Dewey’s Aesthetics

First published Fri Sep 29, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jun 24, 2021

John Dewey is, with Charles Sanders Peirce and William James, one of the leading early figures of the school of American Pragmatists. He has also had a great deal of influence in aesthetics and the philosophy of art. His work Art as Experience (1934) is regarded by many as one of the most important contributions to this area in the twentieth century. The work is especially well-known for its full-blown treatment of aesthetic experience.

Critical of attempts to limit aesthetic experience solely to the domain of fine art, Art as Experience has had a high influence on trends in aesthetic research, which have sought to broaden the scope of the field from the traditional arts to popular culture (Shusterman 1992, 2nd edition 2000), the natural environment (Berleant 1997), and the everyday (Kupfer 1983, Saito 2007, Stroud 2011, Leddy 2012). The work is also often seen as a key part of Dewey’s general late philosophical project, most systematically developed in Experience and Nature (1925), of rethinking experience along naturalist lines as an interaction between the organism and its environment as opposed to a discrete sensory unit such as stimulus, impression, idea, or sense-datum. Instead of investigating how our senses are in touch with reality and whether they represent it correctly—which Dewey takes to be the frame of modern epistemology—Dewey’s starting point, building on his reading of Darwin’s theory of evolution, is to look at the ways in which experience is formed as a part of natural processes to which the human being is fundamentally tied. For Dewey, aesthetic experience is the highest form of this interaction. It is the phase when, in Dewey’s often used words, the interaction between the organism and the environment reaches a stage of fulfillment. Already Experience and Nature includes a chapter on aesthetics the themes of which Dewey went on to develop in much greater depth and detail in Art as Experience some ten years later. Due to the high value that Dewey places on aesthetic experience, Art as Experience has even been regarded as the culminating work of Dewey’s late philosophical thinking (Alexander 2013).

1. Early Forays into Aesthetics

Dewey was in his seventies when Art as Experience was published, but also his earlier work contains numerous discussions of aesthetic related themes, beginning already from his very first book, Psychology (1887), in which Dewey discusses aesthetics and the arts at various points. Dewey, for example, emphasizes the importance of rhythm to our psychic lives, both in perception and in expression. The soul tends to express its most intimate states, especially emotion, in rhythmic form. Rhythm is defined as the mind’s reduction of variety to unity or its breaking unity into variety. It happens when certain beats are emphasized at regular intervals, and it requires that elements be organized temporally, through the mind being carried back and forth, to form a whole. It is not confined to the arts but is pervasive in our experience of time.

Psychology comes from Dewey’s idealist period, which for example shows up in the book’s treatment of imagination, aesthetic feeling, and beauty. Dewey distinguishes between different forms of imagination, which he defines as intellect embodying ideas in particular images. The highest form of imagination is creative imagination, which allows us to penetrate into the hidden meaning of things through finding sensuous forms that are both highly revealing and pleasurable. It makes its objects anew through non-mechanical separation and combination. Implicitly following Kant, Dewey holds that creative imagination’s goal is free play of the self’s faculties. Its function is to seize meaning and embody it in sensuous form to give rise to feeling, thus representing the freely active subjective self.

Part Two of Psychology is devoted to feeling, including, in Chapter Fifteen, aesthetic feeling. This chapter also deals with fine art and taste. Aesthetic feelings characteristically accompany perception of “the ideal value of experience” (PS: 267). The mind responds to certain relations to ideals through feelings of beauty or ugliness. Every content of experience has beauty in it to the extent that it contains an ideal element. Echoing recent views on functional beauty, Dewey argues that a train engine, for example, is beautiful insofar as it is felt to successfully embody its ideal, i.e., its ability to overcome distances and bring humans together. The beautiful object requires a sensuous material. However, this sensuous material is only important insofar as it presents the ideal. Art cannot be purely idealistic in the sense of abandoning sensuous material, but it is idealistic in that it uses such material to promote the appreciation of ideal values of experience. The aesthetic feeling of beauty is universal and not a thing of place and time.

This universality excludes such lower senses as taste and smell from the beautiful. It also excludes the feeling of ownership and any reference to external ends. Harmony constitutes beauty. Harmony is defined as the feeling that accompanies agreement of experience with the self’s ideal nature (PS: 273). Art attempts to satisfy the aesthetic in our nature, and it succeeds when it expresses the ideal completely. The idea, in turn, is the “completely developed self”. So the goal of art is to create the perfectly harmonious self. Against this background, Dewey ranks the fine arts according to their level of ideality. Architecture is the least ideal art, while poetry is fully ideal, having little that is sensuous in it, concentrating as it does on the vital personality of man himself (and nature as only a reflection of this).

Especially outside of philosophical circles, Dewey is best known for his work in education. One of his major works in this area, Democracy and Education (1916), also includes reflections on aesthetic themes, particularly on the imagination, which Dewey regards “as the sole way of escape from mechanical methods in teaching” (DE: 245) that he, in general, opposes. Anticipating the naturalism of Art as Experience Dewey argues that there is no essential gap between aesthetic experience and other forms of experience. The function of the fine arts is not to provide an escape from ordinary life. Rather, it is the enhancement of qualities that make ordinary experiences appealing. The arts are the main means of achieving “an intensified, enhanced appreciation” (DE: 246). Their purpose, beyond being enjoyable, is that they fix taste, reveal depth of meaning in otherwise mediocre experiences, and concentrate and focus elements of what is considered good. In the end the fine arts are “not luxuries of education, but emphatic expressions of that which makes any education worthwhile” (DE: 247). Dewey is also critical of the Aristotelian distinction between useful labor and leisure, where the second is privileged over the first, and believes this prejudicial distinction is still dominant. He comes back to this issue in Art as Experience, where he suggests a new understanding of the relationship between means and ends as a way of improving the quality of people’s daily experience. Means should not be seen as mere disposable preliminary stages, which can be thrown away like a ladder once the end is reached, but as integral parts of the ends that they help to fulfill. This reversal, Dewey believes, will infuse people’s everyday experience with a sense of direction and meaning.

The essay Reconstruction in Philosophy, published in 1920, concludes with a view of an ideal future in which ideas are deepened because they are expressed in imaginative vision and fine art. Religious and scientific values will be reconciled and art will no longer be a mere luxury or a stranger to everyday life. Making a living will be making a life worth living, and the hardness of contemporary life will be bathed in a new light.

Dewey returned briefly to issues of the role of art in society in The Public and its Problems (1927), where art is seen as something that can resolve the problem of dissemination of ideas appropriate for social change. Artists are the real purveyors of news insofar as they cause happenings to kindle emotion and perception. For Dewey, Walt Whitman was the exemplar of such an artist. He concludes that for a great community and a real public to come into being an art of “full and moving communication” must take possession of our mechanized world (PP: 350).

In “Qualitative Thought”, which appears in Philosophy and Civilization (1931), Dewey says some things that anticipate some of the moves he makes in Art as Experience. For example, he argues that there is a “logic of artistic construction” and that refusal to admit this is a sign of breakdown of traditional logic. When a work of art does not hold together so that the quality of one part reinforces and expands the qualities of the other parts it fails. Works that are genuine intellectual and logical wholes have an underlying quality that defines them and that controls the artist’s thinking. The logic of such an artist is the logic of qualitative thinking.

2. Art as Experience

As much as there is fascinating preliminary material in his earlier writings, Art as Experience raises Dewey’s theorizing about aesthetics and art to a new level. Not only is the density of thought and insight in the later work greater, but the understanding of the arts that it is built on is much more sophisticated compared to the earlier investigations. An important event that significantly contributed to the development of Dewey’s aesthetic thinking was his collaboration with the industrialist and art collector Albert C. Barnes to whom Art as Experience is dedicated. Dewey was a member of the staff of the Barnes Foundation of which he was named director in 1925. Not only does Dewey quote at length from Barnes’ writings on painting, but also many of the art examples in Dewey’s book came from his friend’s impressive art collection. One of the focus points of the Barnes collection is early modernist painting, and Art as Experience includes numerous examinations of the paintings by the leading figures of early modernism, particularly Vincent van Gogh, Henri Matisse, August Renoir, and Paul Cézanne.

Art as Experience forms a systematic aesthetic theory in a similar sense to such classics of twentieth century aesthetics as Robin George Collingwood’s Principles of Art, Martin Heidegger’s The Origin of the Work of Art, Theodor Adorno’s Aesthetic Theory, and Monroe Beardsley’s Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism. It is a far more important source of inspiration and target of criticism compared to Dewey’s earlier texts. The following six sections take a look at the main themes of Art as Experience, all of which are, in some way or another, connected to aesthetic experience.

2.1 The Naturalistic Roots of Aesthetic Theory

The aesthetic theory that Dewey develops in Art as Experience could be labeled moderately naturalist. While Dewey locates the “active seeds” of art and other aesthetic phenomena in natural processes (AE: 18), he in no way seeks to reduce them to natural reality nor does he try to explain their origins and perseverance by locating a place for them in the development of the human species, as some contemporary forms of evolutionary aesthetics do. Rather, Dewey’s naturalism is of an emergent sort, in the sense that he seeks to show how aesthetic experience and culture emerge from the natural basis of life, as he understands it (Alexander 2013). The key element of this moderate naturalism is the idea of an organism, or of “the live creature”—a term that Dewey also often uses—which is in a constant interaction with its surrounding world. Dewey argues that this interaction is marked by shifting and reinforcing phases of disarray and stability, of unsettlement and restoration of harmony, which, in Dewey’s view, give experience its basic structure. As Dewey explains in an oft-quoted passage,

life goes on in an environment; not merely in it but because of it, through interaction with it. (AE: 19, italics in the original)

Not surprisingly, Dewey’s conception of experience, upon which his aesthetics is built, has been described as “ecological” (Hildebrand 2008).

In line with his naturalism, Dewey is highly critical of attempts to idealize art and the aesthetic away from “the objects of concrete experience” (AE: 17), as well as of the aspiration to explain art’s value by its supposed capacity to disclose some higher forms of reality from the natural one we share with other animals. For Dewey, this kind of spiritual take on art is yet another example of the human ambition to build permanence within the constantly changing and unpredictable natural world. He traces the origins of many influential dualisms, for example between “high and low” and “material and ideal”, as well as “the contempt for the body” and “the fear of the senses”, to this more fundamental dualism between spirit and nature (AE: 26). Already in Experience and Nature, Dewey argues that there are but two alternatives,

either art is a continuation… of natural tendencies of natural events; or art is a peculiar addition to nature springing from something dwelling exclusively in the breast of man, whatever name be given to the latter. (EN: 291)

He favors the first alternative and takes the movement between instability and stability, activity and passivity, doing and undergoing that he thinks are intrinsic qualities of all experience as the starting points of his aesthetic theorizing. Dewey:

These biological commonplaces are something more than that; they reach to the roots of the esthetic in experience. (AE: 20)

While Dewey promotes a naturalistic starting point for aesthetic theory, he is equally aware of the negative connotations which have often been attached to naturalist understandings of art and the aesthetic, and the scale of the transformation that the rapid development of the natural sciences had on people’s sense of themselves. For physical science seemed to strip

its objects of the qualities that give the objects and scenes of ordinary experience all their poignancy and preciousness. (AE: 341)

However, Dewey finds these worries unfounded. A naturalist aesthetics, which fully recognizes “the continuity of the organs, needs and basic impulses of the human creature with his animal forebears”, does not imply a “necessary reduction of man to the level of brutes”. Rather only a naturalist approach can properly account for the nearly miraculous fact that something as complex and “marvelous” as art and aesthetic experience can emerge from the most basic units of life (AE: 28).

The goal of aesthetic theory, in Dewey’s view, should not, therefore, be to spiritualize works of art and to set them apart from the objects of ordinary experience, but to disclose the “way in which these works idealize qualities found in common experience”. (AE: 17) It is in other words wrong to think of the aesthetic as a luxurious or transcendentally ideal “intruder in experience from without”. Rather, the aesthetic in experience should be understood as “the clarified and intensified development of traits that belong to every normally complete experience”. Precisely this kind of naturalist approach represents for Dewey “the only secure basis upon which esthetic theory can be built” (AE: 52–53).

2.2 Against “The Museum Conception of Art”

Dewey’s critique of a position that he calls “the museum conception of art” is one of the most famous parts of his aesthetic theory. It is for him a textbook example of the kind of compartmentalizing attitude toward art which his naturalism seeks to overcome. In Dewey’s rendering, the museum conception of art by and large corresponds to the modern idea of fine art which emerged in the eighteenth century and which received its most theoretically developed account in Charles Batteux’s The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle (Les Beaux Arts réduits á un même principe, 1746). Around this time, the different arts were gradually seen to form a unified group separate from the sciences, religion, and most importantly from the practical arts. The idea of the autonomy of art surfaced. Art was considered a self-regulating field for which the different art institutions, which were emerging simultaneously, provided a setting. As opposed to the practical arts, such as embroidery and shoe making, whose value depended on the external goals they served, the fine arts were considered to have their own intrinsic measures of value, which could, moreover, be realized in full only within the spaces of the developing art institutions.

The museum conception also represents a more general tendency Dewey sees in philosophical theory, “the philosophical fallacy”. With this term Dewey refers to a set of preconceptions underlying inquiry which frame research and guide its progress before any conscious inquiry has even taken place. In aesthetics, the fallacy has, in Dewey’s view, taken the form that art and the aesthetic must necessarily be something separate from ordinary everyday modes of experience and activity. This is an assumption to which any aesthetic inquiry must fit itself. As in other fields of philosophy, the cure to the fallacy in the case of aesthetics is to look at experience more carefully, in particular at the ways in which aesthetic experience emerges from the common patterns of all experience, which Dewey’s naturalism examines.

Dewey thinks there are historic reasons why the idea of art as something essentially autonomous from other areas of life became so dominant. He traces these back to the rise of nationalism and capitalism. Both of these developments, in his view, reinforced the inclination to set art “upon a remote pedestal” apart from other activities and modes of experience (AE: 11). The conception of art connected to nationalist and imperialist tendencies rendered museums into “the beauty parlor[s] of civilization”, (AE: 346) where each nation exhibited its greatest artistic achievements and, as in some cases, also its artistic loot. Artworks received “a holier-than-thou” aura, which reinforced their esoteric character as something opposed to everyday life (AE: 15). Dewey also refers, in an unusually spiteful tone, to “the nouveaux riches” of his time, whom he thinks collected expensive artworks merely for the sake of buttressing their social statuses with little care for their artistic value and for engaging with them aesthetically. All this meant for Dewey that works of art were in danger of becoming mere stale “art products” instead of artworks that actually do something “with and in experience” (AE: 9).

Dewey believes that there have been no winners in this development: art is concealed or “wrapped”, to follow the terminology of contemporary Deweyan, Richard Shusterman (Shusterman 1992), in a realm of its own separate from people’s everyday needs, values, and attitudes. To achieve a genuine aesthetic experience required leaving this everyday package behind and entering the confined settings of the museum and other institutions of art. In Dewey’s view, the resulting discrepancy between aesthetics and more mundane areas of life is not restricted to theory. It has “deeply” affected

the practice of living, driving away esthetic perceptions that are necessary ingredients of happiness, or reducing them to the level of compensating transient pleasurable excitations. (AE: 16)

The result has been an “esoteric idea of fine art” (AE: 90) and a conception of the everyday as something inherently unaesthetic.

The many examples of non-Western art Dewey discusses in Art as Experience are especially important parts of his argument for restoring the continuity between art and life, releasing it from the yoke of the museum conception of art. For the ways aesthetic practices and artifacts are incorporated into the very center of daily life and common rituals in many such cultures show that aesthetically significant objects do not require any special institutional setting. According to Dewey, such everyday objects as “domestic utensils, furnishings of tent and house, rugs, mats, jars, pots, bows, spears” were essential parts of the life of a community and had a key role for example in

the worship of gods, feasting and fasting, fighting, hunting, and all the rhythmic crises that punctuate the stream of living. (AE: 14)

Art then for Dewey is a far older phenomenon than the modern concept of fine art; it has its origins already in the world of “archaic man” and should be seen as

an extension of the power of rites and ceremonies to unite men, through a shared celebration, to all incidents and scenes of life. (AE: 275).

2.3 Aesthetic Experience

What, then, is an aesthetic experience for Dewey? His account can be regarded as a form of “internalism”, in that it seeks to separate aesthetic experience from other types of experience by looking at its internal qualities, that is, at what aesthetic experience feels like from the inside (Shelley 2009 [2017]).

Aesthetic experience marks for Dewey a unique experience, which shows what experience at its best can be in all quarters of life, not just in art; “esthetic experience is experience in its integrity” (AE: 278). It is a distinctive kind of experiential condensation within the general stream of experience. It is the most important specimen of a form of experience that Dewey terms “an experience”, often italicizing the indefinite article of this concept to emphasize the standout character of the referred experience. In “an experience” the material of experience is fulfilled, consummated, and forms an integral whole, as for example, when a game is played through, a conversation is rounded out or when we finish “that meal in a Paris restaurant” (AE: 43).

Dewey never puts forth an explicit definition of aesthetic experience in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. However, certain features recur in his numerous discussions. Most importantly, aesthetic experience has a temporal structure. Aesthetic experience is something that develops and attains specific qualities as the experience proceeds. It is in this sense “dynamic because it takes time to complete” (AE: 62). To qualify as an aesthetic experience, there must, moreover, be accumulation between the different phases of the experience: aesthetic experience includes a sense that the later phases build on earlier ones and carry them further rather than just mechanically following them. Aesthetic experiences are also intensive; they condense, for example, emotional and formal features to a single experience. Another key quality of aesthetic experience is a feeling of resistance. These resistances are not obstacles: they feed the experience’s development and accumulation and are converted into movement toward a close. In aesthetic experience, the experiencer is also overcome by a sense of rhythm. Aesthetic experience has an internal momentum and, already from the initial phases, the experiencer can feel a sense of direction in it. In other words, in an aesthetic experience “every successive part flows freely, without seam and without unfilled blanks, into what ensues”. Moreover, “as one part leads to another and as one part carries on what went before, each gains distinctness in itself” (AE: 43). Aesthetic experience also does not terminate at some random point. Rather, its close is a summation of its earlier phases, either in the sense that the energy that has gathered up during the experience is released or the experience reaches a fulfillment in some other sense. In short, aesthetic experience involves “inception, development, and fulfillment” (AE: 62).

From a Deweyan viewpoint, aesthetic experience, then, has roughly the following structure. The experience is set off by some factors, such as opening a book, directing a first glance at a painting, beginning to listen to a piece of music, entering a natural environment or a building, or beginning a meal or a conversation. As aesthetic experience is temporal, the material of the experience does not remain unchanged, but the elements initiating the experience, like reading the first lines of a book or hearing the first chord of a symphony, merge into new ones as the experience proceeds and complex relationships are formed between its past and newer phases. When these different parts form a distinctive kind of orderly developing unity that stands out from the general experiential stream of our lives, the experience in question is aesthetic.

Dewey contrasts aesthetic to “inchoate” and “anesthetic” experiences. These experiences, too, have a temporal dimension, but instead of exhibiting the unified development as an aesthetic experience, they include “holes”, “mechanical junctions”, and “dead centres” (AE: 43). The different phases of the experience merely follow each other, but in no way develop or build on the earlier phases. There is no sense of the kind of “continuous merging” that characterizes aesthetic experience. Due to their punctured and mechanical quality, inchoate and anesthetic experiences also lack the ordered development that is a condition of an experience’s aesthetic fulfillment. The anesthetic experience is a function either of loose succession or mechanical connection of parts. As Dewey explains,

Things happen, but they are neither definitely included nor decisively excluded; we drift… There are beginnings and cessations, but no genuine initiations and concludings. One thing replaces another, but does not absorb it, carry it on. There is experience, but so slack and discursive that it is not an experience. (AE: 46–47)

Given the general character of aesthetic experience, it is no surprise that Dewey attributes such high significance to it in his late naturalist philosophy. Aesthetic experience shows how complex and meaningful the experiences which emerge from the basic factors of all interaction—sense of direction, resistance, rhythm, accumulation—can be. Dewey’s aesthetic theory is naturalist precisely in the sense that even an experience as complex as aesthetic experience is seen as continuous with the interaction that he believes characterizes the relationship of even the simplest biological organisms to their environments. Similarly, art is only one of the many practices and areas of life which can be sources of aesthetic experience. Conversation, for example, is one such everyday activity, for it can exhibit the kind of “continuous interchange and blending” which Dewey thinks is essential to aesthetic experience (AE: 43).

Dewey also argues that there is no reason to think of such conceptual categories as “the practical” or “the intellectual” as some way contradictory to the supposedly pure and non-utilitarian category of “the aesthetic”. It is possible to have aesthetic experiences while engaging with practical and intellectual activities. The aesthetic status of the experiences had in these connections, again, depends solely on the experiences’ internal qualities; even “a mechanic” and “a surgeon” can be “artistically engaged” in Dewey’s sense (AE: 11, 103). The practical and the intellectual should not, thereby, be considered “the enemies of the esthetic”: the real enemies are

the humdrum; slackness of loose ends; submission to convention in practice and intellectual procedure. (AE: 47)

Aesthetic experience, in fact, is something that precisely ties the practical, the emotional, and the intellectual into “a single whole” (AE: 61). Upon reflection it is in many cases possible to disentangle these different strands, but in the moment of experience they are all active in constituting aesthetic experience for the whole that it is.

Dewey’s description of aesthetic experience as a process of both doing and undergoing is still worth noting, as it appears widely in the commentary literature. With this conceptual pair, Dewey draws attention to the kind of interplay between activity and passivity that he thinks aesthetic experience involves. The development of an aesthetic experience often requires effort and imaginative activity from the experiencer, but these moments of doing are also joined with phases when the object or the environment is felt to take the lead in the experience without any real sense of doing from the experiencer. Undergoing is the receptive phase of the experience, the taking in of energy, which the experiencer can, then, more consciously work on. A balance between these experiential phases represents for Dewey an ideal of all experience and, again, aesthetic experience becomes an acute expression of the potentialities that Dewey believes are inherent in the basic interaction between the live creature and its environment;

art, in its form, unites the very same relation of doing and undergoing, outgoing and incoming energy, that makes an experience to be an experience. (AE: 54)

The concepts of doing and undergoing also lead Dewey to emphasize the similarities between the work of an artist and the undertakings required from the audience of art. The final artwork is, among other things, the result of planning, choosing, highlighting, clarifying, simplifying, and other ways of organizing and reorganizing material. In Dewey’s view, the experiencer does not just take in “what is there in finished form”: he or she should achieve a sense of the possibilities and challenges that the artist faced in her work, as well as the decisions she took out of which the work grew to its finished form. Both the making of art and experiencing of art are, thereby,

process[es] consisting of a series of responsive acts that accumulate toward objective fulfillment. (AE: 58)

In this sense, aesthetic experience is for Dewey a kind of mirror image of the artist’s activities. It means “[the] recreation of the object” (AE: 60).

2.4 Aesthetic Form

As internalist as Dewey’s approach to aesthetic experience is, and as much as he emphasizes the distinction between an art product as a physical thing and the artwork as an experienced thing, Dewey also presents a detailed examination of the formal features of aesthetic objects similar to those carried out by numerous other philosophers of art. Dewey states that aesthetic experience has “objective conditions” (AE: 68): not all objects and environments inspire the kind of interaction that he thinks constitutes an aesthetic experience. His analysis of “aesthetic form” is an attempt to capture these conditions. Similarly to his understanding of aesthetic experience as dynamic and developing rather than as a clear-cut sense perception, Dewey seeks to bring out the livelier sides of form. Aesthetic form is something that “enhance[s], prolong[s] and purif[ies] perceptual experience” (EN: 292).

On a basic level, by form Dewey means the thing that “organizes material into the matter of art” (AE: 139). Form is constituted by the different parts of the aesthetic object and by their relationships to one another. For Dewey, the parts of aesthetic form are not independent units. Rather, relationship is “something direct and active… dynamic and energetic” (AE: 139). With his conception of form, Dewey draws attention to

the way things bear upon one another, their clashes and unitings, the way they fulfill and frustrate, promote and retard, excite and inhibit one another. (AE: 139)

In the case of aesthetic form, the different parts of the object must adjust themselves as parts of the same object. The individual parts have a functional and active role in the whole of which they are a part.

This also means that perception of aesthetic form is not a matter of unrelated singular perceptions, but it is “serial”, in that “each sequential act builds up and reinforces what went before” (AE: 136). According to Dewey, aesthetic form possess “qualitative unity” which can be immediately felt. A fuller aesthetic experience, nevertheless, requires engaging with the form’s organization precisely in the sense of serial perception. (AE: 141) Against this background, Dewey calls into question the traditional distinction between the arts of time (music, theater, dance) and the arts of space (painting, sculpture, architecture). Even the spatial arts include important temporal dimensions and have to be “perceived by accumulative series of interactions” (AE: 223). Through this sort of serial and cumulating engagement the aesthetic object gradually builds up for the experiencer. This, according to Dewey, is especially the case with the supposedly static art of architecture:

[Even] a small hut cannot be the matter of esthetic perception save as temporal qualities enter in. A cathedral… makes an instantaneous impression… But this is only the substratum and framework within which a continuous process of interactions introduces enriching and defining elements… One must move about, within and without, and through repeated visits let the structure gradually yield itself… in various lights and in connection with changing moods. (AE: 224)

If aesthetic experience has objective conditions, aesthetic form, in turn, has a set of “formal conditions”, which are “continuity, cumulation, conservation, tension and anticipation” (AE: 143). Dewey draws special attention to the factor of resistance. It is a kind of condition of conditions, for “without internal tension” experience of form would be just “a fluid rush to a straightaway mark” in which case there “could be [nothing] called development and fulfillment” (AE: 143). Dewey further specifies the relationship between aesthetic form and aesthetic experience:

[T]here can be no esthetic experience apart from an object… for an object to be the content of esthetic appreciation it must satisfy those objective conditions without which cumulation, conservation, reenforcement, transition into something more complete, are impossible. (AE: 151, italics in the original)

The naturalist underpinnings of Dewey’s aesthetics are apparent also in his analysis of aesthetic form, for its conditions are objective precisely in the sense that they belong “to the world of physical materials and energies” (AE: 151). His naturalism, thereby, locates the origins of aesthetic form “deep in the world itself” (AE: 152).

One of these deep conditions of aesthetic form is rhythm. Dewey finds rhythm “the first characteristic of the environing world that makes possible the existence of artistic form” (AE: 147). The rhythms of art are grounded in the basic patterns of the relation of the live creature and its environment. Dewey opposes the theory of rhythm as the steady recurrence of identical elements as in a ticking clock: “the tick-tock theory” of rhythm (AE: 168). Rather, each rhythmic beat or tick does not merely repeat the past but drives the rhythmic process forward. Various natural phenomena exemplify this type of rhythm, including “a pond moving in ripples, forked lightning [and] the waving of branches in the wind” (AE: 159). These are contrasted to rhythmless phenomena, such as “a monotonous roar” (AE: 159), which do not involve mutually resisting forces and thus do not entail a gathering up of energy which would create an anticipation of release, as in the case of the beating of a bird’s wing. Neither do these wholes possess the kind of accumulation that Dewey finds essential to aesthetic form.

What this all means is that the recurrence typical to aesthetic form should not be understood “statistically” or “anatomically”, but functionally. In the case of aesthetic form, rhythm is something that furthers experience (AE: 171). The beating of a bird’s wing is a good example: it marks the release of energy, but at the same time the beginning of a new accumulation of energy, which again discharges in a new beating of the wing and so on. Dewey finds this form of rhythm

whenever each step forward is at the same time a summing up and fulfillment of what precedes, and every consummation carries expectation tensely forward. (AE: 177)

While Dewey admits that rhythm can be most easily associated with music, he thinks it, in the end, cuts across the arts, to embrace even painting and architecture:

denial of rhythm to pictures, edifices, and statues, or the assertion that it is found in them only metaphorically, rests upon ignorance of the inherent nature of every perception. (AE: 180)

Again, the distinction between the spatial and the temporal arts turns out overly strict. Perception of rhythm in pictures is as essential to their experience as it is to the experience of music.

2.5 Expression

Another central question of aesthetics that Dewey considers at length in Art as Experience is artistic expression. How can an artwork be expressive and serve as means of communication? The issues are intertwined, for Dewey believes “objects of art… communicate” because they are “expressive” (AE: 110). Artistic expression is for Dewey not a simple matter of the artist transmitting her inner emotions to the work. When for example Van Gogh tried to express “utter desolation” in one of his paintings he did not “pour forth” an emotion to the artwork, but selected and organized material, such as paint and pigments, in a certain way to capture this emotional tone, turning the material used into means of expression, or a medium in Dewey’s terminology.

In Dewey’s explanation, the expressive act is set off by “an impulsion”, a state of unsettlement in the organism, which creates a need to restore a state of balance. Impulsion, as distinguished from “impulse”, is a developmental movement of the “whole organism” in response to a need arising from interaction with the environment, for example a craving for food (AE: 64). It is the beginning stage of a complete experience, whereas impulse is momentary, for example a tongue reacting to a sour taste. Impulsion leads to reflection on the possible means and actions for restoring a state of harmony and a decision to act accordingly, like in the case of finding some water to satisfy one’s thirst. The reflective movement caused by the impulsion also makes the creature more aware of itself. “Blind surge” turns into “a purpose” and “the resistance” the creature faces when trying to complete the impulsion “calls out thought” and “generates curiosity” (AE: 65). The act of expression involves similar mental undertakings, which precisely makes the emotive impetus behind expression closer to an impulsion than a reflexive type impulse. It is as if something requires squeezing out or pressing forth, that is expression (AE: 70). Out of this expression the expressive object gradually takes shape.

Another important distinction is between an expression and a discharge of emotion. All expression involves discharge, but only a particular kind of discharge counts as expression. Dewey insists that someone who simply acts angrily is not expressing anger. Mere “giving way” to impulsion does not constitute expression. The goal of expression is not to get rid of the initial emotion, as is the case with screams that merely discharge emotion, but to achieve a clearer sense of its content and significance. For Dewey, expression means “to stay by, to carry forward in development, to work out to completion” (AE: 67–68). For an emotional discharge to turn into expression in Dewey’s sense also requires an external channel for releasing and working on the emotive energy of the background impulsion. Dewey writes:

where there is no administration of objective conditions, no shaping of materials in the interest of embodying the excitement, there is no expression. (AE: 68)

The expressive object is the embodiment of this expressive act.

What also separates expression from an action caused by a mere impulse is that expression has a medium. For example, a crying baby does not, in Dewey’s view, use the cry to express her emotions; the cry is just an ulterior sign of dissatisfaction. However, when the smile and the outreached hand, for example, are used to express the joy of seeing a friend, these bodily movements function as media for expressing joy. Whether something counts as a medium of expression or not thus “depends upon the way in which material is used” (AE: 69). When the artist works on an expressive object based on her initial impulsion, the materials of art—pigments, clays, notes, words—turn into media of expression.

Some of Dewey’s formulations on the artistic medium come close to the so-called medium-specificity claim according to which each of the arts has its own specific medium that gives a kind of internal ground mechanism for the art’s potencies and development; “color does something in experience and sound something else” (AE: 230). Different artistic media are, according to Dewey, suited for different expressive ends in the sense that

every medium has its own power, active and passive, outgoing and receptive, and… the basis for distinguishing the different traits of the arts is their exploitation of the energy that is characteristic of the material used as a medium. (AE: 248)

Aesthetic effects, thereby, attach to their medium.

For Dewey, expression is also not a matter of finding an outer form to an already complete emotion. Emotions, in Dewey’s sense, do not come in ready-made form, but are more like processes. Especially the emotive impulsion behind expression initially lacks a clear-cut content. We might be overcome by a certain emotion but might also be unable to immediately grasp its ultimate content and why we feel the way we do. Dewey compares the position the emotive impulsion has in artistic expression to a magnet that draws in certain material while rejecting others. The impulsion constitutes a kind of gathering principle of the artist’s work, for example explaining her choice of material and ways of using and working on them (AE: 75). In Dewey’s view, the act of expression is driven by the effort to find an appropriate fit between the impulsion and the outer material and involves a constant monitoring of the impact that the artistic decisions have on the development of the initial impulsion. Do they, for example, feed it, clarify it, or obscure it? In other words, “emotional energy” does “real work” in the build-up of artistic expression leading to the expressive object as it

evokes, assembles, accepts, and rejects memories, images, observations, and works them into a whole. (AE: 160)

This is why Dewey emphasizes that in artistic expression it is not just the external materials of marble, pigment, and words that undergo a change. Similar changes occur “on the side of ‘inner’ materials”, such as “images, observations, memories and emotions”; in the development of the expressive act they too receive a new form and structure (AE: 81).

From a Deweyan viewpoint, expression then means processing external material “through the alembic of personal experience”. However, the material itself belongs to “the common world and so has qualities in common with the material of other experiences”. Expression thereby organically connects “a personal act” and an “objective result” (AE: 88). The fact that in expression the artist’s personal experience is mediated through objective material opens the possibility for the audience to share the artist’s vision embodied in the work. An effort to communicate by these sorts of objective means is what turns the external material into a medium, that is, “an intermediary” between the artist and audience (AE: 201). But as the experience behind expression is “intensely individualized”, the work can also open for the public

new fields of experience and disclose new aspects and qualities in familiar scenes and objects. (AE: 149)

In Dewey’s view, communication in the arts, however, takes a different form than in the sciences for example: “science states meanings; art expresses them” (AE: 90). Like many other philosophers of art, Dewey emphasizes that artistic communication does not take place on the level of statements and propositional knowing. Aesthetic art, by contrast to science, constitutes an experience. Art’s manner of communicating is “evocative”: by rendering objective and physical material into an expressive medium, the artist seeks to evoke “the experience he or she wants the audience to have or reflect upon” (Stroud 2011: 105). The cognitive and the experiential sides of art are thereby seen to be very much intertwined in Dewey’s aesthetics.

2.6 Culture and Art’s Significance

Dewey’s take on culture also shows the moderate character of his aesthetic naturalism. He does not consider culture an illusory or in some other way irreal phenomenon, something that should be explained away by reducing it to natural reality. Dewey even finds it unfortunate how often the term “naturalism” has been wrongly thought “to signify a disregard of all values that cannot be reduced to the physical and animal” (AE: 156). In contrast, Dewey believes that humans are both natural and cultural creatures through and through and that the real challenge is to investigate how these two ineliminable sides of human life, nature and culture, are intertwined. Dewey, in fact, became so interested in this issue that he even had plans of naming his late philosophy “cultural naturalism” (Alexander 2013).

Dewey explains culture as a form of “emergence”, that is, culture is something that in time emerges from nature. In other words,

culture is the product not of efforts of men put forth in a void or just upon themselves, but of prolonged and cumulative interaction with environment. (AE: 34–35)

Nature and culture are two different layers of human life. The two key concepts in this instance are rhythm and ritual. Rhythm is for Dewey a fundamental feature of the world, whose existence in nature predates “poetry, painting, architecture and music” (AE: 147). He, again, refers to such rhythmic processes in nature as “dawn and sunset, day and night, rain and sunshine”, “the circular course of the seasons”, “the ever-recurring cycles of growth”, and “the never-ceasing round of births and deaths”, which he believes created a rhythmic space for human experience already from its very dawn. Dewey argues further that new layers emerged into human existence once humans no longer merely observed the rhythmic changes of nature but started to participate in them in the form of rituals and other communal gatherings. Humans came to use the rhythms of nature to celebrate their relationship with nature and to commemorate their most intense experiences. Dewey writes:

Experiences of war, of hunt, of sowing and reaping, of the death and resurrection of vegetation, of stars circling over watchful shepherds, of constant return of the inconstant moon, were undergone to be reproduced in pantomime and generated the sense of life as drama. (AE: 153)

With these rituals Dewey believes humans’ relationship to the surrounding world rose to a level where they started to reflect on their place in the order of things more intently. And the rituals formed in response to the cycles of nature started to embody the worldviews and values of the human groups that they gathered together. The rituals created a sense of community with one’s immediate fellows, as well as a sense of continuity of past generations, thereby widening and enriching “the designs of living” (AE: 29). In Dewey’s view, these rituals were “esthetic”, but they were “also more than esthetic”, for

each of these communal modes of activity united the practical, the social, and the educative in an integrated whole having esthetic form. (AE: 330–331)

Culture is, then, for Dewey something “situated” as well as “situating” (Alexander 2013: 13).

An important value that Dewey sees in art is related to these communal sides of experience. Although Dewey believes each culture is held together by its own individuality, it is still possible to create continuity and community between cultures by expanding experience to absorb the attitudes and values of other cultures. In the end, Dewey regards works of art as

the only media of complete and unhindered communication between man and man that can occur in a world full of gulfs and walls that limit community of experience. (AE: 110)

For example,

barriers are dissolved, limiting prejudices melt away, when we enter into the spirit of Negro and Polynesian art. (AE: 337)

As a result of such engagements we start to “learn to hear” with someone else’s “ears” and “see” with someone else’s “eyes”. Works of art are, then, for Dewey “the most intimate and energetic means of aiding individuals to share in the arts of living” (AE: 339).

There has been considerable discussion in aesthetics whether art has intrinsic value or whether its value is dependent on some external goal it helps to fulfill. Dewey rejects the dichotomy, because he thinks talk of art’s utilitarian aspects tends to involve a too narrow conception of utility. The utility of an artwork is different in kind from the utility of an umbrella or a mower. While these and similar utilitarian objects serve “a particular and limited end”, an artwork “serves life”, for example by carrying us to “a refreshed attitude toward the circumstances and exigencies of ordinary experience” (AE: 140, 144). Artworks can serve life through their evocative function; they can raise experiences that educate us. Dewey also emphasizes how the work of the artwork does not end at the close of the immediate experience, but “continues to operate in indirect channels” (AE: 144).

Like all important experiences, our engagements with artworks can also lead to what Philip Jackson calls “experiential growth” (Jackson 1998: 111). Here Jackson follows Dewey’s notion of growth, which is central to his philosophy of education. The idea of growth is also related to Dewey’s naturalist underpinnings; when the organism overcomes some problematic situation, there is at least some minimal degree of growth. The organism learns something and can use the experience in new circumstances in the future. Growth, in other words is, for Dewey,

essentially the ability to learn from experience; the power to retain from one experience something which is of avail in coping with the difficulties of a later situation. (DE: 49)

Through the different types of experiences artworks can evoke, art too can be an important source of this sort of growth. This is why Dewey thinks we should feel a similar type of respect toward “the creators” of perceptive artworks as we do toward “the inventors of microscopes and microphones”; in both cases we are dealing with artefacts, which can train us in new modes of perception and “open new objects to be observed and enjoyed” (EN: 293).

3. Critical Reactions

Criticism of Dewey’s aesthetics dates from even before Art as Experience. Curt Ducasse (1929), for example, believed that Dewey’s instrumentalism generates a strange theory which holds that human life is a matter of tool-making, all tools are essentially tools for tool-making, and only satisfactions arising from tool-making should be acknowledged (see Alexander 1998). He also criticized Dewey for not allowing for meaningless satisfactions and anarchistic pleasures. Aesthetic perception of colors and tones as such does not need any presence of meaning; nor does appreciation of rainbows or sunsets. Meaning also need not be present in things of pure design. He agreed with Schopenhauer, contra Dewey, that aesthetic contemplation requires not attending to meanings. Also, because the creation of art may on occasion occur in one stroke, it too can be without meaning. Further, it is only by accident that the feeling expressed in the creation of art is due to the perceived situation. Emotions are not always responses to concrete situations and many emotions are about nothing. Artistic expression of emotion should be distinguished from utilitarian expression. It is only the latter that deals with the object of emotion.

Another early critic, Edna Shearer (1935a), thought that Dewey buried art under extraneous ethical and political considerations. She rejected the idea that all life ought to be like art in combining the consummatory and the instrumental. Dewey’s desire to overcome the means/ends distinction is also problematic since a work of art does not seriously contain as ingredients the process that led to its production. The perfect amalgamation of means and ends is utopian. Further, toil just cannot be eliminated from society or from the creative process.

Art as Experience early on had the misfortune of receiving two reviews that negatively impacted its reception. The first, by an avowed follower, Stephen Pepper, complained that it was not truly pragmatist and that Dewey had reverted to an earlier Hegelianism (Pepper 1939). The second, by Benedetto Croce, seemed to confirm this (Croce 1948). Croce, widely seen as Hegelian himself, saw so many similarities between Dewey’s work and his own that he accused Dewey of lifting his ideas. Dewey (1948) insisted otherwise, but the sense that there was something too Hegelian in Art as Experience remained. This did not stop many philosophers, educators, and other intellectuals from producing works in aesthetic theory that were strongly influenced by Dewey. Even before Art as Experience Dewey’s writings on aesthetics and art influenced, and were influenced by, such writers as Mary Mullen (1923), who taught seminars on aesthetics and was Associate Director of Education for the Barnes Foundation; Lawrence Buermeyer (1924), who was another Associate Director of Education at the Barnes Foundation; Albert Barnes himself (1928); and Thomas Munro (1928). After the book’s publication his followers included Irwin Edman (1939), Stephen Pepper (1939, 1945, 1953), Horace Kallen (1942), Thomas Munro again (numerous books) and Van Meter Ames (1947, 1953). Art historian Meyer Schapiro was one of his students.

After the publication of Art as Experience there emerged a long chain of both criticism and defense. Eliseo Vivas (1937) argued that Dewey holds two theories about the emotions’ role in aesthetic experience, one that the esthetic object arouses emotion in the spectator, and the other that the content of meaning of art, objectively speaking, is emotion. But, he argued, experimental aesthetics has shown that emotion is an accidental consequence of aesthetic apprehension, and so should not be included in its definition. The same aesthetic object can arouse different emotional reactions in different spectators. Some trained persons in music even deny that adequate aesthetic experience involves emotion. Dewey also has not given an explanation of the means by which the object expresses emotion. Vivas himself defined aesthetic experience in terms of rapt attention involving apprehension of the object’s immanent meanings.

In a second article (Vivas 1938), he asked: Are emotions attached to the material? How is this consistent with the idea that emotion is not expressed in the object? And how are these ideas consistent with the idea that emotion is aroused in the spectator? Vivas insisted that not all art arouses emotion in everyone who has effective intercourse with it. Music, for sophisticated listeners, is often not suggestive of emotions. When we find “sadness” in music we would do better to call it an objective character of the music than an emotion. Another problem for Dewey: if the self disappears in experience then how can the object arouse emotion in the self or have emotion attached to it? Also, if the self disappears into harmony, how can there be the kind of disharmony associated with emotion?

We have already mentioned Pepper’s objection that Dewey’s theory is not sufficiently pragmatic (Pepper 1939). His specific objection was that Dewey’s views were eclectic, incorporating elements both of pragmatism and of Hegelian organicism. Pepper believed that both theories, as well as formalism, can be valuable when taken separately, but that the mixture in Dewey hurts pragmatism. Pepper identified organicism with the view that the ultimate reality is The Absolute. Dewey replied (1939) that he had based his aesthetic theory on examination of the subject-matter and not on any a priori theory. Words he used, such as “coherence”, “whole”, “integration”, and “complete”, were intended to have meaning consistent with his pragmatic empiricism and did not by themselves indicate a commitment to idealism. Moreover, it was one of his main points that although these terms were applicable to aesthetic matters they could not, contra the idealists, be extended to the world as a whole. The terms had a special sense applying only to experiences as aesthetic. Dewey rejected any theory of a great cosmic harmony associated with the Hegelian notion of the Absolute.

In a later work, Pepper (1945) agreed with Dewey that each reading of a poem brings a new experience, but thought that, since there is also identity of context that can make the differences minor, we can speak of an identical quality running through the different situations. Pepper had many positive things to say about Dewey’s “contextualism” (his word for pragmatism in aesthetics), but he insisted that there is much more permanence of aesthetic values in the world than Dewey would admit. A great work of art may be appreciated as long as the physical work exists and someone exists to perceive it, and insofar as it appeals to common instincts, it may appeal to people of varied cultures.

Isabel Creed (1945) complained that Dewey leaves no place for works that celebrate equilibrium achieved, or for works that result from the artist playing around with the medium. Nor does Dewey explain accidentally encountered aesthetic experiences of natural objects. She thought, contra Dewey, that struggle with our environment is not necessary for aesthetic experience.

Croce, mentioned earlier, rightly pointed out many similarities between his own and Dewey’s thought (Croce 1948). There were, however, still three points of serious contention: (1) Croce placed significantly more importance on the universality of art than Dewey, (2) he still insisted that the material of art consists not of external things but of internal sentiments of human passions: a characteristically idealist position that Dewey vehemently rejected, and (3) whereas he believed that art gives knowledge of a higher reality, Dewey did not. Croce asserted that Dewey is still arguing against Hegelians of his youth who held, for example, to a notion of “the Absolute”, which Croce had rejected. Dewey (1948), in responding to Croce, argued that the list of shared beliefs Croce mentioned in his review were just ideas widely familiar to aestheticians. He thought that because of Croce’s idealism there can be no common ground of discussion between them. In return, Croce (1952) argued that Dewey is too wedded to empiricism and pragmatism and that it is only because Dewey, contrary to his own claims, is committed to a kind of dualism, that he cannot understand Croce’s identification of intuition and expression or recognize how similar Croce’s view is to his own. Frederic Simoni (1952) argued that neither Croce nor Dewey was Hegelian in the sense of believing in the Absolute. George Douglas (1970) agreed with Simoni, finding many similarities between Dewey and Croce. However, Douglas did agree with Pepper (1939) that Dewey never reconciled the pragmatist and historicist (Hegelian) dimensions of his thought (cf. Vittorio 2012, Copenhaver 2017).

Patrick Romanell (1949) held that Croce and Dewey at least share the view that art is about aesthetic experience. However, Dewey’s definition of the subject matter of philosophy of art as aesthetic experience (which treats it as a special type of experience) is inconsistent with his definition of it as the aesthetic phase of experience. Also, when Dewey speaks of aesthetic experience he is not functionalist and is not consistent with his pragmatism. Dewey should have held that just as there is no such thing as religious experience, there is no such thing as aesthetic experience. Dewey (1950) replied that every normally complete experience is aesthetic in its consummatory phase, that the arts and their experience are developments of this primary phase, and that there is nothing inconsistent in this. Where Romanell saw incompatibility Dewey saw continuity of development. Van Meter Ames (1953), however, defended Dewey against critics up to this point in time.

George Boas (1953) argued that Dewey yearns for universality in art where none can be found. He believed that Dewey wrongly takes the term “art” to have only one meaning where it has many. Moreover, while some art communicates, other art conceals: it is wrong to say that all art, or even that all great art, communicates universally. Also, not everyone who practices art is interested in communion and democracy. Some art is intended for communion with God, not with humanity; some art is intended for communion with no one but the artist him or herself.

One of the leading aestheticians of the time, Susanne Langer (1953) saw pragmatism in general, and Dewey in particular, as guilty of psychologism and therefore unable to deal with the issues that really challenge aestheticians. Pragmatism’s assumption is that all human interests are manifestations of drives motivated by animal needs, thus reducing human to animal psychology. Aesthetic values are thereby interpreted either as direct satisfactions or as instrumental to fulfilling psychological needs, making artistic experience no different from ordinary experience. This misses the essence of art, what makes it as important as science or religion. Whereas Dewey held that there is no essential difference between art experience and ordinary experience Langer thought that the appreciative attitude toward art is not at all like that toward a new car or a beautiful morning. But Felicia Kruse (2007) argued that Langer misinterpreted Dewey on several points and was actually much closer to Dewey than she thought.

In the 1950s there was an analytic revolution in English-speaking aesthetics. Prior aesthetic theories were considered to be too speculative and unclear. Dewey’s work was caught up in this condemnation. Arnold Isenberg, for instance, in a founding document of analytic aesthetics, originally published in 1950, dismissed Art as Experience as a “hodgepodge of conflicting methods and undisciplined speculations”, (1950 [1987: 128]) although he found it full of profound suggestions. Dewey’s theories of expression and creativity were particular targets of analytic attack. His was among the views singled out in a general critique of expression as a defining characteristic of art, although often his own distinctive theory was ignored in the process. A situation followed, and continued well into the 1980s, in which, according to one editor of The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Dewey’s aesthetics was virtually ignored (Fisher 1989). While Monroe Beardsley, one of the most important late twentieth century aestheticians, kept an interest in Dewey alive (1958, 1975, 1982), particularly in his discussions of aesthetic experience, other major figures, including Arthur Danto, Mary Mothersill and Richard Wollheim, completely ignored him. Nelson Goodman may be a partial exception (Freeland 2001). He certainly shared with Dewey a conviction that art and science are close in many ways. And, like Dewey, he replaced the question “what is art?” with “when is art?” They also both took a naturalist approach to the arts. However, Goodman, who never refers to Dewey in his Languages of Art (1976), saw art in terms of languages and other symbol systems, whereas Dewey saw it in terms of experience.

Edward Ballard (1957), in a move characteristic of the rise of analytic philosophy in aesthetics, asserted that Dewey rejects many distinctions that are necessary for philosophy, and that this leads to a kind of irrationalism which results in his depending on problematic metaphors like “funding” and “energy”. He thought Dewey’s avoidance of specific techniques in forming theories, for example the technique of formal definition, to be anti-intellectual. Dewey’s rejection of universals as illusions and his enthusiastic acceptance of nominalism must ultimately fail, for theory requires logically inter-related propositions that refer to concepts.

Charles Gauss (1960), like Pepper before him, protested that Dewey’s organicism in Art as Experience disconnects from his earlier pragmatism. Pragmatism, unlike organicism, focuses on interaction with a background that is partially inorganic. Also, contra Dewey, he maintained that aesthetic enjoyment is not a particular kind of enjoyment, but enjoyment of aesthetic characteristics.

Marshall Cohen (1977, originally 1965) complained, also in the analytic vein, about the vagueness of Dewey’s terms. He especially wondered whether unity can really distinguish aesthetic from non-aesthetic experience. He reasoned that the experience of being badly beaten can have as much unity as hearing a sonata. Moreover, aesthetic experience can often have the discontinuous character that Dewey ascribes only to practical experience.

Contemporary American aesthetician Arnold Berleant began his career (1970) in a way that was much more sympathetic to Dewey. He has, in his many writings, developed themes similar to Dewey’s, for example, in his concepts of the “aesthetic field” and “engagement” (1970; 1991). His work on the aesthetics of the environment had a strong influence on the recently emergent field of everyday aesthetics which we will discuss below.

By contrast, Roger Scruton (1974) objected mainly to Dewey’s naturalism. He interpreted Dewey as insisting that aesthetic need must underlie all our interest in art, and believed that Dewey fails to capture what we mean when we say that we are interested in a picture “for its own sake”. Needs can be satisfied by many objects but one cannot substitute pictures for one another. Unlike animal need, interest in a picture involves thought of its object. As a political conservative, Scruton has been opposed to Dewey’s views on education. However, his work on architecture (Scruton 1979), with its emphasis on context, unity, functionalism, and the relations between architecture and everyday aesthetics, is remarkably similar to Dewey’s views about art in general, although Dewey’s name is never mentioned.

John McDermott (1976), one of the leaders of the American Philosophy tradition in the later part of the twentieth century, followed Dewey in arguing that all experience is potentially aesthetic, where the aesthetic sensibility refers to how we feel about our situation. Art today leads us to life. In order to achieve consummatory experience we need to cooperate with our environment.

Although Monroe Beardsley (1982) often spoke positively of Dewey’s notion of aesthetic experience, he thought that Dewey was obsessed with the dangers of dualism and that he talked about “separation” in a misleading way. Dewey thinks the practices of hanging paintings in special buildings would deny continuity between art and life. Yet Beardsley sees no real problem here, for people who see a painting in a museum bring their culture with them. Also, against Dewey’s stress on continuity, Beardsley thought that discontinuity in nature and in culture is required for the emergence of genuine novelty in art. As opposed to Dewey, Beardsley stressed the ways in which art is independent, relatively self-sufficient, and autonomous to a degree. Alan Goldman (2005) argued that Beardsley borrows too much from Dewey’s obscure discussion of experience, but articulates better than Dewey the idea that aesthetic experience is a matter of complete engagement of our faculties with both instrumental and intrinsic benefits. More recently, Goldman (2013) has developed what he calls “the broad view of aesthetic experience”, whose similarities to Dewey’s view he readily acknowledges.

Joseph Margolis (1980) is perhaps the most important contemporary aesthetician coming out of the analytic school to take Dewey seriously, having a natural affinity to pragmatist ways of thought. His idea that works of art are culturally emergent but physically embodied entities is Deweyan in spirit, as is his insistence on a robust relativist theory of interpretation. However, Margolis seldom refers to Dewey and, although he believes himself closer to Dewey’s “Hegelianism” than to Peirce’s “Kantianism”, he finds Peirce more interesting. He also faults Dewey for not being an historicist (1999).

The relative lack of interest in Dewey changed for several reasons in the late 1970s. First, Richard Rorty turned analytic philosophy on its head by advocating a return to pragmatism (Rorty 1979, 1982). In this, Dewey was one of his avowed heroes. Unfortunately, Rorty was not a close reader of Dewey’s aesthetics.

Dewey’s aesthetics finally received an excellent exposition in the work of Thomas Alexander (1987). Alexander developed his ideas further in a book on eco-ontology and the aesthetics of existence (2013). Mark Johnson, in a project inspired by cognitive science, drew on Dewey’s anti-dualism to develop a theory of the aesthetics of human understanding (2007, 2018). Meanwhile, there has been a steady interest in Dewey’s aesthetics in the philosophy of education, with articles appearing on a regular basis in such publications as the Journal of Aesthetic Education and Studies in the Philosophy of Education and several books (Jackson 1998, Garrison 1997, Greene 2001, Maslak 2006, Granger 2006). Ueno (2015) continued in this tradition, stressing the importance of aesthetics in Dewey’s theory of democracy and education during a period of urbanization and industrialization.

Dewey’s renewed influence was due in part to increased interest in various continental aestheticians. The similarities between Dewey and Maurice Merleau-Ponty are the most striking (Ames 1953, Kestenbaum 1977), but he also shares certain features with Hans-Georg Gadamer (Gilmour 1987, who also notes important differences, and Jeannot 2001). Given his critique of capitalism, one can also find connections between his thinking and that of Marxist aestheticians, particularly Theodor Adorno (Lysaker 1998), although there are important differences, especially where Adorno advocates the autonomy of art while Dewey stresses continuity (Lewis 2005, Eldridge 2010).

There has also been some work on marked similarities between Dewey’s aesthetic thought and that of Taoism (Grange 2001), Transcendental Meditation (Zigler 1982), Dogen’s version of Zen (Earls 1992), the great Indian aesthetician Abhinavagupta (Mathur 1981), the Bhagavad-Gita (Stroud 2009), and Confucius (Shusterman 2009, Man 2007, Mullis 2005, Grange 2004). Alexander has recently discussed relations between Dewey and Eastern aesthetics generally (Alexander 2009).

As mentioned earlier, many attacks on Dewey focused on his views on expression. Tormey (1986) for example chided Dewey for assuming that an artist is always expressing something and that the expressive qualities in the work are the result of that act. He thought that Dewey wrongly abandons the distinction between voluntary and involuntary expression, and in doing so, undermines paradigmatic examples of expressive behavior. A work of art may possess expressive qualities of sadness but this is not necessarily the intended consequence of the productive activity of the artist. For Alan Tormey, the artist is not expressing him or herself: he/she is simply making an expressive object. Michael Mitias (1992) defended Dewey against these criticisms.

David Novitz (1992), who approved of Dewey’s ideas that art derives from experiences of everyday life and that the artistic process infuses our daily lives, questioned the idea that fine art always embodies consummatory or unified experiences. He thought Dewey has an idealized view of art that borrows from the very aestheticist theories he criticizes. Further, Dewey does not sufficiently question the boundaries of art.

Richard Shusterman (1992, etc., see bibliography) is the most widely known advocate of Dewey’s pragmatist aesthetics. He especially emphasized the possibilities of treating popular art as fine art with his well-known example of rap as fine art. He also extended aesthetics into the realm of everyday life with his concept of “somaesthetics” (2012). Shusterman strikingly contrasted Dewey’s approach to that of analytic aesthetics. Like Dewey, he stressed the idea that art and aesthetics are both culturally and philosophically central. Some of his most trenchant comments involved similarities between Dewey’s thought and that of such continental thinkers as Foucault and Adorno. However he also had his criticisms of Dewey. He took Dewey to be redefining art in terms of aesthetic experience, which he believed to be too slippery a concept to explain much. Moreover, he asserted that although Dewey has much to say about aesthetic experience, Dewey also holds that it is indefinable, and this leads to problems with its being a criterion of value in art. On the other hand, Shusterman thought that Dewey sees defining art in terms of experience as a matter of getting us to have more and better experiences with art, and not of giving a definition in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. So, although he doubted that philosophical theory can redefine art, he suspected Dewey is not trying to do this anyway. Moreover, he thought it not only possible but valuable to make less dramatic classificatory changes, as for example in legitimating rock music as fine art. He believed that whereas Dewey sought a global redefinition of art, he was simply trying to remedy certain limitations in art practice. Later, he said that much art fails to generate Dewey’s aesthetic experience (Shusterman 2000). He also observed that art cannot be redefined to be equivalent to aesthetic experience, as we are hardly going to reclassify an incredible experience of a sunset as art. Shusterman also insisted on the value of aesthetic experiences that are fragmented and ruptured, contrary to Dewey’s emphasis on unity, and noted that Dewey neglected the possibility of lingering reflection after moments of consummation (Shusterman 2004). Paul C. Taylor addressed Shusterman’s criticism of Dewey as trying to find a definition of art arguing that Dewey provides

a very different kind of definition, one offered in full view of its sociohistorical contingency and pragmatic fuzziness. (Taylor 2002: 24)

This strand of pro-Deweyan thinking was also pursued by Crispin Sartwell in response to multi-culturalism and everyday aesthetics (Sartwell 1995, 2003). In the later instance Sartwell connected everyday aesthetics to Dewey in the ideas that art arises from non-art activities and that the domain of aesthetics goes well beyond the fine arts.

Some contemporary feminist aestheticians have noted that Dewey shares many of their concerns, for example their rejection of mind/body dualism, their democratic instincts, their contextualism, and their tendency to break down traditional distinctions (Seigfried 1996, Duran 2001). Charlene Seigfried found several aspects in Dewey’s thought that may enrich feminist exploration of women’s experiences, including his antidualism, his perspectivalism, his working from concrete experience, his emphasis on the role of feeling in experience, his stress on doing and making, and his attack on the division between practice and theory. However, she noted that Dewey neglected sexism in his analysis, and sometimes made sexist assumptions.

Noël Carroll (2001) thought that Dewey’s theory of art fails to cover many contemporary works which then act as counterexamples to his definition of art as experience. For example, as Rothko’s paintings can overwhelm us at one shot, their experience may not have Dewey’s requisite development and closure. Carroll also thought that the view that experiences of art must be unified is too narrow. Cage’s 4′33″, which Carroll takes to obviously be a work of art, does not consummate or have qualitative unity. Finally, he thought that if experiences of everyday dispersion can be aesthetic then Dewey’s distinction between “an experience” and disconnected daily experience dissolves. This might be contrasted to Philip Jackson’s (1998) defense of Dewey against similar criticisms, especially with respect to Cage’s 4′33″ which he saw as fitting Dewey’s definition nicely. For Jackson, it is the experience that requires unity, not the physical product.

George Dickie (2001) said that Dewey sets forth an expression theory of art without any supporting argument. Lumping Dewey with Collingwood, he thought such theorists place art in the same domain with the growl of a dog with a bone. They made the creation of art like the bowerbird’s production of bowers, i.e., a result of innate natures without a plan in mind. For Dickie, expression of emotion is neither sufficient nor necessary for defining art. He thought these theories wrongly hold that psychological mechanisms in human nature are sufficient for the production of art, as if the production of artworks is teleologically determined by such.

In her popular introductory textbook, Cynthia Freeland (2001) observed that Dewey held that art is the best window to another culture, that it is a universal language, and that we should try to experience another culture as from within since barriers and prejudices can melt away when we enter into the spirit of another culture’s art. Although this universalism seems similar to Clive Bell’s formalism, Freeland noted that for Dewey art is defined not as form but as expression of the life of a community. She thought, however, that we must also know many external facts about the community, and that we must recognize that no culture is homogeneous: there may not be one viewpoint in a culture. She also gave a positive nod to Dewey’s call for a revolution in which the values leading to intelligent enjoyment of art are incorporated into our social relations. Finally, she classified Dewey’s aesthetics as a cognitive theory since it focuses on art’s role in helping people to perceive and manipulate reality. Thus she found continuity between Dewey’s and Goodman’s approaches to art as a kind of language.

Dewey’s thought in aesthetics has also sometimes been brought to bear in analysis of other aspects of his philosophy. Noteworthy is the ethical work of Gregory Pappas (2008), especially his chapter titled “The Intelligent, Aesthetic, and Democratic Way of Life”. Here he discusses Dewey’s aesthetic notion of balance as it applies to ethics. Mark Johnson (1994) and Steven Fesmire (2003) also introduce Dewey’s aesthetic theories into discussion of ethics. Scott Stroud (2011), previously mentioned, further develops the Deweyan idea of moral self-cultivation, while Nathan Crick (2010) applies Dewey’s aesthetic ideas to a conception of rhetoric as an art which in a democracy promotes freedom.

Recently there have been lively debates over the Deweyan tradition in the aesthetics of everyday life. Most of the contestants are inspired by Dewey’s valuation of everyday aesthetic experience but depart from him in various ways. Sherri Irvin (2008a) has argued that the fragmented character of everyday aesthetic experiences might, contra Dewey’s emphasis on consummation, be what gives them their distinctive quality. She goes so far as to assert that even scratching an itch can be aesthetically appreciated (Irvin 2008b). Glenn Parsons and Allen Carlson (2008) contend that, although Dewey’s aesthetic theory may seem particularly appropriate to appreciating everyday objects since we interact with them in a more intimate and multi-sensory way than with art objects, this approach, shared by Korsmeyer (1999), Brady (2005), Leddy (2005, 2012), Shusterman (2006, 2012), and Saito (2007), fails to honor traditional distinctions between aesthetic and mere “bodily” pleasures. They might have also mentioned Glenn Kuehn (2005) who takes an explicitly Deweyan approach to the aesthetics of food, and Katya Mandoki (2007) who takes Dewey as one source of her everyday aesthetics. They think it wrong that the pleasures of taking a bath, for example, could be considered aesthetic. Rather, the objects of everyday aesthetics should be appreciated mainly for their functional beauty (pleasures of the proximal senses are not aesthetic, although they may still add some value to the overall experience), and knowledge of the function of everyday objects is required for their appropriate appreciation. Brian Soucek (2009) and Christopher Dowling (2010) raise criticisms against everyday aesthetics along similar lines. However, Kalle Puolakka (2014, 2015, 2017, 2018) defends a Deweyan approach to everyday aesthetics drawing on Dewey’s theory of imagination and on recent work on Dewey and moral imagination.

Dewey continues to have influence with respect to particular art forms. For example David Clowney and Robert Rawlins (2014) use Dewey to argue that risk-taking and showmanship are integral to music as performed, and Aili Bresnahan (2014) develops a Deweyan theory of performing arts practice with a special view to dance.

A significant recent development in philosophical aesthetics has been the placing of more attention on biology. Along these lines, Alva Noë (2015) has taken a markedly Deweyan stance in discussion of art as strange tools. He writes that although we can take seeing as something that happens in the head, it is, in “Dewey’s image, a transaction of doing and undergoing” (Noë 2015: 78). He agrees with Dewey that lives are not made up of a series of sensations, but are

composed of experiences that demand to be named—that dinner in Venice… [etc.]. (2015: 113)

Most notably, he takes a quote from Dewey about how the existence of works of art has become an obstruction to a theory about them as an epigraph to his book. He ends his book by noting that in Dewey’s view we are all artists since we are all engaged in making experiences. And yet,

true artists don’t only make experiences. They make objects… that afford the opportunity for integral experience. (2015: 205)

It is a mark of the endurance and power of Dewey’s aesthetic theory that it has been so frequently criticized and defended from so many different angles. Although many of these criticisms rest on an incomplete or distorted understanding of Dewey’s thought, there are also many that should be answered by anyone who seeks to carry on Dewey’s legacy.

4. Wider Cultural Relevance

Dewey was ahead of his time in his devotion to multiculturalism. The selection of illustrations Dewey chose for Art as Experience included Pueblo Indian pottery, Bushmen rock-painting, Scythian ornament, and African sculpture, as well as works by El Greco, Renoir, Cezanne and Matisse. He was interested in traditional and folk arts in Mexico, admiring the designs of the rural schools over those of the cities (1926). He was also associated, mainly through Barnes, with African-American culture. Barnes was invited to write a chapter for The New Negro edited by Alain Locke (Locke 1925). The New Negro was one of the founding documents of the Harlem Renaissance. The students in Dewey’s and Barnes’ first experimental classes in art education were mainly from the black working class. Barnes collected African-American art and also encouraged African-American students to study at the Barnes Foundation. African-American painter and illustrator Aaron Douglas, who came to the foundation in 1927, studied in Paris in 1931 under a Foundation fellowship (Jubilee 1982). Barnes also had a long association with Lincoln University, a historically black college, many students of which studied at the Barnes Foundation (Hollingsworth 1994). Dewey was one of the founding members of the NAACP (National Association for the Advancement of Colored People) and one of the sixty signatories to the 1909 “Call” for a National Conference to Address Racial Inequality, a founding document for the NAACP (Library of Congress [Other Internet Resources]).

Dewey also sought to promote cross-cultural understanding through his founding of the China Institute in New York City in 1926. The China Institute, which continues today, advertises itself as the only institution in that city to focus solely on Chinese civilization, art and culture. Hu Shih, a student of Dewey’s at Columbia and one of the leading figures in the creation of the Institute, invited him to Peking in 1919 (Yong Ho 2004 [Other Internet Resources]).

Although Dewey was widely versed in literature, architecture, painting, sculpture, and the theater, he was relatively uneducated in music, and he was said to be tone-deaf. Yet he often had insightful things to say about music, and many musicians and music educators have drawn inspiration from his theory (e.g., Zeltner 1975). Unfortunately, he did not discuss photography or film as separate art forms.

Many writers complain that Dewey showed little interest in the avant-garde art of his time (for example, Eldridge 2010). It is true that Cubism, Dadaism and Surrealism play no role in his writing, and his theory seems to actually preclude Non-objective painting (Jacobson 1960), although he does speak positively of abstract art. Nor did he refer much to such innovative poets as T.S. Eliot and Ezra Pound. Although this may indicate a conservative approach to the arts, he nonetheless had considerable influence on various innovative art movements both in his own time and later. Perhaps most significantly, the director of the Federal Art Project from 1935–1943, Holger Cahill, was a Dewey follower (Mavigliano 1984). Amongst painters, Thomas Hart Benton, the regionalist realist, was an early convert to his philosophy. Dewey was also on the board of the influential Black Mountain College, which had students such as Merce Cunningham and John Cage. Josef Albers, an important painting teacher there, was first influenced by Dewey’s educational theory and later by his aesthetics (Gosse 2012).

In Mexico, Escuelas de Pintura al Aire Libre, or open-air painting schools, began during the Mexican Revolution and achieved an established structure under the government of Alvaro Obregon (1920–24). They were promoted by Alfredo Ramos Martinez, who was inspired by Dewey.

Turning to late twentieth century artists, Dewey’s influence on Abstract Expressionism was especially strong (Buettner 1975, Berube 1998). For example, Robert Motherwell, who studied Art as Experience when he was a philosophy major at Stanford, considered it to be one of his bibles (Berube 1998). Donald Judd, the Minimalist sculptor, read and admired Dewey (Raskin 2010). Earth Art, with its emphasis on getting art out of the museum, might even be seen as applied Dewey. There is also reason to believe that Allan Kaprow, one of the originators of Happenings and Performance Art, read Dewey and drew on his ideas (Kelley 2003). Although one author has argued that contemporary Body Art has moved away from the integrated consummated aesthetic experience Dewey commends (Jay 2002), another argues that Dewey anticipates this movement (Brodsky 2002).


Primary Sources

Most of John Dewey’s works are collected to the thirty-seven volume critical edition The Collected Works of John Dewey, 1882–1953, edited by Jo Ann Boydston (Southern Illinois University Press, 1969–1991). The citations to Dewey’s major works are to the electronic edition of The Collected Works, which preserves the pagination of the print edition. The Collected Works of John Dewey, 1882–1953, edited by Larry A. Hickman (InteLex Corporation, 1996).

  • [EW] 1967, The Early Works, 1882–1898, 5 volumes.
  • [MW] 1976, The Middle Works, 1899–1924, 15 volumes.
  • [LW] 1981, The Later Works, 1925–1953, 17 volumes.

Other abbreviations of Dewey’s works cited in the text:

  • [PS] 1887, Psychology, New York: Harper & Brothers; reprinted in EW 2.
  • [DE] 1916, Democracy and Education. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Education, New York: Macmillan; reprinted in MW 9. [DE 1916 available online]
  • [RP] 1920, Reconstructions in Philosophy, New York: H. Holt and Company; reprinted in MW 12.
  • [EN] 1925, Experience and Nature, Chicago: Open Court; reprinted in LW 1.
  • [PP] 1927, The Public and its Problems, New York: H. Holt and Company; reprinted in LW 2.
  • [AE] 1934, Art as Experience, New York: Minton, Balch & Co.; reprinted in LW 10.

Other works by Dewey cited in the text:

  • 1926, “Mexico’s Educational Renaissance”, The New Republic, 48(616): 116–117; reprinted in LW 2: 199–205.
  • 1931, “Qualitative Thought”, in Philosophy and Civilization, New York: G. P. Putnam’s Sons, 93–106; reprinted in LW 3: 243–262.
  • 1939, “Experience, Knowledge and Value: A Rejoinder”, in The Philosophy of John Dewey, P. Schilpp (ed.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University, 517–608; reprinted in LW 13: 3–90. (See 15–19 for his response to Pepper.)
  • 1948, “A Comment on the Foregoing Criticisms”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 6(3): 207–209. doi: 10.2307/426477; reprinted in LW 15: 97–100. Reply to Croce 1948.
  • 1950, “Aesthetic Experience as a Primary Phase and as an Artistic Development”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 9(1): 56–58. doi: 10.2307/426103; reprinted in LW 16: 195–198.

Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Thomas M., 1987, John Dewey’s Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature: The Horizon of Feeling, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • –––, 1998, “The Art of Life: Dewey’s Aesthetics”, in Reading Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation, Larry A. Hickman (ed.), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1–22.
  • –––, 2009, “The Music in the Heart, the Way of Water, and the Light of a Thousand Suns: A Response to Richard Shusterman, Crispin Sartwell, and Scott Stroud”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 43(1): 41–58. doi:10.1353/jae.0.0028
  • –––, 2013, The Human Eros: Eco-Ontology and the Aesthetics of Existence, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Aldrich, Virgil C., 1944, “John Dewey’s Use of Language”, The Journal of Philosophy, 41(10): 261–271. doi:10.2307/2019375
  • –––, 1963, Philosophy of Art, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Allie, Eric and Jean-Claude Bonne, 2007, “Matisse with Dewey and Deleuze”, R. Winkler (trans.), Pli: The Warwick Journal of Philosophy, 18: 1–19.
  • Ames, Van Meter, 1947, “Expression and Aesthetic Expression”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 6(2): 172–179. doi:10.2307/426285
  • –––, 1953, “John Dewey as Aesthetician”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 12(2): 145–168. doi:10.2307/426869
  • Ballard, Edward G., 1957, Art and Analysis: An Essay Toward a Theory of Aesthetics, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Barnes, Albert C., 1928, The Art in Painting, New York: Harcourt, Brace and Co.
  • Batteux, Charles, 1746, Les Beaux Arts réduits á un même principe, Paris: Durand; translated as The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle, James O. Young (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015. doi:10.1093/actrade/
  • Beardsley, Monroe C., 1958, Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism, New York: Harcourt, Brace.
  • –––, 1975, Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History, New York: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1982, The Aesthetic Point of View: Selected Essays, Michael J. Wreen and Donald M. Callen (eds.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Bell, Clive, 1914, Art, London: Chatto and Windus; reprinted in 1958, New York: Capricorn Books. [Bell 1914 available online]
  • Berleant, Arnold, 1970, The Aesthetic Field: A Phenomenology of Aesthetic Experience, Springfield, IL: Charles C. Thomas.
  • –––, 1991, Art and Engagement, Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Living in the Landscape: Toward an Aesthetics of Environment, Lawrence, KS: University Press of Kansas.
  • Berube, Maurice R., 1998, “John Dewey and the Abstract Expressionists”, Educational Theory, 48(2): 211–227. doi:10.1111/j.1741-5446.1998.00211.x
  • Boas, George, 1953, “Communication in Dewey’s Aesthetics”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 12(2): 177–183. doi:10.2307/426871
  • Brady, Emily, 2005, “Sniffing and Savoring: The Aesthetics of Smells and Tastes”, in Light and Smith 2005: 156–176.
  • Bresnahan, Aili, 2014, “Toward A Deweyan Theory of Ethical and Aesthetic Performing Arts Practice”, Journal of Aesthetics and Phenomenology, 1(2): 133–148. doi:10.2752/205393214X14083775794871
  • Brodsky, Joyce, 2002, “How to ‘See’ with the Whole Body”, Visual Studies, 17(2): 99–112. doi:10.1080/1472586022000032189
  • Buermeyer, Lawrence, 1924, The Aesthetic Experience, Merion, PA: Barnes Foundation Press; second edition, 1929.
  • Buettner, Stewart, 1975, “John Dewey and the Visual Arts in America”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 33(4): 383–391. doi:10.2307/429650
  • Carroll, Noël, 2001, “Four Concepts of Aesthetic Experience”, in his Beyond Aesthetics: Philosophical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 41–62.
  • Clowney, David and Robert Rawlins, 2014, “Pushing the Limits: Risk and Accomplishment in Musical Performance”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 12: art. 15.
  • Cohen, Marshall, 1965 [1977], “Aesthetic Essence”, in Philosophy in America, Max Black (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 115–133; reprinted in 1977, Aesthetics: A Critical Anthology, George Dickie and Richard J. Sclafani (eds), New York: St. Martin’s Press, 484–499.
  • Copenhaver, Brian P., 2017, “Croce and Dewey”, Il Pensiero Italiano: Rivista di Studi Filosofici, 1: 51–72. doi:10.6092/2532-6864/2017.1.51–72
  • Costantino, Tracie E., 2004, “Training Aesthetic Perception: John Dewey on the Educational Role of Art Museums”, Educational Theory, 54(4): 399–417. doi:10.1111/j.0013-2004.2004.00027.x
  • Creed, Isabel P., 1945, “Iconic Signs and Expressiveness”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 3(11/12): 15–21. doi:10.2307/426350
  • Crick, Nathan, 2010, Democracy and Rhetoric: John Dewey on the Arts of Becoming, Columbia, SC: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Croce, Benedetto, 1948, “On the Aesthetics of Dewey”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 6(3): 203–207. doi:10.2307/426476
  • –––, 1952, “Dewey’s Aesthetics and Theory of Knowledge”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 11(1): 1–6. doi:10.2307/426614
  • Dickie, George, 2001, Art and Value. Malden, MA.: Blackwell.
  • Dowling, Christopher, 2010, “The Aesthetics of Daily Life”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 50(3): 225–242. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayq021
  • Douglas, George H., 1970, “A Reconsideration of the Dewey-Croce Exchange”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 28(4): 497–504. doi:10.2307/428489
  • Ducasse, Curt John, 1929, “The Instrumentalist Theory of Art”, in The Philosophy of Art, New York: The Dial Press, 84–94.
  • Duran, Jane, 2001, “A Holistically Deweyan Feminism”, Metaphilosophy, 32(3): 279–292. doi:10.1111/1467-9973.00188
  • Earls, C. Anthony, 1992, “Zen and the Art of John Dewey”, Southwest Philosophy Review, 8(1): 165–172. doi:10.5840/swphilreview19928118
  • Edman, Irwin, 1939, Arts and the Man: A Short Introduction to Aesthetics, New York: W. W. Norton.
  • –––, 1950, “Dewey and Art”, in John Dewey: Philosopher of Science and Freedom. A Symposium, Sidney Hook (ed.), New York: The Dial Press, 47–56.
  • Eldridge, Richard, 2010, “Dewey’s Aesthetics”, in The Cambridge Companion to Dewey, Molly Cochran (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 242–264.
  • Fesmire, Steven, 1999, “Morality As Art: Dewey, Metaphor, and Moral Imagination”, Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 35(3): 527–550.
  • –––, 2003, John Dewey and Moral Imagination, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Fisher, John, 1989, “Some Remarks on What Happened to John Dewey”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 23(3): 54–60. doi:10.2307/3332762
  • Freeland, Cynthia, 2001, But Is It Art? An Introduction to Art Theory, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Garrison, Jim (ed.), 1995, The New Scholarship on Dewey, Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/978-94-011-0071-7
  • –––, 1997, Dewey and Eros: Wisdom and Desire in the Art of Teaching, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • Gaudelli, William and Randall Hewitt, 2010, “The Aesthetic Potential of Global Issues Curriculum”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 44(2): 83–99. doi:10.5406/jaesteduc.44.2.0083
  • Gauss, Charles Edward, 1960, “Some Reflections on John Dewey’s Aesthetics”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 19(2): 127–132. doi:10.2307/428277
  • Gilmour, John, 1987, “Dewey and Gadamer on the Ontology of Art”, Man and World, 20(2): 205–219.
  • Goldman, Alan H., 1995, Aesthetic Value, Boulder, CO: Westview.
  • –––, 2005, “Beardsley’s Legacy: The Theory of Aesthetic Value”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63(2): 185–189. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2005.00196.x
  • –––, 2013, “The Broad View of Aesthetic Experience: The Broad View of Aesthetic Experience”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 71(4): 323–333. doi:10.1111/jaac.12031
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1976, Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols, second edition, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Gosse, Johanna, 2012, “From Art to Experience: The Porous Philosophy of Ray Johnson”, A Tribute to Ray Johnson issue of Black Mountain College Studies, 2. [Gosse 2012 available online]
  • Grange, Joseph, 2001, “Dao, Technology, and American Naturalism”, Philosophy East and West, 51(3): 363–377. doi:10.1353/pew.2001.0040
  • –––, 2004, John Dewey, Confucius, and Global Philosophy, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Granger, David A., 2006, John Dewey, Robert Pirsig, and the Art of Living: Revisioning Aesthetic Education, New York: Palgrave Macmillan US. doi:10.1007/978-1-137-12252-0
  • Greene, Maxine, 2001, Variations on a Blue Guitar: The Lincoln Center Institute Lectures on Aesthetic Education, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • Hildebrand, David, 2008, Dewey: A Beginner’s Guide, Oxford: Oneworld.
  • Hollingsworth, Charles H., 1994, “Port of Sanctuary: The Aesthetic of the African/African American and the Barnes Foundation”, Art Education, 47(6): 41–43. doi:10.2307/3193464
  • Irvin, Sherri, 2008a, “The Pervasiveness of the Aesthetic in Ordinary Experience”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 48(1): 29–44. doi:10.1093/aesthj/aym039
  • –––, 2008b, “Scratching an Itch”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 66(1): 25–35. doi:10.1111/j.1540-594X.2008.00285.x
  • Isenberg, Arnold, 1950 [1987], “Analytical Philosophy and the Study of Art”, in a report for the Rockefeller Foundation, 1950; reprinted with some omissions in 1987, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46: 125–136. doi:10.2307/431270
  • Jackson, Philip W., 1998, John Dewey and the Lessons of Art, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
  • Jacobson, Leon, 1960, “Art as Experience and American Visual Art Today”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 19(2): 117–126. doi:10.2307/428276
  • Jay, Martin, 2002, “Somaesthetics and Democracy: Dewey and Contemporary Body Art”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 36(4): 55–69. doi:10.2307/3301568
  • Jeannot, Thomas M., 2001, “A Propaedeutic to the Philosophical Hermeneutics of John Dewey: ‘Art as Experience’ and ‘Truth and Method’”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 15(1): 1–13. doi:10.1353/jsp.2001.0003
  • John, Joseph D., 2007, “Experience as Medium: John Dewey and a Traditional Japanese Aesthetic”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series, 21(2): 83–90.
  • Johnson, Mark, 1994, The Moral Imagination, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2007, The Meaning of the Body: Aesthetics of Human Understanding, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 2018, The Aesthetics of Meaning and Thought: The Bodily Roots of Philosophy, Science, Morality and Art, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Jubilee, Vincent, 1982, “The Barnes Foundation: Pioneer Patron of Black Artists”, The Journal of Negro Education, 51(1): 40–51.
  • Kallen, Horace, 1942, Art and Freedom, 2 volumes, New York: Duell, Sloan, Pearce.
  • Kaplan, Abraham, 1987, “Introduction”, in LW 10: vii–xxxiii.
  • Kelley, Jeff, 2003, “Introduction”, in Alan Kaprow’s Essays on The Blurring of Art and Life, expanded edition, Jeff Kelley (ed.), Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, xi–xxvi.
  • Kelly, Michael, 2012, A Hunger for Aesthetics: Enacting the Demands of Art, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Kestenbaum, Victor, 1977, The Phenomenological Sense of John Dewey: Habit and Meaning, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Kim, Jiwon, 2009, “Dewey’s Aesthetics and Today’s Moral Education”, in John Dewey at 150: Reflections for a New Century, A. G. Rud, James Garrison, and Lynda Stone (eds.), Western Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 50–60. Also published in the same year in Education and Culture, 25(2): 62–75. doi:10.1353/eac.0.0040
  • Korsmeyer, Carolyn, 1999, Making Sense of Taste: Food and Philosophy, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Kruse, Felicia., 2007, “Vital Rhythm and Temporal Form in Langer and Dewey”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 21(1): 16–26. doi:10.1353/jsp.2007.0023
  • Kuehn, Glenn, 2005, “How Can Food be Art?”, in Light and Smith 2005: 194–212.
  • Kupfer, Joseph H., 1983, Experience as Art: Aesthetics in Everyday Life, Albany, NY: State University of New York.
  • Langer, Susanne K., 1953, Feeling and Form: a Theory of Art Developed from Philosophy in a New Key, New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons.
  • Leddy, Tom, 2005, “The Nature of Everyday Aesthetics”, in Light and Smith 2005: 3–22.
  • –––, 2012, The Extraordinary in the Ordinary: The Aesthetics of Everyday Life, Peterborough, Ont.: Broadview.
  • Lee, Wendy Lynn, 2008, “Environmental Pragmatism Revisited: Human-Centeredness, Language, and the Future of Aesthetic Experience”, Environmental Philosophy, 5(1): 9–22. doi:10.5840/envirophil20085125
  • Lewis, William S., 2005, “Art or Propaganda? Dewey and Adorno on the Relationship between Politics and Art”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 19(1): 42–54. doi:10.1353/jsp.2005.0005
  • Light, Andrew and Jonathan M. Smith (eds.), 2005, The Aesthetics of Everyday Life, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Locke, Alain (ed.), 1925, The New Negro: An Interpretation, New York: A. and C. Bond.
  • Lysaker, John T., 1998, “Binding the Beautiful: Art as Criticism in Adorno and Dewey”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 12(4): 233–244.
  • Man, Eva, 2007, “Rethinking Art and Values: A Comparative Revelation of the Origin of Aesthetic Experience (From the Neo-Confucian Perspective)”, Filozofski Vestnik 28(2): 117–131.
  • Mandoki, Katya, 2007, Everyday Aesthetics: The Play of Culture and Social Identities, Aldershot: Ashgate. doi:10.4324/9781315581286
  • Margolis, Joseph, 1980, Art and Philosophy: Conceptual Issues in Aesthetics, Brighton, Sussex: The Harvester Press.
  • –––, 1999, “Replies in Search of Self-Discovery”, in Interpretation, Relativism, and the Metaphysics of Culture: Themes in the Philosophy of Joseph Margolis, Michael Krausz and Richard Shusterman (eds), Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 337–408.
  • Maslak, Mary Ann, 2006, “The Aesthetics of Asian Art: The Study of Montien Boonma in the Undergraduate Education Classroom”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 40(2): 67–82. doi:10.1353/jae.2006.0016
  • Mathur, Dinesh C., 1981, “Abhinavagupta and Dewey on Art and Its Relation to Morality: Comparisons and Evaluations”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 42(2): 224–235. doi:10.2307/2107293
  • Mavigliano, George J., 1984, “The Federal Art Project: Holger Cahill’s Program of Action”, Art Education, 37(3): 26–30. doi:10.2307/3192762
  • McDermott, John J., 1976, The Culture of Experience: Philosophical Essays in the American Grain, New York: New York University Press.
  • –––, 1986, Streams of Experience, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Mitias, Michael H., 1992, “Dewey’s Theory of Expression”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 26(3): 41–53. doi:10.2307/3333012
  • Mullen, Mary, 1923, An Approach to Art, Merion, PA: Barnes Foundation.
  • Mullis, Eric C., 2005, “Carrying the Jade Tablet: A Consideration of Confucian Artistry”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 3: art. 13. [Mullis 2005 available online]
  • –––, 2006, “The Violent Aesthetic: A Reconsideration of Transgressive Body Art”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 20(2): 85–92. doi:10.1353/jsp.2006.0021
  • Munro, Thomas, 1928, The Scientific Method in Aesthetics, New York: W. W. Norton.
  • Noë, Alva, 2015, Strange Tools: Art and Human Nature, New York: Hill and Wang.
  • Novitz, David, 1992, The Boundaries of Art, Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.
  • Pappas, Gregory Fernando, 2008, John Dewey’s Ethics: Democracy as Experience, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Karmel, Pepe (ed.), 2002, Jackson Pollock: Interviews, Articles and Reviews, New York: The Museum of Modern Art.
  • Parsons, Glenn and Allen Carlson, 2008, Functional Beauty, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199205240.001.0001
  • Pepper, Stephen C., 1939, “Some Questions on Dewey’s Aesthetics”, in The Philosophy of John Dewey, P. Schilpp (ed.), Evanston: Northwestern University, 369–390.
  • –––, 1945, The Basis of Criticism in the Arts, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1953, “The Concept of Fusion in Dewey’s Aesthetic Theory”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 12(2): 169–176. doi:10.2307/426870
  • Puolakka, Kalle, 2014, “Dewey and Everyday Aesthetics: A New Look”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 12: art. 18.
  • –––, 2015, “The Aesthetic Pulse of the Everyday: Defending Dewey”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 13: art. 5.
  • –––, 2017, “The Aesthetics of Conversation: Dewey and Davidson”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 15: art. 20.
  • –––, 2018, “On Habits and Functions in Everyday Aesthetics”, Contemporary Aesthetics, 16: art. 7.
  • Raskin, David, 2010, “Introduction”, in hist Donald Judd, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1–7.
  • Reichling, Mary J., 1991, “Dewey, Imagination, and Music: A Fugue on Three Subjects”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 25(3): 61–78. doi:10.2307/3332995
  • Romanell, Patrick, 1949, “A Comment on Croce’s and Dewey’s Aesthetics”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 8(2): 125–128. doi:10.2307/426595
  • Rorty, Richard, 1979, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1982, Consequences of Pragmatism, Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Saito, Yuriko, 2007, Everyday Aesthetics, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199278350.001.0001
  • –––, 2012, “Everyday Aesthetics and Artification”, Contemporary Aesthetics, Special Issue 4 on Artification: art. 5.
  • Sartwell, Crispin, 1995, The Art of Living: Aesthetics of the Ordinary in World Spiritual Traditions, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • –––, 2003, “Aesthetics of the Everyday”, in The Oxford Handbook of Aesthetics, Jerrold Levinson (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 761–770.
  • –––, 2009, “Dewey and Taoism: Teleology and Art”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 43(1): 30–40. doi:10.1353/jae.0.0035
  • Scruton, Roger, 1974, Art and Imagination: A Study in the Philosophy of Mind, London: Methuen and Co.
  • –––, 1979, The Aesthetics of Architecture, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, 1996, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. See especially her Chapter Seven: “Who Experiences? Genderizing Pluralistic Experiences”, 142–173.
  • Shearer, E. A., 1935a, “Dewey’s Esthetic Theory. I”, The Journal of Philosophy, 32(23): 617–627. doi:10.2307/2016245
  • –––, 1935b, “Dewey’s Esthetic Theory. II”, The Journal of Philosophy, 32(24): 650–664. doi:10.2307/2016825
  • Shelley, James, 2009 [2017], “The Concept of the Aesthetic”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition) Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>
  • Shusterman, Richard, 1992, Pragmatist Aesthetics: Living Beauty, Rethinking Art, Oxford and Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • –––, 2000, Performing Live: Aesthetic Alternatives for the Ends of Art, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Surface and Depth: Dialectics of Criticism and Culture, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, especially Ch. 7, “From Natural Roots to Cultural Radicalism: Pragmatist Aesthetics in Alain Locke and John Dewey”, 123–138.
  • –––, 2004, “Complexities of Aesthetic Experience: Response to Johnston”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 38(4): 109–112. doi: 10.1353/jae.2004.004
  • –––, 2006, “Aesthetic Experience: From Analysis to Eros”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 64(2): 217–229. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2006.00243.x
  • –––, 2009, “Pragmatist Aesthetics and Confucianism”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 43(1): 18–29. doi:10.1353/jae.0.0034
  • –––, 2012, Thinking through the Body: Essays in Somaesthetics, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139094030
  • Simoni, Frederic, 1952, “Benedetto Croce: A Case of International Misunderstanding”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 11(1): 7–14. doi: 10.2307/426615
  • Soucek, Brian, 2009, “Resisting the Itch to Redefine Aesthetics: A Response to Sherri Irvin”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 67(2): 223–226. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6245.2009.01350_1.x
  • Stroud, Scott R., 2009, “Orientational Meliorism, Pragmatist Aesthetics, and the Bhagavad Gita”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 43(1): 1–17. doi:10.1353/jae.0.0032
  • –––, 2011, John Dewey and the Artful Life: Pragmatism, Aesthetics, and Morality, University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Taylor, Paul C., 2002, “The Two-Dewey Thesis, Continued: Shusterman’s Pragmatist Aesthetics”, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 16(1): 17–25. doi:10.1353/jsp.2002.0007
  • Tormey, Alan, 1986, “Art and Expression: A Critique”, in Philosophy Looks at the Arts: Contemporary Readings in Aesthetics, third edition, Joseph Margolis (ed.), Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press, 421–437.
  • Ueno, Masamichi, 2015, Democratic Education and the Public Sphere: Towards John Dewey’s Theory of Aesthetic Experience, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315735764
  • Van Camp, Julie C., 2014, John Dewey’s Notion of Qualitative Thought, Scotts Valley, CA: CreateSpace Independent Publishing (Amazon).
  • Vittorio, Massimo, 2012, “Reflections on the Croce—Dewey Exchange”, Modern Italy, 17(1): 31–49. doi:10.1080/13532944.2012.633345
  • Vivas, Eliseo, 1937, “A Definition of the Esthetic Experience”, The Journal of Philosophy, 34(23): 628–634. doi:10.2307/2018494
  • –––, 1938, “A Note on the Emotion in Mr. Dewey’s Theory of Art”, The Philosophical Review, 47(5): 527–531.
  • Zeltner, Philip M., 1975, John Dewey’s Aesthetic Philosophy, Amsterdam: Grüner.
  • Zigler, Ronald, 1982, “Experience and Pure Consciousness: Reconsidering Dewey’s Aesthetics”, in Philosophical Studies in Education (Proceedings of the Annual Meeting of the Ohio Valley Philosophy of Education Society), Bloomington, IN: Indiana University, 107–114.

Other Internet Resources


Kalle Puolakka would like to thank The Finnish Cultural Foundation for financial support.

Copyright © 2021 by
Tom Leddy <>
Kalle Puolakka <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free