Eliminative Materialism

First published Thu May 8, 2003; substantive revision Mon Mar 11, 2019

Eliminative materialism (or eliminativism) is the radical claim that our ordinary, common-sense understanding of the mind is deeply wrong and that some or all of the mental states posited by common-sense do not actually exist and have no role to play in a mature science of the mind. Descartes famously challenged much of what we take for granted, but he insisted that, for the most part, we can be confident about the content of our own minds. Eliminative materialists go further than Descartes on this point, since they challenge the existence of various mental states that Descartes took for granted.

1. A Brief History

In principle, anyone denying the existence of some type of thing is an eliminativist with regard to that type of thing. Thus, there have been a number of eliminativists about different aspects of human nature in the history of philosophy. For example, hard determinists like Holbach (1770) are eliminativists with regard to free will because they claim there is no dimension of human psychology that corresponds to our commonsense notion of freedom. Similarly, by denying that there is an ego or persisting subject of experience, Hume (1739) was arguably an eliminativist about the self. Reductive materialists can be viewed as eliminativists with respect to an immaterial soul.

Nevertheless, contemporary eliminative materialism—the sort of eliminativism that denies the existence of specific types of mental states—is a relatively new theory with a very short history. The term was first introduced by James Cornman in a 1968 article entitled “On the Elimination of ‘Sensations’ and Sensations” (Cornman, 1968). However, the basic idea goes back at least as far as C.D. Broad’s classic, The Mind and its Place in Nature (Broad, 1925). Here Broad discusses, and quickly rejects, a type of “pure materialism” that treats mental states as attributes that apply to nothing in the world (pp. 607–611). Like many future writers (see section 4.1 below), Broad argued that such a view is self-contradictory since it (presumably) presupposes the reality of misjudgments which are themselves a type of mental state.

Apart from Broad’s discussion, the main roots of eliminative materialism can be found in the writings of a number of mid-20th century philosophers, most notably Wilfred Sellars, W.V.O. Quine, Paul Feyerabend, and Richard Rorty. In his important 1956 article, “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind”, Sellars introduced the idea that our conception of mentality may be derived not from direct access to the inner workings of our own minds, but instead from a primitive theoretical framework that we inherit from our culture. While Sellars himself regarded this theoretical framework as empirically correct, his claim that our conception of the mind is theory-based, and at least in principle falsifiable, would be influential to later supporters of eliminativism.

In articles such as “Mental Events and the Brain” (1963), Paul Feyerabend explicitly endorsed the idea that common-sense psychology might prove to be radically false. Indeed, Feyerabend held that practically any version of materialism would severely undermine common-sense psychology. Like many of his contemporaries, Feyerabend argued that common-sense mental notions are essentially non-physical in character. Thus, for him, any form of physicalism would entail that there are no mental processes or states as understood by common-sense (1963, p. 295).

Like Feyerabend, Quine also endorsed the idea that mental notions like belief or sensation could simply be abandoned in favor of a more accurate physiological account. In a brief passage in Word and Object (1960), Quine suggests that terms denoting the physical correlates of mental states will be more useful and, as he puts it, “[t]he bodily states exist anyway; why add the others?” (p. 264). However, Quine goes on to question just how radical an eliminativist form of materialism would actually be, implying no significant difference between explicating mental states as physiological states, and eliminating mental state terms in favor of physical state terms. He asks, “Is physicalism a repudiation of mental objects after all, or a theory of them? Does it repudiate the mental state of pain or anger in favor of its physical concomitant, or does it identify the mental state with a state of the physical organism (and so a state of the physical organism with the mental state)” (p. 265)? Quine answers this question by rejecting it, suggesting there is no interesting difference between the two cases: “Some may therefore find comfort in reflecting that the distinction between an eliminative and an explicative physicalism is unreal” (p. 265).

Here we see a tension that runs throughout the writings of many early eliminative materialists. The problem involves a vacillation between two different conditions under which mental concepts and terms are dropped. The first scenario proposes that certain mental concepts will turn out to be empty, with mental state terms referring to nothing that actually exists. Historical analogs for this way of understanding eliminativism are cases where we (now) say it turned out there are no such things, such as demons and crystal spheres. The second scenario suggests that the conceptual framework provided by neurosciences (or some other physical account) can or should come to replace the common-sense framework we now use. Unlike the first scenario, the second allows that mental state terms may actually designate something real—it’s just that what they designate turn out to be brain states, which will be more accurately described using the terminology of the relevant sciences. One possible model for this way of thinking about eliminativism might be the discontinuance of talk about germs in favor of more precise scientific terminology of infectious agents. Given these two different conceptions, early eliminativists would sometimes offer two different characterizations of their view: (a) There are no mental states, just brain states and, (b) There really are mental states, but they are just brain states (and we will come to view them that way).

These alternative ways of understanding eliminative materialism produced considerable confusion about what, exactly, eliminative materialism entailed. Moreover, since it was difficult to see how the second version was significantly different from various forms of reductive materialism (hence, Quine’s skepticism about the difference between elimination and explication) it also raised doubts about the distinctiveness of eliminative materialism.

Much of this was brought to light in the discussion generated by an influential 1965 article by Richard Rorty entitled, “Mind-Body Identity, Privacy, and Categories”. Rorty’s so-called “disappearance” theory appeared to openly endorse both conceptions of eliminative materialism, suggesting that sensations do not actually exist and that they are nothing but brain processes (p. 28). As one might expect, the ensuing discussion focused on getting clear on what Rorty’s theory actually claimed (for doubts about Rorty’s status as a true eliminative materialist, see Ramsey (forthcoming)). For example, Cornman’s article introducing the phrase ‘eliminative materialism’ claimed that Rorty was arguing that talk about sensations denotes brain states in much the same way that talk about Zeus’s thunderbolts (allegedly) denotes electrical discharges. Unfortunately, besides suggesting a questionable perspective on reference, this interpretation raised further questions about what distinguished eliminativism from reductionism. In one helpful article by William Lycan and George Pappas (1972)—entitled, appropriately enough, “What Is Eliminative Materialism?”—the authors convincingly argued that you can’t have it both ways. You can either claim that common sense mental notions do not pick out anything real and that mental terms are empty, in which case you are a true eliminative materialist; or you can claim that mental notions can be, in some way, reduced to neurological (or perhaps computational) states of the brain, in which case you are really just a good-old fashioned materialist/reductionist. In a follow-up article, Steven Savitt (1974) introduced the distinction between ontologically conservative (reductive) and ontologically radical (eliminative) theory change, which helped to further clarify and distinguish the central claims of eliminative materialism as it is understood today.

In more recent history, eliminative materialism has received attention from a broader range of writers, including many concerned not only with the metaphysics of the mind, but also the process of theory change, the status of semantic properties, the nature of psychological explanation and recent developments in cognitive science. Much of this attention has been fostered by the husband-wife team of Paul and Patricia Churchland, whose writings have forced many philosophers and cognitive scientists to take eliminativism more seriously. In his 1981 article, “Eliminative Materialism and the Propositional Attitudes”, Paul Churchland presents several arguments in favor of dropping commonsense psychology that have shaped the modern debate about the status of ordinary notions like belief. Patricia Churchland’s provocative 1986 book, Neurophilosophy, suggests that developments in neuroscience point to a bleak future for commonsense mental states. Another influential author has been Stephen Stich. His important 1983 book, From Folk Psychology to Cognitive Science: The Case Against Belief, argues that even conventional computational psychology—which is often assumed to vindicate common-sense psychology—should reject taxonomies for cognitive states that correspond with belief-desire psychology. These authors’ views are discussed in more detail in Sections 3 and 4 below.

2. Contemporary Eliminative Materialism

Modern versions of eliminative materialism claim that our common-sense understanding of psychological states and processes is deeply mistaken and that some or all of our ordinary notions of mental states will have no home, at any level of analysis, in a sophisticated and accurate account of the mind. In other words, it is the view that certain common-sense mental states, such as beliefs and desires, do not exist. To establish this claim, eliminativists typically endorse two central and controversial claims which we will examine below. Much of our discussion will focus upon our notion of belief, since it figures so prominently in contemporary discussions of eliminative materialism. However, many of the arguments presented below are thought to generalize to other mental notions—especially other propositional attitudes.

2.1 Folk Psychology and the Theory-Theory

The standard argument for eliminative materialism begins with the Sellarsian thesis that we employ a theoretical framework to explain and predict intelligent behavior. Because this position claims that we use a theory when employing mental idiom, it is often referred to as the “theory-theory” (see the entry on folk psychology as a theory), and is endorsed not only by eliminative materialists, but by many realists about mental states as well (like Sellars). Folk psychology is assumed to consist of both generalizations (or laws) and specific theoretical posits, denoted by our everyday psychological terms like ‘belief’ or ‘pain’. The generalizations are assumed to describe the various causal or counterfactual relations and regularities of the posits. For instance, a typical example of a folk psychological generalization would be:

If someone has the desire for X and the belief that the best way to get X is by doing Y, then (barring certain conditions) that person will tend to do Y.

Advocates of the theory-theory claim that generalizations like these function in folk psychology much like the laws and generalizations of scientific theories. At the same time, many theory-theorists allow that the laws of folk psychology are learned more informally than scientific theories, as part of our normal development (see, for example, P. M. Churchland, 1981 and Lewis, 1972).

According to theory-theorists, the posits of folk psychology are simply the mental states that figure in our everyday psychological explanations. Theory-theorists maintain the (controversial) position that, as theoretical posits, these states are not directly observed, though they are thought to account for observable effects like overt behavior. Theory-theorists also claim that common-sense assigns a number of properties to these states, such as causal, semantic and qualitative features. For instance, the theory-theory claims common-sense assigns two sorts of properties to beliefs. First, there are various causal properties. Beliefs are the sort of states that are caused in certain specific circumstances, interact with other cognitive states in various ways, and come to generate various sorts of behavior, depending on the agent’s other desires and mental states. As functionalists have claimed, these causal roles appear to define our ordinary notion of belief and distinguish them from other types of mental states. Second, beliefs have intentionality; that is, they each express a proposition or are about a particular state of affairs. This inherent intentionality (also called “meaning”, “content”, and “semantic character”), is commonly regarded as something special about beliefs and other propositional attitudes. Moreover, as we will see below, it is also a popular target of eliminative materialists who challenge the propriety and explanatory value of beliefs.

Although eliminative materialists have traditionally appealed to something like the idea that our folk conception of the mind is a theory, as suggested by the theory-theory, it does not actually require that our commonsense mental notions are embedded in a theoretical framework used for explaining and predicting. Virtually any sort of embedding conceptual framework could be proposed in support of the first step of the eliminativist argument. In fact, although it is seldom recognized, the only thing eliminative materialism actually requires is the relatively weak assumption that we have mental concepts (i.e., concepts of mental states and processes) and that those concepts assign certain properties to those mental states and processes. Even opponents of the theory-theory will typically allow that we possess some sort of conception of mental states like beliefs or pains and that such a conception (at least tacitly) assigns to their corresponding mental entities a variety of intrinsic, relational, intentional, phenomenal, causal, and temporal properties. Anyone who denies this would be denying that we possess notions of mental states – a highly implausible view.

2.2 Eliminative Theory Change

The second component of eliminative materialism is the thesis that folk psychology is profoundly wrong about the actual nature of the mind/brain. Eliminative materialists argue that the central tenets of folk psychology radically misdescribe cognitive processes; consequently, the posits of folk psychology have no role to play in a serious scientific theory of the mind because the posits pick out nothing that is real. Like dualists, eliminative materialists insist that ordinary mental states cannot be reduced to or identified with neurological events or processes. However, unlike dualists, straightforward eliminativists claim there is nothing more to the mind than what occurs in the brain. The reason mental states are irreducible is not because they are non-physical; rather, it is because mental states, as described by common-sense psychology, do not really exist.

To see all of this a little better, it will help to return to the important distinction made by Steven Savitt discussed in Section 1 between ontologically conservative (or retentive) theory change on the one hand, and ontologically radical (or eliminative) theory change on the other hand. Ontologically conservative theory change occurs when the entities and posits of the replaced theory are relocated, often with some degree of revision, in the replacing theory. For example, as our theory of light was gradually replaced by our understanding of electro-magnetic radiation, our conception of light was dramatically transformed as we recognized ways in which our old conception was mistaken or incomplete. Nevertheless, at no point did we come to say that there is really no such thing as light. Rather, light was eventually identified with a form of electro-magnetic radiation.

By contrast, our notion of demons did not come to find a new home in contemporary theories of mental disorder. There is nothing in the theories of schizophrenia, Tourette’s Syndrome, neuro-pathology or any of the other modern explanations for bizarre behavior, that we can sensibly identify with malevolent spirits with supernatural powers. The notion of a demon is just too far removed from anything we now posit to explain behavior that was once explained by demonology. Consequently, the transition from demonology to modern accounts of this behavior was ontologically radical. We dropped demons from our current ontology, and came to realize that the notion is empty—it refers to nothing real.

Eliminative materialists claim that an ontologically radical theory change awaits the theoretical posits of folk psychology in a manner similar to these cases. With straightforward eliminativism, just as we came to understand that there are no such things as demons (because nothing at all like demons appear in modern accounts of strange behavior), so too, eliminative materialists argue that various folk psychological concepts—like our concept of belief—will eventually be recognized as empty posits that fail to correspond with anything that actually exists. Since there is nothing that has the causal and semantic properties we attribute to beliefs (and many other mental states) it will turn out that there really are no such things.

It should be noted that a somewhat similar framework for understanding eliminative materialism is provided by David Lewis’s discussion of functional definitions in psychology (1972) (see the entry on functionalism). In Lewis’s account, our commonsense mental notions can be treated as functionally defined theoretical terms that appear in a chain of Ramsey-sentences. The Ramsey-sentences are a formal reconstruction of the platitudes of commonsense psychology. They provide a set of roles or conditions that more or less must be met for the instantiation of any given state. If nothing comes close to actually filling the roles specified by this framework for a certain state, then we are warranted in saying that the theoretical posit in question doesn’t refer and there is no such thing. Eliminative materialists claim that this is precisely what will happen with at least some of our folk mental notions.

2.3 Category Elimination

We have been treating eliminative materialism as a metaphysical claim about the ontological status of the posits of commonsense psychology; as the claim that there exists nothing that corresponds to the concept in question — it picks out nothing real. This is analogous to what happened in the case of demons and crystal spheres. Because there are no such things, these concepts have no role to play in a proper scientific ontology. However, in recent years the term ‘eliminativism’ has been applied to a very different type of ontological stance toward the posits of commonsense psychology. This alternative stance is that although the commonsense concept does indeed correspond with something real, the kind in question is, for a host of reasons, ill-suited for serious scientific theorizing. Thus, dropping the commonsense concept from science is, at least in part, due to pragmatic considerations about proper scientific practice. Irvine and Sprevak refer to this as “discourse eliminativism” (Irvine and Sprevak, forthcoming). With conventional eliminative materialism, any token invoking of the mental state concept or term will designate nothing — the concept or term has no identifiable intentional object. By contrast, with this alternative picture, particular uses of a mental state concept or term may indeed refer to some actual neurological state or condition that shares many of the features associated with the concept in question. However, because no legitimate scientific type maps properly onto the folk psychological type, the latter should be dropped from the categories of scientific psychology. So with this alternative interpretation of eliminativism, the alleged problem with folk psychology has more to do with the classification system it provides for certain types of mental states or processes; its criteria for demarcation and categorization are grossly ill-suited for cognitive science. The unscientific nature of the category may be due to a variety of considerations (or combination of considerations) including (but not limited to) demarcation criteria that are overly subjective or context dependent, cut across more natural kinds, reduce to wildly disjunctive arrays of real properties, fail to yield useful generalizations, collapse together useful levels of analysis, and so on. Thus, this alternative conception of eliminativism is the exact converse of certain forms of instrumentalism. Whereas an instrumentalist might claim that there are no X’s, but we should continue invoking or talking about X’s in science for pragmatic reasons, a proponent of this alternative picture of eliminativism says there really are X’s, but we should stop using the category in science for pragmatic reasons.

To see this a little better, consider our concept of weed. It is used in everyday life to pick out certain actual plants, but the category is badly ill-suited for science. The category of weeds is highly subjective and cross-classifies a number of natural floral kinds. While it would be wrong to say there are no such things as weeds, the notion does not belong in the science of botany. The alternative conception of eliminativism is based on the idea that certain commonsense psychological categories should be regarded as similar to the category of weeds. Although the folk notion in question may correspond with something actual, the folk category should be dropped from the sciences of the mind because it is inappropriate for serious scientific theorizing and explanation.

An illustration of this alternative picture of eliminativism is provided by Paul Griffiths’ account of our commonsense notion of emotion (Griffiths, 1997). Griffiths argues that the category of emotion should be dropped from scientific psychology and replaced with categories that are better grounded in scientific psychology and neuroscience. He points out that the folk concept cuts across three different kinds of affective states: affect programs, higher cognitive emotions and social constructions. Affect programs are basic and automatic states such as fear or anger that have an evolutionary basis and that are triggered by specific conditions. By contrast, higher cognitive emotions, like jealousy or shame, and social constructions are much less automatic and more easily influenced by a broader range of factors like higher-order thoughts or cultural conditioning. Griffiths argues that these psychological types are almost certainly subserved by radically different cognitive mechanisms and consequently should not be lumped together under some superordinate commonsense category of emotion. Griffiths develops a similar line of argument against emotion based upon levels of analysis and the difference between function-based taxonomies as opposed to lineage-based taxonomies.

A comparable type of outlook is endorsed by Edouard Machery with regard to our concept of (ironically) concepts (Machery, 2008). Machery argues that because our folk notion of concept corresponds to such a heterogeneous group of scientific kinds of stored information — including prototypes, exemplars, and theories — then psychologists would be better off just using these scientific categories and abandoning talk of concepts altogether. Similar sorts of arguments have been leveled against the folk categories of belief (Stich, 1983), pain (Hardcastle, 1999), consciousness (Irvine, 2012), and mental illness (Murphy and Stich, 1999).

One problem with this gloss on eliminativism is that it often depends upon controversial normative claims about appropriate scientific taxonomies. Many deny that, say, the highly disjunctive nature of a commonsense notion is sufficient justification for dropping it. If it was, we would eliminate the categories of memory and inference from scientific psychology. While authors like Griffiths and Machery present very sophisticated arguments involving specific details about the categories in question, most of these arguments either explicitly or tacitly make claims about the requirements of proper scientific categorization that are highly contentious in the philosophy of science (see, for example, the discussion in Machery, 2010).

A second and more serious problem is that this alternative conception of eliminative materialism is not, strictly speaking, a type of eliminative materialism. The claim that some category possesses members but the category itself is nevertheless ill-suited for science is not just a weaker version of the claim that a category is ill-suited for science because it has no members. Say what you will about weeds, clothing, pets and other kinds that are not scientifically respectable, it is clearly wrong to suggest these things are not real. Thus, to avoid confusion, it would probably help if a term other than ‘eliminativism’ was adopted to designate this alternative conception. Irvine and Sprevak’s ‘discourse eliminativism’ is problematic because, besides wrongly implying it is a version of eliminativism, there can also be discourse changes that involve the elimination of a term but where the relevant relabeled category is fully retained. The term ‘consumption’ has been dropped from our scientific nomenclature, but it successfully referred to the legitimately taxonomized disease we now refer to as ‘tuberculosis’. Perhaps a phrase like ‘category dissolution’ or ‘conceptual fragmentation’ would more accurately capture the sort of thing that people like Griffiths and Machery have in mind.

3. Arguments For Eliminative Materialism

Because eliminative materialism is grounded in the claim that common sense psychology is radically false, arguments for eliminativism are generally arguments against the tenability of folk psychology. These arguments typically fall into one of two major families. One family involves arguments stemming from a broad range of considerations that pertain to the assessment of theories in general. The second family focuses upon deficiencies that are unique to folk psychology and its central posits.

3.1 General Theoretical Problems With Folk Psychology

Patricia and Paul Churchland have offered a number of arguments based on general considerations about theory evaluation. For example, they have argued that any promising and accurate theory should offer a fertile research program with considerable explanatory power. They note, however, that common-sense psychology appears to be stagnant, and there is a broad range of mental phenomena that folk psychology does not allow us to explain. Questions about why we dream, various aspects of mental illness, consciousness, memory and learning are completely ignored by folk psychology. According to the Churchlands, these considerations indicate that folk psychology may be in much worse shape than we commonly recognize (P. M. Churchland, 1981; P.S. Churchland, 1986). Another argument that appeals to general theoretical considerations offers an inductive inference based on the past record of folk theories. Folk physics, folk biology, folk epidemiology and the like all proved to be radically mistaken. Since folk theories generally turn out to be mistaken, it seems quite improbable that folk psychology will turn out true. Indeed, since folk psychology concerns a subject that is far more complex and difficult than any past folk theory, it seems wildly implausible that this one time we actually got things right (Churchland, P.M. 1981).

These general theoretical arguments do not seem to have significantly undermined the intuitive support that folk psychology enjoys. In response to the charge that folk psychology is stagnant, many have argued that this assessment is unfair, and that folk psychology has actually stimulated a number of fruitful research programs in scientific psychology (Greenwood, 1991; Horgan and Woodward, 1985). Moreover, defenders of folk psychology note that it hardly follows from the observation that a given theory is incomplete, or fails to explain everything, that it is therefore radically false (Horgan and Woodward, 1985). Defenders of folk psychology object that these theoretical considerations cannot outweigh the evidence provided by everyday, ordinary experience of our own minds, such as our introspective experience, which seems to vividly support the reality of mental states like beliefs.

Regarding this last point, eliminativists like the Churchlands warn that we should be deeply suspicious about the reliability of introspective “evidence” about the inner workings of the mind. If inner observation is as theory-laden as many now suppose outer perception to be, what we introspect may be largely determined by our folk psychological framework. In other words, “introspecting” beliefs may be just like people “seeing” demonic spirits or celestial spheres (Churchland, P.M., 1988). This skepticism about the reliability of introspection is bolstered by empirical work that calls into question the reliability of introspection (Nisbett and Wilson, 1977). As we will see in Section 3.3, the idea that introspection offers an illusory image of the mind is gaining popularity not just with regard to information bearing states like beliefs, but also with regard to phenomenal states like qualia.

3.2 Specific Problems With Folk Psychology

The second family of eliminative materialist arguments focuses upon idiosyncratic features of folk-psychological posits and ultimately denies that these features will be accommodated by a scientific account of the mind. The most widely discussed features are two associated with the apparent linguistic nature of beliefs and other propositional attitudes. First, as a number of philosophers have recently noted, propositional attitudes appear to have a form similar to public language sentences, with a compositional structure and syntax. For example, a person’s belief that, say, the president dislikes terrorists appears to be composed of the concepts “THE PRESIDENT”, “DISLIKES”, and “TERRORISTS”, and differs from the belief that terrorists dislike the president by virtue of something analogous to syntactic arrangement. Second, beliefs resemble public sentences in that they have semantic properties. Beliefs, like public linguistic representations, are about different states of affairs. Both of these quasi-linguistic features of propositional attitudes—their alleged sentential structure and their semantic (or intentional) properties—have been used by philosophers to mount arguments for eliminativism.

3.2.1 Challenging The Syntactic Structure Of Beliefs

Some writers have emphasized the apparent mismatch between the sentential structure of propositional attitudes on the one hand, and the actual neurological structures of the brain on the other hand. Whereas the former involves discrete symbols and a combinatorial syntax, the latter involves action potentials, spiking frequencies and spreading activation. As Patricia Churchland (1986) has argued, it is hard to see where in the brain we are going to find anything that even remotely resembles the sentence-like structure that appears to be essential to beliefs and other propositional attitudes.

In response to this line of reasoning, many have argued that it is a mistake to treat folk psychology as committed to a quasi-linguistic structure to propositional attitudes (Horgan and Graham, 1991; Dennett, 1991). And even for those who find this reading of folk psychology plausible, there is a further difficulty regarding the relevance of neuroscience for determining the status of folk psychology. Some, such as Zenon Pylyshyn (1984), have insisted that just as the physical circuitry of a computer is the wrong level of analysis to look for computational symbol structures, so too, the detailed neurological wiring of the brain is the wrong level of organization to look for structures that might qualify as beliefs. Instead, if we view the mind as the brain’s program, as many advocates of classical AI do, then folk posits exist at a level of analysis that is more abstract than the neuro-physical details. Consequently, many realists about the posits of folk psychology discount the importance of any apparent mis-match between neurological architecture and the alleged linguistic form of propositional attitudes (Fodor & Pylyshyn, 1988; McLaughlin & Warfield, 1994).

3.2.2 Challenging the Semantic Properties of Beliefs

The second type of argument against beliefs focuses upon their semantic properties and concludes that these sorts of properties make propositional attitudes ill-suited for even a computational theory of the mind. Stephen Stich (1983) has emphasized that folk psychology individuates beliefs by virtue of their semantic properties, e.g., we taxonomize states like beliefs by virtue of what they are about. However, according to Stich, there are a host of reasons for rejecting a semantic taxonomy for scientific psychology. Semantic taxonomies ignore causally salient aspects of cognitive states, involve a high degree of vagueness, and break down in the case of the mentally ill or the very young. In place of the semantic individuation method adopted by folk psychology, Stich argues for a syntactic taxonomy that is based upon the causally relevant syntactic or physical properties of a given cognitive state.

Yet, as Stich himself notes, even if it should turn out that folk posits do not belong in a scientific psychology, more is needed to establish that they do not actually exist. After all, we do not doubt the existence of several sorts of things (e.g., chairs, articles of clothing) that are defined in ways that make them ill-suited for science. Thus, Stich’s account is not truly eliminativist for the reasons we saw in Section 2.3: his prescription is for a scientifically superior taxonomy that still involves belief-like states. Moreover, if our best scientific account posited states that share many features with beliefs, such as similar causal roles, then even if the two taxonomies pulled apart in certain cases, we may still regard folk psychology as, in some sense, vindicated. While the scientific taxonomy may not list beliefs as basic cognitive states, it could conceivably still provide the resources for developing a realist interpretation of these and other folk psychological states.

3.2.3 Eliminativism and Cognitive Science

One way to get a stronger eliminativist conclusion would be to argue that there is nothing posited in a scientific account of cognition that shares the central properties we attribute to folk psychological states, at any level of analysis. For example, Ramsey, Stich and Garon (1990) have argued that if certain connectionist models of memory and inference prove successful, then this would form the basis for eliminative materialism regarding states like propositional memories. Since some connectionist models store information in a highly distributed manner, there are no causally discrete, semantically evaluable data structures that represent specific propositions. It is not just that these models lack the sort of sentential, compositional representations assumed in more traditional (or “language of thought”) models. Rather, it is that in these networks there are no causally distinct structures that stand for specific states of affairs. Consequently, there do not appear to be any structures in these networks that might serve as candidates for beliefs and other propositional attitudes. This is noteworthy since many critics of eliminativism claim it is virtually impossible to imagine what a psychological theory would look like that doesn’t invoke propositional attitudes to explain cognition (Hannan, 1993). If Ramsey, Stich and Garon are right, certain connectionist models may, for the first time, provide us with a plausible account of cognition that supports the denial of belief-like states. More recently, Ramsey (2007) has argued that this earlier argument does not go far enough, insisting that connectionist models of this sort not only fail to invoke inner representations that are sufficiently similar to the posits of folk psychology, but that they don’t actually invoke inner representational states at all.

Ramsey, Stich and Garon’s argument assumes that in highly distributed networks, it is impossible to specify the semantic content of elements of the network that are causally responsible for various cognitive episodes. Some have responded to their argument by suggesting that, with highly sophisticated forms of analysis, it actually is possible to pick out causally relevant pieces of stored information (Forster and Saidel, 1994). Others have argued that, like the Churchlands, Ramsey, Stich and Garon have offered a mistaken interpretation of folk psychology, suggesting it requires far less in the way of explicit, discrete structures than they suggest (Dennett, 1991; Heil, 1991). This is a common criticism of eliminative materialism, and we will look at it more closely in Section 4.3.

Another development in cognitive science that has pushed some people in the direction of eliminativism is the attempt to understand cognitive systems as neither classical nor connectionist computational devices, but rather as dynamic systems, described using the mathematical framework of dynamic systems theory (Beer, 2000; van Gelder, 1992; Port and van Gelder, 1995). This approach is often conjoined with some version of embodied cognition, as both place a strong emphasis on the way cognitive agents move about and interact with their environment. While neither the dynamic nor the embodied approaches are inherently anti-representational in nature, at least some authors have employed them to develop accounts of cognitive processes that abandon inner representational states altogether. For example, Anthony Chemero has promoted what he calls “radical embodied cognitive science” (Chemero, 2009). This theoretical framework treats the cognitive agent and environment as a complex coupled system best explained by a mix of dynamics and James Gibson’s ecological theory of perception (Gibson, 1950). Chemero explicitly endorses eliminativism by rejecting the traditional assumption that agents solve problems and navigate through the world by consulting mental representations. He thus joins others in the cognitive science community, like artificial intelligence researcher Rodney Brooks (Brooks, 1991), who have tried to account for cognition without invoking representational entities. Of course, it is too early to know how successful these non-representational approaches will ultimately be, and many defenders of representationalism argue that these efforts are not likely to account for more sophisticated “representation-hungry” tasks like planning (Clark and Toribio, 1994).

A related theoretical development in the philosophy of cognitive science that also pushes a strong anti-representational perspective, at least for basic cognitive states, and that has its roots in the embodied, embedded tradition is radical enactivism. Authors like Daniel Hutto and Erik Myin reject the traditional information-processing outlook and insist that whey they call the “hard problem of content”— the problem of providing a naturalistic account of the semantic properties of representational content (as opposed to mere co-variation) — is probably unsolvable for most inner states commonly thought as mental representations (Hutto and Myin, 2012). Thus, Hutto and Myin join other authors who have endorsed eliminativism about mental representations by focusing upon the problematic nature of content.

3.3 Eliminative Materialism and the Phenomenal

Although most discussions regarding eliminativism focus on the status of our notion of belief and other propositional attitudes, some philosophers have endorsed eliminativist claims about the phenomenal or qualitative states of the mind (see the entry on qualia). For example, Daniel Dennett (1978) has argued that our concept of pain is fundamentally flawed because it includes essential properties, like infallibility and intrinsic awfulness, that cannot co-exist in light of a well-documented phenomenon know as “reactive disassociation”. In certain conditions, drugs like morphine cause subjects to report that they are experiencing excruciating pain, but that it is not unpleasant. It seems we are either wrong to think that people cannot be mistaken about being in pain (wrong about infallibility), or pain needn’t be inherently awful (wrong about intrinsic awfulness). Dennett suggests that part of the reason we may have difficulty replicating pain in computational systems is because our concept is so defective that it picks out nothing real. A similar view about pain has been offered by Valerie Hardcastle (1999). Hardcastle argues that the neurological basis for pain sensations is so complex that no one thing answers to our folk conception. However, despite her own characterization of pain as a “myth”, Hardcastle’s arguments appear to be aimed not at showing that pain is unreal, but rather that it is actually a more complicated phenomenon than suggested by our folk conception.

In another well-known article, “Quining Qualia” (1988), Dennett challenges not just our conception of pain, but all of our different notions of qualitative states. His argument focuses on the apparently essential features of qualia, including their inherent subjectivity and their private nature. Dennett discusses several cases—both actual and imaginary—to expose ways in which these ordinary intuitions about qualia pull apart. In so doing, Dennett suggests our qualia concepts are fundamentally confused and fail to correspond with the actual inner workings of our cognitive system.

Some writers have suggested an eliminativist outlook not just with regard to particular states of consciousness, but with regard to phenomenal consciousness itself. For example, Georges Rey (1983, 1988) has argued that if we look at the various neurological or cognitive theories of what consciousness might amount to, such as internal monitoring or the possession of second-order representational states, it seems easy to imagine all of these features incorporated in a computational device that lacks anything we intuitively think of as “real” or robust consciousness. Rey suggests that the failure of these accounts to capture our ordinary notion of consciousness may be because the latter corresponds with no actual process or phenomenon; the “inner light” we associate with consciousness may be nothing more than a remnant of misguided Cartesian intuitions (see also Wilkes, 1988; 1995 and Irvine and Sprevak, forthcoming).

A somewhat similar outlook has been proposed by Keith Frankish and others, and is commonly referred to as “Illusionism” about consciousness, a label designed to help indicate why it seems to us that phenomenal consciousness is real (Frankish, 2016, 2017). Illusionism is motivated in part by broader theoretical considerations, such as the problematic nature of consciousness from the standpoint of physicalism and the observation that even reductive accounts of phenomenal experience typically suggest some sort of misapprehension of what is really going on. Illusionism claims that introspection involves something analogous to ordinary sensory illusions; just as our perceptual systems can yield states that radically misrepresent the nature of the outer world, so too, introspection yields representations that substantially misrepresent the actual nature of our inner experience. In particular, introspection represents experiential states as having phenomenal properties—the infamous and deeply problematic what-it-is-likeness of our qualitative mental states. Illusionists claim that these phenomenal properties do not exist, making them eliminativists about phenomenal consciousness. What is real are quasi-phenomenal properties—the non-phenomenal properties of inner states that are detected by introspection and misrepresented as phenomenal.

An obvious challenge for such a view is explaining how we can experience something as having feature X without such as experience actually involving the real experience of X. It could be argued that even if the what-it-is-likeness is a feature of how we introspectively represent certain mental states, it would nevertheless be a real aspect of introspection—a feature that is perhaps relocated, but not removed. Famously, the illusion/reality gap seems to collapse when it comes to our inner experiences; as Searle puts it, “where consciousness is concerned the existence of the appearance is the reality” (Searle, 1997, p.122, italics in original). Frankish insists that we can introspectively represent ourselves as having a certain type of experience without actually having that type of experience: “...when we think we are having a greenish experience we are in fact merely misrepresenting ourselves as having one” (Frankish, 2016, p. 33). Illusionism thereby forces us to reconsider the sort of access we have to our own experiential states.

4. Arguments Against Eliminative Materialism

Like any theory that challenges our fundamental understanding of things, eliminative materialism has been subjected to a variety of criticisms. Here, I’ll discuss four that have received considerable attention in recent years.

4.1 The Self-Refutation Objection

Many writers have argued that eliminative materialism is in some sense self-refuting (Baker, 1987; Boghossian, 1990, 1991; Reppert, 1992). A common way this charge is made is to insist that a capacity or activity that is somehow invoked by the eliminativist is itself something that requires the existence of beliefs. One popular candidate for this activity is the making of an assertion. The critic insists that to assert something one must believe it. Hence, for eliminative materialism to be asserted as a thesis, the eliminativist herself must believe that it is true. But if the eliminativist has such a belief, then there are beliefs and eliminativism is thereby proven false.

Eliminativists often respond to this objection by first noting that the bare thesis that there are no beliefs is not itself contradictory or conceptually incoherent. So properly understood, the complaint is not that eliminative materialism (qua-proposition) is self-refuting. Rather, it is that the eliminativist herself is doing something that disconfirms her own thesis. In the above example, the disconfirming act is the making of an assertion, as it is alleged by the critic that we must believe anything we assert with public language. However, this last claim is precisely the sort of folk-psychological assumption that the eliminative materialist is suggesting we should abandon. According to eliminative materialism, all of the various capacities that we now explain by appealing to beliefs do not actually involve beliefs at all. So the eliminativist will hold that the self-refutation critics beg the question against eliminative materialism. To run this sort of objection, the critic endorses some principle about the necessity of beliefs which itself presupposes that eliminative materialism must be false (P. S. Churchland, 1986; Cling, 1989; Devitt, 1990; Ramsey, 1991).

A more sophisticated version of the self-refutation objection has been offered by Paul Boghossian with regard to eliminativist arguments based on the content of psychological states. Boghossian maintains that arguments for irrealism about the content of propositional attitudes work just as well in support of irrealism about all forms of content, including the content of ordinary linguistic expressions. Moreover, he argues that different forms of irrealism about linguistic content presuppose robust semantic notions, such as realist conceptions of truth and reference. This leads to the incoherent position that, for example, there are no truth conditions and yet certain sentences (or beliefs) about content are false (Boghossian, 1990, 1991). In response, Michael Devitt and Georges Rey argue that Boghossian’s argument, despite its sophistication, nevertheless begs the question by ascribing to the eliminativist some version of truth-conditional semantics, whereas many eliminativists would reject such a view of linguistic expressions. While eliminativists would need to construct some sort of non-truth-conditional semantics, Devitt and Rey argue that the challenge of such a project reveals only that eliminativism is implausible, not that it is, as Boghossian claims, incoherent (Devitt, 1990; Devitt and Rey, 1991).

4.2 Rejecting the Theory-Theory

In section 2, we saw that eliminative materialism typically rests upon a particular understanding of the nature of folk psychology. The next criticism of eliminative materialism challenges the various characterizations of folk psychology provided by its advocates—in particular the view set forth by advocates of the theory-theory. This criticism comes from two very distinct traditions. The first tradition is at least partly due to the writings of Wittgenstein (1953) and Ryle (1949), and insists that (contra many eliminativists) common sense psychology is not a quasi-scientific theory used to explain or predict behavior, nor does it treat mental states like beliefs as discrete inner causes of behavior (Bogdan, 1991; Haldane, 1988; Hannan, 1993; Wilkes, 1993). What folk psychology actually does treat beliefs and desires as is much less clear in this tradition. One perspective (Dennett, 1987) is that propositional attitudes are actually dispositional states that we use to adopt a certain heuristic stance toward rational agents. According to this view, our talk about mental states should be interpreted as talk about abstracta that, although real, are not candidates for straightforward reduction or elimination as the result of cognitive science research. Moreover, since beliefs and other mental states are used for so many things besides the explanation of human behavior, it is far from clear that our explanatory theories about inner workings of the mind/brain have much relevance for their actual status.

Defenders of eliminative materialism often point out that folk theories typically have many functions beyond explaining and predicting, but that doesn’t alter their theoretical status nor inoculate their posits from elimination (P.M. Churchland, 1993). Moreover, as we saw at the end of Section 2.1, while eliminativists have typically framed the vulnerability of commonsense mental notions in terms of a false folk psychological theory, it is important to note that, at least in principle, eliminativism does not require such an assumption. Indeed, eliminativism only requires two basic claims: 1) that we share concepts of mental states that include some sort of requirements that any state or structure must meet to qualify as a mental state of that sort, and 2) the world is such that nothing comes close to meeting those requirements. The first of these claims is not terribly controversial and while the requirements for beliefs might come as part of an explanatory theory, they don’t need to. Hence, one common criticism of eliminativism—that our invoking of beliefs and desires is not a theoretical or quasi-scientific endeavor—has very limited force. Cherubs, presumably, are not part of any sort of quasi-scientific theory, yet this alone is no reason to think they might exist. Even if it should turn out that we do not (or do not simply) posit beliefs and other propositional attitudes as part of some sort of explanatory-predictive framework, it may still turn out that there are no such things.

The second perspective criticizing the theory-theory is based on research in contemporary cognitive science, and stems from a different model of the nature of our explanatory and predictive practices (Gordon, 1986, 1992; Goldman, 1992). Known as the “simulation theory”, this alternative model holds that we predict and explain behavior not by using a theory, but by instead running an off-line simulation of how we would act in a comparable situation. That is, according to this picture, we disconnect our own decision-making sub-system and then feed it pretend beliefs and desires (and perhaps other relevant data) that we assume the agent whose behavior we are trying to predict is likely to possess. This allows us to generate both predictions and explanations of others by simply employing cognitive machinery that we already possess. In effect, the simulation theory claims that our reasoning about the minds and behavior of others is not significantly different from putting ourselves in their shoes. Thus, no full-blown theory of the mind is ever needed. Simulations theorists claim that, contrary to the assumptions of eliminative materialism, no theory of the mind exists that could one day prove false.

Both sides of this debate between the theory-theory and the simulation theory have used empirical work from developmental psychology to support their case (Stich and Nichols, 1992; Gordon, 1992). For example, theory-theorists have noted that developmental psychologists like Henry Wellman and Alison Gopnik have used various findings to suggest that children go through phases that are analogous to the phases one would go through when acquiring a theory (Gopnik and Wellman, 1992). Moreover, children appear to ascribe beliefs to themselves in the same way they ascribe beliefs to others. Theory-theorists have used considerations such as these to support their claim that our notion of belief is employed as the posit of a folk theory rather than input to a simulation model. At the same time, simulation theorists have employed the finding that 3-year-olds struggle with false belief ascriptions to suggest that children are actually ascribing their own knowledge to others, something that might be expected on the simulation account (Gordon, 1986).

However the debate between simulation theorists and theory theorists turns out, or whether some sort of hybrid combination of the two proves correct, we should once again bear in mind the point made at the end of Section 2.1. Since even the most ardent simulation theorist will allow that we have mental concepts, it is doubtful that the simulation perspective actually poses a significant threat to eliminativism, and it seems possible for there to be a version of eliminative materialism that could be reconstructed within the simulation framework, even for beliefs and desires. For example, it is at least conceivable that the decision-making machinery that is taken off-line to simulate the reasoning of another person could take as input cognitive states other than beliefs and desires, but that we somehow mistakenly conceptualize as beliefs and desires. On this admittedly speculative scenario, our ability to predict and explain the behavior of others would be simulation-based, and yet our conception of how minds work would be so far off that an eliminativist verdict would be appropriate.

4.3 Defending the Virtues of Folk Psychology

Even among theory-theorists there is considerable disagreement about the plausibility of eliminative materialism. A third criticism of eliminative materialism is that it ignores the remarkable success of folk psychology, success that suggests it offers a more accurate account of mental processes than eliminativists appreciate. Apart from the strong intuitive evidence that seems to reveal beliefs and desires, we also enjoy a great deal of success when we use common sense psychology to predict the actions of other people. Many have noted that this high degree of success provides us with something like an inference-to-the-best-explanation argument in favor of common sense psychology and against eliminativism. The best explanation for the success we enjoy in explaining and predicting human and animal behavior is that folk psychology is roughly true, and that there really are beliefs (Kitcher, 1984; Fodor, 1987; Lahav, 1992).

A common eliminativist response to this argument is to re-emphasize a lesson from the philosophy of science; namely, that any theory—especially one that is as near and dear to us as folk psychology—can often appear successful even when it completely misrepresents reality. History demonstrates that we often discount anomalies, ignore failures as insignificant, and generally attribute more success to a popular theory than it deserves. Like the proponents of vitalism or phlogiston theory, we may be blind to the failings of folk psychology until an alternative account is in hand (P. M. Churchland, 1981; P. S. Churchland, 1986).

While many defenders of folk psychology insist that folk psychology is explanatorily strong, some defenders have gone in the opposite direction, arguing that it is committed to far less than eliminativists have typically assumed (Horgan, 1993; Horgan and Graham, 1991; Jackson and Pettit, 1990). According to these writers, folk psychology, while indeed a theory, is a relatively “austere” (i.e., ontologically non-committal) theory, and requires very little for vindication. Consequently, these authors conclude that when properly described, folk psychology can be seen as compatible with a very wide range of neuroscientific or cognitive developments, making eliminative materialism possible but unlikely.

Of course, folk theories are like any theories in that they can be partly right and partly wrong. Even writers who are sympathetic to eliminativism, such as John Bickle and Patricia Churchland (Bickle, 1992; P.M. Churchland, 1994) point out that the history of science is filled with with cases where the conceptual machinery of a flawed theory is neither smoothly carried over to a new theory, nor fully eliminated. Instead, it is substantially modified and reworked, with perhaps only some of its posits being dropped altogether. Thus, full-blown eliminative materialism and complete reductionism are end-points on a continuum with many possibilities falling somewhere in between. The term “revisionary materialism” is often invoked to denote the view that the theoretical framework of folk psychology will only be eliminated to a degree, and that various dimensions of our commonsense conception of the mind will be at least partly vindicated.

4.4 Eliminativism Eliminated?

One final argument against eliminative materialism comes from the recent writings of a former supporter, Stephen Stich (1991, 1996). Stich’s argument is somewhat complex, but it can be presented in outline form here. Earlier we saw that eliminative materialism is committed to the claim that the posits of folk psychology fail to refer to anything. But as Stich points out, just what this claim amounts to is far from clear. For example, we might think that reference failure occurs as the result of some degree of mismatch between reality and the theory in which the posit is embedded. But there is no clear consensus on how much of a mismatch is necessary before we can say a given posit doesn’t exist. Stich offers a variety of reasons for thinking that there are fundamental difficulties that will plague any attempt to provide principled criteria for distinguishing cases of reference success from cases of reference failure. Consequently, the question of whether a theory change should be ontologically conservative or radical has no clear answer. Because eliminative materialism rests on the assumption that folk psychology should be replaced in a way that is ontologically radical, Stich’s account pulls the rug out from under the eliminativist. Of course, this is a problem for the folk psychology realist as well as the eliminativist, since Stich’s skeptical argument challenges our grounds for distinguishing the two.

5. Concluding Comments

Eliminative materialism entails unsettling consequences not just about our conception of the mind, but also about the nature of morality, action, social and legal conventions, and practically every other aspect of human activity. As Jerry Fodor puts it, “if commonsense psychology were to collapse, that would be, beyond comparison, the greatest intellectual catastrophe in the history of our species …” (1987, p. xii). Thus, eliminative materialism has stimulated various projects partly designed to vindicate ordinary mental states and establish their respectability in a sophisticated account of the mind. For example, several projects pursued by philosophers in recent years have attempted to provide a reductive account of the semantic content of propositional attitudes that is entirely naturalistic (i.e., an account that only appeals to straightforward causal-physical relations and properties). Much of the impetus for these projects stems in part from the recognition that eliminative materialism cannot be as easily dismissed as earlier writers, like C. D. Broad, had originally assumed.

Of course, some claim that these concerns are quite premature, given the promissory nature of eliminative materialism. After all, a pivotal component of the eliminativist perspective is the idea that the correct theory of the mind, once discovered by psychologists, will not reveal a system or structure that includes anything like common-sense mental states. Thus, for eliminative materialism to get off the ground, we need to assume that scientific psychology is going to turn out a certain way. But why suppose that before scientific psychology gets there? What is the point of drawing such a drastic conclusion about the nature of mentality, when a central premise needed for that conclusion is a long ways from being known?

One response an eliminativist might offer here would be to consider the broader theoretical roles eliminative materialism can play in our quest for a successful theory of the mind. Various writers have stipulated necessary conditions that any theory of the mind must meet, and on some accounts these conditions include the explication of various mental states as understood by common sense. According to this view, if a theory doesn’t include states that correspond with beliefs, or provide us with some sort of account of the nature of consciousness, then it needn’t be taken seriously as a complete account of “real” mental phenomena. One virtue of eliminative materialism is that it liberates our theorizing from this restrictive perspective. Thus, the relationship between eliminative materialism and science may be more reciprocal than many have assumed. While it is true that eliminative materialism depends upon the development of a radical scientific theory of the mind, radical theorizing about the mind may itself rest upon our taking seriously the possibility that our common sense perspective may be profoundly mistaken.


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Further Readings

  • Bogdan, R., 1991, Mind and Common Sense: Philosophical Essays on Common Sense Psychology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carruthers, P. and Smith, P.K., 1996, Theories of Theories of Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Christensen, S.M. and Turner, D.R., 1993, Folk Psychology and the Philosophy of Mind, Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum.
  • Churchland, P. M., 1989, A Neurocomputational Perspective, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Feyerabend, P., 1963, Materialism and the Mind-Body Problem, Review of Metaphysics 17: 49–66.
  • Quine, W. V., 1966, On Mental Entities, in The Ways of Paradox, Random House.
  • Rorty, R. (1970). In Defense of Eliminative Materialism, Review of Metaphysics 24: 112–121.
  • Smolensky, P., 1988, On the Proper Treatment of Connectionism, Behavioral and Brain Sciences 11: 1–74.
  • Wellman, H., 1990, The Child’s Theory of Mind, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Other Internet Resources


Thanks to David Chalmers for many helpful comments and suggestions.

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