Chinese Philosophy of Change (Yijing)

First published Fri Mar 29, 2019

This article discusses the Chinese philosophy of change based on the Yijing (I Ching, Book of Changes). A canonized Confucian classic, the Yijing is a composite text consisting of three distinct layers. Its first layer is comprised by the 8 trigrams and 64 hexagrams allegedly created by the mythical figure, Fu Xi (see the images of trigrams and hexagrams in Appendixes 1 and 2). Its second layer are the hexagram statements and line statements allegedly written by King Wen and the Duke of Zhou during the 11th century BCE (see the names of the 64 hexagrams in Appendix 3). Its third layer incorporates seven pieces of writings composed from 5th to 2nd century BCE. Divided into ten segments (hence, the name “Ten Wings”), the authors of these writings used the hexagrams to discuss cosmic patterns, the relations between humanity and nature, and the complexity of human life (see the list of the “Ten Wings” in Appendix 4). By 125 BCE, these three textual layers were combined to form what we now call the Yijing. For a detailed account of the textual history of Yijing, see Nylan 2001: 202–52; Redmond and Hon 2014: 1–157; Richard Smith 2012: 1–47.

Underlying the Yijing philosophy of change is the notion that the cosmos is an organismic process without beginning or end. As a process, the cosmos resembles a great flow in which “all of the parts of the entire cosmos belong to one organic whole” and all the parts “interact as participants in one spontaneously self-generating process” (Tu 1985: 35). As such, there are three characteristics of this great flow: continuity, wholeness, and dynamism. It is continuous because it never stops in renewing itself. It is holistic because it includes everything in the universe and permeates in all aspects of life. It is dynamic because it is full of motion and movement, generating energy and strength all the time (Tu 1985: 38–39). In this cosmic flow, there is no distinction between the following: the natural realm and the human realm, an observing subject and an observed object, and the inner world and the outer world. Everything is part of a totality, a group dance that never stops.

To the Yijing commentators, the unfolding of the universe is vividly portrayed in the 8 trigrams and 64 hexagrams. For instance, they see the 8 trigrams (☰, ☱, ☲, ☳, ☴, ☵, ☶, ☷) as graphic representations of the mixing of the yin and yang cosmic forces (or qi, energy). With different combinations of a straight line (—) representing the yang cosmic force, and a broken line (‒ ‒) representing the yin cosmic force, a trigram symbolizes the cosmos’ constant renewal and its creation of the myriad things. Similarly, a hexagram is also a symbol of the unfolding of the universe. For example, a hexagram can be divided into two trigrams: the lower trigram (lines 1–3) and the upper trigram (lines 4–6). With two trigrams, a hexagram symbolizes the interaction of two sets of yin-yang configuration, demonstrating the multiple ways in which the yin and yang forces interact and transform each other. Or, one takes the lower two lines of a hexagram as representing the earth (di), the middle two lines as representing humankind (ren), and the top two lines as representing heaven (tian). Then, we have a trigram within a hexagram. Known as the “three potencies” (san cai), the relation of heaven, earth, and humankind highlights the co-dependence between the natural realm (tian and di) and the human realm (ren).

1. Human Finitude

With trigrams and hexagrams as symbols of the “three potencies”, the starting point of Yijing philosophy is the acceptance of human finitude. On the one hand, the “three potencies” highlight the limits of human beings in shaping the natural environment. On the other, they empower human beings to pursue their goals if they are willing to adapt to the natural environment. For instance, in Xici (one of the “Ten Wings”), the authors point out that in the oracles there were encouraging words such as “auspicious” (ji) and “without blame” (wujiu), and stern warnings against “calamity” (xiong), “blame” (jiu), “regret” (hui) and “remorse” (lin) (Xici I: 3, 7). These contrasting prognostications highlight the harsh reality of human existence. In some incidents, the wind of luck is on our side; whatever we do seems to go well. But in other incidents, we are clearly out of luck: no matter how hard we try, we are doomed to failure.

To elucidate what they mean by the harsh reality of human existence, the Xici authors identify the period when hexagrams were used in divination. They write:

The Changes came into use in the period of middle antiquity. Those who composed the Changes had fear and anxiety. (Xici II: 7; WB: 345, with modifications)

Here, the Xici authors link the popularity of hexagram divination to the momentous transition when the mandate of heaven (tianming)—the power to rule China—was abruptly passed from the Shang family to the Zhou family. To highlight the importance of divination in assuaging human fear, the Xici authors coin two terms—fear (you) and anxiety (huan)—to describe the different states of human apprehension of uncertainty. To further clarify what fear and anxiety mean, the Xici authors write:

The time at which the Change came to the fore was that in which the house of Yin [Shang] came to an end and the way of the house of Zhou 周 was rising, that is, the time when King Wen and the tyrant Zhou 紂 were pitted against each other. This is why the hexagram statements of the book so frequently warn against danger. He who is conscious of danger creates peace for himself, he who takes things lightly creates his own downfall. (Xici II:11; WB: 352, with modifications)

Directly linking the popularity of hexagram divination to the epic battle between the last ruler of Shang (King Zhou) and the first ruler of Zhou (King Wen), the Xici authors see hexagrams as stern warnings against danger and downfall. In these warnings, hexagrams provoked fear by reminding readers—typically, those involved in government—of the disastrous consequences of bad decisions and reckless moves (such as the tyrant Zhou’s brutality that led to the downfall of the Shang). They also instilled anxiety by calling attention to the vulnerability of human beings and the randomness in human fate (such as the sudden fall of the Shang and the unexpected rise of the Zhou). Whether provoking fear or instilling anxiety, the effect of hexagram divination is the same. It forces readers to reflect on their arrogance, complacency and self-indulgence. It shocks them to look for ways to come to terms with contingency and serendipity. Above all, it directs attention to the dark side of human existence such as disease, deformation, degeneration, and death (Redmond & Hon 2014: 128–139).

For the Xici’s authors, it did not matter whether danger and downfall happened in the political realm or in one’s body. The truth of the matter is that human beings have little control of their fate. At the same time, the Xici’s authors also sought to console nervous readers, assuring them that if they learnt to read hexagrams properly, they will discern the pattern behind incessant changes. They write:

The Changes is a book from which one may not hold aloof. Its dao [i.e., pattern] is forever changing—alternating, movement without rest, flowing through the six empty places [of a hexagram]; rising and sinking without fixed law, firm and yielding transform each other. They cannot be confined within a rule; it is only change that is at work here. They move inward and outward according to fixed rhythms. Without and within, they teach caution. They also show care and sorrow and their causes. Though you have no teacher, approach them as you would your parents. (“Xici” II: 7; WB: 348–49, with modifications)

Seen in this light, the 64 hexagrams are no longer oracles. They become symbols of the constant movements in the universe and the ceaseless changes in one’s life. More important, they point to the intricate networks of factors or forces—from near to far away, from simple to complicated, from visible to invisible—that shape movements and changes.

Take, for instance, Qian ䷀ (The Creative #1). The line statements depict the six yang lines as a dragon in various positions—a “hidden dragon” in line one at the bottom, an “emerging dragon” in line two, a “wavering dragon” in line four, a “flying dragon” in line five, and an “arrogant dragon” in line six at the top (see Appendix 5). In addition, the line statements suggest a correspondence between the dragon’s position and a proper course of action: the “hidden dragon” should avoid taking aggressive action, the “emerging dragon” and the “flying dragon” should seek help from “a great man”, the “wavering dragon” should take flight over the depths despite the danger and apparent risks, and the “arrogant dragon” will regret being stubborn and excessively confident. But, as a hexagram, Qian is ambiguous. On the one hand, in five of its six lines, the tone seems to be upbeat, projecting an impression of an incessant progress from a hidden dragon to an emerging dragon, a wavering dragon and finally a flying dragon. On the other hand, the progression is abruptly cut short by the downfall of an arrogant dragon. Like a Greek tragedy, the rapid fall of the arrogant dragon suggests hubris, highlighting the danger of excessive human pride in making strenuous efforts to pull oneself up.

In Tuan (another piece of the “Ten Wings”), the authors emphasize the importance of mounting of the six dragons of Qian in a timely fashion (shi cheng liu long) (for a translation of the Tuan statement, see WB: 370–72). By mounting of the six dragons in a timely fashion, the Tuan authors mean two things. First, they view the six lines of Qian as constantly changing their positions. Even if one strictly follows the incremental progress from a hidden dragon (the first line) to an emerging dragon (the second line) to a flying dragon (the fifth line), upon reaching the top (an arrogant dragon), one must go back down to a hidden dragon and to start all over again. Second, the Tuan authors suggest readers choose a dragon most suitable to them, such as to assume the position of a hidden dragon when starting a new business or beginning a new career, to act like an emerging dragon after receiving recognition from peers or bosses, to be like a wavering dragon when making crucial transition in career or location, to be like a flying dragon when everything seems to be flourishing, and last but not least, to avoid becoming an arrogant dragon when everything looks perfect but a decline is imminent.

In short, the Tuan authors urge readers to view Qian metaphorically as a spatial-temporal grid to reflect on their surroundings, to look for alternatives, and to anticipate dangers and pitfalls. As such, Qian becomes a symbol of the ever-changing universe. It is particularly helpful when we are at a critical juncture of our lives. At that moment—one may say, the Yijing moment—we feel especially vulnerable and fragile, because we are reminded of the confluence of factors that shape our lives and the dangers of making a wrong decision. On the other hand, Qian also suggest that we act decisively to “mount the six dragons in a timely manner”. Once we mount the six dragons, we become part of the great flow of the universe. We may be a hidden dragon or an arrogant dragon when we enter the great flow, but as we are swept along by the current, we should find our position, our rhythm, our trajectory. In the end, the key point is not when and how we enter the great flow of the universe, but what we become and what we achieve after we join the great flow.

2. Three Approaches to Philosophize Change

In the “Ten Wings”, different authors offer different strategies for individuals to find their roles in the great flow of the universe. For instance, the Shuogua authors suggest that a person should focus on the 8 trigrams as symbols of the unfolding of the universe, such as Gen ☶ representing mountain, Li ☲ representing fire, Kan ☵ representing water, and Zheng ☳ representing thunder (for a summary of the main argument of Shuagua, see WB: 356–65). Like the “Five Agents” (metal, wood, water, fire, and earth), the eight trigrams graphically denote the basic elements of the universe that produce the myriad things. The Shuogua authors also propose that we think of the 8 trigrams as symbols of directions, strategically placed in the east-south-west-north grid. With the cosmic grand scheme in mind, the Shuohua authors urge us to find solace in the rises and falls in human life.

Whereas the Shuogua authors focus on the 8 trigrams, the Xugua authors pay special attention to the sequence of the 64 hexagrams (for a full translation of Xugua, see Lynn 1994: 103–110). In rationalizing the hexagram sequences, the Xugua authors match the order of hexagrams with key moments of human evolution, beginning with the construction of a primitive community to the establishment of a patrilineal family structure based on gender distinctions and matrimony. Later, the patrilineal family structure is further expanded into a complex socio-political system based on the distinctions between kings and officials, and rulers and ruled. While this process of development seems inevitable, occasionally the Xugua authors call attention to challenges and obstacles in maintaining a stable community. They identify moments where the socio-political order is corrupt (Kui #38 and Jian #39) or disintegrated (Huan #59). Because of the danger of corruption and disintegration, the Xugua authors emphasize the need for renewing the socio-political order by replacing corrupt leaders (Ge #49) and re-structuring the entire system (Ding #50). Nevertheless, occasional interruptions do not interfere with or slow down the steady progress of humankind. Based on this epic saga, the Xugua authors place the fortune and misfortune of individuals in the longue durée of human evolution. Accidents, irritant behaviors, unexpected occurrences, and unplanned actions are absorbed and rationalized in the onward march of humankind.

If one just reads the Shuogua and the Xugua, divination does not seem to have a role in decision making. One makes decisions based on either the confluence of cosmic forces or the longue durée of human evolution. But in the Xici, divination is important. In fact, an extended passage is devoted to discussing how to perform divination with 50 yarrow stalks (Xici I: 8, more about it later). In addition, the Xici authors identify divination as one of four ways to use the hexagrams: (1) to use the hexagram statements and line statements as warnings against danger and downfall; (2) to use the changes in trigrams and hexagrams to understand the ceaseless changes in the natural realm and the human realm; (3) to use hexagram images to enhance rulers’ authority; (4) to use divination to provoke inquirers to think more deeply about their choices (Xici I: 9; WB: 314). Based on these four-fold uses of hexagrams, the Xici authors highlight the broad appeal of the Yijing. It can be a book of “wisdom” (zhi) for those who are interested in pondering the causes and patterns of change; it can be a book of “kindness” (ren) for those who are interested in improving the political order; it can be a book of “life” (riyong) for those who just want to live, overcome obstacles, and make fewer mistakes (Xici I: 4; WB: 298). These three approaches—the cosmological, the political, and the existential—formed the bases for Yijing commentators to philosophize change. Over the two thousand years after the canonization of the Yijing in 125 BCE, commentators developed three distinct views toward change—the cosmology of change, the ontology of change, and the moral-metaphysics of change.

3. The Cosmology of Change

Rulers of the Han dynasty (206 BCE–220 CE) were obsessed with building an eternal empire, a humanly-made system that not only mimicked the recurrent pattern of the universe but also responded proactively to the ebb and flow of cosmic forces (Pines 2009, 2012). This everlasting structure was stable and flexible, massive and specific, synchronizing human activities for the unfolding of the universe. Its goal was to merge the natural and human realms, such that the two became one and the same (Loewe 1994, 2005; Wang 2000).

Known as correlative cosmology, the purpose behind this fusion of the natural and human realms was to focus attention on “the mutual responsiveness of heaven and humanity” (Queen 1996: 1–53). This mutual responsiveness of nature and humankind was based on two assumptions. First, the cosmos is orderly and stable. Its orderliness and stability are shown in the regular succession in time, such as the four seasons, the twelve months, the 365¼ days. Second, the same orderliness of the natural world is found in the human realm in the forms of life cycles, the rhythm of work and rest, and the rise and fall of family fortunes. Despite the vicissitudes on the surface, the natural and human worlds are balanced, systematic and predictable. They are perfect mirrors of each other, such that when one moves, the other responds.

The goal of correlative cosmology was not to develop a comprehensive understanding of the universe. Rather, it was to legitimize the transition “from the concept of imperial sovereignty based on might into the need to support a claim to rule with intellectual sanctions” (Loewe 1994: 121–41). Thus, the emperor was said to be the crucial link between the natural and human realms. In fact, according to the Han scholar Dong Zhongshu (ca. 195–105 BCE), the Chinese character for king (王) reflected the solemn responsibility of the emperor (symbolized by the vertical stroke in the middle) for connecting the three potencies ☰: heaven (tian), earth (di) and humankind (ren) (Redmond & Hon 2014: 159–61). As such, the emperor was indeed the Son of Heaven (tianzi) who was omnicompetent, omnipotent and omniscient (Loewe 2011; Queen 1996).

To support absolutism, Han commentators transformed the Yijing into a cosmological manual reflecting the ebb and flow of cosmic forces. They earnestly reorganized the hexagram sequence to match the cosmic rhythm, demonstrating that the natural and human realms are one and the same. Although most of the writings of the Han commentators are lost, in an 8th-9th century text, Zhouyi jijie (A Collection of Explanations on the Changes of Zhou Dynasty) edited by Li Dingzuo, we have glimpses of the ambition of the Han commentators who spent their lives fathoming the cosmos and ordering the world (R. Smith 2008: 57–88).

For instance, Jing Fang (77–37 BCE) created the Hexagrams of Eight Palaces (ba gong gua): Qian ䷀, Kun ䷁, Zhen ䷲, Xun ䷸, Kan ䷜, Li ䷝, Gen ䷳, Dui ䷹. These eight palace hexagrams are the doubles of the eight trigrams. For Jing, each of these palace hexagrams leads a group of seven hexagrams. For example, Qian ䷀ leads ䷫, ䷠, ䷋, ䷓, ䷖, ䷢, ䷍. In this new alignment of hexagrams, there is both a steady increase or decrease of the yin and yang cosmic forces, and the the hidden power of the two forces even when they are dormant (for the new sequence of 64 hexagrams based on eight palaces, see Nielson 2003: 3).

Another new sequence of hexagrams was the “waning and waxing hexagrams” (xiaoxi gua) perfected by Yu Fan (164–233). Representing the ebb and flow of the yin and yang cosmic forces, the “waning and waxing hexagrams” go as follows:

Fu ䷗[24]Lin ䷒[19]Tai ䷊[11]Dazhuang ䷡[34]Guai  ䷪[43]Qian  ䷀[1]Gou ䷫[44]Dun ䷠[33]Pi ䷋[12]Guan ䷓[20]Bo ䷖[23]Kun ䷁[2] (back to Fu)

When reading from Fu to Qian, the yang force gradually increases while the yin force decreases. When reading from Gou to Kun, the yin force increases while the yang force decreases. As a system, the twelve hexagrams are continuous. When the series ends with Kun, it begins anew with Fu (Nielson 2003: 275–76).

By developing these new hexagram sequences, the Han Yijing commentators wanted to achieve two goals. First, they freed themselves from the original sequence of the 64 hexagrams that was, to them, incoherent and inconsistent. To the Han commentators, the problem of the original sequence was its failure in lining up hexagrams in accordance with their graphic images. By creating new sequences, the Han scholars were able to match perfectly the hexagram images with the ebb and flow of cosmic forces (Redmond & Hon 2014: 159–163). Second, with the new sequences, the Han commentators were better equipped to synchronize the hexagrams with the lunar calendar, showing a direct correspondence between the ebb and flow of the cosmic forces and the cycles of life in human society (R. Smith 2008: 62–77). For instance, the “waning and waxing hexagrams” were assigned to represent months in the lunar calendar: Fu ䷗ (the eleventh month), Lin ䷒ (the twelfth month), Tai ䷊ (the first month of the following year), Dazhuang ䷡ (the second month), Guai ䷪ (the third month), Qian ䷀ (the fourth month), Gou ䷫ (the fifth month), Dun ䷠ (the sixth month), Pi ䷋ (the seventh month), Guan ䷓ (the eighth month), Bo ䷖ (the ninth month), and Kun ䷁ (the tenth month) (Nielson 2003: 275–76). The same could be done for the hexagrams sequence based on the eight palaces. By matching the new sequence of the 64 hexagrams with 12 months, the Han commentators allotted eight months to four hexagrams and four months to eight hexagrams (Nielson 2003: 5).

To Han commentators, while the new hexagram sequences highlighted certainty in the universe’s self-renewal, each hexagram represented the possibility of coping with the changing environment. These differing functions addressed a fundamental question in ruling a huge empire: How to formulate flexible policies while keeping a semblance of unity and uniformity? To give themselves flexibility in interpreting hexagrams, the Han commentators created new interpretive strategies. One common strategy called for linking one hexagram to four hexagrams. Take, for instance, Qian ䷀ (The Creative, #1). To interpret the hexagram, one can link it to its opposite, Kun ䷁ (The Receptive, #2), known as “laterally linked hexagrams” (pangtong) (Nielson 2003: 185–88). In addition, Qian can also be read along with its preceding hexagram and following hexagram in accordance with the sequence of the “waning and waxing hexagrams”. So, Qian can be read in relation to Guai ䷪ (Resolution, #43), its antecedent, and Gou ䷫ (Encounter, #44), its posterior. And then, within a hexagram, one can also create “interlocking trigrams” (hugua or huti), that is, using four or five of the hexagram lines to form two new trigrams (Nielson 2003: 111–14). In the case of Qian, it is not possible to create “interlocking trigrams” due to all six lines being yang. But in other cases, the “interlocking trigrams” are significant in deciphering the meaning of a hexagram. Take, for instance, Ge ䷰ (Radical Change, #49). Its second, third, and fourth lines form a Sun trigram ☴ and its third, four, and fifth form a Qian trigram ☰ Combining Sun and Qian forms Gou ䷫ (Encounter, #44)

Another strategy of expanding the scope of interpretation was to turn a hexagram into a different one by transposing some of its lines. Known as “changing the positions of hexagram lines” (yiwei), this strategy allowed Han scholars to introduce other hexagrams when having problems interpreting a hexagram. For instance, Tai ䷊ (Peace, #11) can become Jiji ䷾ (Ferrying Complete #63) by transposing its second line (a yang) and its fifth line (a yin). Likewise, Dazhuang ䷡ (Great Strength, #34) can turn into Xu ䷄ (Waiting, #5) by switching its fourth line (a yang) and its fifth line (a yin). Much more versatile than other methods, the transposition of hexagram lines gave Han commentators the liberty to inject a broad range of alternatives when interpreting a hexagram.

Thus, by giving themselves flexibility in interpreting hexagrams, the Han commentators reaffirmed the orderliness, stability and predictability of the cosmic and human realms. They transformed the Yijing into a cosmological manual to match the rhythm of cosmic forces. In doing so, the Han commentators suppressed and externalized the human fear of uncertainty. They suppressed fear by focusing attention on the repeated rhythm of the universe, as evidenced by the seasonal changes and the passage of time from month to month. They externalized fear by concentrating on the grand scheme of the universe’s renewal that did not seem to give room to uncertainty or rupture. More important, by matching the cosmic realm with the human rhythm, they created an illusion that the Yijing was a ruler’s playbook to fathom the cosmos and order the world (Ch’en 1986: 798–801; R. Smith 2008: 62–88).

4. The Ontology of Change

But the fall of the Han dynasty in 220 CE reveals a fundamental problem of correlative cosmology, namely, human beings are incapable of fully discerning the cosmic pattern, nor can they completely apply the cosmic pattern to human affairs. Even if they tried to mimic the cosmic rhythm in governing the human world, the human world is far too complicated for anyone to handle. In the following seven hundred years, Yijing scholars retreated from fathoming the cosmos. Instead, they turned their attention to ordering the human world and looked for its deep structure.

The major figure who started this turn to the human world was Wang Bi (226–249). Born six years after the collapse of the Han dynasty, Wang Bi was thrown into a situation in which there seemed to be few certainties in life. With China divided into three separate kingdoms—the Wei, the Shu, and the Wu—there was widespread disorder in the country. When everything was in ruin, fewer and fewer people followed the Confucian precepts of honesty, loyalty and filial piety. Instead, trickery, usurpation and pragmatic calculation became the accepted strategies for survival. Apparently, Wang Bi’s experience after the collapse of the Han dynasty brought him face to face with fear and anxiety—the two recurrent themes in the Yijing (Hon 2010). Before his premature death at the age of 23, Wang wrote a commentary on the Yijing along with a commentary on the Laozi. Attached to his Yijing commentary, the Zhouyi zhu (A Commentary on the Changes of Zhou Dynasty), were seven essays in which he discussed how to read the classic. In these essays (rendered as “General Remarks on the Changes of the Zhou” by Richard John Lynn, see Lynn 1994: 25–39), he revisited themes that had been discussed in the Xici, including what a hexagram symbolizes and what the six lines of a hexagram tell us about human existence. In these essays, he presented a notion of change that was completely new.

First and foremost, unlike the Han commentators, Wang Bi did not consider the hexagram sequence as important. Instead, he regards each of the 64 hexagrams as a discrete situation. Furthermore, he points out that the uniqueness of each hexagram is succinctly summarized in Tuan (one of the “Ten Wings”), such as Zhun ䷂ (Difficulty at the Beginning #3) discusses the difficulty when someone starts an endeavor, Meng ䷃ (Youthful Folly, #4) focuses on how a teacher hone his or her skills in teaching; Xu ䷄ (Waiting #5) suggests a pause to reflect on one’s precarious situation (“Ming Tuan”, Lynn 1994: 25–27). As such, readers do not have to strictly follow the hexagram sequence in reading hexagrams. They can pick and choose hexagrams that appear to directly address questions in mind. No matter which hexagrams they pick, the key point is to see a hexagram as a field of action where different forces or players interact.

Thus, for Wang Bi, the purpose of reading hexagrams is to reflect on one’s situation (“Mingyao tongbian”, Lynn 1994: 27–29). The six lines of a hexagram—even a bad one like Gu ䷑ (Ills to Be Cured, #18)—offer options to respond to a situation. They represent the room to maneuver within a system or the possibilities of altering an existing power structure. Precisely in this juncture that exists between what is already configurated and what can be changed, Wang Bi sees the fluidity of human affairs. With proper action, one can turn what appears to be a failure into a blessing. Conversely, lacking appropriate action, one can make what appears to be flourishing into a disaster.

For this reason, Wang Bi does not find the inauspicious hexagram Sun ䷨ (Diminution, #41) terribly frightening (Lynn 1994: 387–96). Judging from its hexagram image and line statements, Sun suggests a situation where those who are high up take advantage of those who are in lower positions, or those who are physically strong victimize those who are weak. Yet, despite the injustice denoted in the hexagram, Wang Bi believes there is still room for optimism. “Supreme good fortune” will come, he declares, if someone finds ways to benefit the public. Similarly, the “oppressions” in hexagram Kun ䷮ (Impasse, #47) are avoidable (Lynn 1994: 428–37). Judging from its line statements, Kun is hopeless. All of its six lines are plagued with some form of oppression: the first line is buried under a barren tree, the second line is burdened with excessive drinking and eating, the third line is caught in rocks, the fourth line is locked in a golden carriage, the fifth line is bullied by a man with purple knee bands, and the sixth line is wrapped by creeping vines. Yet Wang Bi argues that by making the right decision one can reverse what seems to be an oppressive situation into an opportunity for growth and advancement.

By stressing human agency and activism, Wang Bi sees hexagrams as pointers, directing our attention to the source of human creativity and ingenuity. As pointers, hexagrams and hexagram lines serve different functions. While a hexagram connotes a field of action, the six hexagram lines stand for the six players (or the six options) in that field of action (“Minggua shibian tongyao”, Lynn 1994: 29–31). Symbolizing the whole, a hexagram represents a web of relations governing the actions and interactions of the six players. Symbolizing the parts, hexagram lines represent what the six players can or cannot do to advance their interests. Hence, in reading hexagrams, Yijing readers are constantly reminded that every aspect of human life, big or small, is governed by the part-whole relationship. To cope with change, Wang Bi asserts, we must find out the part-whole relationship in each given situation—be it in family, society, or a solitary quest for spiritual communion with nature.

In his comments on the Xici I:9 (preserved by Han Kangbo [332–380]), Wang Bi explains this intricate relationship between part and whole. Originally a passage about divination, Xici I:9 begins with a discussion of selecting a hexagram by counting 50 yarrow stalks. Known as “the number of Great Expansion” (dayan zhishu), the selection includes a step wherein the diviner separates the 50 yarrow stalks into two piles: (a) a group of 49 stalks that will be used to select a hexagram, and (b) an unused stalk that will be set aside in the rest of the divination procedure (for a translation of this passage, see WB: 310–315). Wang Bi views the group of 49 stalks as you (Being) and the unused stalk as wu (Non-Being). He said,

After expanding the numbers of Heaven and Earth, we find that the ones that are of benefit to us number fifty, and of these we actually use forty-nine, thus leaving one unused. Although this one is not used, yet through it the use of the other numbers becomes readily possible, and, although this one is not one of the numbers, yet through it the other numbers are formed. As this one represents the supreme ultimate of change, the other forty-nine constitute the ultimate of numbers. Non-being [wu] cannot be brought to light by means of non-being [wu] but must take place through being [you]. Therefore, by applying ourselves constantly to this ultimate among things that have being [you], we shall surely bring to light the primogenitor from which all things derive. (Lynn 1994: 60–61, with modifications)

In the studies of Neo-Daoism of the Wei-Jin period (220–589), scholars usually consider you (Being) and wu (Non-being) as a dichotomy, either as a contrast between the totality of the universe (Dao) and the myriad things, or as a differentiation between the principle governing the generation and regeneration of the universe (li) and the manifestations of that principle in the activities of animate beings (Chan 1963 [1969: 314–324]; Graham 1959; Schipper 1982 [1993: 192–208]). This dichotomy may be accurate in discussing Neo-Daoism in general and Wang Bi’s commentary to the Laozi in particular. But in Wang Bi’s Yijing commentary, he sees you (Being) and wu (Non-being) as co-dependent (Tang 2015: 51–59; Wagner 2003: 83–147; Yu 2007: 116–148, 204–240). He argues that the one unused stalk symbolizes wu (Non-being), and the forty-nine used stalks stand for you (Being). On the one hand, you depends on wu because the forty-nine yarrow stalks become useful only when they are utilized in casting a hexagram. On the other hand, wu cannot fulfill itself without you because there is no way to perform a divination without the 49 yarrow stalks. As wu, the practice of divination gives unity and coherence to the act of throwing of the 49 yarrow stalks. As you, the act of throwing the 49 yarrow stalks makes divination possible.

One may argue that Wang Bi’s reading of hexagrams limits the Yijing to concrete human affairs. Unlike the Han commentators, Wang Bi had little interest in cosmology and rejected any attempt to match the cosmic realm with the human realm. But in seeing hexagrams as pointers revealing the co-dependence of part and whole, substance and function, Wang Bi reminds us that the Yijing is meant to be read metaphorically. In focusing on hexagrams as pointers—pointing toward something hidden, implicit and yet fundamental—he avoids the mistake of the Han commentators who turn the Yijing into a copious system of signs to document the multifarious changes in the universe. To him, the Han scholars’ attempt is futile because they do not accept the basic tenet of the Yijing—the limits of human knowledge (“Ming Xiang”, Lynn 1994: 31–32).

5. The Moral-Metaphysics of Change

Wang Bi’s Yijing commentary became the standard for interpreting the classic throughout mid-imperial China. Its august status was confirmed by the state-approved Zhouyi zhengyi (The True Meanings of Changes of the Zhou Dynasty) edited by Kong Yingda (574–648). Throughout the Tang dynasty (618–907) and the Song dynasty (960–1126), knowledge of Wang Bi’s Yijing commentary was tested in civil service examinations. Its longevity as the standard Yijing commentary indicated consensus among the Chinese elite that attention must be paid to solving the pressing problems in the country rather than building an eternal empire that mimicked the cosmic rhythm (Hon 2004, 2005; R. Smith 2008: 89–139).

However, while Wang Bi criticized the Han commentators for being overly ambitious in blending the natural and human realms, he was also overly ambitious in using human reason to discern the hidden principle of human affairs. Whereas Han commentators suppressed and externalized the human fear of uncertainty, Wang also suppressed and externalized the same fear. In viewing hexagrams as fields of action, he suppressed the fear by absorbing it into part-whole relations in human affairs. By turning hexagrams into pointers, he externalized the fear by connecting it to a search for the principle of change in the rises and falls of human life. In the end, both the Han scholars and Wang Bi were hubristic in assuming they were omniscient.

In contrast, Zhu Xi (1130–1200)—a key figure of the Cheng-Zhu School of Neo-Confucianism of late imperial China—argued that the “original meaning” (benyi) of Yijing was divination. On the surface of it, Zhu Xi’s argument seemed redundant. It had been well-known that the first two layers of the classics were oracles originating from the Western Zhou period. But Zhu Xi’s point was that for more than a thousand years since the canonization of the Yijing, the classic had never been read properly as a divination manual. For this reason, Zhu Xi believed that the true meaning of Yijing lay in the imagery of the 64 hexagrams. To distinguish the 64 hexagrams from the “Ten Wings”, Zhu Xi created two separate categories in his commentary, the Zhouyi benyi (The Original Meaning of the Changes of the Zhou Dynasty). One category was the “classic” (jing) which covered the 64 hexagrams; the other the “commentarial materials” (zhuan) which included the “Ten Wings”. With these two categories, Zhu made clear that the “Ten Wings” were at best supplementary materials in understanding the hexagrams.

Underlying his view was a different understanding of the formation of the Yijing. Unlike other Yijing commentators, Zhu did not see the classic as an evolution from divination to philosophy. For him, the sixty-four hexagrams are the foundation of the Yijing because they are symbols of the constant changes in the natural and human worlds. This pictorial depiction of transformation—started by Fu Xi and completed by King Wen and the Duke of Zhou—was later turned into a discussion of cosmology and morality by Confucian scholars. As a result, the Yijing ceased to be a pictorial description of the awesome and awe-inspiring transformation in the universe; it became merely another text (like the Book of Poetry and the Book of History in the Confucian canon) that taught morality to kings, nobles and government officials (Hon 2008).

By privileging Fu Xi’s hexagrams over Confucius’s “Ten Wings”, Zhu Xi wanted to achieve two goals. First, he underscored the importance of divination as a method of self-cultivation. For him, divination is not a superstitious act of seeking guidance from a supernatural power. Rather, it is an enriching experience of encountering the unknown and unfathomable. In the process of divination, one faces the multiple forces that shape human life, and thereby becomes aware of the opportunities and resources for improving one’s situation. As Joseph Adler observes, divination is “a way of learning” to Zhu Xi because it helps learners “‘respond’ (ying) to ‘incipient’ change (chi), both in external events and in the mind” (Adler 1990: 190). Second, by focusing on the visual imagery of the hexagrams, Zhu Xi saw the Yijing as significantly different from other Confucian classics. Rather than limiting to kings, nobles and government officials, the Yijing appeals to a broad audience who, literate or illiterate, are concerned with uncertainties in life (Hon 2011).

For this reason, Zhu Xi emphasized the ambiguity of line statements. To highlight their ambiguity, he divided the line statements into two separate utterances: a summary of the image of the hexagram line (xiang), and a prognostication based on a careful consideration of the image of the hexagram line (zhan). By dividing a line statement into two parts, Zhu Xi turns a line statement into a dialogue between the oracle’s calling to attention and the reader’s response. In this hermeneutical circle, nothing is certain or preordained. The conversation can lead in many directions, sometimes predictable and sometimes unpredictable.

On the surface of it, like Wang Bi, Zhu Xi appears to use the Yijing to provoke readers to reflect on their surroundings. However, there is one fundamental difference. For Zhu Xi, a reading of the Yijing does not necessarily answer all questions or solve all problems. Rather, it heightens the reader’s sensitivity to the uncertainty and serendipity of human existence. For instance, Ge ䷰ (Radical Change, #49) and Ding ䷱ (The Cauldron, #50) are known for highlighting the anxiety and fear in a drastic political change. In Ge, the reader is encouraged to lead a revolt against a tyrant ruler who is causing harm to the public. To underscore the urgency of addressing the political crisis, the revolt is compared to the renewal of lives in seasonal changes; it is paired with the pivotal event of the Shang dynasty being replaced by the Zhou dynasty. Above all, it is described as a timely intervention in human affairs to restore order for the benefit of the masses (for a translation of Ge, see WB: 189–192). While Ge advocates a regime change, Ding demands the restoration of political order immediately following the revolt. Graphically, the six lines of Ding ䷱ resemble a cauldron—the bottom line represents the legs of the cauldron; the second to fourth lines symbolize the belly of the cauldron; the fifth line denotes the ears of the cauldron, and the top line suggests the bar that carries the cauldron from place to place. Thus, the reader is encouraged to clean the cauldron to make food, or, in the aftermath of a regime change, to immediately re-establish the political order (for a translation of Ding, see WB: 195–97).

For centuries, the Yijing’s commentators heeded the Xugua authors’ advice to read Ge and Ding together as two phases of a regime change (see WB: 635, 641). While Ge discusses the destructive phase of toppling an old regime, Ding refers to the constructive phase of rebuilding the political order. The two hexagrams jointly call attention to the danger of political corruption, the fear of a tyrant, and the anxiety of losing control amid political upheaval. More important, the two hexagrams highlight the importance of making the right decision amidst power struggles. For this reason, through the centuries, Ge and Ding received special attention from commentators who were interested in political philosophy (see, for instance, Wang Bi’s commentary in Lynn 1994: 444–59).

For Zhu Xi, however, there was no need to connect Ge with Ding. Instead, he sees them as separate situations where readers can ask different questions and express different concerns. For him, the anxiety and fear in the Yijing appear not in the hexagram sequence, but in the dialogue between the oracle and the reader. To downplay the political connotations of these two hexagrams, Zhu Xi stresses the intensity of the oracle-reader dialogue. Take, for example, the hexagram statement of Ge which seems to suggest the possibility of “the disappearance of remorse” (huiwang) after political change. For Zhu, there is no way to tell whether “the disappearance of remorse” is possible without considering the reader’s situation. If the reader is doing the right things, then remorse will automatically disappear. But if the reader is making a mistake, remorse will remain. Hence, “the disappearance of remorse” is provisional; whether the oracle will come true rests in reader’s motive, sincerity and action. Similarly, “the disappearance of remorse” in the fourth line of Ge is provisional as well. Traditionally, the fourth line is read as a leader ready to lead a political change. For Zhu Xi, the fourth line does not look like a situation ripe for political change. Rather, he sees “the disappearance of remorse” as a warning against rushing to make drastic changes (Hon 2008).

Likewise, Zhu Xi does not see in Ding a roadmap to form a new regime. Instead, he sees each line of Ding as a separate situation challenging the Yijing reader. For instance, in the first yin line, Zhu Xi is not worried about the line’s peripheral position. Rather, he is interested in the prognostication (zhen) which indicates that the line is “without remorse” (wujiu). In his comments, Zhu Xi focuses on the subtle meaning of “without remorse” and urges the reader to be positive about the future. He tells the reader that “without remorse” is a result of the first line’s determination to come back from behind and its will to succeed despite its humble position (Hon 2008).

Ultimately, for Zhu Xi, all the Yijing oracles are provisional. Their goal is to provoke thought, command attention, and above all, make readers aware of the contingency of human existence. By highlighting fear and anxiety in reading hexagrams, Zhu Xi incorporated the Yijing into his Neo-Confucian project—an endeavor, he hoped, that would lead to the triumph of the pure and perceptive “mind of the Dao” (daoxin) over the perturbed and perverse “human mind” (renxin). To develop a Confucian moral-metaphysics, Zhu Xi turned to the split second of decision making as a battle ground of one’s moral cultivation. In that split second, Zhu Xi claimed, the human mind is deeply torn between “the mind of the Dao” and “the human mind”, and between “the heavenly principle” (tianli) and “human desires” (renyu) (Adler 2014; Tu 1985: 131–48). In this mental battle, the Yijing reader is put into a moral-metaphysical journey. The hexagrams give the readers hope without losing sight of the immense challenge of overcoming mishaps and failure. They promise success if readers find the means to tame their searching minds and to counter the distractions in their lives. Above all, they give spiritual depth to the readers’ moral struggle, turning it into a battle ground between following the dictates of the flesh, or elevating oneself to form a “trinity with heaven and earth”.

In this way, Zhu Xi opened the Yijing to a wide range of audience. By focusing on divination and the symbolism of the 64 hexagrams, Zhu Xi made the Yijing relevant to readers who might not be well educated. While it remained a canonical text, it was transformed into “a book of life” for common people who struggled daily to make the right decision between the purity of “the heavenly principle” and the perversion of “human desires” (Hon 2012). From the Ming dynasty (1368–1644) to the Qing dynasty (1644–1911), Zhu Xi’s interpretation of the Yijing was promoted by the imperial government. It was included in the state-approved Yijing commentaries, the Zhouyi daquan (The Compendium of Cheng Yi’s and Zhu Xi’s Commentaries on the Changes of the Zhou Dynasty) of the Ming dynasty, and the Zhouyi zhezhong (Balanced Annotations of the Changes of the Zhou Dynasty) of the Qing dynasty.

6. The Three Meanings of Change

On the surface, these three approaches—the cosmology of change, the ontology of change and the moral-metaphysics of change—appear to steadily narrow the scope of philosophizing change. They seem to continuously move away from the cosmos to the human world, and from the human world to an individual’s moral cogitations. One may even say that in this narrowing of the scope, we see a retreat from the empirical to the intellectual, and from the objective to the subjective.

Yet, in their own ways, these three approaches offer answers to the human fear of uncertainty that was characteristic of divination in early China. Whether performed with yarrow stalks, coins or by cracking the bones of oxen, divination in early China was an attempt to calm the nerve and soothe the mind, giving inquirers the courage to make decisions at the crossroads of their lives (Allan 1991; Gotshalk 1999; Marshall 2001; Raphals 2013, Redmond 2017; Shaughnessy 1992 [1997]; K. Smith 1989). On the other hand, the three approaches give hope to readers by transforming the hexagrams into symbols to discuss the human role in the unfolding of the universe (Cheng 2003; Cheng & Ng 2009; Redmond & Hon 2014: 140–57; R. Smith 2008: 31–48). Together, they make three arguments:

  1. Because the universe is an open system that is self-generative and self-transformative, human beings must live with ceaseless change;
  2. Because change takes place in an orderly manner, human beings must find a way to understand their patterns;
  3. Because the patterns of change are discernible, human beings will find peace and comfort in everyday life.

These three arguments are succinctly summarized into the “three meanings of change” (yi you san yi) in Qian Zuodu (Opening up the Regularities of Hexagram Qian) of the Eastern Han (25–220): (1) the multifariousness in change (bianyi), (2) the constancy in change (buyi), and (3) at ease with change (yijian) (Nielson 2003: 301–302, 304–305; R. Smith 2008: 78–79).

If we use these three meanings of change to compare the three approaches, the first two focus primarily on finding the constancy in change (buyi) and thereby assuring us that everything is predictable. By contrast, the third pays special attention to incessant change (bianyi) and urges us to live with uncertainty and serendipity (yijian). If indeed fear—especially the fear of the uncertain future—is the fundamental tenet of the Yijing, the third approach is most honest. Rather than suppressing or externalizing the fear of uncertainty, the third approach faces the fear squarely with humility and candidness. More important, it brings the struggle with the fear of uncertainty to everyday life, particularly in the split second when we make decisions.


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