The Ethics of Clinical Research
Clinical research attempts to address a relatively straightforward, and extremely important challenge: how do we determine whether one medical intervention is better than another, whether it offers greater clinical benefit and/or poses fewer risks? Clinicians may one day be able to answer these questions by relying on computer models, thereby avoiding reliance on clinical research and the ethical concerns it raises. Until that day, clinical researchers begin by testing potential new medical interventions in the laboratory, and often in animals. While these methods can provide valuable information and, in the case of animal research, raise important ethical issues of their own, potential new interventions eventually must be tested in humans. Potential new interventions which work miracles in test tubes and in mice, often leave humans untouched, or worse off.
The human tests of a medical intervention typically pose some risks to subjects no matter how many laboratory and animal tests have preceded them. In this way, the process of collecting data to improve health and well-being exposes research subjects to risks for the benefit of future patients. These studies thus provide a clear example of the central ethical challenge posed by clinical research: When is it ethically permissible to expose research subjects to risks of harm for the benefit of others? The present entry focuses on this concern, and canvasses the most prominent attempts to address it. The present entry largely brackets the range of interesting and important ethical challenges that arise in the course of conducting clinical research: How should it be reviewed? Who may conduct it? What must potential subjects understand to give valid consent? May it be conducted in countries that will not be able to afford the intervention being tested? Do investigators have any obligations to treat unrelated medical conditions they uncover in the course of their research?
One might attempt to address the central ethical challenge by limiting clinical research to the medical setting, offering experimental interventions to patients who want to try them. This approach, which has the virtue of evaluating interventions in the process of trying to help individual patients, can make sense for comparisons of two or more interventions that are widely accepted and already in clinical use. In contrast, this approach poses enormous scientific and practical problems with respect to testing new interventions. On the practical side, who would be willing to manufacture a new intervention without knowing whether it works? What dose should be used? How often should the new drug be taken? More importantly, this approach might not yield reliable information as to whether the new treatment is useful or harmful until hundreds, perhaps thousands of people have received it. Clinical research is designed to address these concerns by systematically exposing a small number of individuals, including very sick ones, to potential new treatments. Many activities, driving a car, smoking a cigarette, flushing our waste down the drain, expose others to risks of harm. Nonetheless, there has been surprisingly little philosophical analysis of the conditions under which it is acceptable to do this (Hayenhjelm and Wolff 2012). Therefore, in addition to being of value in its own right, evaluation of the ethics of clinical research provides an opportunity to consider one of the more fundamental concerns in moral theory: when is it acceptable to expose some individuals to risks of harm for the potential benefit of others?
- 1. What is Clinical Research?
- 2. Early Clinical Research
- 3. Abuses and Guidelines
- 4. Clinical Research and Clinical Care
- 5. A Libertarian Analysis
- 6. Contract Theory
- 7. Minimal Risks
- 8. Goals and Interests
- 9. Industry Sponsored Research
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What is Clinical Research?
Human subjects research is research which studies humans, as opposed to animals, atoms, or asteroids. Assessment of whether humans prefer 100 dollars or a 1% chance of 10,000 dollars constitutes human subjects research. Clinical research refers to the subset of human subjects research which focuses on interventions to improve human health and well-being. The present analysis focuses on research that is designed to improve human health and well-being by identifying better methods to treat, cure or prevent illness. This focus on treating, curing and preventing illness is intended to bracket the question of whether research on enhancements qualifies as clinical research. Such research has the potential to improve well-being, allowing us to remember more and worry less, without identifying methods to address illness.
We shall also bracket the question of whether quality improvement and quality assurance projects qualify as clinical research. To briefly consider the type of research at the heart of this debate, consider a hospital which proposes to evaluate the impact of checklists on the quality of patient care. Half the nurses in the hospital are told to continue to provide care as usual; the other half are provided with a checklist and instructed to mechanically check off each item as they complete it when caring for their patients. The question of whether this activity constitutes clinical research is of theoretical interest for clarifying the precise boundaries of the concept. Should we say that this is not clinical research because the checklist is used by the nurses, not administered to the patients? Or should we say this is clinical research because it involves the systematic testing of a hypothesis which is answered by collecting data on patient outcomes? And this theoretical clarification has significant practical implications, determining whether these activities must satisfy existing regulations for clinical research, including whether the clinicians need to obtain patients’ informed consent to use the checklist.
While clinical medicine is enormously better than it was 100 or even 50 years ago, there remain many diseases against which current clinical medicine offers an inadequate response. To name just a few, malaria kills over a million people, mostly children, every year; chronic diseases, chief among them heart disease and stroke, kill millions each year, and there currently are no effective treatments for Alzheimer disease. The social value of clinical research lies in its ability to collect information that might be useful to identifying improved methods to treat these conditions. Yet, it is the rare clinical research study which definitively establishes that a particular method is effective and safe for treating, curing or preventing some illness. The success of specific research studies more commonly lies in the gathering of information needed to inform future studies.
Prior to establishing the efficacy of an experimental treatment for a given condition, researchers typically need to identify the cause of the condition, possible mechanisms for treating it, a safe and effective dose, and ways of testing whether the drug is having an effect on the disease.
The process of testing potential new treatments can take 10-15 years, and is standardly divided into phases. Formalized phase 0 studies are a relatively recent phenomenon involving the testing of interventions and methods which might be used in later phase studies. A phase 0 study might be designed to determine the mechanism of action of a particular drug and evaluate different ways to administer it. Phase 1 studies are the earliest tests of a new intervention and are conducted in small numbers of individuals. Phase 1 studies are designed to evaluate the pharmacokinetics and pharmacodynamics of new treatments, essentially evaluating how the drug influences the human body and how the human body influences the drug. Phase 1 studies also evaluate the risks of the treatment and attempt to identify an appropriate dose to be used in subsequent phase 2 studies. Phase 1 studies pose risks and frequently offer little if any potential for clinical benefit to subjects. As a result, a significant amount of the ethical concern over clinical research focuses on phase 1 studies.
If phase 1 testing is successful, potential new treatments go on to larger phase 2 studies which are designed to further assess risks and also to evaluate whether there is any evidence that the treatment might be beneficial. Successful phase 2 studies are followed by phase 3 studies which involve hundreds, sometimes thousands of patients. Phase 3 studies are designed to provide a rigorous test of the efficacy of a treatment and frequently involve randomization of subjects to the new treatment or a control, which might be standard existing treatment or a placebo. Finally, post-marketing or phase 4 studies evaluate the use of interventions in clinical practice.
Clinical trials of experimental treatments typically include purely research procedures, such as blood draws, imaging scans, or biopsies, that are performed to collect data regarding the treatment under study. Analysis of the ethics of clinical research thus requires evaluation of three related risk-benefit profiles: (a) the risk-benefit profile of the interventions(s) under study; (b) the risk-benefit profile of the included research procedures; and (c) the risk-benefit profile of the study as a whole.
Potential new treatments sometimes are in the ex ante interests of research subjects. For example, the risks posed by an experimental cancer treatment might be justified by the possibility that it will extend subjects’ lives. Moreover, the risk/benefit profile of the treatment might be as favorable to subjects as the risk/benefit profile of the available alternatives. In these cases, receipt of the experimental intervention ex ante promotes subjects’ interests. In other cases, participation in research poses ‘net’ risks, that is, risks of harm which are not, or not entirely, justified by potential clinical benefits to individual subjects. Experimental interventions sometimes pose net risks. A first in human trial of an experimental treatment might involve a single dose to see whether humans can tolerate it. And it might occur in healthy individuals who have no need of treatment. These studies pose risks to subjects and offer essentially no chance for clinical benefit. The qualifier to ‘essentially’ no chance of clinical benefit is intended to capture the fact that the research procedures included in clinical trials may inadvertently end up providing some clinical benefit to some subjects. For example, a biopsy that is used to collect research data may disclose a previously unidentified and treatable condition. The chance for such benefit, albeit real, is typically so remote that it is not sufficient to compensate for the risks of the procedure. Whether a study as a whole poses net risks depends on whether the potential benefits of the experimental intervention compensate for its risks plus the net risks of the research procedures included in the study.
Clinical research which poses net risks raises important ethical concern. Net-risk studies raise concern that subjects are being used as mere means to collect information to benefit future patients. Research procedures that pose net risks may seem to raise less concern when they are embedded within a study which offers a favorable risk-benefit profile overall. Yet, since these procedures pose net risks, and since the investigators could provide subjects with the new potential treatment alone, they require justification. An investigator who is about to insert a needle into a research subject to obtain some blood purely for laboratory purposes faces the question of whether doing so is ethically justified, even when the procedure is included in a study that offers subjects the potential for important medical benefit. The goal of ethical analyses of clinical research is to provide an answer. Clinical research poses three types of net risks: absolute, relative, and indirect (Rid and Wendler 2011). Absolute net risks arise when the risks of an intervention or procedure are not justified by its potential clinical benefits. Most commentators focus on this possibility with respect to research procedures which pose some risks and offer no chance of clinical benefit, such as blood draws to obtain cells for laboratory studies. Research with healthy volunteers is another example which frequently offers no chance for clinical benefit. Clinical research also poses absolute net risks when it offers a chance for clinical benefit which is not sufficient to justify the risks subjects face. A kidney biopsy to obtain tissue from presumed healthy volunteers may offer some very low chance of identifying an unrecognized and treatable pathology. This intervention nonetheless poses net risks if the chance for clinical benefit for the subjects is not sufficient to justify the risks of their undergoing the biopsy.
Relative net risks arise when the risks of a research intervention are justified by its potential clinical benefits, but the intervention’s risk-benefit profile is less favorable than the risk-benefit profile of one or more available alternatives. Imagine that investigators propose a randomized-controlled trial to compare an inexpensive drug against an expensive and somewhat more effective drug. Such trials make sense when, in the absence of a direct comparison, it is unclear whether the increased effectiveness of the more expensive drug justifies its costs. In this case, receipt of the cheaper drug would be contrary to subjects’ interest in comparison to receiving the more expensive drug. The trial thus poses relative net risks to subjects.
Indirect net risks arise when a research intervention has a favorable risk-benefit profile, but the intervention diminishes the risk-benefit profile of other interventions provided as part of or in parallel to the study. For example, an experimental drug for cancer might undermine the effectiveness of other drugs individuals are taking for their condition. The risks of research participation can be compounded if the indicated response to the harm in question posse additional risks. Kidney damage suffered as the result of research participation might lead to the need for short-term dialysis which poses additional risks to the individual; a subject who experiences a postlumbar puncture headache might need a ‘blood patch’ which poses some risk of blood entering the epidural space which would call for a further response which brings with it additional risks. While commentators tend to focus on the risks of physical harm, participation in clinical research can pose other types of risks as well, including psychological, economic, and social risks. Depending on the study and the circumstances, individuals who are injured as the result of participating in research might incur significant expenses. Most guidelines and regulations stipulate that evaluation of the acceptability of clinical research studies should take into account all the different risks to which subjects are exposed.
To assess the ethics of exposing subjects to risks, one needs an account of why exposing others to risks raises ethical concern in the first place. Being exposed to risks obviously raises concern to the extent that the potential harm to which the risk refers is realized: the chance of a headache turns into an actual headache. Being exposed to risks also can lead to negative consequences as a result of the recognition that one is at risk of harm. Individuals who recognize that they face a risk may become frightened; they also may take costly or burdensome measures to protect themselves. In contrast, the literature on the ethics of clinical research implicitly assumes that being exposed to risks is not itself harmful. The mere fact that subjects are exposed to risks is not regarded as necessarily making them worse off
Increasingly, researchers are storing human biological samples and using them in future research projects. These studies raise difficult questions regarding the possibility of what might be called ‘contribution’ and ‘information’ risks. The former question concerns the conditions under which it is acceptable to ask individuals to contribute to answering the scientific question posed by a given study (Jonas 1969). The frequent neglect of this issue may trace to a narrow understanding of subjects’ interests. Individuals undoubtedly have an interest in avoiding the kinds of physical harms they face in clinical research. It seems that individuals’ interests also may be implicated, and possibly thwarted, when they contribute to particular projects, activities and goals.
Imagine that an individual provides a blood sample which investigators store and use in future research projects designed to promote goals which conflict with the individual’s fundamental values. Can such research harm the individual if they never learn about the results and are never personally affected by them? Are the interests of an individual who fundamentally opposes cloning, and constructs her life around efforts to stop it, set back if she contributes to a research study that identifies improved methods to clone human beings? With respect to information risks, investigators used DNA samples obtained from members of the Havasupai tribe to study “theories of the tribe’s geographical origins.” The study’s conclusion that early members of the tribe had migrated from Asia across the Bering Strait contradicted the tribe’s own views that they originated in the Grand Canyon (Harmon 2010). Can learning the truth about the origins of one’s tribal group harm members of the tribe?
Exposing research subjects to risks of harm is considered morally problematic largely because it has the potential to result in their being harmed. In addition, guidelines and regulations on clinical research are replete with admonitions to expose subjects to risks only when doing so is justified by the value of the study in question. This focus reveals an important although typically implicit feature of most analyses of the ethics of clinical research. It is often said that the ethics of clinical research concerns the protection of research subjects. One might conclude that exposing subjects to risks is regarded as problematic only to the extent that it has the potential to harm them. On this view, analysis of the appropriateness of investigators exposing subjects to risks would be limited to the possibility of making subjects worse off. In fact, while the protection of research subjects is important, it does not exhaust the ethics of clinical research. Guidelines and regulations also reflect implicit principles regarding what constitutes appropriate investigator behavior that are independent of the possibility of making subjects worse off. Put generally, a full analysis of the ethics of exposing subjects to risks needs to justify both the treatment of the subjects and the behavior of the researchers.
The future oriented aspect of clinical research is worth emphasizing. The fundamental ethical concern raised by clinical research is whether and when it can be acceptable to expose some individuals to risks and burdens for the benefit of others. In general, the answer to this question depends crucially on the others in question, and their relationship to those who are being exposed to the risks. It is one thing to expose a consenting adult to risks to save the health or life of an identified and present other, particularly when the two individuals are first degree relatives. It is another thing, or seems to many to be another thing, to expose consenting individuals to risks to help unknown and unidentified, and possibly future others. Almost no one objects to operating on a healthy, consenting adult to obtain a kidney that might save an ailing sibling, even though the operation poses some risk of serious harm and offers the donor no potential for clinical benefit. Greater concern is raised by attempts to obtain a kidney from a healthy, consenting adult and give it to an unidentified individual. Commentators express even greater ethical concern as the path from risk exposure to benefit becomes longer and more tenuous. Many clinical research studies expose subjects to risks in order to collect generalizable information which, if combined with the results of other, as yet non-existent studies, may eventually benefit future patients through the identification of a new intervention, assuming the appropriate regulatory authorities approve it, some company or group chooses to manufacture it, and patients can afford to purchase it. The potential benefits of clinical research may thus be realized someday, but the risks and burdens are clear and present.
Attempts to determine when it is acceptable to conduct clinical research have been significantly influenced by its history, by how it has been conducted and, in particular, by how it has been misconducted (Lederer 1995; Beecher 1966). Thus, to understand the current state of the ethics of clinical research, it is useful to know something of its past.
2. Early Clinical Research
Modern clinical research may have begun on the 20th of May, 1747, aboard the HMS Salisbury. James Lind, the ship’s surgeon, was concerned with the costs scurvy was exacting on British sailors, and was skeptical of some of the interventions, cider, elixir of vitriol, vinegar, sea-water, being used to treat it. Unlike other clinicians of his day, Lind did not simply assume that he was correct and treat his patients accordingly. He designed a study to test whether he was right. He chose 12 sailors from among the 30 or so Salisbury’s crew members who were suffering from scurvy, and divided them into six groups of 2 sailors each. Lind assigned a different intervention to each of the groups, including two sailors turned research subjects who received 2 oranges and 1 lemon each day. Within a week these two were sailors again; the others remained patients, and several were dying.
The ethics of clinical research begins by asking how we should think about the fate of these latter sailors. Do they have a moral claim against Lind? Did Lind treat them appropriately? It is widely assumed that physicians should do what they think is best for the patient in front of them. Lind, despite being a physician, did not follow this maxim. He felt strongly that giving sea water to individuals with scurvy was a bad idea, but he gave sea water to 2 of the sailors in his study to test whether he, or others, were right. To put the fundamental concern raised by clinical research in its simplest form: Did Lind sacrifice these two sailors, patients under his care, for the benefit of others?
Lind’s experiments represent perhaps the first modern clinical trial because he attempted to address one of the primary challenges facing those who set out to evaluate medical treatments. How does one show that any differences in the outcomes of the treatments under study are a result of the treatments themselves, and not a result of the patients who received them, or other differences in the patients’ environment or diet? How could Lind be confident that the improvements in the two sailors were the result of the oranges and lemons, and not a result of the fact that he happened to give this particular treatment to the two patients who occupied the most salutary rooms on the ship? Lind tried to address the challenge of confounding variables by beginning with patients who were as similar as possible. He carefully chose the 12 subjects for his experiment from a much larger pool of ailing sailors; he also tried to ensure that all 12 received the same rations each day, apart from the treatments provided as part of his study. It is also worth noting that Lind’s dramatic results were largely ignored for decades, leading to uncounted and unnecessary deaths, and highlighting the importance of combining clinical research with effective promulgation and implementation. The Royal Navy did not adopt citrus rations for another 50 years (Sutton 2003), at which point scurvy essentially disappeared from the Royal Navy.
Lind’s experiments, despite controlling for a number of factors, did not exclude the possibility that his own choices of which sailors got which treatment influenced the results. More recent experiments, including the first modern randomized, placebo controlled trial of Streptomycin for TB in 1948 (D’Arcy Hart 1999), attempt to address this concern by assigning treatments to patients using a random selection process. By randomly assigning patients to treatment groups these studies ushered in the modern era of controlled, clinical trials. And, by taking the choice of which treatment a given patient receives out of the hands of the treating clinician, these trials underscore and, some argue, exacerbate the ethical concerns raised by clinical research (Hellman and Hellman 1991). A foundational principle of clinical medicine is the importance of individual judgment. A physician who decides which treatments her patients receive by flipping a coin is guilty of malpractice. A clinical investigator who relies on the same methods receives awards and gets published in elite journals. One might conclude that sacrifice of the interests of some, often sick patients, for the benefit of future patients, is essentially mandated by the scientific method (Miller & Weijer 2006; Rothman 2000). The history of clinical research seems to provide tragic support for this view.
3. Abuses and Guidelines
The history of clinical research is littered with abuses. Indeed, one account maintains that the history of pediatric research is “largely one of child abuse” (Lederer and Grodin 1994, 19; also see Lederer 2003). This history has had a significant influence on how research ethicists understand the concerns raised by clinical research and on how policy makers attempt to address them. In particular, policy makers have responded to previous abuses by developing guidelines intended to prevent their recurrence.
The most influential abuses in this regard were the horrific experiments conducted by Nazi physicians during WW II (abuses perpetrated by Japanese physicians were equally horrific, but have received significantly less attention). Response to these abuses led to the Nuremberg Code (Grodin & Annas 1996; Shuster 1997), which is frequently regarded as the first set of formal guidelines for clinical research, an ironic claim on two counts. First, there is some debate over whether the Nuremberg Code was intended to apply generally to clinical research or whether, as a legal ruling in a specific trial, it was intended to address only the cases before the court (Katz 1996). Second, the Germans themselves had developed systematic research guidelines as early as 1931 (Vollmann & Winau 1996). These guidelines were still legally in force at the time of the Nazi atrocities and clearly prohibited a great deal of what the Nazi doctors did.
In addition to being ignored by practicing researchers, wide consensus developed by the end of the 1950s that the Nuremberg Code was inadequate to the ethics of clinical research. Specifically, the Nuremberg Code did not include a requirement that clinical research receive independent ethics review and approval. In addition, the first and longest principle in the Nuremberg Code states that informed consent is “essential” to ethical clinical research (Nuremberg Military Tribunal 1947). This requirement provides a powerful safeguard against the abuse of research subjects. It also appears to preclude clinical research with individuals who cannot consent.
One could simply insist that the informed consent of subjects is necessary to ethical clinical research and accept the opportunity costs thus incurred. the impossibility of conducting clinical research on conditions unique to children or unconscious adults. Representatives of the World Medical Association, who hoped to avoid these costs, began meeting in the early 1960s to develop guidelines, which would become known as the Declaration of Helsinki, to address the perceived shortcomings of the Nuremberg Code (Goodyear, Krleza-Jeric, and Lemmens 2007). They recognized that insisting on informed consent as a necessary condition for clinical research would preclude a good deal of research designed to find better ways to treat dementia and conditions affecting children, as well as research in emergency situations. Regarding consent as necessary precludes such research even when it poses only minimal risks or offers subjects a compensating potential for important clinical benefit. The challenge, still facing us today, is to identify protections for research subjects which are sufficient to protect them without being so strict as to preclude appropriate research designed to benefit the groups to which they belong.
The Declaration of Helsinki (World Medical Organization 1996) allows individuals who cannot consent to be enrolled in clinical research based on the permission of the subject’s representative. The U.S. federal regulations governing clinical research take a similar approach. These regulations are not laws in the strict sense of being passed by Congress and applying to all research conducted on U.S. soil. Instead, the regulations represent administrative laws which effectively attach to clinical research at the beginning and the end. Research conducted using U.S. federal monies, for instance, research funded by the NIH, or research involving NIH researchers, must follow the U.S. regulations (Department of Health and Human Services 2005). Research that is included as part of an application for approval from the U.S. FDA also must have been conducted according to FDA regulations which, except for a few exceptions, are essentially the same. Although many countries now have their own national regulations (Brody 1998), the U.S. regulations continue to exert enormous influence around the world because so much clinical research is conducted using U.S. federal money and U.S. federal investigators, and the developers of medical treatments often want to obtain approval for the U.S. market.
The abuses perpetrated as part of the infamous Tuskegee syphilis study were made public in 1972, 40 years after the study was initiated. The resulting outcry led to the formation of the U.S. National Commission, which was charged with evaluating the ethics of clinical research with humans and developing recommendations for appropriate safeguards. These deliberations resulted in a series of recommendations for the conduct of clinical research, which became the framework for existing U.S. regulations. The U.S. regulations, like many regulations, place no clear limits on the risks to which competent and consenting adults may be exposed. In contrast, strict limits are placed on the level of research risks to which those unable to consent may be exposed, particularly children. In the case of pediatric research, the standard process for review and approval is limited to studies that offer a ‘prospect of direct’ benefit and research that poses minimal risk or a minor increase over minimal risk. Studies that do not qualify in one of these categories must be reviewed by an expert panel and approved by a high government official. While this 4th category offers important flexibility, it implies that, at least in principle, U.S. regulations do not mandate a ceiling on the risks to which pediatric research subjects may be exposed for the benefit of others. This reinforces the importance of considering how we might justify exposing subjects to research risks, both minimal and greater than minimal, for the benefit of others.
4. Clinical Research and Clinical Care
Several attempts have been made to justify exposing research subjects to risks for the benefit of future patients. Lind’s experiments on scurvy exemplify the fact that clinical research is often conducted by clinicians and often is conducted on patients. Many commentators have thus assumed that the ethics of clinical research should be governed by the ethics of clinical care, and the methods of research should not diverge from the methods that are acceptable in clinical care. On this approach, subjects should not be denied any beneficial treatments available in the clinical setting and they should not be exposed to any risks not present in the clinical setting.
Some proponents (Rothman 2000) argue that this approach is implied by the kind of treatment that patients, understood as individuals who have a condition or illness needing treatment, are owed. Such individuals are owed treatment that promotes, or at least is consistent with their medical interests. Others (Miller & Weijer 2006) argue that the norms of clinical research derive largely from the obligations that bear on clinicians. These commentators argue that it is unacceptable for a physician to participate in, or even support the participation of her patients in a clinical trial unless that trial is consistent with the patients’ medical interests. To do less is to provide substandard medical treatment and to violate one’s obligations as a clinician.
The claim that the treatment of research subjects should be consistent with the norms which govern clinical care has been applied most prominently to the ethics of randomized clinical trials (Hellman & Hellman 1991). Randomized trials determine which treatment a given research subject receives based on a random process, not based on clinical judgment of which treatment would be best for that patient. Lind assigned the different existing treatments for scurvy to the sailors in his study based not on what he thought was best for them, but based on what he thought would yield an effective comparative test. Lind did not give each intervention to the same number of sailors because he thought that all the interventions had an equal chance of being effective. To the contrary, he did this because he was confident that several of the interventions were harmful and this design was the best way to prove it. Contemporary clinical researchers go even further, assigning subjects to treatments randomly. Because this aspect of clinical research represents a clear departure from the practice of clinical medicine it appears to sacrifice the interests of subjects in order to collect valid data.
One of the most influential responses to this concern(Freedman 1987) argues that randomization is acceptable when the study in question satisfies what has come to be known as ‘clinical equipoise.’ Clinical equipoise obtains when, for the population of patients from which subjects will be selected, the available clinical evidence does not favor one of the treatments being used over the others. In addition, it must be the case that there are no treatments available outside the trial that are better than those used in the trial. Satisfaction of these conditions seems to imply that the interests of research subjects will not be undermined in the service of collecting scientific information. If the available data do not favor any of the treatments being used, randomizing subjects seems as good a process as any other for choosing which treatment they receive.
Proponents of clinical equipoise as an ethical requirement for clinical research determine whether equipoise obtains not by appeal to the belief states of individual clinicians, but based on whether there is consensus among the community of experts regarding which treatment is best. Lind believed that sea water was ineffective for the treatment of scurvy. Yet, in the absence of agreement among the community of experts, this view essentially constituted an individual preference rather than a clinical norm. This suggests that it was acceptable for Lind to randomly assign sailors under his care to the prevailing treatments in order to test, in essence, whose preferred treatment was the best. In this way, the existence of uncertainty within the community of experts seems to offer a way to reconcile the methods of clinical research with the norms of clinical medicine.
Critics respond that even when clinical equipoise obtains for the population of patients, the specific circumstances of individual patients within that population may imply that one of the treatments under investigation is better for them (Gifford 2007). A specific patient may have reduced liver function which places her at greater risk of harm if she receives a treatment metabolized by the liver. And some patients may have personal preferences which incline them toward one treatment rather than another (e.g., they may prefer a one-time riskier procedure to multiple, lower risk procedures which pose the same collective risk). Current debate focuses on whether randomized clinical trials can take these possibilities into account in a way that is consistent with the norms of clinical medicine.
Even if the existence of clinical equipoise can justify some randomized trials, a significant problem remains, namely, many studies and procedures which are crucial to the identification and development of improved methods for protecting and advancing health and well-being are inconsistent with subjects’ medical interests. This concern arises for many phase 1 studies which offer essentially no chance for medical benefit and pose at least some risks, and to that extent are inconsistent with the subjects’ medical interests.
Phase 3 studies which randomize subjects to a potential new treatment or existing standard treatment, and satisfy clinical equipoise, typically include non-beneficial procedures, such as additional blood draws, to evaluate the drugs being tested. Enrollment in these studies may be consistent with subjects’ medical interests in the sense that the overall risk-benefit ratio that the study offers is at least as favorable as the available alternatives. Yet, evaluation of the overall risk-benefit profile of the study masks the fact that it includes individual procedures which are contrary to subjects’ medical interests, and contrary to the norms of clinical medicine.
The attempt to protect research subjects by appeal to the obligations clinicians have to promote the medical interests of their patients also seems to leave healthy volunteers unprotected. Alternatively, proponents might characterize this position in terms of clinicians’ obligations to others in general: clinicians should not perform procedures on others unless doing so promotes the individual’s clinical interests. This approach seems to preclude essentially all research with healthy volunteers. For example, many phase 1 studies are conducted in healthy volunteers to determine a safe dose of the drug under study. These studies, vital to drug development, are inconsistent with the principle that clinicians should expose individuals to risks only when doing so is consistent with their clinical interests. It follows that appeal to clinical equipoise alone cannot render clinical research consistent with the norms of clinical practice.
Commentators sometimes attempt to justify net-risk procedures that are included within studies, and studies that overall pose net risks by distinguishing between ‘therapeutic’ and ‘non-therapeutic’ research (Miller and Weijer 2006). The claim is that the demand of consistency with subjects’ medical interests applies only to therapeutic research; non-therapeutic research studies and procedures may diverge from these norms to a certain extent, provided subjects’ medical interests are not significantly compromised. The distinction between therapeutic and non-therapeutic research is sometimes based on the design of the studies in question, and sometimes based on the intentions of the investigators. Studies designed to benefit subjects, or investigators who intend to benefit subjects are conducting therapeutic studies. Those designed to collect generalizable knowledge or in which the investigators intend to do so constitute non-therapeutic research.
The problem with the distinction between therapeutic and non-therapeutic research so defined is that research itself often is defined as a practice designed to collect generalizable knowledge and conducted by investigators who intend to achieve this end (Levine 1988). On this definition, all research qualifies as non-therapeutic. Conversely, most investigators intend to benefit their subjects in some way. Perhaps they design the study in a way that provides subjects with clinically useful findings, or they provide minor care not required for research purposes, or referrals to colleagues. Even if one can make good on the distinction between therapeutic and non-therapeutic research in theory, these practices appear to render it irrelevant to the practice of clinical research. More importantly, it is not clear why investigators’ responsibilities to patients, or patients’ claims on investigators, should vary as a function of this distinction. Why think that investigators are allowed to expose patients to some risks for the benefit of others, but only in the context of research that is not designed to benefit the subjects? To apply this proposed resolution to pediatric research, why might it be acceptable to expose infants to risks for the benefit of others, but only in the context of studies which offer the infants no chance for personal benefit?
To take one possibility, it is not clear that this view can be defended by appeal to physicians’ role responsibilities. A prima facie plausible view holds that physicians’ role responsibilities apply to all encounters between physicians and patients who need medical treatment. This view would imply that physicians may not compromise patients’ medical interests when conducting therapeutic studies, but also seems to prohibit non-therapeutic research procedures with patients. Alternatively, one might argue that physicians’ role responsibilities apply only in the context of clinical care and so do not apply in the context of clinical research at all. This articulation yields a more plausible view, but does not support the use of the therapeutic/ non-therapeutic distinction. It provides no reason to think that physicians’ obligations differ based on the type of research in question.
Recent critics argue that these problems highlight the fundamental confusion that results when one attempts to evaluate clinical research based on norms appropriate to clinical medicine. They instead distinguish between the ethics of clinical research and the ethics of clinical care, arguing that it is inappropriate to assume that investigators are subject to the claims and obligations which apply to physicians, despite the fact that the individuals who conduct clinical research often are physicians (Miller and Brody 2007).
The claim that clinical research should satisfy the norms of clinical medicine has this strong virtue: it provides a clear method to protect individual research subjects and reassure the public that they are being so protected. If research subjects must be treated consistent with their medical interests, we can be reasonably confident that improvements in clinical medicine will not be won at the expense of exploiting them. Most accounts of the ethics of clinical research now recognize the limitations of this approach and struggle to find ways to ensure that research subjects are not exposed to excessive risks without assuming that the claims of clinical medicine apply to clinical researchers (Emanuel, Wendler, and Grady 2000; CIOMS 2002). Dismissal of the distinction between therapeutic and non-therapeutic research thus yields an increase in both conceptual clarity and concern regarding the potential for abuse of research subjects.
Clinicians, first trained as physicians taught to act in the best interests of the patient in front of them, often struggle with the process of exposing some patients to risky procedures for the benefit of others. It is one thing for philosophers to insist, no matter how accurately, that research subjects are not patients and need not be treated according to the norms of clinical medicine. It is another thing for clinical researchers to regard research subjects who are suffering from disease and illness as anything other than patients. These clinical instincts, while understandable and laudable, have the potential to obscure the true nature of clinical research, as investigators and subjects alike try to convince themselves that clinical research involves nothing more than the provision of clinical care. One way to try to address this collective and often willful confusion would be to identify a justification for exposing research subjects to net risks for the benefit of others.
5. A Libertarian Analysis
It is often said that those working in bioethics are obsessed with the principle of respect for individual autonomy. Advocates of this view of bioethicists cite the high esteem accorded in the field to the requirement of obtaining individual informed consent and the frequent attempts to resolve bioethical challenges by citing its satisfaction. One might assume that this view within bioethics traces to implicit endorsement of a libertarian analysis according to which it is permissible for competent and informed individuals to do whatever they prefer, provided those with whom they interact are competent, informed and in agreement. In the words of Mill, investigators should be permitted to conduct research and expose subjects to risks provided they obtain subjects’ “free, voluntary, and undeceived consent and participation” (On Liberty, page 11). Setting aside the question of whether this view accurately characterizes bioethics and bioethicists generally, it does not apply to the vast majority of work done on the ethics of clinical research. Almost no one in the field argues that it is permissible for investigators to conduct any research they want provided they obtain the free and informed consent of the subjects they enroll.
Current research ethics does place significant weight on informed consent and many regulations and guidelines devote much of their length to articulating the requirement for informed consent. Yet, as exemplified by the response to the Nuremberg Code, almost no one regards informed consent as necessary and sufficient for ethical research. Most regulations and guidelines, beginning with the Declaration of Helsinki, first adopted in 1964 (World Medical Organization 1996), allow investigators to conduct research on human subjects only when it has been approved by an independent group charged with ensuring that the study is ethically acceptable. Most regulations further place limitations on the types of research that independent ethics committees may approve. They must find that the research has important social value and the risks have been minimized before approving it, thereby restricting the types of research to which even competent adults may consent. Are these requirements justified, or are they inappropriate infringements on the free actions of competent individuals? The importance of answering this question goes beyond its relevance to debates over Libertarianism. Presumably, the requirements placed on clinical research have the effect of reducing to some extent the number of research studies that get conducted. The fact that at least some of the prohibited studies likely would have important social value, helping to identify better ways to promote health and well-being, provides a normative reason to eliminate the restrictions, unless there is some compelling reason to retain them.
One might regard the limitations as betraying the paternalism embedded in most approaches to the ethics of clinical research (Miller and Wertheimer 2007). Although the charge of paternalism often carries with it some degree of condemnation, there is a strong history of what is regarded as appropriate paternalism in the context of clinical research. This too may have evolved from clinical medicine. Clinicians are charged with protecting and promoting the interests of the patient “in front of them”. Clinician researchers, who frequently begin their careers as clinicians, may regard themselves as similarly charged. However, if we accept the thesis that clinical research is normatively distinct from clinical care, we need some reason to think that the norms for clinical care are relevant to clinical research. The fact that these restrictions on the options available to competent adults in the context of clinical research trace to its close relationship with clinical care does not constitute a justification for applying the restrictions to this normatively distinct context. As noted, this is especially important given that the restrictions at least sometimes block otherwise socially valuable research.
The libertarian claim that valid informed consent is necessary and sufficient to justify exposing research subjects to risks for the benefit of others seems to imply, consistent with the first principle of the Nuremberg Code, that research with individuals who cannot consent is unethical. This plausible and tempting claim commits one to the view that research with children, research in many emergency situations, and research with the demented elderly all are ethically impermissible. One could consistently maintain such a view but the social costs of adopting it would be great. It is estimated, for example, that approximately 70% of medications provided to children have not been tested in children, even for basic safety and efficacy (Roberts, Rodriquez, Murphy, Crescenzi 2003; Field & Behrman 2004; Caldwell, Murphy, Butow, and Craig 2004). Absent clinical research with children, pediatricians will be forced to continue to provide sometimes inappropriate treatment, leading to significant harms that could have been avoided by pursuing clinical research to identify better approaches.
One response would be to argue that the Libertarian analysis is not intended as an analysis of the conditions under which clinical research is acceptable. Instead, the claim might be that it provides an analysis of the conditions under which it is acceptable to conduct clinical research with competent adults. Informed consent is necessary and sufficient for enrolling competent adults in research. While this view does not imply that research with subjects who cannot consent is impermissible, it faces the not insignificant challenge of providing an account for why such research might be acceptable.
Bracketing the question of individuals who cannot consent, many of the limitations on clinical research apply to research with competent adults. How might these limitations be justified? One approach would be to essentially grant the Libertarian analysis on theoretical grounds, but then argue that the conditions for its implementation are rarely realized in practice. In particular, there are good reasons, and significant empirical data, to question how often clinical research actually involves subjects who are sufficiently informed to provide valid consent. Even otherwise competent adults often fail to understand clinical research sufficiently to make their own informed decisions regarding whether to enroll (Flory and Emanuel 2004).
To consider an example which is much discussed in the research ethics literature, it is commonly assumed that valid consent for randomized clinical trials requires individuals to understand randomization. It requires individuals to understand that the treatment they will receive, if they enroll in the study, will be determined by a process which does not take into account which of the treatments is better for them (Kupst 2003). There is an impressive wealth of data which suggests that many, perhaps most individuals who participate in clinical research do not understand this (Snowden 1997; Featherstone and Donovan 2002; Appelbaum 2004). The data also suggest that these failures of understanding often are resistant to educational interventions.
It is sometimes argued that the restrictions placed on clinical research studies, such as the requirements for independent review and minimizing risks, are justified on the grounds of soft paternalism. Paternalism involves interfering with the liberty of agents for their own benefit (Feinberg 1986; see also entry on paternalism). As the terms are used in the present debate, ‘soft’ paternalism involves interfering with the liberty of an individual in order to promote their interests on the grounds that the action being interfered with is the result of impaired decision-making: “A freedom-restricting intervention is based on soft paternalism only when the target’s decision-making is substantially impaired, when the agent lacks (or we have reason to suspect that he lacks) the information or capacity to protect his own interests—as when A prevents B from drinking the liquid in a glass because A knows it contains poison but B does not” (Miller & Wertheimer 2007). ‘Hard’ paternalism, in contrast, involves interfering with the liberty of an individual in order to promote their interests, despite the fact that the action being interfered with is the result of an informed and voluntary choice by a competent individual.
If the myriad restrictions on clinical research were justified on the basis of hard paternalism they would represent restrictions on individuals’ autonomous actions. However, the data on the extent to which otherwise competent adults fail to understand what they need to understand to provide valid consent suggests that the limitations can instead be justified on the grounds of soft paternalism. This suggests that while the restrictions may limit the liberty of adult research subjects, they do not limit their autonomy. In this way, one may regard many of the regulations on clinical research not as inconsistent with the libertarian ideal, but instead as starting from that ideal and recognizing that otherwise competent adults often fail to attain it.
Even if most research participants have sufficient understanding to provide valid consent, it would not follow that there should be no limitations on research with competent adults. The conditions on what one individual may do to another are not exhausted by what the second individual consents to. Perhaps some individuals may choose for themselves to be treated with a lack of respect, even tortured. It does not follow that it is acceptable for me or you to treat them accordingly. As independent moral agents we need sufficient reason to believe that our actions, especially the ways in which we treat others, are appropriate, and this evaluation concerns, in typical cases, more than just the fact that the affected individuals consented to them.
Understood in this way, many of the limitations on the kinds of research to which competent adults may consent are not justified, or at least not solely justified, on paternalistic grounds. Instead, these limitations point to a crucial and often overlooked concern in research ethics. The regulations for clinical research often are characterized as protecting the subjects of research from harm. Although this undoubtedly is an important and perhaps primary function of the regulations, they also have an important role in limiting the extent to which investigators harm research subjects, and limiting the extent to which society supports and benefits from a process which inappropriately harms others. It is not just that research subjects should not be exposed to risk of harm without compelling reason. Investigators should not expose them to such risks without compelling reason, and society should not support and benefit from their doing so.
This aspect of the ethics of clinical research has strong connections with the view that the obligations of clinicians restrict what sort of clinical research they may conduct. On that view, it is the fact that one is a physician and is obligated to promote the best interests of those with whom one interacts professionally which determines what one is allowed to do to subjects. This connection highlights the pressing questions that arise once we attempt to move beyond the view that clinical research is subject to the norms of clinical medicine. There is a certain plausibility to the claim that a researcher is not acting as a clinician and so may not be subject to the obligations that bear on clinicians. Or perhaps we might say that the researcher/subject dyad is distinct from the physician/patient dyad and is not necessarily subject to the same norms. But, once one concludes that we need an account of the ethics of clinical research, distinct from the ethics of clinical care, one is left with the question of which limitations apply to what researchers may do to research subjects.
It seems clear that researchers may not expose research subjects to risks without sufficient justification, and also clear that this claim applies even to those who provide free and informed consent. The current challenge then is to develop an analysis of the conditions under which it is acceptable for investigators to expose subjects to risks and determine to what extent current regulations need to be modified to reflect this analysis. To consider briefly the extent of this challenge, and to underscore and clarify the claim that the ethics of clinical research go beyond the protection of research subjects to include the independent consideration of what constitutes appropriate behavior on the part of investigators, consider an example.
Physical and emotional abuse cause enormous suffering, and a good deal of research is designed to study various methods to reduce instances of abuse and also to help victims recover from being abused. Imagine that a team of investigators establishes a laboratory to promote the latter line of research. The investigators will enroll consenting adults and, to mimic the experience of extended periods of abuse in real life, they will abuse their subjects emotionally and physically for a week. The abused subjects will then be used in studies to evaluate the efficacy of different methods for helping victims to cope with the effects of abuse.
The proper response to this proposal is to point out that the fact the subjects are competent and give informed consent does not establish that it is ethically acceptable. One needs to consider many other things. Is the experiment sufficiently similar to real life abuse that its results will have external validity? Are there less risky ways to obtain the same results? Finally, even if these questions are answered in a way which supports the research, the question remains whether investigators may treat their subjects in this way. The fact that essentially everyone working in research ethics would hold that this study is unethical—investigators are not permitted to treat subjects in this way—suggests that research ethics, both in terms of how it is practiced and how it should be practiced, goes beyond respect for individual autonomy to include independent standards on investigator behavior. Defining those standards represents one of the more important challenges for research ethics.
As exemplified by Lind’s experiments on treatments for scurvy, clinical research studies were first conducted by clinicians wondering whether the methods they were using were effective. To answer this question, the clinicians altered the ways in which they treated their patients in order to yield information that would allow them to assess their methods. In this way, clinical research studies intially were part of, but an exception to standard clinical practice. As a result, clinical research came to be seen as an essentially unique activity. And widespread recognition of clinical research’s scandals and abuses led to the view that this activity needed its own extensive regulations.
More recently, some commentators have come to question the view that clinical research is a unique human activity, as well as the regulations and guidelines which result from this view. In particular, it has been argued that this view has led to overly restrictive requirements on clinical research, requirements that hinder scientists’ ability to improve medical care for future patients, and also fail to respect the liberty of potential research subjects. This view is often described in terms of the claim that many regulations and guidelines for clinical research are based on an unjustified ‘research exceptionalism’ (Wertheimer 2010).
The central ethical concern raised by clinical research involves the practice of exposing subjects to risks for the benefit of others. Yet, our everday activities frequently expose some to risks for the benefit of others. When you drive to the store, you expose your neighbors to some increased risk of pollution for the benefits you derive from shopping; speeding ambulances expose pedestrians to risks for the benefit of the patients they carry; factories expose their workers to risks for the benefit of their customers; charities expose volunteers to risks for the benefit of recipients. Despite this similarity, non-beneficial clinical research is widely regarded as ethically problematic and is subject to significantly greater regulation, review, and oversight (Wilson and Hunter 2010). Almost no one regards driving, ambulances, charities, or factories as inherently problematic. Even those who are not great supporters of a given charity do not argue that it treats its volunteers as guinea pigs. And no one argues that charitable activities should satisfy the requirements that are routinely applied to clinical research, such as the requirements for independent review and written consent based on an exhaustive description of the risks and potential benefits of the activity, its purpose, duration, scope, and procedures.
Given that many activities expose some to risks for the benefit of others, yet are not subject to such extensive regulation, some commentators conclude that many of the requirements for clinical research are unjustified (Sachs 2010, Stewart et al. 2008, and Sullivan 2008). This work is based on the assumption that, when it comes to regulation and ethical analysis, we should treat clinical research the way we treat other activities in daily life which involve exposing some to risks for the benefit of others. And this assumption leads to a straightforward solution to our central ethical problem of justifying the practice of exposing research subjects to risks for the benefit of others.
Exposing factory workers to risks for the benefit of others is deemed ethically acceptable when they agree to do the work and are paid a fair wage. The solution suggested for the ethical concern of non-beneficial research is to obtain consent and pay research subjects a sufficient wage for their efforts. This view is much less restrictive than current regulations for clinical research, but seems to be less permissive than a Libertarian analysis. The latter difference is evident in claims that research studies should treat subjects fairly and not exploit them, even if individuals consent to being so treated.
The gap between this approach and the traditional view of research ethics is evident in the fact that advocates of the traditional view tend to regard payment of research subjects as exacerbating rather than resolving its ethical concerns, raising, among others, worries of undue inducement and commodification. Those who are concerned about research exceptionalism, in contrast, tend to regard payment as it is regarded in most other contexts in daily life: some is good and more is better.
The claims of research exceptionalism have led to valuable discussion of the extent to which clinical research differs from other activities which pose risks to participants for the benefit of others and whether any of the differences justify the extensive regulations and guidelines standardly applied to clinical research. Proponents of research exceptionalism who regard many of the existing regulations as unjustified face the challenge of articulating an appropriate set of regulations for clinical research. While comparisons to factory work provide a useful lens for thinking about the ethics of clinical research, it is not immediately obvious what positive recommendations follow from this perspective. After all, it is not as if there is general consensus regarding the regulations to which industry should be subject. Some endorse minimum wage laws; others oppose them. There are further arguments over whether workers should be able to unionize; whether governments should set safety standards for industry; whether there should be rules protecting workers against discrimination.
6. Contract Theory
A few commentators (Caplan 1984; Harris 2005; Heyd 1996) have considered the possibility of justifying the exposure of subjects to risks for the benefit of others on the grounds that there is an obligation to participate in clinical research. One might try to ground this obligation in the fact that current individuals have benefited from clinical research conducted on individuals in the past. At least all individuals who have access to medical care have benefited from the efforts of previous research subjects in the form of effective vaccines and better medical treatment.
Current participation in clinical research typically benefits future patients. However, if we incur an obligation for the benefits we have received from previous research studies, we presumably are obligated to the patients who participated in those studies, an obligation we cannot discharge by participating in current studies. This approach also does not provide a way to justify the very first clinical trials, such as Lind’s, which of necessity enrolled subjects who had never benefitted from previous clinical research.
Alternatively, one might argue that the obligation to participate does not trace to benefits the individuals in fact received from the efforts of previous research participants. Rather, the obligation is to the overall social system of which clinical research is a part (Brock 1994). For example, one might argue that individuals acquire this obligation as the result of being raised in the context of a cooperative scheme or society. We are obligated to do our part because of the many benefits we have enjoyed as a result of being born within such a scheme.
The first challenge for this view is to explain why the mere enjoyment of benefits, without some prospective agreement to respond in kind, obligates individuals to help others. Presumably, your doing a nice thing for me yesterday, without my knowledge or invitation, does not obligate me to do you a good turn today. This concern seems even greater with respect to pediatric research. Children certainly benefit from previous research studies, but typically do so unknowingly and often with vigorous opposition. The example of pediatric research makes the further point that justification of non-beneficial research on straightforward contractualist grounds will be difficult at best. Contract theories have difficulties with those groups, such as children, who do not accept in any meaningful way the benefits of the social system under which they live (Gauthier 1990).
In a Rawlsian vein, one might try to establish an obligation to participate in non-beneficial research based on the choices individuals would make regarding the structure of society from a position of ignorance regarding their own place within that society, from behind a veil of ignorance (Rawls 1999). To make this argument, one would have to modify the Rawlsian argument in several respects. The knowledge that one is currently living could well bias one’s decision against the conduct of clinical research. Those who know they are alive at the time the decision is being made have already reaped many of the benefits they will receive from the conduct of clinical research.
To avoid these biases, we might stretch the veil of ignorance to obscure the generation to which one belongs—past, present or future (Brock 1994). Under a veil of ignorance so stretched, individuals might choose to participate in clinical research, including non-beneficial research as long as the benefits of the practice exceed its overall burdens. One could then argue that justice as fairness gives all individuals an obligation to participate in clinical research when their turn comes. This approach seems to have the advantage of explaining why we can expose even children to some risks for the benefit of others, and why parents can give permission for their children to participate in such research. This argument also seems to imply not simply that clinical research is acceptable, but that, in a range of cases, individuals have an obligation to participate in it. It implies that adults whose turn has come are obligated to participate in clinical research, although for practical reasons we might refrain from forcing them to do so.
This justification for clinical research faces several challenges. First, Rawlsian arguments typically are used to determine the basic structure of society, that is, to determine a fair arrangement of the basic institutions within the society (Rawls 1999). If the structure of society meets these basic conditions, members of the society cannot argue that the resulting distribution of benefits and burdens is unfair. Yet, even when the structure of society meets the conditions for fairness, it does not follow that individuals are obligated to participate in the society so structured. Competent adults can decide to leave a society that meets these conditions rather than enjoy its benefits (whether they have any better places to go is another question). The right of exit suggests that the fairness of the system does not generate an obligation to participate, but rather defends the system against those who would argue that it is unfair to some of the participants over others. At most, then, the present argument can show that it is not unfair to enroll a given individual in a research study, that this is a reasonable thing for all individuals, including those who are unable to consent.
Second, it is important to ask on what grounds individuals behind the veil of ignorance make their decisions. In particular: are these decisions constrained or guided by moral considerations? (Dworkin 1989; Stark 2000). It seems plausible to think that they would be. After all, we are seeking the ethical approach or policy with respect to clinical research. The problem, then, is that the answer we get in this case may depend significantly on which ethical constraints are built into the system, rendering the approach question begging. Most importantly, we are considering whether it is ethical to expose subjects who cannot consent to risks for the benefit of others. If it isn’t, then it seems that this should be a limitation on the choices individuals can make from behind the veil of ignorance, in which case appeal to those choices will not be able to justify non-beneficial pediatric research, nor non-beneficial research with incompetent adults. And if this research is ethical it is unclear why we need this mechanism to justify it.
Proponents might avoid this dilemma by assuming that individuals behind the veil of ignorance will make decisions based purely on self-interest, unconstrained by moral limits or considerations. Presumably, many different systems would satisfy this requirement. In particular, the system that produces the greatest amount of benefits overall may well be one that we regard as unethical. Many endorse the view that clinical research studies which offer no potential benefit to subjects and pose a high chance of serious risk, such as death, are unethical, independent of the magnitude of the social value to be gained. For example, almost all research ethicists would regard as unethical a study which intentionally infects a few subjects with the HIV virus, even when the study offers the potential to identify a cure for AIDS. Yet, individuals behind the veil of ignorance who make decisions based solely on self-interest might well allow this study on the grounds that it offers a positive cost-benefit ratio overall: the high risks to a few subjects are clearly outweighed by the potential to save the lives of millions.
The question here is not whether a reasonable person would choose to make the poor even worse off in order to elevate the status of those more privileged. Rather, both options involve some individuals being in unfortunate circumstances, namely, infected with the HIV virus. The difference is that the one option (not conducting the study) involves many more individuals becoming infected over time, whereas the other option involves significantly fewer individuals being infected, but some as the result of being injected in the process of identifying an effective vaccine. Since the least desirable circumstances (being infected with HIV) are the same in both cases, the reasonable choice, even if one endorses the maximin strategy, seems to be whichever option reduces the total number of individuals who are in those circumstances, revealing that, in the present case at least, the Rawlsian approach seems not to take into account the way in which individuals end up in the positions they occupy.
7. Minimal Risks
Limits on risks are a central part of almost all current research regulations and guidelines. With respect to those who can consent, there is an essentially implicit agreement that the risks should not be too high in the context of non-beneficial research (as noted some argue that there should not be any net risks to even competent adults in the context of so-called therapeutic research). However, there is no consensus regarding how to determine which risks are acceptable in this context. With respect to those who cannot consent, many commentators argue that non-beneficial research is acceptable provided that the net risks are very low. The challenge, currently faced by many in clinical research, is to identify a standard, and find a reliable way to implement it, for what constitutes a sufficiently low risk in this context. An interesting and important question in this regard is whether the level of acceptable risks varies depending on the particular class of individuals who cannot consent. Is the level of acceptable risks the same for individuals who were once competent, such as previously competent adults with Alzheimer disease, individuals who are not now but are expected to become competent, such as healthy children, and individuals who are not now and likely never will be competent, such as individuals born with severe cognitive disabilities?
Some argue that the risks of clinical research qualify as sufficiently low when they are ‘negligible’, understood as risks that do not pose any chance of serious harm (Nicholson 1986). Researchers who ask children a few questions for research purposes may expose them to risks no more worrisome than that of being mildly upset for a few minutes. It seems not implausible that exposing subjects to a risk of minor harm for the benefit of others does not raise ethical concern. Or one might argue that the ethical concerns it raises do not merit serious ethical concern. Despite the plausibility of these views, very few studies satisfy the negligible risk standard. Even routine procedures that are widely accepted in pediatric research, such as single blood draws, pose some, typically very low risk of more than negligible harm.
Others (Kopelman 2000; Resnik 2005) define risks as sufficiently low or ‘minimal’ when they do not exceed the risks individuals face during the performance of routine examinations. This standard provides a clear and quantifiable threshold for acceptable risks. Yet, the risks of routine medical procedures for healthy individuals are so low that this standard seems to prohibit intuitively acceptable research. This approach faces the additional problem that, as the techniques of clinical medicine become safer and less invasive, increasing numbers of procedures used in non-beneficial research would be deemed excessively risky. And, at a theoretical level, one might wonder why we should think that the risks we currently happen to accept in the context of clinical care for healthy children should define the level of risk that is acceptable in clinical research. Why think that the ethical acceptability of a non-beneficial blood draw in pediatric research depends on whether clinicians still use blood draws as part of clinical screening for healthy children?
Many guidelines (U.S. Department of Health and Human Services 2005; Australian National Health and Medical Research Council 1999) and commentators take the view that non-beneficial research is ethically acceptable as long as the risks do not exceed the risks individuals face in daily life. Many of those involved in clinical research implicitly assume that this minimal risk standard is essentially equivalent to the negligible risk standard. If the risks of research are no greater than the risks individuals face in daily life, then the research does not pose risk of any serious harm. As an attitude toward many of the risks we face in daily life, this view makes sense. We could not get through our daily lives if we were conscious of all the risks we face. Crossing the street poses more risks than one can catalog, much less process readily. When these risks are sufficiently low, psychologically healthy individuals place them in the cognitive background, ignoring them unless the circumstances provide reason for special concern (e.g. one hears a siren, or sees a large gap in the sidewalk).
Paul Ramsey reports that during the deliberations of the National Commission on pediatric research, members often used the terms minimal and negligible risks in a way which seemed to imply that they were willing to allow minimal risk research, even with children, on the grounds that it poses no chance of serious harm (Ramsey 1978). The members then went on to argue that an additional ethical requirement for such research is a guarantee of compensation for any serious research injuries. This approach to minimal risk pediatric research highlights nicely the somewhat confused attitudes we often have toward risks, especially those of daily life.
We go about our daily lives as though harms with very low probability are not going to occur, effectively treating low probability harms as zero probability events. To this extent, we are not Bayesians about the risks of daily life. We treat some possible harms as impossible for the purposes of getting through the day. This attitude, crucial to living our lives, does not imply that there are no serious risks in daily life. The fact that our attitude toward the risks of everyday life is justified by its ability to help us to get through the day undermines its ability to provide an ethical justification for exposing research subjects to the same risks in the context of non-beneficial research (Ross & Nelson 2006).
First, the extent to which we ignore the risks of daily life is not a fully rational process. In many cases, our attitude regarding risks is a function of features of the situation that are not correlated directly with the risk level, such as our perceived level of control and our familiarity with the activity (Tversky, Kahneman 1974; Tversky, Kahneman 1981; Slovic 1987; Weinstein 1989). Second, to the extent that the process of ignoring some risks is rational, we are involved in a process of determining which risks are worth paying attention to. Some risks are so low that they are not worth paying attention to. Consideration of them would be more harmful (would cost us more) than the expected value of being aware of them in the first place.
To some extent, then, our attitudes in this regard are based on a rational cost/benefit analysis. To that extent, these attitudes do not provide an ethical argument for exposing research subjects to risks for the benefit of others. The fact that the costs to an individual of paying attention to a given risk in daily life are greater than the benefits to that individual does not seem to have any relevance for what risks we may expose them to for the benefit of others. Finally, there is a chance of serious harm from many of the activities of daily life. This reveals that the ‘risks of daily life’ standard does not preclude the chance of some subjects experiencing serious harm. Indeed, one could put the point in a much stronger way. Probabilities being what they are, the risks of daily life standard implies that if we conduct enough minimal risk research eventually a few subjects will die and scores will suffer permanent disability.
As suggested above, a more plausible line of argument would be to defend clinical research that poses minimal risks on the grounds that it does not increase the risks to which subjects are exposed. It seems plausible to assume that at any given time an individual will either be participating in research or involved in the activities of daily life. But, by assumption, the risks of the two activities are essentially equivalent, implying that enrollment in the study, as opposed to allowing the subject to continue to participate in the activities of daily life does not increase the risks to which he is exposed.
The problem with this argument is that the risks of research often are additive rather than substitutive. For example, participation in a study might require the subject to drive to the clinic for a research visit. The present defense succeeds to the extent that this trip replaces another trip in the car, or some similarly risky activity in which the subject would have been otherwise involved. In practice, this often is not the case. The subject instead may simply put off the trip to the mall until after the research visit. In that case, the subject’s risk of serious injury from a car trip may be doubled as a result of her participation in research. Moreover, we accept many risks in daily life because the relevant activities offer those who pursue them a chance of personal benefit. We allow children to take the bus because we assume that the benefits of receiving an education justify the risks. The fact that we accept these risks given the potential benefits provides no reason to think that the same risks or even the same level of risk would be acceptable in the context of an activity, including a non-beneficial research study, which offers no chance of medical benefit. Finally, and strictly speaking, this justification seems to imply that investigators should evaluate what risks individuals would face if they did not enroll in the research, and enroll only those who would otherwise face similar or greater levels of risk.
8. Goals and Interests
In one of the most influential papers in the history of research ethics, Hans Jonas (1969) argues that the progress clinical research offers is normatively optional, whereas the need to protect individuals from the harms to which clinical research exposes them is mandatory. He writes:
… unless the present state is intolerable, the melioristic goal [of biomedical research] is in a sense gratuitous, and this is not only from the vantage point of the present. Our descendants have a right to be left an unplundered planet; they do not have a right to new miracle cures. We have sinned against them if by our doing, we have destroyed their inheritance not if by the time they come around arthritis has not yet been conquered (unless by sheer neglect). (Jonas 1969, 230–231)
Jonas’s view does not imply that clinical research is necessarily unethical, but the conditions on when it may be conducted are very strict. This argument may seem plausible to the extent that one regards, as Jonas does, the benefits of clinical research to be ones that make an acceptable state in life even better. The example of arthritis cited by Jonas characterizes this view. Curing arthritis, like curing dyspepsia, baldness, and the minor aches and pains of living and aging, may be nice, but may be thought to address no profound problem in our lives. If this were all that clinical research had to offer, we might be reluctant to accept many risks in order to achieve its goals. We should not, in particular, take much chance of wronging individuals, or exploiting them to realize these goals.
This argument makes sense to the extent that one regards the status quo as acceptable. Yet, without further argument, it is not clear why one should accept this view; it seems almost certain that those suffering from serious illness that might be addressed by future research will not accept it. Judgments regarding the present state of society concern very general level considerations and a determination that society overall is doing fairly well is consistent with many individuals suffering terrible diseases. Presumably, the suffering of these individuals provides some reason to conduct clinical research. In response, one might understand Jonas to be arguing that the present state of affairs involves sufficiently good medicine and adequately flourishing lives such that the needs which could now be addressed by additional clinical research are not of sufficient importance to justify the risks raised by conducting it. It might have been the case, at some point in the past, that life was sufficiently nasty, brutish and short to justify running the risk of exploiting research subjects in the process of identifying through clinical research ways to improve the human lot. But, we have advanced, in part thanks to the conduct of clinical research, well beyond that point. This reading need not interpret Jonas as ignoring the fact that there remain serious ills to be cured. Instead, he might be arguing that these ills, while real and unfortunate, are not of sufficient gravity, or perhaps prevalence to justify the risks of conducting clinical research.
This view implicitly expands the ethical concerns raised by clinical research. We have been focusing on the importance of protecting individual research subjects. However, Jonas assumes that clinical research also threatens society in some sense. There are at least two possibilities here. First, it might be thought that the conduct of unethical research reaches beyond individual investigators to taint society as a whole. This does not seem unreasonable given that clinical research typically is conducted in the name of and often for the benefit of society. Second, one might be concerned that allowing investigators to expose research subjects to some risks for the benefit of others might put us on a slippery slope that ends with serious abuses throughout society.
An alternative reading would be to interpret Jonas as arguing from a version of the active-passive distinction. It is often claimed that there is a profound moral difference between actively causing harm versus merely allowing harm to occur, between killing someone versus allowing them to die, for example. Jonas often seems to appeal to this distinction when evaluating the ethics of clinical research. The idea is that conducting clinical research involves investigators actively exposing individuals to risks of harm and, when those harms are realized, it involves investigators actively harming them. The investigator who injects a subject with an experimental medication in the context of a non-beneficial study actively exposes the individual to risks for the benefit of others and actively harms, perhaps even kills those who suffer harm as a result. And, to the extent that clinical research is conducted in the name of and for the benefit of society in general, one can say without too much difficulty that society is complicit in causing these harms. Not conducting clinical research, in contrast, involves our allowing individuals to be subject to diseases that we might otherwise have been able to avoid or cure. And this situation, albeit tragic and unfortunate, has the virtue of not involving clear moral wrongdoing.
The problem with at least this version of the argument is that the benefits of clinical research often involve finding safer ways to treat disease. The benefits of this type of clinical research, to the extent they are realized, involve clinicians being able to provide less harmful, less toxic medications to patients. Put differently, many types of clinical research offer the potential to identify medical treatments which harm patients less than current ones. This not an idle goal. One study found that the incidence of serious adverse events from the appropriate use of clinical medications (i.e. excluding such things as errors in drug administration, noncompliance, overdose, and drug abuse) in hospitalized patients was 6.7%. The same study, using data from 1994, concludes that the approved and properly prescribed use of medications is likely the 5th leading cause of death in the US (Lazarou, Pomeranz, and Corey 1998).
These data suggest that the normative calculus is significantly more complicated than the present reading of Jonas suggests. The question is not whether it is permissible to risk harming some individuals in order to make other individuals slightly better off. Instead, we have to decide how to trade off the possibility of clinicians exposing patients to greater risks of harm (albeit with a still favorable risk-benefit ratio) in the process of treating them versus clinical researchers exposing subjects to risk of harm in the process of trying to identify improved methods to treat others. This is not to say that there is no normative difference between these two activities, only that that difference is not accurately described as the difference between harming individuals versus improving their lot beyond some already acceptable status quo. It is not even a difference between harming some individuals versus allowing other individuals to suffer harms. The argument that needs to be made is that harming individuals in the process of conducting clinical research potentially involves a significant moral wrong not present when clinicians harm patients in the process of treating them.
The primary concern here is that, by exposing subjects to risks of harm, the process of conducting clinical research involves the threat of exploitation of a particular kind. It runs the risk of investigators treating persons as things, devoid of any interests of their own. The worry here is not so much that investigators and subjects enter together into the shared activity of clinical research with different, perhaps even conflicting goals. The concern is rather that, in the process of conducting clinical research, investigators treat subjects as if they had no goals at all or, perhaps, that any goals they might have are normatively irrelevant.
Jonas argues that this concern can be addressed, and the process of experimenting on some to benefit others made ethically acceptable, only when the research subjects share the goals of the research study. Ethically appropriate research, on Jonas’s view, is marked by: “appropriation of the research purpose into the person’s own scheme of ends” (Jonas 1969, 236). And assuming that it is in one’s interests to achieve one’s, at least, proper goals, it follows that, by participating in research, subjects will be acting in their own interests, despite the fact that they are thereby being exposed to risky procedures which are performed to collect information to benefit others.
Jonas claims in some passages that research subjects, at least those with an illness, can share the goals of a clinical research study only when they have the condition or illness under study (Jonas 1969). These passages reveal something of the account of human interests on which Jonas’s arguments rely. On standard preference satisfaction accounts of human interests, what is in a given individual’s interests depends on what the individual happens to want or prefer, or the goals the individual happens to endorse, or the goals the individual would endorse in some idealized state scrubbed clean of the delusions, misconceptions and confusion which inform our actual preferences (Griffin 1986). On this view, participation in clinical research would promote an individual’s interests as long as she was well informed and wanted to participate. This would be so whether or not she had the condition being studied. Jonas’s view, in contrast, seems to be that there are objective conditions under which individuals can share the goals of a given research study. They can endorse the cause of curing or at least finding treatments for Alzheimer disease only if they suffer from the disease themselves.
One possible objection would be to argue that there are many reasons why an individual might endorse the goals of a given study, apart from the fact of having the disease themselves. One might have family members with the disease, or co-religionists, or have adopted improved treatment of the disease as an important personal goal. The larger question is whether subjects endorsing the goals of a clinical research study is a necessary condition on its acceptability. Recent commentators and guidelines rarely, if ever, adopt this condition, although at least some of them might be assuming that the requirement to obtain free and informed consent will ensure its satisfaction. It might be assumed, that is, that competent, informed, and free individuals will enroll in research only when they share the goals of the study in question.
Jonas was cognizant of the extent to which the normative concerns raised by clinical research are not exhausted by the risks to which subjects are exposed, but also include the extent to which investigators and by implication society are the agents of their exposure to risks. For this reason, he recognized that the libertarian response is inadequate, even with respect to competent adults who truly understand. Finally, to the extent Jonas’s claims rely on an objective account of human interests, one may wonder whether he adopts an overly restrictive one. Why should we think, on an objective account, that individuals will have an interest in contributing to the goals of a given study only when they have the disease it addresses? Moreover, although we will not pursue the point here, appeal to an objective account of human interests raises the possibility of justifying the process of exposing research subjects to risks for the benefit of others on the grounds that contributing to valuable projects, including presumably some clinical research studies, is objectively in (most) individuals’ interests (Wendler 2010).
9. Industry Sponsored Research
The fundamental ethical challenge posed by clinical research is whether it is acceptable to expose some to research risks for the benefit of others. In the standard formulation, the one we have been considering to this point, the benefits that others enjoy as the result of subjects’ participation in clinical research are medical and health benefits, better treatments for disease, better methods to prevent disease.
Industry funded research introduces the potential for a very different sort of benefit and thereby potentially alters, in a fundamental way, the moral concerns raised by clinical research. Pharmaceutical companies typically focus on generating profit and increasing stock price and market share. Indeed, it is sometimes argued that corporations have an obligation to their shareholders to pursue increased market share and share price (Friedman 1970). This approach may well lead companies to pursue new medical treatments which have little or no potential to improve overall health and well-being (Huskamp 2006; Croghan and Pittman 2004). “Me-too” drugs are the classic example here. These are drugs identical in all clinically relevant respects to approved drugs already in use. The development of a me-too drug offers the potential to redistribute market share without increasing overall health and well-being.
There is considerable debate regarding how many me-too drugs there really are and what is required for a drug to qualify as effectively identical (Garattini 1997). For example, if the existing treatment needs to be taken with meals, but a new treatment need not, is that a clinically relevant advance? Bracketing these questions, a drug company may well be interested in a drug which clearly qualifies as a me-too drug. The company may be able, by relying on a savvy marketing department, to convince physicians to prescribe, and consumers to request the new one, thus increasing profit for the company without advancing health and well-being.
The majority of clinical research was once conducted by governmental agencies. For example, the US NIH is likely the largest governmental sponsor of clinical research in the world. However, its research budget has declined over the past 20 years (Mervis 2004, 2008), and it is estimated that a majority, perhaps a significant majority of clinical research studies are now conducted by industry: “as recently as 1991 eighty per cent of industry-sponsored trials were conducted in academic health centers…Impatient with the slow pace of academic bureaucracies, pharmaceutical companies have moved trials to the private sector, where more than seventy per cent of them are now conducted” (Elliott 2008, Angell 2008, Miller and Brody 2005).
In addition to transforming the fundamental ethical challenge posed by clinical research, industry sponsored research has the potential to transform the way that many of the specific ethical concerns are addressed within that context. For example, the possibility that investigators and funders may earn significant amounts of money from their participation in clinical research might, it is thought, warp their judgment in ways that conflict with appropriate protection of research subjects (Fontanarosa, Flanagin, and DeAngelis 2005). When applied to investigators and funders this concern calls into question the very significant percentage of research funded by and often conducted by for-profit organizations. Skeptics might wonder whether the goal of making money has any greater potential to influence judgment inappropriately compared to many other motivations that are widely accepted, even esteemed in the context of clinical research, such as gaining tenure and fame, impressing one’s colleagues, or winning the Nobel Prize.
Financial conflicts of interest in clinical research point to a tension between relying on profits to motivate research versus insulating drug development and testing from the profit motive as a way of protecting research subjects and future patients (Psaty and Kronmal 2008). Finally, if industry can make billions of dollars from the development of a single drug one wonders what constitutes an appropriate response to the subjects who were vital to the development of the drug in question. On a standard definition, whether a given transaction is fair depends on the risks and burdens that each party to the transaction bears and the extent to which others benefit from the party’s participation in the transaction (see entry on exploitation). A series of clinical research studies can result in a company earning tens of billions of dollars in profits. Recognizing that a fair level of benefit is a complex function of participants’ inputs compared to the inputs of others, and the extent to which third parties benefit from those inputs, it is difficult to see how one might fill in the details of this scenario to show that the typically minimal, or non-existent compensation offered to research participants is fair.
At the same time, addressing this potential for exploitation by offering substantial payments to research participants who contribute to especially lucrative studies would introduce its own set of ethical concerns: is payment an appropriate response to the kind of contribution made by research participants; might payment constitute an undue inducement to participate; will payment undermine other participants’ altruistic motivations; to what extent does payment encourage research subject to provide misleading or false information to investigators in order to enroll and remain in research studies? In the end, then, as commentators struggle to address the existing ethical concerns raised by clinical research, its conduct in the real world raises new ethical concerns and, thereby, offers opportunities for philosophers looking for interesting, not to mention practically very important issues in need of analysis and resolution.
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