The Philosophy of Music

First published Mon Oct 22, 2007; substantive revision Mon Oct 30, 2023

Philosophy of music is the study of fundamental questions about the nature and value of music and our experience of it. Like any “philosophy of X,” it presupposes knowledge of its target. However, unlike philosophy of science, say, the target of philosophy of music is a practice most people have a significant background in, merely as a result of being members of a musical culture. Many people take music to play a significant and valuable role in their lives. Thus, as with the central questions of metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics, not only can most people quickly grasp the philosophical questions music raises, they tend to have thought about some of those questions before encountering the academic discipline itself.

Music arguably presents more philosophical puzzles than any other art. Unlike painting, its works often have multiple instances, none of which can be identified with the work itself. Thus, the question of what exactly the work is is initially more puzzling than the same question about works of painting, which appear (at least initially) to be ordinary physical objects. Unlike much literature, the instances of a work are performances, which offer interpretations of the work, yet the work can also be interpreted (perhaps in a different sense) independent of any performance, and performances themselves can be interpreted. This talk of “interpretation” points to the fact that we find music an art steeped with meaning, and yet, unlike drama, music—at least “pure” instrumental music—has no obvious semantic content. This quickly raises the question of why we should find music so valuable. Central to many philosophers’ thinking on these subjects has been music’s apparent ability to express emotions while remaining an abstract art in some sense.

This entry focuses almost exclusively on contemporary philosophy of music (i.e., work since the mid-twentieth century) in an analytic vein. For a historical overview, see the entries on the history of Western philosophy of music: antiquity to 1800 and history of Western philosophy of music: since 1800. For much broader introductions to philosophy of music, covering its history, major figures, connections with other disciplines, and a wider range of topics, see Gracyk & Kania 2011 and McAuley, Nielsen, & Levinson 2021. Useful single-author overviews include Scruton 1997, Kivy 2002, Hamilton 2007, and Kania 2020.

Most analytic work has primarily discussed Western classical music. (For criticism of this tendency, see Alperson 2009.) In the last 25 years, there has been increasing recognition that different musical practices may not only suggest different answers to the same philosophical questions, but also raise different philosophical questions. Apart from Western classical music, popular Western traditions, such as rock and jazz, have received the most attention. Non-Western musical traditions have received little attention. (Exceptions include S. Davies 2001: 254–94 and 2007; Alperson, Nguyen, & To 2007; S. P. Walton 2007; and Higgins 2007.)

1. What Is Music?

1.1 Music Alone and Together

It is plausible that song is the most common kind of music listened to across history and the globe. Moving images (film, television, videogames, etc.) are ubiquitous in the contemporary world, and most have musical soundtracks. Nonetheless, most philosophy of music considers what Peter Kivy calls music alone (1990)—instrumental music with no non-musical aspects, elements, or accompaniments. At least three reasons can be given to defend this narrow focus. First, pure music often presents the most difficult philosophical problems. The maudlin text of a song plausibly contributes to the song’s expressiveness; it is more puzzling how a piece of music alone could be emotionally expressive. Second, though the problems are more difficult, the solutions are likely to be more easily evaluated with respect to music alone. Just as apportioning blame is easier when one person is responsible for a crime than when the blame must be divided between a number of conspirators, the success of a solution to the problem of musical expressiveness may be clearer if it can explain the expressiveness of music alone. Third, the expressiveness of music alone will play a role in the expressiveness of musical hybrids such as song or film. Though its text may contribute to the expressiveness of a song, for instance, the musical aspects of the song must play some role. A maudlin text set to a jauntily upbeat melody will clearly not have the same overall expressiveness as the same text set to a plodding dirge. Though expressiveness is used as an example here, these same points apply to discussions of musical understanding and value.

Even if these three reasons are compelling (see Ridley 2004 for a sustained critique), music’s combination with other media raises further philosophical questions. There is no space to consider those questions here, but on the aesthetics of song, see Levinson 1987; Gracyk 2001; Bicknell & Fisher 2013; and Bicknell 2015. On music drama, see Kivy 1988b, 1994; Goehr 1998; and Penner 2020. On film music, see Carroll 1988: 213–225; Smith 1996; Levinson 1996b; and Kivy 1997a. See also the chapters in part V of Gracyk & Kania 2011. On hybrid art forms more generally, see Levinson 1984 and Ridley 2004.

1.2 The Definition of “Music”

Explications of the concept of music usually begin with the idea that music is organized sound. They go on to note that this characterization is too broad, since there are many examples of organized sound that are not music, such as human speech, or the sounds non-human animals and machines make. There are two further kinds of necessary conditions philosophers have added in attempts to fine tune the initial idea. One is an appeal to “tonality” or essentially musical features such as pitch and rhythm (Scruton 1997: 1–79; Hamilton 2007: 40–65; Kania 2011a). Another is an appeal to aesthetic properties or experience (Levinson 1990a; Scruton 1997: 1–96; Hamilton 2007: 40–65). As these references suggest, one can endorse either of these conditions in isolation, or both together.

The main problem with the first kind of condition is that every sound seems capable of being included in a musical performance, and thus characterizing the essentially musical features of sounds seems hopeless. (We need only consider the variety of “untuned” percussion available to a conservative symphonist, though we could also consider examples of wind machines, typewriters, and toilets, in Ralph Vaughan Williams’s Sinfonia Antartica, Leroy Anderson’s The Typewriter, and Yoko Ono’s “Toilet Piece/Unknown.”) Defenders of such a condition have turned to sophisticated intentional or response-dependent theories of tonality in order to overcome this problem. If the essentially musical features of a sound are not intrinsic to it, but somehow related to how it is produced or perceived, we can classify just one of two “indiscernible” sounds as music.

If one endorses only an aesthetic condition, and not a tonality condition, one still faces the problem of poetry—non-musical aesthetically organized sounds. Levinson, who takes this approach, excludes organized linguistic sounds explicitly (1990a: 272). This raises the question of whether there are further distinctions to be made between arts of sound. Andy Hamilton defends a tripartite division, arguing that sound art, as opposed to both music and literature, was established as a significant art form in the twentieth century (2007: 40–65). This is one reason that Hamilton endorses both tonal and aesthetic conditions on music; without the former, Levinson is unable to make such a distinction. On the other hand, by endorsing an aesthetic condition, Hamilton is forced to exclude scales and Muzak, for instance, from the realm of music. Kania (2020: 296–301) suggests that it is a mistake to think that music is necessarily an art. He argues that we should distinguish the medium of music from its artistic uses, just as we do in the cases of language and literature, depiction and painting, and so on.

Jonathan McKeown-Green (2014) makes trenchant criticisms of definitions of music that assume that the nature of music is settled by our conception of music (395, italics removed). He argues that no such definition could be future-proof, since it would be hostage to our changing conception of music. At best, we would end up with a kind of sociological history of music that would fail to fulfill any of the functions of a definition. McKeown-Green singles out the definitions of Kania (2011a) and Levinson (1990a), stated in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, as of this hopeless kind. But Kania (2020: 302–5) argues that McKeown-Green’s criticisms apply equally to the looser definitions of Hamilton and S. Davies (2012).

Having discussed complications, it’s worth returning to the basic idea of “organized sound.” Most theorists note that music does not consist entirely of sounds. Most obviously, much music includes rests. You might think that silence can function only to organize the sounds of music. One counterargument is that an understanding listener listens to the rests, just as she listens to the sounds (Kania 2010). Another is to provide putative cases of music in which the silences do not structure sounds as ordinary rests do. John Cage’s 4′33″ is frequently discussed, though there is broad agreement that this piece is not silent—its content is the ambient sounds that occur during its performance. (See Dodd 2018 for dissent.) Anyway, S. Davies (1997a), Dodd (2018), and Kania (2010) all argue that Cage’s piece is not music—Davies and Dodd because its sounds (if any) fail to qualify as organized, Kania because they fail to meet a tonality condition. Wadle (forthcoming) argues that the piece is music, because of its contextual connections to previous musical works. Kania considers several other contenders for the label of “silent music,” arguing that there are indeed extant examples, most notably Erwin Schulhoff’s “In Futurum” from his Fünf Pittoresken, which predates Cage’s 4′33″ by some 33 years.

2. Musical Ontology

Musical ontology is the study of the kinds of musical things there are and the relations that hold between them. The most discussed issues within this field have been the metaphysical nature of works of Western classical music (the “fundamentalist debate”), and what it is to give an “authentic performance” of such works. Recently there has been growing interest in the ontologies of other Western musical traditions, such as rock and jazz, and discussion of the methodology and value of musical ontology. (For more detailed overviews of these debates, see Matheson & Caplan 2011, and Nussbaum 2021.)

2.1 The Fundamentalist Debate

Musical works in the Western classical tradition admit of multiple instances (performances). Much of the debate over the nature of such works thus reads like a recapitulation of the debate over the “problem of universals”; the range of proposed candidates covers the spectrum of fundamental ontological theories. We might divide musical ontologists into the realists, who posit the existence of musical works, and the anti-realists, who deny their existence. Realism has been more popular than anti-realism, but there have been many conflicting realist views. We begin with two unorthodox realist views before moving on to more orthodox Platonist and nominalist theories, concluding with a consideration of anti-realism.

Idealists hold that musical works are mental entities. Collingwood (1938) and Sartre (1940) respectively take musical (and other) works to be imaginary objects and experiences. The most serious objections to this kind of view are that (i) it fails to make works intersubjectively accessible, since the number of works going under the name The Rite of Spring will be as multifarious as the imaginative experiences people have at performances with that name, and (ii) it makes the medium of the work irrelevant to an understanding of it. One might have the same imaginative experience in response to both a live performance and a recording of The Rite of Spring, yet it seems an open question whether the two media are aesthetically equivalent. But see Cox 1986 and Cray & Matheson 2017 for attempts to revive idealism.

David Davies argues that musical works, like all works of art, are actions, in particular the compositional actions of their composers (2004). Thus he revives what we might call an “action theory” of the ontology of art. (An earlier defender of such a view is Gregory Currie (1989), who argues that artworks are types of action, rather than the particular actions with which Davies identifies them.) Although deciding between theories of musical ontology is always to some extent a matter of finding a balance between the benefits of a theory and its cost in terms of our pre-theoretic intuitions, action theories have a particularly hard row to hoe since they imply that an instance of a work is some action performed by a composer, rather than a performance. In order to make up for such damage to our intuitions the theoretical benefits of an action theory would have to be quite extensive.

Most theorists think that some kind of Platonist or nominalist theory of musical works is more plausible than those so far considered. Platonism, the view that musical works are abstract objects, is arguably still the dominant view, though it seems to be losing ground to sophisticated nominalisms. Its great advantage is its ability to respect more of our pre-theoretic intuitions about musical works than other theories can. On the other hand, it is the most ontologically puzzling, since abstract objects are not well understood. Nonetheless, Platonism has been tenacious, with much of the debate centering around what variety of abstract object musical works are. What we might call “simple Platonism” (known simply as “Platonism” in the literature), is the view that works are eternal existents, existing in neither space nor time (Kivy 1983a, 1983b, Dodd 2007). Puy (2019) presents a variation according to which musical works are higher-order types, of which the types other Platonist thinks are works are specific versions of works. (See D. Davies 2021 for discussion.)

According to “complex Platonism,” musical works come to exist in time as the result of human action. The complexity is motivated by a number of features of musical practice, including the intuition that musical works are creatable, the attribution of various aesthetic and artistic properties to works, and the fine-grained individuation of works and performances (e.g., in terms of who composed them, or what instruments they are properly performed upon) (Ingarden 1961; Thomasson 2004; Wolterstorff 1980; Wollheim 1968: 1–10, 74–84; Levinson 1980, 1990b, 2012; S. Davies 2001: 37–43; Howell 2002; Stecker 2003a: 84–92).

Nominalists identify a musical work with something concrete. The most obvious candidate is a collection of performances, whether the collection be understood as a set (Goodman 1968; Predelli 1995, 1999a, 1999b, 2001), a fusion (Caplan & Matheson 2004, 2006), or something more esoteric (Tillman 2011; see also Moruzzi 2018). Charles Nussbaum (2007: 143–87) and P. D. Magnus (2012) argue for a close analogy between musical works and species. Nussbaum (2021: 334) points out that a sophisticated nominalist theory of species has been developed in great detail over the years by Ruth Millikan (1984, 2000). While such views are attractive because they appeal only to the least problematic kinds of entities, they face serious challenges. Though many of our claims about musical works may be paraphraseable into claims about sets of (possible) performances, some seem to make intractable reference to works. For instance, most performances of The Rite of Spring—even including the possible ones—include several wrong notes. Thus it is difficult to imagine how the paraphrase schema will avoid the nonsensical conclusion that The Rite of Spring contains several wrong notes, if the work consists entirely of performances. In response to this problem, most nominalists add to the collection of performances some provenential item, such as an original score or act of composition. Whether this addition can solve the problem without necessitating the reintroduction of an abstract entity is one question any nominalist must address.

Intermediate between Platonism and nominalism are the views of Philip Letts (2018) and Guy Rohrbaugh (2003). Letts argues that any view of musical works as types would be improved by identifying those types with their associated properties, a proposal that may be developed in a Platonist or nominalist direction. Rohrbaugh’s view of musical works as historical individuals “embodied in,” but not constituted by, physical things such as scores and performances closely resembles to the views of Nussbaum and Magnus, discussed above, but Rohrbaugh takes the work to be an abstract object over and above its embodiments. (For discussion, see Dodd 2007: 143–66.)

In contrast to all these realist views stand those of the anti-realists, who deny that there are any such things as musical works. An early proponent of such a view is Richard Rudner (1950), though it is difficult to say whether he is best interpreted as an eliminativist or a fictionalist, the two anti-realist views currently on the table. According to eliminativists, there are no such things as musical works, and thus we ought to stop trying to refer to them. Ross Cameron (2008) defends such a view, but only with respect to “Ontologese”—the language we speak when we do ontology. He argues that ordinary English locutions such as “there are many musical works” can be true without there being any musical works. (For critical discussion, see Predelli 2009 and Stecker 2009.) According to fictionalists, the value of discourse about musical works is not truth, and thus we ought not to abandon the discourse despite the non-existence of its subject matter, but rather to adopt a different, make-believe attitude towards it (or perhaps we already do so). (See Kania 2008; for criticism, see D. Davies 2011: 45–50, Letts 2015, and Nussbaum 2021: 337.)

Much of this debate over the fundamental ontological category to which musical works belong has turned on “technical” issues, that is, controversial general metaphysical claims about the nature of properties, causation, embodiment, and so on (e.g., Howell 2002; Trivedi 2002; Caplan & Matheson 2004, 2006; Dodd 2007; Hazlett 2012; Kleinschmidt & Ross 2012; Dodd & Letts 2017; Cameron 2008). In the face of this, some theorists have pointed out that musical works are cultural entities, and thus the methodology appropriate to uncovering their ontological status might be quite different from that of general metaphysics (Goehr 1992; S. Davies 2003a; D. Davies 2004; Thomasson 2006). For further discussion of the methodology of musical ontology, see D. Davies 2009, 2017; Predelli 2009; Stecker 2009; Dodd 2010, 2013; Mag Uidhir 2012b; and Nussbaum 2021.

2.2 Higher-level Ontological Issues

It might seem that, since musical works are ontologically multiple, once we have figured out their true nature, we will know what relation holds between the work and its performances, namely, whatever relationship holds between entities of that kind and their instances. However, since the fundamentalist debate is about the basic ontological category to which works belong, resolving that debate may leave open many questions about the relation between a work and its performances. For instance, is the use of a harpsichord required to instance Bach’s Brandenburg Concerto No. 5 in performance? Would producing harpsichord-like sounds on a synthesizer do just as well? What about using another keyboard instrument from Bach’s time, or a modern piano? Learning that musical works are, say, eternal types will not necessarily help settle this issue of “authentic performance,” which is perhaps the most discussed music-ontological issue, of interest to philosophers, musicologists, musicians, and audiences alike. (For an excellent overview of the authentic performance debate, see S. Davies 2001: 201–53. For an investigation of authenticity with respect to things other than instantiation of the work, see Kivy 1995; Gracyk 2001, 2009, 2017; Bicknell 2015; and Cray 2019.)

There have been two sources of widespread confusion in the debate over authenticity in performance. One is a failure to recognize that authenticity is not simply a property, but a relation that comes in degrees and holds with respect to different aspects of its target. Something may be more authentic in one regard and less authentic in another (S. Davies 2001: 203–5). Another is the assumption that authenticity is an evaluative concept, in the sense that “authentic” implies “good.” That this is not the case is clear from the fact that an authentic murderer is not a good thing (S. Davies 2001: 204). Thus, our value judgments will be complex functions of the extent to which we judge performances authentic in various regards, and the values we assign to those various kinds of authenticity.

The central kind of authenticity that has been discussed is authenticity with respect to the instantiation of the work. Most agree that the fullest such authenticity requires the production of the right pitches and rhythms in the right order. (For skepticism based on the history of the practice, see Dyck 2014; Ravasio 2019a; and the discussion in Dodd 2020b and Ravasio 2020.) Pure sonicists argue that this is sufficient (e.g., Kivy 1988a). Timbral sonicists argue that these pitches must also have timbres reflecting the composer’s instrumentation (e.g., Dodd 2007: 201–39). Instrumentalists argue that such sounds must be produced on the kinds of instruments specified in the score (e.g., Levinson 1990c). Much of the debate is over what kinds of aesthetic or artistic properties are essential to musical works. If the limpid textures of Bach’s Brandenburg Concerto No. 5 are essential to it, then one cannot authentically instance the work using a grand piano instead of a harpsichord. As such, the debate reflects a wider one in aesthetics, musical and otherwise, between formalists (or empiricists, or structuralists), who believe that the most important properties of a work are intrinsic ones, accessible to listeners unaware of the historical and artistic context in which it was created, and contextualists, who believe that a work is essentially tied to its context of creation. Stephen Davies has argued for a strong contextualism, claiming that one cannot give a single answer to the question of whether particular instrumentation is required for the fully authentic instantiation of a work. Works can be ontologically “thicker” or “thinner” as a result of the specifications of a composer working within certain conventions (1991, 2001). The more properties of a fully authentic performance a particular work specifies, the thicker it is. Thus for some works (typically earlier in the history of Western music) instrumentation is flexible, while for others (e.g., Romantic symphonies) quite specific instrumentation is required for fully authentic performances.

In addition to the question of what constitutes authenticity, there has been debate over its attainability and value. Those who question its attainability point to our historical distance from the creation of some works (Young 1988). We may no longer be able to read the notation in which the work is recorded, or construct or play the instruments for which it was written. If so, full authenticity is not attainable. But we rarely have no idea about these matters, and thus we might achieve partial authenticity (S. Davies 2001: 228–34). Those who question the value of authenticity often target kinds other than work-instantiation. For instance, one might question the value of producing a performance that authentically captures the sound of performances as they took place in the context of a work’s composition, on the basis that musicians were not as highly skilled then as now, for instance (Young 1988: 229–31). Such arguments, though, have no consequences for the value of work-instantiation. Some argue that although we might attain an authentic instance of a work, the idea that we might thereby hear the work as its contemporaries heard it is wishful thinking, since the musical culture in which we are immersed enforces ways of listening upon us that we cannot escape (Young 1988: 232–7). Thus the point of such authenticity is questioned. In response, we may consider not only the possibility that we are in a better position to appreciate historical works than contemporary ones, but also the remarkable flexibility people seem to show in enjoying many different kinds of music from throughout history and the world (S. Davies 2001: 234–7).

Julian Dodd (2020a) argues that there is more than one way to be true to a musical work, and thus to produce an authentic performance: One can comply with the score, or one can be true to the music’s overall integrity or point (136). When the two conflict, interpretive authenticity trumps score-compliance authenticity (147) because the fundamental norm of work-performance practice is to perform it in a way that evinces a subtle or profound understanding of it (163), while score compliance is valued only because it tends to lead to such performances. Andrew Kania responds that it is unclear whether, even by the lights of Dodd’s own theory, Dodd’s central examples are cases of interpretive authenticity trumping score compliance (Kania 2022: 131–2). More importantly, he argues that Dodd’s conception of the music’s overall integrity or point misses the importance of the surface-level details to a work’s meaning or content. Kania suggests, instead, that the fundamental norm of the practice is to evince an understanding of the work through complying with its score (2022: 127, italics altered).

Moving on from authenticity, a second area that may be independent of the fundamentalist debate is that of comparative ontology. (For dispute over this framing issue, see Brown 2011, 2012.) Just as classical works from different historical periods may be ontologically diverse, so may works from different contemporary traditions. Theodore Gracyk has argued that instances of works of rock music are not performances. Rather, the work is instanced by playing a copy of a recording on an appropriate device (1996; cf. Fisher 1998). Stephen Davies has argued that rock is more like classical music than Gracyk acknowledges, with works for performance at the heart of the tradition, albeit works for a different kind of performance (2001: 30–6). Gracyk’s view has been amplified and defended in attempts to find a place for composition, live performance, and performance skill within his basic framework (Kania 2006, Bruno 2013, Bartel 2017, Magnus 2022).

Work on the ontology of jazz has centered on the nature of improvisation, particularly the relation between improvisation and composition (Alperson 1984, 1998; Valone 1985; Brown 1996, 2000; Hagberg 1998; Gould & Keaton 2000; Sterritt 2000; and Young & Matheson 2000; Bresnahan 2015; Love 2016; Magnus 2016). This has been a useful reminder that not all music is the performance of pre-composed works (Wolterstorff 1987: 115–29). However, improvisation can occur within the context of such a work, as in the performance of an improvised cadenza in a classical concerto. Some have argued that there is not as significant a distinction between improvisation and composition as is usually thought (Alperson 1984). Others have argued that all performance requires improvisation (Gould & Keaton 2000). Yet others restrict the possibility of improvisation to certain kinds of musical properties, such as “structural” rather than “expressive” ones (Young & Matheson 2000). However, none of these arguments are compelling. Usually they turn on equivocal use of terms such as “composition” and “performance,” or beg the question by defining improvisation in terms of deviation from a score or variation of a limited set of “expressive” properties.

Though jazz is not necessarily improvisational, and very few jazz performances lack any sort of prior compositional process, the centrality of improvisation to jazz presents a challenge to the musical ontologist. One might argue that jazz works are ontologically like classical works—composed for multiple, different performances—but that they tend to be thinner, leaving more room for improvisation (Gould & Keaton 2000; Young & Matheson 2000). The difficulty is to specify the work without conflating one work with another, since tokening the melody may not be required, and many works share the same harmonic structure. As a result, some argue that the performance is itself the work (Alperson 1984; Hagberg 2002; S. Davies 2001: 16–19). One problem here is parity with classical music. If jazz performances are musical works in their own right, it is difficult to deny that status to classical performances of works, yet this seems to multiply works beyond what we usually think is necessary. A third possibility is that in jazz there are no works, only performances (Brown 1996, 2000: 115; Kania 2011b). This is counterintuitive if “work” is an evaluative term, but it is not obvious that this is the case.

Julian Dodd (2014a) argues that the kinds of considerations adduced in favor of these views confuse questions of ontology with questions of value. Jazz is ontologically like early classical music, according to Dodd: the focus of critical attention is the improvisatory performance rather than the composition it instantiates, but that composition is no less a musical work for that difference in critical emphasis. (See Fisher 2018 for an attempted reconciliation.) Similar considerations might be adduced against the increasingly complicated ontologies of rock referred to above. Such arguments return us to debates about the methodology of musical ontology.

3. Music and the Emotions

The most widely discussed philosophical question concerning music and the emotions is that of how music can express emotions. (For a more extensive introduction, see part II of Gracyk & Kania 2011; for a thorough treatment, see S. Davies 1994.) There is a second group of questions centered around listeners’ emotional responses to music. These include questions about why and how we respond emotionally to music, the value of such responses, and why we choose to listen to music that elicits “negative” responses from us, such as sadness. Theorists typically restrict themselves to “pure” or “absolute” music on the grounds that it is easier to understand how music with an accompanying text, say, could express the emotions evident in the text. However, an important criterion for the evaluation of such music is how appropriately the composer has set her chosen text to music. So an accompanying text is clearly not sufficient for the musical expression of an emotion. Thus, a better reason for initially putting such music to one side is perhaps that the interrelation of music and text, or other elements, is likely to be highly complex, and best approached with as well-developed a theory of the more basic phenomena in hand as possible. (For an extended criticism of this approach, see Ridley 2004: 1–104.)

3.1 Emotions in the Music

Pieces of music, and performances of them, are standardly said to be happy, sad, and so on. Music’s emotional expressiveness is a philosophical problem since the paradigm expressers of emotions are psychological agents, who have emotions to express. Neither pieces of music, nor performances of them, are psychological agents, thus it is puzzling that such things could be said to express emotions.

One radical way to solve the puzzle is to deny that music is emotionally expressive. A major burden of such eliminativism is to explain away the widespread tendency to describe music in emotional terms. This has been attempted by arguing that such descriptions are shorthand or metaphor for purely sonic features (Urmson 1973), basic dynamic features (Hanslick 1854), purely musical features (Sharpe 1982), or aesthetic properties (Zangwill 2007). There are many problems with such views. For one thing, they seem committed to some sort of scheme for reduction of expressive predicates to other terms, such as sonic or musical ones, and such a scheme is difficult to imagine (Budd 1985a: 31–6). For another, anyone not drawn to this theory is likely to reject the claim that the paraphrase captures all that is of interest and value about the passage described, precisely because it omits the expressive predicates (Davies 1994: 153–4).

Conventionalism is the view that music’s expressiveness is a matter of the conventional association of certain musical elements, such as slow tempi, with certain emotional states, such as sadness. Such conventions must play a role in some cases of expression—for instance, cases of particular musical instruments (e.g., the snare drum) being associated with particular situations (e.g., war) and thus emotions (e.g., foreboding). But such conventions seem unlikely to account for all musical expressiveness, since much of that expressiveness seems less arbitrary than conventionalism would suggest. It seems implausible, for instance, that the convention for funeral dirges might just as easily have that they should be quick-paced and in major keys. Even in cases like the snare drum, it seems possible that the instrument was chosen for the battlefield in part because of the expressive character of its sonic profile.

The cliché that music is “the language of the emotions” is often considered as a possible starting point for a theory of musical expressiveness. The idea combines the attractive simplicity of conventionalism with the formalist notion that music’s order is to be understood in terms of syntax. (See Lerdahl & Jackendoff 1983 for a theory along the latter lines.) However, although Deryck Cooke (1959) and Leonard Meyer (1956) are often cited as proponents, it is not clear that anyone holds a full-blown version of the theory. The central problem is the great disparities between language and music, in terms of the ways in which each is both syntactic and semantic (Jackendoff 2011). A serious subsidiary problem is that even if music were about the emotions in the way that language can be, that would not account for music’s expressiveness. The sentence “I am sad” is about the emotions, but it is not expressive of sadness in the way a sad face is, though you could use either to express your sadness. Most people agree that music’s relation to emotion is more like that of a sad face than that of a sentence. (This last criticism is also applicable to Susanne Langer’s theory (1953) that music is about the emotions in a symbolic yet non-linguistic way.)

We now turn to theories that attempt to connect the notion of music’s expressiveness to actual felt emotions. One obvious way to do so is to argue that pieces of music or performances of them are expressions of such emotions—those of the composer or performer. There are two major problems with this “expression theory.” The first is that neither composers nor performers often experience the emotions their music is expressive of as it is produced. Nor does it seem unlikely that a composer could create, or a performer perform, a piece expressive of an emotion that she had never experienced. This is not to deny that a composer could write a piece expressive of her emotional state, but for the expression theory to be an account of musical expressiveness, at least all central cases of expressiveness must follow this model, which is not the case. Moreover, if a composer is to express her sadness, say, by writing a sad piece, she must pen the right kind of piece. In other words, if she is a bad composer she might fail to express her emotion. This brings us to the second major problem for the expression theory. If a composer can fail to express her emotions in a piece, then the music she writes is expressive independent of the emotion she is experiencing. Thus music’s expressiveness cannot be explained in terms of direct expression.

Those usually cited as classic expression theorists include Tolstoy (1898), Dewey (1934), and Collingwood (1938). (A classic critique is Tormey 1971: 97–127.) These theorists have been defended in recent discussions, however, from accusations that they hold the simple view outlined above (Ridley 2003, Robinson 2005: 229–57). Jenefer Robinson has attempted to revive the expression theory, though she defends it as an interesting and valuable use of music’s expressiveness, rather than an account of expressiveness itself (2005: 229–347; 2011).

A second way to link music’s expressiveness with actual felt emotions is through the audience. According to arousalism, the expressiveness of a passage of music amounts to its tendency to arouse that emotion in a competent listener. Arousalism faces several objections. First, some competent listeners seem emotionally unmoved by music (or are at least not moved to the specific emotions expressed by it). But perhaps the arousalist can simply restrict the class of listener to which his theory appeals to those who are so moved. Second, some emotions, such as fear, require a particular kind of intentional object (something threatening), yet there is no such object at hand when we hear fearful music. Thus it seems implausible to claim the music’s fearfulness resides in its arousal of fear in us. But perhaps the arousalist can broaden the class of aroused emotions to include appropriate responses to the expressed emotion, such as pity. Third, in many cases it seems that listeners respond emotionally to the expressiveness of the music. It is not clear that the arousalist can handle such cases non-circularly. (A sophisticated defense of the arousal theory is to be found in Matravers 1998: 145–224, though see the second thoughts in Matravers 2011. For an extended critique, see S. Davies 1994: 104–200.)

Despite the problems of the arousal theory as the whole story of musical expressiveness, there is a growing consensus, thanks largely to the work of Jenefer Robinson (1994, 2005), that our lower-level, less cognitive responses to music must play some role in the emotional expressiveness we attribute to it. However, this role is likely to be a causal one, rather than part of an analysis of what it is for music to be emotionally expressive.

Several theorists have defended accounts of musical expressiveness known variously as resemblance, contour, or appearance theories (e.g., Kivy 1989, though see Kivy 2002: 31–48 for recent qualms; Budd 1995: 133–54; S. Davies 1994: 221–67). The central idea is that music’s expressiveness consists in the resemblance between its dynamic character and that of various typical aspects of people experiencing emotions. The aspects appealed to include the phenomenology of the experience of the emotion, the emotion’s facial expression, the contour of vocal expression or bodily behavior of a person experiencing the emotion. Stephen Davies argues that such theories hold music to be expressive in a literal albeit secondary sense of the term. We say that a piece of music is sad in the same sense in which we say that a weeping willow is sad (S. Davies 2006: 183). Such uses are no more metaphorical than a claim that a chair has arms.

Jerrold Levinson agrees that there is an important resemblance between the contour of music expressive of an emotion and the contour of typical behavioral expressions of that emotion. He objects, however, that such an account cannot be the whole, or even the most fundamental part of the story (Levinson 1996a, 2006b). He drives in a wedge precisely at the point where an appeal is made to the resemblance between the music and typical behavioral expressions. He asks what the manner and extent of the resemblance between the two must be, precisely, in order for the music to count as expressive of some emotion. After all, everything resembles everything else in all sorts of ways, and so one could point out many resemblances between a funeral march and an expression of joy, or for that matter a cup of coffee and sadness. The resemblance theorist must give some account of why the funeral march, and not the cup of coffee, is expressive of sadness and not joy. Levinson claims that the obvious answer here is that the funeral march is “readily hearable as” an expression of sadness. If this is correct, then the resemblance the music bears to emotional behavior is logically secondary—a cause or ground of its expressiveness. The expressiveness itself resides in the music’s disposition to elicit the imaginative response in us of hearing the music as a literal expression of emotion. As a logical consequence, the imaginative experience prompted must include some agent whose expression the music literally is.

In reply to this kind of objection, Stephen Davies has emphasized the role of the listener’s response in resemblance theories. Such responses have always been appealed to by such theories, as evidenced by Malcolm Budd’s talk of “hearing as” (1995: 135–7), and Peter Kivy’s discussion of our tendency to “animate” that which we perceive (1980: 57–9). But Davies now makes the appeal quite explicit and central, devoting as much space to explication of the response-dependent nature of expressiveness as to the role of resemblance (2006). For Davies, the response of the competent listener upon which the expressiveness of the music depends is one of an experience of resemblance rather than imagined expression (2006: 181–2). Matteo Ravasio (2019b) argues that this leads to further problems.

Since Davies’s theory posits at base a contour-recognition experience while Levinson’s posits an imaginative experience of expression, the link between literal expression and musical expressiveness looks closer in Levinson’s theory than in Davies’s. An empirical consequence seems to be that Davies’s theory will predict weaker emotional responses to music than Levinson’s. Whether or not this is an advantage or disadvantage of the theory depends on the empirical facts about how we respond emotionally to music.

3.2 Emotions in the Listener

There are three main questions asked about our emotional responses to pure music, apart from what role they play in expressiveness. The first is analogous to the “paradox of fiction.” It is not clear why we should respond emotionally to music’s expressiveness when we know that no one is undergoing the emotions expressed. The second is a variant of the “paradox of tragedy.” If some music arouses “negative” emotional responses in us, such as sadness, why do we seek out the experience of such music? This leads to the more general question of the value of our emotional responses to music. The first two questions are addressed in this section, and the third in section 5.1.

Peter Kivy (1999) argues that those who report emotional reactions to music are confusing the pleasure they take in the beauty of the music, in all its expressive individuality, with the feeling of the emotion expressed. Though most philosophers appeal to ordinary experience and empirical data to reject the plausibility of Kivy’s position, they admit the problem that motivates it, namely, the conceptual tension between the nature of music and the nature of the emotions we feel in response to it. There is some consensus that emotions are cognitive, in the sense that they take intentional objects—they are about things—of certain kinds. For instance, in order to feel fear, one must believe that something is threatening (the “intentional object” of the emotion). When one listens to a sad piece of music, however, one knows there is nothing literally feeling sad, and thus it is puzzling that one should be made sad by the experience.

Part of the solution is that not all emotional responses (broadly construed) are cognitive (Robinson 1994; 2005: 387–400). For instance, it is no more puzzling that one could be startled by a fortissimo blow to a bass drum than that one could so respond to a thunderclap. Another part of the solution is that the music can be the object of our emotions, as when we are delighted by an effective ending to a long and complex piece.

As for emotional responses to music’s expressiveness, there are at least two possible explanations. One appeals to the phenomenon of “emotional contagion” or “mirroring responses” (S. Davies 1994: 279–307; 2006: 186–8). When surrounded by moping people, one tends to become sad. Moreover, such a “mood” is not about some intentional object. One is not necessarily sad for the mopers, nor whatever they are sad about, if anything. Similarly, when “surrounded” by music that presents an appearance of sadness, one might become sad, but not sad about the music, or anything else (Radford 1991). For critical discussion, see Robinson 2005: 379–412 and S. Davies 2011b.

If our experience of music’s expressiveness necessarily involves imagining that the music is a literal expression of emotion, then our emotional responses to that expressiveness are no more puzzling than emotional responses to other imagined expressive agents, such as fictional characters in novels. The advantage is only slight because the question of how and why we respond emotionally to fictions is itself a philosophical problem of some magnitude. Nonetheless, there are several theories available (see the supplement to the entry on imagination, §2). One difficulty with appealing to a solution to the paradox of fiction is that it is not clear that our emotional responses to the expressiveness of music are the same as those to emotionally expressive characters. For instance, the standard example of an emotional response to music is being made sad by a dirge, while the standard example of emotional response to fiction is (something like) to feel pity for a sad character. If the former is to be explained in the same way as the latter, we would expect listeners to feel pity in response to the funeral march (pity for the persona imagined to be expressing her sadness through it). However, we surely do feel sad (in some sense) in response to tragedy, and it is not obvious that we do not feel pity (or imagined pity, or whatever one’s preferred theory of emotional response to fiction posits) in response to sad music.

Leaving behind the topic of how and why we respond emotionally to music, we turn to the question of why we seek out music that arouses “negative” emotions in us, such as sadness, assuming henceforth that we are in fact aroused to such emotions. (Since this problem is a close analog of the “paradox of tragedy,” some of the references below are to literature not explicitly about music, but the transposition of the arguments to music is not difficult to imagine. (See also the supplement to the entry on imagination, §3.) Most solutions assume that our negative emotional response is a price we are willing to pay for the benefits of engaging with the piece in question. The benefits appealed to include understanding and appreciating the music, including the expressiveness responsible for the negative response (Goodman 1968: 247–51; S. Davies 1994: 311–20; Goldman 1995: 68; Robinson 2005: 348–78).

A different benefit is Aristotelian catharsis, in which our negative emotional response to expressive art results in a psychological purgation of the negative emotions (Aristotle 1987: 6, 1449b21–1450b20). A less therapeutic approach is the suggestion that, since these emotions are without “life implications” (that is, as discussed above, we are not sad about any actual tragic events), we are able to take advantage of our responses to savor these emotions, gain an understanding of them, and be reassured that we have the capacity to feel them (Levinson 1982). Two things that must be explained by any defender of this kind of response are, first, our persistence in seeking out music that elicits negative emotional experiences after we have received the resulting benefit and, second, the enjoyment we seem to take in these negative responses, as opposed to putting up with them for their related benefits.

A different kind of solution to the problem argues that responses such as sadness that are evoked by expressive music are not really negative. Hume (1757) argues, with respect to tragedy, that the pleasure we take in the mode of presentation of the content of an artwork does not simply counterbalance the negative emotion evoked, but rather subsumes and transforms it into a pleasurable feeling. Kendall Walton argues (also with respect to tragedy) that sadness is not in itself negative. Rather, it is the situation to which sadness is the response that is negative. Thus, though we would not seek out the death of a loved one, given the death we “welcome” the sorrow (K. Walton 1990: 255–9). Similarly, we cannot affect the sadness of a musical work by not listening to it, and so we welcome our sorrowful response to it as appropriate. Berys Gaut (2007: 203–26) argues that though sadness is typically aroused by situations we would prefer to avoid, sadness in response to artistic expressiveness is an exception and thus not negative in any paradoxical way. A difficulty for all three solutions is the extent to which they accord with our emotional experience in rejecting the characterization of our sadness as negative.

4. Understanding Music

A central topic in the understanding of narrative art forms, such as literature and film, is what constitutes an acceptable interpretation of a work. One debate concerns whether there is a single correct interpretation of any work or multiple acceptable interpretations. Another concerns the constraints on acceptable interpretations, e.g., the extent to which the artist’s intentions may or should be taken into account.

Though these questions seem equally applicable to musical works (S. Davies 2002a; Dubiel 2011), most of the literature on understanding music has focused on two more specifically musical topics: first, our understanding of basic musical features, such as pitch and rhythm and, second, interpretations of works of the sort given by music theorists. (For more detailed introductions to these and other topics in musical understanding, see S. Davies 2011c and Huovinen 2011.)

Before we turn to those topics, it is worth noting that two distinct activities go by the name of “interpretation” in music (and other performance arts): what might be called performative and critical interpretation (Levinson 1993). While a critical interpretation of a musical work (often called an analysis) is roughly equivalent to an interpretation of a novel—typically expressed linguistically—a performative interpretation is a way of playing or singing the work, typically expressed in a performance of it. It is not easy to clarify the relationship between these two kinds of musical interpretation, but see Levinson 1993, Maus 1999, Thom 2007, Neufeld 2012, and Dodd 2020a.

4.1 Basic Musical Understanding

Animals can hear music in a sense—your dog might be frightened by the loud noise emitted by your stereo. People, by contrast, can understand the music they hear. What constitutes this experience of understanding music? To use an analogy, while the mere sound of a piece of music might be represented by a sonogram, our experience of it as music is better represented by something like a marked-up score. We hear individual notes that make up distinct melodies, harmonies, rhythms, sections, and so on, and the interaction between these elements. Such musical understanding comes in degrees along a number of dimensions. Your understanding of a given piece or style may be deeper than mine, while the reverse is true for another piece or style. My general musical understanding may be narrow, in the sense that I only understand one kind of music, while you understand many different kinds (Budd 1985b: 233–5; S. Davies 2011c: 88–95). Moreover, different pieces or kinds of pieces may call on different abilities, since some music has no harmony to speak of, some no melody, and so on. Many argue that, in addition to purely musical features, understanding the emotions expressed in a piece is essential to adequately understanding it (e.g., Ridley 1993; S. Davies 1994; Levinson 1990d: 30; Scruton 1997; Robinson 2005: 348–78).

At the base of the musical experience seem to be (i) the experience of tones, as opposed to mere sounds of various frequencies, where a tone is heard as being in “musical space,” that is, as bearing relations to other tones such as being higher or lower, or of the same kind (at the octave), and (ii) the experience of movement, as when we hear a melody as leaping up or wandering far afield and then coming to rest where it began. Roger Scruton (1983; 1997: 1–96) argues that these experiences are irreducibly metaphorical, since they involve the application of spatial concepts to that which is not literally spatial. (There is no identifiable individual that moves from place to place in a melody (S. Davies 1994: 229–34).) Malcolm Budd (1985b) argues that to appeal to metaphor in this context is unilluminating since, first, it is unclear what it means for an experience to be metaphorical and, second, a metaphor is only given meaning through its interpretation, which Scruton not only fails to give, but argues is unavailable. Budd suggests that the metaphor is reducible, and thus eliminable, apparently in terms of purely musical (i.e., non-spatial) concepts or vocabulary. Stephen Davies (1994: 234–40) doubts that the spatial vocabulary can be eliminated, but he is sympathetic to Budd’s rejection of the centrality of metaphor. Instead, he argues that our use of spatial and motion terms to describe music is a secondary, but literal, use of those terms that is widely used to describe temporal processes, such as the ups and downs of the stock market, the theoretical position one occupies, one’s spirits plunging, and so on. The debate continues in Budd 2003, Scruton 2004, and S. Davies 2011d.

Davies is surely right about the ubiquity of the application of the language of space and motion to processes that lack individuals located in space. The appeal to secondary literal meanings, however, can seem as unsatisfying as the appeal to irreducible metaphor. We do not hear music simply as a temporal process, it might be objected, but as moving in the primary sense of the word, though we know that it does not literally so move. Andrew Kania (2015) develops a position out of this intuition by emphasizing Scruton’s appeal to imagination while dropping the appeal to metaphor, arguing that hearing the music as moving is a matter of imagining that its constituent sounds move. (See also de Clercq 2007 and Trivedi 2011: 116–18.) Kania explicitly models his theory on the popular Waltonian theory of fiction (K. Walton 1990), though Walton seems to resist the application of his theory to basic musical understanding because of the differences between music and more paradigmatically representational arts (K. Walton 1988: 358–9, 1994: 53–4).

Apart from pitch space and melodic movement, there has been little philosophical discussion of either the nature and understanding of basic musical features such as melody, rhythm, meter, and harmony or how these elements work together in complex musical wholes. But see Roger Scruton 1997: 19–79, 2007; Stephen Davies 2001: 47–71; Hamilton 2007: 119–52; and Cheyne, Hamilton, and Paddison 2020.

It is widely acknowledged that explicit music-theoretical knowledge can aid deeper musical understanding and is essential for the adequate description and understanding of musical experiences—including one’s own (Kivy 1990). However, several philosophers have argued that one need not possess these concepts explicitly (nor the correlative vocabulary) in order to listen with understanding (Budd 1985b; 245–8; S. Davies 1994: 346–9; Levinson 1990d: 35–41). Mark DeBellis (1995: 117–31) argues that understanding fairly basic features of music, such as different kinds of cadences, requires a fused experience in which one applies a concept such as dominant seventh in one’s perception of the musical sounds. Stephen Davies (2011c: 88–94) responds that the serious but untutored listener should be able to develop such concepts, and thus have such experiences. Erkki Huovinen (2008) provides an example intended to cast doubt on this. Suppose that a melody is transposed from C major to D-flat major, but in a lower octave. One listener might hear the melody as reappearing higher, since D-flat is a half-step above C, while another might hear it as lower, since the constituent pitches of the second appearance are all lower than those of the first. Only a listener who understands the sense in which both these claims are true—that the melody has been transposed down a major seventh—truly understands what is going on musically. Yet such concepts of pitch organization … are not usually learned without some tuition (Huovinen 2008: 325).

4.2 Higher-level Musical Understanding

For various art-historical reasons, formalism was the dominant approach to music-theoretic analysis, that is, the critical interpretation of musical works, throughout the twentieth century. (Hamilton 2007: 66–94 & 153–91 provides a useful discussion of the history from a philosophical perspective.) In short, the value of works of music was held to reside primarily in their large-scale harmonic structure.

Jerrold Levinson (1997) makes a case against such “architectonicism” in favor of “concatenationism,” the view that basic musical understanding consists in following the musical and emotional qualities of passages of music, and transitions between them, that are short enough to be apprehended as a single experience (“quasi-hearing”). He qualifies this basic idea considerably, allowing for the experience of previous parts of the piece, and anticipation of future parts, to modify one’s experience of the music in the moment. He also allows that architectonic awareness may play a role in enhancing one’s moment-to-moment experience, and may even play an ineliminable part in the understanding of some pieces. Nonetheless, Levinson maintains that the part played by architectonic knowledge in basic musical understanding is minimal, and that the cases where architectonic knowledge is necessary are very much the exception.

Peter Kivy has taken up the gauntlet on behalf of architectonicism (2001; see also S. Davies 2011c: 95–9). While Kivy acknowledges that the kinds of experiences Levinson champions are necessary to basic musical understanding, he defends the idea that grasping the large-scale form of most pieces of Western classical music, at least, is necessary for an adequate understanding of them. He does not deny that the experience of the form of a piece in listening to it is more intellectual than quasi-hearing, but he rejects Levinson’s argument that it is non-perceptual, and thus marginal to an adequate experience of it as music. Rather, Kivy argues, such experience is a matter of bringing one’s perceptions under sophisticated concepts. (A tactic Kivy does not consider is an attempt to hoist Levinson with his own contextualist petard, arguing that even if architectonic listening is non-perceptual it is a well-established mode of understanding pieces of music in the Western classical music world, and thus that to argue music must be understood primarily perceptually is to beg the question.)

The extent of the disagreement between the architectonicist and the concatenationist is unclear. They agree that the aspect of musical understanding the other emphasizes is a non-negligible component in the full understanding of a musical work. Levinson has been explicit since the first publication of his view that he intends it more as a polemic against and corrective to architectonicism, rather than as a replacement for it (1997: ix–xi; 1999: 485; 2006a). Perhaps that purpose has now been fulfilled, but see Huovinen 2013 for a revival of the debate and an attempted synthesis.

5. Music and Value

5.1 Music’s Artistic Value

Most philosophical discussions of the value of music are implicitly restricted to the artistic value of purely instrumental musical works. To the extent that such discussions are motivated by the abstract nature of such music (see below), it is not clear to what extent they can be extended to musical hybrids such as song. Moreover, as we saw in section 1.2, it is not obvious that all music is art. Perhaps non-art music can be artistically valuable, but it presumably has other values; a complete theory of the value of music would apparently have to account for those values. (Presumably, art music can also have non-artistic value.)

Following the literature, however, the remainder of this subsection considers the artistic value of purely musical works. This is not the place to go into the many disputes about the nature of aesthetic and artistic value. (For an excellent introduction, see Stecker 2003b.) For our purposes, we can note there are two central points about artistic value on which there is some consensus. First, most philosophers take the value of artworks to be intrinsic (or inherent) to them, in the sense that the value of a work is tied essentially to the experience that the work affords. Thus, artworks are not (properly) valued merely instrumentally, as means to some end, but “for” or “in” themselves (Budd 1995: 1–16; S. Davies 1987: 198–200; Scruton 1997: 374–6; Levinson 1992: 15–17).

The question that naturally arises next is what it is about the experience an artwork affords that makes it valuable. That pleasure is a non-negligible part of the answer to this question is the second point upon which there is some consensus (S. Davies 1987: 198–205; Levinson 1992; Kivy 1997b: 212–17). However, concomitant with this consensus is an acknowledgment that simple pleasure taken, say, in the sensuousness of the musical sounds is too trivial to ground the great value widely attributed to music. In looking for other sources, the puzzle that arises is that music is supposed to be an abstract art, par excellence. If this means that music is divorced from everything else that concerns us in the “real world” (that is, extra-musical life), it is puzzling why we should find so valuable the experiences musical works afford.

There are a couple of dimensions to most solutions of the puzzle of pure music’s value. One is the extent to which it is agreed that music really is abstract. To the extent that one thinks that music is not divorced from the real world, one will be able to argue that music’s value is at least no more puzzling than the value of arts more obviously related to the real world, such as literature and representational painting and sculpture. The other dimension to most solutions of the puzzle of pure music’s value is the extent to which one thinks the abstractness of music is the source of its value. Thus, two theorists might agree on the extent to which music is related to the real world (by being expressive, say), yet one locate its primary value in that expressiveness while the other locates it in its abstract, purely formal features.

Unsurprisingly, those who take the experience of music’s expressiveness to be a more intimately emotional one (through being predicated on imaginative engagement with the music, say), tend to emphasize that experience as more central to musical understanding, and thus attribute a larger part of music’s value to its expressiveness. Those, on the other hand, whose theory of the experience of musical expressiveness is more distanced (a matter of noticed resemblance, say), tend to place less weight on this element in their theories of musical value. At one extreme of this spectrum is the position that denies music to be expressive at all, and thus cannot attribute any of music’s value to its expressiveness (most notably Hanslick 1854; see also Zangwill 2004). Most theorists agree, however, that music’s value is to be located in different kinds of experience, including the experience of formal and expressive features; their disagreements are mostly about the relative weight of these different kinds of experiences in a complete account of musical value.

The extent of the disagreement between various parties to this dispute is not clear. Those defending the value of music’s expressiveness tend to claim that its contribution to overall musical value is significant, but many stop short even of according it primary value, and do not argue against the value of formal elements of musical works (Ridley 1995: 192–6; Levinson 1982, 1992: 20–2, 1996a: 124–5; Robinson 2005: 413; Young 2014: 150–4). They content themselves rather with pointing out the ways in which expressiveness can be valuable, focusing largely on the value of the emotional responses such expressiveness elicits in us. These include many of the features discussed above with respect to our interest in listening to music that arouses negative affective states in the listener. To recap, our emotional responses to music’s expressiveness can enable us to savor, understand, and even (to some extent) experience emotions in a “safe” way. They can provide us with a cathartic release, and enable us to participate in a kind of communication with the composer or communion with other members of our musical culture (Levinson 1982, 1996a; Higgins 1991, 2012; S. Davies 1994: 271). Emphasizing this last point, Roger Scruton argues that music’s value is quasi-moral, in that the kinds of music one responds to, or those valued in a particular culture, reflect the state of that individual’s or culture’s “soul” (1997: 380–91; see also S. Davies 1994: 275–6.) Stephen Davies (1987: 207–12) has argued that there are beneficial consequences of an interest in music in general, such as heightened emotional and aural sensitivity, which are not properly valued as consequences of listening to individual pieces, but which lead us to value musical culture as a whole (just as we value kindness for its consequences in general, while rejecting instrumental motivations for kind acts as inappropriate).

By contrast, those who defend the value of formal features tend to argue that the value of those features is primary, and that the value of music’s expressiveness is overrated. Peter Kivy, for instance, argues that expressive properties serve merely to highlight musical structure, as color might be used by the painter to emphasize contour or mass. Other expressive properties serve as structural properties in their own right (1990: 196). (See also Sharpe 2000: 1–83, and Zangwill 2004.)

Alan Goldman (1992) argues against the idea that music is particularly suited to the expression of emotion, claiming that representational arts such as painting and literature are better at this. Moreover, he disputes the grounds of the value of expressiveness given above. For example, he denies that music can teach us much about the emotions, and that we can savor our negative emotional responses to expressive music. Similarly, after an extensive discussion of the nature of musical expressiveness, Malcolm Budd argues that such expressiveness cannot come close to explaining music’s value (1995: 155–7). He points to the facts that much valuable music is not expressive and that the equal expressiveness of different pieces would be outweighed in a comparative evaluation by the differences between them in terms of formal value.

Both Goldman and Budd locate the value of pure music precisely in the abstractness that to some seems the greatest obstacle to explaining that value. Budd (1995: 164–71) points out that we have an extensive interest in abstract forms outside the realm of music, such as those of natural formations and in the decorative arts, and that such forms are capable of possessing valued aesthetic properties, such as beauty, elegance, and so on. Thus, it is no surprise that we value highly the works of an art of abstract forms. Goldman (1992), by contrast, emphasizes the detachment from the world of practical affairs implied by music’s abstractness. The complexity of great musical works demands the active engagement of our cognitive faculties, which we find rewarding, yet not in the pursuit of some practical goal that could be frustrated.

These issues are thrown into sharp relief in the debate over how instrumental musical works could be “profound.” See Kivy 1990: 202–18, 1997b: 140–78, 2003; Levinson 1992; White 1992; Ridley 1995, 2004: 132–65; S. Davies 2002b; Dodd 2014b.

There is no space here to discuss the evaluation of musical works and performances. See S. Davies 1987, Levinson 1990e, and Gracyk 2011.

5.2 Music’s Moral Value

There are musical aspects or elements of many uncontroversially representational art forms, such as song. Jeanette Bicknell (2015: 81–91) and Aaron Smuts (2013) discusses the ethics of song performance. But there has been little discussion, in the analytic tradition, of the relationship between musical and ethical values (as opposed to musical examples of more general ethical concerns, such as cultural appropriation). Kathleen Higgins (1991, 2012) and Roger Scruton (1997: 457–508) argue in very different ways that music is – or should be – central to our thinking about ethics. Garry Hagberg has explored many connections between improvisatory jazz practice, ethics, and politics (2002, 2006, 2008, 2021; see also Higgins 1991: 177). Peter Kivy (2008) argues against music’s capacity to affect our moral knowledge, behavior, or character. Jerrold Levinson (2013: 51–5), Philip Alperson (2014), and James Harold (2016) defend music’s moral efficacy.

The debate over whether an artwork’s moral flaws are artistic flaws has focused almost exclusively on representational (especially narrative) art forms. (Gaut (2007) offers an excellent overview.) Music has largely been ignored because it has been assumed to lack sufficient representational capacity to embody an attitude toward some object. Maria José Alcaraz León (2012), however, argues that music’s emotional expressiveness is enough to apply arguments about whether moral flaws are artistic flaws to pure instrumental music. (For critical discussion, see Kania 2020: 254–5.) Musicologist Susan McClary argues that canonical works of instrumental classical music oppress women by expressing a positive attitude toward narratives of the subjection of feminine elements (e.g., certain musical themes) by masculine ones. (See, for example, McClary 1991: 19–23, 53–79; for critical discussion, see Maus (2011).)


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