First published Thu Sep 11, 2014; substantive revision Thu Feb 20, 2020

The term ‘authentic’ is used either in the strong sense of being “of undisputed origin or authorship”, or in a weaker sense of being “faithful to an original” or a “reliable, accurate representation”. To say that something is authentic is to say that it is what it professes to be, or what it is reputed to be, in origin or authorship. But the distinction between authentic and derivative is more complicated when discussing authenticity as a characteristic attributed to human beings. For in this case, the question arises: What is it to be oneself, at one with oneself, or truly representing one’s self? The multiplicity of puzzles that arise in conjunction with the conception of authenticity connects with metaphysical, epistemological, and moral issues (for recent discussion, see Newman and Smith 2016; Heldke and Thomsen 2014). On the one hand, being oneself is inescapable, since whenever one makes a choice or acts, it is oneself who is doing these things. But on the other hand, we are sometimes inclined to say that some of the thoughts, decisions and actions that we undertake are not really one’s own and are therefore not genuinely expressive of who one is. Here, the issue is no longer of metaphysical nature, but rather about moral-psychology, identity and responsibility.

When used in this latter sense, the characterization describes a person who acts in accordance with desires, motives, ideals or beliefs that are not only hers (as opposed to someone else’s), but that also express who she really is. Bernard Williams captures this when he specifies authenticity as “the idea that some things are in some sense really you, or express what you are, and others aren’t” (quoted in Guignon 2004: viii).

Besides being a topic in philosophical debates, authenticity is also a pervasive ideal that impacts social and political thinking. In fact, one distinctive feature of recent Western intellectual developments has been a shift to what is called the “age of authenticity” (Taylor 2007; Ferrarra 1998). Therefore, understanding the concept also involves investigating its historical and philosophical sources and on the way it impacts the socio-political outlook of contemporary societies.

1. Origins and Meaning of the Concept of Authenticity

1.1 Sincerity and Authenticity

A number of significant cultural changes in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries led to the emergence of a new ideal in the Western world (Trilling 1972). During this period, human beings came to be thought of more as individuals than as placeholders in systems of social relations. This emphasis on the importance of the individual is seen in the prevalence of autobiographies and self-portraits, where the individual becomes the centre of attention not because of extraordinary feats or access to special knowledge, but because he or she is an individual.

In the same period, society comes to be seen not as an organic whole of interacting components, but as an aggregate of individual human beings, a social system with a life of its own, which presents itself to the individual as not itself quite human but rather as artificial, the result of a “social contract”. Being human is understood as being best achieved through being unique and distinctive, even when these collide with certain social norms. At the same time, there is an increasing awareness of what Charles Taylor (1989) calls “inwardness” or “internal space”. The result is a distinction between one’s private and unique individuality, and one’s public self (Taylor 1991; Trilling 1972).

With these social changes there is a sharp shift in the conceptions of approbation and disapproval that are commonly used in judging others and oneself. For instance, concepts like sincerity and honor become obsolescent (Berger 1970). In earlier times, a sincere person was seen as someone who honestly attempts to neither violate the expectations that follow from the position he holds in society, nor to strive to appear otherwise than he ought to. However, by the time of Hegel, the ideal of sincerity had lost its normative appeal. Hegel polemically refers to sincerity as “the heroism of dumb service” (Hegel 2002 [1807]: 515) and launches an attack on the bourgeois “honest man,” who passively internalizes a particular conventional social ethos. In the condition of sincerity, the individual is uncritically obedient to the power of society—a conformity that for Hegel leads to subjugation and a deterioration of the individual (Hegel 2002 [1807]; Golomb 1995: 9; Trilling 1972). For Hegel, in the progress of “spirit”, the individual consciousness will eventually move from this condition of sincerity to a condition of baseness, in which the individual becomes antagonistic to external societal powers and achieves a measure of autonomy. Hegel shows this clearly in a comment on Diderot’s Rameau’s Nephew, a story in which the narrator (supposedly Diderot himself) is portrayed as the reasonable, sincere man who respects the prevailing order and who has achieved bourgeois respectability. In contrast, the nephew is full of contempt for the society in which he figures as a worthless person. However, he is in opposition to himself, because he still aspires to a better standing in a society, which he believes has nothing but emptiness to offer (Despland 1975: 360; Golomb 1995: 13–15). For Hegel, the narrator is an example of the sincere, honest soul, while the nephew figures as the “disintegrated,” alienated consciousness. The nephew is clearly alienated, but for Hegel this alienation is a step in the progression towards autonomous existence (Williams 2002: 190).

In the midst of this conceptual change, the term ‘authenticity’ becomes applicable in demarcating a somewhat new set of virtues. The older concept of sincerity, referring to being truthful in order to be honest in one’s dealings with others, comes to be replaced by a relatively new concept of authenticity, understood as being true to oneself for one’s own benefit. Earlier, the moral advice to be authentic recommended that one should be true to oneself in order thereby to be true to others. Thus, being true to oneself is seen as a means to the end of successful social relations. In contrast, in our contemporary thinking, authenticity as a virtue term is seen as referring to a way of acting that is choiceworthy in itself (Ferrara 1993; Varga 2011a; Varga 2011b).

1.2 Autonomy and Authenticity

The growing appeal of the idea of authenticity has led to the emergence of a highly influential modern “ethic of authenticity” (Ferrara 1993; Ferrara 2017). This ethic acknowledges the value of the dominant “ethic of autonomy” that shapes modern moral thought (Schneewind 1998; Dworkin 1988). The idea of autonomy emphasizes the individual’s self-governing abilities, the independence of one’s deliberation from manipulation and the capacity to decide for oneself. It is connected to the view that moral principles and the legitimacy of political authority should be grounded in the self-governing individual who is free from diverse cultural and social pressures. According to the ethic of autonomy, each individual should follow those norms he or she can will on the basis of rational reflective endorsement. To some extent, authenticity and autonomy agree in supposing that one should strive to lead one’s life according to one’s own reasons and motives, relying on one’s capacity to follow self-imposed guidelines. In both cases, it is crucial that one has the ability to put one’s own behavior under reflexive scrutiny and make it dependent on self-determined goals (Honneth 1994).

One crucial difference is that the ethic of authenticity introduces the idea that there are motives, desires and commitments that sometimes should outweigh the restrictions of rational reflection. This is because those motives are so fundamental to the cohesion of one’s own identity that overriding them would mean disintegrating the very self which is necessary to be a moral agent. The point is that there are types of moral philosophical reasoning that can be repressive if they arise from “an autonomous moral conscience not complemented by sensitivity to the equilibrium of identity and by authenticity” (Ferrara 1993: 102). Besides leading an autonomous life, guided by one’s own, non-constrained reasons and motives, authenticity requires that these motives and reasons should be expressive of one’s self-identity. Authenticity guides the moral agent to follow only those “moral sources outside the subject [that speak in a language] which resonate[s] within him or her”, in other words, moral sources that accord with “an order which is inseparably indexed to a personal vision” (Taylor 1989: 510). Hence, authenticity entails an aspect that lies beyond the scope of autonomy, namely, a “language of personal resonance” (Taylor 1991: 90). This points to the gap between (Kantian) autonomy and authenticity: one can lead an autonomous life, even if this way of living fails to express a person’s self-understanding.

In recent years, more attention has been devoted to highlighting how autonomy and authenticity can come apart (e.g. Oshana 2007; Roessler 2012; MacKay forthcoming). Some argue that authenticity demands more than is necessary for autonomy: a person does not have to reflectively endorse key aspects of her identity in order to qualify as autonomous (Oshana 2007). If she acknowledges that aspects of her identity contradict her self-conception, she might still be autonomous, even if this acknowledgement injects ambivalence into her life.

In all, the ideal of authenticity does not object to the importance of the self-given law, but disagrees that full freedom consists in making and following such a law (Menke 2005: 308). It is not just about being involved in the authorship of such a law, but about how this law fits with the wholeness of a person’s life, and how or whether it expresses who the person is. In this sense, the idea of autonomy already represents a counterposition to an ethic that is solely concerned with strict adherence to social norms.

1.3 Authenticity and the self

Another decisive factor in the development of the ideal of authenticity was that it emerged together with a distinctively modern conception of the self. This is visible in the work of Rousseau, who argues that the orientation toward life that should guide the conduct one chooses should come from a source within. This led to questions about inwardness, self-reflection and introspection, many of them addressed in his Confessions (1770). When the space of interiority becomes a guiding authority, the individual must detect and distinguish central impulses, feelings and wishes from ones that are less central or conflict with one’s central motives. In other words, interiority must be divided into what is at the core and what is peripheral. In this picture, the measure of one’s actions is whether they spring from and express essential aspects of one’s identity or whether they come from a peripheral place.

Such a conception of the self exhibits decisive parallels to the tradition of “religious individualism” that centers religious life on the individual and stresses the importance of inwardness and the introspective examination of one’s inner motives, intentions and conscience. Investigating the characteristics of the modern subject of inwardness, Foucault (1980: 58–60) suggests that “it seems to us that truth, lodged in our most secret nature, ‘demands’ only to surface.” For Foucault, confession—the look inward to monitor one’s interior life and to tell certain “truths” about oneself—has become a part of a cultural life, reaching from religious contexts to psychological therapy. The radicalization of the distinction between true and false interiority has led to new possibilities; inner states, motivations and feelings are now increasingly thought of as objectifiable and malleable in different contexts.

Rousseau also adds that acting on motives that spring from the periphery of the self, while ignoring or denying essential aspects of one’s self, simply amounts to self-betrayal and annihilation of the self. Rousseau’s The New Heloise (1997 [1761]) emphasizes this aspect by showing how the novel accentuates the significant costs and the potential self-alienation involved in suppressing one’s deepest motivations. But, in addition, in the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality, Rousseau argues that, with the emergence of a competitive public sphere, the ability to turn inward is increasingly compromised, because competitive relations require intense role-playing, which Rousseau calls an “excessive labor” (Rousseau 1992 [1754]: 22). The ongoing instrumental role-playing not only causes alienation, but ultimately inequality and injustice, since it destroys the immanent moral understanding with which, according to Rousseau, humans are hard-wired. Social life requires identification with social roles, but because role identity is determined by other people’s normative expectations, role-playing leads to a tension that might be understood as a matter of politics more than anything else (Schmid 2017).

2. Critique of Authenticity

The idea of autonomy—the view that each individual must decide how to act based on his or her own rational deliberations about the best course of action—has in many ways paved the way for the idea of authenticity. However, authenticity goes beyond autonomy by holding that an individual’s feelings and deepest desires can outweigh both the outcome of rational deliberation in making decisions, and our willingness to immerse ourselves into the reigning norms and values of society. Whereas sincerity generally seems to accept a given social order, authenticity becomes an implicitly critical concept, often calling into question the reigning social order and public opinion. In Rousseau’s optic, one of our most important projects is to avert from the social sphere and to unearth what is truly us underneath the ‘masks’ that society forces on us. But when authenticity comes to be regarded as something like sincerity for its own sake (Ferrara 1993: 86), it becomes increasingly hard to see what the moral good is that it is supposed to bring into being.

A frequently mentioned worry with the ideal of authenticity is that the focus on one’s own inner feelings and attitudes may breed a self-centered preoccupation with oneself that is anti-social and destructive of altruism and compassion toward others. Christopher Lasch (1979) points out similarities between the clinical disorder referred to as Narcissistic Personality Disorder and authenticity. According to Lasch, narcissism and authenticity are both characterized by deficient empathic skills, self-indulgence and self-absorbed behavior. Similarly, Allan Bloom (1987: 61) maintains that the culture of authenticity has made the minds of the youth “narrower and flatter,” leading to self-centeredness and the collapse of the public self. While Lasch and Bloom worry about the threat that the self-centeredness and narcissism of the “culture of authenticity” poses to morality and political coherence, Daniel Bell voices worries about its economic viability. What Bell fears is that the “megalomania of self-infinitization” that comes with the culture of authenticity will erode the foundations of market mechanisms that are “based on a moral system of reward rooted in the Protestant sanctification of work” (Bell 1976: 84). More recently, critics have argued that when properly analyzed, authenticity demands positing the existence of a “true self.” It requires positing an essentialist structure leading to metaphysical problems that current accounts of authenticity fail to solve (Bialystok 2014). Correspondingly, Feldman (2014) argues in favor of abandoning the ideal of authenticity because it builds on confused assumptions about the self, the value of one’s “gut feelings” in revealing one’s values, and the supposedly corrupting influence of the “external” social realm (for a critique of this position, see Bauer 2017; Ferrara 2009)

However, one might argue that this only becomes a problem if one thinks of authenticity as entirely a personal virtue. In other words, there is only a clash between morality and social life and being authentic if the “true” self is regarded as fundamentally prone to anti-social behaviour. But many thinkers at this time understood human nature as fundamentally disposed toward beneficence, so that evil was seen as arising from socialization and upbringing rather than from deep drives within the human being. For instance, Rousseau holds that certain immoral characteristics are immanent in man but were produced by the dynamics of modern society, which is characterized by a competitive way of relating to others and striving for acknowledgement in the public sphere. Rousseau thus externalizes the origins of societal evil and alienation from the original nature of man. The undistorted self-relation of natural man inspires sympathy and considerate relations with others, sensitive to “seeing any sentient being, especially our fellow-man, perish or suffer, principally those like ourselves” (Rousseau 1992 [1754]: 14). In somewhat the same way, economic theorists of the time supposed that unregulated markets are self-correcting, as human beings are naturally inclined to engage in mutually advantageous commercial activities (Taylor 2007: 221–269). On this view, authenticity does not amount to egoism or self-absorption. On the contrary, the prevailing view seems to have been that, by turning inward and accessing the “true” self, one is simultaneously led towards a deeper engagement with the social world. This is why Taylor (1989: 419–455) describes the trajectory of the project of authenticity is “inward and upward”.

It might however be objected that supposing that the “inner” is a morally worthy guide is deeply misguided and builds upon an overly optimistic idea of human nature. It may be argued that once the idea of rational deliberation is set aside, the powerful impact of the non-rational becomes apparent. Thinkers such as Nietzsche and Freud have put in question the conception of human nature, and especially of our “inner” nature, as fundamentally good. Following their “hermeneutics of suspicion” (Ricoeur 1970), human nature comes to be seen as including forces of violence, disorder and unreason as well as tendencies toward beneficence and altruism. In that case, any idea of an ethic based primarily on the ideal of authenticity is simply untenable.

Others have expressed serious concerns not about the optimistic view of human nature, but about the conception of the self that underlies the idea of authenticity. Some argued that the dichotomies that the concept authenticity was built on, like conformity vs. independence, individual vs. society, or inner-directedness vs. other-directedness, were entirely misguided. The underlying assumption that considers the individual separate from the environment is an absurd assumption that erodes that bond between the individual and community, which ultimately is the source of the authentic self (Slater 1970: 15; Sisk 1973). In agreement with Slater (1970) and Yankelovich (1981), Bellah et al. (1985) and Fairlie (1978) contend that such a pursuit of authenticity is self-defeating, for with the loss of the bond with community, the sense of self is also diminished.

Additionally, in The Jargon of Authenticity, Adorno contended that the “liturgy of inwardness” is founded on the flawed idea of a self-transparent individual who is capable of choosing herself (Adorno 1973: 70). The doubtful picture of the self-centered individual covers up the constitutive alterity and mimetic nature of the self. In the concluding part of The Order of Things, Foucault maintained that present society was witnessing a crisis, not only of authenticity but also of the whole idea of the subject in its temporary historically contingent constitution, foreseeing that “man would be erased, like a face drawn in sand at the edge of the sea” (Foucault 1994: 387). Foucault clearly opposed the idea of a hidden authentic self, which he critically referred to as the “Californian cult of the self” (1983: 266). The recognition that the subject is not given to itself in advance leads him to the practical consequence that it must create itself as a work of art (Foucault 1983: 392). Rather than searching for a hidden true self, one should attempt to shape one’s life as a work of art, proceeding without recourse to any fixed rules or permanent truths in a process of unending becoming (Foucault 1988: 49). In a similar vein, Richard Rorty has argued that the idea of coming to “know a truth which was out there (or in here) all the time” (Rorty 1989: 27) is simply a myth. Postmodern thought raises questions about the existence of an underlying subject with essential properties accessible through introspection. The whole idea of the authentic as that which is “original”, “essential”, “proper”, and so forth now seems doubtful. If we are self-constituting beings who make ourselves up from one moment to the next, it appears that the term “authenticity” can refer only to whatever feels right at some particular moment.

Yet others have based their criticism of authenticity especially on the emergence of a pervasive “culture of authenticity”. Cultural critics have argued that the ostensible “decline” of modern society might not primarily be a result of economical or structural transformations, but as the outcome of an increasingly ubiquitous ideal of authenticity. Before we turn to these critiques, it is helpful to understand how the ideal of authenticity became so widespread. First, we should mention that Rousseau’s work, made a significant contribution to the popularization of authenticity. Indeed, some argue that authenticity can be seen as a “keystone” in Rousseau’s work, giving unity to his reflections on sociality, political order, and education (Ferrara 2017: 2). Particularly The New Heloise (1997 [1761]) was enormously influential, with at least 70 editions in print before 1800 (Darnton 1984: 242). This dispersion of the ideal of authenticity into popular culture was further strengthened by several factors. For instance, a wide array of intellectuals of the nineteenth and the early twentieth century had embraced the idea of authenticity, and even radicalized it by resisting established codes and publicly defending alternative, “artistic” or “bohemian” modes of life.

The reception of the work of Sartre and Heidegger has surely contributed to the popularization of the idea of authenticity, and the decisive impact of this idea first began to manifest itself after the Second World War (Taylor 2007: 475). Rossinow contends that the politics of the 1960s were centered on questions of authenticity. Following his account, the main driving force towards political and social changes of the New Left movement in the 1960s was “a search for authenticity in industrial American life” (Rossinow 1998: 345). Both J. Farrell (1997) and Rossinow argue that the New Left emerged partly as a reaction to traditional American liberalism and Christian existentialism, replacing the negative concept of “sin” with “alienation” and the positive goal of “salvation” with that of “authenticity”. Confronted with what they understood as alienation that “isn’t restricted to the poor” (Rossinow 1998: 194), New Left activism reached beyond civil rights to moral rights and attempted to bring about a recovery of a sense of personal wholeness and authenticity by curing the institutions of American society.

The emerging youth culture was characterized by a severe dissatisfaction with the “morass of conformity” of the parental generation (Gray 1965: 57). The critique of the growing conformity of life got more persistent during the 1950s, and a number of social scientists in widely read books criticized what they saw as widespread conformity and inauthenticity. Among these, The Lonely Crowd (1950) by Riesman and The Organization Man (1956) by Whyte received the most attention. Riesman points out that the efficacious functioning of modern organizations requires other-directed individuals who smoothly adjust to their environment. However, he also notes that such people compromised themselves, and a society consisting mostly of other-directed individuals faces substantial deficiencies in leadership and human potential.

On the background of this development, it seems that at a time when relativism appears difficult to surmount, authenticity has become a last measure of value and a common currency in contemporary cultural life (Jay 2004). So, under the impact of existentialism on Western culture, the ubiquitous desire for authenticity has emerged in modern society as “one of the most politically explosive of human impulses,” as Marshall Berman argues (1970: xix).

3. Conceptions of Authenticity

3.1 Kierkegaard and Heidegger

Kierkegaard’s work on authenticity and his suggestion that each of us is to “become what one is” (1992 [1846]: 130), is best seen as linked to his critical stance towards a certain social reality and a certain essentialist trend in philosophical and scientific thought. On the one hand, he (1962 [1846]) condemned aspects of his contemporary social world, claiming that many people have come to function as merely place-holders in a society that constantly levels down possibilities to the lowest common denominator. In more contemporary terms, we can say that Kierkegaard provides a criticism of modern society as causing “inauthenticity”. Living in a society characterized by such “massification” lead to what he refers to as widespread “despair” that comes to the fore as spiritlessness, denial, and defiance. On the other hand, he rejected the view that a human being should be regarded as an object, as a substance with certain essential attributes. Rather than being an item among others, Kierkegaard proposes to understand the self in relational terms: “The self is a relation that relates itself to itself…” (Kierkegaard 1980 [1849]:13). This relation consists in the unfolding project of taking what we find ourselves with as beings in the world and imparting some meaning or concrete identity to our own life course. Thus, the self is defined by concrete expressions through which one manifests oneself in the world and thereby constitutes one’s identity over time. In Kierkegaard’s view, “becoming what one is” and evading despair and hollowness is not a matter of solitary introspection, but rather a matter of passionate commitment to a relation to something outside oneself that bestows one’s life with meaning. For Kierkegaard, as a religious thinker, this ultimate commitment was his defining relation to God. The idea is that passionate care about something outside ourselves gives diachronic coherence in our lives and provides the basis for the narrative unity of the self (Davenport 2012).

The most familiar conception of “authenticity” comes to us mainly from Heidegger’s Being and Time of 1927. The word we translate as ‘authenticity’ is actually a neologism invented by Heidegger, the word Eigentlichkeit, which comes from an ordinary term, eigentlich, meaning ‘really’ or ‘truly’, but is built on the stem eigen, meaning ‘own’ or ‘proper’. So the word might be more literally translated as ‘ownedness’, or ‘being owned’, or even ‘being one’s own’, implying the idea of owning up to and owning what one is and does (for a stimulating recent interpretation, see McManus 2019). Nevertheless, the word ‘authenticity’ has become closely associated with Heidegger as a result of early translations of Being and Time into English, and was adopted by Sartre and Beauvoir as well as by existentialist therapists and cultural theorists who followed them.[1]

Heidegger’s conception of ownedness as the most fully realized human form of life emerges from his view of what it is to be a human being. This conception of human Dasein echoes Kierkegaard’s description of a “self”. On Heidegger’s account, Dasein is not a type of object among others in the totality of what is on hand in the universe. Instead, human being is a “relation of being”, a relation that obtains between what one is at any moment (the immediacy of the concrete present as it has evolved) and what one can and will be as the temporally extended unfolding or happening of life into an open realm of possibilities. To say that human being is a relation is to say that, in living out our lives, we always care about who and what we are. Heidegger expresses this by saying that, for each of us, our being (what our lives will amount to overall) is always at issue. This “being at stake” or “being in question for oneself” is made concrete in the specific stands we take—that is, in the roles we enact—over the course of our lives. It is because our being (our identity) is in question for us that we are always taking a stand on who we are. Since the German word for ‘understanding’, Verstehen, is etymologically derived from the idea of ‘taking a stand’, Heidegger can call the projection into the future by which we shape our identity ‘understanding’. And because any stand one takes is inescapably “being-in-the-world”, understanding carries with it some degree of competence in coping with the world around us. An understanding of being in general is therefore built into human agency.

To the extent that all our actions contribute to realizing an overarching project or set of projects, our active lives can be seen as embodying a life-project of some sort. On Heidegger’s view, we exist for the sake of ourselves: enacting roles and expressing character traits contribute to realizing some image of what it is to be human in our own cases. Existence has a directedness or purposiveness that imparts a degree of connection to our life stories. For the most part, having such a life-plan requires very little conscious formulation of goals or deliberation about means. It results from our competence in being members of a historical culture that we have mastered to a great extent in growing up into a shared world. This tacit “pre-understanding” makes possible our familiar dwelling with things and others in the familiar, everyday world.

Heidegger holds that all possibilities of concrete understanding and action are made possible by a background of shared practices opened up by the social context in which we find ourselves, by what he calls the ‘They’ (das Man). Far from it being the case that social existence is something alien to and opposed to our humanity, Heidegger holds that we are always essentially and inescapably social beings. As he says,

They itself prescribes that way of interpreting the world that lies closest. Dasein is for the sake of the They in an everyday manner… In terms of the They, and as the They, I am ‘given’ proximally to ‘myself’…. (1962 [1927]: 167, translation modified)

To be a teacher, for instance, I must adopt (and perhaps blend) some set of the ready-made styles of classroom presentation and of dealing with students laid out in advance by existing norms and conventions of professional conduct.

To say that we are always the They is not to say we are automata, however. Heidegger suggests that even in the bland conformism of “average everydayness” we are constantly making choices that reflect our understanding of who we are. Nevertheless, in average everydayness, we are as a rule adrift, acting as one of the “herd” or “crowd”—a form of life Heidegger calls “falling” (Verfallen). Heidegger (1962 [1927]: 220) emphasizes that calling this way of living “falling” does not imply that it is “a bad or deplorable ontical property of which, perhaps, more advanced stages of human culture might be able to rid themselves” (1962 [1927]: 220). On the contrary, since there is no exit from the social world—since it is the “only game in town”—it plays a positive role in creating the background of shared intelligibility that lets us be fully human in the first place. Nevertheless, Heidegger is aware that there is something deeply problematic about this falling mode of existence. In “doing what one does”, he suggests, we fail to own up to who we are. We do not take over our own choices as our own and, as a result, we are not really the authors of our own lives. To the extent that our lives are unowned or disowned, existence is inauthentic (uneigentlich), not our own (eigen).

Our condition as They-selves is one of dispersal, distraction and forgetfulness. But this “downward plunge” captures only one aspect of Dasein, Heidegger says. In order to be able to realize the capacity for authenticity, one must undergo a personal transformation, one that tears us away from falling. This is possible only given certain fundamental insights arising in a life. The first major shift can occur when one experiences an intense bout of anxiety. In anxiety, the familiar world that seemed to assure one’s security suddenly breaks down, and in this world-collapse one finds that the significance of things is “completely lacking” (1962 [1927]: 186). One finds oneself alone, with no worldly supports for one’s existence. In anxiety, Dasein encounters itself as an individual, ultimately alone. In Heidegger’s words, “Anxiety individualizes Dasein and thus discloses it as ‘solus ipse’” (1962 [1927]: 188). The second transformative event is the encounter with one’s “ownmost” possibility, the possibility of death as the possible loss of all possibilities. In facing our own finitude, we find that we are always future-directed happenings or projects, where what is crucial to that ongoing forward movement is not its actualization of possibilities, but the “How” with which one undertakes one’s life. Heidegger tries to envision a way of life he calls anticipatory running-forward (Vorlaufen) as a life that clear-sightedly and intensely carries out its projects, no matter what they may be. The third transformative event is hearing the call of conscience. What conscience calls out to us is the fact that we are “guilty” in the German sense of that word, which means that we have a debt (Schuld) and are responsible for ourselves. Conscience tells us that we are falling short of what we can be, and that we are obliged to take up the task of living with resoluteness and full engagement. Such resoluteness is seen clearly in the case of vocational commitments, where one has heard a calling and feels pulled toward pursuing that calling.[2]

The three “existentialia” that structure Dasein’s Being-in-the-world make up the “formal existential totality of Dasein’s structural whole”, what Heidegger calls care. To be Dasein, an entity must have some sense of what it is “coming toward” (Zu-kunft, the German for “future”), what has “come before” (what is “passed”, Vorbei), and what one is dealing with in one’s current situation (“making present”). The defining characteristics of Dasein’s potentiality-for-Being are displayed in the transformative events that lead to the possibility of being authentic (eigentlich, as we saw, from the stem meaning “proper” or “own”). When Dasein confronts and grasps its authentic possibility of being, it becomes possible to see the whole of Dasein, including both its being as a They-self and as authentic being-one’s-self. “Dasein is authentically itself in [its] primordial individualization”, where the “constancy [Ständigkeit] of the Self … gets clarified” (1962 [1927]: 322). What defines the wholeness and unity of Dasein is determined not by an underlying substance (e.g., the sub-ject, that which underlies), but by the “steadiness and steadfastness” (beständigen Standfestigkeit, ibid) of authenticity.

The key to understanding authenticity lies, as we have seen, in the characterization of Dasein’s being as a relation between two aspects or dimensions making up human existence. On the one hand, we find ourselves thrown into a world and a situation not of our own making, already disposed by moods and particular commitments, with a past behind us that constrains our choices. With respect to this dimension of human life, we are generally absorbed in practical affairs, taking care of business, striving to get things done as they crop up from time to time. This “being-in-a-situation” naturally inclines us to everyday falling as Heidegger describes it.

At the same time, however, to be human is to be underway toward achieving ends that are understood as integral to one’s overarching life-project. My actions at any moment, though typically aimed at accomplishing tasks laid out by the demands of circumstances, are also cumulatively creating me as a person of a particular sort. In this sense, my futural projection as “understanding” has the structure of being a projection onto one’s ownmost possibility of being. So, for example, when I attend a boring parent/teacher conference, I do so as part of handling my current duties. But this act is also part of being a parent insofar as it contributes to determining “that for the sake of which” I understand myself as existing. Given this distinction between current means/ends strategic actions and long-range life-defining undertakings, it is possible to see that there are two senses of freedom in play in Heidegger’s account of human existence. There is freedom in the humdrum sense of doing what I choose to do under ordinary conditions, a freedom Heidegger presumably interprets in an agent-libertarian way. But there is also freedom in an ethically more robust sense. In addition to choosing courses of action among options, Dasein is capable of “choosing to choose a kind of being-one’s-self” (1962 [1927]: 314) through its ongoing constitution of that identity for the sake of which it exists. Thus, I attend the parent/teacher conference and behave in a particular way because I care about being a parent and a citizen of a particular sort. I understand this stance as having repercussions for my life as a whole, and I grasp the need for resoluteness in holding steady to undertakings of this sort if I am to shape my identity in the way I can care about. For Heidegger, the resolute commitment that is made concrete and defined in one’s day-to-day actions is what imparts steadiness and steadfastness to a life. It is also the condition for being responsible for one’s own existence: “Only so can [one] be responsible [verantwortlich]”, Heidegger says (1962 [1927]: 334, translation modified). Authenticity, defined as standing up for and standing behind what one does—as owning and owning up to one’s deeds as an agent in the world—becomes possible in this sort of resolute commitment to the “for the sake of which” of one’s existence.

It should be obvious that this conception of authenticity has very little to do with the older idea of being true to one’s own pregiven feelings and desires. But there is still a clear respect in which the idea of “being true to oneself” has a role to play here. What distinguishes this conception from the conceptions of pop psychology and romantic views of authenticity is the fact that the “true self” to which we are to be true is not some pre-given set of substantive feelings, opinions and desires to be consulted through inward-turning or introspection. On the contrary, the “true self” alluded to here is an on-going narrative construction: the composition of one’s own autobiography through one’s concrete ways of acting over the course of a life as a whole. Feelings and desires are, of course, profoundly important, as are the features of one’s situation and one’s concrete connections to others. Heidegger wants to recover a firm sense of the wholeness of the existing individual. But this wholeness is found in the connectedness of what Heidegger calls the “happening” or “movement” of a life—that is, in the unfolding and constantly “in-progress” storyizing that continues until death. What is at stake in the ideal of authenticity is not being true to some antecedently given nature, then, but being a person of a particular sort. Heidegger emphasizes that being authentic presupposes that one instantiate such virtues as perseverance, integrity, clear-sightedness, flexibility, openness, and so forth. It should be obvious that such a life is not necessarily opposed to an ethical and socially engaged existence. On the contrary, authenticity seems to be regarded as a “executive virtue” that provides the condition for the possibility of being a moral agent in any meaningful sense whatsoever.

Others argue that Heidegger uses authenticity in both evaluative-normative and purely descriptive senses. In the descriptive use of the term, inauthenticity is simply the default condition of everyday life, in which our self-relations are mediated by others. In this sense, authenticity involves no judgment about which mode of being is superior for Dasein. But sometimes Heidegger’s language turns normative (Carman 2003), and the seemingly neutral inauthentic form of relating transforms into something negative. Inauthentic Dasein is now “not itself”, loses itself (Selbstverlorenheit), and becomes self-alienated. At this point, it is argued that when introducing the normative-evaluative sense, Heidegger presents three modes of life: authentic—average(ness)—inauthentic, where the authentic and inauthentic modes are existential modifications of average everydayness (Blattner 2006: 130; Dreyfus 1991). In this picture, an authentic way of life is owned, an inauthentic disowned, and the middle one—which is how we live much of the time—is simply one that is unowned. Dasein and authenticity emerge in contrast to this background and out of this background, so that the primordially indifferent mode is the condition of possibility for authenticity or inauthenticity. In addition, Carman (2003: 295) argues that Heidegger’s notion of conscience can help us further illustrate his account of authenticity and shows how the “call of conscience” may be interpreted as expressive responsiveness to one’s own particularity.

3.2 Sartre and de Beauvoir

Published in 1943, Sartre’s opus magnum, Being and Nothingness: A Phenomenological Essay on Ontology, had a significant influence on philosophical thought and intellectual life in the second half of the twentieth century. His principal goal in this book is to “repudiate the spirit of seriousness” of traditional philosophy as well as of bourgeois culture (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 796). The spirit of seriousness assumes (1) that there are transcendent values that exist antecedently to humans, and (2) that the value of a thing is part of the actual being of the valued thing. Sartre’s view, in contrast, is that all values are generated by human interactions in situations, so that value is a human construct with no extra-human existence in things.

To address the question of human existence, Sartre scrutinizes our everyday lives, focusing on two particular aspects. He notes that human beings, like other entities in the world, have certain concrete characteristics that make up what he calls their “facticity” or what they are “in themselves” (en soi). Facticity makes up the element of “givenness” we must work with: I find myself with a past, a body and a social situation that constrains me in what I can do. This “just being there” is above all contingent: there is no prior justification or reason for the existence of my being. On Sartre’s view, the “in itself” does not even have any determinate characteristics, since every determination (every “this, not that”) is first introduced into the totality of being by our specific interpretations of things.

While human beings share their “facticity” with other entities in the world, they are unique among the totality of entities insofar as they are capable of distancing themselves from what is “in itself” through reflection and self-awareness. Rather than being an item in the world with relatively fixed attributes, what is distinctive about me as a human being is that I am capable of putting my own being in question by asking myself, for example, whether I want to be a person of a particular sort. This capacity for gaining distance inserts a “not” or a “nonbeing” into the totality of what is, which allows me to organize what surrounds me into a meaningfully differentiated whole. In addition, human consciousness is the source of the “not” because it is itself a “nothingness”. In other words, a human being is not just an “in itself” but also a “for itself (pour soi), thus characterized by what Sartre calls “transcendence”. As transcendence, I am always more than I am as facticity because, as surpassing my brute being, I stand before an open range of possibilities for self-definition in the future.

Sartre’s notion of transcendence is closely linked with the idea of freedom. Humans are free in the sense that they have the ability to choose how they are going to interpret things, and in these interpretations they are deciding how things are to count or matter. We constitute the world through our freedom to the extent that our ways of taking things determine how reality will be sorted out and matter to us. At the same time, we constitute ourselves through our own choices: though the facticity of my situation creates some constraints on my possible self-interpretations, it is always up to me to decide the meaning of those constraints, and this means that what I take to be limitations are in fact produced by my own interpretations or meaning-giving activities. Such limitations are grasped in light of antecedent commitments, on the background of which situations becomes intelligible, as affording certain actions and/or modes of evaluation. It is our antecedent commitments that shape our world, making situations and objects intelligible as threatening or favorable, easy or full of obstacles, or more generally, as affording certain actions (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 489). Our engagements provide a hermeneutic structure within which our situations and motives become comprehensible and reveal themselves in the way situations appear to us—as significant, requiring our attention, etc. (1992a [1943]: 485).

It is important to note that Sartre’s notion of freedom is radical. Freedom is absolute to the extent that each person decides the significance of the constraints in his or her facticity: “I find an absolute responsibility for the fact that my facticity … is directly inapprehensible”, because supposed “facts” about me are never brute facts, “but always appear across a projective reconstruction of my for-itself” (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 710). For Sartre, only our choices and their projected ends define our situations as meaningful, as threatening or favorable, as affording certain actions etc. The resistances and obstacles that one encounters in a situation acquire meaning only in and through the free choice. Thus, individuals are responsible not only for their identities, but for the way the world presents itself in their experiences. Even others are just “opportunities and chances” for my free creative activity. According to this early formulation, it is up to us to interpret how other people are to matter to us relative to situations in which we find ourselves engaged (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 711).

But human beings are not merely characterized by facticity and transcendence; they are also seen as embodying a deep and irreconcilable tension between facticity and transcendence. This tension comes to the fore in Sartre’s account of “bad faith”. Bad faith, a kind of self-deception, involves believing or taking oneself to be an X while all along one is (and knows oneself to be) actually a Y. The most familiar form of bad faith is acting as if one were a mere thing—solely facticity—and thereby denying one’s own freedom to make oneself into something very different. Thus, the person who thinks she is a coward “just as a matter of fact” is excluding from view the ability to transform her existence through changed ways of behaving. Such bad faith is a denial of transcendence or freedom.

At first, it might seem that one could escape bad faith by making a sincere, deep commitment to something and abiding by that commitment—for example, a total, resolute engagement of the self comparable to Kierkegaard’s notion of an “infinite passion”. In this regard, Sartre considers a person who tries to wholeheartedly believe that his friend really likes him. “I believe it”, he says, “I decide to believe in it and maintain myself in this decision…” (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 114). My belief will be steady and solid, like something “in itself” that informs my being and cuts through all the tenuousness and unsteadiness of my subjective life. I know I believe it, I will say. If I could make myself believe something in this way, then to achieve this might be what we could call “good faith:” to actually be something, without the questionability of the “not” creeping in. However, Sartre doubts that such an absolute, being-determining commitment is possible. In fact, Sartre claims that any such sort of “good faith” would actually amount to little more than another form of self-deception. For if my decision to believe is in fact a decision, it must always be something that to some extent distances me from what is decided. That is why we use the word ‘believe’ to imply some degree of uncertainty, as when we say, “Is he my friend? Well, I believe he is”. Lucid self-awareness shows us that in making a choice, we can never attain the condition of the “in itself”, because what we are is always in question for us. This is what Sartre means when he says human being is always “previously corrupted” and that “bad faith [always] reapprehends good faith” (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 116). Thus, the project of being in good faith seems impossible, as we are always necessarily in bad faith.

The inescapable nature of bad faith seems to leave no room for the possibility of authenticity. This might be why the word translated as “authentic” only appears twice in this vast tome. On one occasion, Sartre attacks Heidegger for introducing the idea of authenticity as a way of providing something foundational in an otherwise totally contingent world. The concept of authenticity “shows all too clearly [Heidegger’s] anxiety to establish an ontological foundation for an Ethics…” (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 128). A second and more obscure appearance of the word comes at the end of the discussion of bad faith early in the book. Here Sartre acknowledges that his account of bad faith seems to have the consequence that there can be no such thing as good faith, so that “it is indifferent whether one is in good faith or in bad faith”, and that in turn seems to imply that “we can never radically escape bad faith”. Nevertheless, he goes on, there may be a “self-recovery of being which has been previously corrupted”, a recovery “we shall call authenticity, the description of which has no place here” (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 116n).

One might thus conclude that there is no way to be true to what one is, because there is nothing that one is. However, such a negative conclusion would be reached only by someone who embraced from the outset the “spirit of seriousness” Sartre sets out to attack. Seriousness would lead us to think that there is simply a fact of the matter about a person: the person is either a believer or he is not. But, as Linda A. Bell (1989: 45) has noted, there is another possibility. If one rejects the spirit of seriousness, one might lucidly acknowledge that, as transcendence, one’s belief is always in question and so not really a secure belief. Yet, at the same time, one might also recognize that, as facticity, one genuinely holds a belief, and that the belief is central to one’s being as an engaged agent in this situation. In Sartre’s convoluted style of formulation, “he would be right if he recognized himself as a being that is what it is not and is not what it is” (Bell 1989: 45). On this account, I believe, but I also acknowledge my ability to retract the belief, since nothing is ever fixed in stone.

What is suggested here is that a correlate of authenticity can be found in the idea of being true to the inescapable tension at the core of the human self. This would be attained if one clear-sightedly acknowledged the fundamental ambiguity of the human condition. Authenticity would then be what Sartre calls a “self-recovery of being which was previously corrupted” (1992a [1943]: 116). In a sense, humans can never really be anything in the way brute objects can be things with determinate attributes. In Bell’s words, authenticity would be “the awareness and acceptance of—this basic ambiguity” (1989: 46). This conclusion is supported by Sartre’s later work, Anti-Semite and Jew where he writes,

Authenticity, it is almost needless to say, consists in having a true and lucid consciousness of the situation, in assuming the responsibilities and risks it involves, in accepting it … sometimes in horror and hate. (1948: 90)

Lucid recognition of the ambiguity of the human condition is the leading idea behind Beauvoir’s The Ethics of Ambiguity. Beauvoir takes over Sartre’s characterization of the human condition and expands on ideas only hinted at in Sartre’s famous lecture, “The Humanism of Existentialism” (1946), in developing a conception of authenticity. According to Beauvoir, Sartre’s conception of the human being as “engaged freedom” implies not just that each individual finds his or her “reason for being” in concrete realizations of freedom, but that willing one’s own freedom necessarily involves willing the freedom of all humans. In achieving one’s own freedom, she writes, freedom must also will “an open future, by seeking to extend itself by means of the freedom of others” (1948: 60). The point here is that a dedication to freedom, when clearly grasped in its full implications, will be seen to call for a future in which an unrestricted range of possibilities is open to all.

Beauvoir also builds on Sartre’s notion of engagement to extend the idea of authenticity. Following Sartre, we are always already engaged in the affairs of the world, whether we realize it or not. To be human is to be already caught up in the midst of social and concrete situations that call for commitments of certain sorts on our part. Sartre takes this ground-level fact of engagement as the basis for exhorting us to be engaged in a deeper sense, where this implies that we decisively and wholeheartedly involve ourselves in what the current situation demands. Of course, once we have abandoned the spirit of seriousness, we will recognize that there are no antecedently given principles or values that dictate the proper course for our existential engagement, so that any commitment will be tenuous and groundless. But the authentic individual will be the one who takes up the terrifying freedom of being the ultimate source of values, embraces it, and acts with a clarity and firmness suitable to his or her best understanding of what is right in this context. In this way, the conception of authenticity is continuous with the ideal of being true to ourselves: we are called upon to become, in our concrete lives, what we already are in the ontological structure of our being.

This is in agreement with the manner in which Sartre describes the consequences of acting against one’s deepest commitments.

There is no doubt that I could have done otherwise, but that is not the problem. It ought to be formulated like this: could I have done otherwise without perceptibly modifying the organic totality of the projects that make up who I am?

Sartre goes on to say that the character of the act may be such that

instead of remaining a purely local and accidental modification of my behavior, it could be effected only by means of a radical transformation of my being-in-the-world… In other words: I could have acted otherwise. Agreed. But at what price? (Sartre 1992a [1943]: 454)

Thus, acting otherwise or, more precisely, failing to act on one’s fundamental commitments, comes at the price of transforming who one is. This change effectively precludes one from carrying on with an unchanged self-conception.

4. Recent Accounts of Authenticity

In the last three decades, authors like Taylor (1989, 1991, 1995, 2007), Ferrara (1993; 1998), Jacob Golomb (1995), Guignon (2004, 2008) and Varga (2011a) have attempted to reconstruct authenticity by maintaining that the justified criticism of self-indulgent forms of the idea does not justify the total condemnation of the idea itself (see Taylor 1991: 56). Instead of abandoning the notion of authenticity, they attempt to reconstruct it in a manner that leads neither to aestheticism nor to atomistic self-indulgence.

In The Ethics of Authenticity, and the more fully articulated Sources of the Self, Taylor makes a case for retaining the concept of authenticity (and the practices associated with it) on the grounds that the original and undistorted idea of authenticity contains an important element of self-transcendence (Taylor 1991: 15; Anderson 1995). Unsatisfied with the widespread criticism of authenticity as an adequate ethical orientation, Taylor sets out to prove that authenticity does not necessarily lead to aestheticism or self-indulgence: the justified criticism of self-indulgent forms of the ideal does not justify the complete condemnation of the ideal itself (Taylor 1991: 56). This would mean extricating aestheticism, subjectivism, individualism, and self-indulgent interpretations of this ideal from what Taylor (Ibid.: 15) holds to be an original understanding of that concept as achieving self-transcendence (Anderson 1995). Restoring an undistorted version, Taylor says, could guard against meaninglessness, which is one of the “malaises of modernity” that Taylor regards as tied to trivialized forms of the culture of authenticity. Self-transcendence, which once was a crucial element in the ideal of authenticity, is practically lost from the contemporary version, giving rise to cultures of self-absorption, which ultimately deteriorate into the malaise of absurdity.

Already in Sources of the Self, Taylor draws attention to how modernism gives birth to a new kind of inward turn that not only attempts to overcome the mechanistic conception of the self linked to disengaged reason but also the Romantic ideal of a faultless alignment of inner nature and reason. Instead, for the modernists, a turn inward did not mean a turn towards a self that needs articulation.

On the contrary, the turn inward may take us beyond the self as usually understood, to a fragmentation of experience which calls our ordinary notions of identity into question. (Taylor 1989: 462)

While in modernism, the turn inward still contained a self-transcending moment, the critical point where the ideal of authenticity becomes flattened is when it becomes ‘contaminated’ by a certain form of ‘self-determining freedom’ that also contains elements of inwardness and unconventionality (Taylor 1991: 38). Self-determining freedom

is the idea that I am free when I decide for myself what concerns me, rather than being shaped by external influences. It is a standard of freedom that obviously goes beyond what has been called negative liberty (being free to do what I want without interference by others) because that is compatible with one’s being shaped and influenced by society and its laws of conformity. Instead, self-determining freedom demands that one break free of all such external impositions and decide for oneself alone. (Taylor 1991: 27)

Not only is self-determining freedom not a necessary part of authenticity, it is also counterproductive because its self-centeredness flattens the meanings of lives and fragments identities. For Taylor, the process of articulating an identity involves adopting a relationship to the good or to what is important, which is connected to one’s membership in a language community (Taylor 1989: 34–35). As he clearly states, “authenticity is not the enemy of demands that emanate from beyond the self; it presupposes such demands” (Taylor 1991: 41). It cannot be up to me to decide what is important, since this would be self-defeating. Instead, whatever is important for me must connect to an inter-subjective notion of the good, wherefrom a good part of its normative force lastly emanates. In this sense, authenticity simply requires maintaining bonds to collective questions of worth that point beyond one’s own preferences. Taylor wants to show that modes of contemporary culture that opt for self-fulfillment without regard

(a) to the demands of our ties with others, or (b) to demands of any kind emanating from something more or other than human desires or aspirations are self-defeating, that they destroy the conditions for realizing authenticity itself. (Taylor 1991: 35)

Thus, not only do we need the recognition of concrete others in order to form our identities, but we must also (critically) engage with a common vocabulary of shared value orientations. In other words, Taylor points out that authenticity needs the appropriation of values that make up our collective horizons.

In his Reflective Authenticity, Alessandro Ferrara also sets out to defend authenticity as an ideal, but in contrast to Taylor he is interested in the social and philosophical issues of the relation between authenticity and validity. According to Ferrara’s diagnosis, we are currently witnessing a profound transition that, besides affecting cultures, values and norms, also touch on the “foundations of validity,” thereby affecting the “bedrock of the symbolic network through which we relate to reality and reproduce our life-forms” (Ferrara 1998: 1). At the core of this transformation is the reformulation of “well-being” (eudaimonia) as the normative ideal of authenticity, which can be of help in reconstructing a contemporary understanding of normativity. For Ferrara, it can ground a new ideal of universal validity “ultimately linked with the model of exemplary uniqueness or enlightening singularity thus far associated with ‘aesthetics’” (Ferrara 1998: 10). Authenticity is then characterized by the “self-congruency” of an individual, collective or symbolic identity (Ferrara 1998: 70), and is thought of as providing a new universal validity that does not build on the generalizable but rather on the exemplary. Ferrara views Simmel’s idea of an individual law as an instructive example of such an anti-generalizing universalism, and it is exactly this characteristic that makes it better suited to the pluralist contexts faced by modern Western societies. More recently, Ferrara (2019) has argued that authenticity currently faces a “dual paradox” and is misconstrued by many critics advocating its deconstructionist dismissal.

Golomb (1995) provides an informative historical overview of the genesis and development of the concept of authenticity, paying attention to both literary and philosophical sources. While continuously reminding us of the inherently social dimension of authenticity, one of the achievements here is the focus on boundary situations where authenticity “is best forged and revealed” (Ibid.: 201). Golomb takes a neutral position on the ethical value of authenticity, maintaining that “there is no reason to suppose that it is any better or any more valuable to be authentic than to act inauthentically” (Ibid.: 202).

Guignon (2004) explores both the philosophical roots of authenticity and its contemporary manifestations in popular culture. He thoughtfully criticizes pop-psychological literature that deals with the authentic life by making recourse to the subdued ‘inner child’. Since Rousseau, the dichotomy between authentic and inauthentic has often been interpreted akin to the distinction between child and adult (Guignon 2004: 43). Like the inner child, the authentic self is depicted as not yet corrupted by the pressures, competitiveness, and conformity of modern public life. Guignon draws on the psychoanalytic theories of Freud and Jung to remind us of less romanticized visions of the inner child. Additionally, Guignon (2004: 151) aims to identify the manner in which authenticity can be understood as being at the same time a personal and a “fundamentally and irreducibly” social virtue. Authenticity then involves reflectively discerning what is really worth pursuing in the social context in which the agent is situated (Ibid.: 155). If the ideal of authenticity is possible only in a free society with a solid foundation of established social virtues, it would seem that trying to be authentic, if it is to be coherent, must involve a commitment to sustaining and nurturing the type of society in which such an ideal is possible. A reflection on the social embodiment of virtues therefore suggests that authenticity, like many other character ideals, carries with it an obligation to contribute to the maintenance and well-being of a particular type of social organization and way of life (Guignon 2008: 288; 2004: 161). On the other hand, Guignon (2004, 2008) argues that in a democratic society, in which the authority of government—in setting the political course—stems from the consent of the governed, there is good reason to promote virtues like authenticity that sustain such an organization of government. To be authentic is to be clear about one’s own most basic feelings, desires and convictions, and to openly express one’s stance in the public arena. But that capacity is precisely the character trait that is needed in order to be an effective member of a democratic society (Guignon 2008: 288).

Varga (2011a) shares the fundamental assumption that authenticity has a certain potential (and therefore deserves to be reformulated), but he also thinks that it could be used for a critical inquiry into the practices of the self in contemporary life. By way of an analysis of self-help and self-management literature, Varga detects a “paradoxical transformation:” the ideal of authenticity that once provided an antidote to hierarchical institutions and requirements of capitalism, now seems to function both as an institutionalized demand towards subjects to match the systemic demands of contemporary capitalism and as a factor in the economic utilization of subjective capacities. Varga argues that it is in “existential” choices that we express who we are, and that these have a complex phenomenology characterized by a sense of necessity. In such choices, described as “alternativeless choices”, we articulate who we are, bringing into reality some tacit intuitions that often only take on a gestalt-like formation. In these cases, we both discover who we are “on the inside”, and actively constitute ourselves. Varga’s examination of the structure of our commitments culminates in the claim that the internal structure of our commitments commits us to more than what we happen to care about. In many cases it may actually commit us to publicly intelligible values that we take our commitments to embody—an aspect that may constrain the manner of our practical deliberation and the way in which we can pursue our commitments (Varga 2011a,b).

Along similar lines, Bauer (2017) defends authenticity as an ethical ideal, arguing that the ideal should understood as the combination of the ideal of expressing one’s individual personality and the ideal of being an autonomous and morally responsible person. Others have argued that authenticity might require more than living in accord with commitments that one wholeheartedly endorses. For example, Rings (2017) highlights an epistemic criterion. The point is that the commitments in question have to be chosen in light of an acknowledgment of facts concerning one’s personal history and present context. Thus, self-knowledge might matter more than hitherto recognized, even if the self-relation most pertinent to authenticity is not primarily of an epistemic nature.


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Charles Guignon

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