Translating and Interpreting Chinese Philosophy

First published Tue Oct 27, 2015; substantive revision Fri Aug 9, 2019

Issues and problems of interpretation of written texts are distinct from issues and problems of translations of them, but the two can rarely be analyzed apart from each other. Moreover, both are closely related by matters of language. Difficulties encountered in translation of texts obviously generate difficulties in interpreting them, and vice versa: the less confidence we have that we understand what a text is about the more difficult it is to be confident of our own (or anyone else’s) translation of it.

Thus an appreciation of problems discussed in this essay must begin with an examination of the issues and problems stemming from the classical language in which Chinese philosophers wrote and edited their texts long ago, which will not only be necessary for understanding and evaluating the texts themselves, but perhaps useful as well for seeing some more general issues in metaphilosophy, cross-cultural philosophy, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind in a somewhat different light.

A second reason for the complexity of the topics related to this entry is that some knowledge of the early philosophical—and other—texts were and are prerequisite for understanding all later philosophy because of the frequency of the references to them, and also because they provided the basic model for the writing of the later ones. Unfortunately most of these early Chinese texts have come down to us only in corrupted form, increasing significantly the number and variety of issues and problems of translating and interpreting them, especially if our primary concern is to provide exegeses and translations of them in terms of what they meant to the people who first wrote and read them.

Moreover, the texts as we have them in English today have been variously translated and interpreted by scholars and others with very different backgrounds and interests for most of the past two centuries: missionaries first, followed by merchants and diplomats long-term resident in China, followed in the 20th century by academics from a wide variety of disciplines, including history, literature, linguistics, religion, Asian Studies (sinology), and now, for the past several decades, philosophers. Needless to say, many different translations and interpretations of virtually all of the classical texts mirror closely the disparate concerns and agendas of their publishers. They all do, however, share a decidedly Western orientation in style, outlook, methodology, and more; seldom are things viewed from the Chinese perspective, and consequently charges of a Eurocentric bias in Chinese philosophy as a field of study are unfortunately not without merit, increasing yet again the problems of interpreting them appropriately.

In addition to the unusual nature of the classical Chinese language, corrupted texts, and the variety of people who have worked with them, a fourth reason for the complexity of the topic of this entry is also the reason significantly responsible for its being the only one of its kind in this Encyclopedia. There are no entries under “Translating and Interpreting…” for Greek philosophy, for example, nor German Idealism or French Postmodernism. Even Indian philosophy lacks such an entry. This fact should bring home not just the singularity of the classical Chinese written language, compared to contemporary languages derived from the proto-Sanskrit Indo-European family of languages written in alphabet scripts, but remind us as well of the greater distance between Chinese and other cultures from past to present. This is in good measure due to geography: India and Greece have been in contact since before the Alexandrian conquests, but the Himalayas, Xinjiang and Gobi deserts, and the East China Sea made for a fairly solitary cultural development in China that for many centuries hindered cross-cultural intercourse except for the cultures on its periphery, Korea, Japan, and areas of Southeast Asia. The Silk Roads notwithstanding, we find few cross-cultural western links with the Chinese as we do for the Indian (as, e.g., the Hindu god of fire Agni with Latin ignis, root of English “ignite”). It is not necessarily that China is the ultimate “Other” for Europeans and for writers in European traditions, but rather that its heritage is much like European traditions in many of its formal dimensions, yet so different in details, and that writers in European traditions have only come upon the scope and depth of that heritage comparatively recently. It is not for nothing that Leibniz referred to China as the “Oriental Europe” (Leibniz WoC: 12 [1708]).

After coming to understand how the classical Chinese language itself poses problems for translators and interpreters we will then examine other issues methodological, metaphysical, and comparative relating to the reading of classical texts which tend to combine exegetical and translation concerns.

The primary focus will be on those issues in dispute among scholars in the field (not alone philosophers) which have philosophical implications, attempting balanced accounts of both the disputes and the implications. At times authors will be quoted at some length to insure that their positions have not been distorted in the course of their narration.

As noted above, the linguistic focus will be somewhat narrow temporally—by Chinese standards, at least: the period from roughly the 7th through the 1st centuries BCE. Most of the framing texts that became canonical in one tradition or another were written, compiled, edited, and much else during this period, and the classical language grew and was maturing at the same time. It continued to grow during the whole of later Chinese history, and canonical texts were added to the corpus throughout the same period; but the bases for both were laid during the earlier period, some knowledge of which were (and are) requisite for interpreting and translating them.

None of what has been said up to this point is to suggest that studying Chinese language and early thought is only for the classically curious and linguistically intrepid. There has been an explosion of scholarly growth in classical Chinese studies over the past half-century, sufficient in both breadth and depth to allow non-specialists to read translations of Chinese philosophical texts with sensitivity and understanding. Translations of primary and secondary texts and philosophical commentaries thereon have grown apace, with a multiplicity of exegetical orientations, as have literary, historical, religious, and other studies that collectively have been shrinking the claimed mysteriousness of the East almost to the vanishing point. There are, for instance, over 150 translations in English alone of the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching), and a dozen different renditions of the Confucian Analects are in common use today in courses dealing with Chinese thought. Thus a paucity of materials can no longer be used as an excuse for not including classical Chinese philosophical texts in undergraduate courses, or indeed in the several philosophical discourses now current in professional circles. Some rudimentary knowledge of how the language works can also be of value to readers in their academic studies and/or participation in these discourses, not least by helping them in understanding and analyzing how and why both translations and interpretations of Chinese philosophical texts can and do differ from each other—at times in significant ways, thus enabling them to evaluate their readings in the subject matter for themselves. It may serve as well to see some contemporary issues in philosophy of language, or mind, or in metaphysics from a slightly different perspective, and for all these reasons this entry may also serve in a small way as a “state of the art” essay on the field.

1. The Classical Chinese Language: What, How, and Why Does It Convey What It Conveys?

1.1 Chinese Characters

Odd as these three initial questions may appear, all of them have been asked and answered differently by Western linguists at one time or another. To be sure, much sophisticated work has been done over the past century, and there is a general consensus on a variety of phonetic, syntactic, and semantic matters. But disputes on an equally wide range of other issues are just as numerous, with evidence and arguments being advanced for incompatible theses about the different dimensions of the language(s). Many of these issues have implications philosophers should not ignore when engaged in translation and/or interpretation, and perhaps should not ignore even when working closely only in the contemporary Western philosophical tradition.

European scholars have been fascinated by the Chinese written language since the early Jesuit missionaries to China began writing about it in the late 16th century. A little later Andreas Muller claimed to have worked out a “key” for Chinese in the 1670s, which excited the young Leibniz, already keenly interested in all things sinological since at least 1668 (Leibniz WoC: 11 [1668]). At about the same time Jacob Gohl wrote a book arguing that the language had to have been invented all at once (Duyvendak 1936). John Webb argued instead that Chinese was the primitive language of the human race (1669). Leibniz retained his interest in the language as well as all else having to do with China, but fairly early gave up on the possibility of the written language being the basis of the “Universal Characteristic” he sought as the basis for reasoning throughout his life (Leibniz WoC: 38 [1679]).

For the next 150 years the study of the Chinese language was overwhelmingly in the hands of missionaries, merchants, and diplomats to the “Middle Kingdom”, amateurs all, with several insights into the language mixed with fanciful speculations about its origin, nature, and development. Most of these studies had as their major goal ascertaining the extent to which Chinese philosophical and religious beliefs were or were not compatible with “the one true faith” in order for conversion work to go forward.

Coming closer to the present, the disputes about the nature of the language are very different than in Leibniz’s day, but almost equinumerous, beginning with what to call the characters that comprise the written form. Among the candidates nominated for the title are lexigraphs, phonograms, phonic indicators, phonoideographs, logographs, morphographs, sinographs, syllabograms, and syllabo-phonograms (DeFrancis 1984: 73; the list is not complete).

For current purposes it is only necessary to note about this nomenclature that its terms divide between emphasizing that the graphs convey sounds (phonetics), which are in the majority, and a minority suggesting the graphs function basically as conveyers of ideas, or meanings, i.e., semantics (hereafter the more general terms “characters” and “graphs” will continue to be employed interchangeably). Within the general category of the characters there are smaller groupings, the names for which have been commonly agreed upon for some time. Three of these smaller groupings we must examine briefly.

The total number of characters (individual graphs) in the largest Chinese dictionaries is a little under 50,000, but less than a fifth of those are found with any regularity in the classical texts, and still today a working vocabulary of from 5000 to 7000 graphs is considered sufficient for all but the most advanced reading. A very small set of these characters are labelled “pictograms”, or “pictographs”, being basically stylized pictures of what they stand for: “tree” is written 木, the sun 日, and child, 子. These characters are highly stylized now. They better represented what they signified before, but were nevertheless conventional even then, as all characters have been (see below).

The members of a second, still rather small set of characters are generally called “ideographs”, supposedly representing more abstract ideas incapable of being pictured directly. There are two subsets here. The first comprises fairly simple and direct graphs: 一, 二 , and 三 signify 1, 2, and 3 respectively, and 上 and 下 are “above” and “below”, or “high” and “low”. The second subset involves less simple and direct graphs, but they do have much illustrative content. Some famous textbook examples of this category of ideograms are ming, which combines the pictures of the sun 日 and moon 月together to signify the Chinese word for “bright”, 明 (as with English, it also means “intelligent”). Here is a paradigmatic example of the conventionality of the characters. The sun and the moon together do suggest light, illumination, etc. But so would a picture of a candle, or two candles; a fire, or two fires. Many pictures might represent a word, or concept, and consequently, to some extent at least, using sun and moon together for “bright” is arbitrary, the signified cannot be determined unambiguously from the signifier alone; it must become conventional.

Together, pictographs and ideographs make up less than 10% of all Chinese characters. Among the remaining 90+%, far and away the most common are generally referred to as phonetic compounds. These are made up of at least two elements, one of which is semantic, or meaning-indicative, and are called significs or, more misleadingly, radicals. The other element in compound graphs is the phonetic, or sound-indicative component. Thus the word for “spider” in Chinese (zhu) sounds exactly like the word for “dark red” (burgundy, vermilion), so the graph denoting “spider” contains that color word (朱). But to indicate the reference more clearly in its written form, the graph for “insect” (虫) has been added as a signific, obtaining the phonetic compound graph 蛛, zhu.

Phonetic compounds do not, however, form a neat and tidy set. Dao—probably the most pregnant character in the Chinese classical lexicon—has two major components, both of which are significs in themselves, and neither of which is pronounced anything like dao, in either their ancient or modern sounds.

Similarly, the word wu which means “lie”, “falsely accuse”, or “malicious” is and was pronounced like the word for “witch” or “shaman”, 巫, which became the phonetic component of the word when it took on a written form, with “speech”, 言 added as signific. If we now note that witches were not trustworthy in ancient China we end up with a graph signifying “words of a witch”, 誣—but the graph is listed as a phonetic compound, not an ideograph. This example can be generalized: many so-called “phonetic” elements in complex Chinese characters also have semantic content, and often are even more meaning-indicative than the signific. Using similarly-sounding words to generate new meanings for one or more of them is called “paronomasia” (Ames 2008), and at times, homonyms or near-homonyms are used to define a word, a technique used in China’s first dictionary the Shuowen jiezi (ca. 1st century CE).

It probably seems odd that the sounds of a language could be of any import in explicating the philosophies of its speakers: French certainly sounds different than German, but it is highly doubtful the differences are of any philosophical import. The links between spoken and written Chinese in the past, however, are more tenuous than between French or German, contributing to the written language developing a grammar that is sui generis, requiring semantic material on a much larger scale than is common in other languages. And if the grammars of the spoken and written languages differ, one must be very careful when considering the relation of language to thought in ancient (and to some extent modern) China.

In the first place, the Chinese language has only about 400 distinct sounds (virtually all characters are single syllable). Because it employs tones—from four to eight depending on the “dialect”—the sounds may be multiplied to 1600, but this is still a very small number for developing a vocabulary, and of course the sounds are not distributed evenly across the characters. Consequently there are a very large number of homonyms in Chinese. In a modern 5000+ dictionary, for example, there are 81 graphs pronounced yi, 46 of them in the falling tone; 80 graphs are pronounced shi, 15 in the even tone. Anciently there were a number of consonantal endings to the sounds that have since disappeared in most dialects, but even then there would be anywhere from 3 to 10 or more different graphs—hence with different meanings—pronounced in exactly the same way (Karlgren 1966).

What this means is that the written language often cannot be understood when read aloud unless the listeners are already familiar with the passage and what this means in turn is that the written language should probably not be seen as a transcription of speech (Graham 1987: 390; DeFrancis 1984: 126).

All languages have this difficulty with homophones, but those with an alphabet have recourse in their written forms to disambiguate the aural homonymy without a context even though the mechanism is not consistently employed (Cooper 1978: 7). Speakers of English are never confused about the meanings, for example, of “bare” and “bear”, or “flower” and “flour”. “Bear” and “bear” however can cause speakers of English trouble without a context that gives them the animal and not the “carry” reading, or vice versa.

To complicate the graph/sound relation still further, there are some graphs that have different meanings when pronounced differently. 樂, for example, means “music” when pronounced as yue, “joy”, “pleasant”, or “find pleasure in” when pronounced as yao, and “to enjoy” (intransitive) when pronounced as le.

These communicative difficulties could, however, also be seen as a blessing in disguise, for they seem to have given Chinese thinkers two distinct linguistic media for communicating their thoughts and feelings: speaking their native tongue, a natural language, and writing classical Chinese using characters, at least a semi-artificial language (but one with great beauty and power to affect readers). Thus what follows “so-and-so said” in any classical text is very rarely a strict transcription of what the speaker actually said; instead, it very probably indicated in brief form what was meant. Adding a syntactic/stylistic note in this context, one scholarly wit has said of the classical language

Its telegraphic terseness could reflect ordinary speech only if every Chinese speaker were far more laconic than any Gary Cooper character. (Hansen 1992: 34)

Although the grammar of written classical Chinese differs from the language spoken then or now, and it is neither systematic nor complete, one shouldn’t think it was consciously put together by some particularly clever language-oriented members of the Chinese intelligentsia at a particular place and time long ago, as Jacob Gohl did (Duyvendak 1936: 6). Rather is it almost surely a development of the oracle bone inscriptions of the Shang Dynasty (Keightley 1978). Thus the written and spoken languages evolved differently over centuries.

The spoken language, like all others, was undergoing phonetic change much of the time, which the written form could not reflect because of its non-alphabetic nature; hence the rise of the use of phonetic compounds, of which there were already almost 7000 out of the 9350+ graphs recorded in the Shuowen. Because the written form could no longer reflect the sounds of the spoken there was much less incentive to attempt reflecting syntax either, especially when it is kept in mind that the spoken language was indeed continually undergoing change as well, and that to refer to the differences in sounds and sound patterns between them as “dialects” overlooks the fact that some of the variants were (and are) as different from each other as Italian from German. In this sense to say “I speak Chinese” is like saying “I speak European”. So the two language forms evolved separately for the most part, the spoken, we may surmise, much more rapidly, both within and between regional “dialects”.

Factors such as these are what must have led at least one well-known sinologist to claim that “The Chinese characters made Chinese civilization the culture of the book and not the orator” (Creel 1997: 447). This generalization was based in large part on the basis of Creel’s earlier work attempting to show the semantic basis of the majority of the characters, i.e., that they were basically ideographs (1936). Peter Boodberg replied quickly and in detail, offering phonetic explanations for graphs Creel had analyzed as semantic (1937). The debate continued, not without acrimony, with a response from Creel (1938), and a rejoinder from Boodberg (1940). More recently John DeFrancis argued long and hard for the phonetic interpretation of the Chinese script (1984), as did William Hannas, who

rejected the untenable assumption that Chinese characters are “ideographic”, that is, relate to meaning directly without the intervention of language. (1997: 6)

Chad Hansen challenged this phonetic view (1993), arguing for the appropriateness of the semantic emphasis of the graphs on a number of counts, not the least of which was that the Chinese themselves took the graphs to be semantically and not phonetically based, and that they used the ideograph rather than the phonogram as the unit of classification of their dictionaries. He was quickly rebuked for engaging in “scientific creationism” (Unger 1993: 949; see the pages following Unger for Hansen’s rejoinder).

In addition to the problem of ignoring the Chinese scholars’ view of their own language, the phonetics-based position suffers from the fact that the graphs do not make for an efficient representation of the sounds of the spoken languages. Both DeFrancis and Hannas, insistent on the characters as basically representations of sounds, nevertheless admit they do the job “poorly” (DeFrancis 1984; Hannas 1997: 1).

Establishing the precise nature of the relationship between phonetic and the semantic elements of classical Chinese is not an easy task; it is closer and more complex than it may seem at first, especially when we take historical context into account. The earliest philosophers conveyed their views orally, not in written form, with the Confucian Analects as a prime example; more than half the entries begin, as above, with “The Master said”, even when what follows is paraphrase, unless extremely brief. It is of importance, however, that readers of the Analects always keep in mind that the Master was engaged in conversation with his students. There is a dynamism in the text that is difficult to appreciate if it is overread.

Further, China’s most revered book of poems is also its oldest (ca. 8th century BCE), and the poems were and are centrally concerned with sounds and sound patterns (and Confucius insisted his students study it). Moreover, far and away the best means of memorizing texts or parts of them is by knowing how to pronounce the graphs in sequential order. Indeed, many works in the canon were consciously rhymed at times during their composition to aid memorization as a philosophical exercise (we will have more to say on this theme in §4.2). On the other hand, once you know that “to lie” is depicted as “the words of a witch” you will likely not forget it. On the one hand again, over 90% of the characters have a phonetic element in them. But on the other, the Chinese themselves used semantics and not phonetics for the construction of their dictionary classification system, as Hansen noted.

The place of rhetoric in China is also contested. Like Creel, another well-known sinologist could say “We know of no early oratorical tradition in China” (Crump 1964: 36), and a communications scholar maintains that there was no tradition of rhetoric in China (Murphy 1983: 3). Others allow that there was, but it was not worth much. To them, “Chinese rhetoric is characterized by harmony, deprecation of speech, and lack of interest in logic” (Lu and Frank 1993: 445). Contradicting all of these latter generalizations is a lengthy work entitled Rhetoric in Ancient China, Fifth to Third Century B.C.E. (Lu 1998).

Clearly the relation of sound to meaning in classical Chinese is not yet established to the satisfaction of all, linguists, sinologists, or otherwise. The issues involved, as we are seeing, extend far beyond linguistics normally construed to include problems in philosophy—Chinese and Western—and politics. In the words of one contemporary scholar:

In the scholarly war over the nature of Chinese writing, while the two sides are engaged in earnest battles, the Chinese scholars are onlookers, whose views are almost completely ignored. (Gu 2014: 695)

There is more to be said about these matters, but first we must consider briefly what links sound and meaning together in any language: syntax.

1.2 On the Syntax of Classical Chinese

Roughly speaking, if phonetics/phonology is the study of the relation of words to their sounds, and semantics the relation of words to meaning, then syntax is the study of the relation of words to each other, which is what we usually think of as grammar. Classical Chinese is an isolating language, meaning that each graph stands alone at all times, in isolation, without affixes of any kind, and unmarked for case, number, gender, or tense. The third-person pronoun ta can be he, him, her, she, it; they, them. And so can the graph qi, 其. qu, 去, retains exactly that form for go, going, gone, and went. What follows is that most Chinese characters can serve equally as both nouns and verbs, and modifiers too (adjectives and adverbs); apart from context no graph has a unique grammatical function. Word order is supposedly fixed, being Subject-Verb-Object, but so-called nouns regularly default to verbs (e.g., “running is a strenuous exercise”). Style also made the topic subject of the sentence difficult to ascertain, as when the head noun or object was omitted whenever context made it even slightly clear who or what it was.

Not infrequently the identity of the omitted subject was not clear, even to fairly knowledgeable readers. Consider one of the love poems in the Book of Odes about a noblewoman and her knightly lover, translated three different ways. First, (Legge 1871: 150):

“The cock has crowed
The court is full”
But it was not the cock that was crowing,—
It was the sound of the blue flies.

Second (Waley 1960: 37):

The Lady: The cock has crowed; it is full daylight
The Lover: It was not the cock that crowed,
It was the buzzing of those green flies.

Third, (Pound 1954: 45):

Cock’s crow’d. The courtiers are all
Crowding the hall.’
Cock hasn’t, she lies
But one hears some blue flies.

Now in the first translation, we don’t know who says the cock has crowed. In the second it is the Lady, and in the third, her lover. And these patterns continue through the remaining stanzas. Clearly the poem will be differently understood and enjoyed depending on who we think is saying what. Legge and Waley are very well known translators, and if some sinologists arch their eyebrows at including Ezra Pound’s work—he knew only the rudiments of classical Chinese when he began it—there are others who admire Pound’s efforts, especially his translation of the Analects as well as the Odes (Harbsmeier 1990: 140; for an appreciation of Pound of another kind in this regard, see Nylan 2014: xxxiii–xl). An equally ubiquitous stylistic rule was to employ parallel construction of sentences. At times this proved extremely helpful for interpreting opaque sentences, when they preceded or followed others structurally the same. But just as often vagueness and/or indeterminacy resulted for all save the first pair.

Thus, while matters of style are formally distinguished from syntax in the study of languages, they are neverthless linked closely together in classical Chinese, making many sentences difficult to understand even in context. (At times it makes them easier: style, especially parallelism, can at times indicate the best syntactic reading of a passage). Overall—especially with its lack of inflections—the language can be said to be “syntactically overdetermined” in that there may well be a number of grammatically possible ways of interpreting a syntactically generated sentence (Fuller 1999: 2; Karlgren 1962). In a number of cases more than one reading will be consistent with the context of the section, and/or the entire text. This situation is exacerbated by the lack of punctuation in early classical Chinese: no periods, colons, semi-colons, dashes, commas, or parentheses were inserted into texts until much later, and both then and now you can get very different readings of a text depending on where you place a comma and/or a period (for example: “John thought Marsha was a fool”; “John, thought Marsha, was a fool”). The written language compensates in part for the lack of punctuation marks by the use of “function words”, graphs that have little or no meaning on their own, but serve as grammatical instructions: zhe, 者, for example, usually nominalizes what precedes it; ye, 也, is a phrase-final marker; hu, 乎, concludes sentences to be read interrogatively; and so on. A few other graphs serve as both function words and meaning words. The graph zhi, 之, is a sign of the genitive. Unfortunately for easy reading, it can also be used as a pronoun, and as another word for “to go”. That is to say, it is not always easy to see the syntactic category into which zhi should be placed in a sentence. Indeed, it has even been maintained that while the focus of language in English is the sentence, in classical Chinese it is context (DeFrancis 1984: 52; Hansen 1992: 34).

There is much more to say about the syntax of classical Chinese, and the ways in which it does not reflect exactly the syntax of the spoken language at any time, but for the purpose of understanding issues of translation in Chinese philosophy, we might let the author of a contemporary textbook of classical Chinese have the last word (Fuller 1999: 2):

[T]here may be several perfectly grammatical ways to explain the syntax of a [classical Chinese] sentence. Skill in reading lies in deciding which alternative is most likely… Such judgments of meaning cannot be based on grammar alone. They rely not only on a knowledge of grammar, but also on a sense of the larger arguments of the sentence, the paragraph, and the composition as a whole.

1.3 On the Semantics of Chinese Characters

As we have seen, a few phonetic and a number of syntactic features of Classical Chinese, singly or severally, can contribute to generating a host of possible interpretations of any given passage(s) in a text, by allowing for multiply grammatical readings of them. In many if not most of these cases more than one of the readings will be consistent with the context, and in keeping with the principle of logical charity when that principle is applicable. At times semantic concerns can reduce the number of interpretive possibilities of a sentence or section, but unfortunately at other times the semantic content of the characters can increase them. This is a major reason why the Daodejing, to take a famous example, is impenetrable to a few, enigmatic to many more, and highly allusive for everyone, and has been the subject of well over 150 translations of it in English alone, as noted earlier.

The opening line of Chapter I reads:

道 可 道 非 常 道
Dao ke dao fei chang dao.

(in first, third, and sixth positions here) means “path”, “way”, “the way”, “to follow”, “to go down a path”. It also means “to speak”, “doctrines”.
functions like English modal “can”.
a sign of negation; usually in the sense of “not the same as”.
“unvarying”, “constant”, “enduring”, “unchanging”.

Literally, then, we have something like “dao can dao not the same as unchanging dao”.

Here are six translations of this passage, all by reputable scholars.

The Way that can be told of is not an Unvarying Way. (Waley n.d.: 141)
The way that can be spoken of is not the constant way. (Lau 1963: 57).
The Tao that can be trodden is not the enduring and unchanging Tao. (Legge 1959: 95)
A Way that can be followed is not a constant Way. (Ivanhoe 2002: 1)
Way-making (dao) that can be put into words is not really way-making. (Ames and Hall 2003: 77)
As to a Dao—
If it can be specified as a Dao
It is not a permanent Dao. (Moeller 2007: 3)

A bit of syntax first. Translations 1–4 all take the first and third occurrences of dao as nouns, the second as a verb. 5 makes verbs of all three, and 6 pretty much makes nouns of all three. Nothing in the original strictly prohibits any of these; the ultimate determinant of each translation almost surely had more to do with the translator’s interpretation of the text overall than with its language.

Turning to semantics, while all six translations have family resemblances to one another, philosophically the ontological claims made in 1, 2, 4 and 6 are different from 3 and 5 with respect to the nature of the dao: in the former, if you can talk about it, it isn’t a (or the) unchanging dao; whereas in 3 and 5 the claim is that if you can walk (tread, follow) the (or a) dao it isn’t a (or the) unchanging dao. The articles in parentheses are also of ontological import here: “a dao is surely different from “the” dao (there are no articles in Chinese). Four of the translators had “way”/“tao”/“dao” grow capital letters, presumably to tell the reader something more than would be conveyed by using lower case (impossible in the original, of course). But what exactly is it that is being conveyed?

Dao is by no means the only character with such different meanings, although it is a special case. De, 德, has the same multiplicity of them: “virtue”, “power”, “excellence”, “force”, “conduct”, “charisma”. And so do many other graphs of philosophical import. At the same time, many other graphs do not have meanings different enough to cause philosophical problems of interpretation. Fa, 法, entries, for example, include “law”, “regulation”, “method”, “pattern”, where the general meaning of fa is fairly clear, or at least clear enough that any of the English terms could normally be used to translate it without undue loss of meaning, or philosophical distortion.

Returning now to the first line of the Daodejing, all six of the translators can proffer good reasons for choosing the English words they used; their translations are consistent with Chinese syntax and semantics, but without context it is impossible to ascertain which meaning the author of the sentence intended; indeed, we don’t know which of the several contributors to the text wrote the first line. The principle of logical charity is no help in this case—assume that the author(s) do not contradict themselves—because the Daodejing is notorious for being paradoxical: Chapter 56 begins: “Those who know do not speak; Those who speak do not know”, which is clearly intentional, and rhetorically efficacious despite its logical invitation to a charge of tu quoque. It thus makes no sense at all to ask which of the six translations is the correct one, or even the best one, except on the basis of an interpretation of the text as a whole, all six of which currently on offer herein contest the others. Indeed there is a high probability that the author of the line intended the ambiguity attendant on the construal of the second dao, in which case it becomes impossible to give the correct translation in English. One long-time student of early Daoism summed up the matter succinctly: “Reading [it] is an act of creation” (Welch 1971: 11). We will return to the theme of ambiguity—both syntactic and semantic—in §4.2.

If the student new to the study of Chinese philosophy takes away one idea from this brief summarization of a complex set of interconnected linguistic issues focusing on texts, perhaps the most fruitful one would be that the writing of philosophy in classical Chinese affects the philosophy written in a number of ways that call into question the unquestioned assumption that writing is simply transcribed speech, relatively unaffected by its means of transmission. This is a dubious idea for any language, but especially suspect with classical Chinese. Consider the following from Michael Nylan, writing about the compositions of the Han Dynasty scholar-official and author Yang Xiong (53 BCE–18 CE):

Phrases replete with reduplicatives, verbal alliteration and rhymes would have delighted the tongue and the ears. The eye would have been attracted by the dance of the black ink graphic patterns on the silk scroll or bamboo bundle, especially where there was visual alliteration. (Nylan 2011: 63)

A second useful idea to retain would be that relatively few issues of translation of early Chinese texts can be resolved once for all on linguistic grounds alone. Even judging better from worse readings almost always hinges more on the interpretation given to the text by the interpreter and/or translator, and the purpose(s) for which the translation was done, topics to which we will now turn. We will begin with some issues that are of import both in contemporary Western philosophy and for the student of Chinese thought, following which we will concentrate directly on the latter.

2. Metaphysical Issues

2.1 Can Machines Think in Chinese Rooms?

As we begin to address the major issues and problems in the interstices between translation and interpretation a major problem arises immediately, for some scholars would claim that there are no such issues or problems: translations and interpretations are, and should be kept distinct. Many proponents of machine translation and Artificial Intelligence (AI ) are prime examples of this orientation, and the field has become far more sophisticated than in the days when the term “hydraulic ram” in an article on dam construction came out “water buffalo” in the Russian. Many advances have been made in the purely linguistic dimensions of mechanical translation, enough, obviously, to maintain at least minimal plausibility for the claim of distinctness between the two endeavors, especially because of the rising number of users of automatic translation on their laptops. But as those users also realize, when the text to be translated exceeds the phrase level by much, context must enter in to achieve correct outcomes. In context, Khrushchev’s famous “We will bury you” at the U.N. translated fairly literally a Russian colloquialism for which the English equivalent would almost surely have been “We will leave you in the dust” (he was talking about the difference between planned and market economies at the time). Had the U.N. interpreter heeded context, the Cold War might have been less chilling, and thus perhaps less dangerous.

With classical Chinese context is almost always essential for translation, making some interpretation equally necessary. This may be a low level of interpretation, of course; simply ascertaining the correct subject of a sentence where no subject is present, or inferring a verb from a prior occurrence, without going into any metaphysical speculations. We should note in passing, however, that this Chinese example does not automatically refute the machine translation claim of the separateness of the two efforts of translation and interpretation. If it is indeed the case that classical Chinese is not a close transcription of speech (which it isn’t), but embodies a grammar (which it pretty much does), it can be argued that it is thus at least somewhat not a natural language in the way Natural Language Processing scholars use the term for written documents they work with, and hence not a genuine counterexample to the AI claim.

This issue bears directly on another well known philosophical controversy. In 1980 John Searle published his famous “Chinese Room Argument” (Searle 1980). He was attempting to counter the AI claim that computers could be said to be intelligent—could think, had minds—if they could pass the “Turing Test” (Turing 1950). His argument was that the Turing test was inadequate for establishing computer intelligence, conducting a thought experiment in which a person placed in a room with an appropriate computer program, could “read” strings of symbols (Chinese characters) slid under the door into the computer, and the program would generate an appropriate symbolic response, hence pass the “Turing Test” for intelligence even though the person at the computer didn’t recognize a single Chinese graph. The “test” was that if 70% of the people (later reduced to 30%) who engaged in the keyboard exchanges for five minutes could not tell the AI responses from those of a native Chinese speaker, the machine was intelligent.

A vast literature has grown up around the “Chinese Room Argument”, in the philosophy of mind and related areas, which it would take us too far afield to consider herein. But we should note that Searle’s example presupposes that it is modern spoken Chinese that is being recorded, not the classical language. In the former, the parts of speech can normally be established by syntax alone, surely an asset in sorting out semantic elements appropriately. But the classical language always requires context to make clear the grammatical function of a graph, and it will surely be a long time (if ever) before any program could include not only the syntax, but all of the contexts necessary for correctly “reading” the semantics of the sentence(s). Establishing context requires common sense, which computers remain notorious for lacking.

Replacement tests for Turing’s based on common sense are now being worked on, (Levesque, et al. 2012), and a future work may allow appropriate exchanges in classical Chinese to pass such a test. But until then Searle’s conclusion about the inseparability of translation and interpretation will continue to have force, and we can get on with the issues and problems attendant on the links between them in Chinese Philosophy as they impinge on contemporary metaphysical concerns.

2.2 On a Very Different Idea of Conceptual Schemes

In 1973 Donald Davidson published an influential paper claiming, nuances aside, that the idea of cognitive relativism—with truth relative to particular conceptual schemes—was incoherent. Davidson’s argument hinges on his rejection of what he calls “The third dogma of empiricism”, namely, that we can meaningfully distinguish conceptual schemes from an uninterpreted reality—taken as “a neutral ground” or “coordinate system”—by means of which we could compare and contrast differing conceptual schemes. He says:

In giving up dependence on the concept of an uninterpreted reality …we do not relinquish the concept of objective truth—quite the contrary. Given the dogma of a dualism of scheme and reality, we get conceptual relativity, and truth relative to a scheme. Without the dogma, this kind of relativity goes by the board. Of course truth of sentences remains relative to language, but that is as objective as can be. (Davidson 1973: 20)

Angus Graham rejected Davidson’s claim, saying that the postulation of conceptual schemes different from our (modern Western) one was “inescapable” for scholars of the language and thought of other cultures, and indeed, “that the very idea was an indispensable tool for such inquirers, to which Davidson’s objections did not directly apply.” (Graham 1992: 59).

The idea that truth might be relative to a conceptual scheme, however, was as abhorrent to Graham as it was incoherent to Davidson. To be sensitive to the differing thought patterns of another culture while yet not descending into philosophical unintelligibility or epistemological chaos Graham argued that languages not having a common ancestor will seldom have synonymous terms in their lexicons, and consequently many sentences in such languages (i.e., English and Chinese) will not be fully intertranslatable because they do not express the same proposition (1992: 65). He can thus hold to a conception of truth by claiming that “if a true statement does have a translation equivalent … the latter will be true as well” (1992: 68).

The major problem with Davidson’s account is that he construes “conceptual schemes” as sets of propositions, on the basis of which he is claiming that there can only be one such true set. But as we have already begun to see—and will see more of—from the example of Chinese philosophy written in classical Chinese, the Chinese concern is much more with naming, syntax, and what we might call “written rhetoric”—composing persuasive ideas and transmitting them for effect both visually and aurally—rather than truth in the propositional sense (for which there is no close lexical equivalent in Chinese). Hansen has gone the farthest with this claim throughout his major work: “… language is a social practice. Its basic function is guiding action” (1992: 3).

Indeed, for Graham and others the acceptance of the idea of differing conceptual schemes to explain different vocabularies and syntactic patterns is one important reason that makes the study of Chinese philosophy interesting, so long as we also treat the different schemes as equals and not treat one as in any way inferior to the other. Seen as equals, it then becomes

… possible to use one to criticize something in another, as Fingarette uses Confucius to undermine our inner/outer dichotomy, Rosemont the problematic of moral choice, Hall and Ames the concept of transcendence. (Graham 1992: 78)

We will be inclined to think of conceptual schemes as either true or false if they are seen as systems of propositions as Davidson is implying, but we can also view them as “a pre-logical pattern of names … as the product of the classifying act of naming”, according to Graham (1992: 68). And this is a proper area of study for linguists, sinologists and philosophers; indeed, for Graham and many others it is an area necessary to study for discussing similarities and differences cross-culturally with any precision or clarity (1992: 69).

There is, however, another dimension of Davidson’s position that is also connected directly to his concern with propositional truth as the locus of a “conceptual scheme”, but connected in another way.

2.3 The Hypothesis of the Relativity of Linguistics

That idea can and does also refer to an overall way of being in and responding to one’s world, which has been an important topic in philosophy and linguistics since Benjamin Lee Whorf, who along with his teacher Edward Sapir developed what has come to be known as the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis of linguistic relativity. Stated simply the thesis is that the way human beings perceive and describe the world in which they live is a function of the structure of the native language(s) they acquire to describe and interact with it. In Whorf’s words,

…[T]he grammar of each language is not merely a reproducing instrument for voicing ideas but rather is itself the shaper of ideas, the program and guide for the individual’s mental…development. (1956: 212)

There is a “strong” version of the hypothesis, namely, that the language structures determine the conceptual map we employ in negotiating our world, and a weaker version that those structures influence construction and use of the map, or to return to Davidson’s language, the “conceptual scheme”. Relatively few people subscribe to the strong version of the hypothesis, but the weaker formulation has many adherents. For thinking about translation issues, however, it is useful to note that the standard objection to the strong interpretation of Whorf’s claim is that if it was correct, he wouldn’t be able to give examples of it. Davidson (among others), argues that Whorf endeavors to describe the alien metaphysics of the Hopi, based on their language, using, of course, English (Davidson 1973: 5). Mandelbaum does the same for Whorf’s account of Apache and Shawnee (1979: 67). The point of the objection in both cases is that major differences between languages in what they identify or call our attention to notwithstanding, they may all be described in a single language.

But that is not the point that a strong version of Whorf emphasizes. As Graham argued,

Whorf would hardly have denied that bilingual readers would be clearer about the divergence with an equally sophisticated Hopi account to compare with his. (1992: 68)

Of course we can give an account of different patterns of syntax and naming—not different truths—between languages, in a single language; that is what field linguists do, and increasingly, comparative philosophers. Given that the 47 Eskimo words for “snow” has been exposed as a hoax (Pullum 1991: 166) we must take another example of the Whorfian orientation and its implications. In China, native speakers do not seem to have grandparents or siblings simpliciter. Rather do they have individual lexical items for mother’s father, mother’s mother, father’s father, father’s mother; and until the one child policy went into effect they had younger brothers and older brothers, and the same for sisters. Many of them will also use distinguishing kin names for other elders with whom they stand in a relation, whereas English makes do with generic “aunt” and “uncle”. There is nothing at all mysterious here, nor any question of truth: the Chinese simply have many more and specific kinship terms than English speakers.

A more complicated if not mysterious situation obtains, however, when we shift from simple naming to matters more syntactic. Graham again (1992: 78):

Since the interrogative words of different languages are not synonymous, and connect with their syntactic structures, it seems inevitable that Aristotle or anyone else asking questions with them will be categorizing along lines initially set by the language in which he thinks.

Appreciating the full significance of what Graham is saying here for issues of translation and interpretation is difficult at first, for the very simple reason that the Aristotelian categories are quite familiar to students of Western philosophy, having been conveyed to them in translations from the Greek into English; therefore the interrogatives of Greek won’t seem all that foreign to us, and we feel fairly confident that we can read and understand Aristotle pretty much as he intended to be read.

Thus, if we think only in terms of translating into or out of our native tongue, and draw all our examples therefrom, many of the more general linguistic and conceptual difficulties attendant on the work of translation and textual exegesis elude our understanding against the Whorfian perspective. To see what is at stake, let us suppose that a South Asian philosopher wished to translate Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason into Sanskrit. At first blush it appears that there will be a fair amount of semantic overlap in the vocabularies (perhaps not entirely surprising, both German and Sanskrit being Indo-European languages). For the dual nature of the world, saṃsāra can work very well for phenomena (the world of experience), and the non-negative dimensions of nirvana can stand duty for noumenal (The world beyond, of which we cannot speak or know directly). The fits are not exact, but close. Maya approximates Erscheinungswelt (the world of appearances), and dharma seems to embody pretty well Kant’s overarching concern with the concept of duty, especially since dharma also means and is closely bound up with ’law,’ matching Kant’s linking of duty and (moral) law.

These semantic parallels are not inconsequential, but it is highly unlikely that by utilizing a Sanskrit vocabulary Kant’s philosophy is going to come through a translation at all clearly. What, for example, to do with karma? It does not appear in the Critique or in any of Kant’s other writings. The Hindu Sanskritist, however, might believe that every rational person had an idea of karma even though it might not always be explicit beyond the confines of Indian civilization, and therefore feel justified in attributing the concept to Kant implicitly, and get on with his translation and exegesis. Of course for us this will not do; it is incredible that the concept of karma played any role whatsoever in Kant’s thinking. But if this be admitted, then the employment of the other terms adumbrated above becomes suspect, for their meanings are linked intimately not only to each other, but to karma. The dharma of each of us is determined by our karma, the chains of which, speaking figuratively, we must break if we are to escape samsara for nirvana.

Thus Whorf seems to require translators and interpreters—of non-Indo-European language materials in particular—to think about how best to explicate abstract classifications based on grammatical categories and lexical items not found in one of the languages under study. But in addition to the conceptual, it is also imperative to think carefully about how best to explicate the experiential sense of being in the world among speakers of very different languages. Returning to our earlier example of kin terms, the Whorfian orientation suggests we might ask whether or how young Chinese are or are not situated in their families differently than their American cousins, owing to the difference in the specificity of the relations in which they stand and speak with their kin.

That is to say, the Whorfian hypothesis does not have to be construed as having to do solely, or even mainly with truth conditions, but rather with human experiences as they are molded by the languages people speak that affect the contexts of their experiences. This is what seems to be the point of the Whorfian hypothesis: there are very different ways we may describe and be in the world we inhabit jointly, but experience differently because of our language and cultural determinants, and thus describe in ways that may not be altogether intertranslatable with a language that molded different experiences for its speakers.

Thus the translator and exegete must struggle to convey the ways of being in the world the authors of their texts indicate in their writings, and learn how to get around the problems caused by the fact that not all passages from the Chinese classical texts are fully intertranslatable into English. It is an important struggle which few translators have engaged in, but must begin to tackle if the charge of a Eurocentric bias in Chinese philosophy is ever going to be fully met (see §3.4, below).

Conceptual relativism does not follow from these claims. It would follow only if two languages were fully intertranslatable, but that a true statement in one turned out to be false in the other; so far no plausible examples of this possibility have been advanced. Thus truth conditions à la Davidson should not be of direct concern in these contexts—but will be in the consideration of how to deal with incommensurability with respect to exegetical methodologies, to which we will turn in §4.1.

3. Why Interrogate Chinese Philosophical Texts?

3.1 Introduction

There are almost as many answers to this question as there are comparative philosophers working in the field of Chinese thought. Herein we may cover only a few of them as illustrative of more general trends and tendencies. Moreover, the reader must bear in mind that a great many translations and accounts of Chinese philosophy have been and still are made by non-philosophers, adding more answers to the question of why the texts are deemed worthy of interrogation than can be taken up herein.

Despite the multiplicity of appropriate responses to the questions, however, the reasons for asking them basically reduce to two, and they hold not only for Chinese writings, but all foreign philosophical texts. We translate and interpret them in order to 1) learn more about the people in the culture whence the text came; and/or 2) to learn more about ourselves and our own culture. That is to say, most texts worthy of translation and exegesis are both windows on the culture that produced them and mirrors of our own.

There are numerous ways these goals can be achieved individually, and together, depending on the nature of the approach to the texts. First we will examine briefly the interrogation of Chinese texts against the background of the problems, patterns of argument and standards of rational justification in the Western philosophical tradition; its “grammar”, so to speak (Makeham 2012: xii). The governing idea is that although surely different, Chinese thinkers have enough in common with their Western counterparts to make associative and contrastive comparisons between them and/or their ideas a useful method of engagement with the text.

Then, in the following section (3.3) the texts are interrogated a little differently, with the governing idea being something like a “hermeneutics of suspicion” in reverse. With this approach the “grammar” of the Western philosophical tradition is downplayed to the extent possible, the exegetes and translators believing that it distorts the Chinese materials by overwriting them with distinctly Western concerns; we should not look for theodicean writings in a culture without a concept of an all-good creator God. Instead of asking “To what extent do these texts suggest answers to philosophical questions that vex us?” they tend to ask “ To what extent do these texts suggest we might ask different philosophical questions?” Finally, in §3.4 we will sketch quickly the problematik of Chinese philosophers in China, and how and why it overlaps only slightly at present with the Western approaches.

3.2 The Comparative Approach

For the great majority of Anglophone and European comparative philosophers of China the Western philosophical heritage is the basis for the comparisons. This may or may not be regrettable, but is in some measure unavoidable because it is obviously the more familiar tradition and the ground of the comparativist’s views. It is hard to imagine any scholar essaying a translation of a text without some knowledge of what it’s about, and its importance, and for philosophers that “aboutness” and the importance stem from conceptions drawn from the translator’s own philosophical training, which is the kernel from which the interpretation will grow. Obviously close and careful readings of the text can alter—perhaps significantly—the original interpretation given to it, but an interpretation of some kind we tend to have at all times when working with a Chinese classical text (or any other).

Some texts wear their interpretations pretty much on their sleeves; it is hard to interpret the “Legalist” Hanfeizi text as a Confucian treatise because of the extent to which it is a criticism thereof, championing a system of regulations and laws that was an anathema to The Master. Most Chinese classical texts are not, however, of this kind, as we should already expect from our earlier discussion about the classical language. They require a good deal of interpretive analysis and evaluation. Almost none of them are pure, the work of a single author and unaffected by the vagaries of history or the ravages of time. They are composites, with fragments of several texts often strung together by we-know-not who, then burned in large quantities during the bibliographic holocaust of 213 BCE and the destruction of the libraries during the civil war that followed soon afterward; with remaining copies re-assembled—again by the nameless—and that is pretty much the way they have come down to us. Greater understanding of several texts has come from unearthing very old copies of them written on bamboo or silk at recently excavated archaeological sites, particularly those at Mawangdui in Hunan and Guodian in Hubei; but it remains that virtually every work we have today is more or less corrupt.

The composite nature of most texts also means there can be no tidy classification system for them either, nor even for their parts at times: labelling this chapter of a text Daoist, or Mohist, and that one more or less Confucian ignores the fact that there were a large number of ideas current in the classical period, with different thinkers adopting and adapting them in different ways. We may speak of lineages—the followers of a particularly gifted teacher—but few scholars any longer think of clear and distinct philosophical “schools”.

One highly composite text—both ideologically and temporally—is the Analects of Confucius, a long string of abbreviated statements by or about Confucius and his students, not put into its present form until at least two centuries after he died in 479 BCE (Kim and Csikszentmilhalyi 2014). Most translations and exegeses of the text place great emphasis on his ethics, and those of his successors, especially Mencius. They have been interpreted against the background of consequentialism (Im 2011); Christianity (Legge 1871); Kantian (many mainland scholars ever since Liang Qichao and his student Mou Zongsan a century ago); as virtue ethics, Aristotelian and otherwise (most comparativists working in the field today; see Tiwald 2010); as Character ethicists (Kupperman 2004); as one among several “natural moralities” (Wong 2006); or their views have been addressed against the background of differing strands of feminist ethics (Raphals 1998; Li 2000; Wang 2003; Rosenlee 2007).

It would be a mistake to ask which of these readings of the Analects or the early Confucians in general is the correct one. In the first place, we must note that all of the ethical theories save one are Western, and the questions focus on which one best fits with early Confucian writings. Even more basically, the concept of ethics as a delimitable field of philosophy is itself Western, not Chinese, which problematizes even more the question of “correctness”. Consequently the translator/exegete must constantly guard against reading out of the text simply what he or she has read into it. Rather obviously Confucius and his successors could not hold all these ethical positions, and perhaps they didn’t hold any of them, or any ethical theory at all. Thus all these interpretations can’t possibly be right, and more probably they are all of them wrong in at least some respects.

Indeed, perhaps even to suggest right and wrong is wrong here. If the reader wants only to know what the statements in the Analects originally meant to those who first heard them then all these philosophical readings must be suspect in some degree. A more purely narrative and less analytic/evaluative approach is called for. Asking how much like Aristotle the sayings of Mencius may be is different from ascertaining how King Liang heard them when Mencius supposedly first spoke to him.

Answering the latter question is more often done by sinologists with disciplinary training other than philosophy, in which the issues are more philological, etymological and historical (see Brooks and Brooks 2001), but a number of philosophers have well served the profession by focusing heavily on the translation rather than exegetical side of comparative work, saving their exegetical remarks, if any, for introductions or notes (an older example is D.C. Lau’s Tao Te Ching (1963), a newer one Eric Hutton’s Xunzi (2014)). Again, textual problems arising from this kind of activity tend to be more philological and historical than exegetical or philosophical, even though the texts are basically philosophical.

Both questions, however, are important ones with respect to translation and textual exegesis, for both can generate significant insights. Asking whether Confucius may be legitimately construed as a closet consequentialist, or feminist, can enlarge the reader’s view of these ethical orientations, as well as illumine a number of dimensions of the Master’s views. On the other hand, striving to give an account of a thinker or group of them at the time they lived allows readers more conceptual room to form their own judgements about the value of the views in the translation and/or exegesis.

We may see the same points with another type of comparative textual scholarship done philosophically, examining similarities and differences between a specific Chinese and a specific Western thinker. One might take two intellectual giants from their cultures and juxtapose them, like Aristotle and Confucius (Sim 2007; Yu 2007; Ivanhoe 2014). Or investigate how much like Kierkegaard’s anti-rationalist reaction to Hegel is Zhuangzi’s skepticism about reason (Carr and Ivanhoe 2000). Or choose two disparate thinkers, and employ new comparative practices to elucidate some ostensibly similar concepts in differing cultural contexts (Yearley 1990).

What can be learned from such studies? Taking the Aristotle/Confucius comparisons, we learn just how much weight Confucius gave to rituals, family, customs and traditions as prerequisite for flourishing personal lives and social harmony, for example. The weight grows even heavier when we reflect that Aristotle said almost nothing about rituals, family, customs and traditions, though he dealt in great detail with great sensitivity in virtually all aspects of human life personal and social. By his silence on ritual matters he obliges us to look at Confucius’s insistence on those dimensions of human life again. He was deeply concerned with ritual performance; why?

In the same way we may obtain new insights into Aristotelianism: there are libraries full of commentaries on the writings of Aristotle gathered over the past two millennia, but it is doubtful that any of them commented on the significance of the absence of any concern with ritual matters in those writings. By placing Confucius alongside him the lacunae quickly becomes obvious, and invites our contemplation.

Another dimension of the comparative approach involves focusing on a specific audience for the comparativist’s translation work and commentary. If we believe the Mozi resembles Utilitarianism in many respects for instance, the writings of Bentham and Mill can serve well as the interpretive framework for our efforts. The specific syntactic patterns and lexical items we employ, however, plus notes and commentary, will be somewhat different if we are basically writing for a general audience of undergraduates or the general reader than if we are trying to engage other philosophers of a Utilitarian persuasion in dialogue about the contribution(s) the Mohist views can make to the further sophistication of the views of Bentham and Mill (Angle 2014: 229). And with only minor caveats, the same may be said for exegeses of the text in comparative contexts.

Many comparative philosophers also do strict exegeses no less than comparative ones, focusing on simply explicating, against a philosophical background, the dominant views of a person, “school”, text or concept. Examples of each are Leo Chang’s The Philosophical Foundations of Han Fei’s Political Theory (1986); Daoism Explained, by Hans-Georg Moeller (2011); Heaven, Earth and Man in the Book of Changes, by Hellmut Wilhelm (1977); and Ironies of Oneness and Difference: Coherence in Early Chinese Thought by Brook Ziporyn (2013).

3.3 The Contrastive Approach

The comparative approach to exegesis in Chinese philosophy obviously leaves much room for consideration of differences as well, which are often as illuminating as the similarities, and at times even more so. This approach also tends to enrich philosophy overall by increasing its scope, reach, and capacity for self-correction; there is no better cure for culture-boundedness than steeping oneself in another. And in that way—as well as many others—comparative philosophers of China may hope to engage in fruitful dialogue with other philosophers ignorant of non-Western cultures in general, Chinese in particular.

All of these laudable consequences of the comparative approach notwithstanding, there is another way to interrogate Chinese texts which merits attention because it is equally capable of illuminating them. This latter approach places the Western tradition more in the background while engaged in research, interpretive and translation efforts. That is to say, the translating philosopher must be open to the text as it is, not within the contexts determined by the nature of the questions addressed to it in the vocabulary of Western philosophy. This critical stance is not urging philosophers to approach a text as a tabula rasa, for such cannot be done. It is to urge that philosophers attend very carefully to the lexicon for translating Chinese into English, for that lexicon may be construed as a theory of sorts, and an increasingly poor one; it is a theory that Chinese philosophy is pretty much like Western philosophy, and consequently the vocabulary of the one can be carried over to the other without undue distortion (Hansen 1992: 17).

But no translation is innocent, nor any interpretation. The form of our questions determine the range of the possible answers we can obtain. Thus, if we ask what view of the inner life Confucius held, we almost surely will not be able to see that perhaps he didn’t hold any such view, or even think about having an “inner life”, as Herbert Fingarette argued in his famous book on the Master (1972). Asking which theory of propositional truth early Daoists held makes it difficult to see, as Hansen argued, that the early Daoists (and all other early Chinese thinkers) had little interest in propositional truth, but in language as praxis-guiding behavior, as we noted earlier (§2.2, and will take up again in §4.3 ). There are multiple cosmologies in Western philosophy, beginning with the several put forth by the Greeks, all of them conforming to a logical order. But we shouldn’t ask which one of them early Chinese cosmology most nearly resembles if Hall and Ames are right in claiming that Chinese cosmology is best described as an aesthetic order not a logical one (1987: 16). It might be that the early Confucians didn’t have any ethical theory, but based their descriptions, analyses and evaluations of human activity on the basis of their roles (Rosemont and Ames 2009; Ames 2011; Rosemont 2015).

These suggestions clearly do not fit well with the standard “grammar” and presuppositions of the Western philosophical tradition. It makes no sense to ask what contribution Chinese thought can make to the mind-body problem if the dichotomy is altogether absent their writings, nor to seek light on the nature of propositional truth if its propositional content was not a factor in their thinking about language.

One problem with this approach to interrogating Chinese texts is that it thus reduces the opportunities for comparative philosophers to engage in genuine dialogue with their Western-oriented brethren, and makes it easier to continue using the shibboleth that Chinese thought “isn’t really philosophy”. On the other hand, the contrasters will insist that the comparative approach robs the Chinese of their own voice, forcing them into a philosophical milieu that is not theirs. This can be seen in the frequency with which the comparisons tend to be asymmetrical: when something is lacking, or an argument missing, or some other deficit is seen, the Chinese side is at fault. But the plausibility of the charge rests almost solely on assuming the Western definition of the problem and approach to it. And in the end, just how plausible is it to think that all the real problems of philosophy, and all the methods for dealing with them, have been advanced in a single civilization?

These sketches of the comparative and contrastive approaches to the exegesis of Chinese philosophical texts have been just that: sketches; there are many more examples of each kind, and a number of comparative philosophers combine the two. And it must be remembered that much work has been done by scholars not trained in philosophy, increasing the number of ways of approaching the texts. Good exemplars of the variety of approaches to the field are introductory works on Chinese philosophy, which tend to combine both some comparative and contrastive elements, and differ in thrust as their authors foreground the Chinese elements, or emphasize philosophy (especially analytic) in their narratives. Two examples of the former are Lai (2008) and Wen (2012); coming down more firmly on the philosophy side are Van Norden (2011) and Liu (2006). The field is thus fairly fluid as it continues to come into its own, which readers should celebrate and not bemoan because of the variety of perspectives on the Chinese tradition on offer, all based on solid scholarly work from one discipline or another. We shall return briefly to these issues in §4.3.

3.4 The Chinese Approach

Chinese scholars working in the field of Chinese philosophy have much in common with their Western peers, but the differences are even greater, at least at present. In the first place, with few exceptions the Chinese would not see themselves as comparativists. They will read closely comparative works on Aristotle and Confucius, but basically for what they can learn about the latter, not the former. This is not chauvinism. To be concerned with how Confucius might illuminate the thought of Aristotle is to do philosophy, but not Chinese philosophy, and that is what they are about

Confucianism looms large in their work. Some scholars are working with Daoist and other texts unearthed from Mawangdui and elsewhere (Cao Feng), and a few are essaying Chinese themes against a Western model (Yang Guorong). But Confucianism is still seen as the embodiment and expression of Chinese culture, and is enjoying a renaissance of interest and scholarship—and general popularity—not seen since the May 4th Movement of 1919. A few Chinese philosophers are asking what contribution Confucianism might make to philosophy in a global context, but most of them are concentrating on its relevance to China today—and tomorrow.

A second difference between Chinese philosophers and Western comparativists is that the Chinese do their work in accordance with their own “grammar”, their own questions, definitions of problems, methodology, patterns of argument and standards of justification. They, too, have inherited a tradition over two millennia old, with a monumental amount of material—there are over 8000 commentaries on the Analects alone—but the questions and problems are seldom those of the West, except in those sections of university philosophy departments that specialize in Western philosophy. and there are not inconsequential differences in methodology, patterns of arguments and styles of justification as well.

Among the questions contemporary Chinese scholars are asking is the extent to which Confucianism might legitimately be considered a religion. Are there resources in the texts to suggest making it a state religion? (Kang Xiaoguang). Shouldn’t the focus be on spiritual practice, not theory? (Pang Fei). What kind of constitution best reflects Confucianism in today’s world? (Jiang Qing). Is Confucianism better studied today against the background of Western philosophy? (Zhang Longxi). Or must it be studied in its own cultural context? (Zhang Xianglong).

This is important work, which clearly has much of political as well as philosophical import, although the politics do not seem to be inspired by nationalism of any sort (although recapturing cultural pride is clearly in evidence). Some of it will appear conservative to Western eyes, as when the editor of an anthology on The Renaissance of Confucianism in Contemporary China says that “One finds in these essays … only sparse attention to the Western notion of human rights” (Fan 2011: 2). Others envisage a “progressive” Confucianism (Angle 2012: 1), which, unsurprisingly, includes more Western elements. The bulk of contemporary philosophical scholarship in China is not, however, of much direct interest to Western philosophers (or the general public), which is why there is such a disparity between translations of work done by the comparativists into Chinese (a lot) and Chinese scholarship rendered into English (very little). The Chinese can and do study the work of their Western counterparts fairly closely, largely for the insights that work provides on their own tradition. Coming the other way we have few works in English: the political text of Jiang Qing (2012) and some works on aesthetics by Li Zehou (2006, 2009). There is little else, and what there is tends to be articles in specialized anthologies (Fan 2011) or journals of translation (Contemporary Chinese Thought, The Journal of Chinese Humanities).

In sum, textual exegesis and translation in Chinese philosophy is a cultural practice, but it is usually practiced differently in different cultures. The situation is changing slowly, but probably will not change very much for some time.

4. Methodological Issues

4.1 On Generalizations Cultural and Philosophical

Deciding whether to be basically narrative or dialogical is probably the first issue facing the exegete. Another issue interpreters of Chinese texts must take into consideration in advancing their positions is the extent to which one may make generalizations about Chinese civilization and culture writ large.

This question arises because the conceptual categories within which Chinese authors thought and wrote differ sufficiently from the contemporary English reader’s that the former will be very difficult to understand without being placed in a larger cultural and philosophical overall conceptual framework, at least at first perusal. At the same time, however, if Western scholars are inclined to shudder when they hear sweeping generalizations about the history of Western culture and philosophy, knowing how diverse they really have been and are, we should perhaps want to embrace the Golden Rule, and do unto other cultures what we would have done with our own. And it can also be highly misleading, as a number of sinologists have been arguing recently against their generalizing colleagues.

This is a perplexing problem. If we do not generalize to the larger milieu in which a particular text is placed it is difficult to appreciate either what it says or the significance it has in the culture that grew it. But if the best we can do—like a number of late 19th century German scholars—is characterize China as a land of ewigen Stillstand we are surely better off with no generalizations whatsoever; making vague or erroneous generalizations tend to stereotypes, and there are already a superfluity of these for China, from Charlie Chan to Fu Manchu.

Thus the historian Michael Puett warns us that

All of these interpretive strategies—reading in terms of schools, essentialized definitions of culture, evolutionary frameworks—have the consequence of erasing the unique power that particular claims had at the time,

and recommends that

we dispense with … frameworks… [and] … should instead work on a more nuanced approach…. (Puett 2004: 23–25).

But on the other side is the Shang Dynasty historian David Keightley, who believes it important to essay major generalizations and who addresed the issue by asking “What made China Chinese?” (Keightley 2014). The reader of that paper will see that in addressing the grand question Keightley throws light on another, closer to home: what makes us “us?”

Yet at the same time Puett was not simply crying “wolf”. A disturbingly large number of scholars have made generalizations that were not simply misleading in their consequences, but have had racist, or “orientalist” undertones, or, more commonly, have just been plain flat-out wrong. To take only a few more egregious examples, although not a trained sinologist, Kant studied China and lectured on Chinese thought in his geography classes including statements that Confucius taught nothing but manners for the elite, and referred to the views of the Daodejing as “the monster system of Laotse”; generalizing his remarks to “a concept of virtue and morality never entered the heads of the Chinese” (Ching 1978: 168–69). These examples could be multiplied many times over, and are not relics from the past:

It can be argued that almost every change China has ever undergone originated from abroad or because of some foreign stimulus. (Deeker 2013: 70)

Moreover, there is an additional reason for eschewing generalizations (Goldin 2008: 21):

If there is one valid generalization about China, it is that China defies generalization. Chinese civilization is simply to huge, too diverse and too old for neat maxims.

Undercutting the image of a multimillenia, monolithic static culture is certainly a good thing, politically as well as intellectually. Arguably more nonsense and worse has been written about China than any other non-Western culture, and it is ongoing, as above. But perhaps we should not eschew generalizations about China altogether. Shifting the angle of vision only very slightly Roger Ames gave an important rejoinder to the anti-generalizers (Ames 2011: 21):

I would maintain that the only thing more dangerous than striving to make responsible cultural generalizations is failing to make them… . Philosophical interpreters must sensitize the student of Chinese philosophy to the ambient uncommon assumptions that have made the Chinese philosophical narrative so different from our own.

Perhaps Keightley should have the last word on this issue. As justification for his asking “What makes the Chinese Chinese?” He said:

The Chinese, after all, have probably fed more people more successfully than any or other culture in world history. How they developed the social capital to do this is well worth our study. (2014: 83)

Given that it is nigh unto impossible to give an interpretation of a text without making generalizations that go considerably beyond it, we should give the nod to the pros rather than the cons in this particular debate, but the latter perform the salutary function of warning students to take the generalizations lightly at all times, and abandon them for others in the light of further study.

4.2 Translating the Truth

Davidson’s focus on propositional truth (§2.2 above) is altogether in keeping with the concern of most Anglophone 20th century philosophers to analyze language as the main means of communicating facts about the world to our fellow human beings. When the facts are indeed as communicated, we say the statements expressing them are “true”. The precise nature of the relation between the facts and the statements of them has generated different theories of truth—correspondence, coherence, pragmatic, semantic, even “deflationary”—with the question remaining an open one today, although fewer philosophers are pursuing an answer to it.

No matter which theory one adopts, elaborating this concept of “truth” involves a cluster of related concepts: sentence, proposition, statement, fact, semantics, reference, connotation, denotation, plus a few others. There is another conception of “truth”, however, where the direct conveying of information is not central to the definition, and consequently “knowledge” is also conceived somewhat differently. Other uses of language might be equally or more important for some philosophers. Remember Chad Hansen’s claim (§2.2) that all of the early Chinese philosophers held that “language is a social practice. Its basic function is guiding discourse ” (1992: 3). If so, then the standard translation of the graph zhi as “knowledge” becomes problematic, identified as it is with “justified true belief”. Rosemont argues that “We are inclined to focus on the informative uses of language, that is, the transmission of knowledge that”. On his account readers will profit more if zhi is translated as “realize” instead of “knowledge”, following Hall and Ames (1987). “If ‘to personalize’ means ‘to make personal’, then ‘to realize’ is ‘to make real’ in the sense of knowing how, knowing about, knowing to” (Rosemont 2012: 47). Much the same thing has been noted by Stephen Angle and Justin Tiwald in a forthcoming book on Neo-Confucianism, in which they say they will focus on “knowledge as an activity rather than knowledge as a set of truths” (2015: 5, 1).

This, too, may be construed as “truth”, even though not propositional, and with a different concept-cluster around it: authenticity, engagement, trustworthy, integrity, honesty, upright, and more. In 2014 a Symposium celebrating the inauguration of a new online journal of cross-cultural philosophy (Confluence, 1, 1) was devoted to the question of whether the concept of truth was useful in the pursuit of cross-cultural philosophical research. The four symposiasts represented Japanese philosophy, Confucianism, Aztec philosophy and Tibetan Buddhism. None of them found close approximations for “truth” in the propositional sense in the cultures they studied, but all four said there were analogues for the terms associated with truth as “truthfulness” in the lexicons of the thinkers and traditions they worked with. This non-propositional sense of truth is of course not unknown in the West; everyone understands what Vaclav Havel meant when he entitled an anthology of his essays Living in Truth (1990). But it has not been a major concern among English-speaking philosophers since the analytic movement got under way a little over a century ago.

Helping people to hold true beliefs is a very worthwhile endeavor, and so is helping them transform themselves to lead meaningful lives. The translator/interpreter must be aware of which approach is reflected in the text under examination. If we believe the author(s) were concerned with the way things are in the world, we will employ interpretive methods to ascertain the truth of the claims made, namely, those methods concerned with propositional truth: logical and linguistic analysis, especially in the Anglophone tradition, and/or hermeneutics or phenomenology among continental philosophers.

If we understand the ancient Chinese philosophers as having another basic aim, however, we might pause at using Western interpretive strategies adopted for propositional truth-seeking to study the praxis-guiding normative statements of the Chinese. In praxis-guiding discourse(s) human flourishing for oneself and others was the basic concern. Put another way, the standard style of Western philosophical writings tends to be explanatory and justificatory, whereas the Chinese style tends to be narrative (of experience) and normative. There are exceptions in both cases of course; normativity is no more unknown in the West than explanations are in China. But in general truth is associated with facts and propositions in modern Western philosophical texts, and with values and the conduct of one’s life in China’s classical texts. If so, it is by no means clear that the methodologies developed for philosophical critiques and exegeses in the modern Western tradition are suitable for application mutatis mutandis to Chinese classical writings; attempting to uncover and explicate one kind of truth may well hinder acquiring insights about the other.

4.3 Translating the Sounds of Silence

These two different senses of “truth” bespeak two different orientations toward philosophy and its purposes; we might loosely refer to them as truth- seeking and way-making. The truth-seeking approach is familiar to us, being at the heart of the Western intellectual tradition, in science no less than philosophy. And philosophical analysis, hermeneutics and phenomenology are all tried and true methods for teasing the (propositional) truth from texts. The model for writing in this philosophical tradition is clarity and precision of expression (at least in the analytic school).

It is not at all clear, however, that those methods are equally appropriate for working with Chinese texts much of the time. There are two reasons for this, the first of which is the Chinese model of writing. Hark back to the discussion of classical Chinese earlier (§1–1.4) while reading the following two quotes. First, from some NLP computer scientists:

Classical Chinese poetry … is particularly concise, finely rich, highly rhetorical and thus linguistically complex, requiring a high degree of creativity in writing it, sophisticated interpretation in reading it, and difficulty in understanding it. (Fang, et al. 2009).

The comment is specifically about poetry but the point is fairly general, especially for the canonical texts of the early period. For the next quote, readers should keep in mind the Western philosophical model of writing, with clarity and precision the most valued narrative qualities. Michael Nylan again (2011: 66):

Polysemy eminently suits the serious classical turn. For where words have more than one meaning, their appearance is apt to induce an initial state of confusion. This confusion proves useful if it makes readers aware that it is context and context alone that determines the values and valences that words assume in any piece of writing, binding author to reader in the construction and reconstruction of meaning.

If analytic and hermeneutic methods do not get us to the “truths” found in the classical texts, what other methods might be employed? Leigh Jenco (2007) has argued that while the non-Western orientation in comparative philosophy is clear from the texts studied, the possibilities for using non-western methodologies for philosophical inquiry into those texts are not, and hence the adequacy of Eurocentric approaches to the discipline can be maintained, as well as the “not really philosophy” charge frequently levelled against Chinese texts because they do not contain arguments, are ambiguous, have little empirical or logical content, etc. Put another way, while Chinese texts can become objects of study for the ideas contained in them, their methods of scholarly inquiry never enter the picture, continuing thereby to legitimate a Eurocentric approach to scholarly methodologies.

Kalmanson (2017) picks up on Jenco’s themes, describing Chinese methods for gaining insights from Chinese texts such as ritual preparation before reading them, meditation, memorization and recitation. At first blush it might seem bizarre to suggest that the performance of rituals, memorization and recitation should be called “methods” for interrogating philosophical texts. But the bizarreness can lessen if we can get away from propositional truth, knowing-that, and expository models of clarity and precision. The classical Chinese texts are composites more or less, are neither clear nor precise, are extremely terse, appeal to the eye and the ear equally, and are replete with ambiguities. Yet the Chinese have long held that those texts, composed and/or edited by the sages, contain all the truths needed to lead an exemplary life, a belief firmly held by many for over 2000 years—and still held by more than a few today. Is it possible that we may gain more insight into the “truths” of the Daodejing by memorizing and then reciting it than by subjecting it to logical and linguistic analysis? The famous scholar-philosopher Zhu Xi of the 13th century suggested how we should read, and his advice is perhaps an appropriate coda to this entry on issues in translating and interpreting Chinese philosophy:

There is layer upon layer [of meaning] in the words of the sages. In your reading of them, penetrate deeply. If you simply read what is on the surface you will misunderstand. Steep yourself in the words; only then will you grasp their meaning. (trans., Gardner 1990 128)


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The SEP editors note that the posthumous update to this entry published on August 9, 2019 was to the Bibliography only and was provided by two of the SEP subject co-editors for Chinese Philosophy.

The author acknowledges good friends Roger Ames and Michael Nylan, who made many helpful comments and suggestions on an earlier draft of this entry, and Uri Nodelman, who unmuddled my account of AI considerably. I am grateful to all three, and to my daughters Samantha Healy and Constance Rosemont, and my wife JoAnn Rosemont, for essential assistance in the preparation of the manuscript for publication.

Copyright © 2019 by
Henry Rosemont Jr.

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