Material Constitution

First published Wed Feb 25, 2009; substantive revision Thu Sep 9, 2021

What is the relationship between a clay statue and the lump of clay from which it is formed? We might say that the lump constitutes the statue, but what is this relation of material constitution? Some insist that constitution is identity, on the grounds that distinct material objects cannot occupy the same place at the same time. Others argue that constitution is not identity, since the statue and the lump differ in important respects. Still others take cases like this to motivate revisionary views about persistence, identity, or existence.

This article presents some of the most important puzzles of material constitution and evaluates some of the most popular replies.

1. The Puzzles

Puzzles of material constitution played an important role in the development of philosophy and continue to be a source of much debate today. Here, we introduce four of the most famous puzzles.

The Debtor’s Paradox. The ancient playwright Epicharmus tells the tale of a poor but resourceful debtor. When approached for payment, the man responds with a riddle. If you add a pebble to a collection of pebbles, you no longer have the same number. If you add a length to a cubit, you no longer have the same measure. In the same way, if you add a bit of matter to an existing portion of matter, you no longer have the same entity. Since man is nothing more than a material object whose matter is constantly changing, we do not survive from one moment to the next. The debtor concludes that he is not the same person who incurred the debt, so he cannot be held responsible for the payment. The exasperated creditor then strikes the debtor, who protests the abusive treatment. The creditor expresses sympathy, but points out that he cannot be held accountable for the assault. After all, material change has already taken place so, by the debtor’s own line of reasoning, the guilty party is no longer present. The scene is intended to be comedic, but the argument is no laughing matter. The man who incurred the debt was constituted by one portion of matter, M1. The man who is approached for payment is constituted by a distinct portion of matter, M2 (let us assume, for the sake of argument, that M2 consists of M1, together with some new matter). If constitution is identity, then the debtor’s reasoning is sound: the man approached for payment is not the man who incurred the debt. More generally, this version of the argument would show that it is impossible for material objects to survive the addition of any new parts. (Note: the claim that constitution is identity should not be confused with the thesis of “composition as identity”. On the latter view, see Section 8 of the entry on identity.)

The Puzzle of Dion and Theon. The Stoic philosopher Chrysippus asks us to consider the case of Dion and Theon, where Dion is a normal human being and Theon is a large part of Dion consisting of everything but Dion’s right foot. Suppose now that the right foot is removed. Theon obviously survives the operation, for his parts remain completely unchanged. But, in that case, it seems as if Dion does not survive the operation, for otherwise we would have two people in the same place at the same time. Hence, Dion does not survive the loss of his foot. More generally, the argument would show that material objects cannot survive the loss of any constituent parts. (A modern version of the puzzle, due to Peter Geach, concerns Tibbles and Tib, where Tibbles is a cat and Tib a cat-part consisting of everything but Tibbles’s tail.)

The Ship of Theseus Puzzle. The ancient historian Plutarch recounts the story of the famous ship of Theseus, whose parts were all gradually replaced as they wore down. The resulting ship was eventually displayed in Athens, where philosophers debated whether it was still the original ship of Theseus, despite having none of the original parts. In the modern era, Thomas Hobbes added a further twist to the story. Suppose that a custodian collected the original planks as they were removed from the ship and later put them back together in the original arrangement. In this version of the story, we are left with two seafaring vessels, one on display in Athens and one in the possession of the custodian. But where is the original Ship of Theseus? Some will say that the ship is with the museum, since ships can survive the complete replacement of parts (provided, at least, that the change is sufficiently gradual). Others will say that the ship is with the custodian, since ships can survive being disassembled and reassembled. Both answers seems correct, but this means that, at the end of the story, the ship of Theseus is in two places at once. More generally, the argument suggests that it is possible for one material object to exist in two places at the same time. We get an equally implausible result by working backwards. After all, there are clearly two ships at the end of the story, but both ships were also around at the beginning, for the reasons just given. So, at the beginning of the story, there were two ships of Theseus occupying the same place at the same time—one of which would go on to the museum and one of which would end up with the custodian.

The Puzzle of the Statue and the Clay. Various ancient philosophers, including Aristotle, pointed out that statues seem to differ in important respects from the portions of matter from which they are made. Suppose that, on Monday, a sculptor purchases an unformed lump of clay, which he names ‘Lump’. Suppose further that, on Tuesday, the artist sculpts the clay into the form of the biblical king David and names his statue ‘David’. It is tempting to say that, in this case, there is only one object in the sculptor’s hands—David just is Lump. But, on reflection, this identification is problematic, since Lump and David seem to differ in many respects. For example, Lump existed on Monday, whereas David did not. Moreover, Lump could survive being squashed tomorrow, whereas David could not. However, this would imply that Lump and David and numerically distinct entities, since Leibniz’s Law tells us that numerical identity requires qualitiative sameness. The upshot, once again, is that it is possible for two material objects to exist in the same place at the same time.

These four puzzles differ in details, but raise a common problem. (A fifth puzzle—the problem of the many—raises significantly different issues and is dealt with in a separate entry.) We will focus on the case of the statue and the clay, and we will formulate the puzzle as follows:

  1. David did not exist on Monday (but does exist on Tuesday).
  2. Lump did exist on Monday (and also exists on Tuesday).
  3. If (1) and (2), then David is not identical to Lump.
  4. [So] David is not identical to Lump.

The premises of the argument are plausible, but the conclusion is problematic, for it implies the possibility of spatially coincident objects—something that we ordinarily take to be impossible.

Generally speaking, there are five possible replies to this puzzle. First, one could simply accept (4) and admit that David is not identical to Lump. We consider this response in sections 2 and 3, where we discuss the constitution view of David Wiggins (1968) and the temporal parts theory of David Lewis (1976). Second, one could deny (1) by either denying the existence of David or by insisting that David existed on Monday. We consider these responses in section 4, where we discuss the eliminativist views of Peter Unger (1979), Peter van Inwagen (1990), and Roderick Chisholm (1979). Third, one could deny (2) by either denying the existence of Lump (as the eliminativist does) or by claiming that Lump does not survive being shaped into a statue. We consider this second option in section 5, where we discuss the dominant kinds view of Michael Burke (1992). Fourth, one could deny (3) by rejecting the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law. We consider this response in section 6, where we discuss the relative identity theory of Peter Geach (1967). Fifth and finally, one could respond to the paradox by insisting that the underlying issues are in some sense verbal, so that there is no fact of the matter about which premise (if any) is false. We consider this response in section 7, where we discuss the deflationist views of Rudolf Carnap (1950) and others. (For an alternative survey of these issues, along with a collection of relevant papers, see Rea 1987.)

Note that, while our focus throughout will be on material objects, similar problems arise for other kinds of entities, including events, properties, and groups—see, for example, Pfeifer (1989), Shoemaker (2003), and Uzquiano (2004a).

2. Coincident Objects

The most popular reply to the puzzle of material constitution is to embrace the conclusion: Lump and Statue exist at the same place at the same time, but differ in their historical and modal properties, so it is possible for there to be two material objects in the same place at the same time. This view is sometimes referred to as the constitution view since it holds that the statue is constituted by, but not identical to, the lump of clay from which it is formed. In a slogan: constitution is not identity (Johnston 1992). Constitution is distinguished from identity insofar as it is an asymmetric relation—Lump constitutes Statue, but not vice versa. Constitution is also taken to be a dependence relation—as David Wiggins (1968, p. 91) puts it, the statue “consists in” and is “nothing over and above” the lump of clay. (For more on the nature of constitution, see Wasserman 2004.)

The constitution view is extremely popular, having been defended by Wiggins (1968), Doepke (1982), Lowe (1983, 1995, 2003), Simons (1985), Yablo (1987), Oderberg (1996), Baker (1997, 2000, 2002), Thomson (1998), Shoemaker (1999), Fine (2003), Koslicki (2008), and many others. Indeed, the view is so common, it is sometimes called “the standard account” (Burke 1992). Why not join the crowd?

“Just try to walk through a wall,” quips the skeptic. “Two things can’t be in the same place at the same time!” We will call this the impenetrability objection, since it appeals to the common idea that impenetrability is the mark of the material (Descartes 1641 [1993, p. 13]).

The constitution theorist has a ready reply to the this objection. Unlike you and the wall, David and Lump share the same parts, and this material coincidence explains how they are able to occupy the same place at the same time (Wiggins 1968). Material coincidence also helps to answer another common complaint. Suppose that Lump weighs 10lbs. David will obviously weigh the same. So why don’t you get a reading of 20lbs. when you place both on the scale? (Lewis 1986, p. 252) Answer: because the two objects share the same weight as a result of sharing the same parts (Zimmerman 1995, p. 89, fn. 57). Here it is important to note that we do not determine the weight of a wall, for example, by summing up the weight of its bricks and its constituent molecules, since that would involve counting some parts more than once. According to the constitution theorist, weighing David and Lump would involve the same kind of double-counting.

Material coincidence may explain how spatial coincidence is possible, but what about material coincidence itself? On the face of it, the claim that different things can be made up out of the exact same parts is no more plausible than the claim that different things can be located in the exact same place. We will call this the extensionality objection, since it appeals to the common idea that wholes are individuated by their parts in the same way that sets are individuated by their members.

One obvious response to this objection is to reject extensionality (Thomson 1983). However, this move comes at a cost since it requires giving up on classical mereology. A second response is to deny that objects like David and Lump share all their material parts. For example, Baker (2000, p. 81) suggests that David’s nose is a part of David, but not a part of Lump. A third response is to grant that coinciding objects share all their material parts, while insisting that they differ in some non-material aspect (see, for example, Rea 1998, McDaniel 2001. Paul 2002, Koslicki 2008, and Brower 2014). The most familiar version of this view traces back to Aristotelian idea that material objects are compounds of matter and form (see Aristotle’s metaphysics).

Whether or not David and Lump share all the same parts, it is clear that they share many of the same properties. Both have the same weight, the same size, and the same shape. Indeed, the two seem to be perfect duplicates, right down to their sub-atomic structure. But this raises a puzzle: how could duplicates of this kind differ in their temporal properties, persistence conditions, and the like? We will refer to this as the grounding objection since it appeals to the common idea that such properties must be grounded in more basic features of an object. (For different statements of this worry, see Simons 1987, pp. 225–6, Heller 1990, pp. 30–2, Burke 1992, Zimmerman 1995, pp. 87–8, and Olson 2001. The objection is sometimes put in terms of supervenience, but, as Bennett 2004 points out, supervenience is importantly different from grounding.)

The natural response to this objection is to appeal to differences in kind (Wiggins 1980). Lump can survive being squashed or rolled into a ball, for example, since Lump is a mere lump of clay. David, however, is a statue, and statues cannot survive changes of these kinds. This response, however, pushes back the explanatory challenge: how could intrinsic duplicates like Lump and David differ in kind? One option would be to appeal to relational differences. For example, Lynne Rudder Baker suggests that David—unlike Lump—is a statue because it is essentially related to an artworld—it is the sort of thing that is admired, reviewed, and discussed (Baker 2000, pp. 35–46). The problem is that this seems to get things backwards, for it is natural to say that David is admired, reviewed, and discussed because it is a statue (rather than a mere lump of clay). A related idea is to explain the difference in kind by appealing to differences in historical facts (Burke 1992, p. 15). For example, one might say that Lump is a mere lump of clay because it was created by a claymaker whose intent was to create a lump, whereas David was created by a sculptor whose intent was to create a statue. One worry for this line of response is that it cannot be extended to every case of constitution. For example, Alan Gibbard (1975) asks us to imagine a case in which an artist sculpts a statue of the biblical giant Goliath in two pieces—bottom and top—and then brings those pieces together, simultaneously creating a statue (‘Goliath’) and a new piece of clay (‘Lumpl’). The next day, the artist smashes the statue to bits, simultaneously destroying both the statue and the lump. The crucial feature of this case is that Lumpl and Goliath share all of their historical properties and appear to stand in the same relations to everything else around them. For example, both are created at the same time, by the same person, with a single set of intentions. Both are put on display in the same galleries and gazed upon by the same patrons. Both are destroyed at the same time, in exactly the same way. In short, Lumpl and Goliath seem to share all their relational properties while still differing in kind, in which case the explanatory challenge remains unanswered. (For recent discussions of this issue, see DeRosset 2011, Einheuser 2011, Sutton 2012, Saenz 2015, and Koslicki 2018.)

At this point we have reviewed the three most common complaints about the constitution view: the impenetrability worry, the extensionality objection, and the grounding problem. A fourth and final concern is what we might call the anthropic objection (see, for example, Sosa 1987, Sider 2001, pp. 156–8, and section 2.5 of the entry on ordinary objects.) So far, we have focused on the question of whether two material objects—like David and Lump—could exist at the same place and time. But why stop at two? Consider the mereological sum of David and Lump’s material simples. Those simples existed long before David or Lump came into existence, so the sum would appear to be another object in addition to the statue and the lump. But why stop at three? Consider the instatue that coincides with David whenever that statue is indoors and then goes out of existence whenever David is taken outside (cf. Hirsch 1982, p. 32). There is also the tablestatue (that exists when and only when the statue is on a table), the litstatue (that exists when and only when the statue is in the light), the dinnerstatue (that exists only when the statue’s sculptor is eating dinner), and so on. Ernest Sosa (1987) refers to this multiplication of entities as “the explosion of reality”.

Defenders of the constitution view may try to run from the explosion and insist that there are only two (or three, or four) objects in the same place at the same time. But what could justify this exclusionary attitude? Granted, we do not normally concern ourselves with instatues, litstatues, and the rest. Ordinary English does not even have sortal terms for discussing these entities. But these are facts about our interests and linguistic decisions. Why should we think that there is a correspondence between the sortal terms in our language and the kinds of objects in the world? One way to explain this correspondence would be to claim that reality is determined, in some sense, by our conceptual scheme. But the constitution view is normally offered as an alternative to anti-realist views of this kind. Perhaps, then, the constitution theorist should accept Sosa’s explosion and say that our inattentiveness does not exclude things like instatues and litstatues from the realm of being? Perhaps all of those objects exist at the same place at the same time, sharing the same parts and the same matter (Yablo 1987, Bennett 2004, Hawthorne 2006, Fairchild 2019)? Perhaps. But this brings us very close to adopting a different view of material constitution. It is to that view that we now turn.

3. Temporal Parts

Consider the case of Interstate 5. I-5 runs through Washington, Oregon, and California, but the road is not wholly present in any of those states. Rather, I-5 exists in different states by having different road segments in each—there is the Washington segment of I-5, the Oregon segment, etc. According to the temporal parts theory (or four-dimensionalism), persistence through time is exactly like that. (Quine 1953, Lewis 1976, Sider 2001) Just as roads exist at different places by having distinct spatial parts at those places, material objects exist at different times by having distinct temporal parts at those times. In the case of David Lewis, for example, there is the 1970s segment, the 1980s segment, and so on. More formally, we can say that x is a temporal part of y at (or during) t if and only if (i) x is a part of y at (or during) t, (ii) x overlaps everything that is a part of y at (or during) t, and (iii) x exists only at (or during) t (Sider 2001, p. 60).

Consider now the case of U.S. Route 29, which runs from the western suburbs of Baltimore to Pensacola, Florida. As U.S. 29 passes through Charlotte it becomes Tyson St.—a street wholly located within the state of North Carolina. The two roadways in this case are not identical, but they are partly identical, for Tyson St. is identical to a proper part of U.S. 29. According to the temporal parts theorist, the case of the statue and the clay is similar. Lump exists for some period of time and then “turns into” David. If the sculptor is unsatisfied with her work and squashes the statue, then Lump—but not David—continues to exist, in which case David is nothing more than a proper temporal part of Lump.

There are, of course, various arguments for and against this view. (See the entry on temporal parts.) Here, we focus on the relevance of the doctrine to the puzzles of material constitution and, in particular, to the challenges facing the constitution view.

The impenetrability objection. The first problem for the constitution view was that it allowed for two material objects to exist in the same place at the same time. The temporal parts theorist avoids this objection for he will say that, whenever Lump and David exist, there is a single object that exactly occupies the relevant location—a temporal part that is shared by both David and Lump. Of course, those two objects will be partly present at the same location, but this is no more problematic than two roads being partly present at the same place by sharing a common road segment.

The extensionality objection. The second problem for the constitution view was that it allowed for two objects to be composed of all the same parts. The temporal parts theorist avoids this problem in the case of the statue and the lump, since he will say that those objects share some, but not all, of the same temporal parts. Of course, those objects will have all the same parts when they both exist, but this is no more problematic than two roads sharing all the same parts where they overlap.

The grounding objection. The third challenge for the constitution theorist was to identify a ground for the different features of coinciding objects. The same challenge can be put to the friend of temporal parts. In the case of the statue and the clay, for example, we have two objects that are perfect duplicates whenever they both exist—in virtue of what, then, do they differ with respect to their temporal properties, persistence conditions, and so on? The temporal parts theorist could follow the constitution theorist in claiming that the relevant objects differ in kind, for example, in virtue of their historical properties or he could simply insist that the difference in kind is grounded in the fact that the two objects have different temporal parts (Wasserman 2002).

The anthropic objection. The last worry for the constitution view was that it postulated an unexplained correspondence between the sortal terms in our language and the kinds of objects in the world. The temporal parts theorist avoids this worry as well. On the standard four-dimensionalist picture, persisting objects are ultimately composed of instantaneous temporal parts and, for any collection of these parts, there is a further object that they compose (Quine 1960, p. 171). For example, there is an object composed of all and only the temporal parts of David when that statue is indoors. This would be what we earlier called an “instatue”. There is also an object composed of all and only the temporal parts of David when that statue is in the light. This is what we earlier called a “litstatue”. In this way, the temporal parts theorist finds a place for all of the objects introduced earlier, and thereby avoids an implausible correlation between the sortal terms of our language and the kinds of objects in the world. (Of course, some people think that this solution is worse than the problem—see, for example, Markosian 1998, p. 228, Elder 2008: 440, and Korman 2015: Chapter 4.)

Unfortunately, the temporal parts solution cannot be extended to the case Lumpl and Goliath since those objects exist at all of the same times and thus share the same temporal parts. The four-dimensionalist who accepts extensionality will therefore be forced to conclude that Lumpl is identical to Goliath. This, however, is problematic, since those objects seem to differ in their modal properties. Lumpl, for example, could survive beings squashed, whereas Goliath could not.

The most popular reply to this worry is due to David Lewis (1971, 1986), who defends a counterpart theory of de re modal ascriptions. According to Lewis, ordinary objects like Goliath exist in only one possible world, but have counterparts at other worlds that serve as truth-makers for de re modal ascriptions. Crucially, whether or not something counts as a counterpart of Goliath (for example) will depend on what respects of similarity are at issue. Since the name ‘Goliath’ is associated with the kind statue, a sentence like “Goliath could survive being squashed” will normally be true (relative to a context) just in case Goliath has some statue-counterparts that survive squashing (i.e., some counterparts that survive squashing as statues). Presumably, there are no such counterparts, so that sentence will express a falsehood. Meanwhile, the name ‘Lumpl’ is associate with kind lump of clay, so a sentence like “Lumpl could survive being squashed” will be true just in case Lumpl has a lump-counterpart that survives being squashed. Presumably, there are some such objects at other worlds, so that sentence will express a truth. Moreover, this will be the case even if the temporal parts theorist is correct and a single object is picked out by both ‘Lumpl’ and ‘Goliath’. The key point is that the phrase ‘could survive being squashed’ expresses different properties when combined with these names, so Leibniz’s Law has no application. (For objections to counterpart theory, see Fara and Williamson 2005.)

One worry for this response is that it cannot account for apparent non-modal differences between Lumpl and Goliath. For example, Kit Fine (2003) argues that Lumpl, but not Goliath, might be well-made, and that Goliath, but not Lumpl, might be Romanesque. Since these are not modal ascriptions, counterpart theory has no application. As a result, it is unclear what the temporal parts theorist is to say about apparent differences of this sort. (For more on this issue, see the exchange between Fine 2006, Frances 2006, and King 2006.)

4. Eliminativism

The simplest way of avoiding the puzzles of material constitution is to deny the existence of some of the objects that give rise to those problems. For example, if one claims that there are no such things as statues and lumps of clay, then there is no threat of having a statue and a lump of clay in the same place at the same time.

This kind of eliminativism is often associated with Peter Unger (1979), who (at one time) defended the thesis of mereological nihilism. Nihilism is the view that there are there are no composite objects (i.e., there are no objects with proper parts—only atoms exist). On this view, there are no statues, animals or any other macroscopic object made up out of smaller parts. Since the nihilist denies the existence of statues in general, he will deny the existence of the particular statue, David. Hence, he will reject the very first premise of the original argument for coincident objects. He will also reject the second premise of that argument, since he will deny the existence of the relevant lump. (Note that Unger’s use of ‘nihilism’ differs slightly from its current meaning—see van Inwagen 1990, p. 73.)

The nihilist makes two main claims, both of which can be challenged. First, there is the negative thesis that there are no composite objects and no statues in particular. The most common reaction to this claim is an incredulous stare. For many, the existence of composite objects is a Moorean fact, more certain than any premise that could be used to argue against it. The nihilist may reply that we can make sense of our statue-talk by paraphrasing it into claims about simples. For example, instead of saying that there is a statue on the table, we can say that there are some simples arranged “statuewise” on top of some other simples arranged “tablewise”. Similarly for other talk of statues, ships, and other composite objects. (For more on this paraphrasing strategy, see van Inwagen 1990, chapter 10. For worries, see O’Leary-Hawthorne and Michael 1996, Uzquiano 2004b, and McGrath 2005.) This brings us to the nihilist’s positive thesis that there are material simples. This claim can also be challenged. After all, it was once thought that chemical atoms were fundamental particles, until the discovery of protons and neutrons. And it was thought that protons and neutrons were mereological simples, until the discovery of quarks. One might think it is possible for this process goes on without limit, in which case our world would be gunky (i.e., it would have no simples as proper parts). The problem is that this possibility is inconsistent with nihilism, which seems to imply that a material world must contain material simples (Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, Schaffer 2003).

A second version of eliminativism is associated with Peter van Inwagen (1990), who defends the view that living objects are the only composite objects. This view is closely related to nihilism, but has one notable advantage—it allows for the existence of human persons. For example, in the case of Dion and Theon, van Inwagen will say that Dion exists at the beginning of the story, since the activity of the relevant simples constitutes a life (the life of Dion). But van Inwagen will deny that Theon exists, for the activity of the relevant simples only constitutes a part of Dion’s life at that time. Of course, the activity of those same simples constitutes a life after Dion’s right foot is removed, at which point the simples come to compose Dion. More generally, van Inwagen denies the existence of what he calls “arbitrary undetached parts”:

The Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts (DAUP): For every material object m, time t, and regions r1 and r2, if m occupies r1 at t and r2 is a sub-region of r1, then there is a part of m that occupies r2 at t. (cf. van Inwagen 1981, p. 123)

Let m = Dion, t = a pre-operation time, r1 = the region occupied by Dion at t, and r2 = the region corresponding to all of Dion except for his right foot at t. If DAUP were correct, then Theon would exist, for it would just be the proper part of Dion that occupies r2 at t. Van Inwagen denies the existence of Theon, so he rejects the general principle as well. (For more on DAUP and material constitution, see van Inwagen 1981, Olson 1995, and Parsons 2004.)

Van Inwagen’s version of eliminativism is subject to the same objections raised against nihilism, but it also faces problems of its own. Here is one worry. There are borderline cases where it is vague whether or not the activity of some simples constitutes a life (consider, for example, the question of when, exactly, a person’s life comes to an end). But, if it is vague whether the activity of some simples constitutes a life then, according to van Inwagen, it is vague how many objects exist. But it cannot be vague how many objects exist, since cardinality claims can be made in a part of language where nothing is vague. Suppose, for example, that there are exactly one-million simples and that it is vague whether or not the activity of those simples constitutes a life. Now consider the numerical sentence that asserts the existence of (at least) one-million and one objects. (A numerical sentence is a first-order sentence asserting the existence of some objects. For example, the numerical sentence that there exist at least two objects is: ∃xy(xy).) If van Inwagen is correct, then it is indeterminate whether or not the relevant numerical sentence is true, in which case one of the constituent expressions—‘∃’, ‘x’, ‘y’, ‘~’, ‘=’—must be vague. Yet philosophers have claimed that the terms of first-order logic do not admit of borderline cases. (For a more detailed presentation of this argument, see Lewis 1986, pp. 212–213, Sider 2001, pp. 120–132, and section 2.2 of the entry on ordinary objects. For potential replies, see Hirsch 2002b, Liebesman and Eklund 2007, and van Inwagen 1990, Chapter 13.)

A third version of eliminativism is often associated with Roderick Chisholm (1973), who defends the doctrine of mereological essentialism: for any x and y, if x is a part of y then, necessarily, y exists only if x is a part of y. This doctrine is an “eliminativist” view insofar as it denies the existence of mereologically ductile objects. For example, in the Ship of Theseus case it is natural to think that there is a ship which survives the replacement of at least some of its parts. The essentialist’s response to the paradox is to deny this apparent truism. In the same way, the Debtor’s Paradox and the Puzzle of Deon and Theon only arise on the assumption that human persons can gain and lose parts. The essentialist solves these puzzles by rejecting this assumption. The Puzzle of the Statue and the Clay remains problematic, however, for that example involved a change in shape, rather than a change in parts. In order to respond to this puzzle, the essentialist must endorse an additional principle: for any xs and for any y, if the xs compose y then, necessarily, the xs exist only if they compose y. This thesis says that the whole is essential to the parts, so that whenever you have the same parts, you have the same whole. The defender of this thesis will say that, in our earlier case, Lump exists on both Monday and Tuesday, for the same clay parts are there on both days. The same is true of David. The parts that compose David on Tuesday are present on Monday, in which case the first premise of the earlier argument is false—David did exist on Monday. In that case, the defender of mereological essentialist is free to identify David and Lump and thereby avoid any commitment to coincident objects.

Viewed from one perspective, the essentialist’s picture can seem intuitive. When one rearranges the dining room furniture, one does not bring new furniture into existence—one simply brings existing furniture into a new arrangement. In the same way, rearranging the material contents of the universe does not bring new material objects into existence—it simply puts existing objects into new arrangements. Thus, when the artist sculpts the lump of clay she gives that object a new form, but does not create a new object. Viewed from another perspective, however, this picture seems completely absurd, for it implies that if we annihilate a single particle of David, the entire statue will be destroyed. More frightening still, if we annihilate a single particle from your body, then you will no longer exist. The mereological essentialist may reply that, if we were to annihilate a particle from David, there would still be a statue left in its place—call it David*. David* would not be identical to David, but it would be very similar. For example, it would have roughly the same mass, the same shape, and the same location. In Chisholm’s terminology, this would be a “statue-successor” of David, and the existence of this successor gives us a loose sense in which “the statue” survives. Here is a second worry for the essentialist, focusing on the idea that the whole is essential to the parts. Imagine that the artist who sculpted David becomes dissatisfied with her work and squashes the statue while preserving all the bits of clay. If the whole is essential to the parts, then it would follow that David (the thing that was previously composed of those parts) still exists. But this seems absurd—statues cannot survive being squashed. We get an equally absurd result in the opposite direction. David’s parts existed prior to the sculpting, so David itself existed prior to the sculpting. But how can a statue exist before it is sculpted? The eliminativist might reply that the thing which is (currently) a statue existed prior to the sculpting, but it was not (then) a statue. In this sense, at least, we can say that the statue did not exist prior to sculpting. Similarly, the thing which is (currently) a statue may survive being squashed, but it will not (then) be a statue. So, in that sense, the statue will not survive the squashing. (For more details on this paraphrasing strategy, see Chisholm 1976, chapter 3.)

5. Dominant Kinds

In the previous section, we examined various ways of resisting the first premise of our original argumentthe claim that David did not exist on Monday. Let us now turn our attention to the second premise: Lump did exist on Monday. Eliminativists like Unger and van Inwagen will reject this premise, since they deny the existence of objects like Lump. But there are other accounts that reject this premise as well. One such theory is the dominant kind view defended by Michael Burke (1994, 1997a, 1997b).

Burke begins with the assumption that there is a single object present on Tuesday. For the moment, let us call this object “Rex”. Burke assumes that Rex is both a lump of clay and a statue. This is a perfectly natural assumption, but it is also problematic. As we have seen, kinds are associated with different persistence conditions. For example, unlike the kind statue, the kind lump of clay is associated with the property of being able to survive squashing. Now consider the following principle: for any object o and kind K, if o is a K, then o has the persistence conditions associated with K. (Burke 1994, p. 598) If this principle is correct, then we have a problem. Rex is both a lump of clay and a statue, so the principle tells us that it is able to survive squashing and that it is not. Burke concludes that the proposed principle is false—it is possible for an object to be a K without having the persistence conditions associated with that kind. In particular, Burke claims that Rex is a statue and a lump of clay, but it only has the persistence conditions associated with one of those kinds. Which one? Burke answers that, in general, an object has the persistence conditions associated with its dominant kind. What is a dominant kind? Burke answers that, in general, an object’s dominant kind is the kind that “entails possession of the widest range of properties” (Burke 1994, p. 607). For example, if something is a lump of clay, then it must have certain physical properties. If something is a statue, on the other hand, then it must have both physical and aesthetic properties. In this sense, statue entails a wider range of properties than lump of clay. Hence, statue dominates lump of clay. Rex therefore has the persistence conditions associated with the kind statue. Rex, in other words, is just David. What about Lump? In the original story, the name ‘Lump’ is introduced for the lump of clay that exists on Monday. At that point there was no statue, so Lump’s dominant kind is simply lump of clay. Let us now introduce the name ‘Lump*’ for the lump of clay that exists on Tuesday. The lump of clay that exists on Tuesday is also a statue (Lump* is David, i.e., Rex), so Lump*’s dominant kind is statue. Hence, Lump ≠ Lump*. On Burke’s view, the process of sculpting a lump of clay into a statue destroys one object (a mere lump of clay) and replaces it with another (a statue). The resulting statue is also a lump of clay, but it is numerically distinct from the lump of clay with which we began. Burke concludes that Lump exists on Monday, but does not exist on Tuesday. Hence, the second premise of the original argument is false.

The dominant kinds view has several advantages over the eliminativist accounts. Most notably, the dominant kinds view recognizes the existence of ordinary objects like statues and lumps of clay and allows for these objects to gain and lose parts. However, some of the objections raised in previous sections apply to Burke’s view as well. For example, the anthropic objection from section 2 can also be raised against the dominant kinds view (Sider 2001, p. 165). In addition, the view faces problems of its own.

First, there is the objection from commonsense. According to Burke, sculptors can destroy lumps of clay by doing nothing more than reshaping them in accordance with certain artistic intentions. In fact, given certain theories of what constitutes an artwork, the sculptor doesn’t even have to do that much. Suppose that an artist takes a liking to a particular rock in his yard. He gives it the title Rocky and invites art critics to admire his new work of art. If this is all it takes to create an artpiece, then this is all it takes to destroy a rock. After all, the rock at the beginning of the story has piece of rock as its dominant kind, while the rock at the end has piece of art as its dominant kind. Hence, the latter rock is numerically distinct from the former—the original rock is no more. This seems absurd. Burke replies by appealing to ambiguity (1994, 596–7). According to him, ‘the rock’ could denote the rock (a singular object) or the rocky stuff (the matter that constitutes that object). On the first reading, the rock from the beginning of the story is not the same as the rock at the end (since there is a new dominant kind). But, on the second reading, the rock from the beginning of the story is the same as the rock at the end (since it is the same matter throughout). Burke claims that this is enough to satisfy the demands of commonsense. (For more on mass terms and the distinction between stuff and things, see the entry on the metaphysics of mass expressions.)

A second problem concerns Burke’s account of dominance. Burke claims that one kind dominates another when it entails a wider range of properties. This seems to get the current case correct, for there is a natural sense in which statue entails a wider range of properties than lump of clay. But other cases are less clear. Take, for example, the case of a performance artist who poses his own body to form a statue. The relevant object is both a person and a statue. The kind statue entails having certain aesthetic properties, but does not entail having any mental properties. The kind person arguably entails having certain mental properties, but does not entail having any aesthetic properties. But, in that case, neither kind dominates the other, so Burke’s account seems incomplete. (For further discussion of this worry, see Rea 2000.)

A final problem for the dominant kinds view is that it cannot be extended to all cases of constitution. For example, in the Ship of Theseus case, we seem to have two ships in the same place at the same time. Since there is a single kind at issue in that case, the question of dominance does not arise and Burke’s account cannot help. (For further examples of this kind, see Fine 2000.)

6. Relative Identity

In the previous two sections, we discussed various ways of challenging the first two premises of the argument for coincident entities. Let us now turn our attention to the third and final premise: If David did not exist on Monday and Lump did exist on Monday, then David is not identical to Lump. The premise follows from Leibniz’s Law: for any x and y, if x is identical to y, then x and y share all of the same properties. The denial of Leibniz’s Law therefore provides one way of resisting the final premise of the argument.

The denial of Leibniz’s Law is sometimes associated with Peter Geach (1962, 1967), who defends a view called the relative identity theory. Geach’s central thesis is that there is no relation of absolute identity—identity is always relative to a kind. Thus, we can say that David is the same statue as Lump and we can say that David is the same lump of clay as Lump, but it makes no sense to say that David is the same as Lump simpliciter. The consequent of the third premise is therefore nonsense, like saying ‘David is not taller than’. More generally, Geach rejects the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law as incomplete, since it includes a non-relativized identity predicate. In this way, the relative identity theorist is able to block the third step of the argument for coincident objects.

Geach makes many interesting claims about the behavior of relative identity relations. For example, he claims that it is possible for a to be the same K as b, but not the same K*, where ‘K’ and ‘K*’ are sortal terms denoting distinct kinds. Take, for example, the Debtor’s Paradox. In that case, we have an earlier portion of matter, M1, and a later portion of matter M2. According to Geach, M1 is not the same portion of matter as M2, but it is the same person. In this way, he is able to allow for the persistence of persons through changes in parts. (See the entry on relative identity for more details.)

The relative identity theorist may deny the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law, but there is significant pressure to accept some version of that principle since it seems to capture a central fact about identity. An obvious suggestion is to offer a relativized version of Leibniz’s Law: for any x and y, if x is the same K as y, then x and y share all of the same properties (where ‘K’ is a sortal denoting a kind). If Geach’s relative identity relations do not conform to this law, one might worry that they are not identity relations at all. And here we have a potential problem. Take the case of David and Lump. As we have seen, some philosophers want to say that David is both a statue and a lump of clay (it is not a mere lump of clay, since it is also a statue, but it is still a lump of clay). Lump is obviously a lump of clay. Since there is only one lump of clay on Tuesday, David must be the same lump of clay as Lump. But then, by the relativized version of Leibniz’s Law, David and Lump must share all of the same properties. This, once again, seems false. Lump existed on Monday, but David did not, so there is at least one property that Lump has and David lacks. In response, the relative identity theorist might appeal to another component of Geach’s view. Geach suggests that proper names are always associated with kinds. For example, ‘David’ is associated with the kind statue and ‘Lump’ is associated with the kind lump of clay. Taking a cue from the counterpart theorist (section 3), the relative identity theorist may go on to claim that this association creates opaque contexts when we ascribe modal properties. Take, for example, the following pair of statements:

  1. Lump existed on Monday.
  2. David existed on Monday.

The relative identity theorist could say that (1) is true if and only if there was a lump of clay on Monday which is the same lump of clay as Lump. (2), on the other hand, is true just in case there was statue on Monday which is the same statue as David. Given these truth conditions, (1) is true and (2) is false, for there was a lump of clay on Monday (the same lump of clay as Lump), but no statue. More importantly, on this analysis the predicates in (1) and (2) express different properties, in which case the relativized version of Leibniz’s Law has no application. So, one cannot move from (1) and the negation of (2) to the conclusion that Lump and David are distinct lumps of clay.

A second worry for Geach is that it seems as if the relative identity theory cannot solve all of the puzzles with which we began. Take, once again, the Ship of Theseus Puzzle. In that case, we have the original ship of Theseus (A), the museum’s ship (B), and the custodian’s ship (C). The problem is that B seems to be the same ship as A, which seems to be the same ship as C. If the same ship as relation is transitive, we get the absurd conclusion that B is the same ship as C. The relative identity theorist might deny transitivity, of course, but this would give us another reason to suspect that relativized identity relations are not really identity relations at all (Gupta 1980).

A third and final worry for Geach concerns his denial of absolute identity. As many commentators have pointed out, this denial has drastic implications for logic, semantics, and set theory. To take just one example, consider the set theorist’s axiom of extensionality: for any sets A and B, if A and B have the same members, then A is the same set as B. Let A be David’s unit set and let B be Lump’s unit set. Is A the same set as B? The relativist must reject this question as ill-formed. It makes no sense to ask whether x and y are the same members, since this requires a notion of absolute identity (intuitively, ‘member’ does not denote a genuine kind, so ‘same member as’ does not express a relative identity relation). As a result, the relative identity theorist must deny extensionality, which throws set theory into jeopardy (Hawthorne 2004).

7. Deflationism

Imagine a debate between two friends over whether or not boats are ships. One party points to a rowboat and says, “That boat is a ship. After all, a ship is a vessel that floats on water and the rowboat is obviously a vessel that floats on water.” The second party disagrees: “A ship is a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water and the rowboat is not sufficiently large. So the boat is not a ship.” Clearly, there is something defective about this debate. First, there are two “candidate meanings” for the predicate ‘ship’—namely a vessel that floats on water and a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water. Second, neither of these candidate meanings is more “natural” than the other—unlike ‘water’ or ‘electron’, the predicate ‘ship’ does not correspond to a natural kind in the world. Third, the two parties to the debate agree on all of the “non-ship” facts—in particular, both parties agree that the rowboat is a vessel, that it floats on water, and that it is relatively small in size. Given these points, it is tempting to say that the two parties agree on all of the facts and that their dispute is merely verbal. Note that this conclusion is consistent with the view that one of the parties is actually mistaken. Suppose, for example, that semantic externalism is correct and the meanings of our terms are determined, in part, by overall use (see the entry on externalism about mental content). In that case, the first party to our debate is presumably mistaken, since English-speakers do not use the term ‘ship’ for rowboats. Still, there is a sense in which the debate is verbal, for there is a possible language (“English*”) that (a) employs a different, equally natural meaning for ‘ship’, (b) is adequate for describing all of the facts, and (c) is such that the first party’s statements would be true in that language. Thus, we might say that the real dispute between the two parties is over whether or not English is English*. And that is clearly a verbal dispute.

Some philosophers have suggested that the debate over material constitution is defective in exactly the same way. There is no genuine dispute between Lewis and Unger, for example, over whether or not statues exist. Both parties agree on all of the relevant facts—e.g., that there are simples arranged statuewise. And both parties agree that there are two possible languages (“Lewis-English” and “Unger-English”) where the sentence “Statues exist” comes out true in one and false in the other. So the only disagreement is over whether English is Lewis-English or Unger-English. In other words, the debate is merely verbal. This kind of deflationist view is often associated with Rudolf Carnap (1950), Hilary Putnam (1987) and, more recently, Eli Hirsch (2002a, 2002b, 2005). The issues raised by deflationism are extremely complicated; here, we will limit ourselves to a few initial observations. (For a longer introduction to these issues, see Chalmers, Manley, and Wasserman 2009. For an extended defense of deflationism, see Thomasson 2015.)

In the imagined dispute, we know exactly what the disputed term is (‘ship’) and exactly what the relevant candidate meanings are (a vessel that floats on water and a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water). In the actual dispute between Lewis and Unger, matters are not so clear. One might suspect that the disputed term in this case is the predicate ‘statue’, but it turns out to be fairly difficult to specify the relevant candidate meanings. For example, we might say that, in Lewis-English, ‘statue’ simply means a collection of simples arranged statuewise. Whether or not that is a plausible interpretation of what Lewis means depends in part on the meaning of ‘collection’ (Sider 2009, pp. 388–90). In any case, it is even more difficult to specify an appropriate candidate meaning for ‘statue’ in Unger-English. More importantly, even if we are able to specify the relevant candidate meanings, we will not have succeeded in showing that the general dispute between Lewis and Unger is verbal, for the dispute can be brought out without using the predicate ‘statue’ (or any non-logical predicate, for that matter). Consider, for example, a world that contains one-million simples arranged statuewise and nothing else. And consider the numerical sentence (see section 4) which asserts the existence of at least one-million and one things. Lewis and Unger will disagree over the truth of that sentence. But that sentence contains only logical vocabulary. Hence, if the two parties are really talking past each other, then they must assign different meanings to one or more of the logical constants.

The most plausible suggestion is that Lewis and Unger assign (or, at least, intend to assign) different meanings to the existential quantifier, ‘∃’ (as well as quantificational phrases like ‘there are’, ‘there is’, and ‘some’). And, indeed, this is where deflationists have focused their attention. Putnam, for example, writes that “[T]he logical primitives themselves, and in particular the notions of object and existence, have a multitude of different uses rather than one absolute ‘meaning’ ” (1987, p. 71). This thesis—that there are many meanings for the existential quantifier that are equally natural and equally adequate for describing all the facts—is often referred to as “the doctrine of quantifier variance” (Hirsch 2002b). What exactly are the candidate meanings in question? Once again, matters are not so clear. Lewis could, of course, simply interpret Unger to be using a restricted quantifier that ranges only over simples. On that interpretation, Unger speaks truthfully when he utters the sentence “Statues do not exist”, since there are no statues among the simples. The problem with this interpretation is that it seems manifestly implausible, given that Unger will insist that his quantifiers are to be understood as unrestricted. Even more worrying is the question of how Unger is supposed to interpret Lewis. He cannot, for example, say that Lewis is using a less restrictive quantifier, for that would be to say that there are things (that Lewis’s quantifier ranges over) that do not exist (by Unger’s own lights). Unger could, perhaps, take a more holistic approach and interpret Lewis’s assertion of ‘Statues exist’ to mean there are some simples arranged statuewise. More generally, Unger could interpret Lewis by replacing singular quantifiers over composites with plural quantifiers over simples, and by replacing each predicate of composites with an irreducibly plural predicate of simples. Once again, we should expect protest—Lewis will reject the proposed translation and insist that he is using singular quantification when he asserts the sentence ‘Statues exist’.

These initial observations bring out one disanalogy between the ontological dispute and paradigm verbal disputes. In the earlier argument over whether or not boats are ships, the proposed translations are friendly, since the first party will admit that he uses ‘ship’ to mean a vessel that floats on water and the second will grant that he uses ‘ship’ to mean a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water. Given this disambiguation, the dispute will evaporate. The deflationist’s proposals are instead hostile, for neither Lewis nor Unger will accept the deflationist interpretation offered by his opponent (Sider 2009, section 5). This does not mean that the ontologists’ debate is non-verbal, but it does mean that the issues involved here are more complicated than those in paradigm verbal disputes. (For recent work on quantifier variance, see Thommason 2016, Finn and Bueno 2018, Hirsch and Warren 2019, Sud and Manley 2020, and Eklund forthcoming.)


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