Informed consent is currently treated as the core of bioethics. In clinical practice, the doctrine of informed consent rose to dominance during the course of the 20th century. It replaced a medical ethos founded on trust in physicians’ decisions, often on the assumption that “doctor knows best”, with an ethos that sought to put patients in charge of their own care. In medical research, the influential Nuremberg Code responded to the cruelty of Nazi experiments stipulating: “The voluntary consent of the human subject is absolutely essential”. But why should we require informed consent, e.g. when it comes at a cost to the individual’s health? What is the content, the scope, and the status of that requirement? How does informed consent in bioethics, the focus of the present entry, relate to consent in sexual ethics, business ethics, and political philosophy?
- 1. The requirement of informed consent
- 2. Why informed consent?
- 3. The idea of consent
- 4. Informed consent
- 5. Voluntary consent
- 6. Own-waivers of informed consent
- 7. Exceptions to informed consent
- 8. The status of informed consent
- 9. Consent in other domains
- 10. Conclusion: the core of informed consent
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In English, “consent” has several meanings. In the relevant sense, consent transactions have a distinct structure: agent A consents to B’s φ-ing on A, under a certain description of φ-ing, whether or not the offer was initiated by B. For example, a man may consent to a physician’s touching the man’s testicles as part of a testicular cancer exam upon the physician’s suggestion (compare Kleinig 2010, 6–7).
Informed consent is shorthand for informed, voluntary, and decisionally-capacitated consent. Consent is considered fully informed when a capacitated (or “competent”) patient or research participant to whom full disclosures have been made and who understands fully all that has been disclosed consents voluntarily to treatment or participation on this basis.
In its most important role in bioethics, informed consent is a legitimacy requirement for certain actions. Inadequately informed consent makes certain intrusions impermissible. Roughly, when a sufficiently capacitated adult does not give sufficiently informed and voluntary consent to intervention in her body or her private sphere, then, at least when the intervention is substantial, not trivial, and absent severe jeopardy for third parties, the intervention is impermissible—even when it seeks to assist her, physicians recommend it, third parties would benefit from it, and the patient herself had repeatedly consented to it before expressing a change of mind. When the antecedent is inapplicable—for instance, when the patient lacks decision-making capacity—similarly spirited rules apply, such as rules delegating consent “authority” to the patient’s advance directive or proxy.
While consent and informed consent are relevant to medical torts, to distributive and proprietary medical claims, and to ideal (as opposed to merely legitimate) doctor-patient relationships, this entry focuses on informed consent in its central role as a legitimacy requirement for medical intervention. Contemporary medical culture and central human rights documents support something like this requirement. In the U.S., where regulatory commitment to informed consent is especially strong, federal funding for research usually requires review of informed consent procedures, and the constitutional right to privacy binds government to honor patients’ refusal of care. Lack of informed consent can be used to establish negligence (and hence malpractice and torts), or battery and assault.
Since the 1970s, extensive bioethics writing focuses on how to define and achieve “valid” consent—sufficiently capacitated, informed, and voluntary consent—and the conditions, especially in medical research, have become increasingly demanding. The contrast between these post-informed consent expectations and an earlier medical ethos is vivid in an excerpt of the Hippocratic Oath (fifth century B.C.E.): “Conceal most things from the patient… Give necessary orders with cheerfulness and serenity… revealing nothing of the patient’s future or present condition.” Present-day physicians like to think that they treat their patients differently.
Section 2 discusses the potential justifications for the requirement of informed consent. Sections 3–5 delineate its content with greater detail. Sections 6–7 note potential waivers and exceptions to the requirement. Sections 8–9 review its status and its relations to consent requirements in other normative fields. Section 10 concludes.
Plato attacks political democracy by drawing an analogy to the medical arena: “When a man is ill… to the physician he must go, and he who wants to be governed, to him who is able to govern” (Plato Republic, VI 489B–C, 180). Nowadays it is common to reject both Plato’s anti-democratic politics and his medical ethics. A central defense of political democracy against Plato’s attack rests on the Condorcet jury theorem, which underwrites the “wisdom of the masses.” But why reject Plato’s medical ethics? In the medical arena there are no masses, and yet the informed consent requirement gives a single non-expert—the patient or the research participant—veto power over some interventions, even against the will of many expert physicians. Why not take Plato’s, or Hippocrates’s, approach in the medical arena? Why require informed consent, disallowing even a mass of medical experts to make the final decision on matters that fall within their fields of expertise—medical treatment and medical investigation? The main arguments for informed consent revolve around:
- prevention of abusive conduct,
- non-domination, and
- personal integrity.
The simplest rationale for the informed consent requirement is that it protects study participants’ and patients’ health and welfare. It protects participants from investigators’ overzealous attempts to promote science and personal careers, even on participants’ backs, and it also protects regular patients from neglectful clinicians or from overconfident, but often wrong, paternalistic ones. While many moral doctrines oppose harming study participants or patients, bioethicists’ expositions of this instrumental rationale typically echo utilitarian philosopher John Stuart Mill, for whom “Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign” (Mill 1990, 135; see also ch. 3). They explain that patients and research participants are typically the best judges of their own good and mind it far more than the doctor does, even when the doctor is convinced that he or she acts in their best interests (compare Mill 1990, e.g. 215). They add that doctors’ training scarcely prepares them to know patients’ distinctive non-medical interests.
However, insofar as the goal is to protect patients and trial participants from harm, why honor informed consent requirements when many physicians and patients—a Condorcet “jury”—are fairly certain that a particular patient or participant is not making a decision that furthers her own medical interests? In clinical care, for example, patients’ biases and ignorance about medicine arguably tend to exceed those of physicians; sometimes, patients refuse interventions that everyone considers best for them—even family, friends, and these patients themselves, before a change of heart. In the future, patients may refuse interventions that highly-reliable algorithms predict patients like them to be glad to have undergone. Indeed, some patients knowingly jeopardize their own health in the name of religious or moral commitments. This being the case, why is it important—as it seems to many of us and as is enshrined in law—to honor the requirement of informed consent? For example, why honor the requirement when a fully capacitated Jehovah’s Witness refuses a blood transfusion on religious grounds? Why honor it when health is not at stake, for example, in experiments on stored tissue? Finally, specifically from a utilitarian standpoint, why honor the requirement on occasions when it seems to set back collective health, for example, when we cannot develop a new drug that would help many, because no one is altruistic enough to consent to participate in its risky study?
The 1970s saw the ascent of a second rationale, autonomy, as the predominant justification of informed consent, through influential work by Ruth Faden, Tom Beauchamp, James Childress, and a U.S. President’s Commission (Faden and Beauchamp 1986, 8; National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1979, section b (1), 282–3; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, ch. 4; Beauchamp 2010; see also President’s Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1982, 27; Feinberg 1986; Dworkin 1988, 111, 113; Buchanan and Brock 1989, 36ff.; Brock 1994, 31–2).
Philosophers of action usually understand autonomy as governance over one’s own agency—acting according to a law that one sets for oneself. Likewise, for bioethicists Beauchamp and Childress, “The autonomous individual acts freely in accordance with a self-chosen plan, analogous to the way an independent government manages its territories and establishes its policies” (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 99–100). As the authors emphasize (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 100–1), autonomy so understood differs from autonomy as having the will that one wants to have (Frankfurt 1988). It also differs from many other uses of “autonomy” in bioethics and biolaw (Dworkin 1988, 101ff.)—so many as to prompt some to question the force of autonomy-based justifications (O’Neill 2003). However, initially, autonomy seems like a promising ground for informed consent requirements. The rationale for not transfusing a protesting, decisionally-capacitated Jehovah’s Witness even when forced transfusion would save the witness’s life is clearly not protection of her health. Instead, it may seem to do with maintaining her self-rule on such momentous issues: a matter of respect for an autonomous decision maker’s refusal. And fully informed consent usually assumes freedom from controlling interference and from an inadequate understanding of the basic risks of the intervention, components of fully autonomous choice as well (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 100–1).
While occasionally, the need for autonomous authorization of medical intervention is considered “axiomatic” (Beauchamp 2010, 58), it is commonplace to defend autonomy on independent grounds. A complete autonomy-based justification for the informed consent requirement would explain both why personal autonomy, under a plausible explication, matters—why it has high value or status, at least in the health arena; and how honoring the informed consent requirement engages with its value or status correctly.
Some attempt to justify autonomy on merely instrumental grounds, suggesting, for example, that concordance between our care and our values is often key to our continued satisfaction and cooperation with assigned medical teams. Others add that autonomy is inherently good for us. First, self-rule is central to a good life, perhaps because it makes us less self-alienated and more worthy of praise for our virtuous decisions. Second, autonomous choices promote our ultimate goals, on the non-controversial assumption that medicine affects non-technical and controversial matters of value and faith on which physicians are not experts (say, a Jehovah’s Witness’s faith), and the controversial assumption that these goals define how well our lives go (President’s Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1982; Dworkin 1988, 113).
However, these links between informed consent, autonomy, and the good life are more tenuous than informed consent requirements are usually assumed to be. In the Jehovah’s Witness case, any medical good that might come from promoting the patient’s future cooperation with assigned medical teams is irrelevant once refusal to accept transfusion makes the patient’s future life an impossibility. In addition, according to the beliefs of some Jehovah’s Witnesses, what their religion says is that they must refuse transfusion, not that undergoing forced transfusion would land them in hell or breach their personal integrity. To impose transfusion on Jehovah’s Witnesses of that particular persuasion might not blight their lives, yet it remains a clear breach of informed consent requirements.
Fully autonomous decision-making seems to be bad for us sometimes in at least certain respects, say, when it involves tortuous deliberations, makes us more accountable for embarrassing mistakes, or invites social pressure to make certain choices (Dworkin 1988, ch. 5). The cost of ensuring that a single decision is absolutely autonomous may be a severe, permanent, or fatal health problem. This health problem will usually affect well-being more than a small marginal decrease of autonomy would—yet some informed consent requirements apply. Indeed, on no theory of well-being—neither desire satisfaction, hedonic state, nor objective list—does it seem to follow that either informed consent or autonomous choice invariably makes a patient’s life better (Buchanan and Brock 1989, ch. 1 §4, esp. p. 40). And if they did, then it would be absurd to claim, as proponents of the autonomy rationale do (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, e.g. pp. 12, 14), that informed consent and the principle of autonomy are distinct from, sometimes conflict with, and often supersede, the principle of beneficence.
A different version of the autonomy rationale states, in the spirit of Immanuel Kant’s ethics, that autonomy should command our awe and reverence, whether or not it is good for us (Hill 1991, 43). The literature on informed consent regularly cites Kant’s Formula of Humanity (Kant 1996, 80 [4:429]) to establish that duties of respect for autonomy bind physicians (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 63, 103; Dworkin 1988, 110; Levine 1988, 96–7; Pellegrino and Thomasma 1993, 128). Alan Donagan’s defense of the requirement of informed consent illustrates this Kantian approach: “Recognition of every human being as having a unique dignity as human, and as therefore being an end in every relation in which others may morally stand to him, entails that no human being may legitimately be interfered with in pursuing his conception of his happiness in whatever way seems best to him” (Donagan 1977, 31).
This version of the autonomy rationale is criticizeable as well. Kant associated respect for persons with treating them only in ways that they could possibly or rationally consent to, not with treating them in ways that they have actually consented to—rationally, voluntarily, or otherwise (Wertheimer 2014, 149). The notion of autonomy as bioethicists understand it hardly resembles Kant’s notion of autonomy (O’Neill 2003). And while some contemporary Kantians interpret autonomy as “our authority to determine our own actions” (Buss 2016), many gross violations of informed consent do not directly transgress that alleged authority. A surgeon who exploits a patient’s surgical anesthesia to force an experimental intervention grossly violates informed consent by affecting heavily the incognizant patient’s body and life, but less directly if at all by thwarting the patient’s determination of what actions to perform. During the violation, the anesthetized patient was not performing any action. Likewise, informed consent finds some interventions far more reprehensible than others, although their impacts on our autonomous action and pursuits are similar. Performing a testicular cancer exam without the patient’s informed consent is very problematic, and transgresses core informed consent requirements. It is far harder to justify than looking carefully at a skin mole on a patient’s cheek from across a clinic desk, in order to detect cancer, without the patient’s informed consent. Non-consensual facial scrutiny might not even violate informed consent. The main difference seems to be in whether a sensitive area of the patient’s body is being touched and scrutinized without the patient’s consent, which can constitute extreme battery; and not in the patient’s exercise of agency, say, in the number or nature of the patient’s actions and plans that are thereby blocked. It may be true that extreme battery symbolizes extreme contempt towards the patient as a sovereign agent, but here, at least, it does not involve greater interference with his autonomy as characterized above.
Regardless of either the exact meaning of autonomy or the extent to which autonomy is good for us, grounding informed consent in autonomy turns out to be difficult. First, autonomous decision making over all matters that heavily affect one’s health is not something to which any patient has a right. Organ waitlists, for instance, can be perfectly legitimate even when some patients demand in full voluntariness the next available organ and autonomously refuse to wait in line. Just because receiving the organ would serve their autonomous wills does not make it their right to obtain organs designated to others ahead of them on the list without interference. Admittedly, the autonomy rationale may here be conjoined with a clarification as to which matters concerning patients’ health they have a right to determine. But for some that right would then be the reason why their consent is required, when it is required (McConnell 2018), potentially making any further reference to autonomy redundant.
A second challenge to grounding informed consent requirements in autonomy is that violating informed consent requirements can have positive impact on autonomy. One example is when closing off an option, in violation of informed consent, enables more important freedoms. For instance, closing off patients’ options for voluntary euthanasia was said to increase their autonomy by freeing them, as well as similar patients, from family pressure to use that option (Velleman 1992); surely it may do so even when accomplished through forced injection of an antidote or other violations of informed consent.
A third challenge is that not all acts that are generally assumed to violate informed consent seem contrary to autonomous decision-making. Suppose that a sufficiently capacitated adult patient refuses a safe, beneficial, and time-sensitive surgery to prevent a moderate disability, due to a simple misunderstanding of medical facts. There is no time to convince him of his mistake. Being uninformed, his decision cannot count as autonomous. But present medical practices surrounding informed consent continue to forbid, possibly for good reasons, forcing care on such a patient—for example, strapping him to the bed to deliver an operation. In such instances, the problem with forced care cannot be simply violation of autonomy. Some have argued in somewhat similar cases that forced care is legitimate, because it would contravene “mere desire” not “rational desire” (Savulescu 1994), and because “the state has the right to prevent self-regarding harmful conduct…when… that conduct is substantially nonvoluntary…” (Feinberg 1986, 12). A different possible conclusion is that present informed consent practices are sound, they just rest on justifications other than respect for personal autonomy; surely a “No” to an intervention in the body is often a “No” even when the patient lacks the capacity or the information to authorize an autonomous “Yes” (compare Estlund 2007, 121–5; Gunderson 1990). A third possible conclusion is that while what is wrong with forced care in this setting is the violation of autonomy, what “autonomy” means here is simply a domain over which one should remain sovereign and have the final say, even if uninformed, incapacitated, and so forth (Enoch 2017, 31–32). This, however, is not how “autonomy” is used in bioethics.
As a final challenge to grounding informed consent in autonomy, consider a patient who has been treated fairly and offered a simple explanation of her treatment and the alternatives, which she could comprehend if she tried; her failure to comprehend it and to choose autonomously is the fruit of her own neglect. Can the physician or the investigator really be blamed for the patient’s consequent non-autonomous choice (Sreenivasan 2003; Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 85, 95; Millum and Bromwich 2013)? In many areas of life in which consent seems necessary, what matters is not so much the “quality of choice,” say, how autonomous it is, but whether the person had been given the opportunity to make a choice of that quality (Scanlon 1988). Advocates of the autonomy rationale may respond in one of two ways. First, they may insist that when an investigator did due diligence to help candidate participants understand the significant risks of a study yet sees that they have not been understood, she has a reason to explain again, or recruit other candidates, precisely because the autonomy of study participation matters; alternatively, they may insist that having been given real opportunity to decide autonomously already counts as having been given autonomy over the matter.
An alternate rationale defends informed consent requirements as a bulwark against such deontological offenses as assault, deceit, coercion, and exploitation (Manson and O’Neill 2007, 75f.), or fraud (Millum and Bromwich 2013). From this viewpoint, informed consent requirements are instrumental against certain abusive acts, not (only) against setbacks to health and welfare.
The abuse-prevention rationale may be unable to account for the full extent of clinicians’ informed consent duties. We have already mentioned that physicians should make some effort to explain information again if they discover that their patients misunderstand crucial risks. Intuitively, this is so even if the patient was given an excellent explanation, one that worked with similar patients and which would rule out reasonable suspicion of deceit, exploitation, or fraud, their patients misunderstand crucial risks should make some effort to explain again. Given that abuse has already been ruled out, the abuse-prevention rationale fails to account for this duty (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 118; compare Manson and O’Neill 2007, 82–3). That said, the abuse-prevention rationale in no way rules out an account of that duty based on complementary rationales for informed consent (Millum and Bromwich 2013, 218).
Another challenge for the abuse-prevention rationale is that it is difficult to ground in the deontological morality that has been invoked to motivate it. Typically understood as agent relative and moment relative, deontological morality may be unable to provide strong reasons for preventing future deontological offenses, especially by others. A truly deontological abuse-prevention rationale would therefore leave little room for strong reasons to enforce informed consent requirements on others, yet some informed consent rights are surely legally enforceable by third parties later. It would also hardly leave room for strong reasons against coercive medical intervention when third parties perform the coercion; for example, against extracting a live kidney from a consenting patient who consents only due to her family’s coercion, yet such reasons are widely recognized. Any consequentialist variant on the abuse-prevention rationale would usually need to focus on all bad consequences, not just on abusive conduct and its downstream consequences, and serious harm to someone’s health would often count as a worse consequence than someone’s having been deceived.
In recent years, a number of philosophers have argued that “Informed consent… is generally important [in part] because it can make a distinctive contribution to the restoration of trust” (O’Neill 2002, 145; see also Bok 1999, 11, 26–7, 63; Jackson 1994, 491; Kass et al 1996; Tännsjö 1999, 24). Their trust rationale is future-looking. It points out the importance of ongoing societal trust in caretakers and medical institutions, for example, as a precondition of ongoing compliance with medical advice, registration for organ donor cards, and participation in medical research. Since violations of informed consent would jeopardize that trust, they are something to be avoided. This rationale has the advantage of potentially demanding informed consent even to certain low-risk and low-impact interventions. For example, forced testicular exam may be medically “safe”, but, if discovered, could profoundly shake public trust in providers. The rationale also addresses the special wrongness of outright lying to patients (perhaps worse than non-lying deceit: Jackson 1991, 7–9)), say, to realize beneficial placebo effects. If discovered, lying and battery could easily undermine public trust in physicians.
The trust rationale is most plausible as a partial rationale. It faces serious objections if it is taken as a comprehensive justification of informed consent (Eyal 2014). For one thing, being forward-looking, this rationale is vulnerable to the objection that, intuitively, informed consent can remain necessary even when the public could never find out that a core violation of the requirement took place. While the requirement of informed consent might not obtain across the board, it seems inappropriate to determine whether it obtains in a given context based on e.g. how chemically traceable is the medication whose forced administration is being considered, although that would affect how much this act would jeopardize future public trust in physicians. Another challenge to this version of the trust rationale is that invasive interventions without a person’s informed consent are usually thought to wrong that person, not to wrong only the potential future victims of a decline in public trust. A possible response would be that the (only) reason why we consider informed consent to be the immediate patient’s right is that what is likeliest to inspire public trust is unconditional commitment to one’s immediate patient’s alleged consent rights.
A quite different version of trust rationale is backward-looking. This version defends informed consent as an intrinsically important way to honor the trust that the patient has placed in the physician, and as part of the fiduciary role that the physician has undertaken (Joffe and Truog 2010, 352ff.), perhaps a matter of virtuous trustworthiness (Pellegrino and Thomasma 1993, 65–78). However, the backward-looking version of the trust rationale has difficulty explaining the need for informed consent outside pre-existing caretaker-patient relationships. Forced bodily trespass, for example, seems (not much less) wrong when it comes from complete strangers.
Another rationale surrounds self-ownership: we are presumed to hold proprietary rights over ourselves and our bodies, perhaps in line with John Locke’s idea that “every Man has a Property in his own Person” (Locke 1988, V. 27, 305). Naturally, once an owner’s consent is given, the alleged proprietary prohibition on access and on direct impact is removed. This rationale may better explain why we must normally grant our permission, even for medical intervention that is safe, low-impact, and clearly beneficial, and requires no agency on our part. Trespass into a private sphere can be forbidden even when it involves mere touching, and the owner is foolish or selfish to reject it (Archard 2008, 27f; Thomson 1990, ch. 8; Nozick 1986).
But an account based on self-ownership raises more questions than it settles. Self-ownership may just mean that the individual should be the final arbiter in the relevant sphere, and that seems like a part of what informed consent requires—hardly an edifying rationalization for requiring informed consent (compare Cohen 1995, chs. 9–10). Alternatively, self-ownership may designate a more circumscribed list of rights (Fried 2005; Archard 2008, 29–30), but this list would also stand in need of a defense, and cannot by itself count as adequate justification. A further challenge is that the self-ownership rationale fails to clarify why touching sensitive areas of the body without consent seems worse than touching less sensitive areas without consent. Property violation is not usually a matter of degree (compare Archard 2008, 30–1). Finally, the self-ownership rationale fails to clarify why physicians must disclose and ensure our comprehension of information prior to intervention, something which proprietary rights seldom require. Indeed, the notion of self-ownership could be used against coercing doctors to give patients that information—because such coercion may violate these physicians’ self-ownership rights to interact as they will.
Bioethicists rarely explore the value of non-domination as a rationale for informed consent, although this rationale is used extensively in sexual ethics and political philosophy. The idea here would be that no one should be under the arbitrary control of another and that informed consent requirements help to prevent such arbitrary control. One would argue that medicine is rife with potential to become hierarchical, given the utter dependency of patients and research participants on physicians (Levine 1988, 121–2), as well as the knowledge gaps between them, especially in the investigational context. Therefore, it is important to ensure that patients and research participants retain a high degree of control over what happens to them, and informed consent helps with this. This rationale may shed light on the special importance of informed consent to research participation—where the knowledge gap is greater, and where there is a specific informed consent right to withdraw from research at any point. Even if one has autonomously waived protection, arbitrary control by others, without the protection of a consent requirement, remains intolerable.
The non-domination rationale has difficulty explaining why physicians and investigators who are closely monitored and cannot afford to mistreat patients would also be obligated to let patients decide. Arguably, some existing systems have ample institutional mechanisms in place to prevent physicians and investigators from exercising arbitrary control, even without informed consent requirements, and yet commonsense recognizes such requirements.
A final rationale for informed consent requirements is the need to protect patients’ sense of personal integrity. One reason offered for keeping surrogate pregnancy contracts non-enforceable is the need to maintain surrogate carriers’ sense of personhood by never coercively taking babies away (Radin 1983, e.g., 960). A similar rationale may be thought to justify informed consent in general, and to reflect our special relation to our bodies. As Gerald Dworkin put a slightly different point, “one’s body is irreplaceable and inescapable. If my architect doesn’t listen to me and this results in a house I do not like, I can always move. I cannot move from my body.” (Dworkin 1988, 113). By one interpretation, personal integrity underlies self-ownership norms. What it requires is, in Ronald Dworkin’s words, “a prophylactic line that comes close to making the body inviolate” (Dworkin 1983, 39). However, personal integrity may instead give rise to a normative continuum, on which the outer line of the body is only one stop. Touching someone’s cheek without his informed consent is hardly as bad as touching more sensitive areas of his body without his informed consent. The continuum may also extend outside the body. As Judith Thomson points out, it is a greater transgression to touch an unwilling person’s body than to touch his shoes, yet a small transgression exists, even when he is not wearing them (Thomson 1990, 207–8). It also matters how and why these areas are touched. Such continua may be thought to track the typical degree of injury to personal integrity.
An account in terms of personal integrity would require more specification. For example, what is the relation between this account and the offense of battery? Would this account condemn the use of a magic wand to treat an unwilling patient’s ailments without cutting his skin and so, perhaps without battery (Brock 1999, 529f)? Would it also condemn threat of fines that coerces patients to move their bodies in certain ways, even without touching them? Is the account ultimately grounded in an a priori argument, in evolutionary psychology (Wertheimer 2003, 113f.), in the typical material harms from violations of bodily integrity, or in still other considerations?
Let us now review the different elements of fully free and informed consent in some detail, starting with the notion of consent itself. English admits of both psychological and behavioral senses of consent. Psychologically, consent can designate “a state of mind of acquiescence” (Westen 2003, 5), and “an act of will—a subjective mental state…” (Hurd 1996, 121). But the medical requirement of informed consent seems to include at least some behavioral expression of consent (Kleinig 2010, 9–10), ranging from a patient’s signature, to her not protesting when a nurse approaches with a syringe (so-called implicit or tacit consent). That said, the need for some comprehension and voluntariness means that mental states also affect when consent legitimizes medical intervention, perhaps supporting a hybrid view of one sort (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 84) or another (Alexander 2014).
When emergency intervention is needed but normal consent cannot be obtained, say, because the patient is unconscious and neither she nor her family’s specific preferences can be identified in time, proponents of informed consent often justify intervention by invoking a potentially different form of consent. They say that presumed consent obtains, even if actual and express consent does not. Presumed consent is also often invoked in order to legitimize a general policy of harvesting organs from healthy deceased persons to use in transplantation unless they explicitly indicated their opposition, and a similar general policy of testing all incoming patients for HIV except those who explicitly request not to be tested. Such policies reverse the usual default assumptions about what is permissible and place the onus on any individual who has reservations, to “opt out.” The underlying thought is that when opting out remains easy, so-called presumed consent is perfectly consonant with patient sovereignty (Sunstein and Thaler 2008).
Some authors oppose the terminology of presumed consent as a contrived “myth” or “fiction” of actual consent (Harmon 1990; Brownsword 2004, 232–3; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 107; Dworkin 1988, 117). They concede that when a nurse approaches a patient with a syringe, the patient’s failure to protest constitutes actual, albeit tacit, consent per convention. But they add that it is fraudulent to presume consent when consent is not explicitly given and no relevant convention specifies that silence expresses consent.
This opposition seems to interpret “presumed consent” ascriptions as meaning: Presumably, the patient has given actual (albeit tacit) consent. The opponents seem right on point: it goes too far to assume that, just because a patient fails to carry in her pocket a directive forbidding care or organ harvesting in the event of an emergency or death, she is consenting. However, on a different interpretation, presumed consent ascriptions mean: Presumably, the patient would have consented to the intervention if, under the current circumstances, she were decisionally-capacitated. A possible ground for such counterfactual ascriptions is that there is no special information that indicates that the patient would not consent, and most people would consent. This interpretation seems to sidestep the difficulty.
Of course, if opt-out organ procurement policies are justified, it is not necessary that one justify them in terms of consent (presumed or otherwise) as long as one is prepared to argue that sometimes, certain values defeat individuals’ consent rights. In the case of organs from the deceased, the primary pull for making consent not refusal into the default may well be the huge benefit to the organ recipient and the far lower harm to the deceased. Together, these factors may make high-quality informed consent less urgent.
Clinical trials are commonly anticipated by a formalized process in which participants receive explanations of the purpose, methods, risks, benefits, and alternatives to study participation, as well as other matters, before they sign informed consent forms (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 129). Fairly similar processes exist in invasive care. But what is the point of these processes? One of Plato’s characters mocks doctors who set aside time to keep sick patients informed: “Foolish fellow, … you are not healing the sick man, but you are educating him; and he does not want to be made a doctor, but to get well” (Plato Laws, IV.720a–c, p. 413). Let us discuss two forms of transgression of the information requirement: (1) lies, deceit, and merely-partial disclosure, and (2) the patient’s failure to comprehend well-presented information. We shall then discuss (3) the content and (4) the cogency of the information requirement.
Lies about pertinent matters are broadly assumed to violate the informed consent requirement. So does non-lying deceit that intentionally prompts a false impression, for example, complete concealment of a potentially despairing prognosis, or its statement in obscure Latin terms that the patient cannot understand, in order to maintain the patient’s hope and medical adherence. So does non-lying deceit that is voluntary but unintentional, say an explanation in obscure Latin terms meant only to impress the patient but foreseen to hamper comprehension (Jackson 1991, 6). Interestingly, ignorance of side effects that results purely from the early stage of scientific inquiry into them is taken to permit informed consent and autonomous decisionmaking (Millum and Bromwich 2013). A recent question is how much certain mild forms of intentional manipulation—for example, placing the hopeful news both at the beginning and at the end of a prognostic report so as to make its affect more hopeful—invalidate informed consent (Eyal 2016).
The intentional use of the placebo effect in clinical care, commonly a deceitful means to help a patient feel better, is condemned by prominent bioethicists in the name of informed consent (Bok 1999, 61ff.; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 125). Other seeming breaches of the information component of informed consent are somewhat more popular with bioethicists. First, the well-established “nocebo” effect is when the patient’s expectation of a negative outcome as a possibility generates corresponding symptoms or exacerbates them. When a severe, unavoidable nocebo effect from disclosure is predictable, most philosophical observers support withholding certain information (Cohen 2014). In some cultures, patients are averse to hearing about risks because they falsely believe that the mention of remote risks makes those risks likelier to materialize. While the expectation is false, it means that full disclosure of these risks would meet with aversion, potential anxiety, and fewer clinic visits, and many bioethicists permit partial disclosure in such settings (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 106). Finally, so-called deceptive studies can begin while the participant is waiting in the corridor for what she believes is an altogether different experiment, precisely because full disclosure would foil the investigation. Their deceitful nature notwithstanding, such studies are ubiquitous in psychology and some bioethicists find forms of them acceptable (but see condemnation in Bok 1995).
What is the point of the disclosure process? The Nuremberg Code can be understood to answer that one point is that a research participant should “have sufficient knowledge and comprehension of the elements of the subject matter involved as to enable him to make an understanding and enlightened decision.” Clearly, mere disclosure does not ensure that. Even when information is given in plain terms in the participant’s language, many participants fail to appreciate statistical information about risks, or the fact that in placebo controlled trials, they might not receive the treatment under investigation, or the fact that trials aim to further scientific knowledge and not necessarily their own medical good. The result is that participants tend to overestimate the benefits of trial participation and downplay its risks, part of a phenomenon called the “therapeutic misconception” (Candilis and Lidz 2010; Miller 2010, 382ff.; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 129).
Many contemporary writers therefore emphasize that truly informed consent requires much more than mere disclosure, and that the point of disclosure, rather, is the comprehension potentially gained through effective communication (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 127ff; Manson and O’Neill 2007, e.g., 184–5). Psychologists and health literacy experts seek effective ways to improve comprehension among patients and candidate study participants (Candilis and Lidz 2010). And when a patient or a candidate participant is known to understand the relevant information anyhow because she is a physician specializing in the field, intuitively disclosure is unnecessary, evidence that its point is comprehension and hence, perhaps, autonomous decision-making (Beauchamp 2010, 57).
“However, a challenge arises in cases where disclosing all of the very serious risks to candidates, results in forms that are so long as to inhibit comprehension. When this happens, a preference for adequate comprehension over adequate disclosure may suggest that we should neglect to mention at least some major risks. If that seems misplaced, there might be some point to adequate disclosure beyond its potential contribution to the patient’s or the study candidate’s adequate comprehension, such as greater transparency and accountability.
When comprehension remains poor despite repeated efforts to elicit comprehension, what should investigators do? Is enlistment in a trial illegitimate, because no autonomous authorization took place (Faden and Beauchamp 1986; Candilis and Lidz 2010)? Some philosophers respond that it remains legitimate, because by giving candidates the opportunity to issue autonomous authorization, investigators do their parts (Sreenivasan 2003), avoid any potential fraud (Millum and Bromwich 2013), and treat the candidates fairly (Miller and Wertheimer 2010), conditions that they find sufficient for valid consent. Indeed, even the permissibility of skipping disclosure when the patient is a medical expert might be taken to indicate that part of the point of informed consent is to prevent fraud, which is impossible when the patient is easily capable of detecting fraud, and not necessarily autonomous authorization.
What information should be disclosed or comprehended? It is common to emphasize that patients cannot possibly be “fully informed” if that would include all facts, or all facts that are material to physicians’ decisions. For example, research participants, who need to know the main risks of participation, do not need to know much about the history of the disease. But how are we to determine which facts patients and trial participants should be informed about? Three legal standards exist: the professional standard, the reasonable person standard, and the individual standard.
The professional standard mandates informing patients and participants of those details that it is conventional for professionals in the field to mention. Once predominant, this standard has lost much of its traction with U.S. courts. Indeed, no professional convention exists on this issue, and courts have opined that patients should decide which information is pertinent to them. The reasonable person standard mandates disclosing whatever details a reasonable patient would find pertinent. Finally, the individual standard mandates informing the patient or participant of those details that she, as a determinate individual, in keeping with her potentially unreasonable conception of the good, would find pertinent if she were otherwise reasonable (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 122f.; Levine 1988, 104–5; Berg et al. 2001, 46–52). An argument against requiring the disclosure of any risk is that neither advance disclosure nor risk comprehension are necessary for the restoration of trust and for deterring abuse of patients and trial participants; what is necessary is only ready patient and trial participant access to the relevant information in the event that abuse is suspected (Manson and O’Neill 2007, 179ff.).
As with many other “standards” in medical ethics, the question arises as to whether they are mere recommended procedures for doctors, judges, and professional educators, or exhibit fundamental moral principles.
Whether being informed is cashed out in terms of disclosure or of comprehension, and whichever standard is used, asking that patients or study participants be even adequately informed is sometimes asking too much. U.S. federal regulations waive the information requirement in research for some studies that involve no more than a minimal risk. In clinical care, many patients would rather not think about risks and prognoses that would turn their stomachs and that they can do little about. In some such contexts it seems cogent not to demand informing in any form (see sections 6, 7 below). However, outright lies surely remain forbidden even in such circumstances. A possible conclusion is that informed consent encompasses several layers of requirement that differ in their stringency.
When is consent sufficiently voluntary? Let us discuss three potential barriers to voluntariness: (1) literal coercion, (2) “undue inducement”, and (3) “no choice” situations.
Voluntary consent is usually thought incompatible with coercion, which philosophers define, roughly, as a threat to make someone seriously worse off than she is or should be, unless she consents (Wertheimer 1987). Nonetheless, the prevailing medical ethos tends to treat more cases as cases of coercion than this philosophical definition would suggest. A threat to cause even slight pain unless a patient acquiesces would be taken to invalidate her consent. It would do so even if the patient and the physician have common knowledge that it would not make her seriously worse off and so, that it would not amount to coercion. A threat to deny preventative intervention that is not otherwise owed—which therefore rarely amounts to a threat to make the patient worse off than she is or should be—unless the patient consents to an intervention would also be frowned upon.
How much do “implicit threats” count as threats? Imagine a practitioner who asks her own patient to participate in a study that the practitioner runs, and the patient fears that care would suffer if he declines, without the practitioner actually saying so. When the patient’s fear is well-founded, or even intentionally instilled by the practitioner, the norm has been to consider consent invalid. This clearly makes sense if what makes coercion problematic is (unjust) curtailment of options. However, even when the fear is unfounded and unintended, the hierarchy and the power inequality of the physician-patient relationship are often still thought to make such consent involuntary. The thought is that someone’s options count in this context as curtailed even when what curtails them is uncertainty and the patient’s own pessimism.
Another category often said to undermine voluntariness is undue inducement, a term of art meaning that something is being offered that is alluring to the point that it clouds rational judgment, for instance cash in hand or airline tickets in return for kidney donation or risky study participation. Attention is fixated on the benefit, disallowing proper consideration of risks. The thought here is not that the offer is too good to decline rationally, but that, as in deceit and hypnosis, proper reasoning and decision-making about it becomes impossible, at least for some patient populations (Wilkinson 2003, 117–118). A common worry among bioethics practitioners, undue inducement is less concerning to philosophers who have tried to make sense of the notion (e.g. Wertheimer 2010).
In some areas of practical ethics, the lack of decent alternatives to accepting a bad offer, a so-called “No choice” situation (Wertheimer 1987, e.g., p. 13), is said to make us forced or compelled to choose the offer (Cohen 1979), or to undermine voluntariness otherwise. While in such cases, indecent alternatives remain in principle open to us—the offer is not physically imposed on us—the same could be said of most literal coercion. In “your money or your life” situations, the option of dying remains open in principle. Consider then a poor person who knows that his only way to gain access to an expensive life-saving drug is to participate in a risky or very unpleasant study where the drug is provided free of charge. He is not, strictly speaking, coerced (Hawkins 2008, 24–5), but some believe that his consent is involuntary and the trial is unethical. None of the options available to him are decent.
There is a problem with this claim. Its logic suggests that whenever a sick, rich person has no decent alternative to taking a badly unpleasant life-saving drug, there is no voluntary consent, and drug delivery is illegitimate. Even when the nasty side effects remain far better for her than her only alternative—to die of the disease—she is not providing voluntary consent to take the drug, and it is unethical to give it to her. Since the latter reasoning is surely flawed, the former reasoning may be flawed as well.
Some have responded that the poor man’s inability to give voluntary consent to trial participation stems from injustice, not natural disease, and that this makes a big difference. But surely medical aid that saves consenting victims from the horrible results of injustice and carries unpleasant side effects can remain fully permissible. For example, following the 2010 earthquake in Haiti, it was fully permissible for the U.S. military and its physicians to perform consensual life-saving leg amputations. It was permissible whether earthquake injuries were purely natural, partly the result of non-U.S. injustice (local contractors’ independent neglect of safety rules), or partly the result of U.S.-perpetrated injustice (long-standing U.S. meddling in Haitian politics at the expense of accountability, including accountability for neglectful construction projects).
Another way out is to say that consent is insufficiently voluntary when the patient’s options are unfairly curtailed by the offer itself (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 92, 97). “Your money or your life” offers diminish our options, and that is why these offers compromise our voluntariness. By contrast, the above-mentioned offers to the poor trial candidate and to the rich patient do not curtail options and they maintain voluntariness. However, imagine impoverished potential study participants who lack alternative ways to obtain life-saving drugs. Imagine further that the investigators offer them these drugs whether or not they consent to participate, free of charge. The intuition is that this free, unconditional offer increases the voluntariness of these potential participants’ decisions on whether to participate, and it makes their invitation to participate in the trial easier to defend ethically. The free offer keeps their options open and thereby, commonsense suggests, renders their consent more genuinely voluntary. Note, however, that the options that the offer opens for them are not ones that the invitation to participate would otherwise have curtailed.
When, if ever, is a person authorized to waive her informed consent rights? Should participants who donate blood in a medical trial be permitted to authorize its use in any future trial, without their specific consent for each token (as U.S. federal regulations allow them, since 2018, to do)? What about a patient or a candidate study participant who asks to be spared tedious descriptions of her different options, and would rather entrust the medical team, or her village elder, with key decisions? What about someone who asks her physician to lie to her, if he is willing, should her prognosis be despairing? And what about a woman who would like to sell pregnancy services with a fully enforceable contract to hand over the baby even if she develops strong maternal feelings toward him or her and seeks to revoke her consent?
In democratic politics, we delegate many decisions to representatives. But we keep ourselves barred from signing away others, including the decision to waive our voting rights altogether. The question as to which decisions our institutions should allow patients to delegate to third parties is complex and under-explored. Bioethicists usually frown upon letting patients grant so-called carte blanche, or general consent, to whatever the physician considers appropriate for them (Dworkin 1988, e.g., 125–6). Instead, patients are usually encouraged or compelled to make decisions on a more ongoing basis—to give so-called specific consent (Kleinig 2010, 18)—although there are logical limits to how specific consent can be (Manson and O’Neill 2007, 12).
The requirement of informed consent is often attacked on the ground that many patients would rather have physicians make certain decisions for them, and that such delegation often seems acceptable (Schneider 1998). One answer to the attack argues that informed consent is a patient’s right, not her duty (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 105, 107), and that, since informed consent serves autonomy, it ought to be autonomously waiveable (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 106). Indeed, autonomously signed advance directives that bind one’s future self can be perfectly consensual and autonomous. What we may call “waiveable waivers” of informed consent rights (“Please spare me the full disclosure or decide in my name unless I ask to resume full disclosure or active control”) seem relatively easy to accept and fairly consistent with autonomy. However, we do impose some rights, which we consider inalienable, on unwilling rights holders. The right not to become a slave is inalienable, and the same may apply to some informed consent rights, such as the right not to become a participant of a clinical trial that one cannot exit.
An alternative answer to the attack is therefore that some informed consent rights are waiveable (perhaps including many disclosure rights), and others are non-waiveable (perhaps including the right to revoke prior consent to bodily intrusion). Theory is needed in order to tell which informed consent rights are waiveable and which are not. (Is the alleged second-order right to waive informed consent rights alienable?) Theory should also explore whether non-waiveable consent requirements are consistent with patient autonomy, say, because what such requirements impose is autonomous decision-making (potentially out of paternalistic concern with protecting the patient’s autonomy).
Even absent own-waivers, and despite absolutist statements of the informed consent requirement, such as the Nuremberg Code, many contemporary theorists agree that there are cases where informed consent procedures are not necessary. The law, and many bioethicists, recognize exceptions to informed consent requirements, such as lack of decision-making capacity, or emergency circumstances where the patient’s wishes are unknown (Tännsjö 1999; Emanuel, Wendler, and Grady 2000). That said, these exceptions serve the spirit of informed consent; they can be plausibly woven into full statements of the requirement (as proposed, for instance, in Dworkin 1988, 117), and they question only its crudest, most absolutist statements. Other exceptions seem harder to reconcile with full-blown commitment to informed consent and its central justifications. Let us discuss, specifically, the extent to which informed consent is needed in (1) benign care and benign experiments, (2) certain risky experiments, and (3) public health policy. We shall then present the general question, (4) When is informed consent needed?
The reality is that informed consent procedures are not legally mandated for the lion’s share of medical care, e.g. standard blood draws, in contrast to more invasive interventions like surgery. Indeed, form filling, mandatory disclosures, and so forth are intuitively unnecessary for the former (Manson and O’Neill 2007, 81f). In medical research, United States federal regulations authorize review boards to omit informed consent requirements on many occasions when “research involves no more than minimal risk to the participants”, a provision expanded in 2018. Again, this seems to make sense in many cases. A relatively safe and low-impact study comparing two widely used drugs to ascertain which is best seems morally permissible, even without a full-fledged informed consent process (Truog et al. 1999).
Some authors have used such examples to downplay the need for informed consent, criticizing what they call bioethicists’ “fixation” with informed consent (O’Neill 2002, 47–8; Brownsword 2004, 224). In response, some proponents of informed consent insist that, in many of the alleged counter-examples, something in the way of informed consent remains vital. In blood draws, in particular, when the patient is shown the needle and silently stretches her arm forward, she is said to give tacit or non-verbal consent (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 107; and see also Manson and O’Neill 2007, 11). This particular response may be insufficient. For example, when a busy nurse with many patients in line realizes that a patient is very ignorant about a blood draw, such that her tacit consent is uninformed, intuitively the nurse does not owe the patient a long explanation of the risks from a sanitized needle prick, which are remote and minor.
To some, this may suggest that fully-fledged informed consent requirements simply do not apply to highly benign interventions. Surely the need to protect health and welfare, at least, through informed consent procedures is lesser when that risk is negligible in the first place. Interestingly, similar logic suggests that when an intervention is not benign yet informed consent cannot improve upon other protections, informed consent may be unnecessary. A possible case in point is observational studies of anonymized electronic health records, where the main risk comes from breach of data security and confidentiality—a serious yet technical matter that few individual patients could assess reliably—and thus informed consent (on top of expert input and democratic decision making) might be an ineffective, unhelpful protection.
Still, some elements of the requirement of informed consent must remain in place, even in standard blood draws and other benign interventions (Dickert et al. forthcoming). Physical duress against a refusing patient and the intentional exploitation of a patient’s ignorance about blood draws both usually remain wrong. This may suggest that informed consent bundles together several requirements with different levels of stringency. Some are necessary in more contexts than others. It may also be thought to substantiate other theories on the ground for informed consent. For example, above we mentioned the view that informed consent is necessary as a preventative bulwark against coercive or fraudulent practices. But on that view, any exception for benign interventions might be impossible, since these interventions would be just as coercive or fraudulent as invasive ones. Thus, if sometimes it is correct for benign studies not to require informed consent, this calls this view into question.
Advancing the field of emergency medicine requires medical experimentation, including trials that compare different interventions and that only sometimes serve the best interests of trial participants. But, in emergency circumstances, it is often impossible to obtain consent from the patient or her family in time. Many physicians believe that, because the field of emergency medicine simply cannot progress absent experimentation, there should be an exception to informed consent requirements even for such risky trials, and substitutes for informed consent should be sought (Fost 1998; Dickert et al. forthcoming). Some elements of informed consent, such as retrospective debriefing, remain relevant though (Dickert et al. forthcoming), again suggesting a “bundled” requirement.
It is interesting that for public health interventions, whose impact on human health can exceed that of clinical interventions, usually little, if any, informed consent is mandated. Exposure to ads and “nudges” that promote populations’ health seems legitimate to most of us even when the authority executing the interventions discloses very little about these interventions, their risks, their alternatives, and any real opportunities to avert them. Changes to traffic regulations that affect accident rates on a grand scale are not thought to demand the consent of each individual citizen. Nor are such changes considered necessary when they are experimental (despite Richter et al. 2001)--health policy trials may require a very different approach to consent than clinical trials.
Differently put, even in the absence of public health emergencies (which can warrant transgressions like forcing individuals to enter quarantine), the widely accepted standard in public health seems more intrusive than the one in clinical care. As further illustration, many would agree that it is legitimate to implement smoke-free bar laws that somewhat increase anti-smoking stigma, partly in order to goad smokers to quit (and not only as measures to protect third parties from second-hand smoke). But most would condemn a clinician who deliberately boosts stigma to goad an individual patient to quit smoking (e.g. mocking the stink), and might explain that such pressure undermines the patient’s freedom to decide whether to quit. Is one of these arguably different approaches to informed consent right and the other one, wrong? Or is informed consent morally required for some interventions and not for others?
An emerging picture is that the need for informed consent depends on many variables. Just like being informed, the voluntariness of choices comes in degrees (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 101). Threats, for example, control us to different degrees, depending on the degree of harm being threatened (Beauchamp 2010, 70–1). The level of voluntariness necessary for valid consent to medical intervention may vary according to the type of intervention offered. So does the level of decision-making capacity necessary for valid consent (Buchanan and Brock 1989, ch. 1; Beauchamp 2010, 71). Robust informed consent that requires a great deal of information, voluntariness, and decisional capacity and is formalized and relatively non-waiveable, is necessary sometimes, but not always. Roughly speaking, robust informed consent (Joffe and Truog 2010, 358; Miller 2010, 391; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 101; Beauchamp 2010, 70–1) tends to be necessary the more risky the intervention, the more it is a high-impact (e.g. a definitive “critical life choice”: Archard 2008), the more it is value-laden and controversial, the more private the area of the body that the intervention directly affects, and the more conflicted and unsupervised the practitioner. On other occasions, the need for very robust informed consent, and indeed, for consent of any form, is lesser (Miller 2010, 393). On those occasions, high financial or other costs of robust consent procedures easily override that need.
Does the need for informed consent depend, among other variables, on whether the consent is for research or for care? Currently, consent procedures for research tend to be more demanding and more regulated than consent procedures for equally intrusive treatment (Levine 1988, 127–30; Miller 2010, 381). Why? A standard account is that the proper goal of research is to gather generalizable knowledge, and not to help the individual, and that this different goal enhances the need for protections like informed consent (Fried 1974). However, actual goals often differ from proper goals. In reality, many researchers are highly committed to promoting participants’ health, and many clinicians seek primarily financial gain, sometimes at patients’ expense. In addition, studies are reviewed independently for their safety, making some so safe that (with or without consent) they impose less risk than similar clinical care. Another rationale for the fewer consent requirements in care is that the relationship between the clinician and the patient is typically a fiduciary one whereas the relationship between the investigator and the study participant is scarcely fiduciary (Joffe and Truog 2010, 364). But this rationale could easily work the other way around: assuming that the fiduciary relationship is a ground for informed consent (Joffe and Truog 2010, 352ff.), the more fiduciary clinical relationship should demand more, not less, by way of informed consent.
Let us return to the general picture of scalar need for informed consent, which depends on many variables and generates different requirements on different occasions. It also raises interesting practical questions. First, who should decide when fully informed consent is necessary (Joffe and Truog 2010, 361)? Might a crude, one-size-fits-all requirement of informed consent serve most practical purposes (Wertheimer 2014)? Perhaps a fair compromise is to use an “intervention ladder” that defines broad categories of intervention as more or less intrusive, then specifies broad categories of circumstance that require especially robust consent in some cases and only minimal consent in others (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007, 41–3)? What seems, in any event, to emerge is that the need for informed consent would be misrepresented as fundamentally a single constraint or threshold. In this area, at least, commonsense morality acknowledges that prescriptions’ strengths and characters vary, with multiple determinants.
When informed consent is required, what kind of requirement does it represent? In particular, does it correlate to a natural right, to a legal right, or to something else?
Bioethicists and human rights lawyers tend to assume that informed consent is a natural right that generates a correlative objective moral duty and, downstream, legal and institutional duties. Many contemporary philosophers assume that consent has moral “magic” that turns what would have been a wrongful action into a right one, in an objective, moral sense (Hurd 1996). But some of the aforementioned justifications for informed consent better support other assumptions.
For example, the forward-looking trust rationale mentioned earlier can be understood to mean that, morally, we should enshrine and then honor legal (and cultural) informed consent requirements as a bulwark for trust in medical practitioners. On that view, violating informed consent requirements toward a patient does not necessarily violate that patient’s natural moral rights, only what are and morally should remain everyone’s legally protected interests.
In a further model, the uniform requirement of informed consent across circumstances reflects our sheer epistemological problem telling in advance the typical circumstances when it objectively applies from relative exceptions on which it does not (Wertheimer 2014, about the requirement in intervention research; see also Alexander 2014). In a still further model, the informed consent requirement only appears to apply homogeneously across circumstances in the eyes of agents who have cultivated, as morally they should, a fruitful yet false belief in the requirement’s objectively homogeneous application (Eyal 2015). In a final model, the justified legal standing of informed consent bolsters its moral standing (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 82–3).
One reason to take non-naturalistic approaches to the status of informed consent seriously is that not all natural rights are legally enforceable. Therefore, a moral informed consent right that is legally enforceable (as that right is usually taken to be in at least some institutional settings) may stand in need of additional moral justification, even if a natural right has been established. That additional, inescapable moral justification may then turn out to justify informed consent regulations even absent natural informed consent rights, say as trust-building measures. In particular, recall that many bioethicists ground informed consent in duties to treat rational, autonomous persons respectfully. Some such duties are clearly non-enforceable. For example, the moral duty not to lie to persons in breach of their autonomous decision-making is seldom legitimately enforceable. It is not the business of third parties to prevent me from disrespectfully and immorally lying to my friends. Thus, additional justification would be needed, beyond simple appeal to respect for autonomy, in order to establish an enforceable informed consent requirement. That inescapable additional moral justification may turn out, if successful, to justify informed consent regulations and the surrounding ethos in full. It may do so even if the project of grounding informed consent in autonomy, and all other attempts to justify natural informed consent rights, founder.
For decades, bioethicists have discussed medical informed consent in relative isolation from consent in political philosophy, contract theory, and sexual ethics, where notions of consent are also pivotal. This is finally changing, and it raises new technical and philosophical questions about how to put these different discourses in dialogue with each other. For instance, is what bioethicists call “presumed consent” the same thing as what political philosophers call “hypothetical consent”? Is what bioethicists call “proxy consent” one with what lawyers call “impersonal consent”? What bioethicists dub “invalid consent” would often be described by contract law experts as “lack of consent” (Beauchamp 2010, 56; Kleinig 2010, 13, 15).
This new development also raises substantive normative questions. For example, imagine that the same basic principle underlies legitimate political regimes and legitimate medical experimentation. It may follow that either tacit consent to a political regime, which Lockean contract theorists often cite, cannot successfully legitimize political regimes; or that tacit consent successfully legitimizes medical experimentation, rendering long consent forms unnecessary. Likewise, imagine that the same basic principle underlies the legitimate procurement of income and that of organs for transplantation. Then perhaps either income tax—without tax-payers’ consent—is illegitimate (Nozick 1986), or a “kidney tax” could be perfectly legitimate (Fabre 2008, chs. 4–5). Either way, existing practice in one of these domains would be misguided.
On a different approach, fundamentally different right-making principles and rationales regarding consent apply in domains like medicine, sex, and the marketplace, as might be indicated by the variety of approaches to consent between these domains. For example, in most commercial transactions, unlike in the medical sphere, there are no legal requirements to disclose all relevant information and to verify that it is understood (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 80; Joffe and Truog 2010, 351), perhaps indicating that fairness matters there more than autonomous decision-making. Likewise, whereas once we consent to sell a car or to support a political candidate (by signing a contract or casting a vote) our consent is not retractable, invasive medical intervention is usually considered illegitimate once a previously consenting patient or research participant expresses a change of mind—as though the point of consent in the medical arena were not simply autonomous authorization but ongoing control (compare Pateman 1990, 79 on the wrongness of forcing sexual interaction even within otherwise consensual marital relations). Finally, if A mishears B’s consent to sex as refusal yet proceeds with sexual advances, a third party who understands the full picture has strong reasons to stop A’s advances (pace Alexander 2014, 105). But if a physician mishears a patient’s consent to medically beneficial treatment as refusal yet proceeds to it, it is far less clear that a third party who understands the full picture should thwart the treatment. The point of medical care is, after all, not defeated by discordance of attitudes in quite the same way that the point of sex is. One possible conclusion from this variety is that the very point of requiring informed consent, and hence what is fundamentally required and when, vary between domains.
The turn of the 21st century has seen doubts surfacing about informed consent, but that just makes the resilience of other parts of the requirement all the more striking. Even purported critics usually revise only the requirement’s prevalent justifications and interpretations in borderline areas, and leave a certain “core” intact. Given how much philosophers usually disagree, it is remarkable that, when a medical intervention is risky, value-laden, high-impact, physically invasive, and/or medically controversial, especially when a patient of sound mind explicitly refuses the intervention, most of us would feel that only the most dire costs would justify imposition of care. The grudging nature of relative skeptics’ acceptance of this core part of the requirement only attests to its philosophical resilience.
In seeking justification for the requirement of informed consent, we may therefore not have one task, but many. We need to justify this powerful, relatively non-controversial core, as well as a weaker and more questionable rim. It is possible that the core stems directly from natural right, whereas the rim is merely instrumental or conventional. It is also possible that they both rely on the same ground, say, the value of autonomy, but touch on it in different measures. Even if the core of the requirement of informed consent commands high priority, other parts may turn out to be easily overridable by competing values, including the value of advancing scientific research.
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For excellent comments, thanks are due to Jennifer Hawkins, as well as Dan Brock, Tom Dougherty, Steve Joffe, Neil Manson, Emma Ryman, Robert Truog, David Wendler, Daniel Viehoff, Alan Wertheimer RIP, Dan Wikler, and my students. Work on the 2018 edition was supported by Wellcome 208766/Z/17/Z.