Critical Disability Theory
Critical disability theory refers to a diverse, interdisciplinary set of theoretical approaches. The task of critical disability theory is to analyze disability as a cultural, historical, relative, social, and political phenomenon. Some call this work “critical disability studies” or CDS (e.g., Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009; Vehmas & Watson 2014). The use of “critical disability theory” here intends to capture a broader swath of approaches, including those originating in the field of philosophy. Critical disability theory is a methodology, not a “subject-oriented area of study” (Schalk 2017). As a methodology, the theory
involves scrutinizing not bodily or mental impairments but the social norms that define particular attributes as impairments, as well as the social conditions that concentrate stigmatized attributes in particular populations. (2017)
Critical disability theorists direct their work toward activism, however, and do not intend insights to remain within academic confines. For example, Julie Avril Minich argues that critical disability theory involves the
scrutiny of normative ideologies [that] should occur not for its own sake but with the goal of producing knowledge in support of justice for people with stigmatized bodies and minds. (2017)
For this reason, thinkers should “recommit” to “social justice work”, including working in solidarity for the purposes of liberation with people “devalued” or “pathologized” but perhaps not labeled or self-identified as disabled (2017). Others have argued that activism such as material practices related to access are a central part of critical disability scholarship, “whether in the classroom, at conferences, in web space, or in our writing” (Hamraie 2016).
In this way, critical disability theory is an emancipatory and developing discourse (Goodley, Liddiard, & Runswick Cole 2018: 206; Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 48). Thinkers use the method to both describe the socio-political constructions of disability and track the impacts of these constructions on oppressed persons, including but not limited to those to whom the concept “disability” attaches. Critical disability theory, then, necessarily refers to lived experiences and attempts to transform the circumstances under which oppressed subjects live through critical, intersectional analysis. Complicating this expansive approach, accountability to disabled persons is paramount to this work (Minich 2016). But, some call for accountability and simultaneously argue that critical disability theory should resist distinctions between disabled and non-disabled subjects. Nirmala Erevelles, for example, does not seek to claim “everyone is disabled” but prefers historically-embedded materialist accounts of disability at intersections among multiple categories of analysis, including “race, class, gender, nation, and sexual identity” (2014, cf. Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 219). Similarly, Alison Kafer refuses a “fixed definition” of disability. She favors leaving open the boundaries of the concept of disability and, therefore, does not settle who counts as disabled. She uses Joan W. Scott’s notion of “collective affinity” to describe disability as a wide net, inhering in no particular persons, but rather describing disability as a complex set of features, attributed to individuals, that pathologize and oppress (2013: 11). At root, as Dianne Pothier and Richard Devlin argue, critical disability theory will claim that
disability is not fundamentally a question of medicine or health, nor is it just an issue of sensitivity and compassion; rather, it is a question of politics and power(lessness), power over, and power to. (2006: 2, as quoted in Gillies 2014 and Sleeter 2010)
While it is clear, then, that critical disability theory attends to devalued persons, controversy over who the subject of critical disability theory is lies at the heart of the approach. This controversy strongly signals the import of critical disability methodology for theoretical work more generally. Critical disability theory deals seriously with the heritage and construction of disability identity, but that identity is in flux and related to the very nature of human embodiment. Disability is unique as an “identity category” because “anyone can enter [it] at any time, and we will all join it if we live long enough” (Garland-Thomson 2002: 20). Indeed, the concern for vulnerability in the approach extends to non-human animals, as some critical disability theorists engage critical animal studies (Taylor 2017). This makes critical disability theory, insofar as it reveals crucial aspects of embodiment, an essential ingredient of any political and social analysis.
Yet some theorists prefer to engage questions of power directly, rather than vulnerable embodiment. Some theorists argue that disability, and its “precursors”—impairments—are precisely the products of power relations (Tremain 2017: 86). For others, disability refers to a body’s incongruence within “space and in the milieu of expectations” (Garland-Thomson 2002: 20). While power and incongruence have material effects, including disabling effects on embodiment, these critical disability theorists will describe disability in immediate reference to power, including its exclusions and hierarchies in discourses and institutions. This, however, again points to the importance of critical disability theory. Attention to—for example—abnormality, hierarchies of capability, and other exclusionary constructions related to disability simultaneously deepen and are deepened by analysis of racism and sexism. If disability is a direct expression of power, as these theorists argue, then power and its effect on human life cannot be understood without treating disability politically and socially.
Alliances among critical discourses, including queer theory and feminist theory, are essential to the task of critical disability theory, as no one theory or discipline alone can nor should attempt to handle the complexity and scope of the phenomena of disability (Sleeter 2010). Broad coalitional possibilities are available to disability theorists, although these possibilities traditionally go unrealized or remain nascent. These include “academic and political connections” with other identity-based areas of study, including “race/ethnic” and “sexuality/queer” studies (Schalk 2013; cf. Goodley, Liddiard, & Cole 2018: 206). For Sami Schalk, critical disability theory must take up these potential coalitions wherever possible to further its goals. These goals, as already implied, are both political and conceptual. In an example of coalitional analysis, Erevelles describes her work this way:
I have argued that the ideology of disability has been used to justify the racial and gendered division of labor based on heteronormative notions of the family and, in doing so, organizes class relations in a capitalist society. (Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 206)
Critical analysis of the phenomena of heterosexism, sexism, and racism, therefore, must make reference to the insights of disability theory in order to achieve their goals. As this entry will demonstrate, critical disability theory and its nuanced approach to vulnerability and power is a key ingredient of critical theory more generally.
This entry intends to describe the contours of critical disability theory, including historical antecedents and key debates. It examines key approaches in critical disability theory and what these approaches offer for the study of disability. It also considers what critical disability theory offers to the analysis of other socio-political phenomena and philosophical problems. Further, this entry describes how critical disability theorists leverage normativity and politics. This entry takes into account the considerable overlap between critical disability theory and feminist theory, both within and outside the traditional confines of the field of philosophy. It does not, however, explicitly explore feminist approaches to disability (e.g., K. Hall 2011; Kittay & Feder 2002; Mackenzie, Rogers, & Dodds 2014; and Wendell 1996; see the entry on feminist perspectives on disability). Additionally, although critical disability theory engages legal issues, work using this approach done in the field of law is not explored here (e.g., Basas 2008, 2013a, 2013b; Belt 2015, 2017; Brown 2014; and Nelson 2016; see the entry disability and justice). This entry, however, does cover Continental philosophical approaches to questions of disability, as these intimately intertwine with and provide examples of critical disability theory. One final note: terminology varies significantly in literature on disability, and so this entry uses the language of the thinkers whose work it describes. This method generates inconsistencies within the entry itself, but any resulting tensions are more fruitful than imposing an arbitrary set of terms that thinkers themselves would not recognize.
This entry has five primary sections. First, by way of background, the entry articulates and explores critical disability theory’s origin in and continued resonance with critical theory. Then, it introduces tensions within disability studies, including the use of the new language of “critical disability theory” to mark off critical approaches against traditional “disability studies”. Second, the entry considers key interdisciplinary approaches in critical disability theory, including crip theory, work at the intersections of disability and race, including dis/ability critical race theory, indigenous approaches, and postcolonial approaches. Third, the entry covers philosophical approaches employing Continental philosophy, with special attention paid to the influence of Foucault. In the fourth section, the entry discusses political engagement, including challenges posed to psychology in the critical disability theory milieu and activism around critical disability theory. Finally, the entry offers concluding thoughts regarding the future of critical disability theory.
- 1. Background
- 2. Interdisciplinary Approaches
- 3. Philosophical Approaches
- 4. Activism
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
This section explores two crucial elements of the setting of critical disability theory: its heritage in critical theory and its tensions and overlap with more traditional disability studies.
1.1 Critical Theory
Critical disability theory is able to challenge traditional disability studies and engage in transformative, intersectional, and coalitional critical work (Ellis et al. 2018). This is thanks in part to its heritage in the critical theory of the Frankfurt School and especially the influence of Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer (Burghardt 2011: 3: Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 51–52). Broadly understood, critical theory identifies, describes, and analyzes the subsumed or hidden origins of social and political culture, discourses, and institutions. In these ways, critical theory also exposes the contingency of ideas or circumstances often presumed natural or unchangeable. Diverse critical theories unite in the sense that they target ideology, distrust appearances, and often point out false consciousness. Critical disability theory thus allies itself with Continental philosophical methods, including phenomenology, Freudian psychoanalysis, and neo-Marxist approaches (Kearney & Rainwater 1996: 195). Continental philosophy involves a widespread rejection of meaning narrowly rooted in science, and it responds to the crisis of the collapse of meaning and temptation to nihilism in modernity generally (Kearney 1986: 2). Under this umbrella, critical theory finds that meaning has social origins, often from “historical strategies of domination and liberation”; therefore, critical theory is interested in “the social relation of the human subject to the historical conditions of production or alienation” (Kearney 1986: 2; see the entry on critical theory).
Critical disability theory is committed to praxis and inquiry that involve “in-depth analysis of the structural and as-yet incompletely understood psychic underpinnings of oppression” (Burghardt 2011: 13). In this way, the critical theory of the Frankfurt School is a necessary ingredient to its work. Madeline Burghardt writes,
Critical theory challenges cultural discursive institutions which undergird viable practices of exclusion and misrepresentation, and thus offers a map toward greater understanding and informed challenge. At its core, critical theory insists that we remain attentive to “the human bottom of non-human things” (Horkheimer 1972: xiii), suggesting an ongoing commitment to the lives implicated in cultural and political practices. (2011: 13)
For Helen Meekosha and Russell Shuttleworth, critical disability theory necessarily includes four primary principles, as follows (2009: 52). First, “critical social theory is irreducible to facts”, meaning that the methods of such a theory outstrip quantitative analysis and reject reduction to the quantitative; further, such theory rejects “atheoretical, context-free science”, claiming that such science is an inappropriate way to access phenomena under analysis (2009: 52; see also Samuels 2014). Second, “critical social theory links theory with praxis in the struggle for an autonomous and participatory society” (2009: 52). This praxis involves viewing autonomy as “emancipation from hegemonic and hierarchical ideologies” rather than reducing autonomy to independence, as was common in disability theorizing in the 1970s–1990s (2009: 52–53). Third, “critical social theory is self-aware of its historicity”, meaning that it sees its own work as embedded within a time and place, reflexively targeting itself with the historical analysis it applies to social structures and institutions (2009: 53–54). Fourth, “critical social theory engages in dialogue among cultures”; on this point, Meekosha and Shuttleworth “call for an explicit dialogue with human rights and emancipatory thinking from the diversity of cultures” and hope to avoid “projecting an international ideal” from Western to non-Western cultures (2009: 54).
The framing of critical disability theory within critical theory partially sets its agenda and opens out to fresh methodologies. For example, critical theory acts as a hinge between critical disability theory and feminist theory and can drive an integrated feminist-disability analysis (Garland-Thomson 2002). Rosemarie Garland-Thomson’s feminist-disability analysis engages “several fundamental premises of critical theory”, including these: representation structures reality; the margins define the center; gender and disability are ways of signifying relationships of power; human identity is multiple and unstable; and all analysis and evaluation has political implications (2002: 6). Along these lines, Garland-Thomson writes,
Disability—like gender—is a concept that pervades all aspects of culture: its structuring institutions, social identities, cultural practices, political positions, historical communities, and the shared human experience of embodiment. (2002: 4)
In this way, disability and ability are fundamentally “produced” rather than discovered; this production occurs through a “disability/ability system”. Disability theorists can employ this system as a category of analysis to help “denaturalize” disability (2002: 6). Similarly, Sami Schalk argues,
by designating (dis)ability as a system of social norms which categorizes, ranks, and values bodyminds and disability as a historically and culturally variable category within this larger system, critical disability studies can better engage in conversations about the ways both ability and disability operate. (2017)
The benefits of critical disability theory, however, do not merely accrue to the study of disability. Critical disability theory offers crucial resources to other analyses, including but not limited to those conducted in feminist philosophy and philosophy more generally. Feminist theory needs disability analysis in order to achieve its own goals, and, again, it is best to unite the two through common critical theory strategies (Garland-Thomson 2002: 2–3). For Garland-Thomson, without disability analysis, feminism cannot critically tackle problems like infanticide, selective abortion, eugenic programs, coercive rehabilitation, genocide, and normalizing surgical procedures, among other phenomena (2002: 9). Meanwhile, Shelley Tremain demonstrates that feminist philosophy’s conceptual work on “essentialism and constructivism, identity, race, sexuality, agency, experience, and oppression” is furthered through the development of a feminist philosophy of disability, as disability analysis aids in debates over these terms (2015: 8).
Further, critical disability theory contributes to philosophy in a broad range of ways. Critical disability theory challenges the marginalization of the study of disability and its ghettoization within bioethics (and its circumscription, thereby, to the medical model) (Tremain 2017). As Tremain argues, disability matters to core debates in philosophy. Specifically, philosophy of disability, as one form critical disability theory can take, contributes to central philosophical puzzles, including debates over relativism, materialism, realism, and determinism (2015).
Critical disability theory is significantly aimed toward exposing and analyzing ableism. Ableism is, minimally, discrimination on the basis of ability, perceived or actual (Campbell 2009: 5). Ableism as a prejudicial attitude prefers and prioritizes the features of the empty subject Garland-Thomson refers to as the “normate” while systematically excluding the abnormal or non-normative embodied minds (1996: 9). But, critical disability thinking situates it maximally as a set of primary social and political structures that marginalize, organize and rank subjects and objects, shapes discourse, and undergirds institutions. Ableism is
a network of beliefs, processes and practices that produces a particular kind of self and body (the corporeal standard) that is projected as the perfect, species-typical and therefore essential and fully human. Disability then is cast as a diminished state of being human. (Campbell 2001: 44)
Ableism systematically interacts with other power structures that stigmatize to produce race, gender, sex, and disability. Ableism shapes our world and produces disability;
regimes of ableism have produced a depth of disability negation that reaches into the caverns of collective subjectivity to the extent that the notion of disability as inherently negative is seen as a ‘naturalized’ reaction to an aberration. (Campbell 2009: 166)
Some refer to this social and political structure as disablism or use the terms interchangeably (Campbell 2009: 5 and Goodley 2014).
Ableism and resistance to ableism is central to the tradition of critical disability theory (Campbell 2008b). To conceive of its importance, consider the parallel to racism: racism and anti-racist work is a necessary and indisputable part of the tradition of critical race theory, regardless of how racism is understood and framed. But, it would be wrong to consider ableism as an additive to sexism and racism. Instead, theorizing ableism is part of a “critique of the dominant order, the other, or alterity” (Goodley 2009). Theorizing ableism is urgent (Wolbring 2008).
A core conception of ableism at work in everyday life is behind most, if not all, work in critical disability theory. Landmark texts in critical disability theory treating ableism directly include Fiona Kumari Campbell’s work, which brings together politics, law, and culture to mark out and establish an expansive reading of ableism and describe its “production, operation, and maintenance” (2009: 4). Ableism erases disability, as “ableistnormativity results in compulsive passing, wherein there is a failure to ask about difference, to imagine human be-ingness differently” (2009: 4). Campbell theorizes the false consciousness of internalized ableism (2008a). Jennifer Scuro analyzes ableism and brings its impacts to the fore to rethink neoliberalism and link the two together (2017).
Theorists have recently used ableism to interrogate what disability is, including cognitive disability (Carlson 2001), how ableism works together with and produces race (Campbell 2008a), the ableism of the concept of resilience (Hutcheon & Wolbring 2013), questions of epistemic responsibility (Reynolds 2016a), sexuality (Baril & Trevenen 2014), and a critical theory of harm (Reynolds 2016b). Meanwhile an ableist lens has been brought to the discipline and practice of academia (Dolmage 2017; Wolbring 2012).
The denaturalization of disability is a key task of critical disability theory, in line with its critical heritage (e.g., Tremain 2017: 33 and 86). This work includes challenging the distinction between impairment and disability, common in more traditional disability studies, which sets aside impairment as natural and disability as socially constructed (Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009, 50; Tremain 2017: 93, 115). Indeed, Tremain argues that impairment itself is socially constructed (2001). Denaturalizing disability and impairment are part of the analysis, politicization, and intersectional understanding of disability sought by critical disability theorists.
Nirmala Erevelles sounds a word of warning with regard to alliances across critical theories, citing Sharon Snyder and David Mitchell’s concept of narrative prosthesis, whereby fiction writers use disability to further plot. She worries that
something similar happens in critical theory—where, for example, Deaf/disability studies likens disability experiences to that of race, while race theorists describe their own oppression as disability. In each case, rather than interrogate the relationship, each group borrows the other’s oppressive associations in an attempt to explain its own oppression. (Erevelles and Kafer 2010: 217)
Analysis in critical disability studies hopes to move beyond the borrowing of oppressive associations to describe the intimate relationships among systems of oppression.
1.2 Tensions within Disability Studies
Critical disability theory challenges the normative assumptions, focus, and direction of more traditional disability studies. This more traditional disability studies is an interdisciplinary field with origins in the promotion of the social model of disability (Mollow 2017: 340; see the entry on disability: definitions, models, experience). Disability studies largely focuses on achieving political inclusion for disabled people. To that end, work done under the auspices of disability studies often uses the language of civil rights, minority politics, and liberal justice frameworks. Simi Linton describes disability studies as both a pedagogical effort—a “remedial endeavor, redressing the sins of omission and commission in the canon”—and as a necessarily political effort focused on the “epistemology of inclusion and integration” (1998: 525–526). Linton cautions that there is a tendency within some academic fields, notably those in the health professions, to refer to themselves as “disability studies” by virtue of taking disabled people as objects of study (1998: 526). Yet, this is inaccurate, as disability studies takes the opposite approach, seeking leadership by disabled people and investigation into social circumstances. Along similar lines, it is important to notice that the language of disability studies has been coopted, for example, by “rehabilitation and special education departments” that remain tied to the medical model and are not “rewriting the script” when it comes to disability (Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 49). Disability studies, working in tandem with the disability rights movement, shifts the focus from the medical model and correlational intervention on disabled people to increase “fit” in society to the “rigidity, faultiness, deficits, and pathological structures” in society itself (Linton 2005: 518). For example, Linton writes,
Disability studies’ project is to weave disabled people back into the fabric of society…as full citizens whose rights and privileges are intact, whose history and contributions are recorded, and whose often distorted representations in art, literature, film, theater, and other forms of artistic expression are fully analyzed. (ibid.)
As aforementioned, traditional disability studies relies on the social model. The social model explicitly draws from critical theory, which makes it “paradoxical” that critical disability theory uses the same tradition to critique traditional disability studies (Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 50). Yet, for Meekosha and Shuttleworth, the turn to the language of critical disability theory and away from the language of disability studies
signifies an implicit understanding that the terms of engagement in disability studies have changed; that the struggle for social justice and diversity continues but on another plane of development—one that is not simply social, economic and political, but also psychological, cultural, discursive and carnal. (ibid.)
Critical disability theory thus responds to the traditional disability studies project by pointing to its limits, including exclusions and framing. Concerns and objects of critique include disability studies’ largely liberal approach (Sleeter 2010), narrow consideration of physical disability, focus on the global North (Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 49) and independent living (2009: 52–53 and Kelly 2010), downplay of pain and suffering (Mollow 2017: 350), and ties to or investment in class elitism (Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 208), neoliberalism (Sleeter 2010), masculinism (Kelly 2010), materialism (Vehmas & Watson 2014), somatophobia (Goodley, Liddiard, & Runswick Cole 2018: 201 and Snyder & Mitchell 2001), and white supremacy (Bell 2006; Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 208; and Moore, Lewis, & Brown 2018 – see Other Internet Resources).
Further, critical disability theory demonstrates the ways exclusions in traditional disability studies come about. Some differences, such as “radical linguistic difference”, including that introduced by Deaf Studies, and “cognitive disabilities and related communicative differences” are regularly excluded from disability studies (Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 212–213). One way these exclusions occur is through investment in the figure of the public disability studies scholar and activist, who attempts to “demonstrate a powerful, resistant, and rational voice in the public arena”; Nirmala Erevelles argues, “more often than not, that voice embodies the normative modes of communication and rationality” (2010: 213). Erevelles calls critical theoretical and political coalitions with those with cognitive difference and mental illness “dangerous alliances”, given the importance disability studies has placed on embodying and using that voice (2010: 214). She advocates for brokering these alliances and defusing the dominant voice of disability studies. On a different note, Erevelles sees radical potential in Deaf Studies, but recommends it remain its own field to maintain positive tension with other areas of disability studies (2010: 210–212). Critique in these areas, and others, has led to the growth of critical disability theory and set its agenda.
Criticisms along these lines is well-received by some theorists. For example, Ann Fox frames such criticism as a reminder that the traditional disability studies must strive to be “critical”; she specifically notes the problems of
[disability studies’] erasure of bodies of color, reinforcing hierarchies, policing points of view, and moments of careerism over coalition. (2017)
Others, meanwhile, argue that criticisms are unfair and stem from a misguided approach. For example, Simo Vehmas and Nick Watson defend disability studies against some key challenges made by “critical disability studies”, including a rejection of disability studies’ materialism (in this case, the authors mean classical Marxist theory; Vehmas & Watson 2014). Referring to critical disability theorists as “post-structural anti-dualists”, Vehmas and Watson reject their approach as lacking the foundation to do normative, and therefore necessary political, work (2014: 638–639). They write, “[Critical Disability Studies] does not examine how things ought to be for disabled people in terms of right and wrong, good and bad” (2014: 638). Yet, critical disability theorists consistently conceive of themselves as doing normative and political work. For example, Margrit Shildrick responds to the critique that her feminist postmodernism is non-normative. She writes,
the very absence of laws, absolutes, and guiding rules and principles necessitates a high degree of personal responsibility in the face of the demand for response,
which issues in a “profound engagement with the issues at hand” (2008: 33; see also Shildrick 2012).
As aforementioned, some critical disability theorists worry that pain is not taken seriously enough in traditional disability studies (Mollow 2017, 350). Yet, those working to transform traditional disability studies have not settled the role of pain in critical work on disability. Indeed, the question of pain behaves as metonymy for the role of embodiment in disability more generally (Tremain 2017: 114). Some have argued that, as the lasting impacts of the social model of disability drives theorists away from embodiment and toward political and social descriptions of disability, the body has been lost. Feminist thinkers of disability like Jenny Morris want to maintain a narrative of disability by which they can achieve recognition of the obstacles that bodies can present. According to disability theorists Tom Shakespeare and Mark Erickson, these thinkers:
do not deny that society causes many problems, [but] they also feel that their bodies may cause difficulties, and they want any theory of disability to take account of the physical dimension to their lives. They suggest that in developing a social and structural analysis the disability movement has omitted a key facet of their experience. (2001: 195)
Indeed, Susan Wendell argues that the desire to relegate pain, and the possibility of pain, to an “other” while fantasizing about a “normal” body importantly undergirds ableist exclusions and the refusal of disabled people. For her, attending to pain must play a role in becoming reconciled to one’s body (1996: 179). So, to disregard pain and its role in disability would be to misunderstand hierarchies of normality. Shelley Tremain, however, maintains a tight focus on the social and political, arguing that “pain and the experience of it are historically and culturally relative and interpreted” (Tremain 2017: 116). Whether or not pain is denied, and how pain is seen to play a role in disability, has become a flashpoint in critical disability theory.
These tensions, and more, have arisen in the literature. Even as seismic transformation occurs, it is not clear whether critical disability theory is a new movement or the continued development of more traditional disability studies. Language use varies among theorists as well as among intersectional, politically engaged work on disability that emerges in multiple scholarly circles. Along these lines, Meekosha and Shuttleworth wonder if critical disability theory “constitutes a radical paradigm shift or simply signifies a maturing of [disability studies]” (2009: 48). This entry will not attempt to settle this matter, as it is not settled; rather, it will cover those signature methods and topics that theorists largely agree count as developing work in critical disability theory.
2. Interdisciplinary Approaches
This section explores interdisciplinary approaches to critical disability theory, along with the areas where there are overlaps and tensions. It describes the intersection of critical disability theory with queer theory and critical race studies, as well as encounters with indigenous thought. Crip theory, dis/ability critical race studies and black disability studies, and indigenous theory and postcolonial theory, are all discussed. This section aims to be highly inclusive yet is at the same time limited by the fact that this literature is developing.
2.1 Crip Theory
Queer theory and critical disability theory productively collude under the umbrella of “crip theory”, pushing understanding forward in both arenas and along new lines (McRuer 2003, 2004, and 2006a; Mollow 2017; Schalk 2013). Queer theory and disability theory have shared interests, including challenging medicalization, and some argue that the AIDS crisis catalyzed the connection between the two (e.g., Mollow 2017, 342). Further, crip theory derives from disability studies but uses queer theory to develop new analyses (Schalk 2013). Consider, for example, questions of passing and coming out, fruitfully analyzed at the nexus of queer theory and disability theory (see Garland Thomson 2002: 21). Crip theorist Robert McRuer argues that crip theory
should be understood as having a similar contestatory relationship to disability studies and identity that queer theory has to LGBT studies and identity. (2006b: 35)
Expanding on this, Alison Kafer describes McRuer’s work (e.g., 2006b) as placing “crip theory in a contestatory relationship to liberal notions of acceptance, tolerance, and assimilation” (2009: 292). For example, McRuer “builds on queer critiques of neoliberalism”, by adding, for instance, to existing queer analyses of the World Bank as a site of heteronormativity by describing its ableism or “antidisability” logic (Kafer 2009: 291). Crip theorists insist on the idea that full analysis of this and other sites of interest require both “queer and disability theory” (ibid., cf. McRuer 2003, 2005, 2006a). These sites include the cultural imperatives of heterosexuality and able-bodiedness, which are significantly tied together (Kafer 2003).
With this in mind, the study of sexuality is one obvious site for crip theory (McRuer 2011; McRuer & Mollow 2012). Literature taking a crip theory approach to sexuality is varied, and much of it intersects with race. Here noted are a few prominent examples. Eli Clare has written extensively, in both personal and political registers, at the intersection of queer experience and disability (e.g., 1999, 2001, 2013). Ann Mollow theorizes the ambiguity of disabled sexuality in terms of both lack and excess, connecting her insights to psychoanalysis (2012). Lydia X. Z. Brown writes about relationships and sexuality from and for an autistic perspective (2013). Kenny Fries, the author of several significant memoirs linking disability and sexuality (2003, 2007, 2017), writes about beauty and body image (1995 ). Michael Gill, whose work focuses on sexual agency and intellectual disability, including sexual abuse and consent (2010, 2015), analyzed an online reality show entitled The Specials (2012). The article interrogates an episode in which an encounter among five white intellectually disabled adults and sex workers from Bangkok raises questions of consent and sex and gender transgression (ibid.). In response to the history of racism and ableism’s explosive and continued violence in the U.S., Michelle Jarman theorizes the “eugenic castration of cognitively disabled men” in order to claim that “reading race and disability as interrelated, dynamic processes can inform our understanding of both past and present violence” (2012: 89–90). Ellen Samuels theorizes the limits of the language of coming out of the closet in crip terms (2003). Meanwhile, Alexandre Baril uses a crip framework to engage a variety of questions connected to trans identity and disability, including anglonormativity, cisnormativity, debility, and transability (2015a, 2015b, 2015c, 2016; Baril & Trevenen 2014).
These questions related to sexuality do not exhaust the possibilities of crip theory; as McRuer’s work makes clear, crip theory extends to a variety of concepts using the springboard of queer and disability theory. Indeed, crip theory is highly inclusive and invites coalitions among pathologized persons, in the tradition of critical disability theory more generally. Sami Schalk notes that
Alison Kafer has argued that crip theory allows for the inclusion of “those who lack a ‘proper’ (read: medically acceptable, doctor provided, and insurer-approved) diagnosis for their symptoms” and “people identifying with disability and lacking not only a diagnosis but any ‘symptoms’ of impairment”. (Kafer 2013: 12, 13, as quoted in Schalk 2017)
For instance, Schalk’s productive “disidentification” with crip theory has led her to take on, as a queer black non-disabled woman, the language of crip theory in new academic and political engagements (2013).
Finally, and significantly, crip theory has taken up the question of futurity; that is, access to the future and dreams about the future. This includes the complex politics of reproduction (e.g., Jarman 2015) but stands in contrast to what some describe as queer theory’s anti-futurity emphasis (e.g., K. Hall 2014). This thread of crip theory is explicitly set up against neoliberalism and the assumption that disability marks a “life not worth living” and a “future no one wants” (Fritsch 2016: 11, cf. Kafer 2013: 1–3). As Kafer describes it, if disability is understood as tragedy, futures without disability become the only desirable futures (2013: 1). Yet, disability is not a fact about the body with static meanings; instead, our orientation toward the future, especially desires about a future without disability, have material impacts and can be politically leveraged to reshape the meanings and impacts of disability (M. Hall 2016). Indeed, these desires and orientations are factors upon which some persons flourish and some do not. Kelly Fritsch writes,
The withering of some disabled lives and the capacitation of others result from neoliberal material and discursive processes that orient and imagine disability as a life without a future unless capacitated through such biocapitalist practices as cures or body/mind enhancement technologies and procedures. (2016: 11–12)
Resistance comes from insisting on a crip future and an accessible future (Kafer 2013: 153). Of the dream of disability to come, McRuer writes,
The disability to come…will and should always belong to the time of the promise…It’s a crip promise that we will always comprehend disability otherwise and that we will, collectively, somehow access other worlds and futures. (2006b: 207–208, as quoted in Kafer 2009: 293)
Similarly, Kim Q. Hall supports radical hope for just access to the future and argues that such hope has wide-ranging impacts, for not only queer, crip, and feminist movements, but also mitigating climate change (2014). Rayna Rapp and Faye Ginsburg, along the same lines, seek the collaborative creation of inhabitable worlds, focusing on the futurity of disability and leveraging demographic studies to “make disability count” for the future rather than “counting disability” in the future (Ginsburg & Rapp 2015, see also Ginsburg & Rapp 2017).
This focus on futurity links tightly with the tradition of critical theory. For instance, Fritsch, using Theodor Adorno’s conception of negative dialectics, argues that disability is a central part of the “sensuous critical thought” that is required for critique and living otherwise (2013, cf. Adorno 1966 [1973: 11]). Adorno describes a world dominated by homogenizing “identity thinking” that “erases contradiction, antagonism, and difference” and “aids and abets capitalism”. Yet, the queer/disabled figure, the “transfigured crip”, is a misfit that can “haunt the able-bodied world” of difference-refusing identity thinking (2013). Fritsch is thus hopeful that the transfigured crip can break open identity thinking. She writes,
the transfigured crip, through the assertion that there is always a remainder that exposes contradictions and haunts the limits of thought, will pose the greatest challenge to, and undo, both neoliberal capitalism and the category of disability itself. In taking the differences and similarities of our sufferings seriously, critically, and reflectively, we open up spaces, cracks, and possibilities for the difference of uncomfortable crip communities to come. (ibid.)
2.2 Dis/ability Critical Race Studies and Black Disability Studies
Critical disability theorists argue that racism and ableism operate jointly, intensifying and borrowing from each other. These phenomena, along with other forms of oppression, thus call for intersectional analysis. This requires the simultaneous investigation of the multiple, intersecting power relationships that affect whole persons through pathologization, stigma, and exclusion (see the entries on feminist perspectives on power and discrimination; see also Crenshaw 1991 for the origin of the term “intersectionality”). Intersectional analyses in critical disability studies, including, for example, the work of Nirmala Erevelles and Andrea Minear (2010) and Fiona Kumari Campbell’s analysis of internalized ableism (2008a), employ and supplement the strategies of critical race theory. Dis/ability Critical Race Studies (DisCrit) is deeply engaged in this work. DisCrit finds its primary location in the field of education but has a wide remit because intersections between race and disability appear at diverse sites of experience and oppression. Theorists tackle topics ranging from pedagogy (Annamma, Boelé, Moore, & Klingner 2013) and the family (Annamma, Ferri, & Connor 2018) to mass incarceration (Annamma 2014a and 2014b), immigration (Annamma 2013), and school violence (Watts & Erevelles 2004). They track the pipelines and continuities among governing institutions to demonstrate how these sites interweave to condition the educational experiences of racialized, disabled subjects.
Consider the school-to-prison pipeline. Subini Annamma engages spatiality and geography in a DisCrit approach to the education experiences of undocumented dis/abled persons, especially young girls, who are caught in this pipeline (2013, 2014a, 2014b, 2017). Annamma, with frequent collaborators David Connor and Beth Ferri, sets the tone for the use of DisCrit in the field of education (Annamma, Connor, & Ferri 2013; Annamma, Ferri, & Connor 2018). Their wide-ranging edited volume DisCrit: Disability Studies and Critical Race Theory in Education presents the work of 21 scholars on key topics and displays a variety of methodologies and applications (Connor, Ferri, & Annamma 2016).
The “foundations of DisCrit in Black and critical race feminist scholarship and activism”, including Anna Julia Cooper, Kimberlé Crenshaw, Patricia Hill Collins, and a variety of “intellectual ancestors” such as Angela Davis, bell hooks, Audre Lorde, and Sojourner Truth (Annamma, Ferri, and Connor 2018: 47). Despite the fact that disability was not significantly treated by these ancestral and contemporary Black feminists, the “intersectional nature” of this “pioneering work” has nonetheless been foundational to the development of DisCrit” (2018: 47–48). Taking into account foundational claims in disability studies, including “privileg[ing] knowledge based on lived experiences of disabled people” (2018: 49) and combining this and other insights from disability studies with work in critical race theory, DisCrit challenges “special education” and allows theorists to better “frame and analyze the lives of disabled youth of color” (2018: 49).
Annamma, Ferri, and Connor provide a thorough lineage of DisCrit and review existing literature (2018). Out of this intensive review of themes and topics, they surface seven foundational tenets of DisCrit and include examples in the literature of each. These tenets are as follows:
- “DisCrit focuses on ways that the forces of racism and ableism circulate interdependently, often in neutralized and invisible ways, to uphold notions of normalcy” (2018: 55);
- “DisCrit values multidimensional identities and troubles singular notions of identity such as race or dis/ability or class or gender or sexuality, and so on” (2018: 56);
- “DisCrit emphasizes the social constructions of race and ability and yet recognizes the material and psychological impacts of being labeled as raced or dis/abled, which sets one outside of the western cultural norms” (2018: 57);
- “DisCrit privileges voices of marginalized populations, traditionally not acknowledged within research” (2018: 58);
- “DisCrit considers legal and historical aspects of dis/ability and race and how both have been used separately and together to deny the rights of some citizens” (2018: 58);
- “DisCrit recognizes Whiteness and ability as property and that gains for people labeled with dis/abilities have largely been made as the result of interest convergence of White, middle-class citizens” (2018: 60);
- “DisCrit requires activism and supports all forms of resistance” (2018: 61).
While DisCrit literature is growing, with contributions from a circle of dedicated scholars, Annamma, Ferri, and Connor note that in their original field of special education thinkers are largely “quite resistant to engage in the racialized nature of education and dis/ability in meaningful or sustained ways” (2018: 48). The three are “cautiously optimistic” that growth in DisCrit will involve more “engagement across disciplines” and “studies that take up all seven tenets in a sustained way” (2018: 63).
Meanwhile, Black disability studies has developed a distinct approach to pedagogy, advocating for interventions that would shift entire educational paradigms and refuse obfuscating, special-topic treatment in curricula (Dunhamn et al. 2015). Approaches to disability must change to open up useful racial analysis. For instance, it is impossible, Sami Schalk argues, to theorize the intersection of race and disability without considering both disability and ability. For instance, she argues that disability,
in terms of claims of lesser intellectual abilities, was used to justify the enslavement of black people, while at the same time an understanding of black people’s bodies as hyper strong and impervious to heat and pain also justified conditions of slave labor. This racial double bind, to borrow from Marilyn Frye, positioned black people as at once disabled and hyper able and yet suited for slavery in both cases. (2017)
Liat Ben-Moshe, whose work on incarceration, deinstitutionalization, and mad studies supports a number of threads in critical disability theory and significantly intersects with race, has also worked on issues of disability in pedagogy and education. Ben-Moshe co-edited Building Pedagogical Curb Cuts (Ben-Moshe, Cory, Feldbaum, & Sagendorf 2005), a text offering resources for accessibility in higher education and integrating disability into curriculum. She has attended to the issue of using disability as metaphor in the classroom, suggesting ways to incorporate a critical perspective by which educators can fruitfully teach the use of disability in literature (2006). Ben-Moshe also co-edited a special issue of Disability Studies Quarterly on the topic of “Interventions in Disability Studies Pedagogy” (Volume 35, No. 2). In the introduction to this issue, Ben-Moshe writes, “I perceive Disability Studies as missionary work and much of my pedagogy is the work of conversion”. In describing conversion, Ben-Moshe refers to access but also “converting students to understanding disability intersectionally, as an identity and a culture” (Ben-Moshe, Day, Ferris, & Nielsen [eds] 2015).
2.3 Indigenous Theory and Postcolonial Theory
Gaining a fuller analytic picture at the nexus of race and disability calls for attention to indigenous persons. Literature on disabled indigenous experiences and related concepts is growing. For example, Huhana Hickey theorizes from the Māori perspective on the political and social circumstances of disabled indigenous persons (2001). Hickey demonstrates that, in addition to the fact that multiply oppressed persons have difficulty getting their needs met through non-intersectional discourse and activism, Māori with disabilities face additional barriers. Specifically, they experience invalidation and minimization of their disabilities within Māori communities (2008: 1). Multiple factors create this situation, including the diversity of cultures within Māori communities, some of which do not have words and concepts for disability identity (2008: 3). Economic oppression among Māori disproportionately affects disabled persons, influencing political and social access. Yet, without the language to describe these issues, their lack of access is not addressed (2008: 3–4). Further, some Māori attribute disability to spiritual or social causes, which leads to exclusion (2008: 3). Significantly, Hickey also cites the post-colonial status of Māori communities as a factor that further complicates questions of religion and contributes to the exclusion of disabled Māori (2008: 4–5). Rejecting both the medical and social models of disability, Hickey advocates for a communities-based model that supports access and human rights (2006). She seeks disability support options for Maori in her research (2004).
Meanwhile, Lavonna Lovern theorizes indigenous disability from a Native American perspective, considering difference and inclusion within Native American communities in North America (2008, 2017). She argues that theorists and activists must address differences between the dominant culture and Native American cultures; otherwise a choice to identify as disabled may further oppress those within Native American cultures. Addressing differences includes paying critical attention to the ontology and epistemology in Native American communities when theorizing about indigenous disability or working in solidarity with those communities (2008). Western conceptions of body and mind are different from Native American conceptions, and the history of colonization has made these differences especially complex to disentangle. Disability dialogues on a global scale would benefit from the engagement of indigenous voices, and the situation of disabled indigenous persons would improve with their inclusion (2017). With Carol Locust, Lovern explores the necessary translation work among cultures to work toward greater understanding, explicating Native American conceptions of difference (Lovern & Locust 2013). In another significant example, Devi Mucina writes from the indigenous Ubuntu perspective of South Africa; his work engages disability, including developmental disability, storytelling, and Blackness (e.g., 2010).
Postcolonial theorists working in critical disability theory deal with colonization and neo-colonization, treating disability within that context. As we have already seen, indigenous disability scholars are dealing with the tangled impacts of colonization. Postcolonial scholars seek to decolonize disability by centering the global South, challenging neo-colonialism in capitalism, culture, and discourse, and re-engaging questions of disability from a diversity of cultures (cf. Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 54). For instance, Shaun Grech details the export of Western disability studies, noting that this silences the majority of disabled people who live in the global South. Grech uncovers and critiques the related ways that the projects of neoliberal development are enacted on this global South majority (2011). In another notable instance, Fiona Kumari Campbell engages an implicit critique of Western disability studies in Contours of Ableism (2009). As Dan Goodley writes in the book’s foreword, “Campbell not only takes to task ableism, she grabs it kicking and screaming from its perch aboard the good ship Empire and tears it apart” (2009: ix).
3. Philosophical Approaches
This section provides key examples of work in the field of philosophy that contributes to and draws from critical disability theory. One sub-section tracks the influence of Michel Foucault, who is significant in critical disability theory, and the second sub-section captures multiple threads of analyses rooted in Continental philosophy that contribute to discursive, carnal, and psychic threads of critical disability theory.
3.1 Foucauldian Analyses
The work of French philosopher Michel Foucault, especially its purchase in historicizing concepts and analyzing power, is trenchant in critical disability theory. This sub-section provides key examples of Foucauldian approaches in critical disability theory.
For example, Shelley Tremain’s edited collection, Foucault and the Government of Disability (2005), brings together interdisciplinary, international work on disability from a variety of theorists who use Foucauldian approaches. In the introduction to that volume, Tremain writes,
The collection is a response to Foucault’s call to question what has been regarded as natural, inevitable, ethical, and liberating; hence, contributions to this collection draw on Foucault in order to scrutinize a range of widely endorsed practices and ideas surrounding disability, including rehabilitation, community care, impairment, normality and abnormality, inclusion, prevention, genetic counseling, accommodation, and special education. (2005: 2–3).
Tremain argues that Foucault’s concepts of biopower and the subject are “indispensable” in the analysis of disability, which in turn relate to his central concepts of government, or the conduct of conduct, and liberalism. This implies that disability is central to both of these concepts (2005: 7).
A Foucauldian approach follows through on efforts in critical disability theory to challenge the distinction between impairment and disability. Tremain argues that the social model, embedded in traditional disability studies and in the thinking of U.K. activists, fails because it strongly distinguishes between impairment and disability (2005: 9). For Tremain, impairment is not natural, value-neutral, and objective but rather is “historically specific and performative” (2017: 115, cf. 2005: 11). Along these lines, Tremain works to undermine, defamiliarize, and denaturalize terminology like “people with disabilities”, hierarchies of “severity” among impairments, the terminology of impairment itself, and type or kind distinctions among disabilities (e.g., physical or intellectual, among other similar terms) (2017). For her, impairment, like disability, is the product of power relations. Just as Judith Butler claims that sex is performatively constituted through gender, Tremain leverages Foucault to make the same claim about the relationship between disability and impairment (2017: 115, cf. Tremain 2001). She writes, “impairment has been disability—or rather, an element of the apparatus of disability—all along” (2017: 93). Indeed, according to Tremain, we should not be surprised that impairment itself is historical as “the shifting limits and borders of the classification of impairment demonstrate its historicity and cultural specificity” (2017: 93).
Tremain uses Foucault’s theoretical approach to articulate a feminist philosophy of disability. On this view disability is both relative and historical (2017). Among other innovations, Tremain introduces the concept of ableist exceptionism, which marks off disability as a-political, even while philosophers and other theorists of all stripes thoroughly politicize and problematize other identity categories (2017: 33–34). Along these lines, she analyzes work in feminist philosophy, philosophy, and the milieu of higher education for its exclusions, which replicate the idea that disability is an individual, biological matter (2017: 30).
Use of Foucault varies within critical disability theory, and so there are other key Foucauldian contributions to thinking about disability. Licia Carlson uses a Foucauldian genealogy to construct a history of intellectual disability, demonstrating that intellectual disability is contingent and constructed, and challenging long-standing beliefs in philosophy and ethics about its meaning and implications (2009, see also Carlson 2001). Nirmala Erevelles uses Foucault’s treatment of Pierre Riviere to frame debate over facilitated communication used by autistic students; using this comparison, she leverages Foucault to suggest that the human subject is fictional, therefore disrupting the question of whether or not a person considered mentally disabled can self-represent (2002). Aimi Hamraie, whose feminist work in critical disability theory focuses on access, technology, and universal design (e.g., 2017), employs Foucault to outline a historical epistemological approach to disability (2015). Joshua St. Pierre, whose critical work focuses on speech disabilities (2013, 2015a, 2015b), uses Foucault to situate Speech-Language Pathology as a governing discourse intended to bring speech under biopower (St. Pierre & St. Pierre 2018). The use of Foucault in these contexts does not go without critique. For example, Bill Hughes argues against the use of Foucauldian analysis in disability theory (2005).
Critical thinkers frequently use Foucault to assess, analyze, and reconsider topics in bio-medical ethics tightly connected to disability. Catherine Mills critically intervenes in bioethics using a largely Foucauldian approach, tackling topics such as reproduction, genetic screening, and selective termination (2008, 2011, 2013, 2015). Melinda C. Hall uses Foucault’s genealogical and biopolitical frameworks, including his concept of vile sovereignty, to reframe bioethical debate over human enhancement (2013, 2016). She argues that disability, the refusal of disabled futures, and the reduction of political and social questions to biological registers undergirds transhumanist desires to achieve posthumanity (2016). Marilou Gagnon, in the field of nursing, critically assesses seclusion rooms, public health campaigns, HIV, and telecare using Foucault’s theoretical structure of sovereign power and governance (Gagnon, Jacob, & Holmes 2010; Gagnon & Stuart 2008; Guta, Gagon, & Jacob 2012; and Jacob, Gagnon, Perron, & Holmes 2009).
Ellen Feder regularly employs a Foucauldian approach, especially using Foucault’s concept of biopower, to intervene in bioethics discourse and make progress in analyzing the family, gender identity, intersex issues, race, and shame surrounding the body, all of which are of serious interest in critical disability theory (1997, 2000, 2007, 2009, and 2014). Catherine Clune-Taylor uses Foucault to critically examine and treat evolving understandings of intersex and sex development, intervening upon treatment protocols, conversion therapy, and reductive understandings of evolution and gender (2010; see also Clune-Taylor 2016). Alice Dreger, too, has employed Foucault to theorize intersex (1998). Feder has also used concepts derived from other Continental philosophers, including Bourdieu’s habitus, to consider the impact of normalization on parent-child relationships in cases where children present atypical genitalia (2006). Feder argues that representations of sexual difference structure reality and become part of shared ideology, rendering it difficult to recognize evidence that complicates common understandings of sexual difference (2006: 191).
Foucault’s work, and so Foucauldian approaches, are a popular object of the kind of critique Vehmas and Watson (2014) use to target critical disability theory as a whole. Critics commonly suppose that Foucault lacks the necessary ground to make normative claims, as he refuses to distinguish normatively among various forms of power (e.g., Fraser 1989: 31 and 33). Hall responds to this frequent critique, writing,
Foucault’s refusal to engage in normative theorizing has normative implications; it allows one to see what has been obfuscated—for example, power’s productive functions—and thus reframe ethics by overthrowing previous normative presuppositions. (M. Hall 2015: 162)
Indeed, Foucault directly described his work as moral. In an interview, Foucault said,
In a sense, I am a moralist, insofar as I believe that one of the tasks, one of the meanings of human existence—the source of human freedom—is never to accept anything as definitive, untouchable, obvious or immobile. (Foucault 1988: 1, as quoted in M. Hall 2015: 162)
3.2 Other Continental Approaches
Other Continental methods significantly impact critical disability theory. This section demonstrates the range of that work by briefly presenting the use of phenomenology, existentialism, Deleuze and Guattari, and psychoanalysis in critical disability theory. Of course, this section is not exhaustive.
Phenomenology, including questions of ontology, hermeneutics, and life writing, is one critical approach taken within disability studies. For instance, Tanya Titchkosky and Rod Michalko argue that framing disability as a “problem” generates a restrictive discourse, specifically, the “requirement for explanation and amelioration, but little else” (2012: 127). They use a phenomenological approach to analyze this framing, which otherwise goes “completely unexamined” (ibid.). The authors write,
This approach permits us to ask, what sort of problem do contemporary times need disability to be? And, what is the meaning of human embodiment that grounds the unquestioned status of disability as a problem? (ibid.)
Phenomenology thus allows Titchkosky and Michalko to push back against what Edmund Husserl refers to as “ruling concealment” and to take advantage of a politically powerful alliance between phenomenology and disability studies that uses disability as the “scene where we can frame how we experience embodied existence” (2012: 141).
Life writing is a practice informed by phenomenology. Susannah B. Mintz contributes significantly to literature on disability and life writing (e.g., 2007). She describes a “phenomenological turn” in disability studies, which reconnects analyses to the body itself. Mintz seeks to push this opportunity further by theorizing the skin and touch, radicalizing mindfulness and ethics of care (2016).
Phenomenology is used to counter dominant discourses in medicine, with significant impact on discussions of illness and health. Havi Carel has written extensively on illness, life, and death from a phenomenological perspective, tackling questions of happiness, the usefulness of phenomenology in medicine, and the experience of illness (2006, 2007, 2011, 2013, 2016). Kevin Aho focuses primarily on phenomenology and mental health and launches new ways of thinking about, for example, medicalization (2008), the body (Aho & Aho 2008), and depression (2013). Maureen Connolly, likewise, frequently turns to phenomenology in her analyses, including work on autism (2008) and embodiment (2001; Connolly & Craig 2002).
Aho’s work also engages existentialism; his edited volume, Existential Medicine: Essays on Health and Illness, presents philosophical work on these topics influenced by Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Hans-Georg Gadamer (2018). While these interventions point toward the health professions, they engage the materiality of the body and the ontology of medicine, which in turn intertwine deeply with the theoretical efforts of critical disability studies. Meanwhile, in Kierkegaard after the Genome, Ada Jaarsma uses Søren Kierkegaard’s existentialism in a wide-ranging work seeking to materialize and politicize belief in bio-political, scientific spaces, including placebos and epigenetics. Her work draws together critical race and crip theory with Kierkegaard’s concepts of freedom and despair (2017).
French philosophers and collaborators Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari have significantly influenced work in critical disability theory, especially with regard to materialism and subjectivity. Rosi Braidotti (1994, 2002, 2006), Kelly Fritsch (2010), Dan Goodley (Goodley & Lawthom 2011; Goodley, Liddiard, & Runswick Cole 2018), Daniela Mercieca and Duncan Mercieca (2010), Griet Roets (Roets & Braidotti 2012), and others have used “DeleuzoGuattarian” concepts, including assemblages, intensities, and a distinctive approach to materiality in order to theorize disability. In this view, an “assemblage” describes an ontological network in which component parts remain fluid in the roles they play in a larger whole; assemblages include “contingent formations” and “desiring forces” (Fritsch 2010: 3 cf. Deleuze & Guattari 1980 ). This means that a challenge is issued to the “normative sovereign able body” that is supposedly independent (Fritsch 2010: 3). This challenge can be a rallying cry in disability theory. According to Fritsch,
disabled people are entangled in multiple assemblages: the human-machine assemblages of wheelchairs, ventilators, or walkers; human-animal assemblages such as assistive animals like guide dogs; or disabled-abled assemblages of the disabled person and care attendant. (2010: 3)
Fritsch cautions that this does not mean disabled people are unique; rather, assemblages fruitfully re-describe ontology, including those considered abled and non-abled (2010: 3). These re-descriptions can help build an “intercorporeal and relational ethics that has repercussions for all beings” (2010: 3).
Recall that critical disability theory challenges the distinction between impairment and disability, a distinction common in more traditional disability studies (e.g., Shakespeare 2006). As we have seen, Foucauldian approaches are used to critique this distinction. Roets and Braidotti, meanwhile, use Deleuze and Guattari to push back against this distinction, especially the ways in which it forces a conception of impairment as negative, tragic, and individual. They attempt to balance a Deleuzian-inspired materialism with regard to the body with the political goals of disability studies (2012). On a DeleuzoGuattarian perspective, “materiality” can be viewed as “plural, open, complex, uneven, and contingent” a view that opens up opportunities for this balance to be achieved (Goodley, Liddiard, & Runswick Cole 2018: 203).
New approaches in psychoanalysis, including strategies employing the psychoanalysis of Julia Kristeva, offer further critical resources to theorizing disability. For instance, Josh Dohmen uses a version of Kristeva’s theory of abjection, transformed by engagement with Sara Ahmed and Tina Chanter, to understand disability exclusion. Despite controversy over elements of Kristeva’s work for thinking disability, Dohmen argues that this Kristevean account is preferable to the Lacanian analyses found elsewhere in disability studies (2016). Meanwhile, Kristeva herself directly engages her concepts in scholarship around disability, laying out a politics of vulnerability (e.g., Kristeva & Herman 2010). Minae Inahara uses Luce Irigaray as a springboard to push back against the entrenched ableism and masculinism of Freud and Lacan and build a psychoanalytic understanding of physical disability (2009).
However, psychoanalytic approaches favored in philosophy circles are in some tension with challenges to psychology found elsewhere in critical disability theory. One important component of critical disability theory is increased attentiveness to mental illness and critique of received frames for understanding and analyzing mental illness. For example, to overcome the dualism endemic in more traditional disability studies, Margaret Price has coined the formulation “bodyminds” to capture the full embodiment that interests her in her work and to deal with the question of pain (2015). Price’s Mad at School: Rhetorics of Mental Disability and Academic Life (2011), challenges the focus of traditional disability studies on disabled bodies at the expense of disabled minds. Price argues that academic culture is produced by and assumes an abled mind and tracks the impact of mental disabilities in higher education (2011).
For theorists working in mad studies (e.g., Mollow 2013 and 2014) and critical psychology studies (e.g., Weiner 2005a, 2005b, and Wiener, Ribeiro, & Warner 2009), it is important to redevelop psychoanalytic approaches in their entirety to make them fit for these kinds of analyses and to break open new modes of thinking. Some thinkers find affect theory a fruitful location for challenging pathologization. For instance, Goodley, Liddiard, and Runswick Cole find it so, writing,
The affective register is always a cultural and embodied register and it is here that we might find moments of resistance as young people connect with others to contest normative ideas that assume their incompetence and emotional immaturity. (2018: 213)
Given the deep relationship in critical disability approaches between theory and praxis, this entry closes with a direct discussion of activism, including influential individual activists, along with their projects, and collectives doing significant work. Activism around critical disability theory engages a variety of topics, from immigration and unjust hiring practices to ableism and storytelling. Because of the material impacts of oppression, including economic oppression, and exclusions in higher education, many of these activists use popular web platforms, including social media, to engage in their advocacy and disseminate their work. Online efforts, policy promotion, and advocacy are covered to indicate efforts currently undertaken by those working under the critical disability theory umbrella.
Critical disability activism is conducted publicly through online forums. Education, writing, and advocacy tools are offered online, in addition to critical analysis of politics, news, history, and ideas. Individual activists and collectivists offer these tools and writings and often crowdsource support, both material and intellectual. Activist Vilissa Thompson, the author of the blog Ramp Your Voice!, is deeply engaged at the intersection of critical race and disability theory, writing, collecting and disseminating scholarship and doing advocacy work embedded at this nexus. According to the blog’s mission statement, Ramp Your Voice! fosters self-advocacy and offers educational tools and services, including workshops and public speaking supporting disabled people, including, especially, disabled girls and women of color. Thompson also offers the blog as a platform for writing by disabled people.
Activist Alice Wong leads the Disability Visibility Project. The project mission, since its founding in 2014, is to provide online space “dedicated to recording, amplifying, and sharing disability media and culture” (Disability Visibility Project). Wong focuses on collecting oral history and collaborates in this work with her DVP’s partner organization, StoryCorps. Influential writer Mia Mingus maintains a blog promoting critical disability activism, Leaving Evidence, and was formerly the coordinator of Black Girl Dangerous, which still serves as an important online archive of critical intersectional work and a springboard for activism.
Philosopher Shelley Tremain regularly blogs in online forums, examining political and social matters relevant to disability. She focuses especially on issues for disabled persons in academia, with specific attention to philosophy. To date, Tremain has conducted 50 interviews with disabled, queer, and POC academic philosophers about their experiences, their subject positions, and how ableism impacts their work. This series of interviews, called “Dialogues on Disability”, is a significant public philosophy project. First hosted on the blog Discrimination and Disadvantage, the full archive and new interviews can now be found on the blog BIOPOLITICAL PHILOSOPHY. Together with Tremain’s other public writings, and the other writing available from a variety of scholars on both blogs, the Dialogues on Disability project constitutes an archive that raises the profile of issues facing disabled academics while at the same time exploring critical-theoretical and intersectional work on disability.
Lydia X. Z. Brown, an activist, community organizer, and legal advocate, maintains a network of internet resources and blog under the name Autistic Hoya. Autistic Hoya is a crucial resource on ableism, language, and the experiences and activist work of disabled and queer POC. It is also a jumping-off point for fighting against institutionalization alongside Brown, including the Judge Rotenberg Educational Center. JRC uses the “graduated electronic decelerator”, which causes electric shocks, to control behavior (Bruno 2016). Autistic Hoya, thanks to Brown’s scholarly labor and activism, is a significant public archive for critical disability theory activism. Significant online resources beyond these examples exist. Meanwhile, critical disability theorists work to influence policy, dealing with topics from institutionalization to social services to law. Brown, a lawyer, is Justice Catalyst Fellow at the Bazelon Center for Mental Health Law. In this role, they support
the educational civil rights of Maryland students with psychosocial, intellectual, and developmental disabilities facing various forms of disproportionate discipline, restraint and seclusion, and school pushout. (Autistic Hoya, Sept. 23, 2019)
Brown served as Chairperson of the Massachusetts Developmental Disabilities Council from 2015–2017, is a founding board member of the Alliance for Citizen-Directed Services, and is a board member of the Autism Women’s Network. Brown was a Fellow with the National LGBTQ Task Force, and has worked for the Autistic Self Advocacy Network, among other key roles and grassroots activism (Autistic Hoya). In all of these ways, Brown has sought to directly influence policy using a critical disability approach.
Finally, direct advocacy on behalf of disabled people, both personal and political, is a key part of critical disability activism. Wong, a former U.S. presidential appointee to the National Council on Disability, is a significant advocate. She works with DisabledWriters.com, promoting the careers of disabled writers and journalists, and #CripTheVote, a non-partisan movement to put disability on political agendas and mobilize disabled people. Brown, along with Morénike Giwa Onaiwu, directs the Fund for Community Reparations for Autistic People of Color’s Interdependence, Survival, and Empowerment. This fund supports autistic people of color directly and materially, and is just one of many ways Brown extends their influence in order to advocate for individual disabled people.
Community activism also occurs through collectives. These collectives accomplish key foundational work that allows access to fundamental information, communication, and activism around oppression, including but not limited to police brutality, inaccessibility, and hermeneutic injustice. A (non-exhaustive) list of notable examples include: the Harriet Tubman Collective, a group of black Deaf and disabled activists; Helping Educate to Advance the Rights of Deaf Communities; Krip-Hop Nation, founded by Leroy F. Moore Jr., which includes disabled hip hop artists and lifts the voices of disabled African Americans in music and media; the National Black Disability Coalition, a U.S. national organization founded in 1990 for black disabled people; the National Coalition for Latinxs with Disabilities, a U.S. national organization for individuals who identify as Latinx and disabled; and, Rooted in Rights, a project of Disability Rights Washington that focuses on disability rights issues using videos and social media. “Storytellers” for Rooted in Rights participate internationally, broadening the scope of its impact.
The links to the websites, blogs, and online spaces highlighted in this section are collected under the heading “Other Internet Resources”, below. This section is mostly limited to North American and English-language examples; suggestions to expand its scope, addressed to the author of this entry, are welcome.
Critical disability theory is a diverse set of approaches that largely seek to theorize disability as a cultural, political, and social phenomenon, rather than an individualized, medical matter attached to the body. In this way, it shares goals with traditional disability studies. But, additionally, critical disability theory actively seeks alliances and has produced work in conversation with other key areas of critical thought: critical race theory, postcolonial theory, queer theory, and Continental philosophy, among other strategies. It also reflexively considers the exclusions, framing, and normative presuppositions of disability studies, favoring intersectional approaches and expansive inclusion. Critical disability theory presumes that those persons to whom the label “disability” attaches share in overlapping and intensifying oppressions with pathologized and devalued persons in circumstances not readily recognized as “disabled” (Minich 2016). As Schalk puts it,
One can study disabled people and not be doing critical disability studies and one can be doing critical disability studies and not be directly studying disabled people. (2017)
In this way, critical disability theory is interested, too, in topics not readily recognized as of concern for disability studies, including (for example):
protests against racialized disparities in health, education, and policing; struggles for environmental justice and reproductive freedom; HIV/AIDS and fat activism; the writings of Audre Lorde on blindness and cancer and of Gloria Anzaldúa on early menstruation and diabetes. (Minich 2016)
As demonstrated here, critical disability theory is a developing discipline with blurry boundaries and actively emerging new work. Indeed, some suggest that offering a literature review of work in this area is premature (Dunhamn et al., 2015; Meekosha & Shuttleworth 2009: 48). This entry nevertheless outlines work currently occurring under the umbrella of critical disability theory, its signature approaches, and key debates. There is room here for the significant shifts in terminology and attention to new topics one should expect from this politically responsive and intersectional field actively developing coalitions across boundaries. Difficulties emerge, too, including what Nirmala Erevelles calls the “complex cultural priorities” of such an enterprise. As she puts it, these “complex cultural priorities” include
the range of disability conditions (e.g., neurological, psychological, physical, cognitive) that the field of disability studies purports to represent in addition to the diversity of the disabled community around the axes of race, class, gender, and sexuality. (Erevelles & Kafer 2010: 212)
Theorists explicitly invite conversations about future directions of critical disability theory (e.g., Minich 2016).
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