Goodman's Aesthetics

First published Sat May 7, 2005; substantive revision Wed Aug 9, 2017

Nelson Goodman has certainly been one of the most influential figures in contemporary aesthetics and analytic philosophy in general (in addition to aesthetics, his contributions cover the areas of applied logic, metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of science). His Languages of Art (first published in 1968 [Goodman 1976]), together with Ernst Gombrich’s Art and Illusion (1960) and Richard Wollheim’s Art and Its Objects (1968), represents a fundamental turning point in the analytic approach to artistic issues in Anglo-American philosophy. His often unorthodox take on art is part of a general approach to knowledge and reality, and is always pervasively informed by his cognitivism, nominalism, relativism, and constructivism. From Languages of Art and subsequent works, a general view of the arts as contributing to the understanding and indeed to the building of the realities we live in emerges. Ultimately, in Goodman’s view, art is not sharply distinguished, in goals and means, from science and ordinary experience. Paintings, musical sonatas, dances, etc. all are symbols that classify parts of reality for us, as do such things as scientific theories and what makes up common, ordinary knowledge.

1. Biographical Sketch

Goodman’s personal life (August 7, 1906–November 25, 1998) was linked to art in many and important ways. From 1929 to 1941, he directed an art gallery in Boston: the Walker-Goodman Art Gallery. It is through this commitment that he met his wife, Katharine Sturgis, a skilled painter whose work is reproduced in Goodman’s Ways of Worldmaking (1978a). In 1941, he received a Ph.D. in Philosophy at Harvard University, with a dissertation, A Study of Qualities (1941), that laid out the nominalist view that would later be presented in his first book, The Structure of Appearance (1951). He taught at Tufts University (1945–46), The University of Pennsylvania (1946–64), Brandeis University (1964–67), and, from 1967, at Harvard University, where he became Emeritus Professor in 1977.

Throughout his life, he remained a passionate collector of ancient and contemporary art pieces, as well as a generous lender and donor to a number of museums. He was a rigorous philosopher who, however, never lacked the capacity to talk to artists and researchers in other fields. In 1967, at the School of Education of Harvard, he established an interdisciplinary program for the study of education and the arts, “Project Zero,” which he directed until 1971. Still at Harvard, he founded and directed the Summer Dance program. It is, then, not at all surprising that, amongst Goodman’s works, we find, next to philosophical production, multimedia projects that combine—indeed very much in Goodmanian fashion—painting (including Sturgis’s work), music, and dance: Hockey Seen (1972), Rabbit Run (1973), and Variations (1985d).

2. Classifying and Constructing Worlds

One way of approaching Goodman’s aesthetics, and of seeing both its unity and continuity with his work in other areas of philosophy, is by recalling some of the ideas presented in one of his early works, Fact, Fiction, and Forecast (originally published in 1954 [Goodman 1983]). There Goodman formulates what he calls “the general problem of projection” (of which the famous “new riddle of induction” is an instance). The problem is grounded in the general idea that we project predicates onto reality (a reality that is itself “constructed” by those projections, according to the constructivist approach Goodman defended from the time of A Study of Qualities [1941], hence in The Structure of Appearance [1951] and, later, in Ways of Worldmaking [1978a]). Hume famously claimed that inductions are based on regularities found in experience, and concluded that the inductive predictions may very well turn out being false. In Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, Goodman points out how “regularities” are themselves in a sense problematic. Take such objects as emeralds, which we classify by using the predicate “green.” They can also be said to be “grue,” i.e., observed up to a certain time t and found green, blue otherwise. Hence, our observations seem to equally grant two different inductions—that emeralds will remain green after t or that they will be blue. The problem is a general one, involving not just hypotheses but the projection of any predicate onto the world. Indeed, as we divide the world into green and blue things, so could we divide it into grue and bleen things (things that are observed up to t and found blue, and green otherwise). Notice that, under a description of the world using the “green/blue” predicate pair, there may be no change at time t (no change in the color of emeralds and sapphires for example), whereas there would be change under the alternative “grue/bleen” pair. Likewise, whereas there may be change, at time t, under “green/blue” (in case that, say, an emerald is painted over at t), there may be no change under the alternative pair, “grue/bleen.” The new riddle of induction—and, in general, the problem of projection—is, then, to explain what are the bases for projecting certain predicates—“green,” “blue,” “red,” etc.—onto the world, and not others—“grue,” “bleen,” “gred,” etc. For, as Goodman states it, “[r]egularities are where you find them, and you can find them anywhere” (1983, 83). There is no difference in principle between the predicates we use and those we could use, but rather a pragmatic difference in habit, or of “entrenchment” of certain predicates and not others.

When one combines the idea of predicate entrenchment to that for which our successfully projecting certain predicates (and more generally symbols) rather than others modifies our observation and very perception of reality (indeed it amounts to constructing different realities), one has the basis for Goodman’s general approach to our cognitive relationship to the world, of which art is a fundamental component. Artworks, too, are symbols, referring to the world (or the worlds they contribute to construct) in a variety of different ways. Understanding the worlds of art is no different, in kind, from understanding the worlds of science or of ordinary perception: it requires interpretation of the various symbols involved in those areas. Which symbols are successfully projected over time—and, for instance, which artistic styles are perceived as familiar and which ones as revolutionary, or which linguistic formulas are categorized as literal and which ones as metaphorical—largely depends on what is customary, “entrenched,” within a certain cultural, artistic, or linguistic community.

3. The Theory of Symbol Systems in Languages of Art

Most of Goodman’s aesthetics is contained in his Languages of Art (which he republished, with slight variations, in a second edition in 1976), although what is there presented is clarified, expanded, and sometimes corrected in later essays. As its subtitle, An Approach to a General Theory of Symbols, indicates, this is a book with bearings not only on art issues, but on a general understanding of symbols, linguistic and non-linguistic, in the sciences as well as in ordinary life. Indeed, Languages of Art has, amongst its merits, that of having broken, in a non-superficial and fruitful way, the divide between art and science. Goodman’s general view is that we use symbols in our perceiving, understanding, and constructing the worlds of our experience: the different sciences and the different arts equally contribute to the enterprise of understanding the world. As in his works in epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of language, Goodman’s approach is often unorthodox and groundbreaking, and yet never in ways that fail to be refreshing and suggestive of future developments (some of those developments were pursued by Goodman himself in later essays and, most notably, in his last book, co-authored with Catherine Elgin, Reconceptions in Philosophy and Other Arts and Sciences [1988]).

With respect to art in particular and to symbolic activities in general, Goodman advocates a form of cognitivism: by using symbols we discover (indeed we build) the worlds we live in, and the interest we have in symbols—artworks amongst them—is distinctively cognitive. Indeed, to Goodman, aesthetics is but a branch of epistemology. Paintings, sculptures, musical sonatas, dance pieces, etc. are all made of symbols, which possess different functions and bear different relations with the worlds they refer to. Hence, artworks require interpretation, and interpreting them amounts to understanding what they refer to, in which way, and within which systems of rules.

Symbolizing is for Goodman the same as referring. Hence, it is important here to emphasize, first, that reference has, in his view, different modes, and, second, that something is a symbol, and is a symbol of a given kind, only within a symbol system of that kind, a system governed by the syntactical and semantic rules that are distinctive of symbols of that kind. Of course, natural languages are examples of symbol systems, but there are many other, non-linguistic systems: pictorial, gestural, diagrammatic, etc.

3.1 Modes of Reference

The fundamental notion which is at the core of Goodman’s theory of symbols is that of reference—the primitive relation of “standing for”—seen as articulated in different modes, of which denotation is one, and as obtaining not just directly but indirectly as well, sometimes across long chains of reference. Indeed, one of the great contributions of Goodman to philosophy is his investigation of kinds of reference or symbolization. Denotation and exemplification are the two fundamental forms of reference out of which Goodman develops most of his analysis. Denotation is the relationship between a “label,” such as “John F. Kennedy,” or “The 34th President of the United States,” and what it labels (Goodman 1976, Chap. 1). In fact, according to Goodman’s nominalist approach, possessing a feature (or what ordinarily would also be called a property, such as being blue) just amounts to being denoted by a certain predicate or, more precisely, by a “label” (such as “blue”). Hence possession is the converse of denotation. (Of course, labels can be particular or general, as reference can be to an individual, as in the “JFK” example above, or, severally, to all the members of a set, as with “blue” with respect to all blue items.) Furthermore, labels are not limited to linguistic ones, i.e., to predicates: pictures, musical symbols, and all other labels classify world items; and what something is depends as much on the nonverbal labels applying to it as on the predicates it falls under.

Exemplification—the sort of reference typical, for instance, of tailors’ swatches—requires possession. In addition to possession, however, which of course by itself is not a form of symbolization, exemplification requires that the exemplifying symbol refers back to the label or predicate that denotes it. Hence, exemplification is “possession plus reference” (Goodman 1976, 53). When a feature is referred to in this way, it is “exhibited, typified, shown forth” (Goodman 1976, 86). While any blue object is denoted by the label “blue,” only those things—e.g., blue color swatches—that also refer to “blue” and analogous labels exemplify such color, are “samples” of it. An important characteristic of samples is that they are selective in the way they function symbolically (see also Goodman 1978a, 63–70). A tailor’s swatch does not exemplify all of the features it possesses—or all the predicates that denote it—but rather only those for which it is a symbol (hence, e.g., predicates denoting color and texture, and not predicates denoting size or shape). Which of its properties does a sample exemplify depends on the system within which the sample is being used: color and texture are relevant to the systems used in tailoring, not size and shape. Exemplification is for Goodman a common and yet, philosophically, unrecognized form of reference. Indeed, throughout his own philosophical oeuvre, we find Goodman using exemplification to explain a number of issues: most notably, expression in art, but also, for instance, the notion of artistic style (1975), how works of architecture can be attributed meaning (1985), or the notion of a “variation upon a theme” in such arts as music and painting (Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 4).

Yet the paths or “routes” of reference can be of many different sorts, and indeed symbols may combine in “chains of reference” to give rise to instances of complex reference (Goodman 1981a). There is, first of all, the sort of symbolization employed by metaphors (as when human beings are referred to as “wolves”), a mode of reference that becomes crucial to Goodman’s analysis of expression in art. In analyzing metaphor, Goodman (1976, Chap. 2; 1979) follows suggestions included in Max Black’s famous article on the topic (Black 1954) but expands and adapts them to his own view that denotational symbols—labels—don’t work alone but rather as members of “schemata” (“a label functions not in isolation but as belonging to a family” [Goodman 1976, 71]), normally correlated to some referential “realm.” “Blue,” “green,” “red,” etc., for instance, typically belong to the same “schema”—a set of labels established by context and habit—and the realm of reference of such a schema is made of all the ranges of things that each label in the schema denotes (all blue objects, all green objects, etc.). We have an instance of metaphorical reference when a symbol, linguistic or not, is made to refer to something not belonging to the realm normally correlated to the symbol’s schema, i.e., not belonging to the sorts of things that the symbols in the schema normally refer to. Hence, calling a painting “sad” is metaphorical because a predicate that is normally projected upon bearers of mental, emotional states is projected upon an inanimate object made of canvas and wood and paint. Using the notions of schema and realm allows Goodman’s analysis to include the claim that typically metaphors bring about rearrangements in a field of reference, which affect several labels at once. It is important to emphasize that, for Goodman, metaphorical usage is no less real or connected to knowledge than literal usage, and metaphorical truth no less a form of truth than literal truth. Indeed, the literal and the metaphorical in a sense lie on the same continuum. Whether the application of a label (and the corresponding possession of a feature) should be considered literal or metaphorical is just a matter of habit—specifically, a matter of the age of the metaphor, for old metaphors lose their metaphorical status and become just literal applications. Using a metaphor himself, Goodman claims that “a metaphor is an affair between a predicate with a past and an object that yields while protesting” (1976, 69). Notice that such a formula includes two elements: that there is resistance to a metaphor (deriving from its literal falseness) but also attraction (deriving from the insightful reorganization of a schema of labels vis-à-vis a referential realm, which the metaphor may bring about). A metaphor is a voluntary misassignment of a label, but it is also more than that: “Whereas falsity depends upon misassignment of a label, metaphorical truth depends upon reassignment” (1976, 70 emphasis added).

Other rhetorical figures (although not all of them) can, in Goodman’s view be explained in terms of metaphorical “transfers” of this kind, indeed as “modes of metaphor”: personification, synecdoche, antonomasia, hyperbole, litotes, irony… (1976, 81–85).

Of course, the same item may perform several referential functions at the same time, denoting certain things while exemplifying certain features, and do so literally or metaphorically. Furthermore, sometimes reference is indirect or mediate (Goodman, Elgin 1988, 42), brought about by the combination of different forms of reference into instances of complex reference. Reference may, so to speak, travel along “chains of reference” made of symbols that refer to, or are referred by, other symbols. An obvious case is that in which a country like the United States is referred to by a picture of a bald eagle, thanks to the picture of the bald eagle being a label for a bird that in turn exemplifies a label like “bold and free,” which in turn denotes the United States and indeed is, furthermore, exemplified by it (Goodman 1984, 62).

3.2 Symbol Schemes and Symbol Systems

In general, how a symbol refers—whether it denotes or exemplifies, what it denotes or which of its features it exemplifies, whether it does so directly or indirectly, literally or metaphorically—depends on the system of symbolization within which the symbol is found. Furthermore, a symbol is the sort of symbol it is—linguistic, musical, pictorial, diagrammatic, etc.—in virtue of its belonging to a symbol system of a certain kind. And symbols differ from each other according to their different syntactic and semantic rules.

Indeed, a symbol system, say, the English language, actually consists of a symbol scheme (not to be confused with the above-mentioned notion of a label “schema”)—i.e., of a collection of symbols, or “characters,” with rules to combine them into new, compound characters—associated to a field of reference. In the English language, for instance, the symbol scheme is made of characters as the letters of the Roman alphabet—“a,” “b,” “c,” etc.—as well as compound characters such as “ape” or “house.” Each character comprises all the verbal utterances and ink inscriptions, i.e., all the “marks” that correspond to it. The mode of reference fundamental to symbol systems is denotation: characters denote, stand for items in the field of reference. The scheme is governed by syntactical rules—determining how to form and combine characters—the system by semantic rules—determining how the range of symbols in the scheme refer to their field of reference.

The fundamental notion with reference to which the different syntactical and semantic rules of systems can be explained is that of a notation—in brief, a symbol system where to each symbol corresponds one item in the realm, and to each item in the realm only one symbol in the system. Hence, for instance, a musical score is a character in a notational system only if it determines which performances belong to the work and, at the same time, is determined by each of those performances (Goodman 1976, 128–130). In a notational symbol scheme all the members of a character are interchangeable (that is, there is “character-indifference” between the marks that make a character) (Goodman 1976, 132–134). Hence, for instance, the Roman alphabet is made of characters in a notational scheme because any inscription of, say, the letter “a” (A or a or a…) expresses the same character and hence can be chosen at will, and because each of such marks cannot be used for any other letter of the alphabet. The same is true, for instance, of the set of the basic musical symbols used in standard musical notation. Accordingly, the two syntactic requirements of a notation are disjointness (each mark belongs to no more than one character) and finite differentiation, or articulation (in principle, it is always possible to determine to which character a mark belongs). Symbol schemes that are notational can be compared in their workings to the way digital instruments of measurement work: for any measurement indicated by the instrument there is always a definite answer to the question, What is the measurement? By contrast, schemes that are non-notational are well exemplified by analog systems of measurement. For their complete lack of articulation, those systems can also be said to be dense throughout: given any mark (e.g., a mark in a scale) it could stand for virtually an infinite number of characters, hence of measurements; or, equivalently, given any two marks, there is a virtually infinite number of possible characters between them.

For the symbol system also to be notational, more than syntactic disjointness and finite differentiation is required. Symbol systems are notational when 1) the characters are correlated to the field of reference unambiguously (with no character being correlated to more than one class of reference, or “compliance class”), 2) what a character refers to—the compliance class—must not intersect the compliance class of another character (i.e., the characters must be semantically disjoint), and 3) it is always possible to determine to which symbol an item in the field of reference complies (i.e., the system must be, semantically, finitely differentiated).With exceptions that will have to be spelled out below, a musical score in standard Western notation is a character in a notational system. Natural languages like the English language have a notational scheme but fail to be notational systems, because of ambiguities (in English, “cape” refers to a piece of land as well as to a piece of clothing) and lack of semantic disjointness (“man” and “doctor” have some referents in common). Finally, pictorial systems fail on both syntactic and semantic grounds.

4. From Languages of Art to Reconceptions: New Looks at Aesthetic Issues

The rich and systematic general analysis of modes of reference and of types of symbol systems presented in Languages of Art allows Goodman to address fundamental questions in the philosophy of art: on the nature of the different art forms and the symbolic functions that are central to them; on questions of ontology and the importance of authenticity; on the distinction between artistic and non-artistic forms of symbolization; and on the role of artistic value.

4.1 Pictorial Representation

Languages of Art prompted a lively debate especially concerning Goodman’s claims about the nature of pictorial representation, or depiction. According to Goodman, the symbolic function that is distinctive of pictures is denotation (1976, Chap. 1)—hence pictures are labels and in that respect are analogous to linguistic predicates. The characteristics that distinguish pictorial systems from other denotational systems (e.g., from natural languages) make them the very opposite of a notation: pictorial systems are dense throughout and in that respect are similar to other analog systems, such as those of diagrams and maps (1976, 194–198; Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 7).

At a first approximation, Goodman’s claim that “denotation is the core of representation” (1976, 5) means that pictures are pictorial labels for their subjects, individuals or sets of individuals, analogously to how names, or predicates, or verbal descriptions are linguistic labels for their denotata. Yet, of course, not all pictures that have a subject—i.e., all pictures that are representational, versus images that are non-representational or abstract—have an actual individual as their subject. Some pictures have just a generic subject (say, a picture of a man, in the sense of a picture of no man in particular), others have a fictional subject (a picture of a unicorn, for example). Goodman’s account of such cases is in terms of multiple denotation for the former and null denotation for the latter. Some pictures—exemplary is an illustration of an eagle placed, in a dictionary, next to the definition of the word “eagle”—refer, severally, to all the members of a given set, such as the set of eagles. Other pictures, such as pictures of unicorns, refer to nothing, since there are no unicorns in reality: they have null denotation. Goodman insists that the existence of pictures with null denotation does not represent a problem for the view that claims that “denotation is the core of representation.” Such pictures are, of course, to be distinguished from other pictures with null denotation, such as pictures of Pegasus or of Pickwick. Yet, they are so distinguished in being pictures of a certain kind—unicorn-pictures—classified differently from pictures of other kinds, such as Pegasus-pictures or Pickwick-pictures.

Hence, Goodman appears to analyze pictorial representation as an ambiguous concept, ambiguous, that is, between a denotational sense (“is a picture of a so-and-so”) and a non-denotational sense (“is a so-and-so-picture”). This may be seen as a disadvantage vis-à-vis “perceptual” theories of depiction such as those proposed, for instance, by Richard Wollheim (1987) and Kendall Walton (1990) (cf. Robinson 2000). Yet concerns on Goodman’s treating the concept of depiction as ambiguous are misplaced, for the phrase “picture of” and its cognates can be easily shown to admit two different interpretations. What can be called the phrase’s relational sense has to do with what, if anything, a picture refers to; the non-relational sense, instead, has to do with, as Goodman would say, the sort of picture it is, or better with the picture’s depictive content (see, e.g., Budd 1993). Indeed, Goodman is right in claiming that, with any picture, there are always two questions: one, what the picture represents, if anything; two, what kind of picture it is (1976, 31). Rather, a much more real problem with Goodman’s theory derives from his not addressing some of the most fundamental questions regarding depiction. Goodman articulates his account of relational depiction in some detail: pictures are symbols in symbol systems that are devoted to denotation (although their members may have individual, multiple, or null denotation) and that have certain (primarily) syntactic characteristics. Yet, Goodman has nothing to say on why certain pictures denote what they do. Lacking a theory of pictorial reference is no oversight on the part of the philosopher however. The fact is that Goodman is interested in investigating the “routes” of reference (1981a)—how symbols can denote or exemplify or refer in more complex and indirect ways. He is not interested in the origins, or “roots,” of reference—hence, with regard to pictures, in how certain marks and not others have become commonly correlated with certain kinds of items in the world. This is as much true of what pictures are labels for as of which labels apply to pictures, that is, of how they are classified. Hence, it turns out, Goodman also has not much to say on the non-relational sense of depiction, i.e., with what makes a picture the sort of picture it is (e.g., a man-picture or a unicorn-picture or a so-and-so-picture). Why pictures are classified in certain ways—as unicorn-pictures, man-pictures, and so on—ultimately, is a matter of entrenchment of certain predicates out of the many predicates available. Given the actual history of the use of our symbols, certain pictorial labels (i.e., pictures) are projected rather than others, and certain verbal labels are projected over those pictorial labels. Accordingly, for the most part, Goodman’s theory of depiction is better seen for what it has to tell us on its own terms—in general, on what distinguishes pictorial symbols from symbols of other sorts.

Pictures are distinguished from symbols of other sorts in virtue of the distinguishing characteristics of pictorial symbol systems. In particular, pictorial symbol systems are syntactically and semantically dense. That is, given any two marks, no matter how small the difference between them, they could be instantiating two different characters, and given any two characters, no matter how small the difference between them, they may have different referents (Goodman 1976, 226–227; Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 7). Hence, pictures are grouped together with such things as diagrams, ungraduated instruments of measurement, and maps—with those symbols, that is, for which, in simpler words, any difference may make a difference: any difference in a mark may correspond to a different character, and any difference in the character may stand for a different correlation to the field of reference. Even a simple picture, for Goodman, is dense, in the sense that any, however small, mark on the canvas may turn out being relevant to pictorial meaning. Whatever the merits of, or problems with, Goodman’s technical analysis, the notion of density is certainly one way to account for what other thinkers—most notably Kendall Walton (1990)—have referred to as an “openendedness” in the investigation of pictures.

Of course, as pictures are likened to such things as diagrams, they also need to be distinguished from them. Goodman’s claim is that the difference between pictures and diagrams is syntactic, i.e., has to do with the composition of the characters or symbols. Pictorial symbol systems, when compared to diagrammatic systems, tend to be relatively replete. That is, to the interpretation of a picture typically a larger number of features is relevant than to the interpretation of a non-pictorial dense system. A drawing by Hokusai may be made of the same marks as an electrocardiogram. Yet, while in a linear diagram as the electrocardiogram only relative distances from the originating point of the line matter, in the drawing a higher number of features—color, thickness, intensity, contrast, etc.—are relevant (Goodman 1976, 229–230). Diagrams typically are relatively “attenuated.” Accordingly, the difference between diagrams and pictures is only a matter of degree: typically, with a picture a smaller number of features can be dismissed as contingent or irrelevant.

There is indeed more that can be found in Languages of Art regarding depiction, and indirectly regarding the notion of being a so-and-so-picture or a such-and-such-picture. An important part of Goodman’s view on depiction is his critique of the idea that resemblance is the distinguishing feature of this sort of symbolization. While Goodman may appear to be, and is usually discussed as, criticizing the resemblance theory of pictorial representation—the “most naïve view of representation” (1976, 3)—his real target is indeed much broader than that. After all, of the resemblance view he also claims that “vestiges” of it, “with assorted refinements, persist in most writing on representation” (1976, 3). What mainly concerns Goodman in Languages of Art is to establish the symbolic, and hence ultimately conventional, nature of pictorial representation—is to draw similarities between pictorial and nonpictorial forms of symbolization. With regard to resemblance, Languages of Art echoes the claim in Fact, Fiction, and Forecast with regard to regularities: resemblances can be found anywhere, for anything resembles anything else in some respect or other. Hence, Goodman does not deny the existence of resemblances between a picture and its subject, rather he claims that which resemblances are going to be noticed depends on what the system of correlation employed makes relevant. To Goodman, pictorial representation is always relative to the conceptual framework (that is, to the system of classification) within which a picture should be interpreted, in the same way in which vision is relative to the conceptual frameworks with which one approaches the visual world. On perception, Languages of Art echoes what Goodman had already claimed in his 1960 review of Ernst Gombrich’s Art and Illusion: “That we know what we see is no truer than we see what we know. Perception depends heavily on conceptual schemata” (Goodman 1972, 142). Thinking that vision may ever take place independently of all conceptualization is to rely on the “myth of the innocent eye”: “there is no innocent eye […]. Not only how but what [the eye] sees is regulated by need and prejudice. [The eye] selects, rejects, organizes, associates, classifies, analyzes, constructs” (Goodman 1976, 7–8).

Accordingly, realism in pictorial representations is reduced to a matter of habit or familiarity, in contrast not only to a resemblance account of realism but to accounts in terms of amount or accuracy of conveyed information as well. Realistic pictures can include inaccuracies—indeed, those used in games of the type “find the n mistakes in the picture” include inaccuracies by definition (Goodman 1984, 127). And the amount of information is not altered, for instance, by switching from the realistic mode of representation of conventional perspective to the non-realistic mode of, say, reverse perspective (Goodman 1976, 35). Goodman’s conventionalism is pervasive and uncompromising: even the rules of perspective in the representation of space, he claims, are conventionally established, and provide only a relative—i.e., relative to culturally established conceptual schemata—standard of fidelity (1976, 10–19). Realistic paintings, drawings, etc. are those that are painted or drawn in a familiar style, i.e., according to a familiar system of correlation. To put it metaphorically, for Goodman, you always need a key to read a picture—sometimes the key is more ready at hand, part of one’s cultural background, other times one must find it and learn how to use it.

There are claims, in Goodman’s account of depiction, that are left unexplained, especially with respect to pictures with indeterminate or fictional reference, that is, with pictures that Goodman would classify by predicates like “man-picture,” “unicorn-pictures,” etc. Of them, Goodman claims that they have “purported” denotation (1976, 67), yet without saying anything on how that should contribute to pictorial meaning. Furthermore, as the analysis progresses, and keeps facing the necessity to account for pictures with indeterminate or fictional reference, as well as with the notion of representation-as (as in a picture that represents Winston Churchill as a bulldog), a somewhat puzzling claim makes its way into Goodman’s account: that depiction in such cases is really a matter of exemplification—exemplification of labels such as “unicorn-picture,” “man-picture,” or “bulldog-picture” (1976, 66). The motivation for such a claim may be that of finding, after all, a mode of reference capable of explaining the way in which such pictures have meaning, i.e., of addressing the above-mentioned non-relational sense of depiction. Yet, Goodman provides no argument to support the claim that a picture representing, say, a unicorn is not just denoted by labels such as “unicorn-picture” but also refers back to those labels. Lack of actual or determinate reference cannot be sufficient to establish that an item denoted by a label refers back to that label. Furthermore, precisely because samples refer to the labels denoting them selectively, an argument would be needed to the effect that pictures of unicorns exemplify such labels as “of-a-unicorn,” rather than labels as, say, “picture” or even “painted by someone” or “painted canvas,” which after all are labels applying to such pictures.

In fact, in light of the above-mentioned ambiguity in the concept of depiction, hence of the fundamental distinction between a relational and a non-relational sense of “picture of,” we should emphasize how much is left out of Goodman’s attempted account of the concept. Notice how pictures may or may not represent something, i.e., relationally; yet, insofar as they have depicted content, they all are, non-relationally, O-pictures, or P-pictures, etc., that is, pictures with an O, or P, etc. content. Such non-relational sense of depiction is indeed the one a theory of depiction ought to investigate (cf. Budd 1993), and Goodman’s general claims on the syntactic and semantic characteristics of pictorial (vs. verbal, or musical, or diagrammatic, etc.) symbol systems do not seem able to encompass the fundamental question about such a notion, hence in a sense the fundamental question for any theory of pictorial representation (cf. Giovannelli 1997). To illustrate, Goodman’s account offers suggestions on what makes a symbol a picture of a dog rather than a verbal description of a dog; at a very general level, the account has also something to say on what makes a symbol a dog-picture rather than a dog-description. Yet, the fundamental question for a theory of depiction is what it means that a picture is a dog-picture, i.e., a picture with a dog as its depictive content, a picture in which competent viewers see a dog, instead of, say, a cat-picture, i.e., a picture in which competent viewer see a cat. For better or worse, perceptual theories of depiction offer an answer to that question; yet, no real competing answer is to be found in Goodman. As mentioned, why some type of marks have become correlated with a certain kind of depictive content (hence presumably prompting a visual perception of such content when looking at the picture) is a matter of entrenchment; and that, in turn, is a question for the anthropologist and the historian, not the philosopher, according to Goodman.

4.2 Expression and Exemplification in Art

The notion of exemplification allows Goodman to offer his theory of expression. More generally, it allows him to indicate an important source of meaning in addition to denotation. Most works of music, dance, and architecture, as well as abstract paintings, do not represent anything at all. Yet, Goodman can show how, next to artworks’ representational powers we must recognize, as a central and pervasive form of symbolization in art, the capacity for artworks to call attention to some of their features, that is, to exemplify them.

As for the features that an artwork appears to exemplify despite its not, literally, possessing them (as when, for instance, a painting is claimed to express sadness in spite of the fact that paintings cannot literally be sad) Goodman claims that such features are metaphorically exemplified, or expressed. In brief, a work of art expresses something when it metaphorically exemplifies it. Accordingly, expression is not limited to feelings and emotions but comprises any feature that can be metaphorically attributed to an artwork: in architecture, for instance, a building may express movement, dynamism, or being “jazzy” although, literally, it can’t have any of those properties (Goodman, Elgin 1988, 40).

To expression and exemplification, too, the general rule for which the relationship between a symbol and what it symbolizes is never “absolute, universal, or immutable” (1976, 50) applies. Hence, like representation, exemplification and expression are relative, in particular they are relative to established use (Goodman 1976, 48).

Goodman’s suggestions on the role of exemplification in art are in many ways enlightening. Applied to art, the notion seems to provide semantic theories, like Goodman’s, with a way to justify the attention we pay, not just to what an artwork symbolizes, by to the artwork itself: we do so because we are made privy of, and are interested in, those of a work’s features that are shown forth, i.e., exemplified (cf. van der Berg 2012, 603). The notion allows to expand the number of features that are deemed significant in a work, while still explaining such significance in referential terms. A poem, for instance, is not just a representational symbol; typically, what a poetic work exemplifies is as important to its meaning and artistic value as what the work represents. Accordingly, the goal of the translator must be “maximal preservation of what the original exemplifies as well as of what it says” (1976, 60). As for expression, expanding the scope of the properties that can be metaphorically exemplified, beyond the strictly emotional ones, adds explanatory power to the theory, making it possible to say, e.g., that a sculpture expresses fluidity (cf. Robinson 2000, 216).

As is the case for Goodman’s analysis of depiction, with regard to exemplification and expression in art, too, one wonders whether Goodman’s claims are meant to provide an exhaustive account of such notions, and not rather just a very general, structural, analysis of them. Whichever the case, Goodman’s proposal is much more acceptable at that general level. More specific claims, such as that expression and exemplification are relative to the conventionally established symbol systems at work, like the analogous claim regarding representation, prompt questions on the necessity, for Goodman, to recognize naturalistic constraints on what can be exemplified, or expressed, or represented by what. More importantly, when we examine specific cases, it becomes unclear whether the distinction between exemplification in general and expression in particular has been well drawn. Since, for Goodman, not only feelings and emotions can be expressed but also such properties as color or sound pitch, one wonders what notion “expressing red,” said of a non-red symbol, amounts to: how different is it from the notion referred to by “expressing sadness” said of something (a musical sonata) that literally is not sad? Furthermore, as a more general concern on Goodman’s project of accounting for the nature, interpretation, and values of artworks fully extensionalistically (i.e., just in terms only of what they refer to), one wonders whether the role of property possession is not undermined by Goodman’s insistence on what a work exemplifies. Certainly, works of art have significant features that they simply possess, without also exemplifying them. A work of art may have to be recognized as, e.g., calm just in the sense of having such feature (if needed, having it metaphorically), and such feature be recognized as relevant to the work’s nature and value—as something that the beholder ought to perceive—without it being the case that the work exemplifies or expresses calmness.

Be as it may, it is certainly worth considering whether expression, hence exemplification, by requiring possession, requires possession that precedes the item’s acquiring exemplifying function. It could be the case that endowing a work with an exemplification function could, at once, endow the work with the feature it exemplifies, a suggestion that seems especially apt to works of art (cf. van der Berg 2012). Whether something like that could be explained, as Goodman would want it, with no reference to either the intentions of artists or, more generally, the context of artistic production remains to be seen. Certainly—and the concern, here, is not just about expression, but about metaphorical reference and exemplification more generally—the suspicion arises that Goodman’s approach, in relying solely on the notion of symbol system to explain reference (i.e., to explain what a symbol refers to and how it does refer to it), ends up underanalyzing the key notions at play: exemplification, metaphorical reference, and, hence, expression. Goodman’s own understanding of symbol systems is that they emerge when certain rules are codified. Yet, of course, artists may succeed, it seems, at securing reference and endowing their works with artistically relevant features within, and thanks to, a specific context of production. Appeal to the rules of a system may not be sufficient to explain how reference is indeed secured. That is, and going back to an issue mentioned above, the rules of a system may never be granular enough to offer a full explanation of how a work of art exemplifies some of its features but not others, or is successfully made to possess, metaphorically, features it expresses.

4.3 Conditions of Identity for Works of Art

Goodman’s theory of symbol systems, as composed of schemes of characters that are governed, depending on the sort of system, by different syntactical rules, and correlated to their extensions according to differing semantic rules, is at the basis of his claims on the identity conditions of works of art of different kinds. Given the syntactic and semantic characteristics of notational systems, the different art forms can be arranged on a spectrum made of the sorts of systems that stand between a pure notation—where there is perfect preservation of identity between replicas (or performances) of the work—and fully dense pictorial systems—where every work is an original.

Goodman relates the issue of identity of works to whether a work’s history of production is integral to the work or not. In brief, it appears that in painting and related art forms, such as drawing, watercolor, and the like (where there is only one instance of a work), but also in etching, woodcut, and the like (where there can be multiple instances of the same work), aspects of the work’s history of production are indeed essential to the identity of the work. Only the actual canvas that was painted by Raphael in 1505 counts as the Madonna del Granduca, and only those prints that come from the original plate used by Rembrandt for his Self-Portrait with a Velvet Cap with Plume (1638) count as the originals of that work—anything else is a copy, however apparently indistinguishable from the original. Art forms like painting and etching are for this reason named by Goodman “autographic” arts: “a work of art is autographic if and only if the distinction between original and forgery of it is significant; or better, if and only if even the most exact duplication of it does not thereby count as genuine” (1976, 113). You are looking at Raphael’s Madonna or at Rembrandt’s Self-Portrait only if you are looking at specific items properly connected, historically, to the artist who produced them. By contrast, music, dance, theater, literature, architecture seem to allow, although in different ways, for instantiations of the work that are independent of the work’s history of production. You can listen to a performance of Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony even if it is performed (as it would normally be) from a contemporary print of the score. Art forms like music, dance, etc., accordingly, can be called “allographic.”

As the examples above already illustrate, the distinction between autographic and allographic arts is not the same as that between arts that are singular and those that are multiple. Etching, for instance, is still autographic although multiple. Incidentally, this could allow Goodman to account for the interesting hypothesis, advanced by Gregory Currie (1989), of superxerox machines capable of reproducing paintings in a molecule-by-molecule faithful way. Such a cloning technique, Goodman could say, would transform the art of painting from singular to multiple, and yet without changing it from autographic to allographic.

Nor is the autographic/allographic distinction to be confused with that between one- and two-stage art forms, so distinguished according to whether the realization of the work requires some form of execution. A painting (which is autographic) is accessible once completed, while a theatrical play (allographic) requires a performance. Yet, allographic arts, too, can be one-stage, e.g., in the case of a novel, and autographic arts be two-stage—woodcut for example.

More relevantly, Goodman articulates his theory of work identity by addressing whether a given art form allows for a notational system, i.e., for a “score” that would “specify the essential properties a performance must have to belong to the work” (1976, 212). Accordingly, Goodman’s can also be seen as a novel way to account for the fact that some art forms—painting and sculpture for instance—do not allow for performances, while other art forms—such as music and dance—do. Advanced at first as a tentative approach, and indeed, throughout presented as open to revisions, the proposal is developed somewhat systematically, with the clear intent of showing its potential for becoming a general and comprehensive theory. Music, painting, literature, theater, dance, and architecture are all addressed with respect to the question of their relationships with the syntactic and semantic requirements of a notation. Goodman’s framework ends up being quite technical, given the need to refer to and explain the syntactic and semantic characteristics of notational systems. Also, such terms as “score,” “script,” and “sketch,” which all acquire specialized meanings. By the same token, the questions are not asked hypothetically or just as a mental exercise—in that sense, trivial notations could be devised for any art form (Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 7). Rather, the questions are addressed with reference to the systems of notations already existing, when they do, and, more generally, with awareness of the actual history of the various art forms.

Naturally, music and painting (and with the latter, of course, sculpture) end up standing on opposite sides of the spectrum, the first being allographic and allowing for a notation, the second autographic and not admitting of any notation compatible with practice. A work of music is, for Goodman, “the class of performances compliant with a character” (1976, 210), where the character is the musical work’s score. Consider that music written in standard musical notation is, for the most part—or, more precisely, for the “main corpus of peculiarly musical characters” (Goodman 1976, 183), i.e., for the flags arranged on the pentagram—in a notational language. All and only those performances that fully correspond to, or “comply with,” the score count as performances of the work. Even one small mistake on the part of the performer, say, in replacing one note for another, is sufficient to declare that, technically, a different work has been performed. On the other hand, other, important aspects of standard musical notation are not in a notational system: indications of tempo, for instance, as well as the convention of letting the performer choose the cadenza, give great latitude to the performer. Hence, in Goodman’s view, while two performances that sound almost exactly alike may not be performances of the same work, radically differently sounding performances may be. Notice, however, how the question of identity is here sharply distinct from the question of value: “the most miserable performance without actual mistakes does count as [a genuine instance of a work], while the most brilliant performance with a single wrong note does not” (Goodman 1976, 186).

One might be tempted to dismiss Goodman’s proposals for their conflicting with ordinary language and musical practice. Yet, it is most important to remember that Goodman is aware of ordinary practice and does not expect it to comply with the philosopher’s technical requirements (as “one hardly expects chemical purity outside the laboratory” [1976, 186]). Nor is he interested in reforming ordinary language: “I am no more recommending that in ordinary discourse we refuse to say that a pianist who misses a note has performed a Chopin Polonaise than that we refuse to call a whale a fish, the earth spherical, or a grayish-pink human white” (Goodman 1976, 187). Indeed, Goodman’s approach to the question of notation is, in an important sense, grounded in previous practice, for a notational system is an acceptable one only when projected from a previous classification of works. Furthermore, the history of an art form may include (as music did) an autographic stage, which only at a later time made room for the establishment of a notation, on the grounds of previous practice. Nor is Goodman’s approach lacking in application to real musical cases, as his discussion of alternative musical notations proves. Without, again, evaluating the different systems of musical notation, Goodman shows how an alternative system, such as the one proposed by John Cage, is not notational, and is indeed in important ways closer to a “sketch,” hence to a drawing, than to a score (Goodman 1976, 187–190).

What was just said about music also applies largely, in Goodman’s view, to the art of dance. While dance does not yet have a standard notation, Goodman finds the tentative notation proposed by Rudolf Laban (which indeed Laban proposed for movement in general) to be a good candidate for a notational system, indeed one with fewer departures from notationality than standard musical notation. And here is one of the many areas where the results of an aesthetic investigation, however tentative, may be relevant to other areas of human knowledge and activity. Goodman points out how a successful notation for human movement could be of great assistance in studies ranging from psychology to industrial engineering, in which it is of utmost importance to find criteria for determining whether, say, a subject or an experimenter has repeated the same behavior: and “the problem of formulating such criteria is the problem of developing a notational system” (1976, 218).

The conclusion that Goodman reaches about architecture is also a good indicator of the importance placed, in his analysis, on the actual history of an art form. Goodman claims that architecture does have, in the architect’s plans, something quite close to a notational system, and hence is, because of that, an allographic art: different buildings, built in different locations and even with certain differences in materials, would be instances of the same work, provided that they correspond to the same plan. Yet, aware of the history of the art form, namely, of its origins as an autographic art and of a certain dependence, even today, on the particular history of production of the particular building, Goodman concludes that in fact “architecture is a mixed and transitional case” (1976, 221).

As said, painting stands at the opposite extreme from a notational system, since works in this art form are “analogs,” characters in syntactically and semantically dense systems. It is important to emphasize how that does not mean that a classification of paintings according to a notational system could not be found, or even found easily: a library-type classification for paintings for instance. What it does mean, however, is that, given the history of the medium and of the ways of classifying works of painting, a library-type notation would be incompatible with established artistic practice. The painting itself (or, in the case of etching, only the prints using the original plate) counts (or count) as the work. And what is true of painting is true of the sketches that precede the painting. The sketch itself is a work of art, and one that is autographic, in spite of its being used as a guide to the production of the final work (Goodman 1976, 192–194).

Since the question of whether a notational system can be devised for a given art form is ultimately a question on the possibility of a “language” for that art form, i.e., at least of a notational scheme, art forms that use natural language bear interesting and sometimes surprising results. With a novel, poem, or the script used for a play or movie, the text is a character in a notational scheme. However, what counts as a work in such art forms is different. In theater or drama, a work is a set of performances compliant with what established in the script. As in the case of music, Goodman’s analyses involve a departure from the ordinary use of language: the dialogue of a play really works as a “score,” while stage directions and the like are a “script”—the former is fully notational, syntactically and semantically, the latter does not uniquely determine the performance, nor is it uniquely determined by the performance (1976, 210–11). It is the “score” part of the text that allows, in theater, for the work to be located in the set of performances. By contrast, with a novel or a poem, where no “score” is part of the text, and hence the text is a “script,” the work, Goodman claims, is the text itself (understood as a set of inscriptions fully corresponding, in spelling and punctuation, with each other). Even in the later work, Reconceptions, Goodman reemphasizes this claim (1988a, 49-65). While endorsing pluralism with regard to the number of correct interpretations (i.e., “applications”) a text may yield—indeed considering it often a positive feature of the artistic use of language—Goodman insists that the work, in literary art, is the text. Hence, in Jorge Luis Borges’s famous Pierre Menard case (that of a fictional French author trying to write a novel word-for-word identical to Cervantes’s Don Quixote [Borges 1962]), Goodman claims that what Menard produced was another inscription of Don Quixote’s text, hence an instance of the same work, albeit with his actions Menard may have suggested a possible, new interpretation of that work. Incidentally, the contrast between theater and the literature more narrowly conceived (i.e., as not including drama) may raise a question regarding poetry. Qua text with meaning (or “applications”, a poetic work is the text itself; yet, qua text to be performed, e.g., recited out loud for an audience, the poem would seem to be considered a character in a notational system, a “score” with as its field of reference the sounds to be uttered. On the other hand, in cinema, an art form Goodman does not address, again, one could identify, within the screenplay, a “score” in the parts that indicate dialogue, a “script” in the scene and instructions, with the ontology of the film itself, however, being that of a multiple art form made of the concrete reproductions of the visual and audio recordings that are displayed in the movie theater or on the TV screen.

Goodman’s theory of notation, and the analysis of the differing ways in which different art forms relate to that notion, establish almost a system for the arts, one that perhaps has not yet received sufficient credit from theorists working in aesthetics. Instead, for the most part contemporary discussion has concentrated on individual art forms and problematic examples.

Within the ontology of music, the claim for which the score fully, and solely, individuates the work has received the most attention. Separating ontological from evaluative claims, as seen above, Goodman could not state his stance on the matter more clearly: “the most miserable performance without actual mistakes” counts as an instance of a work, “while the most brilliant performance with one wrong note does not” (1976, 186). Of the two claims, that compliance with a score is necessary for a performance to be considered a bona fide instance of a musical work has been received with way more controversy than the one for which full compliance is sufficient to declare a performance a legitimate work instance. The former claim may seem naturally problematic. First of all, it clearly conflicts with actual practice. Of course, as mentioned, Goodman does not aim at reforming ordinary usage. Hence, his view is a form of what in art ontological discussions has become known as “revisionism” (versus “descriptivism”; cf. Dodd 2012) only in the sense that it separates ontological claims from actual artistic and art critical practices, thus allowing for even radical departures from such practices—yet, again, without advocating their modification. Even if all that is granted, to many, including thinkers who are sympathetic to the approach, Goodman’s leaving no wiggle-room, so as to allow the inclusion of performances that defer from the score for just minor mistakes (when not welcome changes), is problematic. Indeed, and further, there seems to be a conceptual problem in making sense of the claim on brilliant and yet wrong performances. For, of course, if a performance is wrong, hence fails to be an instance of a work, how can it then be referred to as “brilliant,” i.e., a brilliant performance, ultimately, of such work (Ridley 2013)? The more general and interesting question, here, may be whether Goodman’s theory has the resources to account for the kinship an incorrect performance of Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony has to the Fifth, which other musical pieces (performances of Three Blind Mice to use Goodman’s example) lack. Again, on Goodman’s behalf, dividing, here, might be the only way to conquer. The ontological claim on what individuates an artwork—hence, on what counts as a bona fide instance or performance of a work—is in itself independent of claims, in themselves not even philosophical, on what makes a musical piece recognizably similar (or virtually identical) to another. None of Goodman’s ontological claims need to deny such empirical facts. Further, recognizability, here, may interestingly intersect with symbolization. After all, Goodman is keenly interested in the symbolic relations between works of art (including, e.g., works that count as variations on the same theme; see 1976, 260–261, and Goodman, Elgin 1988, Chap. 4). A performance that aims, say, at an especially intense and driven rendering of a piece and, as a consequence of that, includes, perhaps unavoidably, departures from the prescribed notes, may be considered a (brilliant) rendering of such a piece by virtue of reference to, including exemplication of, the piece as individuated by the original score, although, ontologically, be considered—as it should be, Goodman would insist—an instance of a distinct work.

Especially when concentrating on just one art form and, hence, possibly losing sight of Goodman’s more general and systematic project, it might pass unnoticed that the separation between evaluative and ontological claims, in Goodman, is borne by an approach for which whatever individuates an artwork in the different art forms does not necessarily individuate all of the artwork’s properties, in which, aesthetically, we are interested. What Goodman says, e.g., about literature applies to all art forms: “defining literary works no more calls for setting forth all their significant aesthetic properties than defining metals calls for setting forth all their significant chemical properties” (1976, 210). After all, in art forms like music written according to traditional Western notation, which have developed a notation, we are legitimately interested in the different performances of a work of art—and in the best ones among them—precisely because what defines them as performances of a work is not the same as the set of aesthetic properties the work has to offer. On the other hand, one might be suspicious of the degree of inclusiveness of aesthetic properties (i.e., of non-work-defining properties that may nonetheless be the object of aesthetic attention) Goodman allows. That is, one might wonder whether the sufficiency claim, for which mere compliance with a “score” (in Goodman’s technical sense of the term) is all that is needed to identify, within art forms that have notations, bona fide work instances. With respect to the allographic arts, Goodman is opposed to making any concession to the relevance of historical properties to the individuation of artworks—it’s all left to the rules of the notation, at the syntactic or, if applicable, the semantic level. Hence, a work of music is whatever the “score,” semantically, individuates; and a work of literature is the text itself, the “script,”identified by the syntactic requirements of notations. Yet, in either case, there would be room for a modified notion of the allographic (investigated, for music, by Levinson 1980), according to which a “score” or a “script” are best understood, not just as structures, but as ones projected within given contexts. Such a move would allow restricting the range of aesthetic properties a given artwork can comprise. A performance of Beethoven’s Fifth executed so as to last a year, within such a notion of the allographic, could be considered the performance of a derivative (and bizarre) work, not of the Fifth. Similarly, interpretations of a novel that were to run against what is compatible with a given historically located projection (say, because anachronistic, or because incompatible with the genre a work is in) could, then, be declared inadmissible, or admissible as interpretations of an identical text, yet one projected within a different context and effectively amounting to a different work.

It is worth emphasizing how Goodman, although he begins his investigation with the autographic/allographic distinction (indeed introduced as a rough approximation), aims at developing an account of the role notation, at the syntactic or semantic level, plays within certain arts but not others. The result is not just an explanation of the autographic nature of some arts and the allographic nature of others. It is a way more articulated account of the variety of ways in which notationality, when present, has authority in identifying artworks in the various arts, hence in differently determining the localization of what counts as the artwork. To sum up, where a “score” is present, hence syntactic and semantic notationality, usually, the work is a compliance class of performances. Where a “script” is present, hence a notation only at the syntactic level, usually, the work is a class of inscriptions compliant with such script. Where notation is not established at either the semantic or the syntactic level, there is a “sketch,” which is usually the work itself, as a concrete individual or series of concrete individuals.

The complexity of the approach invites caution towards dismissing Goodman’s reasoning on the grounds of alleged counterexamples. It is quite clear how Goodman, throughout his work, takes himself as mostly offering “suggestions” towards a theory, not yet a complete one. Further, what he says about architecture, and the art form’s being a “mixed and transitional” case, or about drama, and its comprising, in the text of the play, “score” and “script,” suggests looking at ways, which Goodman seems to foresee, of combining parts of his account, and achieving more fine-grained results than the mere verdict on whether an art form is allographic or autographic, notational or not. Hence, in addition to what mentioned above about poetry and cinema, it is worth wondering what Goodman could say of certain forms of installation and conceptual art. For example, when Sol LeWitt gave instructions to create hisWall Drawings (works that were, then, realized by other individuals), was he producing works that represent an insurmountable challenge to Goodman’s distinctions (cf. Pillow 2003)? One possibility would be to consider LeWitt’s instructions as a “script,” which could in itself be counted as an artwork (much as a literary work), but, also, as instructions for the production of distinct works, constituted by the drawings actually realized. Such drawings, in turn, could be considered variations on the “theme” indicated by those instructions, while each an individual work, a concrete “sketch”; or, perhaps, each of LeWitt’s Wall Drawings is best considered a work with unusual mereology, a compound made of the “sketches”—one by one or all together —and those instructions. Whatever the answer to the questions arising in individual cases, the Goodmanian framework, with all its limits and underdeveloped areas, can clearly offer a range of possibilities and conceptual intersections. Somewhat relatedly, Goodman’s willingness to claim that there are cases, as with the class of performances of a John Cage’s composition embodied in a non-conventional score that qualifies as a “sketch,” in which work identity fails to be established (Goodman 1972b, 83-84), may be worthy of further consideration, as the various developments within art may have to make room for cases in which the identity of a work is uncertain.

4.4 Authenticity

An issue closely related to the ontological question of the identity of the work of art in the various art forms—indeed the very issue that Goodman uses, in Languages of Art, to introduce his theory of notation—is that of the importance of authenticity in art and of the aesthetic relevance of being a forgery. (Goodman’s comments on the question of forgery prompted a small debate on that issue, mostly represented in a collection edited by Denis Dutton [1983].) The brief answer is that authenticity matters only where there is no notationality. Hence, for instance, it makes no difference whether a musical piece is performed from the original score or from a copy congruent with that, since the score is in a notational scheme. Yet it does matter whether one is presented with an original Rembrandt or with a copy of it, since paintings are analogs, symbols in syntactically dense systems.

With regard to two visually indiscernible paintings, an original and a copy, Goodman addresses the question whether there is any aesthetic difference between the two pictures (1976, 99–102). Notice that, if there is a difference, it must not depend on what one can visually discern at the present time, for ex hypothesis, there is no such visual difference that can currently be detected. Goodman’s answer is that there is an aesthetic difference between the two paintings even now, when we are unable to tell one painting from the other, for an awareness that one is the original and the other a copy informs us that a difference may be perceived, and indeed modifies our present perception of the two paintings: now, for instance, we look for differences between the two paintings, we train our eyes and minds to discriminate differences that are currently indiscernible (1976, 103–105). Goodman’s takes his claims to be general and as granting the conclusion that “the aesthetic properties of a picture include not only those found by looking at it but also those the determine how it is to be looked at” (1976, 111–112). Hence, even with pictures that are not “perfect” copies of other pictures, indeed with any picture, knowing how it should be classified—including its classification by authorship, as a Rembrandt, a Vermeer, or a Van Meegeren—makes a difference to how the picture may be perceived. For perceiving is, after all, determined by the labels that one projects over what is presented in front of one’s eyes. It must be noticed, then, that this claim is all within a theory of perception and, while claiming that non-perceptible features are relevant to perception, hence are relevant to aesthetic experience, it does not claim that non-perceptible features as such are relevant to aesthetic experience.

4.5 Artistic Style

Goodman’s account of style is a good example of a Goodmanian “reconception”: the philosophical approach to the issue must not only abandon the characterization of style as related to form and hence contrasted to content (for, after all, that an author writes, say, of social issues rather than battles should count as an aspect of the author’s style), but must, most importantly, recognize the role that classifications in terms of style have in understanding and appreciating a work.

Goodman invites us to recognize elements of style in a work’s content, in its form, and in the feelings it expresses. His proposal is that the stylistic features of a work make up a subset of the features “of what is said, of what is exemplified, or of what is expressed” (Goodman 1978a, 32). In particular, stylistic features are those symbolic properties of a work that allow us to place the work in a certain place, time period, and artist’s oeuvre. That is, style properties help in answering questions as “where?”, “when?”, “who?” with respect to a work—they function, metaphorically, as a signature for a work: “style consists of those features of the symbolic functioning of a work that are characteristic of author, period, place, or school” (1978a, 35). Given what Goodman has said, when discussing the issue of authenticity, regarding the aesthetic importance of historical properties of a painting, knowing the style of an artwork is aesthetically relevant, since “knowledge of the origin of a work […] informs the way the work is to be looked at or listened to or read, providing a basis for the discovery of nonobvious ways the work differs from and resembles other works” (1978a, 38). It is in virtue of stylistic properties’ link to the symbolic functions of a work of art that identifying a work’s style, especially when complex and challenging and even difficult to identify, is integral to “the understanding of works of art and the worlds they present” (1978a, 40).

4.6 The Question of the Aesthetic and the Question of Merit

Goodman’s conclusions, on what roughly could be considered the question of what is art as well as on the question of artistic value, follow from his view that aesthetics is really a branch of epistemology and that there is ultimately no sharp division between art and other forms of human knowledge.

The aims of art are the aims of symbolic activity in general, and they have to do with understanding. (Understanding is, for Goodman, a broader concept than knowledge, one that is not bound by literal truth, and that is thus applicable also to the literally false and to what admits of no truth value: metaphors and paintings for example.) Artistic symbols, as symbols in general, are to be judged for the classifications they bring about, for how novel and insightful those categorizations are, for how they change our perception of the world and relations to it. The cognitive value of art counts as artistic merit only because the symbols involved and the experiences they bring about belong in some sense to what Goodman refers to as “the aesthetic.” Hence, the question of when such symbolic activities and experiences are aesthetic or artistic is important, although, for Goodman, more in order to recognize the commonalities between art and other human activities, including science, than to isolate the artistic or aesthetic realm from other areas of knowledge and experience.

Goodman proposes no definition of art nor of what makes an experience aesthetic. Since to be a work of art is, for Goodman, to perform certain referential functions, the question “What is art?” should be replaced with the question “When is art?”. That is, the real issue is to know when, typically at least, the symbolic activity in question has features that bring us to call it “artistic.” Hence, he suggests the existence of symptoms of the aesthetic, i.e., symbol systems’ characteristics that tend to occur in art. In Languages of Art, they were tentatively presented as conjunctively sufficient and disjunctively necessary for an experience to be aesthetic. There Goodman indicated four of such symptoms: syntactic density, semantic density, syntactic repleteness, and exemplificationality (1976, 252–255). In Ways of Worldmaking, the list is enriched by a fifth element: multiple and complex reference (Goodman 1978a, 67–68). In his later contribution that those are only symptoms seems to be taken even more literally: they are clues that indicate but do not guarantee the presence of a work of art; and artistic status is possible even without them. In other words, Goodman’s tentative claims on this issue point to symbolic activities and features of symbolic activity that artworks tend to instantiate. On these grounds, Goodman can once again claim that “[a]rt and science are not altogether alien” (1976, 255). The same features that are characteristic, for instance, of numerical calculation—e.g., articulateness—can be found in musical scores, and the same features that could be called aesthetic—such as exemplification—can be found in scientific hypotheses as well. In a more complete statement: “The difference between art and science is not that between feeling and fact, intuition and inference, delight and deliberation, synthesis and analysis, sensation and cerebration, concreteness and abstraction, passion and action, mediacy and immediacy, or truth and beauty, but rather a difference in domination of certain specific characteristics of symbols” (Goodman 1976, 264).

Goodman links artistic status to the performance of certain symbolic functions in certain ways. Yet, his emphasis on the importance of asking when art is rather than what art is should be seen as anti-essentialist claim with respect to art: there is no one property or set of properties, not even a function or set of functions, that are distinctive of art objects. On the other hand, that emphasis should not be taken to suggest that artworks can slip in and out of artistic status just on the grounds of use. Certainly, Goodman is committed to claiming that something can be a work of art at one time and not another (1978a, 67). Yet, he also emphasizes how artistic status is somewhat permanent: “The Rembrandt painting remains a work of art, as it remains a painting, while functioning only as a blanket” (1978a, 69).

Goodman’s positive claims with respect to the experience of art are certainly to be taken seriously, in spite of the fact that the negative claims preceding them, once read in light of the later developments and applications of cognitive science to art, may sound too quickly dismissive. Goodman emphasizes the cognitive role of emotions in the apprehension of a work of art (1976, 248). In art, he emphasizes, feeling emotions, whether positive or negative, pleasant or unpleasant, is a way to perceive the work and the world through the work. Feeling melancholy when listening to a piece of music, for instance, may be a way to perceive musical features of the work, as well as to perceive the world in terms of them. Hence, the emotions serve the understanding. On the other hand, such claims as, for instance, that the view according to which “art is concerned with simulated emotions suggests, as does the copy theory of representation, that art is a poor substitute for reality” (1976, 246) are, in light of more recent developments, in tension with other claims by Goodman, such as that the “actor or dancer—or the spectator—sometimes notes and remembers the feeling of a movement rather than its pattern, insofar as the two can be distinguished at all” (1976, 248). For the sort of phenomena mentioned in the latter claim may very well be best explained by cognitive theories that consider mental simulation and other forms of mimicry central to certain imaginative activities as well as to memory.

Art has a general importance to the knowledge enterprise, which is addressed with special clarity in Ways of Worldmaking. A primary thesis in that work “is that the arts must be taken no less seriously than the sciences as modes of discovery, creation, and enlargement of knowledge in the broad sense of advancement of the understanding, and thus that the philosophy of art should be conceived as an integral part of metaphysics and epistemology” (1978a, 102). A more general thesis of the book is that the multiple and competing “versions” of the world that humankind makes—through scientific theories (claiming, e.g., that the Sun is the center of the universe, or claiming that the Earth is) but also through mythology, art, philosophy, and so on and so forth—literally make worlds; they “fabricate” what we call “facts.” And there isn’t just one, all-embracing version of the world: multiple and incompatible versions are possible. That is, Goodman is a constructivist and a relativist. His relativism, however, is not one of laissez-faire: versions can be distinguished between right and wrong, and indeed attempts to construct a world may fail. For the worlds that Goodman posits are not possible worlds brought about by possible descriptions of the world. Rather, when the versions are right, they are all part of the actual world.

For such metaphysical and epistemological approach to include the arts amongst the means to construct worlds, one needs only to add that versions of the world include non-verbal versions and non-literal versions as well. Art forms that do not use language, such as painting or music or architecture, can offer ways of perceiving and understanding the world—indeed ways to construct a world—allowing us, for instance, to see and hear and perceive things in new and refreshing ways. Works of art can participate in worldmaking precisely because they have symbolic functions (1978a, 102). As linguistic labels categorize the world (and new, unusual labels as “grue” and “bleen” categorize it differently), so do pictorial labels, for instance, categorize it in a number of ways (and some of them indeed in new ways). Visiting a museum can change our perception of the world, making us notice new aspects of reality and allowing us to encounter a different reality. Literal denotation, metaphorical denotation, as well as exemplification and expression, can all contribute to the construction of a world. Cervantes’s Don Quixote literally denotes no one, yet metaphorically it denotes many of us. And artworks, by exemplifying shapes, colors, emotional patterns, etc., as well as by expressing what they literally do not possess, can bring about a reorganization of the world of ordinary experience. This is not just true in the sense that seeing a painting may change our way of seeing the world. Works of art may have effects that go beyond their medium, and hence music may affect seeing, painting affect hearing, and so on. Especially in “these days of experimentation with the combination of media in the performing arts” […] music, pictures, and dance “all interpenetrate in making a world” (1978a, 106).


A. Primary Works (in Aesthetics)

A.1 Books

  • 1968a, Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols, Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • 1972a, (with Perkins, David, and Howard Gardner), Basic Abilities Required for Understanding and Creation in the Arts: Final Report, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University, Graduate School of Education: Project No. 9–0283.
  • 1972b, Problems and Projects, Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • 1976, Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols, 2nd edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • 1978a, Ways of Worldmaking, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • 1984, Of Mind and Other Matters, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • 1988, (with Catherine Z. Elgin), Reconceptions in Philosophy and Other Arts and Sciences, London: Routledge.

A.2 Articles

  • 1966, “Merit as Means,” in Sidney Hook (ed.), Art and Philosophy, New York: New York University Press, reprinted in Goodman, 1972b.
  • 1968b, “Art and Inquiry” (Presidential Address), Proceedings and Addresses of The American Philosophical Association, Eastern Division, 41, Yellow Springs, OH: Antioch.
  • 1970a, “Some Notes on Languages of Art. Reply to Richard Wollheim,” Journal of Philosophy, 67, reprinted in Goodman, 1972b.
  • 1970b, (with Howard Gardner), “The Randolph Museum Case,” prepared for the Institute in Arts Administration, Harvard University.
  • 1971, “On J. J. Gibson’s New Perspective,” Leonardo, 4.
  • 1972c, “Art and Understanding: The Need for a Less Simple-Minded Approach,” Music Educators Journal 58.
  • 1974a, “On Reconceiving Cognition,” The Monist (Supplement), 58.
  • 1974b, “On Some Questions Concerning Quotation,” The Monist, 58.
  • 1975a, “A Message from Mars,” The Arts Spectrum, Office of the Arts, Harvard University, 2.
  • 1975b, “The Status of Style,” Critical Inquiry, 1.
  • 1975c, “Words, Works, Worlds,” Erkenntnis, 9, reprinted in Goodman, 1978a.
  • 1977, “When Is Art?” In Perkins, David, and Barbara Leondar (eds.), The Arts and Cognition, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • 1978b, “Comments on Wollheim’s Paper: ‘Are the Criteria of Identity that Hold for a Work of Art in the Different Arts Aesthetically Relevant?’” Ratio, 20.
  • 1978c, “Reply to Beardsley,” Erkenntnis, 12, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1978d, “Reply to Eberle,” Erkenntnis, 12, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1978e, “Reply to Kjørup,” Erkenntnis, 12, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1978f, “Reply to Robinson,” Erkenntnis, 12, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1978g, “Reply to Rudner,” Erkenntnis, 12, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1978h, “Stories upon Stories; or, Reality in Tiers,” originally presented at the Conference on Levels of Reality, Florence, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1979a, “J. J. Gibson’s Approach to the Visual Perception of Pictures,” Leonardo, 12.
  • 1979b, “Metaphor as Moonlighting,” Critical Inquiry, 6, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1980, “Twisted Tales—or, Story, Study, and Symphony,” Critical Inquiry, 7.
  • 1981a, “Routes of Reference”, Critical Inquiry, 8, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1981b, “Perspective as a Convention—on the Views of Goodman and Gombrich,” Leonardo, 14.
  • 1981c, “Routes of Reference.” Critical Inquiry, 8, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1981d, “The Telling and the Told,” Critical Inquiry, 7.
  • 1981e, “Ways of Worldmaking,” Leonardo, 14.
  • 1982a, “Fiction for Five Fingers,” Philosophy and Literature, 6, reprinted in Goodman, 1984.
  • 1982b, “Implementation of the Arts,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 40.
  • 1983a, “Afterword: An Illustration,” in Copeland, Roger, and Marshall Cohen (eds.), What Is Dance? Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1983b, “Modes of Symbolization,” in Copeland, Roger, and Marshall Cohen (eds.), What Is Dance? Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1983c, “Realism, Relativism, and Reality,” New Literary History, 14.
  • 1983d, (with Menachem Brinker), “Representation and Realism in Art,” printed in Hebrew as “Yitzog v’ realizem b’omanut,” Iyyun, 32.
  • 1983e, “The Role of Notations,” in Copeland, Roger, and Marshall Cohen (eds.), What Is Dance? Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1985a, “How Buildings Mean,” Critical Inquiry, 11, reprinted in Goodman, Elgin, 1988.
  • 1985b, “Statements and Pictures,” Erkenntnis 22.
  • 1985c, “The End of the Museum?” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 19.
  • 1986a, “A Note on Copies,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 44, pp. 291–292.
  • 1986b, (with Catherine Z. Elgin), “Interpretation and Identity—Can the Work Survive the World?” Critical Inquiry, 12.
  • 1986c, “The Nature and Function of Architecture,” Domus, 672.
  • 1987a, with Catherine Z. Elgin, “Changing the Subject,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46, reprinted with modifications in Shusterman, Richard (ed.), Analytic Aesthetics, Oxford: Blackwell, 1989.
  • 1987b, “Variations on Variation—or Picasso Back to Bach,” Acta Philosophica Fennica, 43.
  • 1988, “Aims and Claims,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 22.
  • 1988, “On What Should Not Be Said about Representation,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 46.
  • 1991a, “On Capturing Cities,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 25.
  • 1991b, “Retrospections,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 25.
  • 1992, “Contraverting a Contradiction, A Note On Metaphor And Simile, Reply To Kulka, Tomas,” Poetics Today, 13.
  • 1994, (with T. Kulka), “How Metaphor Works its Wonders,” in Czech, Filosoficky Casopis, 42.
  • 1996, “Authenticity,” in Turner, Jane Shoaf (ed.), The Grover Dictionary of Art, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1997, “Some Reflections on My Philosophies,” Philosophia Scientiae, 2.

A.3 Multimedia Works

  • 1972, Hockey Seen: A Nightmare in Three Periods and Sudden Death, first performed in Cambridge, Mass. Drawings by Katharine Sturgis; author and producer, Nelson Goodman; choreographer, Martha Gray; composer, John C. Adams.
  • 1973, Rabbit, Run, dance version of John Updike’s novel, first performed at the Agassiz Theatre, Harvard University. Author and producer, Nelson Goodman; choreographer, Martha Gray; composer, Joel Kabakov.
  • 1985d, Variations: An Illustrated Lecture Concert, including live or taped performance of David Alpher’s “Las Meninas” Theme and Variations for piano, guitar, oboe, and cello, synchronized with presentation of slides of Las Meninas by Velazquez and of Picasso’s painted variations on it, first performed at the University of Helsinki. Conceptual design by Nelson Goodman.

B. Secondary Works

B.1 References

  • Black, Max, 1954, “Metaphor,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 55, pp. 273–294.
  • Borges, Jorge, 1962, “Pierre Menard, Author of the Quixote,” Labyrinths, New York: New Directions, pp. 36–44.
  • Budd, Malcolm, 1993, “How Pictures Look.” In Knowles, Dudley, and John Skorupski (eds.), Virtue and Taste, Cambridge: Blackwell.
  • Currie, Gregory, 1989, An Ontology of Art, New York: Saint Martin’s Press.
  • Dodd, Julian, 2013, “Adventures in the Metaontology of Art: Local Descriptivism, Artefacts and Dreamcatchers,” Philosophical Studies, 165: 1047–68.
  • Dutton, Denis, 1983, The Forger’s Art, Berkeley, Calif.: University of California Press.
  • Giovannelli, Alessandro, 1997, “Pictures and Reference in Nelson Goodman,” (in Italian), Annali del Dipartimento di Filosofia di Firenze, 1996-1997, pp. 91–131.
  • Gombrich, Ernst, 1960, Art and Illusion, London: Phaidon Press.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1941, A Study of Qualities, Ph.D. Dissertation, Harvard University; in book form, New York: Garland (Harvard Dissertations in Philosophy Series, 1990).
  • –––, 1951, The Structure of Appearance, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press (3rd edition), Boston: Reidel, 1977.
  • –––, 1954, Fact, Fiction, and Forecast, University of London: Athlone Press. 4th ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1983.
  • Levinson, Jerrold, 1980. “Autographic and Allographic Art Revisited,” Philosophical Studies, 38: 367–84.
  • Pillow, Kirk, 2003. “Did Goodman’s Distinction Survive LeWitt?” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61, pp. 365–80.
  • Ridley, Aaron, 2013, “Brilliant Performances,” Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 71: 209–27.
  • Robinson, Jenefer, 2000, “Languages of Art at the Turn of the Century,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58, pp. 213–218.
  • Walton, Kendall, 1990, Mimesis as Make-Believe, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Wollheim, Richard, 1968, Art and Its Objects: An Introduction to Aesthetics, New York: Harper and Row (2nd edition), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
  • Wollheim, Richard, 1987, Painting as an Art, London: Thames and Hudson.

B.2 Festschrifts and Symposia

  • The Monist, Special issue dedicated to Languages of Art, 1974, 58. Includes: Margolis, Joseph, “Art as Language”; Sparshot, F. E., “Goodman on Expression”; Tormey, Alan, “Indeterminacy and of Identity in Art”; Kjørup, Søren. “George Inness and the Battle of Hastings, or Doing Things with Pictures”; Walton, Kendall L., “Are Representations Symbols?”; Bennett, John G., “Depiction and Convention”; Carrier, David, “A Reading of Goodman on Representation”; Ross, Stephanie, “Caricature”; Goodman, Nelson. “On Some Questions Concerning Quotation.” 294–306; Howard, V. A., “On Musical Quotation.”
  • The Monist, Supplement, Symposium on Skills and Symbols, 1974, 58. Includes: Gardner, Howard, “A Psychological Investigation of Nelson Goodman’s Theory of Symbols”; Wartowsky, Marx W., “Art, Action and Ambiguity”; Goodman, Nelson, “On Reconceiving Cognition.”
  • Erkenntnis, Special issue dedicated to The Philosophy of Nelson Goodman, 1978, 12. Includes: Eberle, Rolf A., “Goodman on Likeness and Difference of Meaning”; Wartowsky, Marx W., “Rules and Representation: The Virtues of Constancy and Fidelity Put in Perspective”; Robinson, Jenefer. “Two Theories of Representation”; Kjørup, Søren, “Pictorial Speech Acts”; Howard, V. A., “Music and Constant Comment”; Sagoff, Mark, “Historical Authenticity”; Beardsley, Monroe C., “Languages of Art and Art Criticism”; Morawski, Stefan, “Three Observations on Languages of Art”; Rudner, Richard S., “Show or Tell: Incoherence among Symbol Systems”; Goodman, Nelson, “Replies”.
  • The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Symposium: Aesthetics and Worldmaking: An Exchange with Nelson Goodman, 1981, 39. Includes: Ackerman, James S., “Worldmaking and Practical Criticism”; Kulenkampff, Jens, “Music Considered as a Way of Worldmaking”; Martin, Richard, “On Some Aesthetic Relations”; Nagel, Alan F., “‘Or as a Blanket’ Some Comments and Questions on Exemplification”; Margolis, Joseph, “What is When? When is What? Two Questions for Nelson Goodman”; Silvers, Anita, “The Secret of Style”; Hernadi, Paul.“More Questions Concerning Quotations”; Goodman, Nelson, “Replies.”
  • Journal of Aesthetic Education, Symposium on More Ways of Worldmaking, 1991, 25. Includes: Hernadi, Paul, “More Ways of Worldmaking”; Goodman, Nelson, “On Capturing Cities”; Elgin, Catherine Z., “Sign, Symbol and System”; Mitchell, W.J.T., “Realism, Irrealism and Ideology—A Critique of Nelson Goodman”; Wollheim, Richard, “The Core of Aesthetics”; Hernadi, Paul, “Reconceiving Notation and Performance”; Ullian, J. S. “Truth”; Bruner, Jerome, “Self-Making and World-Making”; Hawley, A., “A Venerable Museum Faces the Future—Guided Tour Through the Gardner and its Director’s Mind”; Elgin, Catherine Z., “What Goodman Leaves Out”; Goodman, Nelson, “Retrospections”; Berka, Sigrid, “An International Bibliography of Works by and Selected Works about Nelson Goodman.”
  • The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Symposium: The Legacy of Nelson Goodman, 2000, 58. Includes: Carter, Curtis, “Nelson Goodman: Obituary”; Robinson, Jenefer, “Languages of Art at the End of the Century”; Elgin, Catherine Z., “Reorienting Aesthetics, Reconceiving Cognition”; Lopes, Dominic McIver, “From Languages of Art to Art in Mind”; Cometti, Jean-Pierre, “Activating Art: A View from France”; Kivy, Peter, “How to Forge a Musical Work”; Gardner, Howard, “Project Zero: Nelson Goodman’s Legacy in Arts Education.”

B.3 Books

  • Cohnitz, Daniel, and Rossberg, Marcus, 2006, Nelson Goodman, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • Douglas, Mary, and David Hull, 1992, How classification works: Nelson Goodman among the social sciences, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Elgin, Catherine, 1983, With Reference to Reference, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Elgin, Catherine, 1997, Nelson Goodman’s Philosophy of Art (The Philosophy of Nelson Goodman: Selected Series series). New York: Garland Publishing.
  • Ernst, Gerhard, Steinbrenner, Jakob, and Scholz, Oliver (eds.), 2009, From Logic to Art: Themes from Nelson Goodman, Philosophical Research (Philosophische Forschung), Vol. 7, Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag.
  • Morizot, Jacques, 1996, La philosophie de l’art de Nelson Goodman, Nîmes: Éd. J. Chambon.
  • Paetzold, Heinz, 1997, The Symbolic Language of Culture, Fine arts, and Architecture: Consequences of Cassirer and Goodman: Three Trondheim Lectures, Trondheim: FF Edition.
  • Reimer, B., and J. E. Wright (eds.), 1992, On the Nature of Musical Experience, Niwot, Co.: University Press of Colorado.
  • Rudner, Richard, and Israel Scheffler (eds.), 1972, Logic and Art: Essays in Honor of Nelson Goodman, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Shottenkirk, Dena, 2009, Nominalism and Its Aftermath: The Philosophy of Nelson Goodman, (Synthese Library), New York: Springer.

B.4 Articles and Book Chapters

  • Ackerman, James, 1981. “Worldmaking and Practical Criticism,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 249–54.
  • Arrell, Douglas, 1990. “Exemplification Reconsidered,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 30: 233–43.
  • –––, 1987. “What Goodman Should Have Said About Representation,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46: 41–9.
  • Bach, Kent, 1970. “Part of What a Picture Is,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 10: 119–37.
  • Beardsley, Monroe, 1978. “Languages of Art and Art Criticism,” Erkenntnis: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, 12: 95–118.
  • –––, 1973. “Semiotic Aesthetics and Aesthetic Education,” Philosophic Exchange: Annual Proceedings, 1: 155–71.
  • –––, 1973. “What Is an Aesthetic Quality?” Theoria: A Swedish Journal of Philosophy, 39: 50–70.
  • Bender, John, 1996. “Realism, Supervenience, and Irresolvable Aesthetic Disputes,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 54: 371–81.
  • Bennett, John, 1974. “Depiction and Convention,” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 58: 255–68.
  • Blumson, Ben, 2008. “Depiction and Convention,” Dialectica: International Journal of Philosophy of Knowledge, 62: 335–48.
  • Boretz, Benjamin, 1970. “Nelson Goodman’s Languages of Art from a Musical Point of View,” Journal of Philosophy, 67: 540–52.
  • Brown, Lee, 1980. “Philosophy, Rhetoric, and Style,” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 63: 425–44.
  • –––, 1996. “Musical Works, Improvisation, and the Principle of Continuity,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 54: 353–69.
  • Bruner, Jerome, 1991. “Self-Making and World-Making,” Journal of Aesthetic Education: 67–78.
  • Bull, Malcolm, 1994. “Scheming Schemata,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 34: 207–17.
  • Campbell, Keith, 1994. “Nelson Goodman’s Assimilation of Literary and Scientific Knowledge,” Literature and Aesthetics: The Journal of the Sydney Society of Literature and Aesthetics, 4: 7–15.
  • Cantrick, Robert, 1993. “Is the Constructionalist Program Still Relevant?” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 51: 71–2.
  • Capdevila-Werning, Remei, 2011. “Can Buildings Quote?,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 69: 115–24.
  • Carrier, David, 1982. “Art Without Its Artists?” British Journal of Aesthetics, 22: 233–44.
  • –––, 1974. “A Reading of Goodman on Representation,” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 58: 269–84.
  • Carter, Curtis, 2000. “A Tribute to Nelson Goodman,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 251–3.
  • Charlton, William, 1979. “The Art of Apelles,” Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volume, Suppl. 53: 167–186.
  • Chasid, Alon, 2004. “Why the Pictorial Relation Is Not Reference,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 44: 226–47.
  • Cohen, Ted, 1981. “The Facts of Narrative: A Response to Nelson Goodman,” Synthese: An International Journal for Epistemology, Methodology and Philosophy of Science, 46: 351–4.
  • Coldron, John, 1982. “Peltz on Goodman on Exemplification,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 16: 87–94.
  • Cometti, Jean-Pierre, 2000. “Activating Art,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 237–43.
  • Cooper Wengrowicz, Monica, 2002. “Poetry and Scientific Exposition: An analysis of Two Forms of Symbolic Representation,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 36: 86–99.
  • Davies, David, 1996. “Interpretive Pluralism and the Ontology of Art,” Revue Internationale De Philosophie, 50: 577–92.
  • –––, 1991. “Works, Texts, and Contexts: Goodman on the Literary Artwork,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21(3): 331–46.
  • D’Cruz, Jason, and P.D., Magnus, 2014. “Are Digital Images Allographic?,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 72: 417–27.
  • Derksen, Anthony, 2005. “Linear Perspective as a Realist Constraint,” Journal of Philosophy, 102: 235–58.
  • Dickie, George, 1985. “Evaluating Art,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 25: 3–16.
  • Drost, Mark, 1994. “Husserl and Goodman on the Role of Resemblance in Pictorial Representation,” International Studies in Philosophy 26: 17–27.
  • Eaton, Marcia, 1977. “Metaphor and the Causal Theory of Expression,” Personalist, 58: 358–68.
  • Elgin, Catherine Z., 1991. “What Goodman Leaves Out,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 25: 89–96.
  • –––, 1993. “Relocating Aesthetics,” Revue Internationale De Philosophie, 46: 171–86.
  • –––, 2000. “Interpretation and Understanding,” Erkenntnis: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, 52: 175–83.
  • –––, 2000. “Reorienting Aesthetics, Reconceiving Cognition,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 219–25.
  • Elkins, James, 1993. “From Original to Copy and Back Again,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 33: 113–20.
  • Falk, B., 1975. “Portraits and Persons,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 75: 181–200.
  • Files, Craig, 1996. “Goodman’s Rejection of Resemblance,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 36: 398–412.
  • Gardner, Howard, 2000. “Project Zero: Nelson Goodman’s Legacy in Arts Education,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 245–9.
  • Giordani, A., Frigerio, A., Mari, L., 2013. “On Representing Information: A Characterization of the Analog/Digital Distinction,” Dialectica: International Journal of Philosophy of Knowledge, 67: 455–483.
  • Giovannelli, Alessandro, 2012. “Nelson Goodman (1906–1998),” in A. Giovannelli (ed.), Aesthetics: The Key Thinkers, London: Continuum, 166–80.
  • Goodrich, R. A., 1988. “Goodman on Representation and Resemblance,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 28: 48–58.
  • Gover, K. E., 2015. “Are All Multiples the Same? The Problematic Nature of the Limited Edition,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 73: 69–80.
  • Harris, N. G. E., 1973. “Goodman’s Account of Representation,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 31: 323–7.
  • Hernadi, Paul, 1981. “More Questions Concerning Quotation,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 271–3.
  • Hester, Marcus, 1972. “Are Paintings and Photographs Inherently Interpretative?” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 31: 235–46.
  • Hopkins, Robert, 2005. “Aesthetics, Experience, and Discrimination,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63: 119–33.
  • Howard, V. A., 1978. “Music and Constant Comment,” Erkenntnis: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, 12: 73–82.
  • –––, 1972. “On Representational Music,” Noûs, 6: 41–53.
  • Hyman, John, 2013. “Depiction,” Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 71: 129–50.
  • Innis, Robert, 1977. “Art, Symbol, and Consciousness: A Polanyi Gloss on Susan Langer and Nelson Goodman,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 17: 455–76.
  • Jacquette, Dale, 2000. “Goodman on the Concept of Style,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 40: 452–66.
  • Janaway, Christopher, 1999. “What a Musical Forgery Isn’t,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 39: 62–71.
  • Jensen, Henning, 1973. “Exemplification in Nelson Goodman’s Aesthetic Theory,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 32: 47–51.
  • Kivy, Peter, 2000. “How to Forge a Musical Work,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 233–5.
  • Kotrozo-Donnell, Carol, 1982. “Representation as Denotation,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 40: 361–8.
  • Kulenkampff, Jens, 1981. “Music Considered as a Way of Worldmaking,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 254–8.
  • Kulka, Tomas, 2005. “Forgeries and Art Evaluation: An Argument for Dualism in Aesthetics,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 39: 58–70.
  • Kulvicki, John, 2003. “Image Structure,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61: 323–40.
  • Lammenranta, Markus, 1992. “Goodman’s Semiotic Theory of Art,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 22: 339–51.
  • –––, 1988. “Nelson Goodman on Emotions in Music,” Acta Philosophica Fennica, 43: 210–6.
  • Laner, Iris, 2015. “Practical Aesthetic Knowledge: Goodman and Husserl on the Possibilities of Learning from Aesthetic Practices,” Estetika: The Central European Journal of Aesthetics, 52: 164–89.
  • –––, 2014. “Learning by Viewing: Towards a Phenomenological Understanding of the Practical Value of Aesthetic Experience,” Proceedings of the European Society for Aesthetics, 6: 208–28.
  • Lauter, H. A., 1988. “Cognitive Art,” Philosophical Inquiry: International Quarterly, 10: 85–95.
  • Levinson, Jerrold, 1980. “Autographic and Allographic Art Revisited,” Philosophical Studies: An International Journal for Philosophy in the Analytic Tradition, 38: 367–84.
  • Lewis, Douglas, 1971. “Analog and Digital,” Noûs, 5: 321–8.
  • Lopes, Dominic M. McIver, 2000. “From Languages of Art to Art in Mind,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 227–31.
  • Lord, Catherine, and José A. Benardete, 1991. “Baxandall and Goodman,” in Kemal, Samil, and Ivan Gaskell (eds.), The Language of Art History, New York: Cambridge Univ Press.
  • Manns, James, 1977. “Goodman on Metaphor,” Personalist, 58: 173–8.
  • Margolis, Joseph, 1970. “Numerical Identity and Reference in the Arts,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 10: 138–46.
  • –––, 1976. “Aesthetic Appreciation and the Imperceptible,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 16: 305–12.
  • –––, 1981. “What is When, When is What: Two Questions for Nelson Goodman,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 266–8.
  • –––, 1984. “Artworks and the History of Production,” Communication and Cognition: An Interdisciplinary Quarterly Journal, 17: 89–106.
  • –––, 1998. “Farewell to Danto and Goodman,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 38: 353–74.
  • Martin, Richard, 1981. “On Some Aesthetic Relations,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 258–64.
  • McCormick, Peter. 1987. “Real Fictions,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46: 259–70.
  • Mitchell, W. J. T., 1991. “Realism, Irrealism, and Ideology: A Critique of Nelson Goodman,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 25(1): 21–35.
  • Mitias, Michael, 1994. “Expression in Architecture,” in Mitias, M. (ed.), Philosophy and Architecture, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Morawski, Stefan, 1978. “Three Observations on Languages of Art,” Erkenntnis: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, 12: 119–28.
  • –––, 1974. “On Mimesis,” Ajatus: Yearbook of the Philosophical Society of Finland, 36: 201–34.
  • Morizot, Jacques, 2011. “Phenomenalism in Epistemology and Physicalism in Aesthetics,” Principia: Revista Internacional de Epistemologia, 15: 439–52.
  • Morton, Luise, and Thomas R. Foster, 1991. “Goodman, Forgery, and the Aesthetic,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 49: 155–9.
  • Newall, Michael, 2010. “Pictorial Resemblance,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 68: 91–103.
  • Novitz, David, 1975. “Picturing,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 34: 145–55.
  • Nozick, Robert, 1972. “Goodman, Nelson, on Merit, Aesthetic,” Journal of Philosophy, 21: 783–5.
  • Pearce, David, 1988. “Musical Expression: Some Remarks on Goodman’s Theory,” Acta Philosophica Fennica, 43: 228–43.
  • Peltz, Richard, 1972. “Nelson Goodman on Picturing, Describing, and Exemplifying,” Journal of Aesthetic Education, 6: 71–86.
  • Pillow, Kirk, 2003. “Did Goodman’s Distinction Survive LeWitt?” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61: 365–80.
  • Pole, David, 1974. “Goodman and the ‘Naïve’ View of Representation,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 14: 68–80.
  • Predelli, Stefano, 1999. “Goodman and the Wrong Note Paradox,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 39: 364–75.
  • –––, 1999. “Goodman and the Score,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 39: 138–47.
  • Ralls, Anthony, 1972. “The Uniqueness and Reproducibility of a Work of Art: A Critique of Goodman’s Theory,” Philosophical Quarterly, 86: 1–18.
  • Ridley, Aaron, 2013, “Brilliant Performances,” Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 71: 209–27.
  • Robinson, Jenefer, 1979. “Some Remarks on Goodman’s Language Theory of Pictures,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 19: 63–75.
  • –––, 2000. “Languages of Art at the Turn of the Century,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 58: 213–8.
  • Ross, Stephanie, 1981. “On Goodman’s Query,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 19: 375–88.
  • Sagoff, Mark, 1976. “The Aesthetic Status of Forgeries,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 35: 169–80.
  • Salmon, Merrilee, 1974. “Representation and Intention in Art,” Philosophical Forum, 5: 365–74.
  • Savile, Anthony, 1971. “Nelson Goodman’s Languages of Art: A Study,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 11: 3–27.
  • Schutz, Robert, 1975. “Sense and Reference in the Languages of Art,” Philosophical Studies: An International Journal for Philosophy in the Analytic Tradition, 28: 77–89.
  • Schwartz, Robert, 1997. “Pictures, Puzzles, and Paradigms,” Philosophia Scientiae, 2: 231–42.
  • Shusterman, Richard, 1995. “Art Infraction: Goodman, Rap, Pragmatism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 73: 269–79.
  • Sigman, Jill, 2000. “How Dances Signify: Exemplification, Representation, and Ordinary Movement,” Journal of Philosophical Research, 25: 489–533.
  • Silvers, Anita, 1981. “The Secret of Style,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 268–71.
  • Sirridge, Mary, 1980. “The Moral of the Story: Exemplification and the Literary Work,” Philosophical Studies: An International Journal for Philosophy in the Analytic Tradition, 38: 391–402.
  • Smith, Barbara Herrnstein, 1970. “Literature as Performance, Fiction and Art,” Journal of Philosophy, 67: 553–62.
  • Soldati, Kristina, 2013. “Dance-Specific Aspects in the Tradition of the Symbol Theory of Nelson Goodman,” Proceedings of the European Society for Aesthetics, 5: 442–454.
  • Sparshott, Francis E., 1974. “Goodman on Expression,” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 48: 187–202.
  • Stalker, Douglas, 1978. “Goodman on Authenticity,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 18: 195–8.
  • Todd, Jennifer, 1980. “The Roots of Pictorial Reference,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 39: 47–58.
  • Topper, David, 1984. “On the Fidelity of Pictures: A Critique of Goodman’s Disjunction of Perspective and Realism,” Philosophia: Philosophical Quarterly of Israel, 14: 187–98.
  • Tormey, Alan, 1973. “Aesthetic Theory and Education,” Philosophic Exchange: Annual Proceedings, 1: 177–81.
  • van de Vall, Renée, 2015. “The Devil and the Details: The Ontology of Contemporary Art in Conservation Theory and Practice,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 55: 285–302.
  • van der Berg, Servaas, 2012. “Towards Defending a Semantic Theory of Expression in Art: Revisiting Goodman,” South African Journal of Philosophy, 31: 600–612.
  • Walton, Kendall, 1971. “Languages of Art: An Emendation,” Philosophical Studies: An International Journal for Philosophy in the Analytic Tradition, 22: 82–5.
  • –––, 1974. “Are Representations Symbols?” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 58: 236–54.
  • Wartofsky, Marx, 1974. “Art, Action and Ambiguity,” Monist: An International Quarterly Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry, 58: 327–38.
  • Webster, William, 1971. “Music is not a ‘Notational System’,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 29: 489–98.
  • Weitz, Morris, 1971. “Professor Goodman on the Aesthetic,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 29: 485–8.
  • Wilsmore, Susan, 1987. “The Literary Work is not Its Text,” Philosophy and Literature, 11: 307–16.
  • Wilson, Catherine, 1982. “Illusion and Representation,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 22: 211–21.
  • Wollheim, Richard, 1970. “Nelson Goodman’s Languages of Art,” Journal of Philosophy, 67: 531–9.
  • –––, 1991. “The Core of Aesthetics,” Journal of Aesthetic Education: 37–45.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 1985. “Art in Realist Perspective,” Idealistic Studies: An Interdisciplinary Journal of Philosophy, 15: 87–99.
  • Woosuk, Park, 2014. “Misrepresentation in Context,” Foundations of Science, 19: 363–74.
  • Wreen, Michael, 1983. “Goodman on Forgery,” Philosophical Quarterly, 33: 340–53.
  • Young, James, 1999. “Art, Knowledge, and Exemplification,” British Journal of Aesthetics, 39: 126–37.
  • Zeimbekis, John, 2015. “Why Digital Pictures Are Not Notational Representations,” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 73: 449–53.
  • Ziff, Paul, 1971. “Goodman’s Languages of Art,” Philosophical Review, 80: 509–15.

Other Internet Resources

Also, there are 3 supplementary documents in the Summer 2015 archived version of the SEP entry on relativism that are relevant:

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