This article considers several questions concerning the philosophy of death.
First, it discusses what it is to be alive. This topic arises because to die is roughly to lose one’s life.
The second topic is the nature of death, and how it bears on the persistence of organisms and persons.
The third topic is the harm thesis, the claim that death can harm the individual who dies. Perhaps the most influential case against the harm thesis was made by Epicurus. His argument is discussed, as is a contemporary response, the deprivationist defense of the harm thesis.
The fourth topic is a question that seems to confront proponents of the harm thesis, especially those who offer some version of the deprivationist defense: if a person is harmed by her death, at what time does her death make her worse off than she otherwise would be? Some answers are considered.
Fifth is further issues that may lead us to doubt the harm thesis. One is a further question about deprivationism: we are not always harmed by what deprives us of things; what makes some of these worrisome and not others? Next is a question concerning the fact that there are two different directions in which our lives could be extended: into the past (our lives could have been longer if they began earlier), or into the future (they could have been longer if they ended later). Assuming the former does not matter to us, why should the latter?
The sixth topic concerns events that occur after a person has died: is it possible for these events to harm her?
Seventh is a controversy concerning whether extreme long life, even immortality, would be good for us. Of particular interest here is a dispute between Thomas Nagel, who says that death is an evil whenever it comes, and Bernard Williams, who argues that, while premature death is a misfortune, it is a good thing that we are not immortal, since we cannot continue to have our current characters and remain meaningfully attached to life forever.
A final controversy concerns whether or not the harmfulness of death can be reduced. It may be that, by adjusting our conception of our well-being, and by altering our attitudes, we can reduce or eliminate the threat death poses us. But there is a case to be made that such efforts backfire if taken to extremes.
- 1. Life
- 2. Death
- 3. Epicurus and the Harm Thesis
- 4. The Timing Puzzle
- 5. Further Reservations Concerning the Harm Thesis
- 6. Posthumous Harm
- 7. Never Dying
- 8. Can Death’s Harmfulness be Reduced?
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
To die is to cease to be alive. To clarify death further, then, we will need to say a bit about the nature of life.
Some theorists have said that life is a substance of some sort. A more plausible view is that life is a property of some sort, but we should also consider the possibility that lives are events. If we say that lives are events, we will want to know something about how to distinguish them from other events, and how they are related to the individuals that are alive. It would also be useful to know the persistence conditions for a life. If instead we conclude that life (or alive) is a property, we will want to clarify it, and identify what sorts of things bear it. Let us briefly discuss each of these views—that life is a substance, a property, or an event.
We can deal quickly with the view called ‘vitalism’ (defended by Hans Driesch, 1908 and 1914, among others), which holds that being alive consists in containing some special substance called ‘life.’ Vitalism is a nonstarter since it is unclear what sort of stuff vitalists take life to be, and because no likely candidates—no special stuff found in all and only in living things—have been detected. Moreover, vitalism faces a further difficulty, which Fred Feldman calls ‘the Jonah Problem’: a dead thing, such as a whale, may have a living thing, say Jonah, inside it; if Jonah has ‘life’ inside him, then so does the whale, but by hypothesis the whale is not alive. Of course, in this example Jonah is in the whale’s stomach, not in its cells, but the difficulty cannot be solved by saying that an object is alive if and only if it has ‘life’ in its cells, as an infectious agent (organisms with ‘life’ in them) could survive, for a time, within the dead cells of a dead whale.
As Jay Rosenberg noted (1983, p. 22, 103), sometimes when we speak of a life we mean to refer to the events that make up something’s history—the things that it did and the things that happened to it. (For example, the publication of The Problems of Philosophy was one of the events that made up one life, namely Bertrand Russell’s.) Yet a rock and a corpse have histories, and neither has a life. Presumably, then, ‘a life,’ in the sense we are discussing, refers to the history of something that is alive. In that case what we are really looking for is clarification of a property, not an event. We want clarification of what it is to be alive.
According to a second theorist, Peter van Inwagen, while a life is indeed an event, it is not the history of something. “‘Russell’s life,’” van Inwagen writes (1990, p. 83), “denotes a purely biological event, an event which took place entirely inside Russell’s skin and which went on for ninety-seven years.” Russell’s life included the oxygenation of his hemoglobin molecules but not the publication of his books.
If lives are biological events, it would be useful to know more about what they are, how they are individuated, and what their persistence conditions are. Van Inwagen declines to provide these details (1990, p. 145). He assumes that (the events he calls) lives are familiar enough to us that we can pick them out. But he does make the useful comment that each such event is constituted by certain self-organizing activities in which some molecules engage, and that it is analogous to a parade, which is an event constituted by certain marching-related activities of some people. Having taken the notion of a life for granted, he draws upon it in his account of organisms. On his view (1990, p. 90), some things compose an organism if and only if their activity constitutes a life.
Many theorists have defended the view that life, or (being) alive, is a property, but there is considerable disagreement among them about what precisely that property is. The main views on offer are life-functionalist accounts and accounts that analyze life in terms of DNA or genetic information or evolution by natural selection.
Life-functionalism, a view introduced by Aristotle, analyzes the property alive in terms of one or more salient functions that living things typically are able to perform. The salient functions Aristotle listed were nutrition, reproduction, sensation, autonomous motion, and thought. However, life-functionists disagree about how to formulate their account and about which functions are salient. Take Aristotle’s list. Obviously, it would be a mistake to say that something is alive if and only if it can perform all of the functions on the list. Might we say that, for something to be alive, it suffices that it be capable of one or more of the listed functions? Is being capable of one of these functions in particular necessary for something to be alive? As Fred Feldman points out, neither of the suggestions just mentioned is acceptable. Devices such as Roomba cleaning robots can do one of Aristotle’s functions, namely move themselves, but are not alive, so being able to do at least one listed function does not suffice for being alive. Nor is it plausible to say that any one on the list is necessary for being alive. Which on the list would this necessary function be? Perhaps nutrition? Adult silk moths are alive but lack a digestive system, so are incapable of nutrition. And, as many theorists have noticed, many living things cannot reproduce; examples include organisms whose reproductive organs are damaged and hybrid animals such as mules.
What, now, about accounts that analyze life in terms of genetic information? Feldman thinks that something like the Jonah problem arises for any account according which being alive consists in containing DNA or other genetic information, as dead organisms contain DNA. A further problem for such views is that it is conceivable there are or could be life forms (say on other planets) that are not based on genetic information. This latter difficulty can be avoided if we say that being alive consists in having the ability to evolve, to engage in Darwinian evolution, assuming that evolution by natural selection is possible for living things that lack nucleic acid. We might adopt NASA’s definition, according to which life is “a self-sustaining chemical system capable of Darwinian evolution.” However, accounts like NASA’s are implausible for a further reason: while the ability to evolve by natural selection is something that collections of organisms—species—may or may not have, it is not a feature an individual organism may have. Later members of a species come to have features earlier members lacked; some of these new features may make survival more or less likely, and the less ‘fit’ are weeded out of existence. An individual organism, such as a particular dog, cannot undergo this process. Yet individuals may be alive.
Because he has encountered no successful account of life, no account exempt from counterexamples, Feldman concludes that “life is a mystery” (p. 55). Despite his skepticism, however, there is a good case to be made for saying that what distinguishes objects that are alive from objects that are not is that the latter have a distinctive sort of control over what composes them, which the former lack. Let us see if we can make this claim clearer.
Consider ordinary composite material objects that are not alive. We can assume that, at a given time, these are made up of, or composed of, more simple things, such as molecules, by virtue of the fact that the latter meet various conditions. Among the conditions is the requirement that (in some sense in need of clarification) they be bonded together. Take the boulder near my front porch. Among the things that compose it now will be a few molecules, say four molecules near the center of the boulder, that are bonded together, in that each is bonded to the others, directly or indirectly (a molecule, A, is indirectly bonded to another molecule, B, if A is directly bonded to a molecule C that is directly bonded to B, or if A is bonded to a molecule that is indirectly bonded to B). The things that make up the boulder are not limited to these four molecules, but they are limited to molecules that are bonded to them. Nor is the boulder unique in this way; something similar seems true of any composite material object. A composite material object is composed of some things at a time only if those things are bonded together at that time.
What sort of bonding relationship holds among the things that compose material objects? Any answer to this question will be controversial. Let us set it aside, and move on to some further assumptions about the composition of nonliving composite material objects, namely that a great many of them persist for a while (some persist for a very long time) and that what composes them at one time normally differs from what composes them at other times. Exactly how this works is a complicated matter, but among the conditions that such objects must meet if they are to persist is that any change in their composition be incremental. (Even this condition is controversial. For more on material objects, see the article Material Constitution and Ordinary objects.) Consider the boulder again. Suppose that at one time, t0, it is composed of some molecules, and that all or most of these molecules remain bonded to each other until a later time t1. Suppose, too, that no or few (few as compared to the number of molecules that composed the boulder at t0) molecules come to be newly bonded to these by the time that t1 rolls around. Under these conditions the boulder undergoes an incremental change in composition, and it seems plausible to say that the boulder remains in existence over the interval t0–t1, and, at t1, is composed of the molecules that remain bonded together with the molecules that are newly attached to them. Presumably, it will also survive a series of such incremental changes in composition. But it will not survive drastic and sudden changes. It would stop existing, for example, if the molecules that compose it were suddenly dispersed.
Enough said about composite material objects that are not alive. Now let us see if we can shed some light on what makes living objects special. What is it that distinguishes an object that is alive from an object that is not?
The answer seems to be that, normally, a live object has a distinctive sort of control over whether things come to be, or cease to be, part of it. The control in question is made possible by activities its constituents themselves are capable of. Contrast objects that are not alive, say automobiles. What an ordinary car is composed of is settled for the car by the mechanics who repair it (detaching some parts and affixing others), by whether it is involved in an accident and loses some parts, and so forth. Imagine a car that is not passive in this way. Imagine that its parts were somehow capable of replacing some of themselves with fresh parts, without assistance from outside, so that the activities of the parts that compose the car today were responsible for its being composed of certain parts tomorrow. That would make it quite lifelike.
Let us describe, in a bit more detail, what the molecules that compose living objects can do:
- Working together, these molecules can engage in activities that are integrated in conformity with (under the control of) the information that some of them carry (information that is comparable to blueprints and instructions), much as soldiers that make up an army can engage in activities that are integrated in conformity with battle plans and instructions issued by the commanding officers that are among them.
- Deploying these activities, the molecules can self-modify, in the sense that they can bond new (perhaps recently ingested) molecules to themselves, or prune (and excrete) some away, combining themselves in various ways (e.g., constructing cells), thereby giving way to a slightly different assembly of molecules at a later time, and fueling their activities by drawing upon external energy sources or stored reserves.
- The molecules can also pass along their ability to self-modify, enabling the molecules to which they give way to continue these activities, thus allowing the object they compose to sustain a given form (or forms) over time (say that of a dog) despite the fact that what composes that object at one time differs from what composes it at another time.
The view on offer—we might call it the compositional account of life—is that an object is composed of things that are capable of the activities just described if and only if it is alive.
This account of life needs refinement, but it avoids at least most of the worries mentioned earlier. It implies that an object may be alive even though it is sterile (as in the case of mules), even though it survives on stored energy (as in the case of a silk moth), and conceivably even if it lacks nucleic acid (yet is still composed of things that engage in activities integrated in conformity with information they carry). In fact, it implies that being capable of none of the items on Aristotle’s list is necessary nor sufficient for being alive. What is more, the compositional account just sketched implies that being alive is a property an individual, say the last remaining dodo, may bear on its own, which suggests that it may be alive without being capable of Darwinian evolution. At the same time, it explains how collections of live individuals may evolve. Individual objects are alive only if their composition is under the control of some of their parts (e.g., nucleic acid molecules) that carry information. The mechanisms by which such information is carried tend to be modified over time, altering the information they carry, and thus the features of the organisms they help shape, introducing mutations that may or may not facilitate survival. (For more on the nature of life, see Bedau 2014 and the entry on Life.)
The previous section discussed the nature of life, thereby clarifying what it is that death ends. This section discusses the nature of death and how death is related to the persistence of organisms and persons. (For an excellent discussion of views of death outside of the analytic tradition, see Schumacher 2010.)
According to the compositional account of life discussed in the previous section, objects that are alive have a distinctive capacity to control what they are composed of, fixing these constituents together in various ways, by virtue of the fact that their constituents can engage in various self-modifying activities that are integrated in conformity with information they carry. Let us call these vital activities.
It is one thing to have the capacity to engage in vital activities and another actually to engage in them, just as there is a difference between having the ability to run and actually running. Being alive seems to involve the former. It consists in having the relevant capacity. To die is to lose this capacity. We can call this the loss of life account of death.
The event by which the capacity to engage in vital activities is lost is one thing, and the state of affairs of its having been lost it is another. ‘Death’ can refer to either. However, the capacity to engage in vital activities may be lost gradually, rather than all at once, so it is reasonable to speak of a process of dying. In some cases that process is especially complicated, because the self-modifying activities of some organisms result in the construction of complex physiological systems that must remain largely intact for the self-modifying activities of these organisms to remain integrated. In defining death, some theorists focus on these systems, and claim that an organism’s life ends when that organism’s physiological systems can no longer function as an integrated whole, or when this loss becomes irreversible (Christopher Belshaw 2009; David DeGrazia 2014).
The loss of life account of death has been challenged by theorists who claim that things whose vital activities are suspended are not alive (Feldman 1992, Christopher Belsaw 2009, Cody Gilmore 2013, and David DeGrazia 2014). When zygotes and embryos are frozen for later use in the in vitro fertilization procedure, their vital activities are brought to a stop, or very nearly so. The same goes for water bears that are dehydrated, and for seeds and spores. It seems clear that the zygotes and water bears are not dead, since their vital activities can easily be restarted—by warming the zygote or by wetting the water bear. They are not dead, but are they alive? If we deny that they are alive, presumably we would do so on the grounds that their vital activities are halted. If something’s life can be ended by suspending its vital activities without its dying, then we must reject the loss of life account of death.
However, the loss of life account is thoroughly established in ordinary usage, and is easily reconciled with the possibility of suspended vitality. In denying that frozen embryos are dead, it is clear that we mean to emphasize that they have not lost the capacity to deploy their vital activities. When we say that something is dead, we mean to emphasize that this capacity has been lost. Having used ‘dead’ to signal this loss, why would we want to use the word ‘alive’ to signal the fact that something is making active use of its vital activities? Our best option is to use a pair of contrasting terms. We can use ‘viable’ to indicate that something has the capacity to deploy vital activities and ‘unviable’ to indicate that it has lost this capacity. When instead we are concerned about whether or not something is engaging its vital activities, we can use different contrasting terms, say ‘vital’ and ‘nonvital’, the former to characterize something that is employing its capacity for vital activities and the latter to characterize something that is not making use of its capacity for vital activities. What seems relatively uncontroversial is that being dead consists in unviability. To retain the loss of life account, we have only to add that being alive consists in viability. We can then say that a frozen embryo is viable and hence alive despite its lack of vitality, and it will die if its life ends (it will die if it ceases to be viable). Of course, if we are willing to abandon the loss of life account, we could instead use ‘alive’ to characterize something that is both viable and vital. We would then say that a frozen embryo is not alive (since it lacks vitality) but also that it is not dead (since it remains viable).
People often speak of being dead as a ‘state’ or ‘condition’ as opposed to an event or process. They say an organism comes to be in this state once it dies. This way of speaking can be puzzling on the assumption that what dies ceases to exist. (This assumption is discussed below.) If the assumption is true, then an organism that dies stops existing but simultaneously comes to be in the state of death. Mustn’t something exist at a time if it is (literally) in some state at that time? But of course it would be absurd to deny that something can truly be dead on the grounds that death is a state and what does not exist at a time cannot be in any state at that time.
Why not solve the problem by saying that upon dying an organism leaves a corpse, and it is the corpse that is in the state of being dead? There are several problems with this suggestion. Some organisms do not leave corpses. What corpses are left eventually disintegrate. Whether an organism leaves a corpse or not, and whether its corpse exists or not, if that organism dies at time t and does not regain life then it is dead after t.
The difficulty can be avoided if we say, with Jay Rosenberg 1983, p. 42), that dead is a relation between an organism, the time it died, and a subsequent time, and that when someone asserts, at some given time t, ‘Socrates is dead,’ what is asserted (ignoring the possibility of restored life, discussed in the next section) is roughly that Socrates died before t.
As is mentioned below, some theorists deny that an object that is at one time an organism may continue its existence as a corpse. Such theorists will say that organisms and their corpses are two different objects. They may conclude that ‘dead’ is ambiguous—that it means one thing as applied to organisms, and another thing as attributed to the corpses organisms leave. In any case, they will need to deny that, as concerns corpses, being dead implies having died, as corpses are never alive, according to them. If, on the other hand, an object that is an organism may continue its existence as a corpse, then, at any time t after that object dies, ‘dead’ applies univocally to it at time t, and means roughly died before t.
It will be useful to sharpen the loss of life account if, as seems conceivable, it is possible to restore life to something that has died.
Restoration in this sense is quite different from the revival of something, such as a frozen embryo, whose vital activities have been halted. Something can be revived only if it is alive—only if it has the capacity to deploy vital activities, as in the case of a frozen zygote. It is revived when it regains vitality. Something’s life can be restored only if it has lost its capacity for vital activities. Life is restored when this capacity is regained.
To bring the possibility of restoration into view, imagine a futuristic device, the Disassembler-Reassembler, that chops me into small cubes, or individual cells, or disconnected atoms, which it stores and later reassembles just as they were before. It is far from obvious that I would survive—and that my life would continue—after Reassembly. (Assuming that I am a material object, the account of objects sketched in Section 1.3 implies that chopping me into bits ends my existence forever.) But even if my existence would pick up again after Reassembly occurs, it is quite clear that I would not live during intervals when my atoms are stacked in storage. I would not even exist during such intervals. If I can be Reassembled, my life would be restored, not revived. Restoration, not revival, is a way of bringing a creature back from the dead.
Now imagine a Corpse Reanimator, a device that moves molecules back to where they were prior to the death of the creature that left the corpse, and restarts its vital activities. Some theorists say that I continue my existence as a corpse if it remains in good shape; they will assume that I remain in existence after losing my life, and continue my existence after the Corpse Reanimator does its work. On their view the Corpse Reanimator restores my life--it gives me back the capacity to engage in vital activities.
Given the possibilities of restoration and revivification, it seems best to refine the loss of life account, as follows:
Dying is the loss of an object’s life—the loss of its capacity to perpetuate itself using vital activities. An object dies at the time it loses this capacity. It is dead at all times afterwards, except while that capacity is regained.
Death for you and me is constituted by the loss of our capacity to sustain ourselves using vital activities. This characterization of death could be sharpened if we had a clearer idea of what we are, and its implications concerning our persistence. After all, we cannot retain any capacities if we fail to persist, so if we fail to persist we stop being capable of vital activities. We die. However, what we are, and what is involved in our persistence, is a matter of controversy.
There are three main views: animalism, which says that we are human animals (Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997, 2007); personism, which says that we are creatures with the capacity for self-awareness; and mindism, which says that we are minds (which may or may not have the capacity for self-awareness) (McMahan 2002). Animalists typically say that we persist over time just in case we remain the same animal; mindist typically suggest that our persistence requires our remaining the same mind. Personism is usually paired with the view that our persistence is determined by our psychological features and the relations among them (Locke 1689, Parfit 1984). (For more on what we are, see the entry on Personal Identity.)
If we are animals, with the persistence conditions of animals, we die when we cease to be the same animal. If we are minds, with the persistence conditions for minds, we die when we cease to meet these conditions. And if persistence is determined by our retaining certain psychological features, then the loss of those features will constitute death.
These three ways of understanding death have very different implications. Severe dementia can destroy a great many psychological features without destroying the mind, which suggests that death as understood by personists can occur even though death as understood by mindists has not. Moreover, human animals sometimes survive the destruction of the mind, as when the cerebrum dies but the brainstem does not, leaving an individual in a persistent vegetative state. Many theorists also think that the mind could survive the extinction of the human animal, say when the brain is removed from the body, kept alive artificially, and the remainder of the body is destroyed (assuming that a bare brain is not a human animal). These possibilities suggest that death as understood by mindists can occur even though death as understood by animalists has not (and also that the latter sort of death need not be accompanied by the former.)
What is the relationship between existence and death? May people and other creatures continue to exist after dying, or cease to exist without dying?
Take the first question: may you and I and other creatures continue to exist for some time after our lives end? Fred Feldman (1992, p. 91) coins the term termination thesis to refer to the view that “when a person dies, he or she … goes out of existence; subsequently, there is no such thing as that person.” (A version of the thesis applies to any living thing.) We can call those who accept the termination thesis terminators, and those who deny it anti-terminators. One point anti-terminators such as Feldman (1992, 2000, 2013) cite is that people who encounter corpses sometimes call them dead animals, or dead people. Such talk may suggest that we believe that animals continue to exist, as animals, while no longer alive. The idea might be that an animal continues to count as the same animal if enough of its original components remain in much the same order, and animals continue to meet this condition for a time following death (Mackie 1997). On this view, if you and I are animals (as animalists say), then we could survive for a time after we are dead, albeit as corpses. In fact, we could survive indefinitely, by arranging to have our corpses preserved.
However, this way of defending the anti-terminators’s view may not be decisive. The terms ‘dead animal’ and ‘dead person’ seem ambiguous. Normally, when we use ‘dead people’ or ‘dead animal’ we mean to speak of persons or animals who lived in the past. One dead person I can name is Socrates; he is now a ‘dead person’ even though his corpse surely has ceased to exist. However, in certain contexts, such as when we are standing inside morgues, we seem to use the terms ‘dead animal’ and ‘dead person’ to mean “remains of something that was an animal” or “remains of something that was a person.” On this interpretation, even in morgues calling something a dead person does not imply that it is a person.
Still, the dispute between terminators and anti-terminators is unlikely to be settled on the basis of how we use terms such as ‘dead animal’ and ‘dead person.’ Metaphysical considerations must weigh in. For example, consider that the remarks made in Section 1.3 about the persistence of objects are consistent with the possibility that objects that are people may continue their existence as corpses, which may be useful to anti-terminators. On the other hand, many theorists think that nothing is a person unless it has various psychological features, which corpses lack, and some think that nothing is an organism unless it is alive. Terminators may be able to exploit these thoughts.
What about the second question: can creatures cease to exist without dying? Certainly things that never were alive, such as bubbles and statues, can be deathlessly annihilated. Arguably, there are also ways that living creatures can be deathlessly annihilated (Rosenberg 1983, Feldman 1992, Gilmore 2013). Perhaps an amoeba’s existence ends when it splits, replacing itself with two amoebas, and the existence of chlamydomonas ends when pairs of them fuse to form a zygote. Yet when amoebas split, and chlamydomonas fuse, vital activities do not cease. If people could divide like amoebas, perhaps they, too could cease to exist without dying. (For a famous discussion of division, fusion, and their implications, see Parfit 1981.) If such ‘deathless exits’ are possible, we would have to modify the loss of life account of death.
However, proponents of the loss of life account can hold their ground. They can say that division, fusion, and other apparent examples of deathless exits are unusual ways of dying, because, in such cases, nonexistence is not brought about via the destruction of vital activities, but they are not ways of escaping death altogether. Proponents of the loss of life account might also turn the tables on its critics, and argue as follows: nothing can be alive unless it exists, so if something ceases to exist it ceases to be alive, but to cease to be alive is to die. So there are no deathless exits.
Defining death is one thing; providing criteria by which it can be readily detected or verified is another. A definition is an account of what death is; when, and only when its definition is met, death has necessarily occurred. A criterion for death, by contrast, lays out conditions by which all and only actual deaths may be readily identified. In some cases criteria for death are intended to capture conditions by which the actual deaths of human persons may be identified. Such a criterion falls short of a definition, but plays a practical role. For example, criteria for the death of a person would help physicians and jurists determine when death has occurred.
In the United States, the states have adopted criteria for the death of a person modeled on the Uniform Determination of Death Act (developed by the President’s Commission, 1981), which says that “an individual who has sustained either (1) irreversible cessation of circulatory and respiratory functions, or (2) irreversible cessation of all functions of the entire brain, including the brain stem, is dead. A determination of death must be made in accordance with accepted medical standards.” In the United Kingdom, the accepted criterion is brain stem death, or the “permanent functional death of the brain stem” (Pallis 1982).
These current criteria are subject to criticism, even if we put aside reservations concerning the qualifier ‘irreversible’. Animalists might resist the criteria since the vital activities of human beings whose entire brains have ceased to function can be sustained artificially using cardiopulmonary assistance. Mindists and personists might also resist the criteria, on the grounds that minds and all psychological features can be destroyed in human beings whose brain stems are intact. For example, cerebral death can leave its victim with an intact brain stem, yet mindless and devoid of self-awareness. (For more on criteria for death, see the article on the Definition of Death.)
Is death bad for some people who die? Is it good for some of them?
According to the harm thesis, death is, at least sometimes, bad for those who die, and in this sense something that ‘harms’ them. It is important to know what to make of this thesis, since our response itself can be harmful. This might happen as follows: suppose that we love life, and reason that since it is good, more would be better. Our thoughts then turn to death, and we decide it is bad: the better life is, we think, the better more life would be, and the worse death is. At this point, we are in danger of condemning the human condition, which embraces life and death, on the grounds that it has a tragic side, namely death. It will help some if we remind ourselves that our situation also has a good side. Indeed, our condemnation of death is here based on the assumption that more life would be good. But such consolations are not for everyone. (They are unavailable if we crave immortality on the basis of demanding standards by which the only worthwhile projects are endless in duration, for then we will condemn the condition of mere mortals as tragic through and through, and may, as Unamuno (1913) points out, end up suicidal, fearing that the only life available is not worth having.) And a favorable assessment of life may be a limited consolation, since it leaves open the possibility that, viewing the human condition as a whole, the bad cancels much of the good. In any case it is grim enough to conclude that, given the harm thesis, the human condition has a tragic side.
It is no wonder that theorists over the millennia have sought to defeat the harm thesis. Let us consider some challenges to the harm thesis, beginning with the case against it developed by the ancient Greek philosopher Epicurus.
Epicurus (341–270) adopted a version of hedonism according to which pleasure (or pleasant experiences) is the only thing that is intrinsically good for us (that is, the only thing that is good for us in itself), while pain (or painful experiences) is the only thing that is intrinsically bad for us, bad in itself. Call this view intrinsic hedonism. (For a discussion of intrinsic value, see the entry on Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Value.) Epicurus’s commitment to intrinsic hedonism prompted him to say, in his Letter to Menoeceus, that “everything good and bad lies in sensation.” He also claimed, in that same letter, that “when we are, death is not, and when death is present, then we are not.” The death of a person, and that person’s existence, do not overlap in time. On the basis of this assumption about death and existence, he concluded that a person’s death does not cause her to have any experiences (sensations)—indeed, “death is to be deprived of sensation.” In the following passage, he uses these thoughts against the harm thesis:
Make yourself familiar with the belief that death is nothing to us, since everything good and bad lies in sensation, and death is to be deprived of sensation. … So that most fearful of all bad things, death, is nothing to us, since when we are, death is not, and when death is present, then we are not.
Much about Epicurus’s argument is unclear, so let us work through it more carefully and see if we can fill in some details that he did not supply. Some speculation will be necessary, but we can develop a reconstruction that aligns with the things he wrote.
Earlier we mentioned one of the views Epicurus accepted, which we can state as follows:
- Intrinsic hedonism is true: a person’s experiences (sensations) of pleasure (or her pleasant experiences) are the only things that are intrinsically good for her, the only things that are good for her in themselves, while her experiences of pain (or painful experiences) are the only things that are intrinsically bad for her, bad in themselves.
From this view it follows that
- something is intrinsically good or bad for a person only if it is an experience.
Now, regardless of whether a person experiences her death, that death is not itself an experience. (Compare: I may experience jogging down the street, and I may experience the cup that is in front of me, but neither jogging nor the cup is itself an experience. My experiences are, so to speak, in my mind. Cups are not.) Let us add this observation to the argument:
- A person’s death is not an experience.
And if a person’s death is not an experience at all, clearly it is not an experience that is intrinsically good or bad for her. So, from 1–3, it follows that
- a person’s death is not intrinsically good or bad for her.
However, something that is not intrinsically bad for a person might nevertheless make other things happen that are detrimental to her, in which case it may be extrinsically bad for her. Seeing somebody fall and break her arm is not intrinsically bad for a person, but it might well cause her painful sadness, which makes the accident she saw extrinsically bad for her. Similarly, something that is not intrinsically good for a person might be extrinsically good for her.
Epicurus recognized the possibility of extrinsic goodness. It is not entirely clear how he understood it, but he seemed to accept a view we can call extrinsic instrumentalism: something is extrinsically good or bad for a person only if it makes her have things (other than itself) that are intrinsically good or bad for her. Let us add this to the argument:
- extrinsic instrumentalism is true: something is extrinsically good or bad for a person only if it makes her have things that are intrinsically good or bad for her.
Armed with this assumption, Epicurus can reject the possibility that a person’s death is extrinsically bad for her, arguing as follows. Because Epicurus thought that the death of a person and that person’s existence do not overlap in time, he thought that
- a person’s death does not make her have any experiences.
From premises 2, 5 and 6 it follows that
- a person’s death is not extrinsically good or bad for her.
To complete the argument against the harm thesis, Epicurus would need an additional assumption, such as this:
- something is good or bad for a person only if it is either intrinsically or extrinsically good or bad for her.
Premises 4, 7 and 8 entail that the harm thesis is false:
- a person’s death is not good or bad for her.
Is this Epicurean argument convincing? Let us see if we can find weak spots. We can begin with a reservation concerning the term ‘death.’
Earlier we noted that ‘death’ might be used for dying, the event or process of losing life, or being dead, the property of having lost life. The first reservation about the argument is that it is strongest if its uses of ‘death’ refer to being dead, and not to (the event or process of) dying. Here is why.
Being dead is not an experience, and it does not make a person have any experiences. So (on Epicurus’s assumptions) it is neither intrinsically nor extrinsically bad for a person to be dead. However, a person may experience dying, and the experience of dying (the experiences dying causes her to have) might well be intrinsically bad for her, even if only painful experiences are intrinsically bad for her (as premise 1 says). So even if being dead is not extrinsically bad for a person, the question arises as to whether, for some people, it is extrinsically bad to die. If something makes a person have painful experiences, isn’t it extrinsically bad for her, other things being equal? At least this much is true: the Epicurean argument does not show that dying painfully is not extrinsically bad for a person.
Apparently, then, the argument does not demonstrate that neither being dead nor dying is ever bad for those who die. Nevertheless, unless we find further weaknesses in it, it still seems to support powerful conclusions: being dead is neither good nor bad for those who die, and dying is extrinsically good or bad for them only if and insofar as it causes them to have painful (pleasant) experiences. Dying is wholly a matter of indifference for those who do not experience it, say because they sleep through it.
But there are further reservations to consider. Intrinsic hedonism is questionable. So is extrinsic instrumentalism.
Consider the first of these. Which things are intrinsically good or bad for us is a controversial matter , but many theorists deny that the list is limited to pleasure and pain. (For further discussion, see the entry on Intrinsic Goodness, the entry on Preferences, and “What Makes Someone's Life Go Best,” Parfit 1984, pp. 493–502.) Adding more things to the list can undermine the Epicurean argument.
For example, we might adopt some version of preferentialism, or the desire fulfillment account, which is the view that it is intrinsically good for us to fulfill one of our desires (assuming that the desire meets various conditions; exactly what these are is controversial—let us put the matter aside), and it is intrinsically bad for us to have a desire that comes to be thwarted. Now, many of my desires may be fulfilled, and many may be thwarted, without my noticing—desire fulfillment need have not experiential upshot. If I want my child to be happy, and she is, my desire is fulfilled, even if she has travelled away so far from me that I cannot interact with her, now or ever again. So preferentialism blocks the Epicurean’s move from premise 1 to 2.
Preferentialism also blocks the move to 7. Epicureans cannot use extrinsic instrumentalism to deny that a person’s death is extrinsically good or bad for her if the things that are intrinsically good or bad for her are not limited to experiences. Preferentialism implies that things may be extrinsically bad for us by virtue of thwarting our desires, regardless of whether this has any experiential upshot. Suppose, for example, that I desire that my child have a happy upbringing, and, for various reasons, it turns out that I am the only one who can make this happen, but I die suddenly, and as a consequence she has a miserable childhood. Arguably, my untimely death would be bad for me, in that it would thwart my desire, even if I die in my sleep, and am never aware of her fate. (The role a person’s experience plays in her being harmed is discussed by several theorists, including Rosenbaum 1986, Nussbaum 2013, Silverstein 2013, and Fischer 2014.)
Now consider some worries about extrinsic instrumentalism, which says that something is extrinsically good or bad for us only if it causes us to have things that are intrinsically good or bad for us. This view overlooks something that Thomas Nagel (1970) noted in his seminal essay “Death,” namely the fact that things may be extrinsically good or bad for us, other things being equal, by virtue of causing us not to have—by virtue of precluding our having—things that are intrinsically good or bad for us. Consider that being rendered unconscious prior to surgery is extrinsically good for a patient who otherwise would endure great suffering when the physicians apply the knife, in that it keeps him from suffering, and not because it causes him to accrue pleasure or some other good. Of course, after waking, the patient might also accrue pleasure or some other good as an indirect result of having been sedated, but in view of the suffering that it averts, being sedated is extrinsically good for him whether he receives that indirect bonus or not. As well, being made unconscious might be extrinsically bad for a person, say when it precedes, not surgery, but rather some joyous occasion he will miss because he is not conscious while it occurs. It is extrinsically bad for him, in this case, because it prevents him from taking joy in the occasion he misses. This remains true whether or not he also accrues some pain or other intrinsic evil as an indirect result of being sedated.
If it is indeed the case that things may be extrinsically good (bad) for us, other things being equal, by virtue of precluding our having evils (goods), we will want to allow for this fact in settling on an adequate understanding of what makes things good or bad for us. Next let us consider how this might be done, and the implications for the harm thesis.
To argue that death may be bad for those who die (even if they do not experience dying), theorists typically draw upon some version of the comparativist view that we are harmed by what makes our lives as wholes worse than they otherwise would be, and benefitted by what makes our lives as wholes better than they otherwise would be (early proponents of this view include Nagel 1970, Quinn 1984, and Feldman 1991). Applying comparativism, we may claim that, in at least some cases, dying at a time makes our lives as wholes worse than they would have been had we not died when we did, roughly because, by cutting our lives short, it deprives us of good life. This suggestion about death needs further development, but first let us explain the comparativist view more clearly.
Note that how well off you are at one time is likely to differ from how well off you are at another time. Your welfare level rises and falls over time. (For a discussion of welfare, see the article on Well-Being.) What determines how well off you are at a time, or during an interval of time, are the things you then accrue that are intrinsically good for you, goods such as pleasure, together with the things you then accrue that are intrinsically bad for you, evils such as pain (using the term ‘evil’ as a synonym for ‘bad’). Accruing the former at a time boosts your welfare level during that time, other things being equal, while accruing the latter lowers your welfare level during that time. Your welfare level during an interval of time will be positive if the goods you then accrue outweigh the evils. It will be 0—neither positive nor negative—if and only if you are capable of accruing goods or evils (unlike, say, a shoe, which is incapable of faring well or ill) but the goods you accrue are exactly offset by the evils and vice versa. The welfare level resulting from the goods and evils you accrue over the course of your life we may call your lifetime welfare level.
Using the notion of a lifetime welfare level, let us formulate an account of what it is for something to be extrinsically good or bad for us. Let us say that something is extrinsically good (bad) for us if and only if, and to the extent that, it is overall good (bad) for us simpliciter, where:
an event is overall good (bad) for us simpliciter if and only if, and to the extent that, it makes our lifetime welfare level higher (lower) than it otherwise would be.
(Why add the term ‘simpliciter’? Read on.) By way of illustration, consider a typical case in which you receive treatment by a dentist. Let us assume that, on this particular occasion, the dentist fills a cavity in one of your teeth, and that, had you not received this treatment, your tooth would have decayed, painfully, for months, until finally you would have sought out proper treatment. So the salient difference between your lifetime welfare level in the situation in which you are treated right away, on one hand, and the lifetime welfare level you would have in the case that you were not treated until much later, on the other, is that, in the latter situation, that level is significantly lower, due to the pain you would incur. Hence, on these assumptions, receiving treatment was overall good for you: the greater that pain would have been, the better for you it was that you were treated.
Note that things that are overall good for you may be a mixed bag—they may bring some pain or other intrinsic evils in their wakes, as well as some intrinsic goods, and the mix may differ from time to time. In some cases, what is overall good for you simpliciter is overall bad for you in a temporally relative sense—overall bad for you during some period of time. And although it is overall bad for you during one period of time, it might be overall good for you during some other period of time. Let us elaborate upon this point briefly. Comparativists can say that:
an event is overall good (bad) for us at some time t if and only if, and to the extent that, it makes our lifetime welfare level higher (lower) at t than it otherwise would be.
Suppose, for example, that, while your tooth’s cavity is being filled, the dentist’s drill causes you pain, and that this is pain you would not have had if you had not sought treatment, and instead watched TV. In that case, your visit to the dentist is overall bad for you during the time your tooth is being repaired. Yet, as emerged earlier, your visit to the dentist is overall good for you simpliciter, insofar as it enables you to reduce the episodes of toothache you would suffer over the course of your life.
Comparativists can accept intrinsic hedonism, but need not. They could, for example, pair comparativism with some version of the preferentialist view (mentioned earlier) that getting what we want—fulfilling one of our desires—is intrinsically good for us, and having our desires thwarted is intrinsically bad for us. Comparativism is neutral on the issue of what counts as the intrinsic goods and evils. Theorists who conclude that things other than pleasure are intrinsically good for us will want to weigh them in when they assess an individual’s welfare level. For example, preferentialists can say that even if accruing pleasure boosts a person’s welfare level so does desire fulfillment.
According to comparativism, a person’s death, whether painful or not, may well be overall bad for her (and hence extrinsically bad for her). To decide whether a person’s death is overall bad for her simpliciter (usually we can drop ‘simpliciter’ without creating confusion) we compare her actual lifetime welfare level to the lifetime welfare level she would have had if she had not died. Suppose, for example, that Hilda died (painlessly) on December 1, 2008 at age 25 and that, had she not died, she would have gone on to prosper for 25 years—her welfare level during that time would have been high—then suffer during her final five years. Her overall welfare level over her final 30 years would have been high, despite the downturn during the last five. Hence her lifetime welfare level had she not died at age 25 is significantly higher than her lifetime welfare level would be upon dying at 25. The former is boosted by the many goods she accrues during her final 30 years, and these goods are absent from her lifetime welfare level as it would be were her life ended at age 25. Hence dying at 25 is overall bad for her.
Importantly, dying at a time is not overall bad for everyone who dies. In fact, it will be overall good in many cases. Imagine that, had she not died at age 25, Hilda would have fared badly for 25 years—her welfare level during that time would have been low. We might also suppose that, during her last five years her welfare level would have been positive. Despite this last stipulation concerning her final five years, her lifetime welfare level had she not died at 25 is significantly lower than her lifetime welfare level would be if she did die at 25, so, on our new assumptions, dying at 25 is overall good for her.
According to comparativism, when a death is bad for us despite not making us accrue intrinsic evils such as pain, it is bad for us because it precludes our coming to have various intrinsic goods which we would have had if we had not died. We might say that death is bad for us because of the goods it deprives us of, and not, or at least not always, because of any intrinsic evils for which it is responsible. This stance is sometimes called deprivationism, and its proponents deprivationists.
As promising as it is, however, there may be grounds for doubting that comparativists can give the harm thesis a deprivationist defense. Let us discuss one such doubt next.
If we cannot identify a time when something makes us worse off than we otherwise would be, we might well doubt that it really was bad for us. We might go so far as to say that what never makes us worse (better) off than we otherwise would be is not bad (good) for us. Call this the Epicurean presumption. Given this presumption, proponents of the harm thesis need an answer to the timing question, which asks: if death is bad for us, at what time (or times) does it make us worse off than we otherwise would have been? In some cases in which things are bad for us, it seems rather easy to identify times when we are made worse off, but in other cases, especially in some cases involving death, it seems more difficult, which may make us worry about the deprivationist defense of the harm thesis. All this needs elaboration.
If having something is intrinsically bad for us, it is bad for us—because it is intrinsically bad for us—while we have it. Moreover, if something is overall bad for us wholly by virtue of making us have things that are intrinsically bad for us, we can say that it makes us worse off while we have those evils. For example, coming to be infected with a flu virus is overall bad for us, and the time it makes us worse off is not when we come to be infected, but rather while we are sick, while we suffer. (If we came to be infected with a virus, and our immune system dealt with it, preventing our becoming sick, the infection would not be bad for us.) This line of thought suggests that a painful death makes us worse off while we die, or rather while dying is painful for us. What about a painless death? Might it also be bad for us? (If so, when are we made worse off?) Perhaps; more on that in a bit.
We can use the term concurrentism for the view that a bad death makes us worse off while we die.
If we reject intrinsic hedonism, we might conclude that death can make us worse off not just while we die but at other times as well. If we adopt some form of preferentialism, we can take the view that things may make us worse off at the time one of our desires is thwarted. Suppose that, as George Pitcher (1984) suggested, a desire that you have now may be thwarted by your death, even though you will die several months from now. In that case, it might be now that your death makes you worse off than you would have been had you not died. Pitcher’s assumptions suggest that priorism is true: death may make you worse off before you die. It may harm you retroactively.
Identifying a time something makes us worse off seems rather easy in cases, such as the examples of infection or thwarted desire, in which it brings us have pain or other things that are intrinsically bad for us. But what about cases in which something is bad for us due to the fact that it precludes our having things that are intrinsically good for us? In cases like this, the victim incurs deprivation harm. But at what time are such persons worse off than they otherwise would be? When, in particular, does dying painlessly make a person worse off?
Is it possible to defend a concurrentist answer to this question about death? Julian Lamont (1998) says we incur deprivation harm at the time some event ensures that we will not retain or attain some good that is otherwise available. Call such an event an ensuring event. Death may itself be an ensuring event, he thought, so death and deprivation harm may occur simultaneously.
But this suggestion appears doubtful. Recall the earlier case in which we come to be infected and only later experience any symptoms. The event of coming to be infected is overall bad for us, but it seems implausible to say that this makes us worse off than we otherwise would be at the time we are infected. Instead, it seems, coming to be infected makes us worse off later, while we are sick. We are unlikely to adopt concurrentism as our story concerning catching the flu, which makes it doubtful as our story concerning deprivation harm.
In cases like catching the flu, it makes sense to say that the offending event is bad for its victim after it occurs—while she is incurring intrinsic evils she otherwise would lack. Perhaps the same is true of deprivation harm. Recall the example, discussed earlier, in which being sedated at time t is bad for a person due to the fact that it deprives her of good things: in this example, it seems, being sedated makes her worse off than she otherwise would be at a time after t—at the time when she would have been enjoying those goods had she not been sedated. Can we extend this story to the deprivation harm for which a victim’s death is responsible? Does a person’s death makes her worse off than she otherwise would be after she dies—during the time when she would have been enjoying the goods of which her death has deprived her, had she not died? Call this stance subsequentism. Proponents of subsequentism include Neil Feit (2002) and Ben Bradley (2004, 2009).
Subsequentism is plausible only if we can make good sense of the welfare level someone occupies while dead, but this may not be possible. There are at least two problems to discuss.
One difficulty is the problem of the subject. Suppose we are terminators rather than anti-terminators (discussed in Section 2.6). Suppose, too, that you die at time t1 but had you not you would have experienced joy at time t2. Time t2 arrives while you are dead, so that, given the termination thesis, t2 arrives while you no longer exist. Consider the property, lacks joy. Does it make sense to attribute this (or any other) property to you at t2? Does it make sense to say that some subject has a property at a time when that subject does not exist? If not, it seems difficult to make sense of your having a welfare level then. Epicurus seemed to be thinking along these lines when he wrote that “death is nothing to us, since when we are, death is not, and when death is present, then we are not.” (Echoing Epicurus, Nagel 1970 wrote “So long as a person exists, he has not yet died, and once he has died, he no longer exists; so there seems to be no time when death, if it is a misfortune, can be ascribed to its unfortunate subject.” But if this is the reason we cannot ascribe misfortune to a victim of death then we cannot even ascribe death to any victim.)
It might seem possible to solve the problem of the subject by simply switching sides and becoming anti-terminators, but this will not work. Anti-terminators can say that it is a straightforward matter to attribute the property lacks joy to you at t2, since you still exist at t2. You are your (joyless) corpse at t2. This won’t work because you might die and go out of existence without leaving a corpse, and even if you leave a corpse it might rot away, taking you out of existence, well before time t2 arrives. Both possibilities are consistent with the fact that, had you not died when you did, at t1, you would have experienced joy at t2.
Still, there are more promising strategies for solving the problem of the subject. Subsequentists might adopt a view that is sometimes called metaphysical eternalism (defended by Nagel 1970 and Silverstein 1980, among others). On this view, past and future objects are ontologically on a par with present objects. Existing things are spread out in both space and time. Suppose it is possible to refer to anything that is ontologically on a par with present objects. Then, given metaphysical eternalism, we can still refer to Socrates, even though ‘Socrates’ refers to something whose existence is temporally located wholly in the past, and say of him that he is not alive. For similar reasons, perhaps, we can also attribute the property lacks joy to a person, such as Socrates, whose existence is over.
However, even if they can solve the problem of the subject, and make sense of attributing properties to subjects who are dead, subsequentists face another difficulty: it seems confused to speak of how well off a subject is during times when she is dead. Now, it does make sense to attribute the property lacks joy to a corpse, and to a person who has stopped existing. Anti-terminators will add that a person will have this property—lacks joy—while she is a corpse. But it makes no sense to ask how well off a person is while she is a corpse or during some time after she has stopped existing altogether. The concept of faring well or ill does not apply to things like concrete blocks and corpses or to persons while they are corpses. Things that do fare well or ill may pass through periods of time when they have a level of welfare that is equal to 0—during those times they are capable of accruing goods or evils but do neither—but unlike them, bags of concrete are not capable of having any welfare level, not even a level of 0. The same seems true of a corpse. And the same seems true of us during such times as we are no longer alive—times when we have become corpses or when those corpses have turned to dust.
Many theorists who reject subsequentism assume that because death takes a person out of actual existence, the dead are not “there” to be harmed. Palle Yourgrau (2019) rejects this assumption. He combines modal realism (the view that, like the actual world, other possible worlds are concrete objects) with the thesis of transworld identity (one and the same object exists in more than one possible world), and says that although a dead person no longer exists in the actual world, one and the same person is still alive, and exists, in other possible worlds. We may deny that, after a person has died, she is no longer real at all—not “there” to be harmed—because she still exists in other worlds, according to Yourgrau.
Some (Nagel 1970; Silverstein 1980) suggest that death harms us but at no determinate time. This view is criticized by Julian Lamont (1998) on the grounds that it implies that some events take place but at no particular time. But William Grey (1999) counters that Lamont has misunderstood Nagel’s (and Grey’s) indefinitist position, which is that the harm death causes is incurred during a stretch of time that has blurry boundaries (compare: the time of the onset of baldness).
As Grey understands it, indefinitism is correct only if subsequentism, priorism or concurrentism is true (Grey opts for subsequentism), for even a period of time with blurry edges must occur before, after or at the same time as a mortem event (eternalism is an exception since an infinite period has no boundaries to blur).
Suppose we conclude that there just is no (stretch of) time, whether with blurry edges or not, at which we are made worse off than we otherwise would be by a death that precludes our having goods we otherwise would have. Given the Epicurean presumption, we would have to conclude that it is not bad for us to be deprived of such goods by death. But of course we need not accept this conclusion. We can instead reject the Epicurean presumption. Being deprived of goods by death is bad for us, we can say, if, and insofar as, it is overall bad for us simpliciter, and to be overall bad for us simpliciter, there need not be a time at which death makes us worse off than we otherwise would be. There need be no time at which death makes our welfare level lower than it otherwise would be. Death can preclude our enjoying years of pleasant activities, making our lives worse than they would have been had we not died, even if at no time we are worse off than we would be had our lives not been cut short.
Isn’t it still possible to raise a question about timing, namely: if death is overall bad simpliciter for those who are deprived of happy years, at what time is it bad for them? This question does indeed arise, but it is not the timing question we have been asking, and an answer to the one is not an answer to the other. The answer to the new question is this: if true at all, the proposition that death is overall bad for us simpliciter is an eternal, a timeless, truth (Feldman 1991). A timeless truth is a proposition that is true at all times if true at all. That 6 is less than 7 is an example. That the welfare level Harry accrued today is lower than the welfare level Mary accrued today is another example. And so is the proposition that Sam’s death is overall bad for him simpliciter. It amounts to the claim that Sam’s actual lifetime welfare level is lower than the lifetime welfare level Sam would have accrued had he not died. Jens Johansson (2013) coined the term atemporalism for the view that “death is bad for the deceased but not at any time.” (For further discussion of atemporalism see Lamont 1998, Silverstein 2000 and Feit 2002.)
Before we move on, let us consider some further objections to the harm thesis and the deprivationist defense of it.
Another worry about the deprivationist defense is that deprivationism appeals to comparativism, and comparativism says that an event or state of affairs harms me, in that it is bad for me, when my life would have been better for me, my lifetime welfare higher, had that that event not occurred. However, there seem to be exceptions.
I am not harmed, it seems, by failing to be brilliant, or rich and beautiful. But compare my life as it is, with my unimpressive IQ, income and looks, to my life as it would be were I brilliant or rich or beautiful: the former is considerably worse than the latter. My not being a genius (or rich and so forth) precludes my coming to have many goods. It makes my life worse than it otherwise would be, so comparativism seems to imply that not being a genius is bad for me. Suppose you have the winning Mega Millions jacpot ticket, and you decide to give it to me. Before you hand it over, you have a stroke and die. Has your death harmed me?
Epicureans might renew their attack on the harm thesis by exploiting examples like these. The examples appear to show that things can have enormous negative value for me without harming me. Similarly, Epicureans might insist, the preclusion of goods by death is harmless: cut short, my life is worse than it would be were I not to die, but this comparative difference does not show that I am harmed.
It seems that the comparative criteria work well when we evaluate losses, such as the loss of my arms, and also when we evaluate some lacks, such as the inability to see or to feel pleasure. But, arguably, the criteria have worrisome implications when we evaluate certain other lacks, such as my lack of genius. It is relatively clear that a person is harmed by the inability to see but less clear that he is harmed by the lack of genius. Why is that?
Nagel seems inclined to think that the solution is to “set some limits on how possible a possibility must be for its nonrealization to be a misfortune,” but also mentions that we might not regard, as a misfortune, “any limitation, like mortality, that is normal to the species.” Draper suggests that harmless preclusion involves cases in which the events or states of affairs that would be good for us if they held are highly improbable (Draper 1999). Another explanation might focus on the relative importance of having some goods rather than others. In some moods, we may consider it harmful to be deprived of a good just when it is important for us to have it. The troublesome lacks we have been discussing might be lacks of goods it is unimportant to have; such lacks would not be harmful even though we would be better off without them. (But if, against all odds, a person is a genius, or rich, or beautiful, would taking these away be harmless to her?)
Lucretius, a follower of Epicurus, extended Epicurus’s case against the harm thesis. The argument he developed involved a thought experiment:
Look back at time … before our birth. In this way Nature holds before our eyes the mirror of our future after death. Is this so grim, so gloomy? (Lucretius 1951)
According to his symmetry argument, it is irrational to object to death, assuming it ends our existence, since we do not find it objectionable that we failed to exist prior to being alive, and the way things were for us while not existing then is just like the way things will be for us after death ends our existence; our pre-vital nonexistence and our posthumous nonexistence are symmetrical, alike in all relevant respects, so that any objection to the one would apply to the other.
Lucretius’s argument admits of more than one interpretation, depending on whether it is supposed to address death understood as dying or as being dead (or both).
On one interpretation, the argument is this: the ending of life is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against it is the fact that it is followed by our nonexistence, yet the latter is not objectionable, as is shown by the fact that we do not object to our nonexistence before birth. So understood, the symmetry argument is weak. It would have some force for someone who thought initially that death puts us into a state or condition that is ghastly, perhaps painful, but that need not be our complaint. Instead, our complaint might be that death precludes our having more good life. Notice that the mirror image of death is birth (or, more precisely, becoming alive), and the two affect us in very different ways: birth makes life possible; if a life ends up being good for us, birth starts a good thing going. Death makes further life impossible; it brings a good thing to a close.
Perhaps Lucretius only meant to argue that being dead is not bad, since the only thing we could hold against it is our nonexistence, which is not really objectionable, as witness our attitude about pre-vital nonexistence. So interpreted, there is a kernel of truth in Lucretius’s argument. Truly, our pre-vital nonexistence does not concern us much. But perhaps that is because our pre-vital nonexistence is followed by our existence. Perhaps we would not worry overly about our post-vital nonexistence if it, too, were followed by our existence. If we could move in and out of existence, say with the help of futuristic machines that could dismantle us, then rebuild us, molecule by molecule, after a period of nonexistence, we would not be overly upset about the intervening gaps, and, rather like hibernating bears, we might enjoy taking occasional breaks from life while the world gets more interesting. But undergoing temporary nonexistence is not the same as undergoing permanent nonexistence. What is upsetting might be the permanence of post-vital nonexistence—not nonexistence per se.
There is another way to use considerations of symmetry against the harm thesis: we want to die later, or not at all, because it is a way of extending life, but this attitude is irrational, Lucretius might say, since we do not want to be born earlier (we do not want to have always existed), which is also a way to extend life. As this argument suggests, we are more concerned about the indefinite continuation of our lives than about their indefinite extension. (Be careful when you rub the magic lamp: if you wish that your life be extended, the genie might make you older!) A life can be extended by adding to its future \(or\) to its past. Some of us might welcome the prospect of having lived a life stretching indefinitely into the past, given fortuitous circumstances. But we would prefer a life stretching indefinitely into the future.
Is it irrational to want future life more than past life? No; it is not surprising to find ourselves with no desire to extend life into the past, since the structure of the world permits life extension only into the future, and that is good enough. But what if life extension were possible in either direction? Would we still be indifferent about a lengthier past? And should our attitude about future life match our attitude about past life?
Our attitude about future life should match our attitude about past life if our interests and attitudes are limited in certain ways. If quantity of life is the only concern, a preference for future life is irrational. Similarly, the preference is irrational if our only concern is to maximize how much pleasure we experience over the course of our lives without regard to its temporal distribution. But our attitude is not that of the life- or pleasure-gourmand.
According to Parfit, we have a far-reaching bias extending to goods in general: we prefer that any good things, not just pleasures, be in our future, and that bad things, if they happen at all, be in our past. He argues that if we take this extensive bias for granted, and assume that, because of it, it is better for us to have goods in the future than in the past, we can explain why it is rational to deplore death more than we do our not having always existed: the former, not the latter, deprives us of good things in the future (he need not say that it is because it is in the past that we worry about the life-limiting event at the beginning of our lives less than the life-limiting event at the end). This preference for future goods is unfortunate, however, according to Parfit. If cultivated, the temporal insensitivity of the life- or pleasure-gourmand could lower our sensitivity to death: towards the end of life, we would find it unsettling that our supply of pleasures cannot be increased in the future, but we would be comforted by the pleasures we have accumulated.
Whether or not we have the extensive bias described by Parfit, it is true that the accumulation of life and pleasure, and the passive contemplation thereof, are not our only interests. We also have active, forward–looking goals and concerns. Engaging in such pursuits has its own value; for many of us, these pursuits, and not passive interests, are central to our ‘identities’, our fundamental values and commitments. However, we cannot make and pursue plans for our past. We must project our plans (our self–realization) into the future, which explains our forward bias. (We could have been devising and pursuing plans in the past, but these plans will not be extensions of our present concerns.) It is not irrational to prefer that our lives be extended into the future rather than the past, if for no other reason than this: only the former makes our existing forward-looking pursuits possible. It is not irrational to prefer not to be at the end of our lives, unable to shape them further, and limited to reminiscing about days gone by. As Frances Kamm (1998, 2021) emphasizes, we do not want our lives to be all over with.
Nevertheless, it does not follow that we should be indifferent about the extent of our pasts. Being in the grip of forward-looking pursuits is important, but we have passive interests as well, which make a more extensive past preferable. Moreover, having been devising and pursuing plans in the past is worthwhile. If fated to die tomorrow, most of us would prefer to have a thousand years of glory behind us rather than fifty. We want to have lived well.
In “Death” Thomas Nagel offered a response to Lucretius that has been widely discussed. It is entirely reasonable not to want to come into existence earlier even though we want to live longer, Nagel said, because it is metaphysically impossible for a person to have come into existence significantly earlier than she did, even though it is possible for a person to have existed longer than she actually did. However, his response hinges on questionable assumptions about the essential features of people’s origins, as Nagel acknowledges (in footnote 3 of the reprint of “Death” in his collection Mortal Questions.) Imagine someone who originated from a zygote that had been frozen for a very long time. Mightn't that zygote have been frozen for a brief time instead? Wouldn’t that be a way for this person to have come into existence far earlier than she did?
According to Frederik Kaufman (2016, p. 63), this thought experiment (perhaps tweaked a bit) might provide a way in which a human organism could have come into existence far earlier than she did, but it does not provide a way in which a person could have come into existence far earlier. “Persons (properly understood) cannot exist earlier than they do.” He bases this view on the assumption—challenged by animalists but defended by Parfit—that persons are objects (distinct from organisms) with psychological persistence conditions, chief among which is psychological continuity, together with the assumption that “if mental continuity is constitutive of personal identity, then when a particular consciousness emerges is essential to that person.”
According to Aristotle,
a dead man is popularly believed to be capable of having both good and ill fortune—honour and dishonour and prosperity and the loss of it among his children and descendants generally—in exactly the same way as if he were alive but unaware or unobservant of what was happening (Nicomachean Ethics 1.10)
The belief Aristotle reported in this passage is that a person may be benefitted or harmed by things that happen while she is dead. Nagel (1970, p. 66) agrees; drawing upon his indefinitist approach he says that “a man's life includes much that does not take place within the boundaries … of his life” and that “there is a simple account of what is wrong with breaking a deathbed promise. It is an injury to the dead man.” If something that occurs while a person is dead is bad for her, let us say that it is responsible for posthumous harm. (But this way of speaking is potentially misleading, as theorists who argue that posthumous events may harm us need not assume that the victims are worse off while they are dead.) Is there such a thing as posthumous harm?
The main reason to doubt the possibility of posthumous harm is the assumption that it presupposes the (dubious) possibility of backwards causation. As Ernest Partridge wrote, “after death no events can alter a moment of a person's life” (1981, p. 248). The dead may be wronged, Partridge thought, but being wronged is not a kind of harm. (The claim that a person may be wronged by actions others take after she is dead is itself quite controversial. Like Partridge, some theorists think that people may be wronged but not harmed posthumously. Priorists typically argue that both are possible, while other, theorists, such as J.S. Taylor 2012, argue that neither is possible.)
We might also question the possibility of posthumous harm by drawing on the assumption (made by Mark Bernstein 1998, p. 19, and Walter Glannon 2001, p. 138, among others) that something is intrinsically good or bad for a person only if it reduces to her intrinsic, non-relational properties. For simplicity, we can focus on one version of this view, namely intrinsic hedonism. Suppose we assume that a person is harmed only by what is intrinsically or extrinsically bad for her, that intrinsic hedonism is the correct account of intrinsic harm and comparativism is the correct account of extrinsic harm, and also that the termination thesis (people do not exist while dead) is true. On these assumptions, it is impossible for an event that occurs after a person dies to be bad for her. It cannot be bad for her in itself and it cannot be overall bad for her either. To be overall bad for a person, a posthumous event would have to make her have fewer goods or more evils or both than she would have had if that event had not occurred. But nothing that happens after a person dies and ceases to exist has any bearing on the amounts of pleasure or pain in her life. Nothing that occurs after she ceases to exist modifies any of her intrinsic properties.
Although the above assumptions rule out the possibility of posthumous harm, they are entirely consistent, we have seen, with the possibility of mortal harm, the possibility that people are harmed by dying. (We might think otherwise if, as some theorists do, we assume that a person no longer exists at the time she dies. Joel Feinberg 1984, following Barbara Levenbook 1984, defined death as “the first moment of the subject’s nonexistence,” which makes death something that occurs after a person has ceased to exist, and suggests that by ruling out the possibility that a person is harmed by things that occur after she ceases to exist we rule out the possibility of mortal harm.)
Those who defend the possibility of posthumous harm deny that it involves backwards causation. But how could posthumous events affect people if not via backwards causation?
Some theorists say that posthumous harm occurs when posthumous events change the value of a person’s life for the worse. Dorothy Grover (1989) suggests that posthumous events may affect the “quality” of a person's life, say by changing the value of her accomplishments. David Velleman (1991) argues along similar lines, claiming that later events may affect the meaning of earlier events, and the latter bears on the value of a person’s life.
Some theorists (for example, Pitcher 1984, Feinberg 1984, Luper 2004 and 2012, and Scarre 2013) appeal to preferentialism to explain the possibility of posthumous harm. We noted earlier that preferentialists can defend the idea that some events harm their victims retroactively, and that death is such an event. Preferentialists can take a similar stance on posthumous events, assuming that things that happen after we die may determine whether desires we have while alive are fulfilled or thwarted.
According to Pitcher, posthumous events harm us by being responsible for truths that thwart our desires. For example, being slandered while I am dead makes it true that my reputation is to be damaged, and this harms me at all and only those times when I desire that my reputation be untarnished. It is while I am alive that I care about my reputation’s always being intact, and it is while I am alive that my well-being is brought lower by posthumous slander. Similarly, my desire that my child have a happy upbringing even if I am not there to provide it will be thwarted if, after I die, she catches some devastating illness. The event that makes it true that my child will be miserable occurs after I am gone, but this truth thwarts my desire about my child now, so it is now that I am worse off. The posthumous events themselves harm me only indirectly; directly I am harmed by their making things true that bear on my interests.
However, the desire-based case for the possibility of posthumous harm remains controversial. It will be rejected by theorists who doubt that people are harmed by events that do not modify their intrinsic features, and by theorists who think that it hinges on the possibility of backwards causation, of course. Velleman (1991, p. 339) rejects the desire-based case on the grounds that “we think of a person's current well-being as a fact intrinsic to the present, not as a relation that he currently bears to his future.” Some theorists echo a criticism that was offered by Partridge (1981, p. 246). Consider an event that thwarts one of a person's desires. To harm her by virtue of thwarting that desire, Partridge claims, the event must occur while she still has that desire, while she still cares about whether it is fulfilled, but she and her desire are gone by the time a posthumous event occurs. For some theorists (Vorobej, 1998, Suits 2001), the point is that we have no reason to care whether our desires are fulfilled by events that occur once we no longer have those desires, and we no longer have desires after we die. Parfit resisted this charge by noting that while some of our desires are conditional on their own persistence (we want them fulfilled at a time only on condition that we will still have them at that time), others are not.
Is it always a misfortune for us to die? Would never dying instead be bad for us? In a pair of influential essays, Thomas Nagel defends an affirmative answer to the first question, while Bernard Williams defends an affirmative answer to the second.
In “Death” (and in The View From Nowhere, p. 224) Nagel argues that no matter when it happens, dying is bad for those who die. He bases this view on the claim that “life is worth living even when the bad elements of experience are plentiful and the good ones too meager to outweigh the bad ones on their own. The additional positive weight is supplied by experience itself, rather than by any of its contents.” (1970, p. 60) Nagel’s view appears to be that it is intrinsically good for us to experience things, and that this good is great enough to outweigh any evils that accompany it. Hence a person’s welfare level is positive at any time when she is experiencing things, and no matter how much misery continued existence will bring her, it is overall good for her to live longer, assuming that she continues to experience things. (Nagel does not argue that being deprived of continued life would be a misfortune if that life were entirely devoid of experience.)
Nagel considers objections to his view towards the end of his essay. One might argue, Nagel points out (as noted earlier), that mortality is not a misfortune on the grounds that the nonrealization of remote possibilities (like being immortal) is not harmful, or on the grounds that limitations that are normal to the species (like mortality) are not harmful. He responds that the normality and inevitableness of death “do not imply that it would not be good to live longer.” Whenever death comes, it would have been good to live longer, so it is bad for us that we will not: “if there is no limit to the amount of life that it would be good to have, then it may be that a bad end is in store for us all.” (1970, p. 69)
Nagel’s case for saying that death is always bad for those who die rests on his claim that the goodness of experiencing outweighs any accompanying evils. However, the latter is implausible, as is evident to anyone who would rather be sedated into unconsciousness than undergo the suffering she would otherwise experience during surgery. Under such circumstances, sedation is overall good for us, despite the fact that (indeed: because) it stops us from experiencing things for a time. And once this is acknowledged, it seems reasonable to add that, under certain circumstances, dying would be overall good for us, and hence not bad for us after all. It would be overall good for us if the further life we otherwise would have would bring us great evils, such as suffering, that are not offset by goods.
Bernard Williams (and others, such as Shelly Kagan 2012) takes the view that it would be bad to live forever, even under the best of circumstances. In his influential essay “The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality,” Williams argues that although the deaths of some persons is a misfortune for them, never dying would be intolerable. In arguing for these views, Williams draws upon the notion of a categorical desire, which we can clarify as follows.
Consider a woman who wants to die. She might still take the view that if she is to live on, then she should be well fed and clothed. She wants food and clothing on condition she remain alive. In this sense her desires (for food and clothes) are conditional on her remaining alive, and, in being conditional on her living on, they do not give her reason to live. Contrast a father who desires that his beloved daughter have a good start in life. His desire is not conditional on his remaining alive. In this sense, it is, Williams says, categorical. In fact, his desire gives him reason to live, because he can see to her well-being if he survives. Williams thinks that our categorical desires are not only what motivate us to live on, they give meaning to our lives, and are important elements of our characters. He also thinks that it is by virtue of the fact that we will retain the same character until a later time that it is clear to us that we will be the same person until then.
The bearing on death, according to Williams, is, first, that we have good reason to condemn a death that is premature in the sense that it thwarts our categorical desires. Second, mortality is good, for if we live long enough, eventually we will lose our categorical desires. At that point we will no longer be motivated to live on, and oppressive boredom will set in. When we contemplate this fate from our vantage point in the present, we find it that it is not even clear to us that these bored seniors are us.
If we could find a way to extend our lives indefinitely, yet avoid the ravages of senescence, and remain healthy and mentally competent, couldn’t we avoid becoming jaded with life by gradually varying our interests over time, adding to and perhaps replacing some of our categorical desires, again and again? Several theorists including Nagel (1986, p. 224, n. 3), Glover (1977, p. 57), and Fischer (1994), have argued that the lives of superseniors need not become dull and tedious. Williams’s view is that it is not possible to make eternal life desirable (which claim is not identical to the claim that eternal life would inevitably be bad for us). Varying my categorical desires will not work, because, to be desirable, the endless life I design for myself must meet two conditions: (1) “it should clearly be me who lives forever,” and (2) “the state in which I survive should be one that, to me looking forward, will be adequately related, in the life it presents, to those aims I now have in wanting to survive at all.” (1973, p. 83) If I replace my categorical desires, I fall afoul of at least one of these conditions. Life under the future desires is detached from life under my current categorical desires. Moreover, the desires I give myself in the future will be elements of a character that is very different from my current character; replacing my current character with an entirely different one later in life makes it far less clear, Williams appears to think, that the individual living that later life is me. “The degree of identification needed with the later life … is absolutely minimal.” (1973, p. 85)
Williams’s claim that immortality cannot be made desirable remains controversial. It is not obvious that eternal life is undesirable if it involves changing our categorical desires and characters (insofar as our characters are defined by the desires). Nor is it obvious that such changes must violate Williams’s two conditions for the desirability of continued life. Williams seems to think that the individual who is changed in this way will not clearly be the same person as before, but he stops short of saying that it clearly will not be the same person (indeed, he defends a bodily continuity criterion for identity in “The Self and the Future,” pp. 46–63, so he presumably thinks that a person does survive changes of desires and character). Concerning Williams’s second condition, his view is that if we replace our characters and desires, “there is nothing left by which he can judge” whether future life is desirable (1093, p. 85). Yet it seems reasonable to take the view now that it would be good for me to develop and fulfil desires in the future—desires I now lack. Many of us would welcome the prospect of gradually transforming our interests and projects over time. The gradual, continuous transformation of our desires and projects does not end our lives, or existence. It is distinct from, and preferable to, annihilation. If we could live endlessly, the stages of our lives would display reduced connectedness, yet remain continuous, which is a property that is important in the kind of survival most of us prize. Even after drinking from the fountain of eternal youth, we would tend to focus on relatively short stretches of our indefinitely extensive lives, being animated by the specific projects and relationships we have then. However, sometimes we would turn our attention to long stretches of life, and then, prizing continuity, we might well phase in new and worthwhile undertakings that build upon, and do not wholly replace, the old. (For further discussion of the desirability of eternal life, see Overall 2003, Bortolotti 2009, Smuts 2011, Luper 2012b, Altshuler 2016, Buben 2016, Cholbi 2016, and Fischer 2019.)
Even if death is usually bad for those of us who die, perhaps it need not be bad for us, if we prepare ourselves suitably. This might be possible if some form of preferentialism is true, and if, by altering our desires, we could cease to have any interests that dying would impair. For then we might be able to thanatize our desires, in this sense: we might abandon all desires that death might thwart. Among these are desires we can satisfy only if we live on for a few days, but also desires we cannot possibly satisfy within the span of a normal lifetime, and the desire for immortality itself. Instead of desiring that some project of mine succeed, which is a desire that might be thwarted by my death, I might instead adopt a conditionalized version of this desire, namely: should I live on, let my project succeed. If all goes well, thanatizing would insulate us from harm from death by leaving us with no interests with which dying interferes.
Unfortunately, this strategy will backfire. The main problem is that death can interfere with desire fulfillment not just by falsifying the objects of our desires but also by precluding our having desires (Luper 2013). So even if we resolve, from now on, to limit ourselves to desires whose objects cannot be falsified by death, we are still vulnerable to the harm death will do us if it precludes our having and fulfilling desires. Hence thanatizing would force us to avoid having any desires whose fulfillment would have benefitted us, and to deny ourselves such desires would be as bad for us as the harm we are trying to avoid.
However, the core idea of adapting our desires is useful, if not taken to an extreme. It is prudent to avoid taking on goals we cannot possibly attain, and hence prudent to eschew projects that cannot possibly be completed during the course of a normal lifetime.
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