Social Institutions

First published Thu Jan 4, 2007; substantive revision Tue Apr 9, 2019

The term, “social institution” is somewhat unclear both in ordinary language and in the philosophical literature (see below). However, contemporary sociology is somewhat more consistent in its use of the term. Typically, contemporary sociologists use the term to refer to complex social forms that reproduce themselves such as governments, the family, human languages, universities, hospitals, business corporations, and legal systems. A typical definition is that proffered by Jonathan Turner (1997: 6): “a complex of positions, roles, norms and values lodged in particular types of social structures and organising relatively stable patterns of human activity with respect to fundamental problems in producing life-sustaining resources, in reproducing individuals, and in sustaining viable societal structures within a given environment.” Again, Anthony Giddens (1984: 24) says: “Institutions by definition are the more enduring features of social life.” He (Giddens 1984: 31) goes on to list as institutional orders, modes of discourse, political institutions, economic institutions and legal institutions. The contemporary philosopher of social science, Rom Harre follows the theoretical sociologists in offering this kind of definition (Harre 1979: 98): “An institution was defined as an interlocking double-structure of persons-as-role-holders or office-bearers and the like, and of social practices involving both expressive and practical aims and outcomes.” He gives as examples (Harre 1979: 97) schools, shops, post offices, police forces, asylums and the British monarchy. In this entry the above-noted contemporary sociological usage will be followed. Doing so has the virtue of grounding philosophical theory in the most salient empirical discipline, namely, sociology.

In the not so recent past it might have been asked why a theory of social institutions has, or ought to have, any philosophical interest; why not simply leave theories of institutions to the theoretical sociologists? However, in recent years philosophers have addressed a variety of ontological, explanatory, normative and other theoretical issues concerning social institutions (Searle 1995, 2007 and 2010; Tuomela 2002; Miller 2010; Epstein 2015; Guala 2016; Ludwig 2017). Of particular importance is the work of John Searle (1995; 2010). One source of the impetus for this has been recent philosophical work on social action and social forms more generally (Gilbert 1989; Searle 1990); Tuomela 2007; Schmid 2009; Miller 2001; Bratman 2014; Tollefsen 2015; Ludwig 2016). Another source is the recognition that a good deal of normative work on social justice, political philosophy and the like presupposes an understanding of social institutions. For instance, philosophers, such as John Rawls (1972), have developed elaborate normative theories concerning the principles of justice that ought to govern social institutions. Yet they have done so in the absence of a developed theory of the nature and point of the very entities (social institutions) to which the principles of justice in question are supposed to apply. Surely the adequacy of one’s normative account of the justice or otherwise of any given social institution, or system of social institutions, will depend at least in part on the nature and point of that social institution or system. Thus distributive justice is an important aspect of most, if not all, social institutions; the role occupants of most institutions are the recipients and providers of benefits, e.g. wages, consumer products, and the bearers of burdens, e.g. allocated tasks and, accordingly, are subject to principles of distributive justice. Moreover, arguably some institutions, perhaps governments, have as one of their defining ends or functions, to ensure conformity to principles of distributive justice in the wider society. However, distributive justice does not appear to be a defining feature, end or function of all social institutions. By this I do not mean that some social institutions are unjust and, for instance, exist in practice to serve narrow economic or other special interests (Marx 1867; Habermas 1978; Honneth 1995); though clearly many are. Rather I am referring to the fact that a number of social institutions, such as the so-called Fourth Estate and the university, are arguably not defined—normatively speaking—in terms of justice, but rather by some other moral value(s), e.g. truth (Ostrom 2005; Miller 2010).

The entry has five sections. In the first section an overview of various salient accounts of social institutions and their main points of theoretical difference is provided. Accounts emanating from sociological theory as well as philosophy are mentioned. Here, as elsewhere, the boundaries between philosophy and non-philosophical theorising in relation to an empirical science are vague. Hence, it is important to mention theories such as those of Emile Durkheim and Talcott Parsons, as well as those of John Searle and David Lewis. Moreover, it is also important to highlight some of the theoretical differences, notably those of an ontological character.

In the second section individualist theories of social institutions based on rational choice theory and, in particular, on notions of coordination equilibria are discussed (Lewis 1969; Guala 2016).

In the third section collective acceptance theories of social institutions are discussed (Searle 1995 and 2010; Tuomela 2002 and 2007; Ludwig 2017).

In the fourth section the teleological account of social institutions is presented (Miller 2010).

In the fifth section, issues of agency are discussed. In what sense, if any, are institutions agents (French 1984; List and Pettit (2011); Tollefsen 2015; Epstein 2015)? Is there an inconsistency between the autonomy (or alleged autonomy) of individual human agents, on the one hand, and the ubiquity and pervasive influence of institutions on individual character and behaviour, on the other (Giddens 1984; Bhaskar 1979)?

1. Social Institutions: An Overview

Any account of social institutions must begin by informally marking off social institutions from other social forms. Unfortunately, as noted above, in ordinary language the terms “institutions” and “social institutions” are used to refer to a miscellany of social forms, including conventions, rules, rituals, organisations, and systems of organisations. Moreover, there are a variety of theoretical accounts of institutions, including sociological as well as philosophical ones. Indeed, many of these accounts of what are referred to as institutions are not accounts of the same phenomena; they are at best accounts of overlapping fields of social phenomena. Nevertheless, it is possible, firstly, to mark off a range of related social forms that would be regarded by most theorists as being properly describable as social institutions; and, secondly, to compare and contrast some of the competing theoretical accounts of the “social institutions” in question.

Social institutions in the sense in use in this entry need to be distinguished from less complex social forms such as conventions, rules, social norms, roles and rituals. The latter are among the constitutive elements of institutions.

Social institutions also need to be distinguished from more complex and more complete social entities, such as societies or cultures, of which any given institution is typically a constitutive element. A society, for example, is more complete than an institution since a society—at least as traditionally understood—is more or less self-sufficient in terms of human resources, whereas an institution is not. Thus, arguably, for an entity to be a society it must sexually reproduce its membership, have its own language and educational system, provide for itself economically and—at least in principle—be politically independent.

Social institutions are often organisations (Scott 2001). Moreover, many institutions are systems of organisations grounded in economic, political etc. spheres of activity (Walzer 1983). For example, capitalism is a particular kind of economic institution, and in modern times capitalism consists in large part in specific organisational forms—including multi-national corporations—organised into a system. Further, some institutions are meta-institutions; they are institutions (organisations) that organise other institutions (including systems of organisations). For example, governments are meta-institutions. The institutional end or function of a government consists in large part in organising other institutions (both individually and collectively); thus governments regulate and coordinate economic systems, educational institutions, police and military organisations and so on largely by way of (enforceable) legislation.

In this entry the concern is principally with social institutions (including meta-institutions) that are also organisations or systems of organisations. However, it should be noted that institutions of language, such as the English language, are often regarded not simply as institutions but as more fundamental than many other kinds of institution by virtue of being presupposed by, or in part constitutive of, other institutions. Searle, for example, holds to the latter view (Searle 1995: 37; Searle 2008). A case might also be made that the family is a more fundamental institution than others for related reasons, e.g. it is the site of sexual reproduction and initial socialisation (Schoeman 1980; Lamanna 2002).

Note also that uses of the term “institution” in such expressions as “the institution of government”, are often ambiguous. Sometimes what is meant is a particular token, e.g. the current government in Australia, sometimes a type, i.e. the set of properties instantiated in any actual government, and sometimes a set of tokens, i.e. all governments. Restricting the notion of an institution to organisations is helpful in this regard; the term “organisation” almost always refers to a particular token. On the other hand, the term “institution” connotes a certain gravity not connoted by the term “organisation”; so arguably those institutions that are organisations are organisations that have a central and important role to play in or for a society. Being central and important to a society, such roles are usually long lasting ones; hence institutions are typically trans-generational.

Having informally marked off social institutions from other social forms, let us turn to a consideration of some general properties of social institutions. Here there are four salient properties, namely, structure, function, culture and sanctions.

Roughly speaking, an institution that is an organisation or system of organisations consists (at least) of an embodied (occupied by human persons) structure of differentiated roles (Miller 2010; Ludwig 2017). (Naturally, many institutions also have have additional non-human components, e.g. buildings, raw materials.) These roles are defined in terms of tasks, and rules regulating the performance of those tasks. Moreover, there is a degree of interdependence among these roles, such that the performance of the constitutive tasks of one role cannot be undertaken, or cannot be undertaken except with great difficulty, unless the tasks constitutive of some other role or roles in the structure have been undertaken or are being undertaken. Further, these roles are often related to one another hierarchically, and hence involve different levels of status and degrees of authority. Finally, on teleological and functional accounts, these roles are related to one another in part in virtue of their contribution to (respectively) the end(s) or function(s) of the institution; and the realisation of these ends or function normally involves interaction among the institutional actors in question and external non-institutional actors. (The assumption here is that the concept of an end and of a function are distinct concepts. On some accounts, function is a quasi-causal notion (Cohen 1978 Chapter IX), on others it is a teleological notion, albeit one that does not necessarily involve the existence of any mental states (Ryan 1970 Chapter 8)). The constitutive roles of an institution and their relations to one another can be referred to as the structure of the institution.

I note that the common-sense view that an institution consists (essentially) of an embodied structure of roles has been thought by some to be undermined by the consideration that actions are ascribed to institutions per se (as opposed to their members), e.g. in the sentence, ‘The Supreme Court of the United State ruled that segregation is unconstitutional’, and the fact that an institution could have had different members than the ones it actually had, e.g. someone other than Brett Kavanaugh might have been nominated by President Trump to sit on the Supreme Court and confirmed by the US Senate. In response to this kind of argument Ludwig has, in effect, defended the common-sense view by proffering his time-indexed, reductive individualist view according to which not only is the Supreme Court the group that consists of everyone who is at any time a member of the Supreme Court, but what the Supreme Court does at any time is what the those justices at that time do (Ludwig 2017: 66). Importantly, Ludwig points out that the term, “the Supreme Court of the US” functions as a definite description and not a name. As is the case with all definite descriptions, e.g. “the President of the US”, the individuals picked out by “the Supreme Court of the US” could have been different (Ludwig 2017: 68).

An important distinction relevant to the understanding of institutional structure can be made between what is constitutive of an institution, e.g. the judges of the Supreme Court, and what is required to maintain it in existence, e.g. acceptance of the authority of the Supreme Court by the US citizenry. (See sections 3 and 5 below.)

Note that on the conception of institutions as embodied structures of roles and associated rules, the nature of any institution at a given time will to some extent reflect the personal character of different role occupants, especially influential role occupants, e.g. the British Government during the Second World War reflected to some extent Winston Churchill’s character. Moreover, institutions in this sense are dynamic, evolving entities; as such, they have a history, the diachronic structure of a narrative and (usually) a partially open-ended future.

Aside from the formal and usually explicitly stated, or defined, tasks and rules, there is an important implicit and informal dimension of an institution roughly describable as institutional culture. This notion comprises the informal attitudes, values, norms, and the ethos or “spirit” which pervades an institution. As such, it is to be distinguished from the wider notions of culture frequently in use among anthropologists. Culture in the wide sense embraces not only informal but also formal elements of institutions, e.g. rules and other components of structure (Tylor 1871; Munch and Smelser 1993)). Culture in the narrow sense influences much of the activity of the members of that institution, or at least the manner in which that activity is undertaken. So while the explicitly determined rules and tasks might say nothing about being secretive or “sticking by one’s mates come what may” or having a hostile or negative attitude to particular social groups, these attitudes and practices might in fact be pervasive; they might be part of the culture (Skolnick 2008).

It is sometimes claimed that in addition to structure, function and culture, social institutions necessarily involve sanctions. It is uncontroversial that social institutions involve informal sanctions, such as moral disapproval following on non-conformity to institutional norms. However, some theorists, e.g. Jon Elster (1989: Chapter XV), argue that formal sanctions, such as punishment, are a necessary feature of institutions. Formal sanctions are certainly a feature of most, if not all, of those institutions that operate within a legal system. However, they do not appear to be a feature of all institutions. Consider, for example, an elaborate and longstanding system of informal economic exchange among members of different societies that have no common system of laws or enforced rules.

Thus far we have informally marked off social institutions from other social forms, and we have identified a number of general properties of social institutions. It is now time to introduce and taxonomize some of the main theoretical accounts of social institutions, including historically important ones. In sections 2, 3 and 4 recent influential theories of social institutions will be discussed in more detail.

Notwithstanding our understanding of social institutions as complex social forms, some theoretical accounts of institutions identify institutions with relatively simple social forms—especially conventions, social norms or rules. At one level this is merely a verbal dispute; contra our procedure here, such simpler forms could simply be termed “institutions”. However, at another level the dispute is not merely verbal, since what we are calling “institutions” would on such a view consist simply of sets of conventions, social norms or rules. Let us refer to such accounts as atomistic theories of institutions (Taylor 1985: Chapter 7). Schotter is a case in point (Schotter 1981) as is North (1990). The best known contemporary form of atomism is rational choice theory and it has been widely accepted in, indeed it is in part constitutive of, modern economics. The most influential philosophical theory within a broadly rational choice framework is David Lewis’ theory of conventions (Lewis 1969). According to Lewis, conventions are regularities in action that solve coordination problems confronted by individual agents.

The “atoms” within atomistic accounts themselves typically consist of the actions of individual human persons, e.g. conventions as regularities in action. The individual agents are not themselves defined in terms of institutional forms, such as institutional roles. Hence atomistic theories of institutions tend to go hand in glove with atomistic theories of all collective entities, e.g. a society consists of an aggregate of individual human persons. Moreover, atomistic theories tend to identify the individual agent as the locus of moral value. On this kind of view, social forms, including social institutions, have moral value only derivatively, i.e. only in so far as they contribute to the prior needs, desires or other requirements of individual agents.

The regularities in action (or rules or norms) made use of in such atomistic accounts of institutions cannot simply be a single person’s regularities in action (or a single person’s rules or norms prescribing his or her individual action alone); rather there must be interdependence of action such that, for example, agent A only performs action x, if other agents, B and C do likewise. Moreover, some account of the interdependence of action in question is called for, e.g. that it is not the sort of interdependence of action involved in conflict situations (although it might arise as a solution to a prior conflict situation).

Assume that the conventions, norms or rules in question are social in the sense that they involve the required interdependence of action, e.g. the parties to any given convention, or the adherent to any such norm or rule, conform to (respectively) the convention, norm or rule on the condition that others do. Nevertheless, such interdependence of action is not sufficient for a convention, norm or rule, or even a set of conventions, norms or rules, to be an institution. Governments, universities, corporations etc. are structured, unitary entities. Accordingly, a mere set of conventions (or norms or rules) does not constitute an institution. For example, the set of conventions comprising the convention to drive on the left, the convention to utter, “Australia”, to refer to Australia, and the convention to use chopsticks does not constitute an institution. Accordingly, a problem for atomistic accounts of social institutions is the need to provide an account of the structure and unity of social institutions, and an account that is faithful to atomism, e.g. that the structure is essentially aggregative in nature. On the other hand, ‘atomists’ can obviously help themselves to some notion of a bundle of related conventions or rules. Consider for instance a set of traffic rules, e.g. ‘drive on the left’, ‘do not exceed 35 miles per hour in built up areas’ and so on. Moreover, the ‘bundle’ might include a variety of types of atomistic social forms, e.g. conventions, norms and rules. Guala’s account of institutions (Guala 2016) is a case in point, as we shall see in section 2 below.

By contrast with atomistic accounts of social institutions, holistic—including structuralist-functionalist—accounts stress the inter-relationships of institutions (structure) and their contribution to larger and more complete social complexes, especially societies (function). Thus according to Barry Barnes (1995: 37): “Functionalist theories in the social sciences seek to describe, to understand and in most cases to explain the orderliness and stability of entire social systems. In so far as they treat individuals, the treatment comes after and emerges from analysis of the system as a whole. Functionalist theories move from an understanding of the whole to an understanding of the parts of that whole, whereas individualism proceeds in the opposite direction”. Moreover, (Barnes 1995: 41), “such accounts list the ”functions“ of the various institutions. They describe the function of the economy as the production of goods and services essential to the operation of the other institutions and hence the system as a whole.” Such theorists include Durkheim (1964), Radcliffe-Brown (1958) and Parsons (1968; 1982). Of particular concern to these theorists was the moral decay consequent (in their view) upon the demise of strong, mutually supportive social institutions. Durkheim, for example, advocated powerful professional associations. He said (1957 p.6):

A system of morals is always the affair of a group and can operate only if the group protects them by its authority. It is made up of rules which govern individuals, which compel them to act in such and such a way, and which impose limits to their inclinations and forbid them to go beyond. Now there is only one moral power—moral, and hence common to all—which stands above the individual and which can legitimately make laws for him, and that is collective power. To the extent the individual is left to his own devices and freed from all social constraint, he is unfettered by all moral constraint. It is not possible for professional ethics to escape this fundamental condition of any system of morals. Since, then, the society as a whole feels no concern in professional ethics, it is imperative that there be special groups in the society, within which these morals may be evolved, and whose business it is to see that they are observed.

Moreover, here the meta-institution of government obviously has a pivotal directive and integrative role in relation to other institutions and their inter-relationships, even though government is itself simply one institution within the larger society. Further, holistic accounts of institutions lay great stress on institutional roles defined in large part by social norms; institutional roles are supposedly largely, or even wholly, constitutive of the identity of the individual human agents who occupy these roles. (Individuals participate in a number of institutions and hence occupy a number of institutional roles; hence the alleged possibility of their identity being constituted by a number of different institutional roles.)

Many such holistic accounts deploy and depend on the model, or at least analogy, of an organism. A salient historical figure here is Herbert Spencer (1971, Part 3B—A Society is an Organism). On this holistic, organicist model, social institutions are analogous to the organs or limbs of a human body. Each organ or limb has a function the realisation of which contributes to the well-being of the body as a whole, and none can exist independently of the others. Thus the human body relies on the stomach to digest food in order to continue living, but the stomach cannot exist independently of the body or of other organs, such as the heart. Likewise, it is suggested, any given institution, e.g. law courts, contributes to the well-being of the society as a whole, and yet is dependent on other institutions, e.g. government. Here the “well-being” of the society as a whole is sometimes identified with the stability and continuation of the society as it is; hence the familiar charge that holistic, organicist accounts are inherently politically conservative. This political conservatism transmutes into political authoritarianism when society is identified with the system of institutions that constitute the nation-state and the meta-institution of the nation-state—the government—is assigned absolute authority in relation to all other institutions. Hence the contrasting emphasis in political liberalism on the separation of powers among, for example, the executive, the legislature and the judiciary.

Holistic accounts of social institutions often invoke the terminology of internal and external relations (Bradley 1935). An internal relation is one that is definitive of, or in some way essential to, the entity it is a relation of; by contrast, external relations are not in this way essential. Thus being married to someone is an internal relation of spouses; if a man is a husband then necessarily he stands in the relation of being married to someone else. Likewise, if someone is a judge in a court of law then necessarily he stands in an adjudicative relationship to defendants. Evidently, many institutional roles are possessed of, and therefore in part defined by, their internal relations to other institutional roles.

However, the existence of institutional roles with internal relations to other institutional roles does not entail a holistic account of social institutions. For the internal relations in question might not be relations among institutional roles in different institutions; rather they might simply be internal relations among different institutional roles in the same institution. On the other hand, the existence of institutional roles with internal relations does undermine the attempts of certain forms of atomistic individualism to reduce institutions to the individual human agents who happen to constitute them; ex hypothesi, the latter are not qua individual human persons in part defined in terms of their relations to institutional roles.

In the context of a discussion of atomistic and holist accounts of institutions, it is important to distinguish the view that institutions are not reducible to the individual human persons who constitute them from the view that institutions are themselves agents possessed of minds and a capacity to reason (see Section 5). Epstein (2015) has offered detailed arguments against the former view, including in its favoured contemporary form according to which institutions (and other collective entities) supervene on the individual persons whose roles they occupy. Thus Epstein points out (2015: 46) that some facts about the firm, Starbucks, do not depend (supervene)on facts about people and the actions they perform but rather on facts about coffee, for instance. (See also Ruben 1985). Peter French (1984) is an advocate of the latter view as are, in somewhat different forms, List and Pettit (2011), Tollefsen (2015) and Epstein (2015). (See also Margaret Gilbert’s notion of a “plural subject” [1989: 200]). Searle (1990), Miller (2001) and Ludwig (2017) have argued against the proposition that collective entities per se are agents possessed of mental states. For instance, Ludwig has offered analyses of sentences that apparently ascribe mental states to collective entities, such as ‘Germany intends to invade Poland’, in terms of the intentions of individual members of these entities, and the actions of collective entities in terms of the members of the collective group in question being agents of an event (Ludwig 2017).

Thus far we have discussed atomistic and holistic accounts of social institutions. However, there is a third possibility, namely, (what might be termed) molecular accounts. Roughly speaking, a molecular account of an institution would not seek to reduce the institution to simpler atomic forms, such as conventions; nor would it seek to define an institution in terms of its relationships with other institutions and its contribution to the larger societal whole. Rather, each institution would be analogous to a molecule; it would have constitutive elements (“atoms”) but also have its own structure and unity. A number of philosophical theories of social institutions are explicitly or implicitly molecular in character (Harre 1969; Searle 1995; Miller 2010). Moreover, on this conception each social institution would have a degree of independence vis-à-vis other institutions and the society at large; on the other hand, the set of institutions might itself under certain conditions form a unitary system of sorts, e.g. a contemporary liberal democratic nation-state comprised of a number of semi-autonomous public and private institutions functioning in the context of the meta-institution of government.

A general problem for holistic organicist accounts of social institutions—as opposed to molecular accounts—is that social institutions can be responses to trans-societal requirements or needs. Accordingly, an institution is not necessarily a constitutive element of some given society in the sense that it is both in part constitutive of that society and wholly contained within that society. Examples of such trans-societal institutions are the international financial system, the international legal system, the United Nations and some multi-national corporations. Indeed, arguably any given element of such a trans-societal institution stands in some internal relations to elements of other societies.

In this section accounts of institutions have been discussed in general terms. It is now time to focus on some specific influential, contemporary philosophical accounts beginning with ones based in rational choice theory.

2. Social Institutions and Coordination Equilibria

As noted above, the starting point for theories of social institutions utilising a rational choice framework is Lewis’ theory of conventions (Lewis 1969). According to Lewis—who was inspired by Hume (Hume 1740: Book III)—conventions are the solutions to coordination problems. (See also Schwayder 1965.) Thus the regularity in behaviour of driving on the right is the solution to the coordination problem confronting road users. Here there are two equilibria: everyone driving on the right or, alternatively, everyone driving on the left. Everyone driving on the right is an equilibrium since everyone prefers to drive on the right, given everyone else does, and everyone expects everyone to drive on the right. Conventions are certainly ubiquitous. However, social institutions evidently consist in more than conventions. Importantly, as noted above, they consist in part in rules, including but not restricted to laws and regulations. But regularities in behaviour that result from compliance with rules are not necessarily equilibria in the sense in use in rational choice theory. Accordingly, a serviceable account of social institutions looks like it needs to help itself (at least) to both conventions (or, at least, equilibria in the sense of Nash equilibria, i.e. (roughly) a combination of actions such that no actor has an incentive to change his or her action unilaterally), and rules.

Guala has propounded an account of institutions he refers to as the rules-in-equilibrium approach. This account, as its name suggests, seeks to unify the rules-based conception of institutions and the view that institutions are the equilibria of strategic games (Guala 2016). As such, institutions facilitate coordination and cooperation; indeed, that is their defining function. However, regularities in behaviour in accordance with an equilibrium strategy, e.g. everyone driving on the left, typically take the form of a rule, e.g. ‘Drive on the left’. Therefore, according to Guala, essentially institutions are rules that people are motivated to follow, i.e. rules backed up by a system of incentives and expectations that motivate people to follow these rules. Accordingly, and in contrast with collective acceptance accounts (see section 3 below), there is no need to posit joint intentions or the like in order to ensure the rules in part constitutive of an institution are followed—or otherwise to provide the ‘glue’ that holds an institution together.

Moreover, contra Searle (1995) and (again) contra the collective acceptance account (see section 3 below), for the most part institutional rules are merely regulative and not constitutive (Guala 2016: ch.5). Roughly speaking, a regulative rule governs a pre-existing action type, e.g. ‘Do not walk on the grass’, whereas constitutive rules (supposedly) create new forms of activity, e.g. the rules of chess, and have the form ‘X counts as Y in circumstances, C’ (Searle 2010: 96). According to Guala, constitutive rules are not necessary to institutions; regulative rules are sufficient. (See section 3 below.)

Guala’s account has implications for controversies concerning alleged differences between the natural sciences and the social sciences and, specifically, for the pluralist view that unlike natural entities, social entities, such as institutions, are mind-dependent (Searle 2010). For example, the fact that a dollar bill is money and not merely paper, depends on a collective belief that it can be used as a medium of exchange. By contrast, a molecule of water is water irrespective of anyone’s belief. At this point Guala invokes a distinction between causal dependence and ontological dependence. Dollar bills are causally dependent on beliefs but not ontologically dependent. Since the causal dependence of social entities on beliefs and the like is consistent with the causal dependence of natural entities on one another and on beliefs etc., the mind-dependence of social entities does not imply a pluralist view of the natural sciences and the social sciences. A monist conception is admissible.

Moreover, according to Guala, the view that institutions are mind-dependent (Searle 2010: 17–18) is inconsistent with the existence of mistaken beliefs about institutions on the part of participants in those institutions. Guala is certainly right to claim that there are such mistaken beliefs, e.g. everyone might falsely believe that their worthless devalued currency was money. What of his argument that some advocates of the mind-dependence of institutions are necessarily committed to infallibilism—and, specifically, to the false claim that institutional participants cannot be mistaken about their institutions? Guala states that infallibilism about social kinds (e.g. we cannot be wrong about whether a piece of paper is money or not) and anti-realism (e.g. a piece of paper is money if we collectively accept that it is) go together and do so “because their opposites—realism and fallibilism are tightly connected” (Guala 2016:151). If objects exist independently of our representations of them (realism) then our representations can be mistaken (fallibilism). On the other hand, if objects ontologically depend on our representations of them (anti-realism)—and, in particular, our collective beliefs about them—then we cannot be mistaken about them (infallibilism).

Guala also argues (2016: ch. 14) that his monist rules-in-equilibrium approach can resolve normative disputes, such as those in relation to same-sex marriage. On his unified account, he claims, realism can be preserved, e.g. marriage does not depend non-causally on our intentions, but yet same-sex marriage is allowable. In this connection Guala relies on the type/token distinction and argues that while institution tokens solve particular coordination problems, institution types are identified by their functions, e.g. same-sex unions fulfil the functions of marriage. However, the conservative view, e.g. of the Catholic Church, would simply dispute that same-sex marriages do serve the same essential functions, e.g., the function of procreation. Moreover, this manoeuvre does not seem to address adequately the normative questions that now arises at the level of functions. What function or functions ought marriage serve? What moral constraints are there on specific social arrangements that might otherwise serve those functions, e.g. polygamy? Here it is a background assumption that while the function or functions that an institution should have depends in part on the functions that it in fact has, one cannot simply read off the former from the latter. A corrupt police force might have the enrichment of most of its officers as one of its de facto functions but it would not follow from this that this was a legitimate function.

Moreover, Guala’s normative neutrality is open to question. Guala’s rules-in-equilibrium account of institutions helps itself only to instrumental normativity (including the rationality of compliance due to sanctions) and eschews moral considerations in favour of the permissive notion of preference. The contrast here is with the teleological account (section 4) which grounds institutions on collective goods, especially aggregate human need, e.g. the need for food (agricultural institutions), health (hospitals), education (schools), security (police services) etc. And, as David Wiggins has argued (1991) needs generate moral obligations. On Guala’s view cooperative enterprises which undermine institutions, e.g. corrupt cliques, criminal organisations, can themselves be institutions, as can somewhat trivial convention-governed games, e.g. tic-tac-toe, hopscotch.

More generally, Guala’s view seems to overstate the coordinating function of institutions and, as a result, conflate the underlying problem solved by an institution with the surface problem that the availability of multiple solutions gives rise to, i.e. the problem of coordinating on one of the available solutions. Thus the underlying problem of avoiding traffic collisions is solved by all traffic travelling in one direction keeping to one side of the road and all traffic travelling in the opposite direction keeping to the opposite side. However, this solution now gives rise to a coordination problem since there are two equally good solutions, i.e. all driving on the left or all driving on the right. This point applies to other rational choice coordination equilibria approaches, including Lewis’ influential theory of conventions (Miller 1986).

3. Collective Acceptance Theory of Institutions

Collective acceptance accounts and, for that matter teleological accounts, of social action in general, and of social institutions in particular, fall within the rationalist, individualist, philosophy of action tradition that has its roots in Aristotle, Hume and Kant and is associated with contemporary analytic philosophers of social action such as Michael Bratman (1987), John Searle (1995), and Raimo Tuomela (2002). However, this way of proceeding also has a place outside philosophy, in sociological theory. Broadly speaking, it is the starting point for the voluntaristic theory of social action associated with the likes of Georg Simmel (1971), Max Weber (1949), (the early) Talcott Parsons (1968) and Alfred Schutz (Schutz and Parsons 1978). For example, the following idea in relation to social action is expressed by Parsons (1968: 229):

actions do not take place separately each with a separate, discrete end in relation to the situation, but in long complicated ‘chains’ … [and] the total complex of means-end relationships is not to be thought of as similar to a large number of parallel threads, but as a complicated web (if not a tangle).

However, unsurprisingly, the teleological account lays much greater explanatory emphasis on the means-end relationship in collective action contexts and much less on collective acceptance.

That said, the starting point for both kinds of theory has been the notion of a joint action and its constitutive conative notions (or,at least, terminology) of shared intentions (Bratman 2014), we-intentions (Tuomela 2013), collective intentions (Searle 1990), collective ends (Miller 2001: Chapter 2), depending on which theorist is in question. Examples of joint action are two people lifting a table together, and two men jointly pushing a car. However, such basic two person joint actions exist at one end of a spectrum. At the other end are much more complex, multi-person, joint actions, such as a large group of engineers, tradesmen and construction workers jointly building a skyscraper or the members of an army jointly fighting a battle.

Over the last several decades a number of analyses of joint action have emerged (Gilbert 1989; Miller 2001: Chapter 2; Searle 1990 and 1995; Tuomela 2002; Schmid 2009; Ludwig 2016). A number of these theorists have developed and applied their favoured basic accounts of joint action in order to account for a range of social phenomena, including conventions, social norms and social institutions.

Individualism (of which more below) is committed to an analysis of joint action such that ultimately a joint action consists of: (1) a number of singular actions; and (2) relations among these singular actions. Moreover, the constitutive conative attitudes involved in joint actions are individual attitudes; there are no sui generis we-attitudes.

By contrast, according to supra-individualists (Gilbert 1989), when a plurality of individual agents perform a joint action, then the agents have the relevant propositional attitudes (beliefs, intentions etc.) in an irreducible ‘we-form’, which is sui generis (Searle 1990) and as such not analysable in terms of individual or I-attitudes Tuomela 2013). Moreover, the individual agents constitute a new entity, a supra-individual entity not reducible to the individual agents and the relations among them (Epstein 2015).

If the starting point for theorists in this strand of contemporary philosophy of action is joint action (and its associated collective intentionality), it is by no means the endpoint. Specifically, there is the important matter of the relationship between joint action and social institutions. For example, while joint actions per se do not seem to necessarily involve rights, duties and other deontic properties (see Gilbert 1989 for a contrary view), it is self-evident that social institutions do so. Theorists within this recent tradition agree that joint actions—or perhaps the collective intentionality definitive of joint actions—is at least one of the building blocks of social institutions. However, the question remains as to the precise relationship between joint actions (and its associated collective intentionality) on the one hand, and social institutions on the other. More specifically, there is the question of how, or if, we-intentions can generate deontic properties, such as the institutional rights and duties definitive of institutional roles.

According to collective acceptance accounts (Searle 1995 and 2010; Tuomela 2002; Ludwig 2017), social institutions are created and maintained by collective acceptance. Collective acceptance accounts are constructivist; institutional facts and, therefore, institutions exist only in so far as they are collectively believed to exist or are otherwise the content of a collective attitude, such as a we-intention. Typically, such collective attitudes are not to be understood as reducible to individual attitudes or aggregates thereof. (Ludwig is an exception among collective acceptance adherents. According to him the so-called we-intentions constitutive of collective acceptance (Ludwig 2017: 132) are analysable in terms of interlocking individual intentions to achieve some outcome by means of a shared plan (Ludwig 2017: 26)). Thus Searle claims his notion of a collective intention or we-intention is a primitive notion that is not reducible to an individual intention, nor to an individual intention in conjunction with other individual attitudes such as individual beliefs (Searle 1995: 24–6; Searle 2010: Chapter 3). Searle’s invocation of an unanalysed allegedly primitive notion is controversial in the context of reductive accounts (Miller 2001; Bratman 2014; Ludwig 2016). On the other hand, Tuomela provides a non-reductive analysis of we-intentions. He makes a distinction between irreducibly collective we-mode attitudes and individualistic pro-group I-mode attitudes (Tuomela 2013: 6–7) and does so on the grounds that the former involve the intention to act together as a group. However, Tuomela is open to the objection that the notion of acting qua member of a group can itself be analysed as acting in according with an individual end which each agent has interdependently with the others (a shared interdependent end) (Miller 2010: 52–54).

Collective acceptance is not simply a matter of psychological attitudes standing in some straightforward causal relation to the external world as is the case, for instance, with common or garden-variety intentions, including the joint intentions definitive of basic joint actions. The idea is not that a group forms a joint intention to (say) push a boulder up a hill and, thereby, jointly cause the boulder to be relocated to the top of the hill. Rather the notion of a performative is typically invoked (Austin 1962; Searle 2010: 11).

Examples of performatives are: ‘I name this ship the Queen Elizabeth’—as uttered when smashing the bottle against the stem; ‘I give and bequeath my watch to my brother’—as occurring in a will (Austin 1962: 5). Performative are speech acts which bring about an outcome in the external world (e.g. that the name of the ship is the Queen Elizabeth or that my brother is the owner of what used to be my watch). Specifically, performatives are sayings which are also doings. In Searle’s terminology, merely saying something (‘I do’) counts as something else (becoming a wife). An important species of performatives are declarative speech acts (e.g. saying ‘I declare war’ in a certain context counts as going to war). A key point about performatives appears to be that it is by virtue of a convention that saying such and such in a given context brings the outcome about (Miller 1984). Accordingly, the outcome depends on collective acceptance (in the sense of compliance with the convention) and, indeed, to this extent the outcome is in part constituted by collective acceptance (in this sense). Searle himself speaks of constitutive rules at this point; rules that have the form ‘X counts as Y in context C’ (Searle 2010: 95).

As mentioned above, Guala denies a central role to constitutive rules. According to Guala, (following Hindriks 2009), constitutive rules are essentially naming devices; they state the conditions of application of theoretical terms used to refer to institutions. For instance, a dollar note (X) counts as money (Y) if it is issued by the relevant authority. Here the Y term simply names a pattern of activity governed by regulative rules, e.g. ‘Use the note as a medium of exchange’. Other theorists who have, in effect, reduced or otherwise down-graded Searle’s notion of constitutive rules in favour of regulative rules, including systems of regulative rules are Miller (2001: 191) and, more recently, Ludwig (2017). According to Ludwig, constitutive rules are regulative rules such that intentionally following them constitutes the activity they govern (Ludwig 2017: 262).

Favourite examples of collective acceptance theorists are money, political authorities, and, most importantly for our concerns here, so-called status roles. Thus Tuomela says (2007: 183): “‘performative’ collective acceptance must have been in place for squirrel pelt to become money.” And Searle says (2010: 101): “But when we count pieces of paper of a particular sort as twenty-dollar bills we are making them twenty dollar bills by Declaration. The Declaration makes something the case by counting it as, that, by declaring it to be, the case.” The problem with this view of money (in its role purely as a medium of exchange) is that Tuomela’s invocation of performatives and Searle’s invocation of declaratives seem unnecessary. The fact that squirrel pelts, shells or bit of inked paper are used as mediums of exchange is sufficient for them to be money. For a squirrel pelt to count as money or to be treated as money or to be collectively accepted as money is just for it to be used as a medium of exchange. The notion of collective acceptance either collapses into regular, interdependent, use or it is superfluous. Nor do such informal exchange systems necessarily generate deontic properties; if your squirrel pelt is refused as a medium of exchange by someone then your expectation (in the sense of belief with respect to the future) has been dashed, but no institutional right has been violated (given the informal character of the arrangement). Of course it would add greatly to the stability of this arrangement if these pelts (or, more likely, bits of inked paper) were somehow authorised as an official medium of exchange, and if a (rule constituted) system of institutional rights and duties in relation to the exchange of these shells was introduced and enforced. However, such a deontological structure does not seem to be a necessary feature of the system of exchange (Miller 2001: 182; Guala 2016: 40). Naturally, it could be replied to this that, nevertheless, institutional rights and duties, as opposed to the underlying functionality of the arrangement, requires performatives and, specifically, declaratives.

What of political authorities? Searle says (1995: 91–2): “More spectacular examples are provided by the collapse of the Soviet empire in the annus mirabilis, 1989.… It collapsed when the system of status-functions was no longer accepted.” However, such collapses of political systems seem to demonstrate a special feature of institutional positions of authority rather than of institutional roles in general. Specifically, it is a necessary condition of wielding authority that subordinates obey the commands of their superior. Presumably, they do so because they believe the person in question has a moral right to be obeyed and/or they fear sanctions if they do not obey (Miller 2001: 189).

What of status roles, i.e. institutional roles, in general? These are the most important for our purposes in this entry. According to Searle (see also Ludwig 2017: Chapter 8), institutions necessarily involve what he calls status-functions, and something has a status-function—as opposed to a mere function—if it has, or those who use it have, deontic properties (institutional rights and duties) and, therefore, deontic powers (Searle 2018). Thus an orthopaedic surgeon has a status-function, and therefore a set of deontic powers, including rights to perform operations and charge people for doing so, and duties not to perform operations he or she is not accredited to perform, e.g. brain surgery. These status-functions, and therefore deontic powers, have been created by collectively accepted constitutive rules (constitutive rules, as we have seen, have for Searle the general form ‘X counts as Y in context C’). Importantly, as we saw above, according to Searle, constitutive rules do not regulate a pre-existing activity; rather the activity is created by, and consists in acting in accordance with, constitutive (and related regulative) rules. Accordingly, institutional roles are of the same general kind as pieces in a game of chess (to use one of Searle’s favourite examples (Searle 2018: 305)) and, therefore, unlike driving a car (which, according to Searle, pre-exists the regulative rules that govern it (Searle 2018: 305)); institutional roles and their defining deontic properties, are institutional facts created by collectively accepted constitutive rules.

The first point to be made here is that contra Searle many institutional roles seem more akin to regularly driving a car than to chess pieces. The institutional role of surgeon is a case point. The ability and activity definitive of a surgeon, i.e. cutting and stitching human bodies, is evidently logically prior to the institutional rights and duties that attach to the institutional role of a surgeon (Miller 2001: 186). More generally, a surgeon could seemingly carry out surgical operations on willing patients irrespective not only of whether she was professionally accredited (and, therefore, possessed of the requisite institutional rights and duties), but also of whether she was widely regarded as a surgeon in her community. Consider, for instance, a morally motivated, skilful, surgeon whose full-time job is transplanting hearts in a jurisdiction in which organ transplantation is illegal.

If this is correct then the crucial issue that now arises concerns the relationship between possession of the deontic properties, i.e. institutional rights and duties, at least in part constitutive of an institutional role, on the one hand, and the actual ability to undertake that role, bearing in mind that the activity is, at least in some cases of institutional roles, logically prior to its institutional raiment. Specifically, are the institutional rights and duties in part definitive of institutional roles, such as that of a surgeon, merely the creation of collectively accepted constitutive rules, irrespective of how collective acceptance and constitutive rules are understood (see, for instance, Ludwig (2017: Chapter 8) for a view that derives from, but is somewhat different to, Searle’s), or are they based on more than this? For instance, are institutional rights and duties in large part based on moral considerations, such as needs, e.g. the institutional right to perform heart transplants is based on the needs of patient for a new heart, as per the teleological account of social institutions (section 4 below)? One response favoured by collective acceptance theorists, such as Tuomela (2013: 126) and Ludwig (2017: 129–130), is to invoke the notion of an explicit or implicit agreement (and, therefore, promise or quasi-promise) as in part constitutive of collective acceptance (because either constitutive of we-intentions or of conventions). However, this reliance on the notion of an agreement ultimately grounds deontic properties on a contractualist moral theory and, therefore, brings with it all the objections to such theories, e.g. that there typically no explicit agreements and a lack of evidence of many implicit agreements.

4. The Teleological Account of Institutions

As noted above, the central concept in the teleological account of social institutions (Miller 2010) is that of joint action. On the teleological account, joint actions consist of the intentional individual actions of a number of agents directed to the realisation of a collective end. (Note that intentions are not the same things as ends, e.g. an agent who intentionally and gratuitously raises his arm ex hypothesi has no end or purpose in doing so.) Importantly, on the teleological account, a collective end—notwithstanding its name—is a species of individual end; it is an end possessed by each of the individuals involved in the joint action. However it is an end, which is not realised by the action of any one of the individuals; the actions of all or most realise the end. So contra anti-reductionist theorists such as Gilbert, Tuomela and Searle, the teleological account holds that joint actions can be analysed in terms of individualist notions. A second major point of differentiation from collective acceptance accounts is that on the teleological account conative notions, such as we-intentions and, more relevantly, collective ends, cannot in and of themselves generate deontic properties, specifically institutional rights and duties. Accordingly, the basis for deontic properties must lie elsewhere. As we shall see, on the teleological account, the basis for deontological properties is to be found in large part in the collective goods provided by institutions.

Collective ends can be unconsciously pursued, and have not necessarily been at any time explicitly formulated in the minds of those pursuing them; collective ends can be implicit in the behaviour and attitudes of agents without ceasing to be ends as such. Further, in the case of a collective end pursued over a long period of time, e.g. by members of an institution over generations, the collective end can be latent at a specific point in time, i.e. it is not actually being pursued, explicitly or implicitly, at that point in time. However, it does not thereby cease to be an end of that institution—which is to say, of those persons—even at those times when it is not being pursued.

As we saw above, organisations consist of an (embodied) formal structure of interlocking roles. These roles can be defined in terms of tasks, regularities in action and the like. Moreover, unlike social groups, organisations are individuated by the kind of activity which they undertake, and also by their characteristic ends. So we have governments, universities, business corporations, armies, and so on. Perhaps governments have as an end or goal the ordering and leading of societies, universities the end of discovering and disseminating knowledge, and so on (Miller 2010: Part B). Here it is important to reiterate that these ends are, firstly, collective ends and, secondly, often the latent and/or implicit (collective) ends of individual institutional actors.

On the teleological account, a further defining feature of organisations is that organisational action typically consists in, what has elsewhere been termed, a layered structure of joint actions. One illustration of the notion of a layered structure of joint actions is an armed force fighting a battle. Suppose at an organisation level a number of “actions” are severally necessary and jointly sufficient to achieve some collective end. Thus the “actions” of the mortar squad destroying enemy gun emplacements, the flight of military planes providing air-cover and the infantry platoon taking and holding the ground might be severally necessary and jointly sufficient to achieve the collective end of defeating the enemy; as such these “actions” constitute a joint action. Call each of these “actions” level-two actions. Suppose, in addition, that each of these level-two “actions” is itself—at least in part—a joint action whose component actions are severally necessary and jointly sufficient for the performance of the level-two “action” in question. Call these component actions, level-one actions. So the collective end of the level-one actions is the performance of the level-two “action”. Thus the individual members of the mortar squad jointly operate the mortar in order to realise the collective end of destroying enemy gun emplacements. Each pilot, jointly with the other pilots, strafes enemy soldiers in order to realise the collective end of providing air-cover for their advancing foot soldiers. Finally, the set of foot soldiers jointly advance in order to take and hold the ground vacated by the members of the retreating enemy force. The actions of each of the individual foot soldiers, mortar squad members and individual pilots are level-one actions.

On the teleological account a further feature of many social institutions is their use of joint institutional mechanisms. Examples of joint institutional mechanisms are the device of tossing a coin to resolve a dispute and voting to elect a candidate to political office.

Joint institutional mechanisms consist of: (a) a complex of differentiated but interlocking actions (the input to the mechanism); (b)the result of the performance of those actions (the output of the mechanism), and; (c) the mechanism itself. Thus a given agent might vote for a candidate. He will do so only if others also vote. But further to this, there is the action of the candidates, namely, that they present themselves as candidates. That they present themselves as candidates is (in part) constitutive of the input to the voting mechanism. Voters vote for candidates. So there is interlocking and differentiated action (the input). Further there is some result (as opposed to consequence) of the joint action; the joint action consisting of the actions of putting oneself forward as a candidate and of the actions of voting. The result is that some candidate, say, Barack Obama is voted in (the output). That there is a result is (in part) constitutive of the mechanism. That to receive the most number of votes is to be voted in, is (in part) constitutive of the voting mechanism. Moreover that Obama is voted in is not a collective end of all the voters. (Although it is a collective end of those who voted for Obama.) However, that the one who gets the most votes—whoever that happens to be—is voted in is a collective end of all the voters, including those who voted for some candidate other than Obama.

If the end realised in joint action, and organisational action in particular, is not merely a collective end, but also a collective good, then moral properties may well be generated. In the first place, the collective good might consist in an aggregate of basic human needs that have been met, as in the case of food producers, schools, hospitals and police organisations. But, arguably, such needs generate moral obligations; other things being equal, the desperately poor (for example) morally ought to be assisted by the ongoing, organised joint action of those able to assist.

In the second place—at the, so to speak, production, as opposed to the consumption, end of joint action—the realisation of collective ends that are also collective goods may well generate joint moral rights. It is easy to see why some agents, and not other agents, would have a right to such a good; they are the ones responsible for its existence, or continued existence. In this connection consider the managers and workers in a factory that produces cars which are sold for profit. Managers and workers in the factory—but not necessarily others—have a joint moral right to be remunerated from the sales of the cars that they jointly produced—and not simply on the basis of some contractual arrangement that they have entered into. It is also clear that if one participating agent has a moral right to the good, then—other things being equal—so do the others. That is, there is interdependence of moral rights with respect to the good. Moreover, these moral rights generate correlative moral duties on the part of others to respect these rights. Naturally these prior joint right and duties can be, and are, institutionalised including by way of contract based legal rights and duties that to some extent respect the relative contributions made by the participants.

Unlike the collective acceptance account the teleological account introduces moral deontology at the ground floor (so to speak) and tries to generate institutional deontology on the back of this prior moral deontology, e.g. institutional moral rights are inter-subjectively believed moral rights. As such it is open to the charge that moral deontology presupposes institutional forms. The concept of a right, for example, might be held to make no sense outside an institutional environment. Indeed, Searle (2010: Chapter 8) offers this kind of argument, including in relation to human rights (Burman 2018). Another objection is that many members of organisations do not have the collective ends of the institution of which they are members as an end; rather they perform their roles because they are paid to do so. However, joint actions can be performed for individual ends; there can be quasi-joint actions (Miller 2001: 180)

In this section the teleological account of social institutions has been elaborated. In the following section issues of institutions and agency are discussed.

5. Institutions and Agency

As mentioned above, it is convenient to conceive of social institutions as possessed of three dimensions, namely, structure, function and culture. While the structure, function and culture of an institution provide a framework within which individuals act, they do not fully determine the actions of individuals. There are a number of reasons why this is so. For one thing, rules, norms and ends cannot cover every contingency that might arise; for another, rules, norms and so on, themselves need to be interpreted and applied. Moreover, changing circumstances and unforeseeable problems make it desirable to vest institutional role occupants (individually or jointly) with discretionary powers to rethink and adjust old rules, norms, and ends, and sometimes elaborate new ones (Warwick 1981)

Legitimate individual or collective discretionary activity undertaken within an institution is typically facilitated by a rational internal structure—including role structure—, and by a rational institutional culture. By rational, it is here meant internally consistent, as well as rational in the light of the institution’s purposes. For instance, a hierarchical role structure might be rational in one institution, e.g. a defence force, but not another, e.g. a university. Again, a culture of greed might undermine an institution’s purposes, e.g. in a financial institution.

Aside from the internal dimensions of an institution, there are its external relationships, including its relationships to other institutions. In particular, there is the extent of the independence of an institution from other institutions, including government. One thinks here of the separation of powers among the legislative, executive and judicial institutions in the United States of America and elsewhere.

It should be noted that, strictly speaking, independence is not the same thing as autonomy, but is rather a necessary condition for it. An institution possessed of independence from other institutions might nevertheless lack autonomy, if it lacked the kinds of rational internal structure and culture noted above. Indeed, internal conflicts can paralyse an institution to the point where it becomes incapable of pursuing its institutional purposes, e.g. a bitterly divided legislature.

Granted that institutional actors have a degree of discretionary power, nevertheless, they are constrained by institutional structure, and specifically the role structure, of the role that they occupy. As is often pointed out, institutional structure also enables the action of institutional actors (Giddens 1984). Police officers, for example, have significant powers not possessed by ordinary citizens.

A much-discussed issue in the philosophical literature that arises at this point concerns the alleged agency of of institutions; specifically, the view that institutions (and other collective entities) per se are agents. As mentioned, advocates of this view in one form or another, include French (1984), Gilbert (1989), List and Pettit (2011), Tollefsen (2015) and Epstein (2015).

List and Pettit provide an argument based on judgement aggregation in support of their view and suggest, further, that the actions of collective entities supervene on those of their members. The judgement aggregation paradox (see also Copp 2007), are supposed to demonstrate the existence of processes of irreducibly collective reasoning from which irreducibly collective intentions and judgements—and, ultimately, group minds—are inferred. (See Szigeti 2013) for counter-arguments to List and Pettit). A key question is whether the examples provided by Copp, by List and Pettit and by others can be accommodated by an analysis which does not help itself to irreducibly processes of collective reasoning, e.g. the notion of joint (epistemic) institutional mechanisms (Miller 2018) mentioned in section 3. Consider the well-known tenure committee example (Copp 2007).

The tenure committee consists of three members and the criteria for assessment are excellence in teaching, research and administration. Each of the members of the committee believes the candidate is excellent in only two of the areas. However, the committee can reach its conclusion to deny or confirm tenure on the basis of a conclusion-driven procedure or a premise-driven procedure. If the conclusion-driven procedure is used tenure will be denied since on this procedure each votes to confirm tenure only if he or she judges the candidate to be excellent in all three areas. If the premise-driven procedure is used tenure will be confirmed. For on this procedure each votes on each criterion and if a majority judge the candidate to be excellent on that criterion the candidate is deemed to be excellent on that criterion. Since with respect to each of the criteria a majority vote that the candidate is excellent, the result is that the candidate is deemed to be excellent in all three areas. The adherents of irreducibly collectivist reasoning claim that that the choice between the premise-driven way and the conclusion-driven way is a choice between submitting to individual reason and submitting to collective reason. However, both procedures involve a voting procedure and to that extent involve a joint institutional mechanism analysable in wholly individualist terms (as per section 3 above). In addition, both procedures involve a process of reasoning from premises to a conclusion; however, this process is one of logic, and in the tenure example it is a process carried out in the heads of the members of the tenure committee. In the premise-driven procedure the premises from which each committee member will individually infer the conclusion that the candidate is excellent in all three areas are determined by voting, whereas in the case of the conclusion-driven procedure the conclusion that the candidate is not excellent in all three areas is inferred from premises that have been individually chosen. Accordingly, there is no process of collective reasoning as such in the use of either procedure.

Supposing institutions, in particular, are collective agents there remains the question of the relationship between these collective agents and their human members. The favoured relationship, e.g. by List and Pettit, is that of supervenience. Epstein has provided detailed arguments against the supervenience thesis. He distinguishes between what he refers as the grounding and the anchoring of social phenomena, including institutions and institutional objects, and utilizes H. L. A. Hart’s distinction between primary rules and secondary rule in doing so (Hart 1961). Roughly speaking, primary rules directly govern the behaviour of citizens, e.g. laws against murder. Secondary rules determine what the primary rules are, e.g. the legislative processes for enacting primary rules. According to Epstein, the grounds of a primary rule against murder consist of facts such as intentional killing, whereas secondary rules, e.g. the legislative enactment process, would anchor the primary rule. Let us now see how this grounding/anchoring distinction works by way of the example of the Supreme Court of the US. According to Epstein (2015: 223), the fact that the Supreme Court issues a particular opinion is grounded in facts such as that its members voted in particular ways. Moreover, their powers, e.g. to vote, are anchored in part by the US Constitution and the Judiciary Acts (which established the US courts). However, says Epstein, some grounding facts are external to facts about the members of the institution in question, e.g. external to facts about the justices of the Supreme Court. Therefore, the actions of a group depend on more than the actions of the members of the group. For instance, the issuance of an opinion by the Supreme Court depends on more than the votes and other actions of the justices of the Supreme Court, it also depends on the constraints on their actions (Epstein 2015: 227), e.g. constraints imposed by, i.e. anchored in, the US Constitution and the Judicial Acts. Epstein takes this dependence of the actions of the Supreme Court on external facts, and specifically the actions of persons other than the members of the Supreme Court, to undermine the supervenience claim. This is plausible. However, since the argument at this point simply assumes that the Supreme Court per se performs actions, it does not demonstrate that the actions of the Supreme Court are not simply the actions of the members of the Supreme Court. For if we assume contra Epstein that the Supreme Court per se is not an agent and does not perform actions, then his argument merely demonstrates what is clearly correct, namely, that the actions of the members of the Supreme Court are to some extent dependent on the actions of persons other than the members of the Supreme Court, e.g. the framers of the US Constitution and of the Judicial Acts. Indeed, arguably, it is the view that institutions per se are agents that is the root of the problem and the difficulties identified by Epstein that arise from positing the supervenience relation merely symptoms. For if institutions are not agents per se and, therefore, do not perform actions and are not possessed of mental states, then there is no need to posit this supervenience relation.

Another important issue in relation to agency concerns the nature of the relationship between institutional structure and the agency of institutional actors (Pleasants 2019). More specifically, a question arises as to whether or not one of these is logically prior to the other (or whether neither is). Thus some theorists, e.g. Emile Durkheim (1964) are held to conceive of structure as sui generis in relation to individual agency; and indeed, at least in the case of structuralists such as Althusser (1971), explanatory of human ‘agency’. The proposition of structuralists such as Althusser is that institutional structures (in the sense of a structure of social roles and social norms) are a basic, non-reducible feature of the world and the actions, values, self-images and the like of individual human agents must conform to these structures because individual agency, properly understood, is in fact constituted by such structures. An individual human agent is simply the repository of the roles and values of the institutions in which the ‘agent’ lives his or her life. Other theorists, e.g., arguably Max Weber (1949) and methodological individualists, conceive of institutional structure as simply an abstraction from the habitual and interdependent actions of individual human beings actors. Social reality is wholly compromised of individual human agents and their ongoing, patterned interactions; there is no structure as such. (Theorists such as Durkheim occupy a mid-position in which there is both sui generis structure and non-reducible agency; such theorists now confront the problem of conflict between structure and individual agency—which overrides which?)

In relation to this issue Anthony Giddens (1976 and 1984) has attempted to reconcile the felt reality of individual agency with the apparent need to posit some form of institutional structure that transcends individual agency.

According to Giddens, structure is both constituted by human agency and is the medium in which human action takes place (Giddens 1976, p. 121). This seems to mean, firstly, that structure is nothing other than the repetition over time of the related actions of many institutional actors. So the structure consists of: (i) the habitual actions of each institutional agent; (ii) the set of such agents; and (iii) the relationship of interdependence between the actions of any one agent and the actions of the other agents. But it means, secondly, that this repetition over time of the related actions of many agents provides not just the context, but the framework, within which the action of a single agent at a particular spatio-temporal point is performed. Structure qua framework constrains any given agent’s action at a particular spatio-temporal point. (In addition, and as Giddens is at pains to point out, structure qua framework enables various actions not otherwise possible, e.g. linguistic structure enables speech acts to be performed.)

This seems plausible as far as it goes; however, we are owed an account of the interdependence among the actions of different agents. On a teleological account of institutions this interdependence is in large part generated by the ends of the institutions.

Here we need to remind ourselves of a characteristic feature of institutions, namely, their reproductive capacity. Institutions reproduce themselves, or at least are disposed to do so. On the teleological account of institutions, this is in large part because the members of institutions strongly identify with the institutional ends and social norms that are definitive of those institutions, and therefore make relatively long term commitments to institutions and induct others into those institutions.

However, it has been suggested by, for example, Roy Bhaskar (1979: 44) that this reproduction of institutions is the unintended result of the free actions of institutional actors in institutional settings. (See also Merton 1968: Part 1 Section 3.) By way of support for this proposition Bhaskar claims that people do not marry to reproduce the nuclear family or work to reproduce the capitalist system.

The first point to be made by way of response to Bhaskar is that even if the reproduction of an institution was an unintended consequence of the intentional participation of agents in that institution it would not follow that those agents did not have various other institutional outcomes as an end. For example, members of a business might have the maximisation of profit as an explicit collective end, even if the reproduction of the company was not intended by anyone.

The second point is that having an outcome as an implicit and/or latent collective end is not equivalent to individually explicitly intending to bring about that outcome. But it is the former, and not the latter that is in question. What is the evidence for the former in relation to Bhaskar’s chosen examples?

Consider a market-based institution, such as a company. Assume that the owners and managers of this company work to maintain the existence of their company and—through training, recruitment and so on—to ensure that it continues beyond their retirement or resignation. Moreover, assume that in their ongoing interaction with customers and with other businesses, they knowingly—and in the case of sales and marketing personnel, intentionally—establish and maintain specific economic relationships. More generally—let us assume—they express, often explicitly, not only their commitment to their own business, but to the market system in general. Further, let us assume that where appropriate and possible, they assist in the maintenance and further development of that system, e.g. by voting for a market oriented political party. Now consider a set of such companies. Arguably—given these fairly plausible assumptions—each of owner and manager of any of these companies has—jointly with the others—an implicit and (much of the time) latent collective end to reproduce the market system.

Further, there are institutions, such as schools and churches, and policymaking bodies, such as governments, that are explicitly engaged in the enterprise of reproducing a variety of social institutions other than themselves. They contribute to the reproduction of various social institutions by propagating the “ideology” of these institutions, but also by advocating and, in the case of government, by implementing specific policies to ensure the reproduction of these institutions.

Doubtless, unintended consequences—or, more precisely, consequences not aimed at as an end—have an important role in the life and for that matter, the death, of institutions (Hirschman 1970). Such consequences might include ones produced by evolutionary style causal mechanisms, or ones involved in so-called “hidden hand” mechanisms. (Albeit, as we saw above, “hidden hand” mechanisms are often the product of deliberate institutional design, and so their consequences are in a general sense aimed at by the designers, if not by the participating institutional actors themselves.)

More specifically, habitual action is a necessary feature of individual and collective—including institutional—life; and each single action performed on the basis of a habit, contributes in turn, and often unintentionally, to the maintenance and reinforcement of that habit. So the fact that institutional actors necessarily act in large part on the basis of habit means that many of their actions unintentionally contribute to the reproduction of the institution. However, this is consistent with a teleological account of social institutions—since, as noted above, there are outcomes other than institutional reproduction, and many of these are outcomes that are clearly aimed at. Moreover, it is consistent even with a teleological explanation of the reproduction of social institutions, since the establishment and periodic justificatory review of habits are themselves susceptible to teleological explanation.


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