First published Sun Oct 3, 2004; substantive revision Mon May 6, 2024

Many of the concepts analysed by philosophers have their origin in ordinary – or at least extra-philosophical – language. Perception, knowledge, causation, and mind are examples. But the concept of substance is a philosophical term of art. Its uses in ordinary language tend to derive, often in a rather distorted way, from the philosophical senses. There is an ordinary concept in play when philosophers discuss “substance”, and this, as we shall see, is the concept of object, or thing when this is contrasted with properties or events. But such “individual substances” are never termed “substances” outside philosophy.

There exist two rather different ways of characterising the philosophical concept of substance. The first is the more generic. The philosophical term “substance” comes from an early Latin translation of the Greek ousia. Ousia is a noun derived from the verb “einai” (to be) and is naturally translated “being”. According to the generic sense, substances are those things that best merit the title “beings”. This is usually interpreted to mean those things that are the foundational or fundamental entities of a given philosophical system. Thus, for an atomist, atoms are the substances, for they are the basic things from which everything is constructed. In David Hume’s system, impressions and ideas are the substances, for the same reason. In a slightly different way, Forms are Plato’s substances, for everything derives its existence from Forms.

The second use of the concept is more specific. According to this usage, substances are a particular kind of entity, and some philosophical theories acknowledge them and others do not. This conception of substance derives from the intuitive notion of individual thing or object, which contrasts mainly with properties and events. According to this usage, it is a live issue whether the fundamental entities are substances or something else, such as events, or properties located at space-times. The issue is how we are to understand the notion of an object, and whether, in the light of the correct understanding, it remains a basic notion, or one that must be characterised in more fundamental terms. Whether, for example, an object can be thought of as nothing more than a bundle of properties, or a series of events.

The reason “substance” has acquired these two usages is that the work that introduced the term to philosophy, Aristotle’s Categories, claims that the things that most merit the title “beings” (substances in the generic sense) are individual objects as opposed to properties or events (substances in the specific sense).

1. Underlying Ideas

The idea of substance has its first theoretical articulation in Aristotle’s Categories, where he distinguishes between individual substances, such as a man or a horse, and the various kinds of properties they can possess, such as being five foot, white, lying down, or in the Lyceum (1b25–2a4). The Categories would go on to be one of the most – perhaps the most – widely studied philosophical texts of antiquity, the middle ages, and early modernity. It has had a profound impact on discussions of substance ever since.

There is an important distinction pointed out by Aristotle between individual objects and kinds of individual objects. In the Categories, this distinction is marked by the terms “primary substance” and “secondary substance.” Thus Fido the dog is a primary substance – an individual – but dog or doghood is the secondary substance or substantial kind. Each arm of this distinction raises different issues, as we will see in section 2 and section 3.

In addition to distinguishing substances from properties, Aristotle also distinguishes substances from events. As a result, the term “substance” is frequently taken to signify durability or even permanence.

In summary, we have inherited from Aristotle two main senses of “substance”:

i. those things that best merit the title “beings”
ii. individual objects, in contrast with properties or events

In spelling out what exactly it is that makes something a substance in sense ii, philosophers tend to have focussed either on the contrast with properties or with events, leading to:

ii.a things that possess properties but do not belong to other things as properties
ii.b things that are relatively permanent and persist through change

The following sections outline some landmark events in the history of the concept of substance and some of the main topics in contemporary discussions.

2. History of the Philosophical Debate on Substance

Almost all major philosophers have discussed the concept of substance and an attempt to cover all of this history would be unwieldy. This entry concentrates on those discussions that have the greatest continuing influence, while attempting to give a joined-up story. Although the focus is on the concept of substance in Western philosophy, which can be traced to Aristotle, some attention is also given to relevant ideas in non-Western philosophy. For more on these, see the entry on Analytic Philosophy in Early Modern India and Weir (2023b [Other Internet Resources]).

2.1 Substance before Aristotle

The idea that there is some fundamental kind of entity underlying the cosmos, a substance in the generic sense, existed before Aristotle. Perhaps the earliest influential example of this idea occurs in the first texts of classical Indian philosophy, the Upanishads, where brahman is identified as that entity that underlies all beings. A similar idea appears in the first Western philosopher, Thales’ claim that all is water, and his successor in the Milesian school, Anaximander’s claim that the fundamental entity is the “apeiron” (“infinite”, “limitless”). There is some evidence that both ideas were influenced by their Indian precursors (McEvilley 2002).

Another candidate for substance in the generic sense is identified by atomists such as Democritus and several early Indian schools including Nyaya-Vaisheshika and Jainism. These thinkers hold that the cosmos is ultimately composed of individual, indestructible objects, entities that therefore satisfy both the generic and the specific concepts of substance – the former, in being the fundamental entities, and the latter both in being objects that are do not belong to things as properties and in their relative permanence.

In his identification of fire, “the least substantial and the most evanescent of elemental stuffs” as the principle underlying the cosmos, Heraclitus can be viewed as advancing a theory on which “the process of change is more real than the material substances that undergo change” (see the entry on Heraclitus). On this reading, Heraclitus is an early critic of the idea of substance as something permanent or unchanging, a criticism that recurs in early Buddhist philosophy, Hume, and Alfred North Whitehead (see section 2.6, Weir 2021b: § 2.c, Zycinski 1989).

At the other end of the spectrum, Parmenides and his followers Zeno and Melissus appear to argue that reality really consists in one permanent, unchanging individual entity. This idea is a precursor to the thesis that reality consists of just one substance that appears, albeit in a more moderate form, in Descartes and Spinoza (see section 2.4).

Plato rejects materialist attempts to explain everything on the basis of that of which it was made. According to Plato, the entities that best merit the title “beings” are the intelligible Forms, which material objects imperfectly copy. These Forms are not substances in the sense of being either ordinary objects as opposed to properties or the subjects of change. Rather they are the driving principles that give structure and purpose to everything else. At Sophist (255c), Plato also draws a distinction between things that exist “in themselves” and things that exist “in relation to something else”. Though its precise nature is subject to interpretation, this distinction can be seen as a precursor to Aristotle’s distinction between substances and non-substances described in the next section, and later followers of Aristotle often adopt Plato’s terminology.

2.2. Aristotle’s account of substance

There are two main parts to Aristotle’s approach to substance, the basic account of substance in the Categories, and the analysis of material substances into matter and form in the Physics and Metaphysics Z. These will be discussed in turn.

2.2.1 Categories

Aristotle’s account in Categories can, with some oversimplification, be expressed as follows. The primary substances are individual objects, and they can be contrasted with everything else – secondary substances and all other predicables – because they are not predicable of or attributable to anything else. Thus, Fido is a primary substance, and dog – the secondary substance – can be predicated of him. Fat, brown, and taller than Rover are also predicable of him, but in a rather different way from that in which dog is. Aristotle distinguishes between two kinds of predicables, namely those that are “said of” objects and those that are “in” objects. The interpretation of these expressions is, as usually with Aristotelian cruxes, very controversial, but a useful way of looking at it is as follows. Dog is said of Fido because it characterises him as a whole. Fat and the others are described as being in because they pick out a constituent feature that could be said to be, in a logical though not a physical sense, part of, or in him. Fido the individual is not attributable to any further thing at all.

Aristotle (1a24–5) adds that when he speaks of the predicables “in” a substance he means “what is in something not as a part, and cannot exist separately from what it is in”. Hence Fido might be in a certain location, in a kennel, or in a litter while remaining a substance, so long as he is capable of existing separately from these things.

Aristotle does not further characterise the “said of” or “in” relations upon which the account of substance in the Categories depends. And so, it is perhaps best to see Aristotle in Categories not as defining “substance”, so that someone wholly lacking the concept might come to understand it, but as exhibiting the marks and characteristics of a primitive concept on which we have an intuitive grasp. If we understand his project in this way, we can see Aristotle as presenting various marks of substance in the Categories. The marks of primary substance are:

1. Being objects of predication but not being themselves predicable of anything else (at least, not in the way entities in the other categories are).

2. Being able to receive contraries (4a10). A substance can go from being hot to being cold, or from being red to being blue, but the instance of blue in an object cannot similarly take on and lose a wide range of attributes.

3. If substance did not exist it would be impossible for things in any of the other categories to exist. There could be no instances of properties if there were no substances to possess them.

But these criteria do not show why “dog” is a secondary substance term and “brown thing” is not. So we need marks for being a secondary substance, or substance concept. On this he says two things.

4. “It is reasonable that, after the primary substances, their species and genera should be the only other things called (secondary) substance. For only they, of things predicated, reveal the primary substance”. (2b28–30)

5. “Of the secondary substances the species is more a substance than the genus, since it is nearer to the primary substance. For if one is to say of the primary substance what it is, it will be more apt to give the species than the genus”. (2b8–11)

The second of these two points is less controversial than the first, for it is indubitable that species terms focus more precisely on particular things than generic terms. The first is, however, once again intuitive but not compelling. It appeals to the fundamental intuition that “dog” tells you what Fido is better than “brown thing” does, but does not really give a reason for this claim. Only in section 3.3, when we discuss Wiggins’s theory, will we find more formal reasons for treating species or sortal concepts as more revealing of “what something really is” than are other terms.

A related issue is what constitutes the unity of the species or secondary substance: why is it not just a collection of properties and, if it is just such a collection, why is it so different from any other collection of properties? In order to begin to see how Aristotle tackled this problem we need the apparatus of form and matter, which does not appear in the Categories. (We will see when discussing contemporary theories in section 3.1, however, that it is not clear that even now can we provide a wholly non-circular account of substance.)

2.2.2 Physics and Metaphysics

The Categories sets out important logical distinctions between different kinds of attribute, but it does not enter into a metaphysical analysis of substance itself. This takes place mainly in the Physics and in Metaphysics, Book Z. In these works, Aristotle analyses substances in terms of matter and form, whereas these notions have no place in Categories. The distinction has led some commentators to talk of Aristotle’s “two systems”, containing two radically different conceptions of substance (Graham 1987). In the earlier, Categories, substances are simply individuals; in the later work they are complexes of matter and form. Whether this represents a change of view, or whether the purposes of the Categories simply did not require reference to the metaphysical analysis of substance is not clear, however.

Aristotle analyses substance in terms of matter and form. Aristotle uses the term “matter” not as the name for a particular kind of stuff, nor for some ultimate constituents of bodies, such as atoms (Aristotle rejects atomism). “Matter” is rather Aristotle’s name for whatever, for a given kind of object, meets a certain role or function, namely being that from which the object is constituted. Relative to the human body, matter is flesh and blood. The matter of an axehead is the iron from which it is made. Relative to the elements, earth, fire, air, and water, matter is an intrinsically characterless “prime matter” that underlies the qualities of them all.

Aristotle uses the term “form” both for accidental predicables such as having a certain shape or colour, and for the essential predicables that make a substance what it is, such as human or dog. These essential predicables are referred to as “substantial forms” and resemble the “secondary substances” of the Categories. In the Physics (190a34–191a21) Aristotle introduces the analysis of substances into matter and form to explain how change occurs. Every change, Aristotle argues, involves an underlying subject, the matter that persists through it, and a form that is either gained or lost. Where the relevant form is a substantial form a new substance comes into existence. The new substance does not come into existence out of nothing, however, but out of a preexisting matter lacking the relevant substantial form. Aristotle is motivated by the need to show that persistence through change is possible, despite the arguments of Parmenides and Heraclitus mentioned in section 1 (cf. Simpson 2023: 2–3).

In the Physics, as in the Categories, “substance” refers to individual objects. In the Metaphysics, Aristotle returns to the question of which of the three items, matter, form, or the composite of matter and form, best merits the title “substance”. Aristotle acknowledges that matter can be a subject of predication and of change, thereby meeting one of the main criteria for substance in the Categories (1028b35ff). This suggests an inadequacy or incompleteness in the account in Categories, for there he had seemed to assume that a subject is an individual of an appropriate kind – what he calls a “this such” – and matter is not an individual, but that from which an individual is made. In the Metaphysics, Aristotle acknowledges that matter is a subject, but rejects the claim that it best merits the title “substance” on the basis that it is not an individual.

The elimination of matter as a good candidate for being substance, leaves either form alone or the composite of form and matter. The composite seems more consonant with the doctrine of Categories, for the composite is the individual. Aristotle, however, chooses the form as more paradigmatically substance. This has puzzled some commentators (e.g. Wiggins 1998: 232ff). The choice of form as substance causes perplexity because the form seems to be a universal and equivalent to the secondary substance, and in his attacks on Plato, Aristotle makes it plain that universals are not substances. But whether substantial forms are universals in Aristotle is a controversial matter. Interpreters disagree about whether the doghood in Fido is best regarded as the universal, or as the particular instance of the universal doghood, other dogs exemplifying numerically different instances of the same universal (for example, Lloyd 1981, Irwin 1988, Woods 1991, and Bostock’s commentary to Aristotle 1994). On the latter view, the most perspicuous way of regarding the individual substance is not as the composite of form and matter (though this is not wrong) but as the form individualised in the matter.

There are at least three serious questions about Aristotle’s substantial forms. One we have already noticed, namely (i) whether such forms are universals or particulars. The others are (ii) what is the relationship between the substantial form and the properties that enter into its definition? We have already noticed this question when discussing Categories. (iii) What is the ontological status of such forms? This is connected with the second question, for it is connected with the question of what the substantial form is over and above the properties essential to it. Let us agree, for purposes of argument, that human being is a kind of substance and that rationality and animality are the properties in terms of which that substance is defined. But what is the relation between the substantial form and those properties? Is the presence of the substantial form human being nothing more than the presence of those properties, or is the form something further that is, in some sense responsible for the presence of those properties?

Aristotle is undoubtedly a realist about substantial forms, in the sense of thinking them to be something more than a mere collection of properties, but how are we to understand this “more”? It would be universally agreed by scholars that substantial forms are meant to be real in the sense that they play an irreducible and ineliminable explanatory role in the behaviour of the things in which they are the form. There are two interpretations of what Aristotle meant by this, one of which seems compatible with modern science and the other not.

On the compatibilist interpretation, Aristotle is merely making the point made by contemporary non-reductionists about scientific explanation: even if the behaviour of complex entities follows from the laws that govern their parts or their matter, certain higher-level (e.g. chemical, biological, psychological) explanations of their behaviour may be impossible to capture using the terminology of lower-level entities and laws (e.g. physics). On this interpretation, Aristotle is attributing to substantial forms an explanatory role that is compatible with a closed system at the level of basic physics (Nussbaum 1978, 1984).

The stronger, incompatibilist interpretation is that Aristotle did not believe that the behaviour of complex entities followed from the laws that govern their parts or their matter (Gotthelf 1987, Robinson 1983). Rather, the behaviour of the matter is influenced by what it is the matter of. The nature of the matter places restrictions on what the enmattered thing can do – an animal can only be made from living tissue, not of stone or fire – but exactly how that matter behaves depends on the substantial form present in it. Whichever of these is the correct interpretation of Aristotle, it was the second that was the core of “Aristotelian science” as found in scholastic philosophy, and it was this aspect of the Aristotelian doctrine of substance that aroused most opposition amongst seventeenth century philosophers and scientists.

2.3 Medieval accounts of substance

Aristotle is not the last ancient philosopher to discuss substance. On the contrary, most important philosophers of the ancient period made use of Aristotle’s concept, and the Categories became the first philosophical text standardly taught to students as part of a curriculum that dominated the Roman and post-Roman world for more than a millennium (Weir 2021: 276–7). Nonetheless, Aristotle’s is the last work on the topic of substance in the Western tradition until the Middle Ages that retains a significant influence in contemporary philosophy.

In the intervening period important discussions of the parallel notion of Dravya continue to be authored in the Indian tradition. As mentioned above, these include Buddhist criticisms of the concept which may have influenced Hume’s famous criticisms of the idea of substance in the Early Modern period (see the entry on Abhidharma). Meanwhile Aristotle’s account of substance in the Categories was transmitted to scholars in the Latin West in a translation by Boethius and underwent a revival in the Arabic-Islamic world beginning with Al Farabi (Druart 1987).

In his Book of Letters, Al Farabi recapitulates Aristotle’s account of primary and secondary substance from Categories, both of which he classes as “absolute substance”. To these Al Farabi adds a third variety, consisting of that which makes known the quiddity or essence of a non-substance. This, he classes as substance “for something else”. Substance “for something else” stands to non-substances as secondary substance stands to primary substance.

Al Farabi also evaluates alternative candidates for the title of “substance”, concluding that primary substances best merit the title because they are “more perfect” than other candidates. In his paraphrase of the Categories, Al Farabi explains this idea of being “more perfect” as a matter of being “more fitted to be ontologically self-sufficient and more fitted to be ontologically more independent from anything else”. (Druart 1987: 94) Al Farabi makes one exception, suggesting that a being that is not predicated of anything else and is not a subject of predication either will be more perfect still, and to that extent even more worthy of the title “substance”. Al Farabi nonetheless adds that it would be wrong to call such a being “substance” on the basis that it is “beyond the categories”.

A second important contribution from the Arabic-Islamic world was made by the Jewish Neoplatonist, Solomon ibn Gabirol (see the entry on Solomon Ibn Gabirol [Avicebron]). Ibn Gabirol’s most important innovation, respecting our topic, is his claim that all substances, apart from God, are composed of form and matter. This contrasts with the ordinary Aristotelian hylomorphism, that leaves room for or affirms the existence soul or intellect as immaterial substances. Ibn Gabirol’s position is therefore, in a sense, an example of materialism. An important caveat, however, is that Ibn Gabirol distinguishes the “corporeal” matter of lower substances and the “spiritual” matter of higher substances. This spiritual matter counts as “matter” because of the role it plays in a substance – that of being the subject of form. It is not clear that spiritual matter counts as “matter” in a sense that would entail any kinship between Ibn Solomon’s position and ordinary materialism of the sort advocated by Democritus, Epicurus or Hobbes.

Ibn Gabirol’s claim that all created substances are composed of matter and form – “universal hylomorphism” as it is known – had a significant impact on Scholastic philosophy of the Latin West, convincing Bonaventure and other Franciscan philosophers. The most influential philosopher of this period was Thomas Acquinas. His principal contribution to the topic of substance consisted in the development of a sophisticated response to universal hylomorphism.

On the one hand, Acquinas recognised a case for extending Aristotle’s distinction between matter and form to all created substances. For Acquinas holds that all created substances are characterised by potentiality, and that in material substance potentiality is contributed by matter. Nonetheless Acquinas objected to the idea of attributing matter to spiritual substances, souls and angels, on the basis that the potentiality of matter consists in its ability to move through space, a property belonging only to corporeal beings (Questiones Disputate de Anima:–164).

Instead, Acquinas accounts for the potentiality of spiritual substances in terms of the distinction between essence and existence, a distinction he defends in De Ente et Essentia. In spiritual substance it is not matter, but essence, that contributes potentiality. While essence thus plays the same role in spiritual substance as matter plays in corporeal substance, it does not merit the title “matter” because the potentiality it contributes does not consist in the ability to move through space.

Another important feature of Ibn Gabirol’s philosophy was his view that one substance instantiates a “plurality of forms” rather than a single substantial form. The same view was defended by Duns Scotus. Scotus argued that a dead person’s body was the same body as had existed when that person was alive. The soul had departed, so the form that was the immortal soul could not be identical with the form of the body. This argument may seem to be specialised to the case of the human immortal soul, but, presumably, a similar problem applies to a dead parrot: it has lost its perceptive and vegetative souls, yet is the same body – even if it is no longer a parrot. By contrast, according to Aquinas, a substance possessed only one form, and its matter was the essentially characterless prime matter. In other words the informed parts of an object – in the case of a living creature, its organs, and the various kinds of stuff that constituted it (in the end, quantities of earth, fire, air, and water) did not possess their own forms, but were informed by the overall substantial form (see Lagerlund 2012).

This line of thought proved to be a slippery slope, and, as so often, the downward slide was led by William of Ockham. On the one hand, Ockham was committed to hylomorphism, in that a substance is composed of form and matter. But he reverses the priorities of Aquinas and Scotus by saying that the parts are actual in their own right and do not derive their actuality from the whole: rather, the whole is nothing but the sum of its parts. This line of thought opened the way to atomism and to treating the unity of wholes as a matter of convention or degree. Buridan, who represents a further development in this direction, says

In this sense, I am not the same as I was yesterday, because something was part of my integrity yesterday, which has already been used up, and something was not part of my integrity, which has meanwhile been added by nourishment. (Buridan, Physics I,q.10, f. xiii; cited Lagerlund 2012: 476)

It is clear that this way of thinking paves the way for atomism and its associated problems as they emerged in early modern philosophy.

2.4 Descartes on substance

The concept of substance figures centrally in Early Modern philosophy, playing a positive role for Descartes, Leibniz, and Spinoza, but attracting criticism from the empiricists, Locke and Hume. Descartes’ and Locke’s discussions are especially influential on later work.

In replying to the second set of objections to his Meditations, Descartes provides the following definition:

Substance. This term applies to every thing in which whatever we perceive immediately resides, as in a subject, or to every thing by means of which whatever we perceive exists. By “whatever we perceive” is meant any property, quality or attribute of which we have a real idea. (AT 7: 161)

Setting aside the epistemic designation of properties, qualities and attributes as “whatever we perceive”, this resembles Aristotles’ definition in the Categories, with which Descartes would have been familiar from his schooling at La Flèche.

Elsewhere, however, Descartes says that a substance is something “capable of existing independently”; “that can exist by itself”; or “which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence” (AT 7: 44, 226, VIII A 24). Descartes contrasts substances, so defined, with modes, qualities and attributes, which can depend for their existence on substances.

In these locations, Descartes affirms an independence criterion of substancehood. This idea may be implicit in Aristotle’s Categories and is gestured at by Al Farabi, but Descartes appears to be the first influential philosopher who explicitly defines substances as those things that are capable of existing by themselves. Descartes adds that only God truly qualifies as a substance so defined, because nothing else could exist without God, a view that would be reaffirmed with greater emphasis by Descartes’ most influential follower, Spinoza. However, Descartes recognises two kinds of “created substance” – things that can exist without anything else, leaving aside God: material body, which is defined by extension, and mental substance, which is defined by thought, which, in this context, is more or less equivalent to consciousness.

Descartes believed that matter operates in an entirely mechanical way. For this reason, he saw no causal role for substantial form to play in material substances and, hence, no need for such forms. His two substances are each defined in terms of one property (extension for matter and thought for mind), hence there is no problem about the relation between substance and the properties in terms of which it is defined. Indeed, Descartes asserts that there is no “real distinction” between the properties, extension and thought, and the substances body and mind: a concrete instance of extension just is one or more bodies, a concrete instance of thought just is, one or more minds, there is nothing further in which these substances consist.

Spinoza and Leibniz, were heavily influenced by Descartes’ ideas on substance. Spinoza, like Descartes, asserts that there is only one substance. This substance is thought of as being both God and Nature. It is an unending controversy whether Spinoza was a pantheist, or an atheist who called nature “God” because it was the one true substance and existed necessarily. Everything else is a mode of this one substance.

The view is analogous to a claim that the universe is space-time as a whole, with matter as distortions in it. If this were true, material objects would be modes of space-time. The analogy would be more exact if one also thought of the laws of nature as equivalent to the divine intellect immanent in nature. Spinoza’s view represents the extreme end of stressing the status of substance as the fundamental existent conceived of as wholly necessary and self-subsistent. Nothing but the universe as a whole meets this criterion fully.

Leibniz acknowledges created substances, though they are very intimately dependent on God. In the Discourse on Metaphysics (§ 14), he says:

it is clear that created substances depend on God, who conserves them and indeed who produces them continuously by a kind of emanation, just as we produce our thoughts. (1998: 66)

The analogy with thought hardly emphasises the independence of substance! Nevertheless, created substances do constitute the created world, and they are also both the subjects of predication and the bearers of change, albeit in a very different way from Aristotle’s individual substances. An Aristotelian individual possesses some properties essentially and some accidentally. The accidental properties of an object are ones that can be gained and lost over time, and which it might never have possessed at all: its essential properties are the only ones it had to possess and which it possesses throughout its existence. By contrast, for Leibniz, even the properties that an object possesses only for a part of its existence are essential to it. Every “monad” (his term for a substance) bears each of its properties as part of its nature, so if it were to have been different in any respect, it would have been a different entity. Furthermore, Leibniz argues that every substance reflects in its nature the rest of the world, for “the result of each view of the universe, as looked at from a certain position, is… a substance which expresses the universe in conformity with that view.” (1998: 66)

Apart from advancing his own, idiosyncratic account of substance, Leibniz also advances an objection to Descartes’ independence criterion for created substance:

I do not know whether the definition of substance as that which needs for its existence only the concurrence of God fits any created substance known to us. . . . For not only do we need other substances; we need our own accidents even much more. (Critical Thoughts: 389)

According to this objection, a substance cannot exist “by itself” (even once we set aside God) because it cannot exist without its own attributes. As we will see below, this kind of objection to the independence criterion has been highly influential in contemporary discussions (Weir 2021: 287–91).

2.5 Locke on Substance

According to Locke, we have two conceptions of substance. One is a “notion of pure substance in general” (Essay II xxiii 2), the other “ideas of particular sorts of substance” (II xxiii 3). Both these conceptions of substance provide difficulties of interpretation. They also both relate to issues in contemporary philosophy of substance, in which Locke’s influence is almost as important as Aristotle’s.

2.5.1 Locke on “pure substance in general

Locke expresses this idea as follows:

The idea then we have, to which we give the general name substance, being nothing, but the supposed, but unknown support of those qualities, we find existing, which we imagine cannot subsist, sine re substante, without something to support them, we call that support substantia, which, according to the true import of the word, is in plain English, standing under or upholding. (II xxiii 2)

The traditional rationale of Locke’s doctrine of “substance in general” is as follows. Properties – or, in Locke’s terms qualities – must belong to something – “cannot subsist…without something to support them”. Of course, they belong to objects, but what are objects over and above their properties? The special category of substantial form, as found in Aristotle, is rejected. All that seems to be left is a bare “something”, which on pain of regress, has no properties in its own right, except the property of being the owner or support of other properties. For a helpful discussion of the difference between this idea, and the Aristotelian idea of substance see Broackes (2006).

This interpretation of Locke’s notion of “substance in general” is, however, a matter of controversy. It is contested whether Locke actually believed in substance as a characterless substratum. Although the first quotation above seems to affirm it, Locke also in the same section speaks disparagingly about the idea, comparing it to the notion that the world rests on an elephant, which rests on a tortoise, and so on: in other words, as not constituting a real explanation at all. Michael Ayers (1975, 1991b: 39–50) believes that the only substratum that Locke acknowledges is the unknown – and, Locke thinks, unknowable by us – structure of the minute parts. This is what he elsewhere characterises as the real essence. It is clear from the text that Locke is at least uneasy with the idea of “pure substance in general”, but it is less clear whether he feels obliged to accept an idea he dislikes, or whether he rejects it. (For the view that he accepts it, and why, see Bennett 1971 and 1987.)

There are indications that Locke is confused about what he means by “substratum”. He argues that the notion of spiritual substance is in no worse a predicament than material substance, because

we have as clear a notion of the substance of spirit as we have of body: the one being supposed to be (without knowing what it is) the substratum to those simple ideas we have from without; and the other supposed (with a like ignorance of what it is) to be the substratum to those operations which we experiment in ourselves within. ‘Tis plain then, that the idea of corporeal substance in matter, is as remote from our conceptions, and apprehensions, as that of spiritual substance, or spirit;…. (II 23 v)

This argument seems to conflate the notions of substratum as pure logical support with that as minute parts. If he means minute parts, then, though it is true that we do not and, in his view, cannot know in detail what they are, we have a theory, which he endorses, that they are probably minute parts as conceived by the atomists, which means they have primary qualities similar in kind though not in scale to those possessed by macroscopic objects. This gives a coherent, though speculative, conception of material substance. Of spiritual substance, we have no similar hypothesis. If, on the other hand, he means pure logical substratum, there is nothing to know, for there is no more to it, in either the material or spiritual case, than its role as substratum. He seems to conflate the ignorance we have of minute parts with the logical emptiness of the idea of pure substratum.

In fact there are three issues concerning the material underpinning of things that Locke regards as mysterious, and he seems to move indifferently from one to the other. First, there is organisation of the minute parts of particular kinds of objects, which is responsible for the manifest properties of those objects, and which he thinks will always fall beyond our knowledge. Second is the mystery of what holds the minute parts together: the problem of explaining attraction in a system that only understands influence by impact (xxiii 23). Third, is that idea of substance as a bare substratum, which is “a supposed, I know not what, to support those ideas we call accidents” (xxiii 15).

Perhaps it is more profitable to ask whether, in his own terms, Locke ought to have accepted a bare substratum. If we accept that the question of what binds together the qualities of a macroscopic object can be answered by appeal to the minute parts, the issue would then be what binds the primary qualities of atoms. Do the size, shape, mass, solidity of a particular atom require a bare substratum to inhere in for them to constitute a coherent object? Would they, without such a substratum be just a stack of qualities, a house of cards with nothing holding them together? There does not seem to be anywhere in the text where Locke discusses this problem – that is, the coherence of atoms as opposed to composite objects – explicitly. One possible resort is to treat solidity as the core or master quality and all the others as features of it. One would never ask what binds together a patch of colour and its shape, because the shape is the shape of the colour patch, and, though the shape of something can change, its shape cannot come away from it, like a separable component (cf. Martin 1980, Denkel 1992, Weir 2023a: 143–5). Perhaps the shape, size and density of an atom are similarly features of the solidity. The quality solidity would then become equivalent to the notion of material stuff or material substance and Locke shows no sign of wanting to elide the ideas of quality and substance in this way, though it should be noted that this is what Descartes does with extension. For Descartes, because he does not believe in void, extension carries with it the other basic properties of matter as features of it.

2.5.2 Locke on “ideas of particular sorts of substance

The ideas of particular sorts of substance – called sortals – are formed

by collecting such combinations of simple ideas, as are by experience and observation of men’s senses, taken notice of to exist together, and are therefore supposed to flow from the particular internal constitution, or unknown essence of that substance. Thus we come to have the ideas of a man, horse, gold, water, etc… (II xxiii 3)

Thus, for Locke, the real essence is an unknown atomic constitution. By contrast, the types that we categorise substances in depend on the properties we happen to be able to perceive and kinds or sorts are defined in terms of these observable properties. Definition in these terms Locke calls “nominal essence”. Our concepts of natural substances presuppose that the nominal essence hides a real essence – that is, that all water, gold, horses etc. are in some way similar at a microscopic level. But Locke both denies that these real essences play any role in the formation of our concepts and is deeply sceptical of our ever being able to discover what they are. His attitude towards the Aristotelian view is expressed later in the paragraph just quoted:

…a philosopher…whatever substantial forms he may talk of, has no other idea of those substances than what is framed by a collection of those simple ideas which are found in them….

Locke’s doctrine of sortals is in some respects realist and in some conceptualist or conventionalist. It is realist in at least the following ways.

i. The properties [ideas] in terms of which sortals are defined do correspond to real qualities and powers in the world. There is no sense in which these building blocks of reality are creatures of our conceptual scheme.

ii. The properties invoked by nominal essences are “supposed to flow from the particular internal constitution, or unknown essence of that substance”(xxiii 3). This internal constitution “makes the whole subsist by itself” (xxiii 6).

Thus Locke is entirely realist about individual bodies and their properties. He is more conventionalist, however, about their classification under particular sortals. There are four ways in which he is a conceptualist about particular substances, as we classify them.

i. There is nothing over and above the properties of an object corresponding to our substance concepts – nothing, that is, like a substantial form – present in the world. Sortals are entirely formed by our minds, in the light of the properties perceived to be in the world.

ii. The boundaries we draw between kinds of things are, to some degree at least, arbitrary and concept relative.

I do not deny, but nature, in the constant production of particular beings, makes them… very much alike and of kin one to another: but I think it nevertheless true, that the boundaries of the species, whereby men sort them, are made by men… (III vi 37: italics in original)

iii. The situation in (ii) is greatly aggravated by our ignorance of real essences. If we could know those more accurately, we would know better where to draw the boundaries.

iv. The disposition of properties in nature need not have been as it is and might actually contain oddities not corresponding to any of our sortals. Sortals, unlike Aristotelian species, place no constraints on how individual objects must or ought to be.

Locke’s contribution is, therefore, three-fold. He brings to centre stage the question of whether properties require some substratum or bare particular to inhere in or belong to. He asserts that the substantial nature of the physical world is the unknown structure of atomic parts, not a substantial form which reflects our usual concepts. Third, he develops a theory of substance which is realist about particular objects and their properties, but conceptualist or conventionalist about our classifications, within the constraints that the facts about particulars and properties impose.

There is one important context, however, where Locke does not appear to talk in a conventionalist way about sortal identity, but in a way that seems to be reminiscent of substantial forms. This is when he is discussing the individuation of living things. He understands ordinary bodies as mereological sums of atoms. As such, any change of particle constitutes a new object, for a mereological sum is individuated by its parts and a change of parts means a change of the object constituted by those parts. Treating ordinary, non-living, bodies as complex enduring objects is a matter of convention determined by the concepts we happen to possess. Living things, however, have a deeper principle of unity.

That being then one plant which has such an organization of parts in one coherent body, partaking of one common life, it continues to be the same plant as long as it partakes of the same life, though that life be communicated to new particles of matter vitally united to the living plant…. (Essay II.27.4)

One might wonder what this “common life” is supposed to be, especially in the light of his rejection of Aristotelian “substantial forms”. Furthermore, it is tempting to argue that all coherent, solid bodies – such as a lump of rock or plasticene – have some principle of organisation that persists through change. Living objects are simply the most dramatic case of this. (Though Peter van Inwagen (1990) defends the view that only living things and atoms are real entities: inanimate complex bodies are not true individuals.) Nevertheless, though the appeal to “life” seems to modify Locke’s conventionalism, it still leaves open the possibility that the divisions we make between different species are conventions, because, though we can recognise life (or a “continuing principle of organisation”) itself, it is still relatively arbitrary and concept-dependent where life (or “principle of organisation”) of one kind ends and another starts. So our division of things into species, though grounded in real continuities in the way that our non-biological (or non-natural) concepts are not, is still nominal.

As we shall see, the idea that there is a real unity that is passed on through the life of an object or through any principle of organisation is something that Hume criticises and rejects.

The potential for a stronger realism in Locke has been exploited by Putnam and Kripke in their development of a modern, essentialist conception of natural kind terms. Locke was pessimistic in two connected respects. First he was sceptical about the possibility of science discovering the nature of the real essences – the structures of atoms or molecules – that underlie kinds of substance picked out by our ordinary sortals. Second, he doubted whether the objects picked out by our actual substance concepts really shared a real essence in the way we assume that they do. He was not confident, that is, that everything we call gold, or iron, or a monkey, was actually interestingly similar at a non-superficial level. More recent work suggests that these forms of pessimism were unfounded. The consequence of this is the possibility of bringing together real essence and the sortal concepts originally picked out by a nominal essence. If we now know water to be H2O and iron to be the element of atomic weight 56, it follows that our substance concepts were, often at least, tracking real essences in the world. This involves reinterpreting the rationale of our substance concepts. Locke thought that our concept of gold was properly expressed as “anything gold in colour, malleable, soluble in aqua regia”. He thought that we add the optimistic assumption that there will be similarity at the microscopic level. What many philosophers, under Putnam’s influence, now think he should have said is that gold is that kind of thing which is individuated by a particular kind of minute structure that underlies the stuff that is gold in colour, malleable, soluble in aqua regia. In other words, our confidence that these kinds have a genuine real essence is built into the concept. If this is correct, then our ordinary “natural kind” concepts, like water and gold, have built into them intimations of a deeper unity than that supplied by superficial features, even if it be allied to a complete agnosticism about what that unity might consist in or whether we might ever uncover it.

2.6 Hume and Kant on substance

It is plausible to maintain the general thesis that there are many issues on which Hume was a sceptic or nihilist, but where his legacy is more reductionist than sceptical or nihilist. This general thesis can be explained and illustrated by considering his treatment of substance, for it is a case in question.

According to Hume, in the Treatise, our belief in substance is the result of a mistake or illusion.

When we gradually follow an object in its successive changes, the smooth progress of the thought makes us ascribe an identity to the succession…When we compare its situation after a considerable change the progress of the thought is broken; and consequently we are presented with the idea of diversity: In order to reconcile which contradictions, the imagination is apt to feign something unknown and invisible, which it supposes to continue the same under all these variations; and this unintelligible something it calls a substance, or original and first matter. (1978: 220)

Hume’s target is any account that postulates a unifying “something” that underlies change, whether this be a characterless substratum, a substantial form or (though this is not explicitly mentioned) something like the “continuing life” that Locke sees as passed on in living things. The crucial point is that a succession of very similar things does not constitute the real continuation of anything, only the illusion of real continuation.

Thus Hume’s treatment of substance is like his treatment of causation, in that he sees both as the projection onto the world of a tendency of our minds either to pass from one thing to another or to associate them in some way. He either doubts that there are such things as substance or causation (scepticism) or even positively denies that there are (nihilism). Both arguments resemble much earlier Buddhist philosophical criticisms of the ideas of substance and causation mentioned in section 2.3. This may be no coincidence. Alison Gopnik (2009) suggests Hume was plausibly influenced by Buddhist philosophy via the Jesuit missionary Charles François Dolu during his stay at La Flèche, in 1735–37.

Out of Hume’s very forthright negative attitude there developed two more subtle variants. One of these variants is in the empiricist tradition. That tradition modified Hume’s approach by developing it into a form of reductionism. The experiences that gave rise, through habit, to the mistaken belief (in, for example, substance or causation) are presented as what the belief really affirms. That is, the empirical basis for what Hume deems to be an illusion, is reinterpreted as the reductive account of the concept. Causation then becomes constant conjunction, or substance a name for a bundle of properties organised in a certain way or the continuing of the possibility of certain sensations.

Kant developed the other variant. He took Hume’s “tendencies of the mind to pass” from one idea to another, without which we could not construct the world, and canonised them as a priori categories of the understanding. Hume’s empiricist emphasis is psychological. It concerns what we are habituated to do. Because of his empiricism, he will not bring non-psychological necessity into it. Nevertheless, there is the implication that making these transitions is the only way in which one can understand the world. Kant drops the empirical psychology and makes it a matter of a priori psychology, that only by employing certain categories could we have experience as of a physical world. It is only by understanding the world as possessing enduring spatio-temporal objects, which enter into causal relations with each other (that is, it is only by applying the categories of substance and causation) that we can have intelligible experience. Substances – that is, a framework of stable, enduring objects – are essential, but the source of this necessity lies not in how the world is in itself, but in the framework that we are obliged to impose.

In the Kantian philosophy of P. F. Strawson (1959, 1966), this framework of necessity is taken in a more common-sense and realist spirit. The world must possess such enduring objects for it to be intelligible for us – indeed, for us to be part of it, for we are essentially stable bodies amongst other stable bodies. The important point for both Strawson and Kant is that there must be substances for there to be a coherent empirical, spatio-temporal world. Substance has become a formal concept of central importance – that is a concept with a special central role in the structure of our conceptual scheme – rather than being the name for certain kinds of important things in the world. This distinction, however, is one that has to be handled carefully, especially within a realist Kantian framework, such as Strawson provides. This should become clear below when we discuss Wiggins’s theory, which is both Aristotelian and Strawsonian.

3. Contemporary Controversies

Two major areas of controversy require attention. First, there are the issues concerning how to characterise substance in contradistinction to properties and the other categories. There are at least two major questions here. One concerns defining the notion of substance. In particular, there has been much debate about whether substance can be accounted for in terms of its special kind of independence. The other is whether substancehood requires some extra component beyond properties, (and, if so, what?) or whether a “bundle of properties” theory of substance is adequate. Second there is the relation between substances and our practices of individuation and reidentification. In particular, we shall look at the issue of whether objects must be individuated under the kind of sortal expressions that correspond to Aristotelian substance concepts, or whether a more generic notion, such as physical body, will suffice. This latter concern will lead on to a consideration of the connection between substance and teleology.

3.1. How substances are distinguished from things in other categories

A central issue in contemporary discussions of substance is how to distinguish substances from other categories. Multiple criteria of substancehood have been proposed. O’Conaill (2022: 11–42) provides a detailed overview.

The most discussed criterion for substancehood is independence. A natural formulation of the independence criterion says that what distinguishes substances from properties is that properties depend for their existence on substances, for they are properties of objects (that is, of individual substances), but that substances do not similarly depend on properties for their existence. The point cannot be made quite so simply, however. Properties could not exist without objects to be properties of, but neither could substances exist without properties, so the dependence appears to be mutual. This objection to the independence criterion makes an early appearance in Leibniz, as mentioned in section 2.4, and has had a significant impact in recent discussions (see Weir 2021: 287–91).

One response, recommended by Rodriquez-Pereyra (2008: 81); Bennett (2001: 134) and Schechtman (2016: 183), is to make it clear that we are not talking about properties in general and substances in general, but about particular instances or cases of a property and the particular objects to which they belong. A particular property instance cannot exist and could not have existed without the substance of which it is a property, but the particular substance can exist and could have existed without that property instance. Thus, a particular instance of colour cannot exist, and could not have existed, without the object of which it is the colour, but the object can exist without the colour instance, for it may change colour and remain the same object, or it could have had a different colour from the start.

A second solution, advanced by Lowe (1998) in his very thorough discussion of all the topics discussed in this section, replaces the notion of mere independence with independence of identity:

x is a substance if and only if x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical to x and the identity of x depends on the identity of y.

A property depends for its identity on the substance to which it belongs whereas, according to Lowe, the substance does not depend for its identity on its properties.

A problem for either solution is that of essential properties. Both versions of the independence criterion imply that, for any given property-instance, a substance can exist without it, or does not depend for its identity on it, neither of which seems true of the essential properties of substances.

Lowe responds by saying that essential properties are identical with the substance, so cannot be cited as something other than substance that meets his criterion for being substance. It is not clear that this will work. The idea that the essence is identical with the substance is Aristotelian, but it is not clear how this applies to essential properties, taken individually. We have already seen, in our discussion of Aristotle, that the relation between the essence as some kind of unity and the properties that seem to constitute it is not clear.

A third solution to the problem of formulating the identity criterion, which purports to avoid either objection just raised, is put forward by Gorman (2006) and Weir (2021, 2023a: 58–76). According to this solution, the independence criterion should be interpreted as saying that a substance, unlike a property, can exist “by itself” in the sense that it can exist without anything it does not include or subsume within itself. It may be true of a substance that it can exist by itself in this sense, despite its inability to exist without even its essential parts and properties. For the parts and properties are subsumed by the substance to which they belong. By contrast, a property cannot exist by itself in this sense because a property cannot exist without belonging to a substance that it does not include or subsume.

A problem for all three versions of the independence criterion is that they do not distinguish between substances and events. The performance of a symphony, for example, is an event, and it may possess the property, in one of its movements, of being allegro. It seems plausible that this particular case of something’s being allegro could not have been exemplified by another performance, but the performance might go on to be andante in another movement, so the event can continue to exist without that original property. Hence, it seems that the event is a substance.

The idea that an event might be a substance is at odds with a second traditional criterion of substancehood: that of being a “continuant” rather than an “occurrent”. It does not seem natural to say that the same event was first allegro, then andante, because it is more natural to attribute the different properties to different parts of the event, which are themselves events (in this case, movements). This brings out a major difference between traditional examples of substances and events, namely that the temporal parts of events are themselves events in their own right, but the temporal parts of objects – meaning by that expression the temporal phases of an object’s existence – are not themselves objects. Indeed, it is not natural to talk of the temporal parts of objects, though some philosophers (led by David Lewis (1986), but see also Sider (2001), Hawley (2001) and the entry on temporal parts) think that there are compelling philosophical reasons for doing so.

One solution to this further problem is to combine the independence criterion and a continuant criterion. On this view, we will treat independence as distinguishing substances and events from properties, while saying that events are those property-instantiators that, when they exist through time, are temporally composed of further things of the same category (i.e., events), whereas substances are those property-instantiators that, when they exist through time, are not temporally composed of things of the same category (i.e., of substances) but endure singly through the period. Alternatively, one might seek some other characteristic of events that distinguishes them from substances. For example, if events are structures of objects, properties/relations, and times, substances might be defined as those independent entities that are not structures of the relevant sort.

A final problem that has been raised for the independence criterion of substance is that it seems unable to cope with the necessity of origin for individual identity. Lowe (1998) responds by denying that origin is essential to identity. Unfortunately, he argues for this position by citing human subjects: Socrates, for example, would still have been who he was even if he had had different parents. This is, of course, controversial about humans, but it is our Cartesian intuitions that make it plausible in that case. That this table, for example, could have been the same object even if made from different material does not have the same plausibility. Gorman (2006: 152), Schneider (2006: 400) and Weir (2021: 305–6) all respond by stipulating that a substance need only be capable of continuing its existence by itself, not of existing by itself for the entirety of its existence.

Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (1994 and 1997) develop a particularly sophisticated conception of the relative independence of substances compared to other categories. Substance, they say, is the only category of thing that might have only one instance through at least a minimally extended period of time. Thus, for example, there is no possible world that has, in a given period of time, only one event, for any non-instantaneous event will be made of events that are its parts. Similarly for properties or tropes, there can never be only one because any one entails the existence of others, as, for example, the existence of a red property (instance) entails the existence of (an instance of) the property colour. By contrast, there could exist through a period of time just one substance, provided that it was atomic.

As Mackie (2000) points out, the full statement of this theory involves various relatively ad hoc restrictions. More importantly, it does not seem to explain what unifies the category of substance, for it does not say that it is true of any substance that it could conceivably be the only substance existing for a period of time – indeed, it could not apply to non-atomic substances, for complex ones can exist only if other substances – those that constitute their parts – also exist. It implies only that something from the category of substance might so exist and that this could not be true of any other category. One might wonder what enabled substances that could not exist alone to count as substances at all.

The independence and continuant criteria are not the only criteria for substancehood discussed in recent literature. An alternative criterion for substancehood that has quickly become important is that of ungroundedness. One fact or thing is said to be “grounded” by a second fact or thing when the first exists or obtains “in virtue of” the second. The notion of grounding, so defined, is imprecise, and there exists much disagreement about how to further clarify it. Nonetheless, the last decade or two have witnessed widespread interest in the idea that many important metaphysical problems will be solved or illuminated by appeal to the notion of grounding. One possible application of this notion is in the suggestion that substances are those things that are fundamental in the sense that they are not grounded by anything further. O’Conaill (2022: 24–5) discusses two grounding definitions of substance drawn from Schaffer (2009) and Schneider (2006).

A final traditional criterion for substancehood that continues to receive some support is unity. In its extreme form, defended by Schaffer (2021) and Heil (2021, 21), this criterion says that a substance must be a mereological simple – that is, something with no proper parts. A more moderate version of the unity criterion advanced by Koslicki (2018) associates substancehood with the kind of unity exhibited by hylomorphic compounds. Neo-hylomorphic conceptions of substance such as Koslicki’s are given their own section in 3.4 below.

3.2 Bundle theories versus substrata and “thin particulars

A second important issue in contemporary discussions of substance is whether substances are in some sense reducible to their properties, or whether there exists some further component, such as Locke’s notion of a substratum discussed in section 2.5. Both views have been defended in recent discussions.

3.2.1 Bundle theories and their problems

Properties might be conceived of as universals, things that can be instantiated in multiple bearers at the same time, or as individuals, property-instances, which are sometimes called “tropes”. There are, therefore, two options for the bundle theorist.

i. Substances are in fact no more than bundles of properties conceived of as universals.
ii. Substances are in fact no more than bundles of properties conceived of as individuals.

On either view, the claim that substances are “no more than bundles of properties” might be regarded as a conceptual analysis of the concept of substance, or it might be regarded as a de facto, but not a conceptual truth. The claim that substances are “no more than bundles of properties” means, at minimum, that there is no further component or ingredient which goes to make up a substance, beyond its various properties. The term “bundle theory” is sometimes used to suggest a stronger view on which the properties are in some sense more fundamental than, and perhaps capable of existing separately from the substance to which they belong. Hume argues that what we usually think of as individual substances are really bundles of properties in this strong sense. As he acknowledges, it follows that the properties will themselves be substances according to definitions that make separability a criterion of substancehood.

The main objections to the claim that substances are bundles of universal properties rest on its apparent commitment to the Identity of Indiscernibles, for if an object is no more than a bundle of properties, then if a and b have exactly the same properties, they are the same bundle. Whether it does carry this commitment may depend on whether one allows spatial points as particulars, in addition to the properties that are universal. If one did, then the universal theories would not entail the identity of indiscernibles, for the same universals could be in two bundles by being at two different locations. In this case, however, it is not clear why the properties themselves should be regarded as universals rather than individuals, on the basis that they too are present at different locations (see Weir 2021: 270–1).

If properties are conceived of as individuals – otherwise known as tropes, property-instances or individualised forms – then there cannot be a problem about the distinctness of exactly similar bundles, for the difference is built into the identity of the elements of the bundle, as it is not if the bundle is made of universals. The problem for this version of the bundle theory seems to be that it is difficult to individuate or distinguish tropes in a way that makes them suitable to be individuals – in one sense, the substances – from which objects are made (Armstrong 1989: 115ff). For example, if an object has a size, a mass, and a motion, are the size and the mass different tropes and is it not strange to think of the size alone as a genuine particular suited to be treated as an “atomic” component of the whole? One way out of this problem may be to resort to the notion of a master property that was invoked in the discussion of Locke on substratum (section 2.1.5); that is, to the notion of one property of which all the others are modes, as extension is the master property of matter for Descartes. It might be argued that theories of this kind are not ordinary bundle theories, however, there is a sense in which the master property fills the role of substratum, while the other properties inhere in, or are modes of, it.

One objection often made against the theory is that the identity of a bundle, like that of a mereological sum, is determined by its members. It follows that on the bundle theory, any change of property is a change in the identity of the substance to which it belongs. And yet, it is ordinarily assumed that substances can survive through changes in property. Various forms of essentialist solutions to this problem have been suggested, for example, by Simons (1994), and Barker and Jago (2018).

3.2.2. The concept of substratum or “thin particular”

If one is not satisfied with a bundle theory of substance, so that one thinks that an individual substance is more than a collection of properties, how is one to understand this “more”? This question can be given a deflationary or a substantive answer. The deflationary answer is that a substance is a thing which has properties, and that is all one needs to say (see, for example, Crane and Farkas 2004: 143f, and Chisholm 1969, cf. Broackes 2006). An object is not composed of properties and some further ingredient – the “thingy” bit – an object is something that simply has properties. Any feature of it can, of course, be regarded as a property, but that does not render an object nothing but a collection of properties. There seems to be a clash of intuitions at this point about what makes sense. An opponent of the deflationary view will say that properties, however understood, must be components of objects, conceptually or formally speaking. If they are not the only components in this sense, one must say something about the nature of the rest. The deflationist thinks that this line of thought embodies some kind of category mistake in the way it handles the idea of a component. The anti-deflationist will argue that the fact that we are talking about components only in a conceptual sense does not alter the fact that we are obliged, once we start, to offer an account that is complete and distinguishes the various elements.

Bennett offers one way out of the need to postulate a mysterious substratum:

When I say ‘This is an orange’ I mean that there are here instances of certain properties such as orangeness, sphericality etc., and I indicate that I am operating on my ideas of those instances in a certain combining manner. (1987: 202; italics added)

This solution, as Bennett recognises, makes substancehood a function of how we operate on the properties we perceive. It is, in that sense, more Kantian than realist. As what it recognises as out there in the world is just a bundle of properties, it does not dissolve the problem in the way that a deflationist would require.

Substantive theories take the thought of a further component seriously, and, though they are not generally distinguished, there are two main conceptions of this extra element, which I will call the “thin particular” and the “substratum” conceptions. “Thin particular” is an expression of D. M. Armstrong’s. It is the particular in abstraction from its properties. When considered with its properties it is a thick particular. The important point is that thin particulars really are particulars. “Bertrand Russell might have been a fried egg”: that is, the thin particular associated with one set of properties and, hence, with one thing, might have belonged to another. Different properties might have been hung on this hook. It is not so clear, by contrast, that a substratum of the kind Locke considers, or like Aristotle’s prime matter, is a particular in this sense. It is more like a kind of stuff – the substantiveness on to which properties are impressed. On this conception, the suggestion that the “piece” of substratum or “prime matter” that is here in object a, might always instead have been there in object b, seems to lack content.

It is useful at this point to take note of the three different functions the thin particular or substratum might fulfil. Its role might be (i) to bind the properties into a unity, so that they do not “fall apart” as C. B. Martin (1980) suggests: (ii) to individualise them, if they are universals, as Gustav Bergman (1947) proposed: (iii) to carry one across the categorial barrier from property to substance; that is, to be what it is that makes something to be in the category of substance.

The first role will not be necessary if one thinks that there is a “master property” of which the others are modes, or if one thinks that unity can come from some causal or organisational connection. (ii) will not apply to a tropist theory, or if one thinks that location will do the job. (iii) rests on the intuition that no collection of properties could, in themselves, amount to a substance: the very idea is a category mistake, and only the presence of a special “substantializing” element could do that. It might be argued that this intuition begs the question against the bundle theory.

3.3 Substances and sortals

As we mentioned in section 3.2, Aristotle’s analysis of substance into matter and form – his “hylomorphism” – can be thought of as a version of the substratum theory. It might make sense, therefore, to include contemporary hylomorphism in the foregoing section. However, neo-Aristotelian views also emphasise a second feature of Aristotle’s approach which deserves to be covered before moving onto hylomorphism.

The Aristotelian tradition anchors the concept of substance, at least in nature, primarily to instances of species of natural object. The Kantian tradition ties it to those enduring bodies the individuation of which gives sense and structure to our spatio-temporal framework. David Wiggins (1967, 1980, 2001) has made a sustained attempt to prove that these two objectives necessarily go together and to make the Aristotelian notion of substance, even including its bias towards the biological, central to our practice of individuating objects.

Wiggins assumes that individuating a temporally enduring object involves being able to re-identify it at different times and under different descriptions. This assumption makes it possible to state substance individuation using the language of identity. Within the scope of this assumption, he makes two claims. The first is the sortal relativity of identity: that is, when any a and b are asserted to be the same thing, they must be the same something-or-other, and the something-or-other must be the kind of concept that answers “what is it?” questions. In other words, there is no such a thing as “bare identity” – identity under no concept at all. Furthermore, the relevant concept must be an Aristotelian substance concept or sortal. More formally, this can be expressed as follows:

If a = b then there is a sortal F such that:
  1. a is an F
  2. b is an F
  3. a is the same F as b.

The second claim is that if the object picked out by “a” also falls under another sortal, G, then so will the object picked out by “b”, and it will be the same G as a. This is represented as an application of Leibniz’s Law, for if a is the-same-G-as-a (as it must be) then, as a = b, b must be the-same-G-as-a. Hence for any sortal G:

  1. a is G iff b is G,
  2. if a is G then b is the same G as a.

The conclusion is striking because it is a denial that a and b might be identical under one form of identification, but not under another. In fact it implies that every individuable object falls under just one ultimate sortal. (Wiggins admits this in 2001: 67 n.7. What is meant by ultimate sortal will emerge below.) For every ultimate sortal has its own principle of individuation, and if an object fell under more than one, there could be a time at which it satisfied the criteria for one and not for the other. Wiggins’s thesis is a very strong claim, apparently backed up by a powerful argument. It is a strong claim for it purports to prove that any world with individuable objects must be constituted by Aristotelian substances. The argument is powerful because it follows by simple logic, granted seemingly plausible claims about identity, and Leibniz’s Law.

On the other hand, there seem to be many cases of objects, which can be identified under a variety of concepts, leading to different life histories. This is termed relativity of identity. For example, a and b may be the same person but not the same child because b is a grown up and no longer a child. Or a and b may be the same lump of clay but not the same statue because b is the lump after it has been reshaped out of its statue shape. These are the most typical kinds of counter examples and Wiggins has responses to both. He deals with the first by invoking the concept of a phase sortal. A phase sortal is one that, by its meaning, denotes part of the life history of something, which, as a whole, is denoted by another sortal. So child is a phase sortal that applies to a phase of the things fully designated by human being. This illuminates an important aspect of the concept of a sortal. It is a necessary condition for F’s being an ultimate sortal that, whenever it applies to something, it applies in a present-tensed manner to the thing through the whole of its existence.

The statue and the lump of clay are dealt with by denying that the lump and the statue are identical: the lump of clay constitutes the statue, but is not identical with it. Notice that he could have argued that the statue was just a phase of the lump, but he does not do so because statue is not, by its very meaning, a phase sortal: statue, unlike child, does not indicate by its meaning a period in the existence of something.

So Wiggins deals with objections mainly by two distinctions. One is between sortals that apply to objects through the whole of their existence, and sortals appropriate only to a phase of their existence: the other is between the “is” of identity and the “is” of constitution. Correspondingly, criticism centres on whether the concepts under which we pick things out behave in as regimented a way as Wiggins requires, and on whether the “is” of constitution is sufficiently different from the “is” of identity to perform the task he wants of it. Wiggins’ views are discussed further in the following supplementary document:

Supplement on Wiggins, Substances, and Sortals

3.4 Contemporary hylomorphism

Since about the mid-1990s there has developed a debate covering similar territory to that discussed by Wiggins, but having rather different roots. It claims to be a revival of a broadly Aristotelian hylomorphism, but it comes mainly from disputes in mereology. A detailed overview of the topic and a defence of a bold scientifically informed form of contemporary hylomorphism can be found in Simpson (2021, 2023).

David Lewis famously propounded the doctrine of Unrestricted Composition: that is, any combination of things in the world constitutes a further thing (e.g., 1986: 211). So my left foot and any arbitrary stone at the bottom of the sea constitutes an object, though an object of no descriptive or explanatory interest. In the opposite corner, Peter van Inwagen (1990) denied that there was any such thing as composition, at least for inanimate material objects.

Van Inwagen’s main argument is that necessary and sufficient (particularly sufficient) conditions cannot be given for the kind of cohesion of parts that is supposed to bind atoms into complexes. None of the standard candidates – contact, fastening, adhesion, fusion, nor any acceptable disjunction of them – will suffice. They all have counterexamples. So the notion cannot be well defined. The arguments are subtle and interesting. The question might be raised whether van Inwagen gives sufficient consideration to the possibility of taking a line similar to that taken by Putnam on natural kinds. One fixes putative paradigm cases of non-living complexes, and says that the kind of cohesion required is whatever sort of bonding holds in those cases. It seems unlikely that there will not be a reasonably tidy, scientific account of how atoms bond. Nevertheless, van Inwagen’s mereological nihilism has a stopping point, namely that he believes that he, though a composite material object, really does exist. So organisms do exist.

Van Inwagen’s unwillingness (unlike the early Unger (1975)) to apply the nihilism to himself, and others like him, prompted the thought in other philosophers that there may be a way of having a doctrine of Restricted Composition on the basis of being things of the right kind – namely having a structure of the right kind – and that this idea resembled Aristotle’s notion of form and his doctrine of hylomorphism. Philosophers following this line of thought included Fine (1999, 2010), Johnston (2006), Lowe (2011), Koslicki (2008, 2018), Rea (2011) and Jaworski (2011, 2012). It is difficult to provide a compact account of these philosophers’ positions, as it can seem that all they have in common is a belief in some form of restricted composition and a sense that the Aristotelian label “hylomorphism” helps to give their theories a pedigree. Our strategy here will be to illustrate modern hylomorphism mainly using the examples of Jaworski and Johnston, then citing a major problem for any theory of this general kind, and illustrating this by reference to Marmodoro (2013), where good discussions of Lowe, Koslicki and Rea can be found. Following this we outline Simpson’s (2023) defence of a more ambitious version of hylomorphism that attempts to avoid the main problem facing other theories.

For most contemporary hylomorphists the notion that plays the crucial role in restricting composition is structure. Jaworski probably deploys this notion in the most straightforward way. He and Rea both use the following illustration. If you compact a human being in a machine or waterproof bag, you retain the same matter, but lose the human being, because you have destroyed the structure. Structure is, therefore, a real and essential element in many or most complex objects. He explains his theory as follows.

Hylomorphism claims…[t]hat structure is a basic ontological and explanatory category. (2011: 169)

Structure is also a basic explanatory principle in that it explains why members of this or that kind are able to engage in the behaviors they do. It is because humans are organized as they are, for instance, that they are able to speak, to learn, to engage in the range of activities that distinguish them from other living things and from non-living ones. (2011: 172)

Most influential contemporary hylomorphists would agree with these statements, but they each have their own way of stating the theory and it is not easy to fit them together. Johnston’s central account is as follows.

A statement of the genuine parts and principle of unity of an item…takes the following canonical form:

What it is for…(the item is specified here)…to be is for…(some parts are specified here) have the property or stand in the relation…(the principle of unity is specified here).

As in: What it is for this hydrochloric acid molecule to be is for this positive hydrogen ion and this negative chlorine ion to be bonded together. … The idea that each complex item will have some such canonical statement true of it might be fairly called ‘Hylomorphism’. For it is the idea that each complex item admits of a real definition, or statement of its essence, in terms of its matter, understood as parts or components, and its form, understood as a principle of unity. (2006: 658)

But Johnston’s notion of a “principle of unity” turns out to be so generous that his theory almost collapses into Lewis’s.

Consider then all the myriad ways of constructing putative wholes from items gravitationally related to other items. Are they all genuine wholes? Given Hylomorphism, there does not seem to be any happy way to insist that they are not all wholes, even though very few of them will be material objects or stable physical systems… A whole consisting of your eyeglasses and Pluto is too far from [normal physical object] paradigms in respect of compactness and maximality to count as a genuine whole in the ordinary sense. But it is fully, completely and genuinely true that it is a whole. (2006: 697)

One might wonder whether such an apparatus preserves what one might want to save from a common-sense notion of composition.

A general worry about the hylomorphist approach might be put as follows. The modern hylomorphists do not claim to be interpreting Aristotle, but to be inspired by his concept of form. This means that it is out of place simply to argue that they have not interpreted him in a scholarly fashion. Nevertheless, it is relevant to point it out if they have totally misunderstood his deployment of the concept of form, for if this is the case, it might suggest that they are pretending to a solution to the composition problem that they do not possess. Someone who was sceptical about their claim to a solution might start by pointing out that the moderns typically reject the “traditional” Aristotelian idea that form has a role as an efficient cause, actually making a difference to the way that its matter behaves. They deny this because they all want their theories to be consistent with the closure of the world under physics: the view that all effects are brought about by microphysical causes in accordance with physical laws. At the same time, they seem to intend their composites to have full ontological weight, and to have causal efficacy.

Jaworski is particularly clear in emphasising that he is a causal pluralist and that the structural level is in no sense epiphenomenal or a mere logical construct out of the lower properties (see his 2011: 174). But one might query whether this is consistent with accepting the possibility of closure under physics. Such closure naturally raises the question of the causal claims made for form or structure, and, hence, for their ontological weight. The importance of explanations at the level of complex structures is not disputed, but whether these represent just ways of conceptualising a fundamental level that we cannot normally access, is another matter. Johnston raises this question (2006: 660–62) but leaves it unresolved. Jaworski insists on causal pluralism, but admits “all forces are operating at a fundamental physical level”: This latter remark seems to concede that what one has in fact is an explanatory pluralism, with causation included in the domain of explanation, but all the brute force confined to physics. Johnston is keen to deny that explanation is a subjective or psychological phenomenon, but admitting this does not place explanation in the world, in the sense in which the forces that actually make things happen are in the world: it only gives them the Platonic objectivity of propositions or theories.

It seems that modern hylomorphism faces the following dilemma. The following argument has appeal.

1. The concept of structure is essential to all or most natural sciences.
2. If something is essential to a valid mode of explanation or understanding, then it should be conceived realistically.


3. There are real structures in the world.

But the following also has appeal.

4. It is sufficient for the concept of structure to be applicable that elements be appropriately arranged in the world, and these arrangements can be characterised without employing the notion of structure. This could be done by specifying the spatio-temporal location of the elements and their causal influence on each other.

If (4) is correct, it looks as if, though our structural concepts are well grounded in reality, structures are not part of the basic furniture of the world. This is, in fact, the same issue as whether Kim’s exclusion principle applies to the special sciences: that is, if physics gives a sufficient causal account of the location of all matter, are the other sciences merely heuristics, but strictly epiphenomenal? (See Kim 2005, Robinson 2014, Simpson 2023: 29–32) Perhaps the status of form and structure cannot be solved in a modern context without solving the exclusion issue.

Anna Marmodoro (2013) argues that the modern hylomorphists have misunderstood Aristotle in a radical fashion, in a way that is directly connected with their concern about the unity and hence reality of composites. She claims, with strong backing from the text, that form is not structure, because it is not a combination of parts. The essence of form is its unity, and its unity depends essentially on the fact that the matter that comes to compose it loses its previous identity. By contrast, in any kind of structure of parts this identity is not lost; the parts are merely organised in a certain way.

On this interpretation, Aristotle must deny the core of (4), which is that the behaviour of complexes derives necessarily from the primitive causal powers of the elements and their spatial relations – this is a “bottom up” atomist principle, and presupposes that the parts retain their identity within composites. But without this core idea in (4), it is difficult to see how there can be “closure under physics”, for if the atoms did not retain their identity, how could the nomic structure that rests on them be preserved?

There seems to be, therefore, a tension between two principles the modern hylomorphists seem to want to preserve. The tension is between the role of form as the creator of a genuine, non-conventional unity in composites, and an openness to the modern belief in the closure of the world under physics.

A modern hylomorphist who takes seriously the tension between the thesis that form plays a genuine causal role and the principle that all effects are brought about by microphysical causes is William Simpson (2021, 2023). Simpson (2023: 32–4) argues that positions such as Jaworkski’s that invoke causal pluralism to reconcile hylomorphism with closure under physics fail to give form the genuine causal role that would earn it a place in our ontology. Instead, he argues that hylomorphists should reevaluate the idea that the material world is closed under physics in the first place. Though it may be an entrenched orthodoxy among analytical philosophers, closure under physics does not follow from our best theory of the behaviour of matter: quantum mechanics. Rather, the implications of quantum mechanics for closure under physics depend on the specific interpretation of the theory one adopts and, in particular, how that interpretation deals with the “measurement problem”: the problem of explaining how macroscopic devices come to register determinate measurement outcomes when the Schrodinger equation only describes a distribution of probabilities. According to the physicist Barbara Drossel and cosmologist George Ellis’s contextual wave function collapse theory, determinate measurement outcomes occur because macroscopic objects act on microscopic objects in a manner that is not itself governed by the microphysical laws. Drossel and Ellis’s theory is empirically equivalent to other interpretations of quantum mechanics and so, Simpson argues, hylomorphists are not obliged to reconcile their position with the thesis that all forces are microphysical. Instead, drawing on the work of Koons (2014, 2022 [Other Internet Resources]), Simpson proposes a version of hylomorphism that treats macroscopic substances as fundamental physical entities with causal powers that would not be expected on the basis of microphysics and are irreducible to the powers of their microscopic parts (Simpson 2021, 2023: 41–4).

3.5 Substance and teleology

There is one mark of substance that was important to Aristotle that we have not discussed. This is the connection between substance and teleology; that is, the notion that what something is is intimately connected with its natural purpose, end or function. The association with teleology does not naturally recommend itself to the modern mind. Wiggins, for example, says that “it would have been both possible and advantageous for Aristotle to distance [his account of substance] from his concern with final causes…” (2001: 80). The concern with teleology is presumably thought to be too closely connected with Aristotle’s theology, or the idea that it is divine design or intelligence that gives natural objects their ends. Nevertheless, it is not easy for an Aristotelian to make a complete break from teleology, and some contemporary Aristotelians have defended the compatibility of a teleological conception of substance with a scientific account of the natural world (e.g. Simpson 2023: 45–63).

Teleology is what distinguishes living things that act for purposes and have organs with functions from lumps and rocks, and it is the former that Aristotelians see as the paradigm substances. It is no accident, therefore, that artefacts, which are generally defined by their function, are often cited as good illustrations – even if not paradigm cases – of substances. So we have a tension developing. On the one hand, lumps and rocks are good paradigm cases of our notion of natural enduring objects. But they are bad cases of objects with purposes or ends. Artefacts are good cases of things with purposes, and are reasonably enduring, but are not natural objects. Living things come near to getting the best of both worlds. They are natural and enduring, and they have purposes, in the sense of natural goals in their behaviour. (Although, according to the modern perspective they do not possess a final end, unlike artefacts: a knife is for cutting, but there is nothing a dog is for, though it has many ends en passant.)

This teleological approach to substance could be expressed as the view that the substances in a given system are those entities crucial from the teleological or design perspective of that system. “Crucial”, here, means that other things exist either to constitute them or to provide a context of operations for them.

The tension between the teleological mark of the substantial and the others we have considered might make it useful to distinguish between descriptive ontological priority and teleological ontological priority. The former is interested in a purely descriptive account of what exists, and it, therefore, rates as the substances those entities that a purely descriptive science would count as basic. The latter, however, counts as substances those things that are deemed fundamental because of the role or function they play in the world. This contrast is most plain in the case of artefacts. An artefact is made of its parts, and, in a sense, they are more basic than it because they constitute it. But if there were not artefacts of the appropriate kind, those parts would never have come into existence: if there were no motor cars, there would be no steering wheels or accelerator pedals. Thus, like Aristotle’s severed finger (Metaphysics 1035b 23–5), these latter do not count as substances. But it is not true that the parts would not exist without the whole if one takes parts right down to the natural elements and atoms that make the artefact. Then one has a conflict about what is deemed basic between the descriptive and the teleological criteria. It is to avoid this conflict that Aristotle rejects atomism, by allowing that there are no true entities, only stuffs, more basic than those he wants to treat as substances by the criteria of teleological significance. He avoids having to face the problem that one set of things is basic or substantial descriptively, namely the atoms from which everything is constituted, and another set of things – the macroscopic objects of our ordinary lives – are substances by the criterion of teleological importance. Because matter is stuff, not individuals, the objects that are teleologically important are also the descriptively basic objects, because what they are made of are not objects at all.

It could be argued that atomism can be reconciled with treating the things that are significant for us as substances only if one thinks of the atoms as existing only in order to constitute such objects. This would be so if God had created the atoms so as to construct macroscopic objects from them, just as we create the parts of artefacts only for the sake of the artefacts. It might be argued that the same objective could be reached without theism if there is irreducible teleology in nature that gives significance to the rest. Thomas Nagel’s view in his (2012) either adopts or comes close to this position. But Nagel’s position seems to challenge natural science within its own realm, whereas the “theological artefact” model does not. It is uncontroversial that an artefact, such as a clock, can be both mechanical and defined as the kind of thing that it is by its function. Applying this model to nature as a whole would involve bringing theology into Aristotle’s metaphysics more directly than he, or indeed Aquinas, intended. The notion that an object is what it is because of its use is found in Heidegger (1927 [2008]) but this is the use to which we put objects, not a divinely ordained teleology; Heidegger’s theory imports the subjective perspective implicit in phenomenology, and this runs counter to Aristotle’s objectivism. If, however, one takes the teleology to be designed into creation, this subjectivism is eliminated, and if one thinks that teleology is the key determinant of substantial identity, as with artefacts, then one has preserved the doctrine of substance, rather than replacing it by a mere theory of function. This would have the consequence that if the designer could change the purpose of an object whilst leaving it physically unchanged – as we do if we use a knife as a screwdriver – then its substantial identity will change. (Schillebeeckx, 1968, Dummett, 1987, Robinson, 2016)

4. Conclusion

All non-relativist philosophical systems acknowledge substances in the most generic sense of that term, for that is only to acknowledge that there are some fundamental entities in their system. Most, if not all, philosophers acknowledge that we cannot function without using substance concepts in the narrower sense, for the notion of an enduring particular or individual substance is essential to our making sense of the world as we live in it. But three things at least remain controversial. First, it is disputed what kinds of concepts need to be deployed to characterise these things: are they the rich variety of traditional or “Aristotelian” substance concepts, or will various ways of identifying things simply as physical bodies with certain characteristics do the job? Second, it is still unclear how far our substance concepts purport to reflect a component in reality (real or imagined) over and above the bundle of properties that constitute its intelligible aspects. Third, the unclarity of the connection between what a thing is and what it does leaves unresolved the degree of interdependence between substance concepts and notions of purpose and final causation


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The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for carefully reading this entry and pointing out a number of typographic and other infelicitous errors.

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