Boethius of Dacia
Boethius of Dacia was a leading philosopher at the faculty of arts in Paris about 1270–1275. He developed the Aristotelian idea of the autonomy of each domain of knowledge in a way that could justify Aristotelian-style natural science and ethics in spite of disagreements with revealed truth. He also made a major contribution to the linguistic theory now known as modism.
- 1. Life and Relations to Predecessors
- 2. Works
- 3. Philosophy
- 4. Influence
- 5. Literature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Relations to Predecessors
Boethius of Dacia, in Latin Boethius de Dacia or Boethius Dacus (“B. from Denmark / the Dane”) was a master of arts at the university of Paris in the early 1270s, and probably already in the late 1260s. Nothing is known about his background except his nationality. His Latinized name is likely to have rendered the Danish name “Bo”. Some twentieth-century scholars refer to him as “Boethius of Sweden”, but this rests on a misunderstanding of the evidence, as shown by Jensen (1963).
According to near-contemporary evidence, Boethius was, along with Siger of Brabant, one of the main targets of the great condemnation of March 1277 when bishop Stephen Tempier of Paris issued a list of 219 theses the teaching of which he prohibited (Hisette 1977: 11f.). Modern research has, indeed, confirmed that several items of the list reflect passages in works by Boethius (Hisette 1977; Piché 1999). It is unknown whether Boethius was still alive in 1277; he may have either died or left France some time before, for when in November 1276, as a prelude to the condemnation, Simon du Val, inquisitor for France, cited some arts masters to appear before him, Siger was included, but Boethius was not. A fourteenth-century bibliography of works by Dominican writers (“The Stams Catalogue”) includes Boethius, so it is possible that after his career in the arts faculty he became a friar.
1.2 Relation to predecessors and contemporaries
Boethius is a very independent thinker, and self-consciously so. Except for one unclear reference to Albert the Great, Boethius never names contemporaries or close predecessors, and so far only one source of influence has been identified with certainty: Albert the Great. However, Albert’s influence is only noticeable in the questions on Meteorology IV (see Fioravanti 1979), and only regards matters of little philosophical importance. Some passages in the remaining œuvre may indicate influence from Thomas Aquinas (Summa contra gentiles, Summa theologiae), but there is no scholarly consensus on this issue.
In much of modern historiography Boethius has been labelled “Averroist” or “radical” or “heterodox Aristotelian”, and has shared those labels with Siger of Brabant. The “Averroist” label has little to recommend it. Like all his contemporaries, Boethius respected and used Averroes, but he did not accord him any special status among authoritative authors (cf. Bianchi 2017). In particular, there is no sign that he defended the doctrine of a pan-human material intellect that was considered Averroes’ signature theory, and in his treatise on dreams he parts company with all known near-contemporaries by totally neglecting Averroes’ optimistic views about the prognostic value of dreams. The epithet “heterodox” or “radical Aristotelian” comes with the tacitly understood counterpart “orthodox and moderate like Aquinas”, and thus only makes sense from a certain religious point of view. Boethius was very much an Aristotelian, but, as was normal at the time, his Aristotelianism contained elements originating in Avicenna and the neo-Platonic Liber de causis. Siger and Boethius were contemporaries and taught the same authoritative books, so they inevitably shared some standard assumptions and topics of discussion, but philosophically they were not particularly close to each other.
Boethius produced question commentaries on Priscian’s authoritative Latin grammar and on several of Aristotle’s works, all of them presumably composed in connection with university courses and first presented orally to his students. In addition, there are two big sophismata, which are redacted reports of university disputations, and at least three opuscula (items 20, 23, and 26 on the list below) that do not directly reflect university teaching. The majority of his attested works are no longer extant, but what remains suffices to reveal some main features of his thought.
In the following list an asterisk (*) indicates that the work is still extant; an obelus (†) that it is referred to by Boethius himself in one of the extant works, and a paragraph sign (§) that it is mentioned in the fourteenth-century “Stams catalogue”. All extant works have been edited in Corpus Philosophorum Danicorum Medii Aevi (“CPhD”), vols. IV–VI, VIII–IX, and XIV, Copenhagen 1969–2020. A few have also appeared in earlier editions, which cannot, however, be trusted.
- *†§ Modi Significandi = Quaestiones super Priscianum Maiorem (“Modi Sign”.). On Priscian books I–XVI (morphology). Cited by Boethius himself as nostra grammatica. Edition by Jan Pinborg and Heinrich Roos in CPhD IV, 1969. An abridged version has been translated into English (McDermott 1980).
- † Quaestiones super librum Constructionum. On Priscian books XVII–XVIII (syntax).
- † De naturali ortu omnium accentuum ex ipsis proprietatibus rerum (“On the natural origin of all accents in the properties of things”). Probably a by-product of a course on Ps.-Priscian, De accentibus.
- * Sophisma Syllogizantem ponendum est terminos. Edition by Irène Rosier-Catach in CPhD IX, 2020.
- † Super librum Perihermenias. On Aristotle’s De interpretatione. Probably questions.
- † Ars demonstrativa. Either questions on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics or—more probably—a work presenting the essentials of its doctrine.
- *†§ Quaestiones super librum Topicorum (“Quaest. Top.”). Edition by Niels Jørgen Green-Pedersen and Jan Pinborg in CPhD VI.1, 1976.
- † Quaestiones super librum Elenchorum.
- † Ars de modis arguendi sophistice et solutionibus eorum (“Treatise on the types of sophistical argumentation and how to solve them”). Possibly identical with item 10 and/or 11.
- † Sophistria. About how to solve sophismata. Possibly identical with item 9 and/or 11.
- † Ars sophistica. Possibly identical with item 9 and/or 10.
- * Sophisma Omnis homo de necessitate est animal. There are two versions: F, first edited in Grabmann 1940 and available in a partial translation into English (Stump 1998); B, first edited in Roos 1962. B is considerably longer than F, but the extra material is not by Boethius, and the Boethian part of the text has been revised by a medieval editor. Edition by Sten Ebbesen in CPhD IX, 2020.
- *§ Quaestiones super libros Physicorum (“Quaest. Ph.”). Only partially preserved. Edition by Géza Sajó in CPhD V.2, 1974. The text is rather corrupt, and there are some editorial mistakes. See corrections in CPhD IX.
- § Quaestiones super librum de Caelo et mundo.
- *§ Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione. Only partially preserved. Edition by Géza Sajó in CPhD V.1, 1972. The text is rather corrupt, and there are some editorial mistakes. See corrections in CPhD IX.
- * Quaestiones super quartum Meteorologicorum. Edition by Gianfranco Fioravanti in CPhD VIII, 1979.
- † Super librum De minerabilibus. A commentary, probably in question form, on De mineralibus, an extract from Avicenna’s Shifā that was attached to the Arabo-Latin translation of Aristotle’s Meteorology.
- *§ Quaestiones super librum De anima. Only an abridged version of the questions on books I–II preserved. It is anonymous in the one and only manuscript, and some scholars have expressed doubts about the attribution to Boethius; see, in particular, Calma 2011. Edition by Robert Wielockx in CPhD XIV, 2009.
- § Quaestiones super libros De sensu et sensato, De somno et vigilia, De longitudine et brevitate vitae, De morte et vita.
- * De somniis (“On Dreams”). No doubt based on the lost questions on De somno et vigilia (item 19). Edition by Niels Jørgen Green-Pedersen in CPhD VI.2, 1976. Translated into Danish (Green-Pedersen 2001), English (Wippel 1987), Italian (Sannelli 1997).
- † Quaestiones super librum De animalibus.
- § Quaestiones super librum De plantis et vegetabilibus.
- *§ De aeternitate mundi (“On the Eternity of the World”) (“De aetern.”). Edition by Niels Jørgen Green-Pedersen in CPhD VI.2, 1976. Translated into Danish (Green-Pedersen 2001), English (Wippel 1987), German (Nicki 2000), Italian (Bianchi 2003), Portuguese (Santiago de Carvalho 1996).
- † Metaphysica. Probably questions on Aristotle’s Metaphysics. Echoes of the work have been found in Anonymus Lipsiensis’ Quaestiones Metaphysicae, edited by Gianfranco Fioravanti in CPhD XIV (2009) under the title Anonymi Boethio Daci Usi Quaestiones Metaphysicae. For the echoes of Boethius, see Fioravanti 2009.
- † Quaestiones morales. Questions on or linked to the Nicomachean Ethics.
- * De summo bono (“On the Supreme Good”). Edition by Niels Jørgen Green-Pedersen in CPhD VI.2, 1976. Translated into Danish (Green-Pedersen 2001), English (Wippel 1987), German (Wöhler 1990), French (Imbach 1986; Imbach & Fouche 2006), Italian (Fioravanti 1984, Bottin 1989).
- † Rhetorica. Probably questions on Aristotle’s Rhetoric.
From the neo-Platonic On Causes (Liber de causis) Boethius borrowed the term fixio. To be “fixed” is to have a place in reality. The First Cause is fixed entirely by itself, lower entities (separate substances, material substances, matter, accidents) all need the support of the First Cause, and, as one descends the hierarchy, increasingly more support from elsewhere. The relation between the First Cause and other beings is also called factio, “making”, but this does not imply creation in the traditional sense; it does, however, mean that everything “made” is existentially dependent on the First Cause and thus fundamentally contingent (Ebbesen 2005, Donati 2017).
Boethius may be classified as a moderate realist.
Every being (ens) is either a thing (res) or a mode of a thing (modus rei). […] Among things, some are natural, others mathematical, and a third group divine. […] Every mode of a thing is reducible to the thing itself as its cause and has been derived from it, for it cannot be a pure figment of the intellect. (Quaest. Top., 3–4)
Boethius operates with “things” (res) on such a high level of abstraction that, like Avicennian quiddities or common natures, they are undetermined as to particularity or universality, but have modes or ways of being (modi essendi) either this or that; thus the concrete term album “(something) white” and the abstract albedo “whiteness” signify the same, though in different ways, reflecting two different modes of being of that “thing” (Ebbesen 1988). On the other hand, he is clear that the fundamental furniture of the world consists of particulars, and while believing in essences, he refuses to hypostatize them: he rejects the notion that existence (esse) is accidental to essence and that an uninstantiated universal can function as a verifier of a proposition by virtue of some “essential being” (esse essentiale), as some of his contemporaries claimed.
Ordinary things, including humans, are compounds of matter and a form. The human form, the soul, has several functions, but it is not a compound of several forms—one like that of inorganic things, one like that of plants, one like that of irrational animals and, finally, an intellect:—it is one and the same formal entity that takes care of the different functions that some of Boethius’ contemporaries assigned to semi-independent parts of the whole soul. On this point he agrees with Thomas Aquinas. He also holds that the intellect is an eternal substance and can be separated from the body, but, he says, then it ceases to be a form and a soul. Hence, in whichever sense somebody’s intellect continues to exist as a substance after the person’s death, it would seem that it ceases to be human. Boethius does not, in his preserved writings, expand on how to understand the continued existence of the human intellect after death, but whatever he thought about this matter, his theory can hardly have made room for a bodily resurrection of human individuals, which, by his own lights, was all right (see §3.3.2, below). That had to be left to faith. (For the questions treated in this paragraph, see in particular Wielockx 2009: 50–55. The unity of the human form is strongly defended in the sophisma Omnis homo &c.).
Boethius is a towering figure among the so-called “modists”, the thinkers in whose linguistic theory modus significandi “mode/way of signifying” is a central concept. On modism and Boethius’ linguistic theory in general, the fundamental works are Pinborg 1967, Rosier (Rosier-Catach) 1983, and Marmo 1994. Also important is Beuerle 2010.
There is no clear starting date for modism, and it only gradually disappears in the late Middle Ages, but the height of creativity was reached in the last third of the thirteenth century. The basic idea is simple: the verb “to run” and the noun “a run” signify the same “thing”, but in different ways. This could be generalized to cover cases like the concrete “white” and the abstract “whiteness”, as well as other parts of speech than just nouns and verbs: “a pain” “it hurts” “hurting” “painfully” “ouch!” could all be seen as having a common significate, only signified in different ways. Similarly, the different cases of a noun, or the different tenses or persons of a verb could be described as different ways of signifying (modi significandi) the same, and in general all grammatical categories could be understood to be based on different modi significandi. Add to this (a) a series of rules about how two words may be construed with each other in a sentence depending on which modes of signifying they possess, and (b) the assumption that at bottom all languages share the same grammar with the same repertoire of modes of signifying, and you have a fairly strong linguistic theory.
The claim about the identity of grammar across languages is based on the assumption that (1) all humans conceptualize external reality in the same way, even though they express their concepts in ways that are culture dependent (as taught by Aristotle in De interpretatione 1); and (2) that this conceptualization does not only result in core concepts like run, pain but also in an awareness of different modifications of the core things underlying the concepts, different modi essendi “modes of being”. This awareness, in turn, means that we harbor different corresponding modi intelligendi “ways of understanding”, that we can then encode in sound, creating words with different modi significandi. How this encoding is done, is a matter of convention, as Boethius repeatedly stresses. What one language expresses by means of case endings, e.g., may be lexicalized in another; the difference is only skin-deep (“accidental”), he holds. He may have held that all languages actually have the resources for expressing all reality-based modes of signifying; at least he held that all languages hold the potential for so doing. One of the consequences of Boethius’ views is that although grammar maps the ways in which words may signify, it does not allow one to predict what any actual word in any language means, and whatever some word means is irrelevant for its grammatical categorization: “chimera” and “nothing” are nouns as truly as “horse” and “thing”, for grammar is about how, not what, words signify. Boethius’ conception of grammar as a science of linguistic structure, not content, was matched by a similar conception of logic (Ebbesen 2016).
Some of Boethius’ contemporaries considered the step from modes of being to modes of understanding to be so automatic that they claimed that the two types of mode were fundamentally identical. Boethius disagreed. According to him, there is not an exact one-to-one correspondence between features of external things and their reflections in the intellect. The intellect has a certain degree of freedom. It can grasp the same mode of being in two slightly different ways. Thus the same real property (mode of being) can give rise to the mode of understanding that results in the mode of signifying of a proper name and to the “intention” (concept) of a particular; and similarly with the mode of signifying of an appellative name and the intention of a universal. The intentions, in turn, are the basis for “local habitudes” (habitudines locales), i.e., relationships between them, such as that between the particular and the universal, which can be fleshed out in rules about inferences. Thus, in some cases the same feature of reality may be reflected in grammar and in logic, but somewhat differently (more details in Ebbesen 2016 and Green-Pedersen 1984: 228–30).
While holding that the signification of words reflects our concepts, Boethius rejected the time-honoured notion that words signify concepts directly and things indirectly. In his view, they directly signify whatever the corresponding concepts are concepts of (Mora-Márquez 2014, 2015).
In what follows “knowledge”, “science” and “scientific knowledge” all represent the Latin scientia, which fundamentally means the sort of knowledge about things and their causes that finds expression in the theorems of a particular science. Also, it should be noted that in accordance with medieval practice “proposition” is used indiscriminately for what we now call a proposition and its linguistic counterpart (a sentence).
Evidence for Boethius’ views about scientia is found in all of his works. The relation between scientia and faith (fides) is a central theme in De aeternitate mundi and De summo bono. The present account follows the interpretation of Boethius’ theory presented in Pinborg 1974 and Ebbesen 2000, 2002, and 2005 (cf. also Donati 2017). For a different interpretation, see Schick 2013.
Boethius’ theory of scientific knowledge and science is fundamentally Aristotelian. Any particular science is an axiomatic system with its own primitive terms, primitive propositions (axioms, “principles” in medieval terminology), and deduced theorems (“conclusions”). All of a science’s propositions are universal and necessary, and thus can only be grasped by the intellect. Yet, the primitive terms and propositions have their origin in sense-perception, and the truth of an affirmative proposition of the form “Every S is P” depends on the instantiation in reality of the composition of subject and predicate that it signifies, and thus requires that the subject term have at least one individual referent. Several particular sciences may form a cluster subordinated to a superior science, whose primitive terms and propositions they may use, but they each add their own set of primitives.
3.3.2 The autonomy of the sciences
Boethius is keen to stress the autonomy of each branch of science.
No specialist (artifex) can grant or deny anything except on the basis of the principles of his own science,
he says time and again. This means, for instance, that a grammarian qua grammarian must abstract from whatever knowledge he may have about the meaning of particular words. Knowing that “donkey” means donkey, and what a donkey is, is none of the grammarian’s business. “Donkey” is a primitive term in zoology, and if the grammarian happens to be also a zoologist, he should be careful not to mix the two sciences he masters. Boethius even reprimands the great authority in grammar, Priscian, for introducing non-grammatical considerations into his work (Modi sign., 47).
Aristotle’s description of scientific procedure in the Posterior Analytics is couched in disputational language, and in Boethius’ own age disputations were a very important part of university teaching and, indeed, of philosophical research, some of them being genuine debates with several participants, others fictive ones in the form of quaestiones with the teacher presenting both the arguments pro and con and the solution. In Boethius’ trademark formulation of the autonomy of each science, the expression “grant or deny” (concedere vel negare) belongs in the context of a disputation where a questioner puts forward propositions of the form “Is S P ?” and a respondent typically answers “I grant it” or “I deny it”. Boethius seems to have conceived of scientific activity as fundamentally similar to participating in a disputation, and keeping within the limits of a particular science as being similar to obeying the rules of a particular type of disputation. Hardly by chance, he describes an unusual variant of the disputational exercise called ars obligatoria. In his version, an opponent puts forward a number of propositions to a respondent, who must grant them all, irrespective of their truth-value, rejecting only such as are incompatible with something he has already granted. After some time, the disputation passes to a second stage, in which the opponent puts forward further propositions, but this time the respondent is allowed and obliged to grant only such as follow from what he had granted in stage 1. The opponent’s job is to try to force him to contradict himself (Quaest. Top., 329–30; cf. Yrjönsuuri 1994, 31–35). This exercise imitates the gathering of a tentative set of axioms of a science, followed by a test of the set’s consistency.
Within a university disputation, what counted as a “true” answer depended on the rules of the particular sort of disputation. In a dialectical one, the respondent should only grant a proposition if it is probable; in that context, granting an improbable proposition amounts to speaking untruly (mentiri) even if in reality it is as the proposition states (Quaest. Top., 139). The analogous situation within a specific science is granting a proposition that is at odds with the principles of the science in case. It is a fundamental principle of (Aristotelian) physics that every movement presupposes a previous movement, hence the claim that there once was a first movement must count as false in physics.
This means that even if Christian theology, or “faith”, as Boethius usually says, were a science, some of its dogmas could not be incorporated in any of the natural sciences. A temporal beginning of the world (creation) cannot, and similarly the notion of a first human being coming into existence without being generated. Nor do the sciences have room for the resurrection of the flesh, for in scientific language that means that an individual may perish (“be corrupted”) and later return numerically the same, and this is not compatible with the Aristotelian science of generation and corruption (cf. §3.4, below).
As a matter of fact, faith is not science (knowledge)—fides non est scientia (De aetern., 366)—and no comprehensive science of the divine is possible. Metaphysics might be a candidate, for all sciences are subordinated to metaphysics, and qua metaphysician a philosopher will know that there is a First Cause (like all of his contemporaries, Boethius held that causal chains cannot be infinite). However, knowing that there is a First Cause does not imply knowing it to a degree that one can capture it in a definition that delimits its possible effects and can be used as a premise in an Aristotelian demonstration—that would require it to have causes through which it could be known. No such knowledge is possible, it would amount to knowing the divine will, which is not accessible to rational investigation. Hence, as the First Cause is fundamentally inscrutable, it is not possible to simply deduce the axioms of lower sciences as theorems of metaphysics.
Sciences must be built the Aristotelian way, and their theorems must be accepted as true. We have no alternative. But they are only as true as their axioms, which may be imperfect approximations to reality as they are not derived from a total understanding of the First Cause, and have a built-in presupposition that the sort of things they mention are instantiated in reality (see §3.3.3, below).
The fact that certain religious tenets have no place in the sciences does not, however, mean that a scientist cannot be a believer. The analysis of the causal system showed that the First Cause may have inexplicable effects, and one may believe that any such effects claimed by faith are real, for all their being inexplicable and in conflict with science. The information about them that revelation provides must be accepted as brute facts. To the believing scientist the truths of faith are truths unconditionally, scientific truths are so only conditionally. But we still need science to make sense of our world.
3.3.3 Necessity and truth of scientific propositions. The sophisma test
An important test for a thirteenth-century philosopher’s theory of truth and knowledge was how well it could handle the sophisma “Every man by necessity is an animal” (Omnis homo de necessitate est animal), and in particular how it would evaluate the truth-value of the sophisma in the supposed situation that no man exists. Item 12 in the above list of Boethius’ works is one of more than thirty treatments of this sophisma from his century. Two major ones by other authors have been published and commented on (Libera 2002; Libera & Gazziero 2008; see also Ebbesen & Pinborg 1970).
Boethius asks (a) whether
- “Every man by necessity is an animal”
is true if
- no man exists,
(b) whether the destruction of the object of some piece of knowledge implies the destruction of the relevant knowledge, and (c) whether the destruction of the things signified by a term implies that it loses its meaning (“falls from its significate” is the formulation). Similar discussions occur in several near-contemporary texts, but Boethius’ answers are not standard ones.
Some of Boethius’ contemporaries rejected the thought-experiment involved in the sophisma because in an Aristotelian sempiternal world the presupposed state of affairs, Ø, cannot occur, as no natural species is ever uninstantiated. Others held that (1) is true because man can neither be nor be conceived of without animal being or being conceived of. Many held that the destruction of the individuals of a species would not imply the destruction of their essence, and so the essence of man would still be around to be the significate of “man”, an object of knowledge and the truth-maker of (1).
Boethius, for his part, held that Ø is a possible state of affairs, human beings are contingent beings, and so the necessity operator in (1) makes the proposition false in all circumstances, and the argument that man cannot possibly be or be conceived of without animal fails because it is not necessary for man to be or to be conceived of at all. Boethius agrees that in a world that does contain at least one human, the human essence is the cause of the inherence of the predicate animal in man, and hence of the truth of
- “Every man is an animal”,
but if Ø were to obtain, (1*) would also be false, because essences presuppose existent carriers. He rejects the claim that “existence is accidental to an essence” (essentiae accidit esse); prior to the generation of a human being its essence was nothing, he says, and after the individual’s destruction it again is nothing. In short: if no human exists, there is no human essence and no composition in reality of man and animal as required for (1*) to be true. He further holds that in a world void of men
- “Man is man” (Homo est homo)
is false, with the consequence that
- “Man is not man”
becomes true, because the truth-maker of a negative proposition is the non-occurrence in reality of the composition signified by the corresponding affirmative. Most of Boethius’ contemporaries would defend (2) with the claim that “No proposition is truer than one in which something is predicated of itself”.
Boethius’ solution to question (a) makes the status of scientific axioms and theorems problematic, because according to Aristotle they are necessary. Moreover, some axioms regard phenomena like eclipses and rainbows that are not always instantiated even in a sempiternal Aristotelian world.
In his answer to question (b) Boethius claims that while the object of knowledge must be extant in order for us to acquire knowledge about it, we need not lose that knowledge if it ceases to exist, only it can no longer be knowledge that the object has a certain predicate, but knowledge about precisely which causes such a thing will have if it comes into being. As for (c), he similarly holds that a word does not become meaningless by losing its referents, because it is still possible to entertain the corresponding concept. So, we can retain a concept of such a thing just as we can keep our knowledge of such a thing even when there is no longer such a thing. Boethius’ answer to (b) combined with remarks elsewhere suggests that he took causal structures to remain in place in all circumstances and scientific theorems of the form “Every S is P” to be necessary in the weak sense that if some S exists, and no superior cause unaccounted for in the relevant science intervenes, then S cannot fail to have the predicate P.
3.4 Eternity of the world
Boethius’ On the Eternity of the World is not about eternity in the theological a-temporal sense, but about sempiternity, existence in a time that neither had any beginning nor will have any end. The crucial question is “Does the notion of a temporal beginning, a creation, make philosophical sense”. Boethius holds that there is no way to definitely prove or disprove that the world is “new”, i.e., that it has come into existence a definite time ago. He refutes arguments purporting to show the actual sempiternity of the world, but not arguments adduced to show that such sempiternity is possible, while he characterizes traditional would-be proofs of a temporal beginning as invalid (“sophistic”).
The central piece of the work is a demonstration that no branch of philosophy can prove the “newness” of the world. The natural scientist cannot, because that would require relying on an assumption that is not included in the principles of his science and would make them an inconsistent set if included. The natural scientist can explain how something comes into being by some pre-existing matter acquiring a form, but that is generation, not creation, and nature only produces new things through generation. Hence, the natural scientist can neither, qua natural scientist, assume the creation of the world and the existence of a first man nor the reality of the future resurrection; indeed, he must deny all three. To the mathematical sciences it simply does not matter whether the world is new or sempiternal. Neither can a metaphysician deliver the desired proof. In the first place, the metaphysician cannot demonstrate that an effect may be delayed in relation to its sufficient cause; i.e., metaphysics presupposes the principle “If a sufficient cause is posited, so is its effect” (posita causa sufficiente ponitur effectus). Second, there is no way a metaphysician may prove that the world is not coeternal with the divine will, for that would require an insight into the divine will that is not accessible to humans; claiming to have such insight amounts to madness, Boethius says.
So, the upshot of the discussion is that when doing natural science one should stick to Aristotelian principles, but remember that qua scientist one is limited to dealing with what is accessible to human reason, so that while conceding the necessity of a conclusion deduced from natural causes one may still concede that things may be factually different due to the First Cause.
At the end of the treatise Boethius lashes out at people like bishop Tempier, who cannot understand how it is possible to be a Christian and a philosopher at the same time:
If someone, whether enjoying a position of dignity or not, cannot understand such difficult matters, then let him obey the wise man and let him believe in the Christian Law, (Wippel’s trl. [1987: 67])
but, he adds, “faith is not knowledge/science”.
3.5 Astrology and dreams as predictors of future events
Like all his contemporaries, Boethius believed in astral influence, and he seems to have believed in the “great year”, i.e., that every so many years (some said 36,000) all heavenly bodies are aligned in the same way, meaning that if everything happening on Earth depended on celestial causality, history would be cyclical. Yet, he points out that such a cyclical view of history is unwarranted, for there is at least one independent causal factor that can override the celestial influence: human free will (Quaest. Ph., 247–253). The thesis about the great year and the exact repetition of history was condemned in 1277; perhaps bishop Tempier’s men found it defended by some other master, perhaps they just read Boethius too superficially.
Aristotle in his De divinatione per somnum (“On Prophesy in Sleep”) rejects the common assumption of his contemporaries that gods may send dreams that inform about future events.Agreement between dream content and a later event is either (1) due to the fact that the dream reflects a bodily affection of the dreamer’s such as an incipient fever that stands in a known causal relationship to a later event such as the unfolding of a disease, or (2) because having had the dream makes the dreamer do what it suggested, or (3) mere coincidence. In De somniis (“On Dreams”) Boethius follows Aristotle in this, and in so doing deviates sharply from all known near-contemporary commentators on De divinatione, who—encouraged by Averroes, among others—left more room for supernatural intervention in dreams or, at the very least, left plenty of room for information about the future conveyed by celestial influence, a view for which they believed they could find support in Aristotle’s text (Ebbesen, forthcoming). In his treatise Boethius mocks “stupid people” who for entirely physiological reasons dream of dark persons or white angels and on waking up claim they have seen devils or that in a rapture they have seen genuine angels. He piously adds that he will not deny that by divine will a devil or an angel may appear to someone, but this looks like a subterfuge, and was taken as such by the men behind the 1277 condemnation, which features the proposition “That raptures and visions do not take place except through nature”.
Boethius’ lost Quaestiones morales was probably a question commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics. There he must have discussed human free will, because elsewhere he says that topic belongs to ethics. But in particular, he is likely to have concentrated on the nature of the supreme good (= happiness), to which he (later, presumably) dedicated a small treatise.
De summo bono (“On the Supreme Good”) is a passionate defense of the thesis that the ideal life is that of an intellectual, a philosopher, who spends his life in the pursuit of truth. It is a rhetorical masterpiece, containing one of the longest periods in all of Latin literature that keeps the reader in suspense for about two pages. According to Boethius, the supreme good possible for man consists in “knowing the true, doing the good, and taking delight in both”. By concentrating on the quest for truth, the philosopher comes to act in a morally correct way (a) because of the insight he has gained in what is base and what is noble, (b) because being absorbed in theoretical work and enjoying it he will not be tempted by sensual pleasures, and (c) because, as opposed to other activities, theorizing cannot be overdone. So, the philosopher “lives as man was born to live”.
Special attention is paid to the philosopher’s quest for knowledge about the First Cause, alias God, but what Boethius claims we can know is actually just that it/he is the cause of the “production” of all beings, of their mutual order in the chain of being, and of their conservation (cf. §3.1, above).
Boethius’ argumentation is primarily based on the Aristotelian ergon argument: the highest good for a human being is to develop to the full the capability that is specific to humans, i.e., our rationality or intellect, and there are many echoes of Nicomachean Ethics X, but his explanation of why the philosopher will act virtuously is not easily compatible with the Aristotelian insistence that ethics is not a theoretical science and that habituation is central to making people virtuous.
The happiness that Boethius is concerned with is entirely this-worldly. A future life is only mentioned once, in an ambiguous remark to the effect that the more one manages to obtain the happiness that reason tells us is possible in this life, the closer one is to the happiness that faith makes us expect in a/the life to come. It could mean that virtuous behavior betters one’s chances on doomsday, but it could also just mean that the philosopher’s happy contemplative life is the closest approximation to the bliss of the beatific vision.
One of the theses condemned in 1277 is a slightly altered, but basically correct quotation of a passage in De summo bono. It says:
That there is no more excellent state [of life] (status) than to dedicate oneself to philosophy.
No reason is given why it is wrong, but the bishop and his men probably thought that a life in holy orders or as a theologian ought to be considered a more excellent status.
In the 1290s the wealthy scholar Geoffrey of Fontaines personally wrote down abridgments of Boethius’ Modi Significandi, the questions on Topics and De anima I–II, as well as the opuscula (see the introductions to the editions).
Modi significandi had a considerable diffusion, evidenced by six extant copies from the thirteenth, five from the fourteenth, and two from the fifteenth century. Strong influence from Boethius has been detected in the anonymous question commentary on Priscian Minor known as Innata est nobis, where he is referred to as “a famous man” (Pinborg 1967: 93–4). The Summa grammatica of John of Dacia (1280), while more dependent on Martin of Dacia’s Modi significandi, also owes a considerable debt to Boethius (Pinborg 1967: 87). According to Pinborg (1967: 91–2), Boethius further left his mark on Michael of Marbais’ Summa de modis significandi, but this has been called in doubt (Kelly 1995: XLV).
Questions on the Topics had a fair number of readers for a long time, surviving in eleven manuscripts from the thirteenth to the fifteenth centuries plus Geoffrey’s abridgement, and being quoted as late as the fifteenth century (Green-Pedersen 1984: 388–9).
The commentaries on Physics, On Generation and Corruption (“GC”), Meteorology and De anima are only preserved in one manuscript each, and so, presumably, had little impact. Those on Physics and GC, which are transmitted in the same manuscript, repeatedly deal with controversial matters like the eternity of the world. The last question on GC has been rendered almost entirely unreadable by overlining, presumably the owner’s reaction to the 1277 condemnation, for the title of the question was “Whether the first movement can be perpetual” and from what remains of the question it is clear that Boethius argued that, scientifically speaking, the world cannot be “new”, although according to faith it is so. Other copies of the two works must have existed, but fear of being denounced to ecclesiastical authorities may have stopped the production of new ones after the condemnation.
Traces of Boethius’ lost questions on the Metaphysics have been discovered in an anonymous set of questions that may be from the 1270’s (Fioravanti 2009). Only a handful of manuscripts transmit De aeternitate mundi and the same is true of De somniis, whereas there is a score of text witnesses to De summo bono, whose success was helped by a common misattribution to the famous sixth-century Roman Manlius Boethius, and in some manuscripts to Thomas Aquinas. Finally, only one manuscript carries the sophisma Syllogizantem, while Omnis homo … is found in two, but in one of them the text has been revised and enlarged by a slightly later scholar.
The 1277 condemnation did not make arts masters stop praising the philosopher’s life in the introductory lecture with which they habitually began every question course on an authoritative book, and in practice most kept Boethius’ distinction between science and faith, though without his provocative formulations.
There is no book-length study of the philosophy of Boethius of Dacia. A comprehensive treatment is found in Ebbesen 2002, but, being in Danish, it is accessible to rather few. A good short introduction is found in Pinborg 1974; see also Ebbesen 1998: 282–6. The main features of his thought are covered in Lanza and Toste 2011 and in Donati 2017. For Boethius’s theory of language, see in particular Pinborg 1967, Rosier (Rosier-Catach) 1983, Marmo 1994, Beuerle 2010.
EditionsSee section 2, above.
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