Human Rights

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Fri May 31, 2024

Human rights are norms that aspire to protect all people everywhere from severe political, legal, and social abuses. Examples of human rights are the right to freedom of religion, the right to a fair trial when charged with a crime, the right not to be tortured, and the right to education. The philosophy of human rights addresses questions about the existence, content, nature, universality, justification, and legal status of human rights. The strong claims often made on behalf of human rights (for example, that they are universal, inalienable, or exist independently of legal enactment as justified moral norms) have frequently provoked skeptical doubts and countering philosophical defenses (on these doubts see Lacroix & Pranchère 2016; Mutua 2002; and Waldron 1987). Reflection on these doubts and the responses that can be made to them has become a sub-field of political and legal philosophy with a very substantial literature (see the extensive Bibliography below). This entry addresses the concept of human rights, the existence and grounds of human rights, the question of which rights are human rights, and relativism about human rights.

1. The General Idea of Human Rights

This section attempts to explain the general idea of human rights by identifying four defining features. The goal is to answer the question of what human rights are with a description of the concept rather than with a list of specific rights. Two people can have the same general idea of human rights even though they disagree about which rights are really human rights and even about whether universal human rights are a good idea. The four-part explanation just below attempts to cover all kinds of human rights including both moral and legal human rights as well as old and new human rights (e.g., both Lockean natural rights and contemporary human rights). The explanation anticipates, however, that particular kinds of human rights will have additional features. Starting with this general concept does not commit us to treating all kinds of human rights in a single unified theory (see Buchanan 2013 for an argument that we should not attempt to theorize together universal moral rights and international legal human rights).

  • Human rights are rights Lest we miss the obvious, human rights are rights (see Cruft 2012 and the entry on rights). Rights focus on a freedom, protection, status, immunity, or benefit for the rightholders. Most human rights are claim rights that impose duties or responsibilities on their addressees or dutybearers. The duties associated with human rights often require actions involving respect, protection, facilitation, and provision. Although human rights are usually mandatory in the sense of imposing duties on specified parties, some legal human rights seem to do little more than declare high-priority goals and assign responsibility for their progressive realization. One can argue, of course, that goalish rights are not real rights, but it may be better to recognize that they comprise a weak but useful notion of a right. (See Beitz 2009 for a defense of the view that not all human rights are rights in a strong sense. Also, see Feinberg 1973 for the idea of “manifesto rights” and Nickel 2013 for a discussion of “rightslike goals”.)
  • Human rights are plural and come in lists If someone accepted that there are human rights but held that there is only one of them, this might make sense if she meant that there is one abstract underlying right that generates a list of specific rights (see Dworkin 2011 for a view of this sort). But if this person meant that there is just one specific right such as the right to peaceful assembly this would be a highly revisionary view. Some philosophers advocate very short lists of human rights but nevertheless accept plurality (see Ignatieff 2004).
  • Human rights are universal All living humans—or perhaps we should say all living persons—have human rights. One does not have to be a particular kind of person or a member of some specific nation or religion to have human rights. Included in the idea of universality is some conception of independent existence. People have human rights independently of whether such rights are present in the practices, morality, or law of their country or culture. This idea of universality needs several qualifications, however. First, some rights, such as the right to vote, are held only by adult citizens or residents and apply only to voting in one’s own country. Second, some rights can be suspended. For example, the human right to freedom of movement may be suspended temporarily during a riot or a wildfire. And third, some human rights treaties focus not on the rights of everyone but rather on the rights of specific groups such as minorities, women, indigenous peoples, and children.
  • Human rights have high-priority Maurice Cranston held that human rights are matters of “paramount importance” and their violation “a grave affront to justice” (Cranston 1967: 51, 52). If human rights were not very important norms they would not have the ability to compete with other powerful considerations such as national stability and security, individual and national self-determination, and national and global prosperity. High priority does not mean, however, that human rights are absolute. As James Griffin says, human rights should be understood as “resistant to trade-offs, but not too resistant” (Griffin 2008: 77). Further, there seems to be priority variation among human rights. For example, the right to life is generally thought to have greater importance than the right to privacy; when the two conflict the right to privacy will generally be outweighed.

Let’s now consider five other features or functions that might be added to these four.

  • Should human rights be defined as inalienable? Inalienability does not mean that rights are absolute or can never be overridden by other considerations. Rather it means that its holder cannot lose it temporarily or permanently by bad conduct or by voluntarily giving it up. It is doubtful that all human rights are inalienable in this sense. One who endorses both human rights and imprisonment as punishment for serious crimes must hold that people’s rights to freedom of movement can be forfeited temporarily or permanently by just convictions of serious crimes. Perhaps it is sufficient to say that human rights are very hard to lose. (For a stronger view of inalienability, see Donnelly 1989 [2020] and Meyers 1985.)
  • Should human rights be defined as minimal rights? A number of philosophers have proposed the view that human rights are minimal in the sense of not being too numerous (a few dozen rights rather than hundreds or thousands), and not too demanding (see Joshua Cohen 2004 and Ignatieff 2004). Their views suggest that human rights are—or should be—more concerned with avoiding the worst than with achieving the best. Henry Shue suggests that human rights concern the “lower limits on tolerable human conduct” rather than “great aspirations and exalted ideals” (Shue 1996: ix). When human rights are modest standards they leave most legal and policy matters open to democratic decision-making at the national and local levels. This allows human rights to have high priority, to accommodate a great deal of cultural and institutional variation among countries, and to leave open a large space for democratic decision-making at the national level. Still, there is no contradiction in the idea of an extremely expansive list of human rights and hence minimalism is not a defining feature of human rights (for criticism of the view that human rights are minimal standards see Brems 2009; Etinson forthcoming; and Raz 2010). Minimalism is best seen as a normative prescription for what international human rights should be. Moderate forms of minimalism have considerable appeal as recommendations, but not as part of the definition of human rights.
  • Should human rights be defined as always being or “mirroring” moral rights? Philosophers coming to human rights theory from moral philosophy sometimes assume that human rights must be, at bottom, moral rather than legal rights. There is no contradiction, however, in people saying that they believe in human rights, but only when they are legal rights at the national or international levels. As Louis Henkin observed,

    Political forces have mooted the principal philosophical objections, bridging the chasm between natural and positive law by converting natural human rights into positive legal rights. (Henkin 1978: 19)

    It has also been suggested that legal human rights can be justified without directly appealing to any corresponding moral human right (see Buchanan 2013).

  • Should human rights be defined in terms of serving some sort of political function? Instead of seeing human rights as grounded in some sort of independently existing moral reality, a theorist might see them as the norms of a highly useful political practice that humans have constructed. Such a view would see the idea of human rights as playing various political roles at the national and international levels and as serving thereby to protect urgent human and national interests. These political roles might include providing standards for international evaluations of how governments treat their people and specifying when use of economic sanctions or military intervention is permissible. This kind of view may be plausible for the very salient international human rights that have emerged in international law and politics in the last fifty years. But human rights can exist and function in contexts not involving international scrutiny and intervention such as a world with only one state. Imagine, for example, that a massive asteroid strike makes New Zealand the only remaining state in existence. Surely the idea of human rights along with many dimensions of human rights practice could continue in New Zealand, even though there would be no international relations, law, or politics (for an argument of this sort see Tasioulas 2012a). And if in the same scenario a few people were discovered to have survived in Iceland and were living without a government or state, New Zealanders would know that human rights governed how these people should be treated even though they were stateless. How deeply the idea of human rights must be rooted in international law and practice should not be settled by definitional fiat. We can allow, however, that the sorts of political functions that Rawls and Beitz describe are typically served by international human rights today.

2 The Existence and Grounds of Human Rights

2.1 How Can Human Rights Exist?

The most obvious way in which human rights exist is as norms of national and international law. At the international level, human rights norms exist because of treaties that have turned them into international law. For example, the human right not to be held in slavery or servitude in Article 4 of the European Convention on Human Rights and in Article 8 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights exists because these treaties establish it. At the national level, human rights norms exist because they have—through legislative enactment, judicial decision, or custom—become part of a country’s law. For example, the right against slavery exists in the United States because the 13th Amendment to the United States Constitution prohibits slavery and servitude. When rights are embedded in international law, we are apt to speak of them as human rights; but when they are enacted in national law we more frequently describe them as civil or constitutional rights.

Although enactment in national and international law is one of the ways in which human rights exist, many have suggested that this is not the only way. If human rights exist only because of enactment, their availability is contingent on domestic and international political developments. Many people have looked for a way to support the idea that human rights have roots that are deeper and less subject to human decisions than legal enactment. One version of this idea is that people are born with rights, that human rights are somehow innate or inherent in human beings (see Morsink 2009). One way that a normative status could be inherent in humans is by being god-given. The American Declaration of Independence claims that people are “endowed by their Creator” with natural rights to life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness. On this view, god, the supreme lawmaker, enacted some basic human rights.

Rights plausibly attributed to divine decree must be very general and abstract (life, liberty, etc.) so that they can apply across thousands of years of human history, not just to recent centuries. But contemporary human rights are specific and many of them presuppose contemporary institutions (e.g., the right to a fair trial, the right to social security, and the right to education). Even if people are born with god-given natural rights, we need to explain how to get from those general and abstract rights to the specific rights found in contemporary declarations and treaties.

Attributing human rights to god’s commands may give them a secure status at the metaphysical level, but in a very diverse world it does not make them practically secure. Billions of people today do not believe in the god of Christianity, Islam, and Judaism. If people do not believe in god, or in the sort of god that prescribes rights, then if you want to base human rights on theological beliefs you must persuade these people to accept a rights-supporting theological view. This is likely to be even harder than persuading them of human rights. Legal enactment at the national and international levels provides a far more secure status for practical purposes.

Human rights could also exist independently of legal enactment by being part of actual human moralities. All human groups seem to have moralities, that is, imperative norms of behavior backed by reasons and values. These moralities contain specific norms (for example, a prohibition on the intentional murder of innocent persons) and specific values (for example, valuing human life). One way in which human rights could exist apart from divine or human enactment is as norms accepted in almost all actual human moralities. If almost all human groups have moralities containing norms that prohibit murder, for example, these norms could constitute the human right to life.

This view is attractive but has serious difficulties. Although worldwide acceptance of human rights has increased in recent decades (see below section 4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices), worldwide moral unanimity about human rights does not exist. Human rights declarations and treaties are intended to change existing norms, not just describe an existing moral consensus.

Yet another way of explaining the existence of human rights is to say that they exist most basically in true or justified ethical outlooks. On this account, to say that there is a human right against torture is mainly to assert that there are strong reasons for believing that it is always morally wrong to engage in torture and that protections should be provided against its practice. This approach would view the Universal Declaration as attempting to formulate a justified political morality: that is, as not merely trying to identify a preexisting moral consensus, but trying to create a consensus that could be supported by very plausible moral and practical reasons. This approach requires commitment to the objectivity of such reasons. It holds that just as there are reliable ways of finding out how the physical world works, or what makes buildings sturdy and durable, there are reliable ways of finding out what individuals may justifiably demand of each other and of governments. Even if unanimity about human rights is currently lacking, rational agreement is available to humans if they will commit themselves to open-minded and serious moral and political inquiry. If moral reasons exist independently of human construction, they can—when combined with premises about current institutions, problems, and resources—generate moral norms different from those currently accepted or enacted. The Universal Declaration seems to proceed on exactly this assumption (see Morsink 2009).

One problem with this view is that an existence based on good reasons seems a rather thin form of existence for human rights. But perhaps we can view this thinness as a practical rather than a theoretical problem—that is, as something to be remedied by the formulation and enactment of legal norms. The best form of existence for human rights would combine robust legal existence with the sort of moral existence that comes from being supported by strong moral and practical reasons.

2.2 Justifications for Human Rights

Justifications for human rights should identify plausible starting points for defending the key features of human rights and offer an account of the transition from those starting points to a list of specific rights (see Nickel 2007). Further, justifying international human rights is likely to require additional steps (see Buchanan 2013). These requirements make the construction of a good justification a daunting task.

Recent attempts to justify human rights offer a dizzying variety of grounds. These include prudential reasons; linkage arguments (Shue 1996); agency and autonomy (Gewirth 1996; Griffin 2008); basic needs (D. Miller 2012); capabilities and positive freedom (Gould 2004; Nussbaum 2000; and Sen 2004) dignity (Gilabert 2018b; Kateb 2011, Tasioulas 2015); and fairness, status equality, and equal respect (Dworkin 2011; Buchanan 2013).

There is a lot of overlap between these approaches, but also important differences that are likely to make them yield different results. For example, an approach framed in terms of agency and autonomy will be more strongly and directly supportive of fundamental freedoms than one framed in terms of basic human needs. Justifications can be based on just one of these types of reasons or be pluralistic and appeal to several. Seeing so much diversity in philosophical approaches to justification may be discouraging (although great disagreement in approaches is common in philosophy) but its good side is that it suggests that there are at least several plausible ways of justifying human rights.

Philosophical justifications for human rights differ in how much credibility they attribute to contemporary lists of human rights, such as the one found in the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948). Some take fidelity to contemporary human rights practice as nearly imperative while others prioritize particular normative frameworks even if they can only justify some of the rights in contemporary lists.

Attempting to discuss all of these approaches would be a task for a large book, not an encyclopedic entry. The discussion here is limited to two approaches: agency/autonomy and dignity.

2.2.1 Agency and Autonomy

Grounding human rights in human agency and autonomy has had strong advocates in recent decades (Griffin 2008; Gould 2004). An important forerunner in this area was Alan Gewirth. In Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Application (1982), Gewirth argued that human rights are indispensable conditions of a life as an agent who survives and acts. Abstractly described, the conditions of such a life are basic freedom and well-being. A prudent rational agent who must have freedom and well-being will assert a “prudential right claim” (1982: 31)to them. But, having demanded that others must respect her freedom and well-being, consistency requires her to recognize and respect the freedom and well-being of all other persons, too. She “logically must accept” (1982: 20) that other people as agents have equal rights to freedom and well-being. These two abstract rights work alone and together to generate a list of more determinate human rights of familiar sorts (Gewirth 1978, 1982, 1996). Gewirth’s argument generated a large critical literature (see Beyleveld 1991 and Boylan 1999).

A more recent attempt to base human rights on agency and autonomy is found in James Griffin’s book, On Human Rights (2008). Griffin does not share Gewirth’s goal of providing a logically inescapable argument for human rights, but his overall view shares key structural features with Gewirth’s. These include basing the justification on the unique value of agency and autonomy, postulating some abstract rights, and making place for a right to well-being within an agency-based approach.

In the current dispute between “moral” (or “orthodox”) and “political” conceptions of human rights, Griffin strongly sides with those who see human rights as fundamentally moral rights (on this debate see Liao & Etinson 2012). Their defining role, in Griffin’s view, is protecting people’s ability to form and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life—a capacity that Griffin variously refers to as “autonomy”, “normative agency”, and “personhood”. This ability to form, revise, and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life is taken to be of paramount value, the exclusive source of human dignity, and thereby the basis of human rights. Griffin holds that people value this capacity “especially highly, often more highly than even our happiness” (2008: 32 [§2.3])

“Practicalities” also shape human rights in Griffin’s view. He describes practicalities as “a second ground” (2008: 37–39 [§2.5]) of human rights. They prescribe making the boundaries of rights clear by avoiding “too many complicated bends” (2008: 37 [§2.5]), enlarging rights a little to give them safety margins, and consulting facts about human nature and the nature of society. Accordingly, the justifying generic function that Griffin assigns to human rights is protecting normative agency while taking account of practicalities.

Griffin thinks that he can explain the universality of human rights by recognizing that normative agency is a threshold concept—once one is above the threshold one has the same rights as everyone else. One’s degree of agency above the threshold does not matter. There are no “degrees of being a person” (2008: 67 [§3.5]) among competent adults. Treating agency in this way, however, is a normative policy, not just a fact about concepts. An alternative policy is possible, namely proportioning people’s rights to their level of normative agency. This is what we do with children; their rights grow as they develop greater agency and responsibility. To exclude proportional rights, and to explain the egalitarian dimensions of human rights, including their character as universal and equal rights to be enjoyed without discrimination, some additional ground pertaining to fairness and equality seems to be needed.

This last point raises the question of whether agency-based approaches in general can adequately account for the universality, equality, and anti-discriminatory character of human rights. The idea that human rights are to be respected and protected without discrimination seems to be most centrally a matter of fairness rather than one of agency, freedom, or welfare. Discrimination often harms and hinders its victims, but even when it doesn’t it is still deeply unfair. For example, human rights that explicitly refer to fair wages and equal pay for equal work (ICESCR Articles 3 and 7.i) seem to be much more about fairness than about agency, freedom, or welfare—particularly since human rights to a wage that ensures a decent standard of living are often mentioned separately (ICESCR Article 7.ii).

2.2.2 Dignity

Many human rights declarations and treaties invoke human dignity as the ground of human rights. In recent decades numerous books and articles have been published that advocate dignitarian approaches to justifying human rights (for example, Gilabert 2018b; Kateb 2014; McCrudden 2013 and the many essays therein; Tasioulas 2015; Waldron 2012 and 2015). There have also been many critics, including Den Hartogh 2014; Etinson 2020; Green 2010; Macklin 2003; Rosen 2012; and Sangiovanni 2017.

A well-worked out conception of human dignity is likely to have at least three parts. The first describes the nature of human dignity, specifying for example whether it is a kind of value, status, or virtue (see Rosen 2012). The second explains the grounds of human dignity—that is, why, or in virtue of which shared capacities or features we all have the sort of dignity described in the first step. Finally, and third, there is the question of human dignity’s practical requirements, or what is concretely involved in “respecting” it. (See the entry on dignity for a broader discussion.)

Human dignity is often understood as a special worth or status which all human beings share in contrast to other animals (e.g., Kateb 2011). We can call this the “Special Worth Thesis”. Attempts to provide good explanatory grounds for the Special Worth Thesis identify one or more valuable features that all human persons share and that non-human animals mostly do not possess or have at much lower levels. The valuable features identified will presumably once again need to be “threshold concepts”, so that people can vary in how much of the feature or capacity they have without thereby losing, lessening, or increasing their human dignity in comparison to other persons. Human dignity is, after all, supposed to be a strongly egalitarian idea. Plausible candidates for such grounds might include moral abilities (to understand and follow moral values and norms and to reason and act in terms of them); thought, imagination, and rationality; self-consciousness and reflective capacities; and the use of complicated language and technologies, among others.

One worry about the Special Worth Thesis is its self-glorifying character. In claiming special worth we humans seem to excuse our many faults—including a terrible capacity for evil, routinely evidenced in our behavior towards other humans and towards non-human animals (Rosen 2013). Another closely associated and increasingly prominent worry is that the Special Worth Thesis is speciesist, arbitrarily ranking the interests, status, and/or value of human beings above that/those of non-human animals (Kymlicka 2018; Meyer 2001). In the context of these reasonable concerns, it is worth noting that support for, or a belief in, human dignity need not be prejudicial towards non-human animals; one can affirm the dignity of homo sapiens while also affirming the equal dignity of other species and forms of life (Etinson 2020; Gilabert 2018b). The Special Worth Thesis is optional and only defended by some theorists.

What attitudes, actions, policies, and rights follow from the duty or reason to respect human dignity? And are human rights among them? The answer will at least in part depend on what we think human dignity is. If it is a kind of virtue shared or shareable by all persons then its practical requirements will include things like praising and/or admiring those who possess it, and perhaps developing or cultivating “dignitarian” dispositions in one’s own character. If human dignity is, by contrast, a kind of value or worth (as in Immanuel Kant’s famous understanding of dignity as a worth “beyond all price” Kant 1785/1996: 43), then it is something we have reason to protect, promote, preserve, cherish, restore and perhaps even maximize, if possible. The human right to life, and its material conditions, is an intuitive product of human dignity understood in this way. If, on the other hand, we think of human dignity as a kind of legal (Waldron 2012 and 2015), moral (Gilabert 2018b; Lee & George 2008), or social status (Etinson 2020; Killmister 2020), then duties of “respect” more naturally follow.

These options are not mutually exclusive. In principle, human dignity can refer to all of these things: value, status, and virtue. If human dignity yields human rights, however, this is going to depend on exactly how we understand its practical requirements in light of its nature and grounds. This practical elaboration is the workhorse of a conception of human dignity. It normally results in one or more general maxims or guidelines: e.g., not to humiliate or degrade, never to treat persons merely as a means, to treat others in justifiable ways, to avoid severe cruelty, to respect autonomy, etc. The prospect of grounding human rights in human dignity faces critical challenges at this juncture. As we saw in the preceding discussion of agency-based approaches, the more specific and singular one’s dignitarian maxim is, the less plausible it will be as an exhaustive ground for standard lists of human rights in all their variety. On the other hand, a pluralistic set of grounding maxims will make human dignity a better source of human rights, but it is unclear whether in doing so we are simply explaining its implicit content or bringing in other values and norms to fill in its indeterminate scope. This raises the possibility that values and norms such as promoting human welfare; agency/autonomy; and fairness partially constitute the idea of human dignity rather than being derived from it (see Macklin 2003).

3. Which Rights are Human Rights?

This section discusses the question of which rights belong on lists of human rights. The Universal Declaration’s list, which has been very influential, consists of six families:

  1. Security rights that protect people against murder, torture, and genocide;
  2. Due process rights that protect people against arbitrary and excessively harsh punishments and require fair and public trials for those accused of crimes;
  3. Liberty rights that protect people’s fundamental freedoms in areas such as belief, expression, association, and movement;
  4. Political rights that protect people’s liberty to participate in politics by assembling, protesting, voting, and serving in public office;
  5. Equality rights that guarantee equal citizenship, equality before the law, and freedom from discrimination; and
  6. Economic and social rights that require that governments to forbid slavery and forced labor, enforce safe working conditions, ensure to all the availability of work, education, health services, and a standard of living that is adequate.

A seventh category, minority and group rights, has been created by subsequent treaties. These rights protect women, racial and ethnic minorities, indigenous peoples, children, migrant workers, and the disabled. This list of human rights seems normatively diverse: the issues addressed cover include security, liberty, fairness, equality before the law, access to work and good working conditions, unduly cruel treatment, and political participation.

In spite of the ample list above, not every question of social justice or wise governance is a human rights issue. For example, a country could have too many lawyers or inadequate provision for graduate-level education without violating any human rights. Deciding which norms should be counted as human rights is a matter of considerable difficulty. And there is continuing pressure to expand lists of human rights to include new areas. Many political movements would like to see their main concerns categorized as matters of human rights, since this would publicize, promote, and legitimize their concerns at the international level. A possible result of this is “human rights inflation”, the devaluation of human rights caused by producing too much bad human rights currency (see Cranston 1973; Orend 2002; Wellman 1995; Griffin 2008).

One way to avoid rights inflation is to follow Cranston in insisting that human rights only deal with extremely important goods, protections, and freedoms. A supplementary approach is to impose several justificatory tests for specific human rights. For example, it could be required that a proposed human right not only protect some very important good but also respond to one or more common and serious threats to that good (Dershowitz 2004; Donnelly 1989 [2003]; Shue 1996; Talbott 2005), impose burdens on the addressees that are justifiable and no larger than necessary, and be feasible in most of the world’s countries (on feasibility see Gheaus 2022; Gilabert 2009; Nickel 2007; and Richards 2023). This approach restrains rights inflation with several tests, not just one master test.

In deciding which norms should be considered human rights it is possible to make either too little or too much of international documents such as the Universal Declaration and the European Convention. One makes too little of them by proceeding as if drawing up a list of important rights were a new question, never before addressed, and as if there were no practical wisdom to be found in the choices of rights that went into the historic documents. And one makes too much of them by presuming that those documents tell us everything we need to know about human rights. This approach involves a kind of fundamentalism: it holds that when a right is on the official lists of human rights that settles its status as a human right (“If it’s in the book that’s all I need to know”.) But the process of identifying human rights in the United Nations and elsewhere was a political process with plenty of imperfections. There is little reason to take international diplomats as the most authoritative guides to which human rights there are. Further, even if a treaty’s ratification by most countries can settle the question of whether a certain right is a human right within international law, such a treaty cannot settle its weight. The treaty may suggest that the right is supported by weighty considerations, but it cannot make this so. If an international treaty enacted a right to visit national parks without charge as a human right, the ratification of that treaty would make free access to national parks a human right within international law, but it may well fail to persuade us that national park access is important enough to be a genuine human right.

3.1 Civil and Political Rights

The least controversial family of human rights is civil and political rights. These rights are familiar from historic bills of rights such as the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen (1789) and the U.S. Bill of Rights (1791, with subsequent amendments). Contemporary sources include the first 21 Articles of the Universal Declaration, and treaties such as the European Convention, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights, the American Convention on Human Rights, and the African Charter on Human and People’s Rights. Some representative formulations follow:

Everyone has the right to freedom of thought and expression. This right includes freedom to seek, receive, and impart information and ideas of all kinds, regardless of frontiers, either orally, in writing, in print, in the form of art, or through any other medium of one’s choice. (American Convention on Human Rights, Article 13.1)

Everyone has the right to freedom of peaceful assembly and to freedom of association with others, including the right to form and to join trade unions for the protection of his interests. (European Convention, Article 11)

No one shall be subjected to arbitrary or unlawful interference with his privacy, family, home or correspondence, nor to unlawful attacks on his honour and reputation. Everyone has the right to the protection of the law against such interference or attacks. (ICCPR Article 17)

Most civil and political rights are not absolute—they can sometimes be overridden by other considerations. For example, the right to freedom of movement can be restricted by public and private property rights, by restraining orders related to domestic violence, and by legal punishments. Further, after a disaster such as a hurricane or earthquake free movement is often appropriately suspended to keep out the curious, permit access of emergency vehicles and equipment, and prevent looting. The International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights permits most rights to be suspended during times “of public emergency which threatens the life of the nation” (ICCPR Article 4). But it excludes some rights from suspension including the right to life, the prohibition of torture, the prohibition of slavery, the prohibition of ex post facto criminal laws, and freedom of thought and religion.

3.2 Economic and Social Rights

The Universal Declaration included economic and social rights (“ESRs”) that address matters such as education, food, health services, and employment. Their inclusion has been the source of much controversy (see Beetham 1995). The European Convention did not include them (although it was later amended to include the right to education). Instead ESRs were put into a separate treaty, the European Social Charter. When the United Nations began the process of putting the rights of the Universal Declaration into international law, it followed the same pattern by placing ESRs in a treaty separate from the one dealing with civil and political rights. This treaty, the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (ICESCR, 1966), treated these standards as rights—albeit rights to be progressively realized.

The ICESCR includes rights to: freedom from slavery and forced labor; adequate income or services to cover food, water, clothing, and shelter; basic health conditions and services; free public education; freedom to work, choose one's occupation, and have adequate opportunities for remunerative employment; fair pay and safe conditions of work; social security; equality for women in the workplace, including equal pay for equal work; freedom to form trade unions and to strike; special protections for mothers and children; adequate rest and leisure; and nondiscrimination in respecting, protecting, and fulfilling these rights. In terms of underlying values and norms, some of these rights are welfare-oriented, others are fairness-oriented, and still others are freedom-oriented (Nickel 2022b).

Article 2.1 of the ICESCR sets out what each of the parties commits itself to do about this list, namely to

take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation…to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant.

In contrast, the Civil and Political Covenant commits its signatories to immediate compliance, to

respect and to ensure to all individuals within its territory the rights recognized in the present Covenant. (ICCPR Article 2.1)

The contrast between these two levels of commitment has led some people to suspect that ESRs are really just valuable goals. For many countries, noncompliance due to inability would have been certain if these standards had been treated as immediately binding.

ESRs have often been defended with linkage arguments which claim that ESRs provide indispensable support to the realization of civil and political rights. This approach was first developed philosophically by Henry Shue. He argued that security and subsistence are so indispensable to the full realization of other rights that anyone who endorses the realization of any other right must also endorse ESRs (Shue 1980; for analysis and critical assessments of linkage arguments see Nickel 2007, 2016, and 2022a).

Do ESRs protect sufficiently important human interests? Maurice Cranston opposed ESRs by suggesting that they are mainly concerned with matters such as holidays with pay which are not of deep and universal human interest (Cranston 1967, 1973; treatments of objections to ESRs include Beetham 1995; Howard 1983; and Nickel 2007). It is far from the case, however, that most ESRs pertain only to superficial interests. Consider two examples: the right to an adequate standard of living and the right to free public education. The former requires governments to work hard at remedying widespread and serious evils such as severe poverty, starvation and malnutrition, and ignorance. The importance of food and other basic material conditions of life is easy to show. These goods are essential to people’s ability to live, function, and flourish. Without adequate access to these goods, interests in life, health, and liberty are endangered and serious illness and death are probable. The unavailability of educational opportunities typically limits (both absolutely and comparatively) people’s abilities to participate fully and effectively in the political and economic life of their county

Are ESRs too burdensome? Another objection to ESRs is that they are too burdensome on their dutybearers. It is very expensive to guarantee everyone basic education and minimal material conditions. Frequently the claim that ESRs are too burdensome suggests that ESRs are substantially more burdensome or expensive than liberty rights. Suppose, however, that we use as a basis of comparison liberty rights such as freedom of communication, association, and movement. These rights require both respect and protection from governments. And people cannot be adequately protected in their enjoyment of liberties such as these unless they also have security and due process rights. The costs of liberty, as it were, include the costs of law and criminal justice. Once we see this, liberty rights start to look a lot more costly.

Further, we need not generally think of ESRs as simply giving everyone a free supply of the goods they protect. Guarantees of things like food and housing may be intolerably expensive and undermine productivity if everyone simply receives a free supply. A viable system of ESRs can require most people to provide these goods for themselves and their families through work, as long as they are given the necessary opportunities, education, and infrastructure. Government-implemented ESRs provide guarantees of availability (or “secure access”), but under many conditions governments should only have to supply the requisite goods in a small fraction of cases.

Countries that do not accept and implement ESRs must still somehow bear the costs of providing for the needy since these countries are unlikely to find it tolerable to allow sizable parts of the population to starve and be homeless. If government does not supply food, clothing, and shelter to those unable to provide for themselves, then families, friends, and communities will have to shoulder this burden. It is only in the last hundred or so years that government-sponsored ESRs have taken over a substantial part of the burden of providing for the needy. The taxes associated with ESRs are partial replacements for other burdensome duties, namely the duties of families and communities to provide adequate care for the unemployed, sick, disabled, and aged. Deciding whether to implement ESRs is not a matter of deciding whether to bear such burdens, but rather of deciding whether to continue with total reliance on systems of informal provision that distribute assistance in a very spotty way and whose costs fall very unevenly on families, friends, and communities.

Are ESRs feasible worldwide? Another objection to ESRs alleges that they are not feasible in many countries (on feasibility see Gheaus 2013, Gilabert 2009, and Nickel 2007). It is very expensive to provide guarantees of subsistence, measures to protect and restore people’s health, and education. Many governments will be unable to provide these guarantees while meeting other important responsibilities. Rights are not magical sources of supply (Holmes & Sunstein 1999). As we saw earlier, the ESR Covenant dealt with the issue of feasibility by calling for progressive implementation, that is, implementation as financial and other resources permit. Does this view of implementation turn ESRs into high-priority goals? And if so, is that a bad thing?

Standards that outrun the abilities of many of their addressees are good candidates for treatment as goals. Viewing them as largely aspirational rather than as imposing immediate duties avoids problems of inability-based noncompliance. One may worry, however, that this is too much of a demotion for ESRs because goals seem much weaker than rights (see O’Neill 2005 and Tomalty 2014). But goals can be formulated in ways that make them more like rights. They can be assigned addressees (the parties who are to pursue the goal), beneficiaries, scopes that define the objective to be pursued, and a high level of priority (see Langford, Sumner, & Yamin 2013 and Nickel 2013; see also OHCHR and the 2030 Agenda for Sustainable Development, UN). Strong reasons for the importance of these goals can be provided. And supervisory bodies can monitor levels of progress and pressure low-performing addressees to attend to and work on realizing their goals.

Treating very demanding rights as goals has some advantages. Goals coexist easily with low levels of ability to achieve them. And goals are flexible: addressees with different levels of ability can choose ways of pursuing the goals that suit their circumstances and means. Because of these attractions it may be worth exploring sophisticated ways to transform very demanding human rights into goals. The transformation may be full or partial. It is possible to create right-goal mixtures that contain some mandatory elements (see Brems 2009). A right-goal mixture might include some rights-like goals, some mandatory steps to be taken immediately, and duties to realize the rights-like goals as quickly as possible.

Do ESRs yield a sufficient commitment to equality? Objections to ESRs as human rights have come from both the political right and the political left. A common objection from the left, including liberal egalitarians and socialists, is that ESRs as enumerated in human rights documents and treaties provide too weak of a commitment to material equality (Gilabert 2018a and Moyn 2018). Realizing ESRs requires governments to ensure everyone an adequate minimum of resources in some key areas but does not require strong commitments to equality of opportunity, redistributive taxation, or wealth ceilings (see the entries on equality, distributive justice, and liberal feminism).

The egalitarian objection cannot be that human rights documents and treaties show no concern for people living in poverty and misery. One of the main purposes of including ESRs in human rights documents and treaties was to promote serious efforts to combat poverty, lack of education, and unhealthy living conditions in countries all around the world (see also Langford, Sumner, & Yamin 2013 on the UN Millennium Development Goals). The objection also cannot be that human rights facilitated the hollowing out of systems of welfare rights in many developed countries that occurred after 1980 (for criticism of this view see Song 2019). Those cuts in welfare programs were often in violation of the requirements of realizing ESRs.

Perhaps it should be conceded that human rights documents and treaties have not said enough about positive measures to promote equal opportunity in education and work. A positive right to equal opportunity, like the one Rawls proposed, would require countries to take serious measures to reduce disparities between the opportunities effectively available to children of high-income and low-income parents (see Rawls 1971 and the entry on equality of opportunity).

A strongly egalitarian political program is probably best pursued partially within but mostly beyond the human rights framework. One reason for this is that the human rights movement will have better prospects for ongoing acceptance and support if it has widespread political acceptance. To achieve this, the rights it endorses must appeal to people with a variety of political views, ranging from center-left to center-right. Support from the broad political center is less likely to emerge and survive if the human rights platform is perceived as mostly a leftist program.

3.3 Human Rights of Women, Minorities, and Groups

Equality of rights for historically disadvantaged or subordinated groups is a longstanding concern of the human rights movement. Human rights documents repeatedly emphasize that all people, including women and members of minority ethnic and religious groups, have equal human rights and should be able to enjoy them without discrimination. The right to freedom from discrimination figures prominently in the Universal Declaration and subsequent treaties. The Civil and Political Covenant, for example, commits participating states to respect and protect their people’s rights without distinction of any kind, such as race, color, sex, language, political or other opinion, national or social origin, property, birth, or social status (ICCPR Article 2.1). On minority and group rights see Kymlicka 1995.

A number of standard civil and political rights are especially important to ethnic and religious minorities, including rights to freedom of association, freedom of assembly, freedom of religion, and freedom from discrimination. Human rights documents also include rights that refer to minorities explicitly and give them special protections. For example, the Civil and Political Covenant in Article 27 says that persons belonging to ethnic, religious, or linguistic minorities

shall not be denied the right, in community with other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language. (ICCPR Article 27)

Feminists have often protested that standard lists of human rights do not sufficiently take into account the unique risks faced by women. For example, issues like domestic violence, reproductive choice, and the trafficking of women and girls for sex work did not have a prominent place in early human rights documents and treaties. Lists of human rights have had to be expanded “to include the degradation and violation of women” (Bunch 2006; see also Okin 1998). Violations of women’s human rights often occur in the “private” sphere, i.e., in the home at the hands of other family members. This suggests that governments cannot be seen as the only addressees of human rights and that the right to privacy of home and family needs qualification to allow police to protect women within the home.

The issue of how formulations of human rights should respond to variations in the sorts of risks and dangers that different people face is difficult and arises not just in relation to gender but also in relation to age, race, sexual orientation, profession, political affiliation, religion, and personal interests. Due process rights, for example, are much more useful to young people (and particularly young men) than they are to older people since the latter are far less likely to run afoul of the criminal law.

Since 1964 the United Nations has mainly dealt with the rights of women and minorities through specialized treaties such as the International Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination (1965); the Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (1979); the Convention on the Rights of the Child (1989), and the Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (2007). See also the Declaration on the Rights of Indigenous Peoples (2007). Specialized treaties allow international norms to address unique problems of particular groups such as assistance and care during pregnancy and childbearing in the case of women, custody issues in the case of children, and the loss of historic territories by indigenous peoples.

Minority groups are often targets of violence. Human rights norms call upon governments to refrain from such violence and to provide protections against it. This work is partly done by the right to life, which is a standard individual right. It is also done by the right against genocide which protects groups from attempts to destroy or decimate them. The Genocide Convention was one of the first human rights treaties after World War II. The right against genocide is clearly a group right. It is held by both individuals and groups and provides protection to groups as groups. It is largely negative in the sense that it requires governments and other agencies to refrain from destroying groups; but it also requires that legal and other protections against genocide be created at the national level.

As a group right, can the right against genocide be a human right? More generally, can a group right fit the general idea of human rights as rights of individual persons proposed earlier? Perhaps it can if we broaden our conception of who can hold human rights to include important groups that people form and cherish (see the entry on group rights). This can be made more palatable, perhaps, by recognizing that the beneficiaries of the right against genocide are individual humans who enjoy greater security against attempts to destroy the group to which they belong (Kymlicka 1989).

3.4 New Human Rights

Although contemporary lists of human rights are already long, there are doubtless norms that should be counted as human rights but are not generally recognized as such. After all, there are lots of areas in which people’s basic welfare, dignity, and fundamental interests are threatened by the actions and omissions of individuals and governments. New technologies create new problems and require us to rethink old solutions. And new political movements emerge and create demands for their goals and norms as human rights.

Prominent recent proposals of new human rights include Kimberley Brownlee’s advocacy of a right against social deprivation that would address severe unwanted loneliness (Brownlee 2020 and 2022), the proposal of a universal right to internet access that was endorsed by the UN General Assembly in 2016 (UN Resolution 32/13), and the similar endorsement in 2022 of a right to a clean, healthy, and sustainable environment (UN Resolution 76/300; see also the entry on environmental ethics).

The right to a healthy environment provides a good example of how new human rights can slowly emerge. After a right of this sort was added to many national bills of rights, environmental NGOs began to promote it within international organizations. In 2000 the European Union’s Bill of Rights, the Charter of Fundamental Rights of the European Union, included in Article 37 an environmental protection norm:

A high level of environmental protection and the improvement of the quality of the environment must be integrated into the policies of the Union and ensured in accordance with the principle of sustainable development.

In 2012 the UN Human Rights Council created a Special Rapporteur (independent expert) on the Environment, eventually approved the right to “a clean, healthy, and sustainable environment”, and forwarded it to the General Assembly—where 80 percent of the world’s countries voted for it (UN Resolution 76/300). Human rights approaches to climate change have also been developed in recent decades (see Bodansky 2009; Caney 2009; Gardiner 2013; and Vanderheiden 2008).

Worries about the proliferation of human rights have not disappeared. Lawyers and international organizations have proposed standards to limit the introduction of new human rights (for example, Alston 1984 and the UN General Assembly 1986). And human rights treaty-making has slowed. After the approval of the Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court in 1999, the only human rights treaty approved by the UN is the 2006 Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities. In 2007 a declaration (not a treaty) on the Rights of Indigenous Peoples was approved by the General Assembly. Prominent philosophers have also advocated smaller lists of human rights (see, for example, Cranston 1967 and 1973; Rawls 1999; and Griffin 2008). Griffin also opposed squeezing new content into existing human rights—which he described as the “ballooning” of rights.

4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices

Two familiar philosophical worries about human rights are that they are based on beliefs and attitudes that are culturally relative and that their creation and advocacy involves ethnocentrism. Human rights prescribe universal standards in areas such as security, law enforcement, equality, political participation, and education. The peoples and countries of planet Earth are, however, enormously varied in their practices, traditions, religions, and levels of economic and political development. Putting these two propositions together may be enough to justify the worry that universal human rights do not sufficiently accommodate the diversity of Earth’s peoples. A theoretical expression of this worry is “relativism”, the idea that ethical, political, and legal standards are only true or justified relative to the traditions, beliefs, and conditions of a particular country, culture or region (see the entry on moral relativism).

During the drafting in 1947 of the Universal Declaration, the Executive Board of the American Anthropological Association (“AAA”) warned of the danger that the Declaration would be “a statement of rights conceived only in terms of the values prevalent in Western Europe and America”. A central concern of the AAA Board in the period right after World War II was to condemn intolerant colonialist attitudes of the day and to advocate cultural and political self-determination. But the Board also made the stronger assertion that “standards and values are relative to the culture from which they derive” and thus “what is held to be a human right in one society may be regarded as anti-social by another people” (AAA 1947).

Such assertions have continued to fuel accusations that human rights are instruments of ethnocentrism, arrogance, and cultural imperialism (Renteln 1990). Ethnocentrism is the assumption, usually unconscious, that “one’s own group is the center of everything” and that its beliefs, practices, and norms provide the standards by which other groups are “scaled and rated” (Sumner 1906; see also Etinson 2018a who argues that ethnocentrism is best understood as a kind of cultural bias rather than a belief in cultural superiority). Ethnocentrism can lead to arrogance and intolerance in dealings with other countries, ethical systems, and religions. Finally, cultural imperialism occurs when the economically, technologically, and militarily strongest countries impose their beliefs, values, and institutions on the rest of the world (for a useful discussion of several power-related concerns about human rights, see Gilabert 2018a).

As in the AAA Board’s case, relativists often combine these charges with a prescription, namely that tolerance of varied practices and traditions ought to be instilled and practiced through measures that include extended learning about other cultures. The idea that relativism and exposure to other cultures promote tolerance may be correct from a psychological perspective. People who are sensitive to differences in beliefs, practices, and traditions, and who are suspicious of the grounds for extending norms across borders, may be more inclined to be tolerant of other countries and peoples than those who believe in an objective universal morality. Still, philosophers have been generally critical of attempts to argue from relativism to a prescription of tolerance (see Williams 1972 [1993] and Talbott 2005). If the culture and religion of one country has long fostered intolerant attitudes and practices, and if its citizens and officials act intolerantly towards people from other countries, they are simply following their own traditions and cultural norms. Accordingly, a relativist from a tolerant country will be hard-pressed to find a basis for criticizing the citizens and officials of the intolerant country. To do so the relativist will have to endorse a transcultural principle of tolerance and to advocate as an outsider cultural change in the direction of greater tolerance. Because of this, relativists who are deeply committed to tolerance may find themselves attracted to a qualified commitment to human rights.

Perhaps for these reasons, relativism is not the stance of most anthropologists today. Currently the AAA has a central Committee whose objectives include promoting, protecting, and developing an anthropological perspective on human rights. While still emphasizing the importance of cultural differences, anthropologists now often support the protection of vulnerable cultures, non-discrimination, and the rights and land claims of indigenous peoples (see the AAA’s 2020 Statement on Anthropology and Human Rights).

The conflict between relativists and human rights advocates may be partially based on differences in their underlying philosophical beliefs, particularly in metaethics. Relativists are often subjectivists or noncognitivists and think of morality as entirely socially constructed and transmitted. In contrast, philosophically-inclined human rights advocates are more likely to adhere to or presuppose cognitivism, moral realism, and intuitionism.

As the AAA’s 1947 Statement shows, the accommodation of diversity has been a concern facing the contemporary human rights regime since its inception. As part of a 1946–47 UNESCO inquiry into the theoretical basis of human rights, the French philosopher, Jacques Maritain, famously suggested that universal agreement on human rights was possible so long as questions of underlying justification were ignored: “Yes… we agree about the rights but on condition no one asks us why” (Maritain 1949: 9). The International Bill of Human Rights appears to violate this embargo when it asserts, in the Preamble to both major Covenants, that “these rights derive from the inherent dignity of the human person”. Nonetheless, Maritain’s idea has strong echoes in contemporary philosophical work (see Taylor 1999), including John Rawls’ idea that human rights can have a minimal public or “political” justification which may be accepted from various “comprehensive” religious, moral, and philosophical points of view (Rawls 1999; Beitz 2009). Indeed, some have argued that international human rights law’s justificatory appeal to human dignity should be understood in precisely this ecumenical way (McCrudden 2008).

Other important methods of accommodating diversity include the abstract formulation of human rights norms, which allows for diverse, context-sensitive modes of social and institutional implementation (see Etinson 2013). As discussed in section 1, a modest understanding of the aims of human rights would leave more room for democratic decision-making at the domestic level, and for cultural and political variation across countries (see also the European Court of Human Rights’ notion of a “margin of appreciation”, discussed in Letsas 2006). And it is worth noting that, within limits, state parties to international human rights treaties are entitled to submit “reservations” that alter the legal effect of treaty provisions as they pertain to that state. This provides a further avenue for legal variation and accommodation.

In the 1990s, Singapore’s Senior Minister Lee Kuan Yew and others argued that international human rights as found in United Nations declarations and treaties were insensitive to distinctive “Asian values”, such as prizing families and community (in contrast to strong individualism); putting social harmony over personal freedom; respect for political leaders and institutions; and emphasizing responsibility, hard work, and thriftiness as means of social progress (on the Asian Values debate see Bauer & Bell [eds] 1999; Bell 2000; and Sen 1997). Proponents of the Asian values idea did not wish to abolish all human rights; they rather wanted to deemphasize some families of human rights, particularly the fundamental freedoms and rights of democratic participation (and in some cases the rights of women). They also wanted Western governments and NGOs to stop criticizing them for human rights violations in these areas.

At the 1993 World Conference on Human Rights in Vienna, countries including Singapore, Malaysia, China, and Iran advocated accommodations within human rights practice for cultural and economic differences. Western representatives tended to view the position of these countries as excuses for repression and authoritarianism. The Conference responded by approving the Vienna Declaration. It included in Article 5 the assertion that countries should not pick and choose among human rights:

All human rights are universal, indivisible and interdependent and interrelated. The international community must treat human rights globally in a fair and equal manner, on the same footing, and with the same emphasis. While the significance of national and regional particularities and various historical, cultural and religious backgrounds must be borne in mind, it is the duty of States, regardless of their political, economic and cultural systems, to promote and protect all human rights and fundamental freedoms.

In recent decades widespread acceptance of human rights has occurred in most parts of the world. Three quarters of the world’s countries have ratified the major human rights treaties, and many countries in Africa, the Americas, and Europe participate in regional human rights regimes that have international courts (see the Georgetown University Human Rights Law Research Guide in the Other Internet Resources below). Ratification does not, of course, guarantee compliance. Further, all of the world’s countries now use similar political institutions (law, courts, legislatures, executives, militaries, bureaucracies, police, prisons, taxation, and public schools) and these institutions carry with them characteristic problems and abuses (Donnelly 1989 [2020]). Finally, globalization has diminished the differences among peoples. Today’s world is not the one that early anthropologists and missionaries found. National and cultural boundaries are breached not just by international trade but also by millions of travelers and migrants, electronic communications, international law covering many areas, and the efforts of international governmental and non-governmental organizations. International influences and organizations are everywhere and countries borrow freely and regularly from each other’s inventions and practices.

Bibliography

A. Books and Articles in the Philosophy of Human Rights

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B. Legal Declarations

Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

For the 2024 update, Adam Etinson has joined James Nickel in authoring and revising this entry.

Copyright © 2024 by
James Nickel <nickel@law.miami.edu>
Adam Etinson <ae45@st-andrews.ac.uk>

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