Chinese Philosophy of Change (Yijing)

First published Fri Mar 29, 2019; substantive revision Mon Sep 18, 2023

Every day, we make decisions to minimize conflicts and disruptions to make peace with ourselves and people around us. Every day, we take actions to smooth out inconsistencies and irregularities to make our lives look manageable and meaningful. Every day, we perform our duties to our families and our professional organizations to present an image of loyalty and responsibility. Yet, despite our best efforts, we know that we must have missed a great deal of opportunities and overlooked a lot of options because we, knowingly or unknowingly, tend to be distracted by immediate interests, unexpected circumstances, and unanticipated events. The fact of the matter is that in the end, we do not fully know the results of our decisions: Are they truly effective in solving problems or repairing estranged relationships? Or are they merely hiding problems or delaying solutions? Or are they inadvertently causing further damages or sowing the seeds for bigger problems to come?

Yet, despite worry, anxiety, and self-pity, we continue to move forward. Occasionally, if we think hard enough, we may even find blessings in disguise—a missed opportunity leads us to a new development; a wrong turn directs us onto a fruitful path; a hurdle pushes us to think more carefully about alternative solutions. In the end, we must admit that the world is far more complicated than we can imagine. To live, we must take a pragmatic and provisional attitude: we do our best to make informed decisions, but we do not know how far we can go and how much we can accomplish.

This quest to be at peace with the complicated world is central to the philosophy of the Book of Changes (Yijing 易經, Zhouyi 周易 or I Ching, hereafter Changes). Despite its multiple authors and divergent layers, the Changes focuses on one question: Given that we have no full knowledge of ourselves and our surroundings due to the constant changes in the world, how do we conduct our life meaningfully and responsibly? Seemingly alarming, this question is based on an understanding of human condition that includes three parts: (1) our finitude due to the limits of our cognitive abilities; (2) our reliance on a system of signs to understand our surroundings and to guide our actions, and (3) our hubris to take full control of our lives, even to the point of planning every step in our daily schedule (Hon 2019).

Directly addressing these three aspects of human condition, the Changes aims to alleviate our self-inflicted anxiety and agony. It reminds us of our limited ability to know our surroundings. It offers us a system of symbols to navigate the complicated world. It provides us with a set of divination rituals to calm our minds. Through these three measures, the Changes helps us develop an appreciation of ourselves—not only knowing who we are, but also finding out what we can and cannot do. In short, the Changes helps us develop self-confidence so that we can face changes with dignity, humility, and resolve.

As a text, the Changes is unique in two ways. Firstly, it is multi-layered. Traditional accounts claim that the first layer of the core text were graphic symbols—the 8 trigrams and 64 hexagrams (see the images of trigrams and hexagrams in Appendixes 1 and 2). Created by a mythical figure, Fu Xi 伏羲, these symbols mimic the continuous unfolding of the universe and denote the fluidity and complexity of human existence. The second layer of the core text included hexagram and line statements (see the names of the 64 hexagrams in Appendix 3). Allegedly composed by King Wen 文王 and the Duke of Zhou 周公 in the 11th century BCE, these written statements invoked concrete historical events—such as the downfall of the Shang dynasty and the rise of the Zhou dynasty—to elucidate the constancy of change in human society. The third layer were seven pieces of writings from 5th century to 2nd century BCE. Divided into ten segments (hence, the name “Ten Wings”, 十翼 shiyi), these writings deduced philosophical insights from the graphic symbols and the hexagram and line statements (see the list of the Ten Wings in Appendix 4). By 135 BCE, the core text and the Ten Wings were combined to form what we now call the Changes—a composite text consisting of symbols, divination reports, historical records, folklores, and philosophical treatises (Nylan 2001: 202–52; Redmond & Hon 2014: 1–157; R. Smith 2012: 1–47; Shaughnessy 2022: 5–64).

Secondly, because of its multiple layers, the nature of the Changes is hard to pin down. If one focuses on the 64 hexagrams, the Changes resembles a manual of divination. Each hexagram is a record of fortune-telling, consisting of a hexagram name describing a specific situation (e.g., marriage, mobilizing an army, or cleaning a well) and six lines detailing the alternative moves in a given situation. But if one focuses on the Ten Wings, one finds lengthy discussions of process cosmology, the philosophy of symbolic forms, and moral-metaphysics. Since its canonization in 135 BCE, the Changes was often read by the Chinese educated elites as a philosophical text. And it was this philosophical reading that made the Changes a living text throughout imperial China that constantly posed critical questions to its readers and commentators (R. Smith 2008: 57–194; Redmond & Hon 2014: 158–180).

For readers today, a major challenge of reading the Changes is overcoming the dichotomy between philosophy and divination. To many of us, divination and philosophy are diametrically opposed. Whereas divination is based on a belief in a god or deity who communicates messages to believers through coveted symbols or trusted mediums, philosophy is based on rational thinking, cool-headed analysis, and precise articulation. To the authors of Changes, however, divination is intrinsically philosophical because its goal is to provide an opportunity for self-reflection. While performing the ritualistic acts of divination, the inquirers find a quiet moment to review their past, examine their present, and make plans for the next step. For the inquirers, it is unimportant whether there is a deity or a spirit during the process of reflection, apprehension, and anticipation; it is more important that they reach a decision after carefully evaluating the available options, and make critical moves to improve their lives.

In the following, we will examine the philosophy of the Changes from four perspectives: the human finitude in the cosmic great dance, the need for decision-making to come to terms with changes, the use of symbols to understand the complexity of the world, and the importance of rituals to find a direction in everyday life. Together, these four aspects underscore both our limitations as sensitive souls constantly perplexed and perturbed by changes, and our abilities as sensible beings to face changes with courage and dignity. More importantly, these four aspects help us appreciate the richness of the voluminous commentaries written on the Changes in imperial China. Despite their differences in tone, style, and structure, these commentaries revealed the hidden meanings of the Changes and developed three distinctive approaches to come to terms with changes: the cosmological approach, the rational humanistic approach change, and the divination approach.

1. The Text of the Book of Changes

1.1 Human Finitude

Underlying the philosophy of the Changes is the notion that the cosmos is an organismic process without beginning or end. As a process, the cosmos resembles a great flow in which “all of the parts of the entire cosmos belong to one organic whole” and all the parts “interact as participants in one spontaneously self-generating process” (Tu 1985: 35). As such, there are three characteristics of this great flow: continuity, wholeness, and dynamism. It is continuous because it never stops in renewing itself. It is holistic because it includes everything in the universe and permeates in all aspects of life. It is dynamic because it is full of motion and movement, generating energy and strength all the time (Tu 1985: 38–39). In this cosmic flow, there is no distinction between the natural realm and the human realm, between an observing subject and an observed object, and between the inner world and the outer world. Everything is part of a totality, a group dance that never stops.

Because of its origin, the philosophy of the Changes was embedded in the practices of divination. In early China, divination was intrinsically philosophical because they were undertaken by the upper classes to make critical decisions, such as starting a war, stopping a natural disaster, or choosing a spouse to continue the family line. Before divination, an inquirer must have a question in mind to seek guidance from a deity or the spirit of an ancestor. The result of a divination would be transmitted to the inquirer in a code (as shown in the engravings in the oracle bones) and the inquirer must interpret the code to formulate an action plan. In the whole process, interpreting the code—known as prognostication—was the most important step where the inquirer, aided by experts, made critical decisions based on the message (Shaughnessy 2014: 1–36; 2022: 68–84). Hence, divination was not a blind faith in a supernatural power. Rather, it was an attempt to make an informed decision based on a reflection of the past, an apprehension of the present, and an anticipation of the future (Allan 1991; Gotshalk 1999; Marshall 2001; Raphals 2013, Redmond 2017; Shaughnessy 1992 [1997]).

More importantly, underlying the practice of divination was the notion that human beings must accept their limitations. First and foremost, human beings cannot fully understand the cosmos because it is an organismic process. As part of the great flow, human beings are bound by specific time and space. Like a drop of water in an ocean, we are conditioned by the totality of the ocean and its dynamism. We act, react, push, and pull, but we never know the vastness and depth of the ocean.

Paradoxically, acknowledging our finitude gives us courage and flexibility to actively involve into our lives. As a drop of water in an ocean, we can reinvent ourselves in every moment. Our action—intentional or unintentional—will cause a change in the world; through the butterfly effect, our action will subsequently come back to affect us in our lives. Consequently, every action we take is both a result of a precedent situation and a cause of the following situation. Bounded and yet free, we are part of the process of creative-creation where, as Alfred North Whitehead puts it, “the many become one and are increased by one” (Whitehead 1929 [1978]: 342–351).

In the Changes, this interdependence of subject and object, inner and outer, cause and effect, are presented graphically in the symbols of yin 陰 (the passive force), a broken line (‒ ‒), and yang 陽 (the active force), a straight line (―). By mixing the straight and broken lines, trigrams (three-line grids) and hexagrams (six-line grids) are formed. Allegedly developed by Fu Xi, these trigrams and hexagrams can be seen as coded messages from a supernatural power. But these trigrams and hexagrams can also be understood as a system of signs that helps us understand the fluidity and complexity of the cosmic flow. In the Xici 繋辭 (The Attached Statements, one of the Ten Wings), we find a description of how Fu Xi developed the eight trigrams to represent the world:

When in early antiquity Pao Hsi [Fu Xi] ruled the world, he looked upward and contemplated the images in the heavens; he looked downward and contemplated the patterns on earth. He contemplated the markings of birds and beasts and the adaptations to the regions. He proceeded directly from himself and indirectly from objects. Thus he invented the eight trigrams in order to enter into connection with the virtues of the light of the gods and to regulate the conditions of all beings. (WB67: 328–329)

For the authors of Xici, the eight trigrams (☰, ☱, ☲, ☳, ☴, ☵, ☶, ☷) ) are potent symbols. They are “signifiers” that help us, the perceivers, develop a sense of what the “signified” may look like. With different combinations of a straight line (—) and a broken line (‒ ‒), the trigrams symbolize the ebb and flow of the yin and the yang cosmic forces. Similarly, a hexagram (a six-lines grid) is also a symbol of the unfolding of the universe. For example, a hexagram can be divided into two trigrams: the lower trigram (lines 1–3) and the upper trigram (lines 4–6). With one trigram below and one trigram above, a hexagram symbolizes the interaction of two sets of yin-yang configuration, demonstrating the multiple ways in which the yin and yang forces interact and transform each other. One may also take the lower two lines of a hexagram as representing the earth (di 地), the middle two lines as representing humankind (ren 人), and the top two lines as representing heaven (tian 天). Then, we have a trigram within a hexagram. Known as the “three potencies” (san cai 三才), the relation of heaven, earth, and humankind highlights the co-dependence between the natural realm (tian and di) and the human realm (ren).

For the authors of Xugua 序卦 (Explaining the Sequence of Hexagrams, one of the Ten Wings), there are meanings in the sequence of the 64 hexagrams. The sequence depicts a continuous development of human society. The process begins with satisfying basic human needs (such as food, shelter, and security) and founding a patrilineal family structure. Subsequently, the patrilineal family structure is further expanded into a complex socio-political system based on the distinctions between kings and officials and rulers and the ruled. Yet, this seemingly triumphant march to perfect human society is repeatedly interrupted by hesitations and disruptions, obstacles and blunders, and reforms and rebellions. At the end, this quest for a better society becomes a never-ending process, like the great flow of the cosmos.

To the authors of Xugua, this never-ending process of building a better society is symbolized by the last hexagram, Weiji 未濟 (䷿ Ferrying Incomplete, #64). If ended with Jiji 既濟 (䷾ Ferrying Complete, #63), the Changes would have been perfect because Jiji is the best hexagram in terms of yin-yang correspondence. Reading Jiji

from the bottom to the top, the first yang line of Jiji corresponds with the fourth yin line, the second yin line corresponds with the fifth yang line, and the third yang line corresponds with the top yin line. In addition, Jiji is perfect in the position of the six lines: a yang line at the first position, a yin line at the second position, a yang line at the third position, a yin line at the fourth position, a yang line at the fifth position, and a yin line at the top position. Ended with Jiji, the Changes would have an optimistic tone. It would suggest that if not now, at least in the distant future, all problems in this world are going to be resolved. Sooner or later, we will reach the paradise.

Ended with Weiji, however, the Changes becomes ominous and open-ended. On the surface, the configuration of Weiji


is undesirable. Looking at the hexagram line positions, Weiji must be in a dreadful condition: its yang positions (first, third, and fifth) are occupied by yin lines, and its yin positions (second, fourth, and sixth) are occupied by yang lines. Being in the wrong positions, all six lines cannot fully utilize their potential. It is somewhat like what we see during the Covid-19 pandemic where the supply chains and production lines were disrupted, dislocated, and displaced due to travel bans and shutdowns. At the same time, although all positions of Weiji are in the wrong order, the lines correspond with one another in terms of their yin-yang nature: the yin lines at the first and third positions correspond respectively with the yang lines at the fourth and sixth positions, and the yang line at the second position corresponds with the yin line at the fifth position. Because of the correspondence amongst the six lines, Weiji is full of vital potentials. Once these vital potentials are activated, Weiji will flourish. It is similar to the potentials of inter- and intra-regional collaborations in the world system that have developed over the last four decades. The temporary disruptions and shutdowns during the pandemic did not cause damages the structure of the system. The system bounces back quickly after the travel bans and shutdowns are lifted.

1.2 Decision Making

Together, Jiji and Weiji show that human agency is the key driving force that would transform a dreadful situation (e.g., Weiji) into a more positive, enterprising situation (e.g., Jiji). For the authors of Xici, this is where decision matters. In a favorable situation, if someone can make good decisions as to what to do, how to do, and when to do, it will yield “good fortune” as opposite to courting “misfortune.” Even in an undesirable situation, if people are smart, they can find ways to make a horrendous situation into a mild “remorse” or even a less less-harmful “humiliation.”

In the hexagram and line statements, the importance of decision making is spelled out clearly. For instance, in the prognostications—inquirers’ interpretations of the messages received in divination—we find both positive utterances such as “auspicious” (ji 吉) and “without blame” (wujiu 无咎) and stern warnings such as “calamity” (xiong 凶), “blame” (jiu咎), “regret” (hui 悔) and “remorse” (lin 吝). These contrasting prognostications highlight the reality of human existence that when the wind of luck is on our side, we will do well, but when we are out of luck, we will be doomed to failure.

Take, for instance, Qian 乾 (䷀ The Creative, #1). The line statements depict the six yang lines as a dragon in various positions (for a translation of Qian, see WB67: 3–10). Reading from the bottom to the top, the first line of Qian is a “hidden dragon”, the second line an “emerging dragon”, the third line “a gentleman (perhaps a stand in of a dragon) in deep thought all day long”, the fourth line a “wavering dragon”, the fifth line a “flying dragon”, and the top line an “arrogant dragon” (see Appendix 5). In addition, each line statements of Qian suggest a proper course of action in respective to the position of the dragon. Thus, the “hidden dragon” should avoid taking aggressive action, the “emerging dragon” and the “flying dragon” most look for assistance from “a great man”, the “wavering dragon” should take flight over the depths despite the danger and apparent risks, and the “arrogant dragon” will regret being stubborn and excessively confident.

But, as a hexagram, Qian is ambiguous. On the one hand, in five of its six lines, the tone seems to be upbeat, projecting an impression of an incessant progress from a hidden dragon to an emerging dragon, a wavering dragon and finally a flying dragon. On the other hand, the progression is abruptly interrupted by the swift downfall of an arrogant dragon. Like a Greek tragedy, the rapid fall of the arrogant dragon suggests hubris, highlighting the danger of excessive human pride in making strenuous efforts to pull oneself up.

To highlight the danger of hubris, the authors of Tuan zhuan 彖傳 (Commentary on the Decision, one of the Ten Wings), emphasize the importance of creatively and continuously assuming the positions of the six dragons in response to the challenges in daily life (for a translation of the Tuan zhuan statement, see WB67: 370–72). By taking up all six positions of the six dragons, the authors of Tuan Zhuan mean two things. First, they view Qian not as a structure of six discrete steps starting from the first line and ending with the top line. Rather they see Qian as a continuum, a cycle of events that keeps repeating itself. Even if one strictly follows the incremental progress from a hidden dragon (the first line) to an emerging dragon (the second line) to a flying dragon (the fifth line), upon reaching the top (an arrogant dragon), one must go back down to a hidden dragon and to start all over again. Second, the authors of Tuan zhuan suggest readers when facing a challenge in their lives, they should choose a dragon most suitable to the circumstances, such as to assume the position of a hidden dragon when starting a new business or beginning a new career, to act like an emerging dragon after receiving recognition from peers or bosses, to be like a wavering dragon when making crucial transition in career or location, to be like a flying dragon when everything seems to be flourishing, and last but not least, to avoid becoming an arrogant dragon when everything looks perfect but a decline is imminent.

On the other hand, the authors of Xici also highlight the importance of decision-making by putting strong emphasis on human precariousness. To draw attention to making wise decisions, the authors of Xici focus on “fear and anxiety” (youhuan 憂患) as a main theme of the Changes. For instance, they link the rise of the popularity of the Changes to the political crisis during the Shang-Zhou transition (Xici II: 7; WB67: 345). To them, the popularity of hexagram divination was a consequence of the “fear and anxiety” arisen from the transferal of the “mandate of heaven” (tianming 天命) from the Shang rulers to the Zhou rulers. Particularly, they view the epic battle between the last ruler of Shang (King Zhou 紂王) and the first ruler of Zhou (King Wen 文王) as the turning point in this drastic shift in political fortune, where the evil king was brought low by the superior power of a virtuous ruler. In this epic of Shang-Zhou translation, the authors of Xici find an affirmation of the Mandate of Heaven—an invisible force of the universe in choosing wise rulers, and also a stern warning in the concrete facts that a once powerful King Zhou was brought low due to the circumstances. Particularly in the downfall of the evil King Zhou, the authors of Xici remind readers of the disastrous consequences of bad decisions and reckless moves.

For the authors of Xici, whether provoking fear or instilling anxiety, the effect of hexagram divination is the same. It forces readers to reflect on their arrogance, complacency, and self-indulgence. It shocks them to look for ways to come to terms with contingency and uncertainty. Above all, it directs attention to the dark side of human beings such as complacency, jealousy, greediness, and wickedness.

1.3 Symbols

Despite warning of hubris and human wickedness, the Xici’s authors also assure readers that if they learn to read hexagrams properly, they will discern the pattern behind incessant changes. They write:

The Changes is a book from which one may not hold aloof. Its dao [i.e., pattern] is forever changing—alternating, movement without rest, flowing through the six empty places [of a hexagram]; rising and sinking without fixed law, firm and yielding transform each other. They cannot be confined within a rule; it is only change that is at work here. They move inward and outward according to fixed rhythms. Without and within, they teach caution. They also show care and sorrow and their causes. Though you have no teacher, approach them as you would your parents. (Xici II: 7; WB67: 348–49, with modifications)

Seen in this light, the 64 hexagrams are no longer oracles. They become symbols of the constant movements in the universe and the ceaseless changes in one’s life. More significantly, they point to the intricate networks of factors or forces—from near to far away, from simple to complicated, from visible to invisible—that shape the movements and changes around us.

Yet, while scholars of Changes generally agree that trigrams and hexagrams are symbols of the cosmic group dance, there is no consensus as to how they understand symbolic and verbal representation. Do they view visual and verbal symbols as realistic representation of the dynamic unfolding of the universe? Or do they view visual and verbal symbols as selective depictions of the outside world?

The former is a version of the “copy theory of representation” where symbols are tools, accurately and realistically copying the outside world for our perusal. It assumes that there is an objective world out there, and we develop tools to copy it. And the effectiveness of the tools is determined by how realistically they are in capturing the objective reality. The latter smacks of Ernst Cassirer’s philosophy of symbolic forms where symbols are schemas, conceptually and homologically classifying the outside world to support our images of the world. It assumes that the universe is far more complex and complicated than humans can apprehend, and therefore, the best humans can do is developing tools to give them a sense of the universe. Thus, the tools created are partly subjective and partly objective. They are subjective in the sense that they are man-made and limited by human cognitive and emotive capabilities. They are objective in the sense that they provide an image of the world, allowing humans to function in daily life.

In the Xici, we find passages that support the copy theory of representation. The clearest example is the story of Bao Xi (Pao Hsi 包犧, another name for Fu Xi 伏羲) in Part 2, 2:1. In that passage, Bao Xi reportedly created a system of signs after observing the meteorological patterns in the sky and the geographical patterns on the ground. This story goes like this:

When in early antiquity Bao Xi ruled the world, he looked upward and contemplated the images in heavens; he looked downward and contemplated the patterns on earth. He contemplated the markings of birds and beasts and the adaptations to the regions. He proceeded directly from himself and indirectly from objects. Thus he invented the eight trigrams in order to enter into connection with the virtues of the light of the gods and to regulate the conditions of all beings. He made knotted cords and used them for nets and baskets in hunting and fishing. He probably took this from the hexagram of THE CLINGING (“Li”). (Xici II: 2; WB67: 328–329 with modifications)

To some scholars, this story not only explains the creation of trigrams and hexagrams but also proves that the graphic symbols are realistic representation of the world. They point out that the two key terms in the Bao Xi story—contemplation (guan 觀) and proceeding [from what is close to us to what is far beyond] (qu 取)—denote an active quest for empirical knowledge through careful observation and rational deduction that leads to a factual understanding of the workings of the universe.

Furthermore, the Bao Xi story continues after his death. We are told that another mythical figure, the Divine Husbandman (shennong 神農) drew inspiration from the hexagram Yi 益 (Increase #42) and used his knowledge to teach people farming. He also drew lessons from the hexagram Shihe 噬嗑 (Biting Through, #21) to teach people how to exchange goods to improve their lives. After the Divine Husbandman, Yellow Emperor, Shao and Shun continued to draw inspirations from a long list of hexagrams. They used their knowledge to teach people to improve their living conditions, including farming, government, and housing. The experiences of all these mythical figures show that the trigrams and hexagrams are realistic representations of the empirical world. Like a Google Map or a satellite image in our times, the trigrams and hexagrams help the mythical figures navigate the complex reality and achieve what they want in everyday life.

However, this “copy theory of representation” only appears in a small number of passages in the Xici. Most of the other passages remind us of Ernst Cassirer’s subjective use of symbols. Take, for instance, Xici I: 2 in which we find a different perspective of the creation of symbols.

The holy sages instituted the hexagrams, so that phenomena might be perceived therein. They appended the judgments, in order to indicate good fortune and misfortune. As the firm and the yielding lines displace one another, change and transformation arise. Therefore good fortune and misfortune are the images of gain and loss; remorse and humiliation are the images of sorrow and forethought. (Xici Part I: 2; WB67: 287–288)

Here, the creation of trigrams and hexagrams is described as a deliberate act of representing the world. We are told that the holy sages “instituted” (she 設) the hexagrams and “appended” (xi 繋) the Xici. In both cases, the creation of knowledge is understood as a calculated act to convey a particular view of the empirical world. More importantly, in the last line of the quoted paragraph, the authors of Xici clearly explain the goal of this production of knowledge. They see the system of signs as a tool to help readers maximize fortune, minimize misfortune, assuage remorse, and avoid humiliation. In other words, the system of signs is intended to assist readers to make decisions to improve their lives, rather than to mimic realities of the world.

In another passage, this deliberate act of representation is even more explicit. In Xici I:12, we find a soliloquy of the Master (presumably Confucius) who questions the efficacy of words and images in conveying reality:

The Master said: Writing cannot express words completely. Words cannot express thoughts completely. Are we then unable to see the thoughts of the holy sages?

The Master said: The holy sages set up the images in order to express their thoughts completely; they devised the hexagrams in order to express the true and the false completely. Then they appended judgements and so could express their words completely. (Xici I:12; WB67: 322)

Through the Master, the authors of Xici assert that the trigrams and hexagrams express the thoughts of their creators and not reflect the reality of the outside world. Similarly, the hexagram statements (or Judgments) are not summaries of empirical facts but suggestions of taking appropriate actions to solve pressing problems in life.

To followers of Cassirer’s philosophy of symbolic forms, the argument in Xici is music to their ears. In his influential article, “Geist and Life”, Cassirer describes human existence as a constant battle between the vicissitudes of life (Life) and the symbols that are deployed to make sense of our surroundings (Form). While the former is “objective”, involving empirical data and concrete facts in the tangible world, the latter is “subjective”, based on artificial schemas that presents a picture of external reality to the perceivers. For Cassirer, it is this tension between what is external and internal, factual and representational, objective and subjective, and realistic and idealistic, that characterizes creativity in human existence. In this continuum between Life and Form, and necessity and freedom, Cassirer urges us to develop our “Will to Formation” to align our understanding of the world with our system of symbols (Ernest Cassirer 1930 [1996:15–18]). To him, developing the “Will to Formation” is more important than developing the “Will to Power”, as Nietzsche suggests, because it helps us come to terms with the plurality, ambiguity, and conflicts in our lives (Cassirer 1930 [1996: 29–33]).

While in principle the authors of Xici may accept Cassirer’s active theory of representation, they are totally committed to trigrams and hexagrams as their preferred system of signs. Having invested so much in pairing trigrams and hexagrams with the cosmic great dance, these authors have no intention to include other systems of symbols to depict the universe, such as the visual arts, literature, or poetry, as Cassirer recommends (Cassirer 1930 [1996: 34–111]). Herein, perhaps, lies their blind spot. Their unwavering commitment to trigrams and hexagrams leads them to a blind alley where they fail to see the value of other systems of signs (such as the number system that appears in Xici I:8).

1.4 Rituals

If one just reads the Shuogua and the Xugua, divination does not seem to have a role in decision making. However, in the Xici, divination plays an important role in helping inquirers to make critical decisions. In fact, an extended passage is devoted to discussing how to perform divination with 50 yarrow stalks (Xici I: 8, more about it later). In addition, the Xici authors identify divination as one of four ways to use the hexagrams: (1) to use the hexagram statements and line statements as warnings against danger and downfall; (2) to use the Changes in trigrams and hexagrams to understand the ceaseless changes in the natural realm and the human realm; (3) to use hexagram images to enhance rulers’ authority; (4) to use divination to provoke inquirers to think more deeply about their choices (Xici I: 9; WB67: 314). Based on these four-fold uses of hexagrams, the Xici authors highlight the broad appeal of the Changes. It can be a book of “wisdom” (zhi 智) for those who are interested in pondering the causes and patterns of change; it can be a book of “kindness” (ren 仁) for those who are interested in improving the political order; it can be a book of “life” (riyong 日用) for those who just want to live, overcome obstacles, and make fewer mistakes (Xici I: 4; WB67: 298).

Recently, Chung-ying Cheng has suggested that we must stop explaining “the source, the formation, and the system of underlying philosophy” in interpreting the Xici. Rather, we should look at its philosophy as a sustained discussion about time, location, and judgment that are derived from the divinatory practices (Cheng 2020: xi–xvi). In other words, instead of seeing divination and philosophy as categorically exclusive, we see them as a continuum. It is from divination that we develop an acute sensitivity to the combined effects of temporal and spatial factors that determine our judgment. And it is this acute sensitivity to time and space that gives us the mental resources to develop a strategy to solve problems, a courage to face challenges, and a determination to overcome fear in crises.

From this perspective, the discussion of divination in Xici I:8 is revealing. The passage goes as follows:

The number of the total is fifty. Of these forty-nine are uses. They are divided into two portions, to represent the two primal forces. Hereupon one is set apart, to represent the three powers. They are counted through by fours, to represent the four seasons. The remainder is put aside, to represent the intercalary month. There are two intercalary months in five years, therefore the putting aside is repeated, and this gives us the whole. (WB67: 310–311)

Set in terse language, the rituals include several steps, as Richard Wilhelm summarizes.

One takes fifty yarrow stalks, of which only forty-nine are used. These forty-nine are first divided into two heaps [at random], then a stalk from the right-hand heap is inserted between the ring finger and the little finger of the left hand. The left heap is counted through by fours, and the remainder (four or less) is inserted between the ring finger and the middle finger. This constitutes one change. Now one is holding in one’s hand either five or nine stalks in all. The two remaining heaps are put together, and the same process is repeated twice. These second and third times, one obtains either four or eight stalks. The five stalks of the first counting and the four of each of the succeeding countings are regarded as a unit having the number value three; the nine stalks of the first counting and the eight of the succeeding countings have the numerical value two. When three successive changes produce the sum 3+3+3=9, this makes the old yang, i.e., a firm line that moves. The sum 2+2+2=6 makes the old yin, a yielding line that moves. Seven is the young yang, and eight the young yin; they are not taken into account as individual line. (WB67: 311)

The goal of these elaborate and repeated rituals is finding hexagrams by counting yarrow stalks. In every step of the process, the inquirer is reminded that his or her action is part of the continual unfolding of the universe. In the end, the inquirer finds a hexagram from which he or she can draw lessons. Hence, the purpose of the entire process is stilling the mind, making one more reflexive, and preparing one to make critical decisions.

In the final passage of Xici II we see a discussion of the importance of decision making in divination.

The eight trigrams point the way by means of their images; the words accompanying the lines, and the decisions, speak according to the circumstances. In that the firm and the yielding are interspersed, good fortune and misfortune can be discerned.

Changes and movements are judged according to the furtherance (that they bring). Good fortune and misfortune change according to the conditions. Therefore: Love and hate combat each other, and good fortune and misfortune result therefrom. The far and the near injure each other, and remorse and humiliation result therefrom. The true and the false influence each other, and advantage and injury result therefrom. In all the situations of the Changes it is thus: When closely related things do not harmonize, misfortune is the result: this gives rise to injury, remorse, and humiliation. (Xici II: 12; WB67: 355–355)

No matter how we call it—a critical moment, a pivotal juncture, or a turning point—an inquirer engaged in divination is at a crossroads in search of a direction. It is a time when the person feels most vulnerable and perplexed. That person is totally alone in this challenging situation when there is no precedent to guide him or her forward, nor are there rule books to help him or her navigate the complex situation. It is this revealing moment of “nothingness”—no precedence, no guidance, nothing to hold on to—that the trigrams and hexagrams are intended to capture.

Yet, the tone of the authors of Xici is decidedly upbeat and proactive in discussing this moment of “nothingness.” They tell us that when we engage in divination, we can adjust our plans in accordance with the circumstances, think more broadly and creatively in searching for solutions, and develop strategies that are outside of the conventions. The goal of practicing the rituals of divination, they declare, is to balance the competing claims, and to make the impossible possible.

2. The Commentaries of the Book of Changes

2.1 The Cosmological Approach

These four aspects of the Changes text—the human finitude, the decision making, the symbols, and the rituals—were the bases upon which the Changes commentators philosophized change throughout imperial China. Over the two thousand years after the canonization of the Changes in 135 BCE, commentators developed three distinct approaches toward changes—the cosmological approach, the rational humanistic approach, and the divination approach. Now, let us first turn to the cosmology of change.

After its canonization in 125 BCE, the Changes text was sealed but its meaning continued to grow and expand in the following two thousand years, as readers repeatedly interpreted the classic to respond to challenges of their times. By writing commentaries to explicate the subtle meanings of the Changes, readers developed what Hans-Georg Gadamer calls a “fusion of horizons” (Gadamer 1989: 3–91; Tracy 1987: 1–27), where they responded to the “call to attention” from the Changes in finding answers to questions that perplexed them. Throughout imperial China from the 2nd century BCE to 1911 CE, whenever there were momentous changes in the socio-political order, the Changes attracted tremendous attention as a living text that offered insights and inspirations to those who were suppressed, oppressed, or felt downtrodden.

During the Han Dynasty (202 BCE – 220 CE), when China was first unified for a long period of time, the dominant trend in interpreting the Changes was the Images and Numbers (Xiangshu 象數) School. Focusing on the hexagram images and the sequence of hexagrams, the Images and Numbers School attracted the attention of the ruling elite who were preoccupied with building an eternal empire. For the ruling elite, they felt that they had a mission to build a socio-political system that not only mimicked the recurrent pattern of the universe but also responded proactively to the ebb and flow of cosmic forces (Pines 2009, 2012; Loewe 1994, 2005; Wang 2000).

What underpinned the Numbers and Images School was a correlative cosmology. By aligning the hexagrams to depict the ebb and flow of the cosmic forces, the Numbers and Images School demonstrated what Sarah Queen calls the “mutual responsiveness of heaven and humanity” (Queen 1996: 1–53). This mutual responsiveness was based on two assumptions. First, the cosmos is orderly and stable. Its orderliness and stability are shown in the regular succession in time, such as the four seasons, the twelve months, the 365 days. Second, the same orderliness of the natural world is found in the human realm in the forms of life cycles, the rhythm of work and rest, and the rise and fall of family fortunes. Despite the vicissitudes on the surface, the natural and human worlds are balanced, systematic and predictable. They are perfect mirrors of each other, such that when one moves, the other responds.

The goal of correlative cosmology was not to develop a comprehensive understanding of the universe. Rather, it was to legitimize the transition “from the concept of imperial sovereignty based on might into the need to support a claim to rule with intellectual sanctions” (Loewe 1994: 121–41). Thus, the emperor was said to be the crucial link between the natural and human realms. In fact, according to the Han scholar Dong Zhongshu 董仲舒 (ca. 195–105 BCE), the Chinese character for king (王) reflected the solemn responsibility of the emperor (symbolized by the vertical stroke in the middle) for connecting the three potencies ☰: heaven (tian), earth (di) and humankind (ren) (Redmond & Hon 2014: 159–61). As such, the emperor was indeed the Son of Heaven (tianzi) who was omnicompetent, omnipotent and omniscient (Loewe 2011; Queen 1996).

To support absolutism, Han commentators transformed the Changes into a cosmological manual reflecting the ebb and flow of cosmic forces. They earnestly reorganized the hexagram sequence to match the cosmic rhythm, demonstrating that the natural and human realms are one and the same. Although most of the writings of the Han commentators are lost, in an 8th-9th century text, Zhouyi jijie 周易集解 (A Collection of Explanations on the Changes of Zhou Dynasty) edited by Li Dingzuo 李鼎祚, we have glimpses of the ambition of the Han commentators who spent their lives fathoming the cosmos and ordering the world (R. Smith 2008: 57–88).

For instance, Jing Fang (77–37 BCE) created the Hexagrams of Eight Palaces (ba gong gua): Qian䷀, Kun ䷁, Zhen ䷲, Xun ䷸, Kan ䷜, Li ䷝, Gen ䷳, Dui ䷹. These eight palace hexagrams are the doubles of the eight trigrams. For Jing, each of these palace hexagrams leads a group of seven hexagrams. For example, Qian ䷀ leads ䷫, ䷠, ䷋, ䷓, ䷖, ䷢, ䷍. In this new alignment of hexagrams, there is both a steady increase or decrease of the yin and yang cosmic forces, and the hidden power of the two forces even when they are dormant (for the new sequence of 64 hexagrams based on eight palaces, see Nielson 2003: 3).

Another new sequence of hexagrams was the “waning and waxing hexagrams” (xiaoxi gua 消息卦) perfected by Yu Fan (164–233). Representing the ebb and flow of the yin and yang cosmic forces, the “waning and waxing hexagrams” go as follows:

(back to Fu)

When reading from Fu to Qian, the yang force gradually increases while the yin force decreases. When reading from Gou to Kun, the yin force increases while the yang force decreases. As a system, the twelve hexagrams are continuous. When the series ends with Kun, it begins anew with Fu (Nielson 2003: 275–76).

By developing these new hexagram sequences, the Han Changes commentators wanted to achieve two goals. First, they freed themselves from the original sequence of the 64 hexagrams that was, to them, incoherent and inconsistent. To the Han commentators, the problem of the original sequence was its failure in lining up hexagrams in accordance with their graphic images. By creating new sequences, the Han scholars were able to match perfectly the hexagram images with the ebb and flow of cosmic forces (Redmond & Hon 2014: 159–163). Second, with the new sequences, the Han commentators were better equipped to synchronize the hexagrams with the lunar calendar, showing a direct correspondence between the ebb and flow of the cosmic forces and the cycles of life in human society (R. Smith 2008: 62–77). For instance, the “waning and waxing hexagrams” were assigned to represent months in the lunar calendar (Nielson 2003: 275–76):

Fu the eleventh month
Lin the twelfth month
Tai the first month of the following year
Dazhuang the second month
Guai the third month
Qian the fourth month
Gou the fifth month
Dun the sixth month
Pi the seventh month
Guan the eighth month
Bo the ninth month
Kun the tenth month

The same could be done for the hexagrams sequence based on the eight palaces. By matching the new sequence of the 64 hexagrams with 12 months, the Han commentators allotted eight months to four hexagrams and four months to eight hexagrams (Nielson 2003: 5).

To Han commentators, while the new hexagram sequences highlighted certainty in the universe’s self-renewal, each hexagram represented the possibility of coping with the changing environment. These differing functions addressed a fundamental question in ruling a huge empire: How to formulate flexible policies while keeping a semblance of unity and uniformity? To give themselves flexibility in interpreting hexagrams, the Han commentators created new interpretive strategies. One common strategy called for linking one hexagram to four hexagrams. Take, for instance, Qian ䷀ (The Creative, #1). To interpret the hexagram, one can link it to its opposite, Kun ䷁ (The Receptive, #2), known as “laterally linked hexagrams” (pangtong) (Nielson 2003: 185–88). In addition, Qian can also be read along with its preceding hexagram and following hexagram in accordance with the sequence of the “waning and waxing hexagrams”. So, Qian can be read in relation to Guai ䷪ (Resolution, #43), its antecedent, and Gou ䷫ (Encounter, #44), its posterior. And then, within a hexagram, one can also create “interlocking trigrams” (hugua or huti), that is, using four or five of the hexagram lines to form two new trigrams (Nielson 2003: 111–14). In the case ofQian, it is not possible to create “interlocking trigrams” due to all six lines being yang. But in other cases, the “interlocking trigrams” are significant in deciphering the meaning of a hexagram. Take, for instance, Ge ䷰ (Radical Change, #49). Its second, third, and fourth lines form a Sun trigram ☴ and its third, four, and fifth form a Qian trigram ☰ Combining Sun and Qian forms Gou ䷫ (Encounter, #44).

Another strategy of expanding the scope of interpretation was to turn a hexagram into a different one by transposing some of its lines. Known as “changing the positions of hexagram lines” (yiwei), this strategy allowed Han scholars to introduce other hexagrams when having problems interpreting a hexagram. For instance, Tai ䷊ (Peace, #11) can become Jiji ䷾ (Ferrying Complete #63) by transposing its second line (a yang) and its fifth line (a yin). Likewise, Dazhuang ䷡ (Great Strength, #34) can turn into Xu ䷄ (Waiting, #5) by switching its fourth line (a yang) and its fifth line (a yin). Much more versatile than other methods, the transposition of hexagram lines gave Han commentators the liberty to inject a broad range of alternatives when interpreting a hexagram.

Thus, by giving themselves flexibility in interpreting hexagrams, the Han commentators reaffirmed the orderliness, stability, and predictability of the cosmic and human realms. They transformed the Changes into a cosmological manual to match the rhythm of cosmic forces. In doing so, the Han commentators suppressed and externalized the human fear of uncertainty. They suppressed fear by focusing attention on the repeated rhythm of the universe, as evidenced by the seasonal changes and the passage of time from month to month. They externalized fear by concentrating on the grand scheme of the universe’s renewal that did not seem to give room to uncertainty or rupture. More importantly, by matching the cosmic realm with the human rhythm, they created an illusion that the Changes was a ruler’s playbook to fathom the cosmos and order the world (Ch’en 1986: 798–801; R. Smith 2008: 62–88).

2.2 The Rational Humanistic Approach

But the fall of the Han dynasty in 220 CE reveals a fundamental problem of correlative cosmology, namely, human beings are incapable of fully discerning the cosmic pattern, nor can they completely apply the cosmic pattern to human affairs. Even if they tried to mimic the cosmic rhythm in governing the human world, the human world is far too complicated for anyone to handle. In the following seven hundred years, Changes scholars retreated from fathoming the cosmos. Instead, they turned their attention to ordering the human world and looked for its deep structure.

The major figure who started this turn to the human world was Wang Bi 王弼 (226–249). Born six years after the collapse of the Han dynasty, Wang Bi was thrown into a situation in which there seemed to be few certainties in life. With China divided into three separate kingdoms—the Wei, the Shu, and the Wu—there was widespread disorder in the country. When everything was in ruin, fewer and fewer people followed the Confucian precepts of honesty, loyalty, and filial piety. Instead, trickery, usurpation and pragmatic calculation became the accepted strategies for survival. Apparently, Wang Bi’s experience after the collapse of the Han dynasty brought him face to face with fear and anxiety—the two recurrent themes in the Changes (Hon 2010). Before his premature death at the age of 23, Wang wrote a commentary on the Changes along with a commentary on the Laozi. Attached to his Changes commentary, the Zhouyi zhu 周易注 (A Commentary on the Zhou Changes), were seven essays in which he discussed how to read the classic. In these essays (rendered as “General Remarks on the Changes of the Zhou” by Richard John Lynn, see Lynn 1994: 25–39), he revisited themes that had been discussed in the Xici, including what a hexagram symbolizes and what the six lines of a hexagram tell us about human existence. In these essays, he presented a notion of change that was completely new.

First and foremost, unlike the Han commentators, Wang Bi did not consider the hexagram sequence as important. Instead, he regards each of the 64 hexagrams as a discrete situation. Furthermore, he points out that the uniqueness of each hexagram is succinctly summarized in Tuan (one of the “Ten Wings”), such as Zhun ䷂ (Difficulty at the Beginning #3) discusses the difficulty when someone starts an endeavor, Meng ䷃ (Youthful Folly, #4) focuses on how a teacher hone his or her skills in teaching; Xu ䷄ (Waiting #5) suggests a pause to reflect on one’s precarious situation (“Ming Tuan”, Lynn 1994: 25–27). As such, readers do not have to strictly follow the hexagram sequence in reading hexagrams. They can pick and choose hexagrams that appear to directly address questions in mind. No matter which hexagrams they pick, the key point is to see a hexagram as a field of action where different forces or players interact.

In his essay “Ming Xiang” 明象 (Clarifying the Images), Wang Bi explains why he wants to change the way of reading the Yijing. He writes:

Images are the means to express ideas. Words are the means to explain the images. To yield up ideas completely, there is nothing better than the images, and to yield up the meaning of images, there is nothing better than words. The words are generated by the images, thus one can ponder the words and so observe what the images are. The images are generated by ideas, thus one can ponder the images and so observe what the ideas are. The ideas are yielded up completely by the images, and the images are made explicit by the words. Thus since the words are the means to explain the images, once one gets the images, he forgets the words, and since the images are the means to allow us to concentrate on the ideas, once one gets the ideas, he forgets the images. (Lynn 1994: 31)

Here, Wang Bi is criticizing the Han exegetes for believing a direct correspondence exists between symbols and reality, words and referents. For him, the Han exegetes are doomed to failure in using the 64 hexagrams to match the unfolding of the universe. Given the scope and scale of the universe, whatever system of knowledge that the Han exegetes create will not be able to include all the animate and inanimate beings, nor can it capture the fluidity and diversity in the constant transformation in the universe. Furthermore, the repeated patterns that the Han exegetes identify are merely what human beings observe or experience; they are not the “real cosmic patterns” that the universe follows, as the frequent appearance of anomalies, calamities, disasters, and unexplained events demonstrate. For this reason, Wang Bi suggested that “once one gets the images, he forgets the words” (dexiang zai wangyan 得象在忘言) and “once one gets the ideas, he forgets the images” (deyi er wangxiang 得意而忘象).

In the latter part of the essay, Wang borrows the Zhuangzi metaphors of “rabbit snares” (ti 蹄) and “fish trap” (quan 筌) to underscore the need to look at reality without being distracted by words or images. He writes:

Similarly, the rabbit snare exists for the sake for the rabbit; once one gets the rabbit, he forgets the snare. And the fish trap exists for the sake of fish; once one gets the fish, he gets the trap. If this is so, then the words are snares for the images, and the images are traps for the ideas. (Lynn 1994: 31)

For Wang Bi, “images” (xiang 象) are traps because they give us a false sense of reality, confusing a representation of reality with the reality itself. Particularly in the Han period, the commentators of the Changes deployed the hexagrams to depict the rise and fall Yin and Yang forces, as if the sequence of hexagrams could accurately map the unfolding of the universe. In a sarcastic tone, Wang questions the effectiveness of using the hexagrams to mimic the cosmic patterns. He writes:

If the lines really do fit with the idea of compliance, why is it necessarily that hexagram Kun 坤 (The Receptive, #2) represent only the cow; and if its concept really corresponds to the idea of dynamism, why is it necessary that hexagram Qian 乾 (The Creative, #1) represent only the horse? (Lynn 1994: 32)

Worse still, when the matching of hexagrams with the unfolding of the universe did not work, the Han exegetes created even more methods, such as “overlapping trigrams” and “trigram change”, to make the correspondence look tenable (Lynn 1994: 32). For Wang Bi, when more of these methods are created, more gaps and exceptions will appear in human systems of knowledge, showing their falsity and inadequacy.

Wang Bi’s goal in critiquing the Han exegetes was to put forward a new method of reading the text. Rather than creating a system of human knowledge that matched the vast scope and scale of the universe, Wang suggested that we should accept the limit of our knowledge—namely, we only know what we can know. We know that the universe is a totality, but we can only apprehend its grand unity in our daily life and through our surroundings. Because of our finitude, we should see hexagrams as symbols helping us to link with the universe. They are pointers, in the form of temporal-spatial grids, that reveal the totality of the universe in the concrete situation of our life. As such, whichever hexagram is picked, it will provoke a conversation between the symbol and the reader, allowing the reader to see the field of action in front of him.

Thus, for Wang Bi, the purpose of reading hexagrams is to reflect on one’s situation (see “Mingyao tongbian” 明爻通變, Lynn 1994: 27–29). The six lines of a hexagram—even a bad one like Gu ䷑ (Ills to Be Cured, #18)—offer options to respond to a situation. They represent the room to maneuver within a system or the possibilities of altering an existing power structure. Precisely in this juncture that exists between what is already set and what can be changed, Wang Bi sees the fluidity of human affairs. With proper action, one can turn what appears to be a failure into a blessing. Conversely, lacking appropriate action, one can make what appears to be flourishing into a disaster.

For this reason, Wang Bi does not find the inauspicious hexagram Sun ䷨ (Diminution, #41) terribly frightening (Lynn 1994: 387–96). Judging from its hexagram image and line statements, Sun suggests a situation where those who are high up take advantage of those who are in lower positions, or those who are physically strong victimize those who are weak. Yet, despite the injustice denoted in the hexagram, Wang Bi believes there is still room for optimism. “Supreme good fortune” will come, he declares, if someone finds ways to benefit the public. Similarly, the “oppressions” in hexagram Kun ䷮ (Impasse, #47) are avoidable (Lynn 1994: 428–37). Judging from its line statements, Kun is hopeless. All of its six lines are plagued with some form of oppression: the first line is buried under a barren tree, the second line is burdened with excessive drinking and eating, the third line is caught in rocks, the fourth line is locked in a golden carriage, the fifth line is bullied by a man with purple knee bands, and the sixth line is wrapped by creeping vines. Yet Wang Bi argues that by making the right decision one can reverse what seems to be an oppressive situation into an opportunity for growth and advancement.

By stressing human agency and activism, Wang Bi sees hexagrams as pointers, directing our attention to the source of human creativity and ingenuity. As pointers, hexagrams and hexagram lines serve different functions. While a hexagram connotes a field of action, the six hexagram lines stand for the six players (or the six options) in that field of action (see “Minggua shibian tongyao” 明卦適變通爻, Lynn 1994: 29–31). Symbolizing the whole, a hexagram represents a web of relations governing the actions and interactions of the six players. Symbolizing the parts, hexagram lines represent what the six players can or cannot do to advance their interests. Hence, in reading hexagrams, Changes readers are constantly reminded that every aspect of human life, big or small, is governed by the part-whole relationship. To cope with change, Wang Bi asserts, we must find out the part-whole relationship in each given situation—be it in family, society, or a solitary quest for spiritual communion with nature.

With the different functions of hexagrams and hexagram lines in mind, we can understand why Wang Bi stresses the mutual dependency of somethingness (you 有) and nothingness (wu 无) in his commentary on Xici 1.8 as preserved by Han Kangbo 韓康伯 (332–380 CE). As discuss earlier, Xici 1.8 describes an elaborate process to select a hexagram by counting 50 yarrow stalks. Known as “the number of Great Expansion” (dayan zhi shu 大衍之數), the selection begins with the diviner separating the 50 yarrow stalks into two piles: (a) a group of 49 stalks that will be used to select a hexagram, and (b) an unused stalk that will be set aside in the rest of the divination procedure. Wang Bi views the group of 49 stalks as somethingness and the unused stalk as nothingness. He writes:

After expanding the numbers of heaven and earth, we find that the ones that are of benefit to us number fifty, and of these we actually use forty-nine, thus leaving one unused. Although this one is not used, yet through it the use of the other numbers becomes readily possible, and although this one is not one of the numbers, yet through it the other numbers are formed. As this one represents the supreme ultimate of change, the other forty-nine constitute the ultimate of numbers. Nothingness cannot be brought to light by means of nothingness but must take place through somethingness. Therefore, by applying ourselves constantly to this ultimate among things that have somethingness, we shall surely bring to light the primogenitor from which all things derive. (Lynn 1994: 60–61; translation modified)

In his comments, Wang Bi cleverly turns the discussion of divination into a meditation on the co-dependence of somethingness and nothingness. He argues that somethingness depends on nothingness because the forty-nine yarrow stalks become useful only when they are utilized in casting a hexagram. Conversely, nothingness cannot fulfill itself without somethingness because there is no way to perform a divination without the 49 yarrow stalks. Representing the practice of divination, nothingness gives the purpose, the unity, and the coherence to the act of throwing of the 49 yarrow stalks. Representing the actual steps of casting a hexagram by throwing the yarrow stalks, somethingness makes divination possible.

An analogy would be a performance of Beethoven’s fifth symphony. As members of the audience, we see musicians playing notes under the baton of a conductor. As listeners, we hear Beethoven’s music that is invisible and ineffable yet transcends everything that happens on stage. Here, the key point is the mutual dependency of the tangible and intangible, what we see and what we hear. Without Beethoven’s music (a structure of notes), there would not have been a performance of the fifth symphony. Conversely, without a performance by an orchestra in front of an audience, Beethoven’s scores remain but scribbles on paper—a potentiality that is untapped and unrealized.

One may argue that Wang Bi’s reading of the hexagrams limits the Changes to concrete human affairs. Unlike the Han dynasty commentators, Wang had little interest in cosmology and rejected any attempt to match the cosmic and human realms. But in seeing the hexagrams as temporal-spatial grids, Wang reminds us that the Changes is meant to be read metaphorically. In focusing on the hexagrams as pointers—pointing toward something hidden, implicit, yet fundamental in time and space—he avoids the pitfall of the Han dynasty commentators who turned the Changes into a copious system of signs to document the multifarious changes in the universe. For him, the Han dynasty commentators’ attempt is futile because they do not accept the basic tenet of the Changes—the limits of human knowledge.

In returning to the root of the Changes as symbols, Wang Bi directs readers’ attention to the metaphorical significance of the hexagrams. As pointers, hexagrams help readers develop a mental picture of their surroundings, allowing them to sort out the opportunities as well as the limitations in each given situation. Hexagrams also expand readers’ horizons by directing their attention from what is near to what is distant, from what is apparent to what is concealed. Above all, they give readers hope by showing the infinite possibilities of changing our lives if we pay careful attention to our surroundings.

On this score, Wang Bi is right that the Changes is simple but profound. Its symbols appear to be simple but the message they carry is profound. The profundity of the Changes lies in the fact that the book not only offers hope and encouragement in facing the challenges of life, but it also stresses human agency and activism in coming to terms with serendipity and uncertainty. With a critical assessment of our surroundings through a reading of hexagrams, we are empowered to turn what appears to be a failure into a blessing, or an impasse into a test of character. We live because we are ready to take charge of our lives. We live because we have (in Paul Tillich’s words) the “courage to be” as part of the whole and as oneself (Tillich 1952: 86–147).

2.3 The Divination Approach

Wang Bi’s Changes commentary became the standard for interpreting the classic throughout mid-imperial China. Its august status was confirmed by the state-approved Zhouyi zhengyi 周易正義 (The True Meanings of the Zhou Changes) edited by Kong Yingda 孔穎達 (574–648). Throughout the Tang dynasty (618–907) and the Song dynasty (960–1126), knowledge of Wang Bi’s Changes commentary was tested in civil service examinations. Its longevity as the standard Changes commentary indicated consensus among the Chinese elite that attention must be paid to solving the pressing problems in the country rather than building an eternal empire that mimicked the cosmic rhythm (Hon 2004, 2005; R. Smith 2008: 89–139).

However, while Wang Bi criticized the Han commentators for being overly ambitious in blending the natural and human realms, he was also overly ambitious in using human reason to discern the hidden principle of human affairs. Whereas Han commentators suppressed and externalized the human fear of uncertainty, Wang also suppressed and externalized the same fear. In viewing hexagrams as fields of action, he suppressed the fear by absorbing it into part-whole relations in human affairs. By turning hexagrams into pointers, he externalized the fear by connecting it to a search for the principle of change in the rises and falls of human life. In the end, both the Han scholars and Wang Bi were hubristic in assuming they were omniscient.

In contrast, Zhu Xi 朱熹 (1130–1200)—a key figure of the Cheng-Zhu School of Neo-Confucianism of late imperial China—argued that the “original meaning” (benyi 本義) of Changes was divination. On the surface of it, Zhu Xi’s argument seemed redundant. It had been well-known that the first two layers of the classics were oracles originating from the Western Zhou period. But Zhu Xi’s point was that for more than a thousand years since the canonization of the Changes, the classic had never been read properly as a divination manual. For this reason, Zhu Xi believed that the true meaning of Changes lay in the imagery of the 64 hexagrams. To distinguish the 64 hexagrams from the Ten Wings, Zhu Xi created two separate categories in his commentary, the Zhouyi benyi 周易本義 (The Original Meaning of the Zhou Changes). One category was the “classic” (jing 經) which covered the 64 hexagrams; the other the “commentarial materials” (zhuan 傳) which included the Ten Wings. With these two categories, Zhu made clear that the Ten Wings were at best supplementary materials in understanding the hexagrams.

Underlying his view was a different understanding of the formation of the Changes. Unlike other Changes commentators, Zhu did not see the classic as an evolution from divination to philosophy. For him, the sixty-four hexagrams are the foundation of the Changes because they are symbols of the constant changes in the natural and human worlds. This pictorial depiction of transformation—started by Fu Xi and completed by King Wen and the Duke of Zhou—was later turned into a discussion of cosmology and morality by Confucian scholars. As a result, the Changes ceased to be a pictorial description of the awesome and awe-inspiring transformation in the universe; it became merely another text (like the Book of Poetry and the Book of History in the Confucian canon) that taught morality to kings, nobles and government officials (Hon 2008).

By privileging Fu Xi’s hexagrams over Confucius’s Ten Wings, Zhu Xi wanted to achieve two goals. First, he underscored the importance of divination as a method of self-cultivation. For him, divination is not a superstitious act of seeking guidance from a supernatural power. Rather, it is an enriching experience of encountering the unknown and unfathomable. In the process of divination, one faces the multiple forces that shape human life, and thereby becomes aware of the opportunities and resources for improving one’s situation. As Joseph Adler observes, divination is “a way of learning” to Zhu Xi because it helps learners “‘respond’ (ying) to ‘incipient’ change (chi), both in external events and in the mind” (Adler 1990: 190). Second, by focusing on the visual imagery of the hexagrams, Zhu Xi saw the Changes as significantly different from other Confucian classics. Rather than limiting to kings, nobles and government officials, the Changes appeals to a broad audience who, literate or illiterate, are concerned with uncertainties in life (Hon 2011).

For this reason, Zhu Xi emphasized the ambiguity of line statements. To highlight their ambiguity, he divided the line statements into two separate utterances: a summary of the image of the hexagram line, and a prognostication based on a careful consideration of the image of the hexagram line. By dividing a line statement into two parts, Zhu Xi turns a line statement into a dialogue between the oracle’s calling to attention and the reader’s response. In this hermeneutical circle, nothing is certain or preordained. The conversation can lead in many directions, sometimes predictable and sometimes unpredictable.

On the surface of it, like Wang Bi, Zhu Xi appears to use the Changes to provoke readers to reflect on their surroundings. However, there is one fundamental difference. For Zhu Xi, a reading of the Changes does not necessarily answer all questions or solve all problems. Rather, it heightens the reader’s sensitivity to the uncertainty and serendipity of human existence. For instance, Ge 革 ䷰ (Radical Change, #49) and Ding 鼎 ䷱ (The Cauldron, #50) are known for highlighting the anxiety and fear in a drastic political change. In Ge, the reader is encouraged to lead a revolt against a tyrant ruler who is causing harm to the public. To underscore the urgency of addressing the political crisis, the revolt is compared to the renewal of lives in seasonal changes; it is paired with the pivotal event of the Shang dynasty being replaced by the Zhou dynasty. Above all, it is described as a timely intervention in human affairs to restore order for the benefit of the masses (for a translation of Ge, see WB67: 189–192). While Ge advocates a regime change, Ding demands the restoration of political order immediately following the revolt. Graphically, the six lines of Ding ䷱ resemble a cauldron—the bottom line represents the legs of the cauldron; the second to fourth lines symbolize the belly of the cauldron; the fifth line denotes the ears of the cauldron, and the top line suggests the bar that carries the cauldron from place to place. Thus, the reader is encouraged to clean the cauldron to make food, or, in the aftermath of a regime change, to immediately re-establish the political order (for a translation of Ding, see WB67: 195–97).

For centuries, the Changes’s commentators heeded the Xugua authors’ advice to read Ge and Ding together as two phases of a regime change (see WB67: 635, 641). While Ge discusses the destructive phase of toppling an old regime, Ding refers to the constructive phase of rebuilding the political order. The two hexagrams jointly call attention to the danger of political corruption, the fear of a tyrant, and the anxiety of losing control amid political upheaval. More important, the two hexagrams highlight the importance of making the right decision amidst power struggles. For this reason, through the centuries, Ge and Ding received special attention from commentators who were interested in political philosophy (see, for instance, Wang Bi’s commentary in Lynn 1994: 444–59).

For Zhu Xi, however, there was no need to connect Ge with Ding. Instead, he sees them as separate situations where readers can ask different questions and express different concerns. For him, the anxiety and fear in the Changes appear not in the hexagram sequence, but in the dialogue between the oracle and the reader. To downplay the political connotations of these two hexagrams, Zhu Xi stresses the intensity of the oracle-reader dialogue. Take, for example, the hexagram statement of Ge which seems to suggest the possibility of “the disappearance of remorse” after political change. For Zhu, there is no way to tell whether “the disappearance of remorse” is possible without considering the reader’s situation. If the reader is doing the right things, then remorse will automatically disappear. But if the reader is making a mistake, remorse will remain. Hence, “the disappearance of remorse” is provisional; whether the oracle will come true rests in reader’s motive, sincerity and action. Similarly, “the disappearance of remorse” in the fourth line of Ge is provisional as well. Traditionally, the fourth line is read as a leader ready to lead a political change. For Zhu Xi, the fourth line does not look like a situation ripe for political change. Rather, he sees “the disappearance of remorse” as a warning against rushing to make drastic changes (Hon 2008).

Likewise, Zhu Xi does not see in Ding a roadmap to form a new regime. Instead, he sees each line of Ding as a separate situation challenging the Changes reader. For instance, in the first yin line, Zhu Xi is not worried about the line’s peripheral position. Rather, he is interested in the prognostication which indicates that the line is “without remorse” (wujiu 无咎). In his comments, Zhu Xi focuses on the subtle meaning of “without remorse” and urges the reader to be positive about the future. He tells the reader that “without remorse” is a result of the first line’s determination to come back from behind and its will to succeed despite its humble position (Hon 2008).

Ultimately, for Zhu Xi, all the Changes oracles are provisional. Their goal is to provoke thought, command attention, and above all, make readers aware of the contingency of human existence. By highlighting fear and anxiety in reading hexagrams, Zhu Xi incorporated the Changes into his Neo-Confucian project—an endeavor, he hoped, that would lead to the triumph of the pure and perceptive “mind of the Dao” (daoxin 道心) over the perturbed and perverse “human mind” (renxin 人心). To develop a Confucian moral-metaphysics, Zhu Xi turned to the split second of decision making as a battle ground of one’s moral cultivation. In that split second, Zhu Xi claimed, the human mind is deeply torn between “the mind of the Dao” and “the human mind”, and between “the heavenly principle” (tianli) and “human desires” (renyu) (Adler 2014; Tu 1985: 131–48). In this mental battle, the Changes reader is put into a moral-metaphysical journey. The hexagrams give the readers hope without losing sight of the immense challenge of overcoming mishaps and failure. They promise success if readers find the means to tame their searching minds and to counter the distractions in their lives. Above all, they give spiritual depth to the readers’ moral struggle, turning it into a battle ground between following the dictates of the flesh, or elevating oneself to form a “trinity with heaven and earth”.

In this way, Zhu Xi opened the Changes to a wide range of audience. By focusing on divination and the symbolism of the 64 hexagrams, Zhu Xi made the Changes relevant to readers who might not be well educated. While it remained a canonical text, it was transformed into “a book of life” for common people who struggled daily to make the right decision between the purity of “the heavenly principle” and the perversion of “human desires” (Hon 2012). From the Ming dynasty (1368–1644) to the Qing dynasty (1644–1911), Zhu Xi’s interpretation of the Changes was promoted by the imperial government. It was included in the state-approved Changes commentaries, the Zhouyi daquan 周易大全 (The Compendium of Cheng Yi’s and Zhu Xi’s Commentaries on the Zhou Changes) of the Ming dynasty, and the Zhouyi zhezhong 周易折中 (Balanced Annotations of the Zhou Changes) of the Qing dynasty.

3. Face Changes with Courage and Dignity

On the surface, these three approaches—the cosmological approach, the rational humanistic approach, and the divination approach—appear to steadily narrow the scope of philosophizing change. They seem to continuously move away from the cosmos to the human world, and from the human world to an individual’s moral cogitations. One may even say that in this narrowing of the scope, we see a retreat from the empirical to the intellectual, and from the objective to the subjective.

Yet, in their own ways, these three approaches offer answers to the human anxiety over uncertainty. They give hope to readers by transforming the trigrams and hexagrams into symbols to discuss the human roles in the unfolding of the universe (Cheng 2003; Cheng & Ng 2009; Redmond & Hon 2014: 140–57; R. Smith 2008: 31–48). Together, they make three arguments:

  • Because the universe is an open system that is self-generative and self-transformative, we must live with ceaseless change;
  • Because changes take place all the time, we must find ways to understand their patterns and to navigate their complexity;
  • In every moment, we must be ready to make difficult decisions in order to find peace and comfort in life.

By emphasizing our need to make difficult decisions in the world of constant changes, the authors of Changes are not suggesting us to be over-worried. Rather, they remind us of our limited ability in understanding the complexity and fluidity of our world. After honestly accepting our finitude, the authors of Changes suggest us to be active and aggressive in reshaping our situation. Here, the turnaround rests on our wisdom of knowing what we can and cannot do. We must remain humble and circumspective in our every step. But based on what we know, we make plans to gradually improve our environment. Like a droplet, we rise and fall with the wave of the ocean. Since both the objective reality and the subjective condition are perpetually shifting, the moment of finding a harmonious integration between attainable and unattainable is always transient. When either the objective reality and the subjective condition changes, or worse still, both of them change, the whole equilibrium is upset, and the process of searching for a new equilibrium has to begin anew. On this note, that is no better ending to the Changes than hexagram Weiji 未濟 (䷿ Ferrying Incomplete, #64) because the act of balancing the competing claims and finding certainty in an uncertain world are going to be continuous without end.

For us today, this philosophy of change is refreshing and energizing because it encourages us to be spontaneous, creative, and experimental in coping with the complexity in life. It also draws our attention to the reality of the 21st century world that is dynamic, fluid, multi-layered, and multi-causal due to the global economy and the transnational networks of circulation. More importantly, it reminds us that we are both a subject and an object in making decisions. On the one hand, we are the products of our environment; on the other hand, we are active players in reshaping our environment. In the end, we are who we are—constantly finding our paths in an ever-changing world.


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Other Internet Resources

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