platonist, since it doesn’t endorse non-existents but rather asserts the existence of non-concrete objects. We’ll henceforth use the Quinean/Platonist interpretation.

In the more expressive, modal version of his theory, Zalta defines ordinary objects \((O!)\) to be those that might be concrete. The reason is that Zalta holds that possible objects (i.e., like million-carat diamonds, talking donkeys, etc.) are not concrete but rather possibly concrete. They exist, but they are not abstract, since abstract objects, like the number one, couldn’t be concrete. Indeed, Zalta’s theory implies that abstract objects \((A!)\) aren’t possibly concrete, since he defines them to be objects that aren’t ordinary (1993, 404):

\[\begin{align} O!x &=_\mathit{df} \Diamond E!x \\ A!x &=_\mathit{df} \neg O!x \end{align}\]

Thus, the ordinary objects include all the concrete objects (since \(E!x\) implies \(\Diamond E!x\)), as well as possible objects that aren’t in fact concrete but might have been. On this theory, therefore, being abstract is not the negation of being concrete. Instead, the definition validates an intuition that numbers, sets, etc., aren’t the kind of thing that could be concrete. Though Zalta’s definition of abstract seems to comport with the way of primitivism—take concrete as primitive, and then define abstract as not possibly concrete—it differs in that (a) axioms are stated that govern the conditions under which abstract objects exist (see below), and (b) the features commonly ascribed to abstract objects are derived from principles that govern the property of being concrete. For example, Zalta accepts principles such as: necessarily, anything with causal powers is concrete (i.e., \(\Box \forall x(Cx \to E!x)\)). Then since abstract objects are, by definition, concrete at no possible world, they necessarily fail to have causal powers.

(ii) The distinction between exemplifying and encoding is a primitive one and is represented in the theory by two atomic formulas: \(F^nx_1\ldots x_n\) \((x_1,\ldots ,x_n\) exemplify \(F^n\)) and \(xF^1\) \((x\) encodes \(F^1).\) While both ordinary and abstract objects exemplify properties, only abstract objects encode properties;[10] it is axiomatic that ordinary objects necessarily fail to encode properties \((O!x \to \Box \neg \exists FxF).\) Zalta’s proposal can be seen a positive metaphysical proposal distinct from all the others we have considered; a positive proposal that uses encoding as a key notion to characterize abstract objects. On this reading, the definitions and axioms of the theory convey what is meant by encoding and how it works. Intuitively, an abstract object encodes the properties by which we define or conceive of it, but exemplifies some properties contingently and others necessarily. Thus, the number 1 of Dedekind-Peano number theory encodes all and only its number-theoretic properties, and whereas it contingently exemplifies the property being thought about by Peano, it necessarily exemplifies properties such as being abstract, not having a shape, not being a building, etc. The distinction between exemplifying and encoding a property is also used to define identity: ordinary objects are identical whenever they necessarily exemplify the same properties while abstract objects are identical whenever they necessarily encode the same properties.

(iii) The comprehension principle asserts that for each expressible condition on properties, there is an abstract object that encodes exactly the properties that fulfill (satisfy) that condition. Formally: \(\exists x(A!x \:\&\: \forall F(xF \equiv \phi))\), where \(\phi\) has no free \(x\)s. Each instance of this schema asserts the existence of an abstract object of a certain sort. So, for example, where ‘\(s\)’ denotes Socrates, the instance \(\exists x(A!x \:\&\: \forall F(xF \equiv Fs))\) asserts that there is an abstract object that encodes exactly the properties that Socrates exemplifies. Zalta uses this object to analyze the complete individual concept of Socrates. But any condition \(\phi\) on conditions on properties with no free occurrences of \(x\) can be used to form an instance of comprehension. In fact, one can prove that the object asserted to exist is unique, since there can’t be two distinct abstract objects that encode exactly the properties satisfying \(\phi\).

The theory that emerges from (i)–(iii) is further developed with additional axioms and definitions. One axiom asserts that if an object encodes a property, it does so necessarily \((xF \to \Box xF).\) So the properties that an object encodes are not relative to any circumstance. Moreover, Zalta supplements his theory of abstract objects with a theory of properties, relations, and propositions. Here we describe only the theory of properties. It is governed by two principles: a comprehension principle for properties and a principle of identity. The comprehension principle asserts that for any condition on objects expressible without encoding subformulas, there is a property \(F\) such that necessarily, an object \(x\) exemplifies \(F\) if and only if \(x\) is such that \(\phi\), i.e., \(\exists F\Box \forall x(Fx \equiv \phi)\), where \(\phi\) has no encoding subformulas and no free \(F\text{s}\). The identity principle asserts that properties \(F\) and \(G\) are identical just in case \(F\) and \(G\) are necessarily encoded by the same objects, i.e., \(F\! =\! G =_\mathit{df} \Box \forall x(xF \equiv xG)\). This principle allows one to assert that there are properties that are necessarily equivalent in the classical sense, i.e., in the sense that \(\Box \forall x(Fx \equiv Gx)\), but which are distinct.[11]

Since \(\alpha\! =\! \beta\) is defined both when \(\alpha\) and \(\beta\) are both individual variables or both property variables, Zalta employs the usual principle for the substitution of identicals. Since all of the terms in his system are rigid, substitution of identicals preserves truth even in modal contexts.

The foregoing principles implicitly characterize both abstract and ordinary objects. Zalta’s theory doesn’t postulate any concrete objects, though, since that is a contingent matter. But his system does include the Barcan formula (i.e., \(\Diamond \exists xFx \to \exists x\Diamond Fx\)), and so possiblity claims like “there might have been talking donkeys” imply that there are (non-concrete) objects at our world that are talking donkeys at some possible world. Since Zalta adopts the view that ordinary properties like being a donkey necessarily imply concreteness, such contingently nonconcrete objects are ordinary.

Zalta uses his theory to analyze Plato’s Forms, concepts, possible worlds, Fregean numbers and Fregean senses, fictions, and mathematical objects and relations generally. However, some philosophers see his comprehension principle as too inclusive, for in addition to these objects, it asserts that there are entities like the round square or the set of all sets which are not members of themselves. The theory doesn’t assert that anything exemplifies being round and being square—the theory preserves the classical form of predication without giving rise to contradictions. But it does assert that there is an abstract object that encodes being round and being square, and that there is an abstract object that encodes the property of being a set that contains all and only non-self-membered sets. Zalta would respond by suggesting that such objects are needed not only to state truth conditions, and explain the logical consequences, of sentences involving expressions like “the round square” and “the Russell set”, but also to analyze the fictional characters of inconsistent stories and inconsistent theories (e.g., Fregean extensions).

It should be noted that Zalta’s comprehension principle for abstract objects is unrestricted and so constitutes a plenitude principle. This allows the theory to provide objects for arbitrary mathematical theories. Where \(\tau\) is a term of mathematical theory \(T\), the comprehension principle yields a unique object that encodes all and only the properties \(F\) that are attributed to \(\tau\) in \(T\) (Linsky & Zalta 1995, Nodelman & Zalta 2014).[12] Zalta’s theory therefore offers significant explanatory power, for it has multiple applications and advances solutions to a wide range of puzzles in different fields of philosophy.[13]

3.7 The Ways of Weakening Existence

Many philosophers have supposed that abstract objects exist in some thin, deflated sense. In this section we consider the idea that the abstract/concrete distinction might be defined by saying that abstract objects exist in some less robust sense than the sense in which concrete objects exist.

The traditional platonist conception is a realist one: abstract objects exist in just the same full-blooded sense that objects in the natural world exist—they are mind-independent, rather than artifacts of human endeavor or dependent on concrete objects in any way. But a number of deflationary, metatontological views, now established in the literature, are based on the idea that the problems traditional platonists face have to do with “some very general preconceptions about what it takes to specify an object” rather than with “the abstractness of the desired object” (Linnebo 2018, 42). These views suggest that abstract objects exist in some weaker sense. Various approaches therefore articulate what may be called the ways of weakening existence. One clear precedent is due to Carnap 1950 [1956], whose deflationary approach may go the furthest; Carnap rejects the metaphysical pursuit of what “really exists” (even in the case of concrete objects) since he maintains that the question “Do \(X\text{s}\) really exist?” are pseudo-questions (if asked independently of some linguistic framework).

But there are other ways to suggest that abstract objects have existence conditions that demand little of the world. For example, Linsky & Zalta (1995, 532) argued that the mind-independence and objectivity of abstract objects isn’t like that of physical objects: abstract objects aren’t subject to an appearance/reality distinction, they don’t exist in a ‘sparse’ way that requires discovery by empirical investigation, and they aren’t complete objects (e.g., mathematical objects are defined only by their mathematical properties). They use this conception to naturalize Zalta’s comprehension principle for abstract objects.

Other deflationary accounts develop some weaker sense in which abstract objects exist (e.g., as ‘thin’ objects). We further describe some of these proposals below and try to unpack the ways in which they characterize the weakened, deflationary sense of existence (even when such characterizations are not always explicit).

3.7.1 The Criterion of Linguistic Rules

Carnap held that claims about the “real” existence of entities (concrete or abstract) do not have cognitive content. They are pseudo-statements. However, he admitted: (a) that there are sentences in science that use terms that designate mathematical entities (such as numbers); and (b) that semantic analysis seems to require entities like properties and propositions. Since mathematical entities, properties, and propositions are traditionally considered abstract, he wanted to clarify how it is possible to accept a language referring to abstract entities without adopting what he considered pseudo-sentences about such entities’ objective reality. Carnap’s famous paper (1950 [1956]) contained an attempt to show that, without embracing Platonism, one can use a language referring to abstract entities.

To achieve these goals, Carnap begins by noting that before one can ask existence questions about entities of a determinate kind, one first has to have a language, or a linguistic framework, that allows one to speak about the kinds of entity in question. He then distinguishes ‘internal’ existence questions expressed within such a linguistic framework from ‘external’ existence questions about a framework. Only the latter ask whether the entities of that framework are objectively real. As we’ll see below, Carnap thought that internal existence questions within a framework can be answered, either by empirical investigation or by logical analysis, depending on the kind of entity the framework is about. By contrast, Carnap regards external questions (e.g., ‘Do \(X\text{s}\) exist?’, expressed either about, or independent of, a linguistic framework) as pseudo-questions: though they appear to be theoretical questions, in fact they are merely practical questions about the utility of the linguistic framework for science.

Carnap’s paper (1950 [1956]) considers a variety of linguistic frameworks, such as those for: observable things (i.e., the spatiotemporally ordered system of observable things and events), natural numbers and integers, propositions, thing properties, rational and real numbers, and spatiotemporal coordinate systems. Each framework is established by developing a language that typically includes expressions for one or more kinds of entities in question, expressions for properties of the entities in question (including a general category term for each kind of entity in question), and variables ranging over those entities. Thus, a framework for the system of observable things has expressions that denote such things (‘the Earth’, ‘the Eiffel Tower’, etc.), expressions for properties of such things (‘planet’, ‘made of metal’, etc.), and variables ranging over observables. The framework for natural numbers has expressions that denote them (‘0’, ‘2+5’), expressions for properties of the numbers (‘prime’, ‘odd’), including the general category term ‘number’), and variables ranging over numbers.

For Carnap, each statement in a linguistic framework should have a truth value that can be determined either by analytical or empirical methods. A statement’s truth value is analytically determinable if it is logically true (or false), or if it’s truth is determinable exclusively from the rules of the language or on the basis of semantic relationships among its component expressions. A statement is empirically determinable when it is confirmable (or disconfirmable) in the light of the perceived evidence. Note that the very attempt to confirm an empirical statement about physical objects on the basis of the evidence requires that one adopt the language of the framework of things. Carnap warns us, however, that “this must not be interpreted as if it meant … acceptance of a belief in the reality of the thing world; there is no such belief or assertion or assumption because it is not a theoretical question” (1950 [1956, 208]). For Carnap, to accept an ontology “means nothing more than to accept a certain form of language, in other words to accept rules for forming statements and for testing, accepting, or rejecting them” (1950 [1956, 208]).

Carnap takes this approach to every linguistic framework, no matter whether it is a framework about physical, concrete things, or a framework about abstract entities such as numbers, properties, concepts, propositions, etc. For him, the pragmatic reasons for accepting a given linguistic framework are that it has explanatory power, unifies the explanation of disparate kinds of data and phenomena, expresses claims more efficiently, etc. And we often choose a framework for a particular explanatory purpose. We might therefore choose a framework with expressions about abstract entities to carry out an explication (i.e., an elucidation of concepts), or to develop a semantics for natural language. For Carnap, the choice between platonism or nominalism is not a legitimate one; both are inappropriate attempts to answer an external pseudo-question.

As sketched earlier, the truth of such existence claims as ‘there are tables’ and ‘there are unicorns’, which are expressed within the framework for observable entities, is to be determined empirically, since empirical observations and investigations are needed. These statements are not true in virtue of the rules of the language. By contrast, existence claims such as ‘there are numbers’ (‘\(\exists xNx\)’) expressed within the framework of number theory, or ‘there is a property \(F\) such that both \(x\) and \(y\) are \(F\)’ (‘\(\exists F(Fx \:\&\: Fy)\)’) expressed within the framework of property theory, can be determined analytically. For these statements either form part of the rules of the language (e.g., expressed as axioms that govern the terms of the language) or are derivable from the rules of the language. When these statements are part of the rules that make up the linguistic framework, they are considered analytic, as are the existential statements that follow from those rules.[14]

All of the existence assertions just discussed are therefore internal to their respective linguistic frameworks. Carnap thinks that the only sense that can be given to talk of “existence” is an internal sense. Internal questions about the existence of things or abstract objects are not questions about their real metaphysical existence.[15] Hence, it seems more appropriate to describe his view as embodying a deflationary notion of object. For Carnap concludes “the question of the admissibility of entities of a certain type or of abstract entities in general as designata is reduced to the question of the acceptability of the linguistic framework for those entities” (1950 [1956, 217]).

Thus, for each framework (no matter whether it describes empirical objects, abstract objects, or a mix of both), one can formulate both simple and complex existential statements. According to Carnap, each simple existential statement is either empirical or analytic. If a simple statement is empirical, its truth value can be determined by a combination of empirical inquiry and consideration of the linguistic rules governing the framework; if the simple existential statement is analytic, then its truth value can be determined simply by considering the linguistic rules governing the framework. Whereas the simple existential statements that require empirical investigation assert the existence of possible concrete entities (like ‘tables’ or ‘unicorns’), the simple existential statements that are analytic assert the existence of abstract entities. Let us call this criterion for asserting the existence of abstract objects the criterion of linguistic rules.

The case of mixed frameworks poses some difficulties for the view. According to the Criterion of Linguistic Rules,

\(x\) is abstract iff “\(x\) exists” is analytic in the relevant language.

But this criterion suggests that impure sets, object-dependent properties, abstract artifacts, and the rest are not abstract. For this criterion appears to draw a line between certain pure abstract entities and everything else. The truth of simple existence statements about \(\{\textrm{Bob Dylan}\}\) or Dickens’ A Christmas Carol, which usually are considered abstract entities, does not depend solely on linguistic rules. The same goes for simple and complex existential statements with general terms such as ‘novel’, ‘legal statute’, etc.

In the end, though, Carnap doesn’t seem to be either a realist or nominalist about objects (abstract or concrete). Carnap rejects the question whether these objects are real in a metaphysical sense. But, contrary to the nominalist, he rejects the idea that we can truly deny the real existence of abstract objects (i.e., a denial that is external to a linguistic framework). This attitude, which settles the question of which framework to adopt on pragmatic grounds (e.g., which framework best helps us to make sense of the data to be explained), is the reason why we’ve labeled his view as a way of weakening existence. See the entry on Carnap for further details.

Proposals by other philosophers are related to Carnap’s view. Resnik (1997, Part Two) has put forward a postulational epistemology for the existence of mathematical objects. According to this view, all one has to do to ensure the existence of mathematical objects is to use a language to posit mathematical objects and to establish a consistent mathematical theory for them.[16] Nevertheless, their existence does not result from their being posited. Instead, we recognize those objects as existent because a consistent mathematical theory for them has been developed. Resnik requires both a linguistic stipulation for considering mathematical objects and a coherency condition for recognizing them as existent. Thomasson (2015, 30–34) advocates for an approach which she takes to be inherited from Carnap. She calls it easy ontology. Since she is not trying to find ultimate categories or a definitive list of basic (abstract or concrete) objects, she prefers a simpler kind of realism (see Thomasson 2015, 145–158). She argues that everyday uses of existential statements provide acceptable ontological commitments when those assertions are supported either by empirical evidence or merely by the rules of use that govern general terms (e.g., sortal terms); in both cases she says that “application conditions” for a general term are fulfilled (see Thomasson 2015, 86, 89–95). She, too, therefore offers a criterion of linguistic rules for accepting abstract objects. Given her defense of simple realism, it appears that she takes both observable objects and theoretical entities in science as concrete.

3.7.2 The Criterion of Minimalism

In what follows, two ways of formulating criteria for the abstract/concrete distinction are considered. The views start with the idea that our concept of an object allows for objects whose existence places very few demands on reality over and above the demands imposed by claims that do not mention abstract objects. Those philosophers who maintain this philosophical thesis are what Linnebo (2012) calls metaontological minimalists. Their proposals are typically put forward in connection with issues in the philosophy of mathematics, but then applied to other domains.

Parsons (1990), Resnik (1997), and Shapiro (1997) contend that, in the case of mathematical theories, coherence suffices for the existence of the objects mentioned in those theories.[17] They do not offer an explicit criterion for distinguishing abstract and concrete objects. Nevertheless, their proposals implicitly draw the distinction; abstract objects are those objects that exist in virtue of the truth of certain modal claims. In particular, the existence of mathematical objects is “grounded in” pure modal truths. For example, numbers exist “in virtue of” the fact that there could have been an \(\omega\)-sequence of objects; sets exist because there might be entities that satisfy the axioms of one or another set theory, etc. Since these pure modal truths are necessary, this explains why pure abstract objects exist necessarily. It also explains a sense in which they are insubstantial: their existence is grounded in truths that do not (on the face of it) require the actual existence of anything at all.[18]

Linnebo (2018) advances a proposal about how to conceive abstract objects by revising our understanding of Fregean biconditional principles of abstraction (see subsection 3.4). Some philosophers take these Fregean abstraction principles to be analytic sentences. For example, Hale & Wright (2001; 2009) consider the two sides of an abstraction principle as equivalent as a matter of meaning; they ‘carve up content’ in different ways (to use Frege’s metaphor). But Linnebo (2018, 13–14) rejects this view and the view that such biconditional principles are analytic.

He suggests instead that we achieve reference to abstract (and other objects) by means of a sufficiency operator, \(\Rightarrow\), which he takes to be a strengthening of the material conditional. He starts with conditional principles of the form “if \(Rab\), then \(f(a) \! =\! f(b)\)” (e.g., “if \(a\) and \(b\) are parallel, then the direction of \(a\) = the direction of \(b\)”) and takes the right-hand side to be reconceptualization of the left-hand side. He represents these claims as \(\phi \Rightarrow \psi\), where the new operator ‘\(\Rightarrow\)’ is meant to capture the intuitive idea that \(\phi\) is (conceptually) sufficient for \(\psi\), or all that is required for \(\psi\) is \(\phi\). For \(\phi\) to be sufficient for \(\psi\), sufficiency must be stronger than metaphysically implies but weaker than analytically implies (see Linnebo 2018, 15). The notion Linnebo considers is a ‘species of metaphysical grounding’. Hence, sufficiency statements allow us to conceptualize statements mentioning abstract objects (or other problematic objects) in terms of metaphysically less problematic or non-problematic objects.

It is important for Linnebo that sufficiency be asymmetric. He wouldn’t accept mutual sufficiency, i.e., principles of the form \(Rab \Leftrightarrow f(a) \! =\! f(b)\), since these would imply that both sides are equivalent as a matter of meaning. Instead, the point is that the seemingly unproblematic claim \(Rab\) renders the claim \(f(a) \! =\! f(b)\) unproblematic, and this is best expressed by sufficiency statements of the form \(Rab \Rightarrow f(a) \! =\! f(b)\), on which the left side grounds the right side. So Linnebo’s notion of reconceptualization is not the Fregean notion of recarving of content.

Moreover, in a sufficiency statement, Linnebo doesn’t require that the relation \(R\) be an equivalence relation; he requires only that \(R\) be symmetric and transitive. It need not be reflexive, for the domain might contain entities \(x\) such that \(\neg Rxx\) (e.g., in the case of the sufficiency statement for directions, not every object \(x\) in the domain is such that \(x\) is parallel with \(x\)—being parallel is restricted to lines). Linnebo calls such symmetric and transitive relations unity relations. When a sufficiency statement—\(Rab \Rightarrow f(a) \! =\! f(b)\)—holds, then new objects are identified. The new objects are specified in terms of the less problematic entities related by \(R\); for example, directions become specified by lines that are parallel. According to Linnebo, the parallel lines become specifications of the new objects. A unity relation \(R\) is therefore the starting point for developing a sufficient (but not necessary and sufficient) condition for reference.

Sometimes the new objects introduced by conditional principles do not make demands on reality; when that happens, they are said to be thin (for example, directions only require that there be parallel lines). However, when the new objects introduced by sufficiency statements make more substantial demands on reality, the objects are considered thick. Suppose \(Rab\) asserts \(a\) and \(b\) are spatiotemporal parts of the same cohesive and naturally bounded whole. Then \(a\) and \(b\) become specifications for physical bodies via the following principle: \(Rab \Rightarrow \mathrm{Body}(a) \! =\! \mathrm{Body}(b)\). In this case, the principle “makes a substantial demand on the world” because it requires checking that there are spatiotemporal parts constituting a continuous stretch of solid stuff (just looking at the spatiotemporal parts does not suffice to determine whether they constitute to a body; see Linnebo 2018, 45).

However, Linnebo does not identify being abstract with being thin (2012, 147), for there are thin objects in a relative sense that are not abstract, namely those that make no substantial demands on the world beyond those introduced in terms of some antecedently given objects. The mereological sum of your left hand and your laptop makes no demand on the world beyond the demands of its parts.[19] Instead, he suggests that abstract objects are those that are thin and that have a shallow nature. The notion of shallow nature is meant to capture “the intuitive idea that any question that is solely about \(F\text{s}\) has an answer that can be determined on the basis of any given specifications of these \(F\text{s}\)” (2018, 192–195). For example, directions have a shallow nature because any question about directions (e.g., are they orthogonal, etc.?) can be determined solely on the basis of the lines that specify them. Shapes have a shallow nature because any question about them (e.g., are they triangular, circular, etc.?) can be determined solely on the basis of their underlying concrete figures. By contrast, mereological sums of concrete objects are not shallow because there are questions about them that cannot be answered solely on the basis of their specifications; for instance, the weight of the mereological sum of your laptop and your left hand depends not only on their combination but also on the gravitational field in which they are located.[20]

Linnebo thus contrasts abstract objects, which are thin and have a shallow nature, with concrete objects, which do not have a shallow nature. Linnebo extends this view in several ways. He constructs an account of mathematical objects that goes beyond the way of abstraction principles by providing a reconstruction of set theory in terms of ‘dynamic abstraction’ (2018, ch. 3). This form of minimalism also allows for abstract objects of a mixed nature; namely, those that are thin relative to other objects. For example, the type of the letter ‘A’ is abstract because it is thin and has a shallow nature, but it is thin with respect the tokens of the letter ‘A’.

This view, as Linnebo himself admits, faces some problems. One of them is that the methodologies used by working mathematicians, such as classical logic, impredicative definitions, and taking arbitrary subcollections of infinite domains, seem to presuppose objects that are more independent, i.e., objects that don’t have a shallow nature (2018, 197; for a discussion of independence, see Section 4.1 of the entry on platonism in mathematics). Another problem (2018, 195) is that in order for an object to count as having a shallow nature, an intrinsic unity relation has to be available. An investigation is required to establish that there is such an intrinsic unity relation in each case. It is far from clear that a conditional principle with an intrinsic unity relation is available for each of problematic cases mentioned in this entry, such as chess, legal institutions or the English language. Finally, Linnebo doesn’t discuss the question of whether sets of concrete urelements are themselves abstract or concrete. At present, there may be an important question left open by his theory that other theories of abstract objects answer.

3.8 Eliminativism

We come finally to proposals that reject the abstract/concrete distinction. We can consider three cases. First, there are the nominalists who both reject abstract entities and reject the distinction as illegitimate. They focus on arguing against the formulations of the distinction proposed in the literature. A second group of eliminativists reject real objects of any kind, thereby dismissing the distinction as irrelevant; these are the ontological nihilists. A final group of eliminativists agree that there are prototypical cases of concrete objects and abstract objects, but conclude that a rigorous philosophical distinction can’t be made clearly enough to have any explanatory power (see Sider 2013, 287). This recalls Lewis’ pessimism (1986a, 81–86) about the possibility of establishing a distinction that is sufficiently clear to be theoretically interesting.

4. Further Reading

Berto & Plebani (2015) provide an useful introduction to ontology and metaontology. Putnam (1971) makes the case for abstract objects on scientific grounds. Bealer (1993) and Tennant (1997) present a priori arguments for the necessary existence of abstract entities. Fine (2002) systematically studies of abstraction principles in the foundations of mathematics. Wetzel (2009) examines the type-token distinction, argues that types are abstract objects while the tokens of those types are their concrete instances, and shows how difficult it is to paraphrase away the many references to types that occur in the sciences and natural language. Zalta (2020) develops a type-theoretic framework for higher-order abstract objects (which includes abstract properties and abstract relations in addition to ordinary properties and relations) and offers both comparisons to other type theories and applications in philosophy and linguistics. Moltmann (2013) investigates the extent to which abstract objects are needed when developing a semantics of natural language; in this book, and also in her article (2020), she defends a ‘core-periphery’ distinction and suggests that natural language ontology contains references to abstract objects only in its periphery. Falguera and Martínez-Vidal (2020) have edited a volume in which contributors present positions and debates about abstract objects of different kinds and categories, in different fields in philosophy.


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  • Azzouni, Jody, 1997a, “Applied Mathematics, Existential Commitment and the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Thesis,” Philosophia Mathematica, 3(5): 193–209.
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  • –––, 2004, Deflating Existential Consequence: A Case for Nominalism, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195159888.001.0001
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  • Baker, Alan, 2005, “Are There Genuine Mathematical Explanations of Physical Phenomena?” Mind, 114(454): 223–238.
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  • Berto, Francesco, and Plebani, Matteo, 2015, Ontology and Metaontology: A Contemporary Guide, London; New York: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Bolzano, Bernard, 1837, Wissenschaftslehre, Sulzbach: J. E. v. Seidel.
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  • Bueno, Otávio, 2008a, “Nominalism and Mathematical Intuition,” Protosociology, 25: 89–107.
  • –––, 2008b, “Truth and Proof,” Manuscrito, 31(1): 419–440.
  • –––, 2020, “Contingent Abstract Objects,” in Falguera & Martínez-Vidal (eds.) 2020, pp. 91–109.
  • Burgess, John P., 2005, Fixing Frege, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Burgess, John P., and Rosen, Gideon, 1997, A Subject with No Object: Strategies for Nominalistic Interpretation of Mathematics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Carnap, Rudolf, 1950 [1956], “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 4(11): 20–40; reprinted with revisions in Rudolf Carnap, Meaning and Necessity, expanded edition, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1956, pp. 205–221.
  • Chalmers, David, 1996, The Conscious Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Colyvan, Mark, 2001, The Indispensability of Mathematics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2010, “There Is No Easy Road to Nominalism,” Mind, 119(474): 285–306. doi:10.1093/mind/fzq014
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This entry was revised, updated, and expanded in 2021 by José L. Falguera and Concha Martínez-Vidal. The author of the previous version of this entry, Gideon Rosen, remains credited on this entry since significant content in Sections 1, 2.1, 3.5.1–3.5.3, and 4 has been retained from the previous version.

Copyright © 2021 by
José L. Falguera <joseluis.falguera@usc.es>
Concha Martínez-Vidal <mconcepcion.martinez@usc.es>
Gideon Rosen

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