Aristotle’s Metaphysics

First published Sun Oct 8, 2000; substantive revision Sat Nov 21, 2020

The first major work in the history of philosophy to bear the title “Metaphysics” was the treatise by Aristotle that we have come to know by that name. But Aristotle himself did not use that title or even describe his field of study as ‘metaphysics’; the name was evidently coined by the first century C.E. editor who assembled the treatise we know as Aristotle’s Metaphysics out of various smaller selections of Aristotle’s works. The title ‘metaphysics’—literally, ‘after the Physics’—very likely indicated the place the topics discussed therein were intended to occupy in the philosophical curriculum. They were to be studied after the treatises dealing with nature (ta phusika). In this entry, we discuss the ideas that are developed in Aristotle’s treatise.

References in the text to the books of Aristotle’s Metaphysics are given by Greek letter. In order (with the corresponding Roman numeral given in parentheses) these are: Α (I), α (II), Β (III), Γ (IV), Δ (V), Ε (VI), Ζ (VII), Η (VIII), Θ (IX), I (X), Κ (XI), Λ (XII), Μ (XIII), Ν (XIV). Translations are taken from Reeve (2016).

1. The Subject Matter of Aristotle’s Metaphysics

Aristotle himself described his subject matter in a variety of ways: as ‘first philosophy’, or ‘the study of being qua being’, or ‘wisdom’, or ‘theology’. A comment on these descriptions will help to clarify Aristotle’s topic.

In Metaphysics Α.1, Aristotle says that “everyone takes what is called ‘wisdom’ (sophia) to be concerned with the primary causes (aitia) and the starting-points (or principles, archai)” (981b28), and it is these causes and principles that he proposes to study in this work. It is his customary practice to begin an inquiry by reviewing the opinions previously held by others, and that is what he does here, as Book Α continues with a history of the thought of his predecessors about causes and principles.

These causes and principles are clearly the subject matter of what he calls ‘first philosophy’. But this does not mean the branch of philosophy that should be studied first. Rather, it concerns issues that are in some sense the most fundamental or at the highest level of generality. Aristotle distinguished between things that are “better known to us” and things that are “better known in themselves,”[1] and maintained that we should begin our study of a given topic with things better known to us and arrive ultimately at an understanding of things better known in themselves. The principles studied by ‘first philosophy’ may seem very general and abstract, but they are, according to Aristotle, better known in themselves, however remote they may seem from the world of ordinary experience. Still, since they are to be studied only by one who has already studied nature (which is the subject matter of the Physics), they are quite appropriately described as coming “after the Physics.”

Aristotle’s description ‘the study of being qua being’ is frequently and easily misunderstood, for it seems to suggest that there is a single (albeit special) subject matter—being qua being—that is under investigation. But Aristotle’s description does not involve two things—(1) a study and (2) a subject matter (being qua being)—for he did not think that there is any such subject matter as ‘being qua being’. Rather, his description involves three things: (1) a study, (2) a subject matter (being), and (3) a manner in which the subject matter is studied (qua being).

Aristotle’s Greek word that has been Latinized as ‘qua’ means roughly ‘in so far as’ or ‘under the aspect’. A study of x qua y, then, is a study of x that concerns itself solely with the y aspect of x. So Aristotle’s study does not concern some recondite subject matter known as ‘being qua being’. Rather it is a study of being, or better, of beings—of things that can be said to be—that studies them in a particular way: as beings, in so far as they are beings.

Of course, first philosophy is not the only field of inquiry to study beings. Natural science and mathematics also study beings, but in different ways, under different aspects. The natural scientist studies them as things that are subject to the laws of nature, as things that move and undergo change. That is, the natural scientist studies things qua movable (i.e., in so far as they are subject to change). The mathematician studies things qua countable and measurable. The metaphysician, on the other hand, studies them in a more general and abstract way—qua beings. So first philosophy studies the causes and principles of beings qua beings. In Γ.2, Aristotle adds that for this reason it studies the causes and principles of substances (ousiai). We will explain this connection in Section 3 below.

In Book Ε, Aristotle adds another description to the study of the causes and principles of beings qua beings. Whereas natural science studies objects that are material and subject to change, and mathematics studies objects that although not subject to change are nevertheless not separate from (i.e., independent of) matter, there is still room for a science that studies things (if indeed there are any) that are eternal, not subject to change, and independent of matter. Such a science, he says, is theology, and this is the “first” and “highest” science. Aristotle’s identification of theology, so conceived, with the study of being qua being has proved challenging to his interpreters. We discuss this identification in Section 14 below.

Finally, we may note that in Book Β, Aristotle delineates his subject matter in a different way, by listing the problems or perplexities (aporiai) he hopes to deal with. Characteristic of these perplexities, he says, is that they tie our thinking up in knots. They include the following, among others: Are sensible substances the only ones that exist, or are there others besides them? Is it kinds or individuals that are the elements and principles of things? And if it is kinds, which ones: the most generic or the most specific? Is there a cause apart from matter? Is there anything apart from material compounds? Are the principles limited, either in number or in kind? Are the principles of perishable things themselves perishable? Are the principles universal or particular, and do they exist potentially or actually? Are mathematical objects (numbers, lines, figures, points) substances? If they are, are they separate from or do they always belong to sensible things? And (“the hardest and most perplexing of all,” Aristotle says) are unity and being the substance of things, or are they attributes of some other subject? In the remainder of Book Β, Aristotle presents arguments on both sides of each of these issues, and in subsequent books he takes up many of them again. But it is not always clear precisely how he resolves them, and it is possible that Aristotle did not think that the Metaphysics contains definitive solutions to all of these perplexities.

2. The Categories

To understand the problems and project of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, it is best to begin with one of his earlier works, the Categories. Although placed by long tradition among his logical works (see the discussion in the entry on Aristotle’s logic), due to its analysis of the terms that make up the propositions out of which deductive inferences are constructed, the Categories begins with a strikingly general and exhaustive account of the things there are (ta onta)—beings. According to this account, beings can be divided into ten distinct categories. (Although Aristotle never says so, it is tempting to suppose that these categories are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive of the things there are.) They include substance, quality, quantity, and relation, among others. Of these categories of beings, it is the first, substance (ousia), to which Aristotle gives a privileged position.

Substances are unique in being independent things; the items in the other categories all depend somehow on substances. That is, qualities are the qualities of substances; quantities are the amounts and sizes that substances come in; relations are the way substances stand to one another. These various non-substances all owe their existence to substances—each of them, as Aristotle puts it, exists only ‘in’ a subject. That is, each non-substance “is in something, not as a part, and cannot exist separately from what it is in” (Cat. 1a25). Indeed, it becomes clear that substances are the subjects that these ontologically dependent non-substances are ‘in’.

Each member of a non-substance category thus stands in this inherence relation (as it is frequently called) to some substance or other—color is always found in bodies, knowledge in the soul. Neither whiteness nor a piece of grammatical knowledge, for example, is capable of existing on its own. Each requires for its existence that there be some substance in which it inheres.

In addition to this fundamental inherence relation across categories, Aristotle also points out another fundamental relation that obtains between items within a single category. He describes this as the relation of “being said of a subject,” and his examples make clear that it is the relation of a more general to a less general thing within a single category. Thus, man is ‘said of’ a particular man, and animal is ‘said of’ man, and therefore, as Aristotle points out, animal is ‘said of’ the particular man also. The ‘said of’ relation, that is to say, is transitive (cf. 1b10). So the genus (e.g., animal) is ‘said of’ the species (e.g., man) and both genus and species are ‘said of’ the particular. The same holds in non-substance categories. In the category of quality, for example, the genus (color) is ‘said of’ the species (white) and both genus and species are ‘said of’ the particular white. There has been considerable scholarly dispute about these particulars in nonsubstance categories. For more detail, see the supplementary document:

Nonsubstantial Particulars

The language of this contrast (‘in’ a subject vs. ‘said of’ a subject) is peculiar to the Categories, but the idea seems to recur in other works as the distinction between accidental vs. essential predication. Similarly, in works other than the Categories, Aristotle uses the label ‘universals’ (ta katholou) for the things that are “said of many;” things that are not universal he calls ‘particulars’ (ta kath’ hekasta). Although he does not use these labels in the Categories, it is not misleading to say that the doctrine of the Categories is that each category contains a hierarchy of universals and particulars, with each universal being ‘said of’ the lower-level universals and particulars that fall beneath it. Each category thus has the structure of an upside-down tree.[2] At the top (or trunk) of the tree are the most generic items in that category[3] (e.g., in the case of the category of substance, the genus plant and the genus animal); branching below them are universals at the next highest level, and branching below these are found lower levels of universals, and so on, down to the lowest level universals (e.g., such infimae species as man and horse); at the lowest level—the leaves of the tree—are found the individual substances, e.g., this man, that horse, etc.

The individuals in the category of substance play a special role in this scheme. Aristotle calls them “primary substances” (prôtai ousiai) for without them, as he says, nothing else would exist. Indeed, Aristotle offers an argument (2a35–2b7) to establish the primary substances as the fundamental entities in this ontology. Everything that is not a primary substance, he points out, stands in one of the two relations (inhering ‘in’, or being ‘said of’) to primary substances. A genus, such as animal, is ‘said of’ the species below it and, since they are ‘said of’ primary substances, so is the genus (recall the transitivity of the ‘said of’ relation). Thus, everything in the category of substance that is not itself a primary substance is, ultimately, ‘said of’ primary substances. And if there were no primary substances, there would be no “secondary” substances (species and genera), either. For these secondary substances are just the ways in which the primary substances are fundamentally classified within the category of substance. As for the members of non-substance categories, they too depend for their existence on primary substances. A universal in a non-substance category, e.g., color, in the category of quality, is ‘in’ body, Aristotle tells us, and therefore in individual bodies. For color could not be ‘in’ body, in general, unless it were ‘in’ at least some particular bodies. Similarly, particulars in non-substance categories (although there is not general agreement among scholars about what such particulars might be) cannot exist on their own. E.g., a determinate shade of color, or a particular and non-shareable bit of that shade, is not capable of existing on its own—if it were not ‘in’ at least some primary substance, it would not exist. So primary substances are the basic entities—the basic “things that there are”—in the world of the Categories.

3. The Role of Substance in the Study of Being Qua Being

The Categories leads us to expect that the study of being in general (being qua being) will crucially involve the study of substance, and when we turn to the Metaphysics we are not disappointed. First, in Metaphysics Γ Aristotle argues in a new way for the ontological priority of substance; and then, in Books Ζ, Η, and Θ, he wrestles with the problem of what it is to be a substance. We will begin with Γ’s account of the central place of substance in the study of being qua being.

As we noted above, metaphysics (or, first philosophy) is the science which studies being qua being. In this respect it is unlike the specialized or departmental sciences, which study only part of being (only some of the things that exist) or study beings only in a specialized way (e.g., only in so far as they are changeable, rather than in so far as they are beings).

But ‘being’, as Aristotle tells us in Γ.2, is “said in many ways”. That is, the verb ‘to be’ (einai) has different senses, as do its cognates ‘being’ (on) and ‘entities’ (onta). So the universal science of being qua being appears to founder on an equivocation: how can there be a single science of being when the very term ‘being’ is ambiguous?

Consider an analogy. There are dining tables, and there are tide tables. A dining table is a table in the sense of a smooth flat slab fixed on legs; a tide table is a table in the sense of a systematic arrangement of data in rows and columns. But there is not a single sense of ‘table’ which applies to both the piece of furniture at which I am writing these words and to the small booklet that lies upon it. Hence it would be foolish to expect that there is a single science of tables, in general, that would include among its objects both dining tables and tide tables. Tables, that is to say, do not constitute a single kind with a single definition, so no single science, or field of knowledge, can encompass precisely those things that are correctly called ‘tables’.

If the term ‘being’ were ambiguous in the way that ‘table’ is, Aristotle’s science of being qua being would be as impossible as a science of tables qua tables. But, Aristotle argues in Γ.2, ‘being’ is not ambiguous in this way. ‘Being’, he tells us, is ‘said in many ways’ but it is not merely (what he calls) ‘homonymous’, i.e., sheerly ambiguous. Rather, the various senses of ‘being’ have what he calls a ‘pros hen’ ambiguity—they are all related to a single central sense. (The Greek phrase ‘pros hen’ means “in relation to one.”)

Aristotle explains his point by means of some examples that he takes to be analogous to ‘being’. Consider the terms ‘healthy’ and ‘medical’. Neither of these has a single definition that applies uniformly to all cases: not every healthy (or medical) thing is healthy (medical) in the same sense of ‘healthy’ (‘medical’). There is a range of things that can be called ‘healthy’: people, diets, exercise, complexions, etc. Not all of these are healthy in the same sense. Exercise is healthy in the sense of being productive of health; a clear complexion is healthy in the sense of being symptomatic of health; a person is healthy in the sense of having good health.

But notice that these various senses have something in common: a reference to one central thing, health, which is actually possessed by only some of the things that are spoken of as ‘healthy’, namely, healthy organisms, and these are said to be healthy in the primary sense of the term. Other things are considered healthy only in so far as they are appropriately related to things that are healthy in this primary sense.

The situation is the same, Aristotle claims, with the term ‘being’. It, too, has a primary sense as well as related senses in which it applies to other things because they are appropriately related to things that are called ‘beings’ in the primary sense. The beings in the primary sense are substances; the beings in other senses are the qualities, quantities, etc., that belong to substances. An animal, e.g., a horse, is a being, and so is a color, e.g, white, a being. But a horse is a being in the primary sense—it is a substance—whereas the color white (a quality) is a being only because it qualifies some substance. An account of the being of anything that is, therefore, will ultimately have to make some reference to substance. Hence, the science of being qua being will involve an account of the central case of beings—substances.

4. The Fundamental Principles: Axioms

Before embarking on this study of substance, however, Aristotle goes on in Book Γ to argue that first philosophy, the most general of the sciences, must also address the most fundamental principles—the common axioms—that are used in all reasoning. Thus, first philosophy must also concern itself with the principle of non-contradiction (PNC): the principle that “the same thing cannot at the same time belong and also not belong to the same thing and in the same respect” (1005b19). This, Aristotle says, is the most certain of all principles, and it is not just a hypothesis. It cannot, however, be proved, since it is employed, implicitly, in all proofs, no matter what the subject matter. It is a first principle, and hence is not derived from anything more basic.

What, then, can the science of first philosophy say about the PNC? It cannot offer a proof of the PNC, since the PNC is presupposed by any proof one might offer—any purported proof of the PNC would therefore be circular. Aristotle thus does not attempt to prove the PNC; in the subsequent chapters of Γ he argues, instead, that it is impossible to disbelieve the PNC. Those who would claim to deny the PNC cannot, if they have any beliefs at all, believe that it is false. For one who has a belief must, if he is to express this belief to himself or to others, say something—he must make an assertion. He must, as Aristotle says, signify something. But the very act of signifying something is possible only if the PNC is accepted. Without accepting the PNC, one would have no reason to think that his words have any signification at all—they could not mean one thing rather than another. So anyone who makes any assertion has already committed himself to the PNC. Aristotle thus does not argue that the PNC is a necessary truth (that is, he does not try to prove the PNC); rather, he argues that the PNC is indubitable. (For more on the PNC, see the discussion in the entry on Aristotle’s logic)

5. What is Substance?

In the seventeen chapters that make up Book Ζ of the Metaphysics, Aristotle takes up the promised study of substance. He begins by reiterating and refining some of what he said in Γ: that ‘being’ is said in many ways, and that the primary sense of ‘being’ is the sense in which substances are beings. Here, however, he explicitly links the secondary senses of ‘being’ to the non-substance categories. The primacy of substance leads Aristotle to say that the age-old question ‘What is being?’ “is just the question ‘What is substance?’” (1028b4).

One might have thought that this question had already been answered in the Categories. There we were given, as examples of primary substances, an individual man or horse, and we learned that a primary substance is “what is neither in a subject nor said of a subject” (2a10). This would seem to provide us with both examples of, and criteria for being, primary substances. But in Metaphysics Ζ, Aristotle does not seem to take either the examples or the criteria for granted.

In Ζ.2 he recounts the various answers that have been given to the question of which things are substances—bodies (including plants, animals, the parts of plants and animals, the elements, the heavenly bodies), things more basic than bodies (surfaces, lines, and points), imperceptible things (such as Platonic Forms and mathematical objects)—and seems to regard them all as viable candidates at this point. He does not seem to doubt that the clearest examples of substances are perceptible ones, but leaves open the question whether there are others as well.

Before answering this question about examples, however, he says that we must first answer the question about criteria: what is it to be a substance (tên ousian prôton ti estin)? The negative criterion (“neither in a subject nor said of a subject”) of the Categories tells us only which things are substances. But even if we know that something is a substance, we must still say what makes it a substance—what the cause is of its being a substance. This is the question to which Aristotle next turns. To answer it is to identify, as Aristotle puts it, the substance of that thing.

6. Substance, Matter, and Subject

Ζ.3 begins with a list of four possible candidates for being the substance of something: essence, universal, genus, and subject. Presumably, this means that if x is a substance, then the substance of x might be either (i) the essence of x, or (ii) some universal predicated of x, or (iii) a genus that x belongs to, or (iv) a subject of which x is predicated. The first three candidates are taken up in later chapters, and Ζ.3 is devoted to an examination of the fourth candidate: the idea that the substance of something is a subject of which it is predicated.

A subject, Aristotle tells us, is “that of which the other things are said, but which is itself not further said of any other thing” (1028b36). This characterization of a subject is reminiscent of the language of the Categories, which tells us that a primary substance is not predicated of anything else, whereas other things are predicated of it. Candidate (iv) thus seems to reiterate the Categories criterion for being a substance. But there are two reasons to be wary of drawing this conclusion. First, whereas the subject criterion of the Categories told us that substances were the ultimate subjects of predication, the subject criterion envisaged here is supposed to tell us what the substance of something is. So what it would tell us is that if x is a substance, then the substance of x—that which makes x a substance—is a subject that x is predicated of. Second, as his next comment makes clear, Aristotle has in mind something other than this Categories idea. For the subject that he here envisages, he says, is either matter or form or the compound of matter and form. These are concepts from Aristotle’s Physics, and none of them figured in the ontology of the Categories. To appreciate the issues Aristotle is raising here, we must briefly compare his treatment of the notion of a subject in the Physics with that in the Categories.

In the Categories, Aristotle was concerned with subjects of predication: what are the things we talk about, and ascribe properties to? In the Physics, his concern is with subjects of change: what is it that bears (at different times) contrary predicates and persists through a process of change? But there is an obvious connection between these conceptions of a subject, since a subject of change must have one predicate belonging to it at one time that does not belong to it at another time. Subjects of change, that is, are also subjects of predication. (The converse is not true: numbers are subjects of predication—six is even, seven is prime—but not of change.)

In the Categories, individual substances (a man, a horse) were treated as fundamental subjects of predication. They were also understood, indirectly, as subjects of change. (“A substance, one and the same in number, can receive contraries. An individual man, for example, being one and the same, becomes now pale and now dark, now hot and now cold, now bad and now good” 4a17–20.) These are changes in which substances move, or alter, or grow. What the Categories did not explore, however, are changes in which substances are generated or destroyed. But the theory of change Aristotle develops in the Physics requires some other subject for changes such as these—a subject of which substance is predicated—and it identifies matter as the fundamental subject of change (192a31–32). Change is seen in the Physics as a process in which matter either takes on or loses form.

The concepts of matter and form, as we noted, are absent from the Categories. Individual substances—this man or that horse—apart from their accidental characteristics—the qualities, etc., that inhere in them—are viewed in that work as essentially simple, unanalyzable atoms. Although there is metaphysical structure to the fact that, e.g., this horse is white (a certain quality inheres in a certain substance), the fact that this is a horse is a kind of brute fact, devoid of metaphysical structure. This horse is a primary substance, and horse, the species to which it belongs, is a secondary substance. But there is no predicative complex corresponding to the fact that this is a horse in the way that there is such a complex corresponding to the fact that this horse is white.

But from the point of view of the Physics, substantial individuals are seen as predicative complexes (cf. Matthen 1987b); they are hylomorphic compounds—compounds of matter and form—and the subject criterion looks rather different from the hylomorphic perspective. Metaphysics Ζ.3 examines the subject criterion from this perspective.

Matter, form, and the compound of matter and form may all be considered subjects, Aristotle tells us, (1029a2–4), but which of them is substance? The subject criterion by itself leads to the answer that the substance of x is an entirely indeterminate matter of which x is composed (1029a10). For form is predicated of matter as subject, and one can always analyze a hylomorphic compound into its predicates and the subject of which they are predicated. And when all predicates have been removed (in thought), the subject that remains is nothing at all in its own right—an entity all of whose properties are accidental to it (1029a12–27). The resulting subject is matter from which all form has been expunged. (Traditional scholarship calls this “prime matter,” but Aristotle does not here indicate whether he thinks there actually is such a thing.) So the subject criterion leads to the answer that the substance of x is the formless matter of which it is ultimately composed.

But Aristotle rejects this answer as impossible (1029a28), claiming that substance must be “separable” (chôriston) and “this something” (tode ti, sometimes translated “some this”), and implying that matter fails to meet this requirement. Precisely what the requirement amounts to is a matter of considerable scholarly debate, however. A plausible interpretation runs as follows. Separability has to do with being able to exist independently (x is separable from y if x is capable of existing independently of y), and being a this something means being a determinate individual. So a substance must be a determinate individual that is capable of existing on its own. (One might even hold, although this is controversial, that on Aristotle’s account not every “this something” is also “separable.” A particular color or shape might be considered a determinate individual that is not capable of existing on its own—it is always the color of shape of some substance or other.) But matter fails to be simultaneously both chôriston and tode ti. The matter of which a substance is composed may exist independently of that substance (think of the wood of which a desk is composed, which existed before the desk was made and may survive the disassembly of the desk), but it is not as such any definite individual—it is just a quantity of a certain kind of matter. Of course, the matter may be construed as constituting a definite individual substance (the wood just is, one might say, the particular desk it composes), but it is in that sense not separable from the form or shape that makes it that substance (the wood cannot be that particular desk unless it is a desk). So although matter is in a sense separable and in a sense a this something, it cannot be both separable and a this something. It thus does not qualify as the substance of the thing whose matter it is.

7. Substance and Essence

Aristotle turns in Ζ.4 to a consideration of the next candidate for substance: essence. (‘Essence’ is the standard English translation of Aristotle’s curious phrase to ti ên einai, literally “the what it was to be” for a thing. This phrase so boggled his Roman translators that they coined the word essentia to render the entire phrase, and it is from this Latin word that ours derives. Aristotle also sometimes uses the shorter phrase to ti esti, literally “the what it is,” for approximately the same idea.) In his logical works, Aristotle links the notion of essence to that of definition (horismos)—“a definition is an account (logos) that signifies an essence” (Topics 102a3)—and he links both of these notions to a certain kind of per se predication (kath’ hauto, literally, “in respect of itself,” or “intrinsically“)—”what belongs to a thing in respect of itself belongs to it in its essence (en tôi ti esti)” for we refer to it “in the account that states the essence” (Posterior Analytics, 73a34–5). He reiterates these ideas in Ζ.4: “there will be an essence only of those things whose logos is a definition” (1030a6), “the essence of each thing is what it is said to be intrinsically” (1029b14). It is important to remember that for Aristotle, one defines things, not words. The definition of tiger does not tell us the meaning of the word ‘tiger’; it tells us what it is to be a tiger, what a tiger is said to be intrinsically. Thus, the definition of tiger states the essence—the “what it is to be” of a tiger, what is predicated of the tiger per se.

Aristotle’s preliminary answer (Ζ.4) to the question “What is substance?” is that substance is essence, but there are important qualifications. For, as he points out, “definition (horismos), like ‘what-it-is’ (ti esti), is said in many ways too” (1030a19). That is, items in all the categories are definable, so items in all the categories have essences—just as there is an essence of man, there is also an essence of white and an essence of musical. But, because of the pros hen equivocity of ‘is’, such essences are secondary—“in the primary (protôs) and unconditional way (haplôs) definition and the essence belong to substances” (1030b4–6). Thus, Ζ.4 tells us, it is only these primary essences that are substances. Aristotle does not here work out the details of this “hierarchy of essences” (Loux, 1991), but it is possible to reconstruct a theory of such a hierarchy on the basis of subsequent developments in Book Ζ.

In Ζ.6, Aristotle goes on to argue that if something is “primary” and “spoken of in respect of itself (kath’ hauto legomenon)” it is one and the same as its essence. The precise meaning of this claim, as well as the nature and validity of the arguments offered in support of it, are matters of scholarly controversy. But it does seem safe to say that Aristotle thinks that an “accidental unity” such as a pale man is not a kath’ hauto legomenon (since pallor is an accidental characteristic of a man) and so is not the same as its essence. Pale man, that is to say, does not specify the “what it is” of any primary being, and so cannot be an essence of the primary kind. As Ζ.4 has already told us, essence, in the primary sense, “will belong to things that are species of a genus and to nothing else” (1030a11–12). Man is a species, and so there is an essence of man; but pale man is not a species and so, even if there is such a thing as the essence of pale man, it is not, at any rate, a primary essence.

At this point there appears to be a close connection between the essence of a substance and its species (eidos), and this might tempt one to suppose that Aristotle is identifying the substance of a thing (since the substance of a thing is its essence) with its species. (A consequence of this idea would be that Aristotle is radically altering his conception of the importance of the species, which in the Categories he called a secondary substance, that is, a substance only in a secondary sense.) But such an identification would be a mistake, for two reasons. First, Aristotle’s point at 1030a11 is not that a species is an essence, but that an essence of the primary kind corresponds to a species (e.g., man) and not to some more narrowly delineated kind (e.g., pale man). Second, the word ‘eidos’, which meant ‘species’ in the logical works, has acquired a new meaning in a hylomorphic context, where it means ‘form’ (contrasted with ‘matter’) rather than ‘species’ (contrasted with ‘genus’). In the conceptual framework of Metaphysics Ζ, a universal such as man or horse—which was called a species and a secondary substance in the Categories—is construed as “not substance but rather a compound of a sort, [consisting] of this account and this matter taken universally” (Ζ.10, 1035b29–30). The eidos that is primary substance in Book Ζ is not the species that an individual substance belongs to but the form that is predicated of the matter of which it is composed.[4]

8. Substances as Hylomorphic Compounds

The role of form in this hylomorphic context is the topic of Ζ.7–9. (Although these chapters were almost certainly not originally included in Book Ζ—there is no reference to them, for example, in the summary of Ζ given in Η.1, which skips directly from Ζ.6 to Ζ.10—they provide a link between substance and form and thus fill what would otherwise be a gap in the argument.) Since individual substances are seen as hylomorphic compounds, the role of matter and form in their generation must be accounted for. Whether we are thinking of natural objects, such as plants and animals, or artifacts, such as houses, the requirements for generation are the same. We do not produce the matter (to suppose that we do leads to an infinite regress) nor do we produce the form (what could we make it out of?); rather, we put the form into the matter, and produce the compound (Ζ.8, 1033a30–b9). Both the matter and the form must pre-exist (Ζ.9, 1034b12). But the source of motion in both cases—what Aristotle calls the “moving cause” of the coming to be—is the form.

In production that results from craft (or art, technê), “the form is in the soul ” (1032b23) of the craftsman. For example, “the craft [of building] is the form [of the house]” (1034a24) and the craft, i.e., the form, is in the understanding, and hence in the soul, of the builder. The builder has in mind the plan or design for a house and he knows how to build; he then “enmatters” that plan or design by putting it into the materials out of which he builds the house. In natural production, the form is found in the parent, where “the begetter is of this same sort as the begotten (not that they are the same thing, certainly, nor one in number, but one in form)—for example, in the case of natural things. For human begets human” (1033b29–31). But in either case, the form pre-exists and is not produced (1033b18).

As for what is produced in such hylomorphic productions, it is correctly described by the name of its form, not by that of its matter. What is produced is a house or a man, not bricks or flesh. Of course, what is made of gold may still be described in terms of its material components, but we should call it not “gold” but “golden” (1033a7). For if gold is the matter out of which a statue is made, there was gold present at the start, and so it was not gold that came into being. It was a statue that came into being, and although the statue is golden—i.e., made of gold—it cannot be identified with the gold of which it was made.

The essence of such a hylomorphic compound is evidently its form, not its matter. As Aristotle says “by form I mean the essence of each thing and the primary substance” (1032b1), and “by the substance without matter I mean the essence” (1032b14). It is the form of a substance that makes it the kind of thing that it is, and hence it is form that satisfies the condition initially required for being the substance of something. The substance of a thing is its form.

9. Substance and Definition

In Ζ.10 and 11, Aristotle returns to the consideration of essence and definition left off in Ζ.6, but now within the hylomorphic context developed in Ζ.7–9. The main question these chapters consider is whether the definition of x ever includes a reference to the matter of x. If some definitions include a reference to matter, then the link between essence and form would seem to be weakened.

Aristotle begins Ζ.10 by endorsing the following principle about definitions and their parts: “a definition is an account, and every account has parts, and as the account is to the thing, so the part of the account is to the part of the thing” (1034b20–22). That is, if y is a part of a definable thing x, then the definition of x will include as a part something z that corresponds to y. Indeed, z must stand to y in the same relation that the definition of x stands in to x; that is, z is the definition of y. So, according to this principle, the definition of a thing will include the definitions of its parts.

In a way, this consequence of the principle seems very plausible, given Aristotle’s idea that it is universals that are definable (Ζ.11, 1036a29). Consider as a definiendum a universal, such as man, and its definiens, rational animal. The parts of this definiens are the universals rational and animal. If these parts are, in turn, definable, then each should be replaced, in the definition of man, with its own definition, and so on. In this way the complete and adequate definition of a universal such as man will contain no parts that are further definable. All proper, or completely analyzed, definitions are ultimately composed of simple terms that are not further definable.

But the implication of this idea for the definitions of hylomorphic compounds is obvious: since matter appears to be a part of such a compound, the definition of the compound will include, as a part, the definitions of its material components. And this consequence seems implausible to Aristotle. A circle, for example, seems to be composed of two semicircles (for it obviously may be divided into two semicircles), but the definition of circle cannot be composed of the definitions of its two semicircular parts. For, as Aristotle points out (1035b9), semicircle is defined in terms of circle, and not the other way around. His point is well taken, for if circles were defined in terms of semicircles, then presumably semicircles would be defined in terms of the quarter-circles of which they are composed, and so on, ad infinitum. The resulting infinite regress would make it impossible to define circle at all, for one would never reach the ultimate “simple” parts of which such a definition would be composed.

Aristotle flirts with the idea of distinguishing between different senses in which one thing can be a part of another (1034b33), but instead proposes a different solution: to specify carefully the whole of which the matter is allegedly a part. “And of the compound statue the bronze is a part, but of what is said to be a statue as form it is not a part” (1035a6). Similarly, “even if the line, when divided, passes away into the halves, or the human into the bones, sinews, and flesh, it is not the case that because of this they are composed of these as being parts of the substance” (1035a17–20). Rather, “what is divided into these as into matter is not the substance but the compound” (1035b20–1).

In restating his point “yet more perspicuously” (1035b4), Aristotle notes parenthetically another important aspect of his theory of substance. He reiterates the priority of form, and its parts, to the matter into which a compound is divided, and notes that “the soul of animals (for this is substance of the animate) is the substance that is in accord with the account and is the form and the essence” (1035b14–5). The idea recurs in Ζ.11, where he announces that “it is clear too that the soul is primary substance, whereas the body is matter” (1037a5). It is further developed, in the Metaphysics, in Ζ.17, as we will see below, and especially in De Anima. For more detail on this topic, see Section 3 of the entry on Aristotle’s psychology.

Returning now to the problem raised by the apparent need to refer to matter in the definition of a substance, we may note that the solution Aristotle offered in Ζ.10 is only partially successful. His point seems to be that whereas bronze may be a part of a particular statue, neither that particular batch of bronze nor even bronze in general enters into the essence of statue, since being made of bronze is no part of what it is to be a statue. But that is only because statues, although they must be made of some kind of matter, do not require any particular kind of matter. But what about kinds of substances that do require particular kinds of matter? Aristotle’s distinction between form and compound cannot be used in such cases to isolate essence from matter. Thus there may after all be reasons for thinking that reference to matter will have to intrude into at least some definitions.

In Ζ.11, Aristotle addresses just such a case (although the passage is difficult and there is disagreement over its interpretation). “The form of the human is always found in flesh and bones and parts of this sort,” Aristotle writes (1036b4). The point is not just that each particular man must be made of matter, but that each one must be made of matter of a particular kind—flesh and bones, etc. “Some things,” he continues, “presumably are this in this” (1036b23), i.e., a particular form in a particular kind of matter, so that it is not possible to define them without reference to their material parts (1036b28). Nevertheless, Aristotle ends Ζ.11 as if he has defended the claim that definition is of the form alone. Perhaps his point is that whenever it is essential to a substance that it be made of a certain kind of matter (e.g., that man be made of flesh and bones, and that one “could not make a saw of wool or wood,” Η.4, 1044a28) this is in some sense a formal or structural requirement. A kind of matter, after all, can itself be analyzed hylomorphically—bronze, for example, is a mixture of copper and tin according to a certain ratio or formula (logos), which is in turn predicated of some more generic underlying subject. The reference to matter in a definition will thus always be to a certain kind of matter, and hence to a predicate, rather than a subject. At any rate, if by ‘matter’ one has in mind the ultimate subject alluded to in Ζ.3 (so-called ‘prime matter’), there will be no reference to it in any definition, “for it is indefinite” (1037a27).

Ζ.12 introduces a new problem about definitions—the so-called “unity of definition.” The problem is this: definitions are complex (a definiens is always some combination of terms), so what accounts for the definiendum being one thing, rather than many (1037b10)? Suppose that man is defined as two-footed animal; “why, then, is this one and not many—animal and two-footed?” (1037b13–14). Presumably, Aristotle has in mind his discussion in Ζ.4 of such “accidental unities” as a pale man. The difference cannot be that our language contains a single word (‘man’) for a two-footed animal, but no single word for a pale man, for Aristotle has already conceded (1029b28) that we might very well have had a single term (he suggests himation, literally ‘cloak’) for a pale man, but that would still not make the formula ‘pale man’ a definition nor pale man an essence (1030a2).

Aristotle proposes a solution that applies to definitions reached by the “method of division.” According to this method (see Aristotle’s logic), one begins with the broadest genus containing the species to be defined, and divides the genus into two sub-genera by means of some differentia. One then locates the definiendum in one of the sub-genera, and proceeds to divide this by another differentia, and so on, until one arrives at the definiendum species. This is a classic definition by genus and differentia. Aristotle’s proposal is that “the division should take the differentia of the differentia” (1038a9). For example, if one uses the differentia footed to divide the genus animal, one then uses a differentia such as cloven-footed for the next division. If one divides in this way, Aristotle claims, “it is evident that the ultimate (or completing, teleutaia) differentia will be the substance of the thing and its definition” (1038a19). For each “differentia of a differentia” entails its predecessor (being cloven-footed entails being footed), and so the long chain of differentiae can be replaced simply by the ultimate differentia, since it entails all of its predecessors. As Aristotle points out, it would be redundant to include any of the differentiae in the chain other than the ultimate one: “when we say footed two-footed animal … we shall be saying the same thing several times over” (1038a22–24).

This proposal shows how a long string of differentiae in a definition can be reduced to one, but it does not solve the problem of the unity of definition. For we are still faced with the apparent fact that genus + differentia constitutes a plurality even if the differentia is the ultimate, or “completing,” one. It is not surprising, then, that Aristotle returns to the problem of unity later (Η.6) and offers a different solution.

10. Substances and Universals

At this point, we seem to have a clear idea about the nature of substantial form as Aristotle conceives of it. A substantial form is the essence of a substance, and it corresponds to a species. Since it is an essence, a substantial form is what is denoted by the definiens of a definition. Since only universals are definable, substantial forms are universals. That substantial forms are universals is confirmed by Aristotle’s comment, at the end of Ζ.8, that “Socrates and Callias … are distinct because of their matter … but the same in form” (1034a6–8). For them to be the same in form is for them to have the same form, i.e., for one and the same substantial form to be predicated of two different clumps of matter. And being “predicated of many” is what makes something a universal (De Interpretatione 17a37).

But Ζ.13 throws our entire understanding into disarray. Aristotle begins by returning to the candidates for the title of ousia introduced in Ζ.3, and points out that having now discussed the claims of the subject and the essence, it is time to consider the third candidate, the universal. But the remainder of the chapter consists of a barrage of arguments to the conclusion that universals are not substances.

Ζ.13 therefore produces a fundamental tension in Aristotle’s metaphysics that has fragmented his interpreters. Some maintain that Aristotle’s theory is ultimately inconsistent, on the grounds that it is committed to all three of the following propositions:

(i) Substance is form.
(ii) Form is universal.
(iii) No universal is a substance.

Others have provided interpretations according to which Aristotle does not maintain all of (i)–(iii), and there is a considerable variety of such interpretations, too many to be canvassed here. But there are two main, and opposed, lines of interpretation. According to one, Aristotle’s substantial forms are not universals after all, but each belongs exclusively to the particular whose form it is, and there are therefore as many substantial forms of a given kind as there are particulars of that kind. According to the other, Aristotle’s arguments in Ζ.13 are not intended to show that no universal is a substance, tout court, but some weaker thesis that is compatible with there being only one substantial form for all of the particulars belonging to the same species. Proponents of particular forms (or essences) include Sellars 1957, Harter 1975, Hartman 1977, Irwin 1988, and Witt 1989b. Opponents include Woods 1967, Owen 1978, Code 1986, Loux 1991, and Lewis 1991.

It would be foolish to attempt to resolve this issue within the confines of the present entry, as it is perhaps the largest, and most disputed, single interpretative issue concerning Aristotle’s Metaphysics. we will, instead, mention some of the main considerations brought up on each side of this dispute, and give our reasons for thinking that substantial forms are universals.

The idea that substantial forms are particulars is supported by Aristotle’s claims that a substance is “separable and this something ” (chôriston kai tode ti, Ζ.3), that there are no universals apart from their particulars (Ζ.13), and that universals are not substances (Ζ.13). On the other side, the idea that substantial forms are universals is supported by Aristotle’s claims that substances are, par excellence, the definable entities (Ζ.4), that definition is of the universal (Ζ.11), and that it is impossible to define particulars (Ζ.15).

In our opinion, the indefinability of particulars makes it impossible for substantial forms to be particulars. If there were a substantial form that is unique to some sensible particular, say Callias, then the definition corresponding to that form, or essence, would apply uniquely to Callias—it would define him, which is precisely what Aristotle says cannot be done. The question, then, is whether the evidence against substantial forms being universals can be countered. This is less clear, but the following considerations are relevant. (1) Aristotle’s claim that a substantial form is an individual (tode ti) does not exclude its being a universal (katholou). Universals are contrasted with particulars (kath’ hekasta), not individuals (although Aristotle does sometimes ignore the distinction between tode ti and kath’ hekaston). What makes something a tode ti is its being a fully determinate thing, not further differentiable; what makes something a kath’ hekaston is its being a particular thing, unrepeatable, and not predicated of anything else. There is thus the possibility of a universal tode ti—a fully determinate universal not further divisible into lower-level universals, but predicated of numerous particulars. (2) The claim that there are no universals apart from particulars needs to be understood in context. When Aristotle asserts (1038b33) that “there is not some animal … beyond the particular ones (ta tina)” he is just as likely to be referring to the particular kinds of animals as he is to particular specimens. If so, his point may be that a generic kind, such as animal, is ontologically dependent on its species, and hence on the substantial forms that are the essences of those species. (3) The arguments of Ζ.13 against the substantiality of universals are presented as part of a give-and-take investigation of the perplexities involved in the notion of substantial form. It is not clear, therefore, whether the blanket claim “No universal is a substance” is intended to be accepted without qualification. Indeed, a closer examination of the arguments may show that qualifications are required if the arguments are to be cogent. For example, the argument at 1038b11–15 is based on the premise that the substance of x is peculiar (idion) to x. It then draws the conclusion that a universal cannot be the substance of all of its instances (for it could not be idion to all of them), and concludes that it must be the substance “of none.” But note that this conclusion does not say that no universal can be a substance, but only that no universal can be the substance of any of its instances (cf. Code 1978). Aristotle’s point may be that since form is predicated of matter, a substantial form is predicated of various clumps of matter. But it is not the substance of those clumps of matter, for it is predicated accidentally of them. The thing with which it is uniquely correlated, and of which it is the substance, is not one of its instances, but is the substantial form itself. This conclusion should not be surprising in light of Aristotle’s claim in Ζ.6 that “each substance is one and the same as its essence.” A universal substantial form just is that essence.

11. Substance as Cause of Being

In Ζ.17 Aristotle proposes a new point of departure in his effort to say what sort of a thing substance is. The new idea is that a substance is a “starting-point and cause” (archê kai aitia, 1041a9) of being. Before looking at the details of his account, we will need to make a brief detour into Aristotle’s theory of causes. The relevant texts are Physics II.3, Posterior Analytics II.11, and Metaphysics Α.3 and Δ.2. See also the entry on Aristotle’s natural philosophy and Section 2 of the entry on Aristotle’s psychology.

The word aitia (“cause” or, perhaps better, “explanation”), Aristotle tells us, is “said in many ways.” In one sense, a cause is “that out of which a thing comes to be, and which persists; e.g., bronze, silver, and the genus of these are causes of a statue or a bowl” (Physics 194b24). A cause in this sense has been traditionally called a material cause, although Aristotle himself did not use this label. In a second sense, a cause is “the form … the account of the essence” (194b27), traditionally called the formal cause. A third sense, traditionally called the efficient cause, is “the primary source of change or rest” (194b30). In this sense, Aristotle says, an adviser is the cause of an action, a father is the cause of his child, and in general the producer is the cause of the product. Fourth is what is traditionally called the final cause, which Aristotle characterizes as “the end (telos), that for which a thing is done” (194b33). In this sense, he says, health is the cause of walking, since we might explain a person’s walking by saying that he walks in order to be healthy—health is what the walking is for. Note that, as in this case, “things may be causes of one another—hard work of fitness, and fitness of hard work—although not in the same sense: fitness is what hard work is for, whereas hard work is principle of motion” (195a10). So hard work is the efficient cause of fitness, since one becomes fit by means of hard work, while fitness is the final cause of hard work, since one works hard in order to become fit.

Although Aristotle is careful to distinguish four different kinds of cause (or four different senses of ‘cause’), it is important to note that he claims that one and the same thing can be a cause in more than one sense. As he puts it, “form, mover, and telos often coincide” (198a25). And in De Anima he is perfectly explicit that the soul, which is the form or essence of a living thing, “is a cause in three of the ways we have distinguished” (415b10)—efficient, formal, and final.

Let us return to Aristotle’s discussion in Ζ.17. The job of a cause or principle of being, he notes, is to explain why one thing belongs to another (1041a11); that is, it is to explain some predicational fact. What needs to be explained, for example, is why this is a man, or that is a house. But what kind of a question is this? The only thing that can be a man is a man; the only thing that can be a house is a house. So we would appear to be asking why a man is a man, or why a house is a house, and these seem to be foolish questions that all have the same answer: because each thing is itself (1041a17–20). The questions must therefore be rephrased by taking advantage of the possibility of a hylomorphic analysis. We must ask, e.g., “why are these—for example, brick and stones—a house?” (1041a26). The answer Aristotle proposes is that the cause of being of a substance (e.g., of a house) is the form or essence that is predicated of the matter (e.g., of the bricks and stones) that constitute that substance. The essence is not always just a formal cause; in some cases, Aristotle says, it is also a final cause (he gives the examples of a house and a bed), and in some cases an efficient cause (1041a29–30). But in any case “what is being looked for is the cause in virtue of which the matter is something—and this is the substance” (1041b6–9) and “the primary cause of its being” (1041b27).

Notice that the explanandum in these cases (“why is this a man?” or “why is that a house?”) involves a species predication (“Callias is a man,” “Fallingwater is a house”). But the answer Aristotle proposes invokes a hylomorphic analysis of these questions, in which form is predicated of matter. So Callias is a man because the form or essence of man is present in the flesh and bones that constitute the body of Callias; Fallingwater is a house because the form of house is present in the materials of which Fallingwater is made. In general, a species predication is explained in terms of an underlying form predication, whose subject is not the particular compound but its matter. Form predications are thus more basic than their corresponding species predications. A substantial form, as a primary definable, is its own substance, for it is essentially predicated of itself alone. But the substantial form of a material compound, because it is predicated (accidentally) of the matter of the compound, is the cause of the compound’s being the kind of thing that it is. The form is therefore, in a derivative way, the substance of the compound, as well.

12. Actuality and Potentiality

In Metaphysics Ζ, Aristotle introduces the distinction between matter and form synchronically, applying it to an individual substance at a particular time. The matter of a substance is the stuff it is composed of; the form is the way that stuff is put together so that the whole it constitutes can perform its characteristic functions. But soon he begins to apply the distinction diachronically, across time. This connects the matter/form distinction to another key Aristotelian distinction, that between potentiality (dunamis) and actuality (entelecheia) or activity (energeia). This distinction is the main topic of Book Θ.

Aristotle distinguishes between two different senses of the term dunamis. In the strictest sense, a dunamis is the power that a thing has to produce a change. A thing has a dunamis in this sense when it has within it “a starting-point of change in another thing or in itself insofar as it is other” (Θ.1, 1046a12; cf. Δ.12). The exercise of such a power is a kinêsis—a movement or process. So, for example, the housebuilder’s craft is a power whose exercise is the process of housebuilding. But there is a second sense of dunamis—and it is the one in which Aristotle is mainly interested—that might be better translated as ‘potentiality’. For, as Aristotle tells us, in this sense dunamis is related not to movement (kinêsis) but to activity (energeia)(Θ.6, 1048a25). A dunamis in this sense is not a thing’s power to produce a change but rather its capacity to be in a different and more completed state. Aristotle thinks that potentiality so understood is indefinable (1048a37), claiming that the general idea can be grasped from a consideration of cases. Activity is to potentiality, Aristotle tells us, as “what is awake is in relation to what is asleep, and what is seeing is in relation to what has its eyes closed but has sight, and what has been shaped out of the matter is in relation to the matter” (1048b1–3).

This last illustration is particularly illuminating. Consider, for example, a piece of wood, which can be carved or shaped into a table or into a bowl. In Aristotle’s terminology, the wood has (at least) two different potentialities, since it is potentially a table and also potentially a bowl. The matter (in this case, wood) is linked with potentialty; the substance (in this case, the table or the bowl) is linked with actuality. The as yet uncarved wood is only potentially a table, and so it might seem that once it is carved the wood is actually a table. Perhaps this is what Aristotle means, but it is possible that he does not wish to consider the wood to be a table. His idea might be that not only can a piece of raw wood in the carpenter’s workshop be considered a potential table (since it can be transformed into one), but the wood composing the completed table is also, in a sense, a potential table. The idea here is that it is not the wood qua wood that is actually a table, but the wood qua table. Considered as matter, it remains only potentially the thing that it is the matter of. (A contemporary philosopher might make this point by refusing to identify the wood with the table, saying instead that the wood only constitutes the table and is not identical to the table it constitutes.)

Since Aristotle gives form priority over matter, we would expect him similarly to give actuality priority over potentiality. And that is exactly what we find (Θ.8, 1049b4–5). Aristotle distinguishes between priority in logos (account or definition), in time, and in substance. (1) Actuality is prior in logos since we must cite the actuality when we give an account of its corresponding potentiality. Thus, ‘visible’ means ‘capable of being seen’; ‘buildable’ means ‘capable of being built’(1049b14–16). (2) As regards temporal priority, by contrast, potentiality may well seem to be prior to actuality, since the wood precedes the table that is built from it, and the acorn precedes the oak that it grows into. Nevertheless, Aristotle finds that even temporally there is a sense in which actuality is prior to potentiality: “the active that is the same in form, though not in number [with a potentially existing thing], is prior [to it]” (1049b18–19). A particular acorn is, of course, temporally prior to the particular oak tree that it grows into, but it is preceded in time by the actual oak tree that produced it, with which it is identical in species. The seed (potential substance) must have been preceded by an adult (actual substance). So in this sense actuality is prior even in time.

(3) Aristotle argues for the priority in substance of actuality over potentiality in two ways. (a) The first argument makes use of his notion of final causality. Things that come to be move toward an end (telos)—the boy becomes a man, the acorn becomes an oak—and “the activity is the end, and it is for the sake of this that the capacity [or potentiality] is acquired. For animals do not see in order that they may have sight, rather they have sight in order that they may see … matter is potentially something because it may come in the form of it—at any rate, when it is actively something, then it is in the form of it” (1050a9–17). Form or actuality is the end toward which natural processes are directed. Actuality is therefore a cause in more than one sense of a thing’s realizing its potential. As we noted in Section 11, one and the same thing may be the final, formal, and efficient cause of another. Suppose an acorn realizes its potential to become an oak tree. The efficient cause here is the actual oak tree that produced the acorn; the formal cause is the logos defining that actuality; the final cause is the telos toward which the acorn develops—an actual (mature) oak tree.

(b) Aristotle also offers (1050b6–1051a2) an “even stricter” argument for his claim that actuality is prior in substance to potentiality. A potentiality is for either of a pair of opposites; so anything that is capable of being is also capable of not being. What is capable of not being might possibly not be, and what might possibly not be is perishable. Hence anything with the mere potentiality to be is perishable. What is eternal is imperishable, and so nothing that is eternal can exist only potentially—what is eternal must be fully actual. But the eternal is prior in substance to the perishable. For the eternal can exist without the perishable, but not conversely, and that is what priority in substance amounts to (cf. Δ.11, 1019a2). So what is actual is prior in substance to what is potential.

13. Unity Reconsidered

In Η.6, Aristotle returns to the problem of the unity of definition (discussed above in Section 9) and offers a new solution based on the concepts of potentiality and actuality. He begins by pointing out (recalling the language of Ζ.17) that the things whose unity he is trying to explain are those “that have several parts and where the totality of them is not like a heap, but the whole is something beyond the parts” (1045a8–10). His task is to explain the unity of such complexes.

The problem is insoluble, he says, unless one realizes that “there is on the one hand matter and on the other shape (or form, morphê), and the one is potentially and the other actively.” Once one realizes this, “then what we are inquiring into will no longer seem to be a puzzle” (1045a20–25). He offers the following example (1045a26–35). Suppose round bronze were the definition of ‘cloak’. If someone were to ask “what makes a cloak one thing, a unity?” the answer would be obvious. For bronze is the matter, and roundness is the form. The bronze is potentially round, and round is what the bronze actually is when it has received this form. The cause of the unity of the cloak (in this sense of ‘cloak’) is just the cause of bronze being made round. Since the cloak is something that was produced, or brought into being, there is no cause of its unity other than the agent who put the form into the matter. Bronze (the matter) is a potential sphere, and the cloak is an actual sphere. But round bronze is equally the essence of both the actual sphere and the potential one. The bronze and the roundness are not two separate things. The bronze is potentially a sphere, and when it is made round it constitutes an actual one—a single sphere of bronze.

It is easy to see how this hylomorphic analysis explains the unity of a substantial material particular, since neither the matter nor the form of such a particular is by itself a single material individual, and it is only when they are taken together that they constitute such an individual. But the question Aristotle is trying to answer is this: “why on earth is something one when the account of it is what we call a defnition?” (Ζ.12, 1037b11). Since proper definables are universals, it remains to be seen how the proposed solution applies to them. After all, universals are not material objects, and so it is not clear how they can be viewed as hylomorphic compounds. But Aristotle has at his disposal a concept that can fill this bill perfectly, viz., the concept of intelligible matter (hulê noêtê). (The main purpose of intelligible matter is to provide something quasi-material for pure geometrical objects that are not realized in bronze or stone, for example, to be made of.) So we surmise that it is for this reason that Aristotle goes on (1045a33) to introduce matter into the current context. If this is so, we may conclude that the material component in the definition of a species is intelligible matter. Elsewhere, he explicitly describes genus as matter: “the genus is the matter of what it is said to be the genus of” (Ι.8, 1058a23). So a species too, although it is not itself a material object, can be considered a hylomorphic compound. Its matter is its genus, which is only potentially the species defined; its differentia is the form that actualizes the matter. The genus does not actually exist independently of its species any more than bronze exists apart from all form. The genus animal, for example, is just that which is potentially some specific kind of animal or other. Aristotle concludes (1045b17–21) that “the ultimate matter and the form (morphê) are one and the same, the one potentially, the other actively … and what potentially is and what actively is are in a way one.”

This solution, of course, applies only to hylomorphic compounds. But that is all it needs to do, according to Aristotle. For he ends the chapter by claiming that the problem of unity does not arise for other kinds of compounds that are not material: “Things that have no matter … are all unconditionally just what is a one” (1045b23).

14. Theology

The science of being qua being is a science of form. But it is also theology, the science of god. The question now is, how can it be both? And to it Aristotle gives a succinct answer:

If there is some immovable substance, this [that is, theological philosophy] will be prior and will be primary philosophy, and it will be universal in this way, namely, because it is primary. And it will belong to it to get a theoretical grasp on being qua being, both what it is and the things that belong to it insofar as it is being. (E.1, 1026a29–32)

So the primacy of theology, which is based on the fact that it deals with substance that is eternal, immovable, and separable, is supposedly what justifies us in treating it as the universal science of being qua being.

A reminder, first, of what this primacy is. As we saw in Sections 2–3 above, only beings in the category of substance are separable, so that they alone enjoy a sort of ontological priority that is both existential and explanatory. Thus walking and being healthy are characterized as “incapable of being separated,” on the grounds that there is some particular substantial underlying subject of which they are predicated (Z.1, 1028a20–31). Often, indeed, separability is associated with being such a subject: “The underlying subject is prior, which is why the substance is prior” (Δ.11, 1019a5–6); “If we do not posit substances to be separated, and in the way in which particular things are said to be separated, we will do away with the sort of substance we wish to maintain” (M.10, 1086b16–19). Similarly, not being separable is associated with being predicated of such a subject: “All other things are either said of primary substances as subjects or in them as subjects. Therefore, if there were no primary substances, there could not be anything else” (Cat. 2b3–6). The starting-points and causes of all beings, then, must be substances. But for all that has been shown so far, the universe could still be made up of lots of separate substances having little ontologically to do with each other.

Here it may serve to return to Z.3, which opens by calling attention to something said (legomenon) about substance, namely that:

Something is said to be (legetai) substance, if not in more ways, at any rate most of all in four. For the essence, the universal, and the genus seem to be the substance of each thing, and fourth of these, the underlying subject. (1028b33–36)

Since “the primary underlying subject seems most of all to be substance” (1029a1–2), because what is said or predicated of it depends on it, the investigation begins with this subject, quickly isolating three candidates: the matter, the compound of matter and form, and the form itself (1029a2–3), which is identical to essence (1032b1–2). Almost as quickly (1029a7–32), the first two candidates are at least provisionally excluded. A—perhaps the—major ground for their exclusion is the primacy dilemma, which we shall now briefly investigate.

The philosophical background to the dilemma is this. If you are a realist about scientific knowledge and truth, as Aristotle is, the structure of your scientific theories must mirror the structure of reality, so that scientific starting-points or first principles, must also be the basic building blocks of reality. Suppose that this is not so. Suppose that your physics tells you that atoms are the basic building blocks of reality and that your psychology tells you that sense-perceptions are the starting-points of scientific knowledge. Then you will face a very severe problem, that of skepticism. For a wedge can be driven between the starting-points of scientific knowledge and reality’s basic building blocks. René Descartes’ famous dreaming argument is one familiar form such a wedge might take. Your sense-perceptions are consistent with your being always asleep and having a very detailed dream.

In B.6, Aristotle introduces a similar problem about the relation between our scientific representation of the world and how the world in itself is structured:

We must … ask whether [the starting-points] are universal or exist in the way we say particulars do. For if they are universal, they will not be substances. For no common thing signifies a this something but a such-and-such sort of thing, whereas substance is a this something.… If then the starting-points are universals, these things follow. But if they are not universals, but [exist] as particulars, they will not be scientifically knowable. For scientific knowledge of all things is universal. Thus there will be other starting-points prior to the starting-points, namely, those that are predicated universally, if indeed there is going to be scientific knowledge of these. (1003a7–17)

The basic building blocks of reality, (Aristotelian) science tells us, are particular matter-form compounds. Yet science’s own starting-points are the forms—the universal essences—of such things. There is no science of you, or of me, though there is one of human beings. How, then, can science possibly be reflecting accurately the structure of reality, when its starting-points and those of reality fail so radically to map onto each other? For there is no greater difference, it seems, than that between particulars and universals. The thing to do, then, given that science provides our best access to the nature of reality, is to investigate the universal forms or essences that are basic to it.

Aristotle begins the investigation with the most familiar and widely recognized case, which is the form or essence present in sublunary matter-form compounds. It is announced in Z.3 (1029b3–12), but not begun until some chapters later and not really completed until the end of Θ.5. And by then it is with actuality (entelecheia) or activity (energeia) that form is identified, and matter with potentiality. The science of being qua being can legitimately focus on form, or actuality, then, as the factor common to all substances, and so to all the beings. But unless it can be shown that there is some explanatory connection between the forms of all these substances, the non-fragmentary nature of being itself will still not have been established, and the pictures given to us by the various sciences will, so to speak, be separate pictures, and the being they collectively portray, divided.

The next stage in the unification of being, and the legitimation of the science dealing with it qua being, is effected by an argument in Λ.6 that trades on the identification of form with actuality and matter with potentiality:

If there is something that is capable of moving things or acting on them, but that is not actively doing so, there will not [necessarily] be movement, since it is possible for what has a capacity not to activate it. There is no benefit, therefore, in positing eternal substances, as those who accept the Forms do, unless there is to be present in them some starting-point that is capable of causing change. Moreover, even this is not enough, and neither is another substance beyond the Forms. For if it will not be active, there will not be movement. Further, even if it will be active, it is not enough, if the substance of it is a capacity. For then there will not be eternal movement, since what is potentially may possibly not be. There must, therefore, be such a starting-point, the very substance of which is activity. Further, accordingly, these substances must be without matter. For they must be eternal, if indeed anything else is eternal. Therefore they must be activity. (1071b12–22)

Matter-form compounds are, as such, capable of movement and change. The canonical examples of them—perhaps the only genuine or fully fledged ones—are living metabolizing beings (Z.17, 1041b29–30). But if these beings are to be actual, there must be substances whose very essence is activity—substances that do not need to be activated by something else.

With matter-form compounds shown to be dependent on substantial activities for their actual being, a further element of vertical unification is introduced into beings, since layer-wise the two sorts of substances belong together. Laterally, though, disunity continues to threaten. For as yet nothing has been done to exclude the possibility of each compound substance having a distinct substantial activity as its own unique activator. Being, in that case, would be a set of ordered pairs, the first member of which would be a substantial activity, the second a matter-form compound, with all its dependent attributes.

In Metaphysics Λ.8 Aristotle initially takes a step in the direction of such a bipartite picture. He asks how many substantial activities are required to explain astronomical phenomena, such as the movements of the stars and planets, and answers that there must be forty-nine of them (1074a16). But these forty-nine are coordinated with each other so as to form a system. And what enables them to do so, and to constitute a single heaven, is that there is a single prime mover of all of them:

It is evident that there is but one heaven. For if there are many, as there are many human beings, the starting-point for each will be one in form but in number many. But all things that are many in number have matter, for one and the same account applies to many, for example, human beings, whereas Socrates is one. But the primary essence does not have matter, since it is an actuality. The primary immovable mover, therefore, is one both in account and in number. And so, therefore, is what is moved always and continuously. Therefore, there is only one heaven. (1074a31–38)

What accounts for the unity of the heaven, then, is that the movements in it are traceable back to a single cause: the prime or primary mover.

Leaving aside the question of just how this primary mover moves what it moves directly, the next phase in the unification of beings is the one in which the sublunary world is integrated with the already unified superlunary one studied by astronomy. This takes place in Λ.10. One obvious indication of this unification is the dependence of the reproductive cycles of plants and animals on the seasons, and their dependence, in turn, on the movements of the sun and moon (Λ.5, 1071a13–16). And beyond even this there is the unity of the natural world itself, which is manifested in the ways in which its inhabitants are adapted to each other:

All things are jointly organized in a way, although not in the same way—even swimming creatures, flying creatures, and plants. And the organization is not such that one thing has no relation to another but rather there is a relation. For all things are jointly organized in relation to one thing—but it is as in a household, where the free men least of all do things at random, but all or most of the things they do are organized, while the slaves and beasts can do a little for the common thing, but mostly do things at random. For this is the sort of starting-point that the nature is of each of them. I mean, for example, that all must at least come to be disaggregated [into their elements]; and similarly there are other things which they all share for the whole. (1075a16–25)

Thus the sublunary realm is sufficiently integrated with the superlunary one that we can speak of them as jointly having a nature and a ruler, and as being analogous to an army (1075a13) and a household (1075a22).

We may agree, then, that the divine substances in the superlunary realm and the compound substances in the sublunary one have prima facie been vertically integrated into a single explanatory system. As a result, when we look at the form of a sublunary matter-form compound, we will find in it the mark of a superlunary activator, just as we do in the case of the various heavenly bodies, and, as in the line of its efficient causes, we find “the sun and its movement in an inclined circle” (1071a15–16). Still awaiting integration, though, are mathematical objects, such as numbers. But in Books M and N these are shown to be not substantial starting-points and causes but abstractions from perceptible sublunary beings—they are dependent entities, in other words, rather than self-subsistent ones. Similarly, in Physics II.2 we read:

The mathematician too busies himself about these things [planes, solids, lines, and points], although not insofar as each of them is the limit of a natural body, nor does he get a theoretical grasp on the coincidents of natural bodies insofar as they are such. That is why he separates them. For they are separable in the understanding from movement, and so their being separated makes no difference, nor does any falsehood result from it. (193b31–35)

This completes the vertical and horizontal unification of being: attributes depend on substances, substantial matter-form compounds depend on substantial forms, or activities, numbers depend on matter-form compounds.

Beings are not said to be “in accord with one thing,” therefore, as they would be if they formed a single first-order genus, but “with reference to one thing,” namely, a divine substance that is in essence an activity. And it is this more complex unity, compatible with generic diversity, and a genuine multiplicity of distinct first-order sciences, but just as robust and well grounded, that grounds and legitimates the science of being qua being as a single science dealing with a genuine object of study (Γ.2, 1003b11–16). The long argument that leads to this conclusion is thus a sort of proof of the existence, and so of the possibility, of the science on which the Metaphysics focuses. It is also the justification for the claim, which we looked at before, that the science of being qua being is in fact theology (1026a27–32).

There, then, in the starry heavens above us, are the forty-nine celestial spheres, all moving eternally in fixed circular orbits. The outermost one, which contains all the others, is the primary heaven. Questions immediately arise: (i) how is the primary heaven moved by the primary mover, the primary god? Aristotle gives his response in Λ.7:

There is something [namely, the primary heaven,] that is always moved with an unceasing movement, which is in a circle (and this is clear not from argument alone but also from the facts). So the primary heaven would be eternal. There is, therefore, also something that moves it [namely, the primary god]. But since what is moved and moves something is something medial, there is something that moves without being moved, being eternal, substance, and activity. This, though, is the way the object of desire and the intelligible object move things: they move them without being moved. Of these objects, the primary ones are the same. (1072a21–27)

Thus the primary heaven is moved by the primary god, in the way that we are moved by a good that we desire. (That this heaven, as well as the other heavenly bodies, are therefore alive is argued for in De Caelo II.12.) But (ii) how can the primary god be such a good? Moreover, (iii) why is he not moved by something else again?

The answer to question (ii) is also found in Λ.7:

Active understanding, though, is intrinsically of what is intrinsically best, and the sort that is to the highest degree best is of what is to the highest degree best. The understanding actively understands itself by partaking of the intelligible object. (For it becomes an intelligible object by touching and understanding one, so that understanding and intelligible object are the same.) For what is receptive of the intelligible object and of the substance is the understanding, and it is active when it possesses it, so that this rather than that seems to be the divine thing that understanding possesses, and contemplation seems to be most pleasant and best. If, then, that good state [of activity], which we are sometimes in, the [primary] god is always in, that is a wonderful thing, and if to a higher degree, that is yet more wonderful. But that is his state. And life, too, certainly belongs to him. For the activity of understanding is life, and he is that activity; and his intrinsic activity is life that is best and eternal. (1072b18–28)

What the primary heaven is moved by, then, is the wish to be in the good state of active contemplation that we, when we are happiest, are in, and that the primary god is always in because he just is that activity. Just as we seek the good that the primary god is, so too does the primary heaven and its forty-eight celestial companions.

This brings us to question (iii). When the understanding is actively contemplating something, that something—that intelligible object—is what activates it. So why isn’t that object yet more primary than the primary god? Aristotle gives his answer in Λ.9; the reasoning, though compressed, should now be fairly readily intelligible:

What does it [the primary god] understand? For it is either itself or something else. And if something else, then either always the same thing or sometimes this and sometimes that. Does it, then, make a difference or none at all whether it actively understands the good or some random object? Or are there not certain things that it would be absurd for it to think of? It is clear, therefore, that it actively understands what is most divine and most estimable and does not change [its object], since change would be for the worse, and would already be a sort of movement. First, then, if its substance is not active understanding but rather a capacity [to understand], … it is clear that something else would be more estimable than the understanding, namely, what is understood. And indeed [the capacity] to understand and active understanding will belong even to someone who actively understands the worst thing, so that if this is to be avoided (for there are in fact some things that it is better not to see than to see), the active understanding would not be the best thing. It is itself, therefore, that it understands, if indeed it is the most excellent thing, and the active understanding is active understanding of active understanding ( noêsis noêseôs noêsis). (1074b22–35)

God is the understanding that understands himself, because his understanding is like ours would be if we imagine it as being the intelligible equivalent of seeing light without seeing any other visible object. From the inside, then, from the point of view of the subject experiencing it, it is a state of consciousness of a sort familiar from the writings of the great religious mystics, in which both subject and object disappear from an awareness that yet remains fully and truly attentive, fully alive and joyous. Insofar as we have any experience-based evidence of what a beatific state is like, this one surely approximates to it. Were we to experience it or something like it, then, there is some reason to think that we would agree that it is bliss indeed, blessed happiness unalloyed. This is the conclusion Aristotle himself comes to and defends in Nicomachean Ethics X.6–8. Practical wisdom and theoretical wisdom, it follows, have the same ultimate starting-point, the same first principle, so that wisdom, too, is something unified.

Go back now to the primacy dilemma and notice that its resolution is within our grasp, though one might be forgiven for not readily understanding Aristotle’s statement of it in M.10:

The fact that all scientific knowledge is universal, so that the starting-points of beings must also be universal and not separate substances, involves the greatest puzzle of those mentioned. But though there is surely a way in which what is said is true, there is another way in which it is not true. For scientific knowledge, like knowing scientifically, is twofold, one potential, the other active: the capacity [or potential], being as matter, universal and indefinite, is of what is universal and indefinite, whereas the activity, being definite, is of what is definite—being a this something of a this something. But it is only coincidentally that sight sees universal color, because this [particular instance of] color that it sees is a color, and so what the grammarian theoretically grasps, namely, this [particular instance of] A, is an A. For if the starting-points must be universal, what comes from them must also be universal, as in the case of demonstrations. And if this is so, there will be nothing separable and no substance either. However, in one way scientific knowledge is universal, but in another it is not. (1087a10–25)

The idea is this. Since forms or essences are universals, you and I may both know the same form, as we may both know the letter A. But when I actively know or contemplate that universal form, what is now before my mind is a particular: this actualization of that universal. Now consider the primary god. He is eternally and essentially the object of the active understanding that he is. So he is a substantial particular. But since he is essentially an activity, he is also a universal essence of a special sort—one that can only be actual, never merely potential. In a way, then, the primary god overcomes the difference between particulars and universals that seemed unbridgeable. For he is at once a concrete particular and the starting-point of all scientific knowledge. He thereby unifies not just being, but the scientific knowledge of it as well, insuring that the latter fits the former in the way that realism requires.

15. Glossary of Aristotelian Terminology

  • accident: sumbebêkos
  • accidental: kata sumbebêkos
  • account: logos
  • activity: energeia
  • actuality: entelecheia
  • alteration: alloiôsis
  • affirmative: kataphatikos
  • assertion: apophansis (sentence with a truth value, declarative sentence)
  • assumption: hupothesis
  • attribute: pathos
  • axiom: axioma
  • be: einai
  • being(s): on, onta
  • belong: huparchein
  • category: katêgoria
  • cause: aition, aitia
  • change: kinêsis, metabolê
  • come to be: gignesthai
  • coming to be: genesis
  • contradict: antiphanai
  • contradiction: antiphasis (in the sense “contradictory pair of propositions” and also in the sense “denial of a proposition”)
  • contrary: enantion
  • definition: horos, horismos
  • demonstration: apodeixis
  • denial (of a proposition): apophasis
  • dialectic: dialektikê
  • differentia: diaphora; specific difference, eidopoios diaphora
  • distinctive: idios, idion
  • end: telos
  • essence: to ti ên einai, to ti esti
  • essential: en tôi ti esti, en tôi ti ên einai (of predications); kath’ hauto (of attributes)
  • exist: einai
  • explanation: aition, aitia
  • final cause: hou heneka (literally, “what something is for”)
  • form: eidos, morphê
  • formula: logos
  • function: ergon
  • genus: genos
  • homonymous: homônumon
  • immediate: amesos
  • impossible: adunaton
  • in respect of itself: kath’ hauto
  • individual: atomon, tode ti
  • induction: epagôgê
  • infinite: apeiron
  • kind: genos, eidos
  • knowledge: epistêmê
  • matter: hulê
  • movement: kinêsis
  • nature: phusis
  • negation (of a term): apophasis
  • particular: en merei, epi meros (of a proposition); kath’hekaston (of individuals)
  • peculiar: idios, idion
  • per se: kath’ hauto
  • perception: aisthêsis
  • perplexity: aporia
  • possible: dunaton, endechomenon; endechesthai (verb: “be possible”)
  • potentially: dunamei
  • potentiality: dunamis
  • predicate: katêgorein (verb); katêegoroumenon(“what is predicated”)
  • predication: katêgoria (act or instance of predicating, type of predication)
  • principle: archê (starting point of a demonstration)
  • qua: hêi
  • quality: poion
  • quantity: poson
  • refute: elenchein; refutation, elenchos
  • separate: chôriston
  • said in many ways: pollachôs legetai
  • science: epistêmê
  • soul: psuchê
  • species: eidos
  • specific: eidopoios (of a differentia that “makes a species”, eidopoios diaphora)
  • subject: hupokeimenon
  • substance: ousia
  • term: horos
  • this: tode ti
  • universal: katholou (both of propositions and of individuals)
  • wisdom: sophia


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Other Internet Resources


We are grateful to István Bodnar for his help in clarifying and improving our presentation, in the supplement on Nonsubstantial Particulars, of Frede’s reading of Aristotle’s definition of ‘in a subject’ (Cat. 1a25), and for stressing the underlying similarity between the Frede and Owen readings.

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