Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones

First published Fri Mar 25, 2011; substantive revision Fri Aug 7, 2020

Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones (1848–1922), a contemporary of Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore at Cambridge University, worked primarily in philosophical logic and ethics. Her most significant contribution to the former area is her application of the intension-extension distinction to singular terms, anticipating Frege’s related distinction between sense and reference and Russell’s pre-“On Denoting” distinction between meaning and denotation. Widely regarded as an authority on philosophical logic by figures as diverse as F. C. S. Schiller and G. F. Stout on the one hand and C. S. Peirce on the other, Jones appeared in published symposia alongside such eminent contemporaries as W. E. Johnson and Bernard Bosanquet and became, in 1896, the first woman to present a paper at the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club. Her major publication, A New Law of Thought and its Logical Bearings, published in 1911 by Cambridge University Press, contained an enthusiastic preface by Stout and was received favorably in Mind, where the reviewer, Schiller, remarked: “Miss Jones has made a great discovery.” In the same year, Russell delivered a paper to the Moral Sciences Club, subsequently published as “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”, responding to a critical paper by Jones, delivered to the same society some months earlier. In ethics, Jones was well known as a defender and expositor of the views of her teacher and mentor, Henry Sidgwick. (Sidgwick regarded Jones as one of his prize students.) Yet, despite the fact that she published numerous articles, a monograph and several textbooks (some going into multiple editions), and was a very visible member of the English philosophical community from the 1890s until her death in 1922, she is now almost entirely forgotten.

Following a biographical sketch (section 1), sections 2–6 focus on Jones’s work in philosophical logic—in particular, her law of significant assertion and her criticisms of Russell; section 7 is devoted to Jones’s contributions to ethical theory. A closing section provides a brief survey of women’s contributions to early analytic philosophy.

1. Biographical Sketch

Born in Wales in 1848, Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones matriculated at Girton College, Cambridge University’s newly established women’s college, in 1875. She studied for the Moral Sciences Tripos under Henry Sidgwick, James Ward and John Neville Keynes, receiving a “First Class”, Sidgwick being among her examiners. (Her brothers’ education took priority over her own, delaying her entry into the academy and occasioning subsequent interruptions.) It was due to the interventions of Sidgwick and Ward that Jones, fluent from childhood in both German and French, was offered to complete, upon graduation, the remaining half of a translation of Hermann Lotze’s massive Mikrocosmos, left unfinished by Elizabeth Hamilton (the recently deceased daughter of Sir William Hamilton). Jones later went on to become Sidgwick’s literary executor. Her research in philosophical logic dates from 1884, when she began her career at Girton College as Resident Lecturer in Moral Sciences and was called upon to teach courses in logic; she later became Vice-Mistress and, subsequently, Mistress of Girton. During this period, Jones wrote a number of introductory logic texts, some of which went through several printings. By 1890, in her Elements of Logic as a Science of Propositions, whose main philosophical themes are summarized in “The Import of Categorical Propositions” (Jones 1893a), she developed her “law of significant assertion”—the “new law of thought” which would become the focus of her subsequent work in philosophical logic, culminating in the eponymously-titled monograph, published by Cambridge University Press in 1911. During the same period Jones also published numerous papers, as well as an introductory text (Jones 1909), in ethics. While her work in this area was primarily devoted to the exposition, interpretation and defense of Sidgwick’s work, she arguably broke new ground in her attempt at resolving Sidgwick’s dualism of practical reason. Jones was also a capable administrator. When she became Mistress of Girton in 1903, the college was £43,000 in debt (equivalent to £5,185,069 in 2020); at the time of her retirement in 1916, the debt had been paid off and funds had been raised to finance several fellowships. Her death in 1922 was marked by the appearance of substantial obituaries in Mind, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society and The International Journal of Ethics (now Ethics).

2. A New Law of Thought

2.1 The Paradox of Predication

In her autobiography, Jones wrote of an early fascination with issues related to the nature and structure of content:

This unsettled question—what is asserted when you make a statement, and what is the proper form of statement?—had deeply interested me from the time when I was a student and puzzled over Mill’s and Jevons’ accounts of propositions. (Jones 1922: 71)

Part of what fascinated her concerned (what I’ll call) the paradox of predication—a paradox that Jones traced to Plato’s Sophist. To understand Jones’s main contributions to philosophical logic, it is useful to review Hermann Lotze’s influential discussion, well known to Jones, of this paradox:

This absolute connection of two concepts S and P, in which the one is unconditionally the other, and yet both stand over against each other as different, is a relation quite impracticable in thought; by means of this copula, the simple ‘is’ of the categorical judgment, two different contents cannot be connected at all; they must either fall entirely within one another, or they must remain entirely separate, and the impossible judgment, ‘S is P’, resolves itself into three others, ‘S is S’, ‘P is P’, ‘S is not P.’ (Lotze 1888, 79)

To predicate P of S is either to say of S what it is not, or it is to say of S what it is. That is, it is to say that S is not S (because it is P), or it is to say that it is S. We either get a contradiction—we say, in effect, that S is not S—or an instance of the law of identity—we say that S is S. Neither option is satisfactory.

For Lotze, the paradox has an immediate upshot: that the ‘is’ of predication be expunged from logic. Grammatical appearances notwithstanding, the basic form an assertion takes is that of an identity statement or of its negation. This, however, renders him incapable of making sense of (what Jones called) “significant assertion”. The content of an assertion, if it is not to be an absurdity (A is not A), must be a triviality (A is A). (Lotze vaguely hints at a pragmatic account of the apparent significance of what he counts as trivialities, remarking that, perhaps, “what we mean by them will eventually justify itself.”) As we shall see, Jones does not depart from Lotze’s austere conception of logical form: an affirmative proposition S is P states an identity, and is true just in case the extension of S = the extension of P. However, she is able to graft a notion of intensional content onto Lotze’s logical skeleton, thus avoiding his paradoxical conclusion that, despite appearances, all positive assertion is analyzed in terms of A is not A.

The debate surrounding this paradox was not marginal, but at the center of contemporary discussion. Although Jones’s own solution falls squarely within the framework of nineteenth century logic, she seems to be responding to worries that were shared by Russell and Moore. Indeed, Dreben and Floyd (1991), who provide a useful discussion of the historical context, argue that the paradox is implicated in Russell and Moore’s break with idealism.

2.2 Identity Propositions and Significant Assertion

The distinction between the intension (or connotation) and extension (or denotation) of names, which traces back to the Port Royal Logic, was widely acknowledged by nineteenth century logicians. But the distinction was applied, as a rule, to general names, not proper names. With regard to proper names, logicians generally sided with John Stuart Mill in holding that they lack connotation. Keynes, for example, writes that proper names are “non-connotative”—that is, “their application is not determined by a conventionally assigned set of attributes” (Keynes 1906, 42).

Jones’s “New Law of Thought”—the law of significant assertion—incorporates the distinction as follows.

The Law of Significant Assertion:
Any Subject of Predication is an identity of denotation in diversity of intension. (Jones 1910–11, 169; 1911b, 2)

The general idea is quite straightforward and will have a familiar ring to anyone acquainted with Frege’s sense-reference distinction (or Russell’s pre-“On Denoting” distinction between meaning and denotation), even if the formulation is slightly clumsy: when we predicate a property of an individual or collection x, we first identify x via an intension f and then assert its identity with an individual or collection y, where y is itself identified via a distinct intension, g. We thus combine “identity of denotation” or “denotational oneness” with “diversity of intension”. As she puts it as early as 1893, “the very essence of Categorical statements… is the reference (in affirmatives) of two terms to one object, in such a way as to indicate that the object (or group) pointed out by the one term has also the characteristics signified by the other…” (1893a, 219). Or, as Stout writes in his Preface to Jones (1911b), “every affirmative proposition asserts, and every negative proposition denies, the union of different attributes within the unity of the same thing” (Stout 1911, v).

As noted, Jones’s conception of logical form is austere: every positive proposition asserts an identity. Accordingly, she takes the terms of all F is G to be the quantifier phrase all F and the predicate G. (“I understand the terms to include the whole of any proposition except the copula” [1893–94, 36].) This departs from the then-standard view, which distinguishes, in addition to the copula, subject term (F), predicate term (G) and quantifier or “term indicator” (all). The quantifier, she also notes, is optional, citing ‘Cicero is Tully’ as a case of an identity proposition in which it is absent (1890, 5).

There are thus only two forms that can properly be referred to as logical forms for Jones—identities and their negations. While Jones holds that S is P asserts an “identity of denotation” in “diversity of intension”, S is not P asserts “difference of denotation” in “intensional diversity”. (Even if one accepts the former analysis, however, the latter is problematic. As Augusta Klein (1911) notes, for a statement of the form S is not P to be informative, more is required than the mere “intensional diversity” of S and P. To see this note that, while ‘Horses are not house plants’ gives us a case of “difference of denotation” in “intensional diversity”, it is no more informative than ‘Horses are horses.’ For Klein, the intensions must overlap to a significant degree for the claim of their diversity to have any cognitive value.)

Jones thus solves a problem that must be faced by anyone espousing the view that predication is, at root, identity. If assertively uttering a sentence exemplifying ‘S is P’ is construed as asserting a proposition that A is A, then we fail to capture the point of the assertion. The assertion appears significant and informative; yet the content is trifling—something about which we can hardly be “informed”. If we take the general form of assertion to be an informative identity—to be “an identity of denotation in diversity of intension”—then the problem disappears. The solution, of course, applies to the cases that interested Frege—sentences that are explicitly of the form A = A. Indeed, Jones’s proposal here is in rough outline that of Frege (1892). (See the entry on Frege—in particular, the section Frege’s Philosophy of Language.)

It is worth remarking, however, that Jones’s label “a new law of thought” is somewhat misleading. In the nineteenth century, the laws of thought were commonly understood to be the following: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle. These are all easily statable in a first-order language. But Jones does not state a new firs-order law, in addition to these three; nor does she explain how the new “law” can supplant the law of identity.

What then is the status of her law, vis-à-vis the other laws? The following passage provides some help:

If we genuinely accept A is A as the expression of a fundamental and primary logical principle, the difficulty is, how theoretically to get beyond it. If we reject it, what we need, and what we find, to put in its place, is a principle of significant assertion of the form S is P. The laws of contradiction and excluded middle are laws of the relations of assertions, and they cannot be expressed in satisfactory and unambiguous form without the use of S is P, S is not P, propositions. So even for them we require a prior principle, explaining and justifying the S is P proposition itself. Such a logical principle, based on a new analysis of S is P, I think I can provide. (1911b, 10–11; emphasis added)

For Jones, the laws of contradiction and excluded middle apply exclusively to contentful assertions. Jones’s worry is that the conception of content inherited from Lotze, on which S is P is, effectively, A is A, is a poor model not only for ordinary assertions, but also of instances of the laws of contradiction and excluded middle. These laws tell us, respectively, that it cannot be the case, for example, both that Socrates is mortal and that he is not, and that it must be the case that either Socrates is mortal or he is not. In short, they tell us, of a significant assertion Φ, that either Φ or its negation obtains, and that Φ and its negation cannot both obtain.

Although Jones calls her law a “prior principle”, this does not mean that she takes her law to be logically prior to the other laws. These other laws provide us with logical forms that cannot have false instances. Jones’s law does something else: it places a constraint on significant assertion, whether true or false, telling us what conditions an assertion has to meet for it to be a significant instance, not only of identity, but also of contradiction and excluded middle.

2.3 Observations on Intension and Extension

Although the concept of intension plays an important role in Jones’s theory, she recognizes that grasping the intension of a name is neither necessary nor sufficient for grasping its extension. One may grasp the intension of a term and not grasp its extension, or conversely, grasp its extension but not its intension. Although undeveloped, her observations here are remarkably prescient.

Concerning the possibility that grasping an expression’s extension does not require grasping its intension, she writes:

I know that metal in extension denotes gold, silver, copper, iron, lead, tin, mercury, aluminium, etc., and I know these when I see them, but I am not able to give a satisfactory statement of the intension which they have in common…

Or again I know, or I may know, all the inhabitants of a country parish and be able to greet them correctly by name when I meet them, but may be entirely unable to give a recognizable description of any of them. Or I may know real diamonds from paste, or one disease from another, and always apply the names rightly, and yet be unable to set out even to myself the connotation or intension. (1911b, 13)

The point applies to the intensions of proper names as well as natural kind terms. What these considerations suggest, as similar considerations later suggested to Gareth Evans (1982), Saul Kripke (1980) and Hilary Putnam (1975), is that names and natural kind terms do not pick out their referents descriptively: mastery of either proper names or natural kind terms does not require that we associate with them any reference-determining description. Jones, however, doesn’t draw this bold conclusion. In fact, she thinks the observation is harmless, since, on her view, the intension of a term can be reconstructed by reflecting on its extension:

What I insist on is that all the names we use have both extension and intension; and either of these may be a guide to the other. I may have the things to which a name applies put before me… and from examination of them reach the intension; or have intension given, and go out and by means of it determine extension. (1911b, 14)

It doesn’t appear, however, that Jones is committing herself to any strong thesis here—that, contra Russell, there is a “backward road” from referent to sense; only that, in practice, a term’s intension can often be gleaned from examination of its extension.

In addition, grasping a term’s intension does not guarantee being able to identify its extension:

On the other hand I may have full descriptive knowledge of a person or plant or precious stone, and yet not be able to recognize the person or plant or jewel though it may much concern me to do so. I may even know much more about a person than his ordinary acquaintances, or even than his dearest friend, and be able to give a much more accurate description of his appearance and manner, and yet not know him when I meet him. (1911b, 13–4)

To connect this observation with the previous, we must assume that the competent use of N, where N is a name or natural kind term, involves a capacity to recognize N’s referent. What this passage then shows is that this recognitional capacity is not grounded in our grasping any reference-securing description or intension. But then grasping a name’s intension does not, by itself, put one in a position to use it to refer.

Of course, the points are, as indicated, undeveloped, and the above interpretation, written in the light of later discussions by Kripke, Putnam and Gareth Evans, may put more weight on Jones’s remarks than they can plausibly bear. But the passage’s placement early on in the monograph reflects an awareness of its significance. (The passage does, of course, fail to register the thought that her observations could undermine a key aspect of her proposal—that names and natural kind terms have intensions, or sense.)

2.4 Applying the Analysis

As we have seen, Jones holds that all affirmative propositions are identities. Applying the analysis can be less than straightforward, however. Consider her analysis of (1):

This small fragrant wild flower is Clematis.

On her view, ‘this small fragrant wild flower’ and ‘Clematis’ have the same extension, yet they possess distinct intensions (Jones 1893–94, 36). Jones doesn’t fully work out the details of this proposal, but the idea seems to be that the extension of the subject term is identical to some Clematis—a subset of the things in the extension of ‘Clematis’.

As can be seen, the analysis assumes that predicate terms are implicitly quantified. Jones held, following William Hamilton, that quantification is not restricted to subject terms, but applies to predicate terms as well (although the quantifier attaching to the predicate is never articulated). While Hamilton’s doctrine of the quantification of the predicate allowed for all sorts of monstrosities (Kneale and Kneale, 1962, 352–4), the only cases that Jones discusses involve quantifying the predicate with ‘some’, and assigning truth conditions to ‘Q + S are some P’ is relatively straightforward:

All \(S\) is some \(P\) \(|S - P^*| = 0\) where \(P^* \subseteq P\)
Some \(S\) is some \(P\) \(|S^* \cap P^*| \gt 0\) where \(S^* \subseteq S\) and \(P^* \subseteq P\)

In each case, we get precisely the truth conditions we would have with a quantifier-free predicate. E.g., ‘All S is some P’ is true just in case all S are P.

The endorsement of Hamilton’s view might seem perverse—and, in fact, Jones is elsewhere critical of his view (1906, 35–6)—but it is necessary if Jones is to retain the view that significant assertion is, at root, the assertion of an identity. After all, if ‘All humans are mortal’ asserts an identity, then, given that identity is commutative, it entails the apparently nonsensical ‘Mortals are all humans.’ The result is at least intelligible if we suppose that the predicate is also quantified—if, that is, ‘All humans are mortal’ is just ‘All humans are some mortals.’ For then, the consequence would be ‘Some mortals are all humans,’ which is just the claim that some subset of the set of mortals is identical to the set of (all) humans. (This, of course, is not quite an identity statement, since one of the terms is quantified, but it is the closest we can get to a workable version of Jones’s proposal.)

Hamilton’s doctrine provides a straightforward explanation of the validity of conversion. Indeed, Jones go so far as to claim that conversion itself presupposes some such approach: “The possibility of conversion… implies that the predicate, as well as the subject, of any proposition has denotation, and a denotation that is implicitly quantified” (1911b, 3; see also Jones, et al. 1914–15, 364). To be clear, Jones has a non-standard conception of conversion, on which the converse of ‘All humans are mortals’ is ‘Some mortals are humans’ and not, as usually understood, ‘All mortals are humans’ (she follows Keynes 1906, §96). Jones takes the former, fully articulated, to be ‘All humans are some mortals.’ Conversion switches the positions of the subject and predicate terms, giving us ‘Some mortals are all humans’. Of course, since the original and its converse are both, at logical form, identity statements, this is just an instance of the commutativity of identity (Keynes 1906, §142).

The analysis is applied to a variety of statement forms (see 1911b, 48–53). One cannot escape the impression, however, that Jones, like the Oxbridge logicians generally, “dissected with some crude instruments” (Grattan-Guinness 1985–86, 113). Indeed, as W. E. Johnson objected in an early exchange with Jones, the analysis seems to presuppose the very notion it seeks to eliminate—predication (Johnson 1892, 23). Consider (2):

Socrates is mortal.
On Jones’s analysis, (2)’s logical form is given by ‘Socrates is identical to some mortal.’ Using contemporary notation, this becomes (3) (recall that, for Jones, some mortal refers to a class):
\(\exists y (y\in \{x | \textit{Mortal}(x)\}\amp \textit{Socrates}=y)\)

As Johnson notes, in thus specifying the set of mortals (‘the set of things x such that x is a mortal’), we are invoking the relation of predication—the very notion that Lotze, and by implication Jones, rejected as unintelligible.[1] (Jones responds in Jones 1893a.)

Still, while the Law of Significant Assertion cannot be true in its full generality, a restriction of the law to identity sentences is worth considering. Accordingly, in discussing Jones in relation to Frege and Russell, I will construe The Law of Significant Assertion as a doctrine concerning identity sentences—sentences of the form a is b (where a and b are names, demonstratives or descriptions and is functions accordingly as the is of identity, not predication)—and not as a claim about subject-predicate sentences generally.

3. Comparison with Frege and Russell

Jones’s analysis of identity sentences has obvious affinities with similar analyses advanced by Frege and the early Russell. In light of this, it is instructive to review how Frege and Russell argue for their respective analyses and compare their arguments with Jones’s own.

3.1 Comparison with Frege

In the opening paragraph of “On Sense and Reference” (Frege 1892), Frege argues that a theory that identifies the semantic value of a name with its referent—the naïve theory—cannot differentiate between the contents of ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ and ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’. Given the plausible assumption that the proposition expressed by a sentence is a function of the semantic values of its constituent expressions together with their mode of combination, it seems inevitable that what the latter sentence says is just what the former sentence says—assuming, with the naïve theory, that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ possess the same semantic value. Of course, the latter sentence is potentially informative, whereas the former sentence is not. This leads Frege to reject the naïve theory. He also rejects, for reasons that need not detain us, a view according to which identity is a relation between the names ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’. The view he settles on is that the contribution that ‘Hesperus’ makes to the propositions expressed by the above-quoted identity sentences is a sense —a way of thinking of the referent. (While one might say that the semantic value of ‘Hesperus’ is the associated sense, this would be incorrect, since, on Frege’s view, ‘Hesperus’ has two semantic values—its sense, and the referent determined by this sense. The proposition expressed by, e.g., ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is partly determined by this sense, whereas the referent of this sentence—for Frege, its truth-value—is partly determined by the associated referent.)

Jones’s argument is similar, but not identical, to Frege’s. She argues that a theory that assimilates all assertion to A is A must fail to account for cases of significant assertion—cases in which we go beyond “pure tautology”. Frege’s argument is more sophisticated, making implicit appeal to a principle of compositionality, and considering alternative theories of the semantic contents of singular terms. Still, both are concerned to correct a similar—perhaps the same—mistake. Indeed, Jones’s and Frege’s interest in identity may derive from a common source, namely Lotze. (See Gabriel 2002 and Heis 2013 for assessments of Lotze’s role in the development of Frege’s thought.)

3.2 Comparison with Russell

Russell’s analysis of identity sentences in Principles §64 falls out of his theory of denoting concepts—concepts that, like intensions, determine an extension. In this section Russell shows how the theory of denoting concepts can explain “why it is ever worthwhile to affirm identity”:

But the question arises: Why is it ever worth while to affirm identity? The question is answered by the theory of denoting. If we say “Edward VII is the King,” we assert an identity; the reason why this assertion is worth making is, that in the one case the actual term occurs, while in the other a denoting concept takes its place… Often two denoting concepts occur, and the term itself is not mentioned, as in the proposition “the present Pope is the last survivor of his generation.” When a term is given, the assertion of an identity with itself, though true, is perfectly futile, and is never made outside the logic-books; but where denoting concepts are introduced, identity is at once seen to be significant. In this case, of course, there is involved, though not asserted, a relation of the denoting concept to the terms, or of the two denoting concepts to each other. But the is which occurs in such propositions does not itself state this further relation, but states pure identity. (Russell 1903; note omitted)

This bears a striking similarity to Jones’s proposal. When an identity statement relates two “terms”, or individuals, it is trivial and “is never made outside the logic-books”; but when at least one denoting concept is involved, the statement is significant. While these cases “involve” a relation of co-reference between the denoting concepts, or between one denoting concept and the term denoted, this relation is not part of what is stated: the one relation stated remains “pure identity”. Thus, even in the case of an identity statement involving a denoting concept, such as ‘the present Pope is the last survivor of his generation,’ we nonetheless assert an identity involving the individual determined by the denoting concept.

In “The Existential Import of Propositions” (Russell 1905a), the theory of denoting concepts is applied to the problem of vacuous singular terms. Russell explains how the failure of a singular term to denote is compatible with the term’s nonetheless having meaning, if we assume that denoting phrases (such as ‘the present King of France’) and at least certain names (‘Apollo’) express denoting concepts. Jones seems not to have considered the application of her denotation-connotation distinction to the problem of vacuous terms and does not appeal to its utility in this connection in arguing for her proposal.

4. Russell’s Recognition of Jones

As we have seen, Jones’s and Russell’s respective analyses of identity statements are similar and, moreover, similarly motivated. This raises a question: did Russell, prior to their public exchange (discussed below), have any awareness of Jones’s work? Complete ignorance on Russell’s part seems unlikely, considering that her teacher, Ward, and her champion, Stout, were Russell’s teachers at Cambridge.[2] It seems plausible that they would have attempted to interest Russell in the work of someone whose concerns overlapped with his so significantly. Moreover, Russell was a regular reader of the journals to which Jones contributed; in several cases, the two appeared in the same issue of Mind or of the Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. (In fact, Jones’s contribution to The Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society for 1906–07, which occurs in the same issue as Russell’s “On the Nature of Truth”, is in part a commentary on Russell’s paper.) But then we have another question—why does he never cite her distinction? Surely his audience, in particular readers of Mind, members of the Aristotelian Society and members of the Moral Sciences Club (see below), could be expected to be acquainted with it. If so, then it would make sense to mention it, if only to show how his (or Frege’s) version of the distinction is markedly different. Even if there is disagreement with the framework in which the distinction is grounded, Russell’s total silence demands an explanation. After all, in “On Denoting” Russell cites approvingly Bradley’s account of universal generalizations in terms of conditionals, even though he has decisively parted ways with Bradley’s logic. So he was clearly capable of separating a valuable idea from the framework in which it is expressed.

One document of interest concerning the question of influence is a letter to Philip Jourdain, dated September 5, 1909. Jourdain had sent Russell the draft of a long survey article on Frege’s work, in which he mentions Jones’s distinction, in Jones (1890) and (1982a), between intension and denotation—a distinction endorsed, as he noted in the published version of the article, by Keynes in the fourth (and final) edition of his influential text, Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic (Jourdain, 1911–12, 201–2, footnote 153). Although Jourdain’s letter is now lost, it appears he is querying Russell about the relation between Jones’s distinction and Frege’s (and, quite possibly, Russell’s related distinction between meaning and denotation). Here Russell responds:

It would seem, from what you say in your letter, that Miss Jones’s distinction of signification and denotation must be much the same as Frege’s Sinn and Bedeutung. But of course some such distinction is a commonplace of logic, and everything turns on the form given to the distinction. I have neither Keynes nor Miss Jones here, or I would look up the point. (Grattan-Guinness 1977, 119)

The note displays a remarkable lack of charity. Russell, instead of expressing interest in the possibility that Jones anticipated Frege on sense and reference, dismisses the distinction as “a commonplace of logic.” Going by what he writes here, how it is made, and not the distinction itself, is what is crucial. But until Russell developed the theory of descriptions, the distinction was made informally, both in his own case and in the case of Frege (1892). (While Frege 1893, §11, does present a formal theory of definite descriptions, one which could conceivably be employed as a formal theory of sense, it is doubtful that Russell had this version of Frege’s theory in mind when writing the above.) Surely the distinction had been worth making in the cases of Frege and of his earlier self, even though no particular form seems to have been given to the distinction in either case. Russell’s dismissal is therefore puzzling.

Moreover, had Russell consulted Keynes’ account of Jones’s distinction, he would have encountered an example that is quite similar to one used by Frege in the opening paragraph of “On Sense and Reference”:

If out of all triangles we select those which possess the property of having three equal sides, and if again out of all triangles we select those which possess the property of having three equal angles, we shall find that in either case we are left with precisely the same set of triangles. Thus, each side of our equation denotes precisely the same class of objects, but the class is determined or arrived at in two different ways. (Keynes 1906, 190)

Whether or not Keynes and Frege give the same “form” to the distinction, Keynes’s presentation is sufficiently close to Frege’s to suggest that one could hardly be in a position to dismiss the one, but not the other, as “commonplace”.[3]

One explanation of Russell’s dismissal of Jones’s distinction has to do with his correspondent. Jourdain, a former student of Russell’s, was quite conversant with the developing mathematical logic (at least to a degree—he was a competent, but not quite first-rate, practitioner), went on to publish informed survey articles on (in addition to the piece on Frege already mentioned) Boole, Jevons, MacColl, and Peano, and had written on Russell’s earlier work on the principles of mathematics. It’s conceivable that Russell resented the fact that Jourdain, expert in both Oxbridge logic and mathematical logic, took Jones to be touching on a point that he and Frege had already laid claim to—perhaps even beating them to a crucial insight. Matters are made worse by the suggestion that Jones had—however casually and indirectly—influenced Russell. Any indication either that he was influenced by Jones, or that she anticipated him in some small way, would detract from Russell’s own contribution. It is one thing to acknowledge a debt to a Frege or to a Peano. Russell saw these men not only as intellectual giants, but also as introducing genuinely revolutionary ideas and techniques into the study of logic and the foundations of mathematics. Not only was Jones manifestly not of their caliber, she was also philosophically quite retrograde. For Russell, mindful both of the figures he was allying himself with and of the innovation in thought that they were introducing, acknowledging that Jones had anticipated some of his ideas may have been repugnant. Small wonder, then, that he kept silent on the matter in his published work and correspondence. As it turns out, Jones was quickly to take credit (in print) for first giving expression to the distinction (see Jones 1910–11), although she sensibly refrained from suggesting that her work influenced Russell.

None of this is to deny that there may have been entirely intellectual reasons for Russell’s dismissal. As indicated, Russell clearly saw Jones as a throwback to an earlier period. Thus, even if there was some recognition that she had come upon a distinction quite similar to that between sense and reference or meaning and denotation, Russell’s indifference could quite easily be attributed to the fact that the insight was grafted onto a system of logic that he rejected.[4]

See Waithe and Cicero (1995, 37–43) for an extended discussion of the relation between Russell and Jones.

5. The Exchange

On December 2, 1910, Jones delivered a paper to the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club, titled “Categorical Propositions and the Law of Identity” (later published, under a different title, as Jones 1911a). Russell responded at a meeting three months later, on March 10, 1911, delivering “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”. While Russell did not acknowledge being influenced by Jones in his earlier work, nor did he compare her view to Frege’s, it is significant that he took her work seriously enough to merit a public response, one that would be recorded in one of his most influential papers.

The main point of their exchange concerns the following well-known passage in “On Denoting”:

If a is identical with b, whatever is true of one is true of the other, and either may be substituted for the other in any proposition without altering the truth or falsehood of that proposition. Now George IV wished to know whether Scott was the author of Waverley; and in fact Scott was the author of Waverley. Hence, we may substitute Scott for the author of ‘Waverley’, and thereby prove that George IV wished to know whether Scott was Scott. Yet an interest in the law of identity can hardly be attributed to the first gentleman of Europe. (Russell 1905b, 420)

Of this passage, Jones writes:

When George IV asked whether Scott was the author of Waverley, what he wanted to know was, whether the intension (‘meaning’, connotation) of Author of ‘Waverley’ could be assigned to Scott—i.e.,—whether identity of denotation could be asserted between Scott and Author of ‘Waverley’. The “first gentleman of Europe” did not want to know whether Scott was Scott … .

No doubt, ‘if a is identical [in denotation] with b,’ whatever is true of the thing denoted by a is true of the same thing denoted by bwith the obvious reservation that a is a does not convey the information that a has the intension (or connotation) b. (Jones 1910a, 379–80; the insertion is Jones’s)

I quote Russell’s response at length:

Miss Jones argues that ‘Scott is the Author of Waverley’ asserts identity of denotation between Scott and the author of Waverley. But there is some difficulty in choosing among alternative meanings of this contention. In the first place, it should be observed that the Author of Waverley is not a mere name, like Scott. Scott is merely a noise, or shape conventionally used to designate a certain person; it gives no information about that person, and has nothing that can be called meaning as opposed to denotation. (I neglect the fact, considered above, that names, as a rule, really stand for descriptions.) But the author of Waverley is not merely conventionally a name for Scott; the element of mere convention belongs here to the separate words, the and author and of and Waverley. Given what these words stand for, the author of Waverley is no longer arbitrary. When it is said that Scott is the author of Waverley, we are not stating that these are two names for one man, as we should be if we said ‘Scott is Sir Walter’. A man’s name is what he is called, but however much Scott had been called the author of Waverley, that would not have made him be the author; it was necessary for him to actually write Waverley, which was a fact having nothing to do with names. (Russell 1910–11, 27–28)

This passage expands on a point made in “On Denoting”, where Russell writes:

Now the relation of meaning and denotation is not merely linguistic through the phrase: there must be a logical relation involved, which we express by saying that the meaning denotes the denotation. (Russell 1905b, 421)

In his response, Russell explains why it is that the relation between a name and its referent is “merely linguistic through the phrase”, whereas the relation between a description and its denotation must be “logical”. The relation between a name ß and what it stands for is (merely) linguistic in that it is acceptable to specify what ß stands for with the phrase ‘the referent/denotation of ß’. The reason that it is acceptable is because ß has its reference or denotation determined conventionally. Thus, since no analysis is possible, all we can do is state the brute fact captured by the schema ‘ß stands for the referent/denotation of ß’. In contrast, the relation between a description and what it denotes is logical—the denotation relation is constrained by the meanings of the constituents of the description and their mode of combination. Thus, if ß is a description, ‘ß stands for the referent/denotation of ß’ does not state a brute fact about our use of ß. Rather, it states a fact that holds in virtue of other facts—facts about the meanings of ß’s constituents and their mode of combination.

A bit later, he continues:

If we are to say, as Miss Jones does, that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ asserts an identity of denotation, we must regard the denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ as the denotation of what is meant by ‘the author of Waverley’. Let us call the meaning of ‘the author of WaverleyM. Thus M is what ‘the author of Waverley’ means. Then we are to suppose that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ means ‘Scott is the denotation of M’. But here we are explaining our proposition by another of the same form, and thus have made no progress towards a real explanation. ‘The denotation of M’, like ‘the author of Waverley’¸ has both meaning and denotation, on the theory we are examining. If we call its meaning M′, our proposition becomes ‘Scott is the denotation of M′’. But this leads to an endless regress. Thus the attempt to regard our proposition as asserting identity of denotation breaks down, and it becomes imperative to find some other analysis. When this analysis has been completed, we shall be able to reinterpret the phrase ‘identity of denotation’, which remains obscure so long as it is taken as fundamental. (Russell 1910–11, 28–29)

Let’s unpack this. Russell is here evaluating a hypothesis according to which a description such as ‘the author of Waverley’ is, contrary to his own view, meaningful in isolation.[5] To assume that this description is meaningful in isolation is to assume that, for some M, ‘the author of Waverley’ means M. Let’s call this meaning M*. Since we accept the following:

The denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ = the denotation of what is meant by ‘the author of Waverley

we also accept

The denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ = the denotation of M*

Now the meaning-in-isolation theorist might suggest that our original sentence, ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’, means that Scott is the denotation of M*. But, as Russell observes, all this does is to replace one description with another. Since the theorist fails to tell us what ‘the author of Waverley’ means in terms that don’t involve an expression equally in need of analysis, we have been given no evidence that this, or any, description is meaningful in isolation.

Jones responds:

Mr. Russell explains my meaning to be that the denotation of The author of Waverley is the denotation of what is meant by the author of Waverley. But I do not accept this. Meaning, intension, of author is authorship; denotation of author is person of whom authorship is an attribute. I do not see from the fact of one proposition being explained by another of the same form … it follows that we “have made no progress towards a real explanation.” This would seem to involve that one categorical proposition cannot be explained by other categorical propositions. (Jones 1910–11, 183–184)

Jones rejects the proposal that what is denoted by the F = what is denoted by the meaning of ‘the F’. While her reasoning is obscure, the point seems to be that these descriptions cannot co-refer, since they involve different concepts—one, but not the other, involves the concept of denotation. The point is confused, however; clearly, the descriptions are co-denoting—relative to the assumption that ‘the meaning of the F’ has a denotation.

Her second point is more intriguing: Jones objects to the regress argument’s conclusion that no real explanation of the meaning of denoting phrases can be achieved if we explain a proposition containing such a phrase with another proposition containing a phrase of the same form. Once again, however, the point is undeveloped. Nonetheless, it is implied that a categorical proposition can indeed be explained by another categorical proposition, so from the fact that p and q share the same form it does not follow that (e.g.) q fails to explain p (in the relevant sense of ‘explain’). (Recall that she takes all categorical propositions to possess the same form.) Echoing Jones’s sentiment, R. M. Sainsbury writes, “it is unclear what sort of explanation is needed, and why the circularity is vicious. This objection [i.e., Russell’s] must be regarded as therefore inconclusive” (Sainsbury 1979, 105). (Broad (1912) responds similarly.) Hylton (1990, 252–53), on the other hand, argues quite persuasively that there is a vicious regress here (Hylton’s remarks are concerned specifically with the passage in “On Denoting”, however).

The point is developed further in Jones’s reply to Broad (1912), responding to Jones (1910–11):

If I say that the import of, e.g. Scott is the Author of Waverley, is to assert identity of denotation with diversity of intension, I can of course also say that: What is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Scott”’, is identical with what is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Author of Waverley”’. As Mr. Broad suggests, the repetition in Subject and Predicate is ineffective, and

What is denoted by ‘Scott’
What is denoted by ‘What is denoted by “Scott”’

have all three the same identical denotation.

Scott is the Author of Waverley.

If my analysis (as far as denotation is concerned) is applied to this, we get:—

What is denoted by ‘Scott’ is identical with what is denoted by ‘Author of Waverley’.

If the same analysis is applied to (2) we have :—

What is denoted by ‘What is denoted by “Scott”’ is identical with what is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Author of Waverley”’,

and so on. We have simply a repetition, for each successive more complicated proposition, of the analysis adopted.

I think that a regress equally “infinite,” equally inevitable, equally innocuous, equally useless, would emerge in the case of any propositional analysis treated in the same way… (Jones 1913, 528)

Jones seems to miss an important point here. The existence of a sequence such as (1′)–(3′) is predicted on both analyses—one according to which ‘Author of Waverley’ (or ‘the author of Waverley’) has meaning in isolation, and one according to which it does not. Thus, the inevitability of the sequence is of no consequence, as it fails to tell against Russell’s theory.

To see this, note that Russell could easily acknowledge that a sequence of the following form will exist when ‘a’ is either a name or a definite description

a is the referent of ‘a
a is the referent of “the referent of ‘a’”
a is the referent of ‘the referent of “the referent of ‘a’”’

In the case of names, the first clause provides the ultimate explanation for the truth of each succeeding clause. This is not true, however, when ‘a’ is a description.

Consider, for example, the following segment of an infinite sequence:

the referent of ‘Scott’
the referent of ‘the referent of “Scott”’

We can say that:

‘Scott’ refers to (4).
‘Scott’ refers to (5).
‘Scott’ refers to (6).

Notice, however, that each member of the latter sequence after (4*) holds because (4*) holds. (Unless, of course, one wants to deny that even ‘Scott’ has meaning in isolation; but this is obviously not Jones’s position.) That is, ‘Scott’ refers to the referent of ‘Scott’ (i.e., (5)) because ‘Scott’ refers to Scott (i.e., (4)).

Now consider the following initial segment of an infinite sequence, (7)–(9), together with the corresponding reference assignments, (7*)–(9*):

the author of Waverly
the referent of ‘the author of Waverly
the referent of ‘the referent of “the author of Waverly”’
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (7)
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (8)
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (9)

Here we see a contrast with (4*)–(6*): to explain the fact reported by (8*) by citing the fact reported by (7*) is unsatisfying, since (7*) is left unexplained. Moreover, (7*), unlike (4*), does not state a brute semantic fact–a fact that cannot be further explained in semantic terms. It is clear that, if ‘the author of Waverly’ is a singular term and, contra Russell, has meaning in isolation, then the relation between it and its denotation, Scott, cannot be like the one that obtains between ‘Scott’ and Scott.

This disanalogy between the two cases may not settle the case in Russell’s favor—perhaps, ‘the author of Waverly’, like ‘Scott’, is meaningful in isolation after all, even though its meaning (or denotation), unlike that of ‘Scott’, can’t be assigned directly (indeed, Richard Montague provided the tools for constructing precisely such a meaning). Even so, Jones is wrong in thinking that the mere existence of a sequence such as (7*)–(9*) is dispositive.

6. Related Criticisms of Russell

An important related criticism, not acknowledged by Russell in subsequent writings (it appeared after his response to Jones in “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”) is a critique of a famous passage in Principia Mathematica. In arguing that descriptions are incomplete symbols and have no meaning in isolation, Russell claims that although ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ expresses an identity, ‘the author of Waverley’ cannot be a name. If it were, then it would be a value of c in the propositional function ‘Scott is c’. But this would mean that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ expresses what ‘Scott is Scott’ expresses, which is absurd:

The “author of Waverly” cannot mean the same as “Scott,” or “Scott is the author of Waverly” would mean the same as “Scott is Scott” which it plainly does not; nor can the “author of Waverly” mean anything other than “Scott” or “Scott is the author of Waverly” would be false. Hence the “author of Waverly” means nothing. (Whitehead and Russell 1910, 67)

Jones observes:

Granted that Intension and Denotation are differently defined, this argument seems to depend on a double use of the word meaning—thus: when it is said that the author of Waverley cannot mean the same as Scott, meaning signifies intension or connotation; plainly intension (or connotation) of the author of Waverley and of Scott, cannot be the same. But when it is said that the author of Waverley cannot mean anything other than Scott, or Scott is the author of Waverley would be false, “mean anything other than Scott” must be understood of denotation; if Scott and the author of Waverley are two distinct persons, clearly Scott is the author of Waverley must be false. (My identity-in-diversity theory removes the difficulty at once.) (Jones 1910–11, 175–76)

Jones’s point can be summarized as follows. When Russell argues that ‘author of Waverly’ cannot mean the same as ‘Scott’ because this would imply that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ and ‘Scott is Scott’ express the same proposition, he uses ‘meaning’ in an intensional sense: “plainly intension (or connotation) of the author of Waverley and of Scott, cannot be the same.” But when he argues that ‘the author of Waverly’ must mean the same thing as ‘Scott’, he uses ‘meaning’ in the denotational sense. Russell’s premises, disambiguated, can be recast as follows: ‘the author of Waverly’ and ‘Scott’ cannot have the same intension; ‘the author of Waverly’ and ‘Scott’ must have the same denotation. From these, it does not follow that ‘the author of Waverly’ has neither denotation nor connotation—that it lacks meaning.

Jones seems to be perfectly correct here. The Principia argument intending to show that descriptions such as ‘the author of Waverly’ have no meaning in isolation assumes that an expression can only possess one kind of meaning—and thus that sameness of meaning is either sameness of intension or sameness of denotation—and Jones is quite right to challenge this. (But see Perkins 2011 both for an alternative reading of the text as well as a useful history of the debate surrounding its interpretation.)

7. The Dualism of Practical Reason

As indicated above, Jones also made significant contributions to ethics and moral psychology. This section will focus on her major contribution to these areas—her attempt at a resolution to a problem that Sidgwick stated in his The Methods of Ethics (ME), but which he never resolved to his satisfaction: the dualism of practical reason.

A central goal of ME is to determine the rules guiding practical rationality and to present these as “methods”—“rational procedures for determining right conduct in any particular case” (78). ME argues at length for the rationality of benevolence: that our actions should have “Universal Good or Happiness” as their goal (507). But, alongside this primary rule or method, Sidgwick also recognizes a secondary rule of self-love or egoism. The latter rule, he is forced to acknowledge, is equally rational: “even if a man admits the self-evidence of the principle of Rational Benevolence, he may still hold that his own happiness is an end which it is irrational for him to sacrifice to any other; and that therefore a harmony between the maxim of Prudence and the maxim of Rational Benevolence must be somehow demonstrated, if morality is to be made completely rational” (498; emphasis added).

The dualism of practical reason is precisely this fact, that practical reason is guided by two distinct but potentially incompatible rules. This incompatibility will not always rise to the surface, but there is a possibility that the two methods give divergent results. As Sidgwick writes, in such a case, “practical reason, being divided against itself, would cease to be a motive on either side”(508). This would be unacceptable for a moral rationalist like Sidgwick, who, in requiring self-evidence of his methods would surely also require that their conjunction meet the same requirement.

Sidgwick’s dissatisfaction with this state of affairs was not simply intellectual. As Bart Schultz notes in his biography:

The gloomy last line of the first edition of the Methods rang out like an English version of the “crisis of the Enlightenment”, warning that practical reason might be reduced to a “chaos.” (2004, 15; note removed)

Sidgwick rejected a “metaphysical” resolution of the dualism. On this view, selfless actions are rewarded in the afterlife, with God or some other force guaranteeing that self-interest and benevolence coincide. He similarly dismissed the view that the methods coincide due to facts about our evolutionary history—that selectional pressures have seen to it that what we desire for ourselves is precisely what benefits the species as a whole. In each case, we are asked to believe that the circumstances in which the methods deliver conflicting results will simply not arise, either due to “the moral government of the universe” or to the contingencies of natural selection.

Sidgwick’s rationalism had him set a high bar for ethical propositions—that they have the certainty of “any axiom in Arithmetic or Geometry” (507). Since the above resolutions fall far short of these standards, he could not accept them.

Jones addressed the dualism on various occasions throughout her career (Jones 1894, 1894–95, 1895, 1909, 1917–18, 1920), and a full survey of these discussions is not possible here. This section will focus on her most considered response to the dualism, her late publication “Practical Dualism” (Jones 1917–18). Where relevant, I will also quote from her roughly coeval entry on Sidgwick for the Encyclopaedia of Religion and Ethics (Jones 1920).

Jones’s stated aim in “Practical Dualism” is to “deduce” the rule of prudence (or rational self-interest) from benevolence (Jones 1917–18, 323): “The reasonableness of benevolence implies the reasonableness of self-love” (1920, 504). The upshot is that we have reduced our fundamental principles to one, thus solving the problem of the dualism of two methods.

The claim that benevolence entails self-love might strike us as puzzling. At least since The Republic, the thought has been that, if there is an entailment, it should go in the opposite direction: self-love entails benevolence, and, accordingly, it is in my interest to promote the happiness of others. But as the following makes clear, Jones’s point is slightly different:

It would thus appear that Benevolence implies Self-Love, and Rational Benevolence irresistibly leads us back to the rationality of Self-Love as our starting-point. Similarly, in the precepts “Do unto others as ye would (reasonably would) they should do unto you,” “Love your neighbour as yourself,” it is implied that the love of self is logically prior to, and sets the standard for, love of our neighbour. (1917–18, 324; see also 1920, 504)

What Jones is claiming here is that the very formulation of benevolence presupposes the rationality of self-love. If we had no independent conception of the value of happiness, then neither self-love nor benevolence would be rationally binding. But the only way that I can come to grasp the value of happiness is by grasping it in my own case. If I grasp the value of your happiness for you, it is only because I already grasp the value of my happiness for me:

Now, a man cannot experience, cannot directly know, any happiness but his own. It must, therefore, be on the ground that his own happiness is to himself ultimately and intrinsically valuable, valuable in itself, that he can logically regard the happiness of others as ultimately and intrinsically valuable to them. His reasoned belief in the value for others of their own happiness must be based, it can only be based, on his recognition of the value for himself of his own happiness. (323; final emphasis added)

My appreciation of the intrinsic value of others’ happiness to them is grounded in my appreciation of the intrinsic value of my happiness for me. What this means logically is that the principle presupposes self-love. That is, the principle of benevolence is neither true nor false if the principle of self-love is false. (See the entry on Presupposition.)

Thus it appears that when Jones writes that “rational benevolence implies or includes the rationality of self-love” (328; emphasis added) she does not have logical implication in mind but rather the relation of presupposition. Moreover, this claim is itself far more plausible on the face of it than the claim of logical entailment.

Still, the question arises, what does the claim of presupposition show? It shows at least this much, that the two principles are consistent—relative to the assumption, as Jones is quick to point out, that benevolence is itself non-contradictory (324). This is a significant development, since Sidgwick’s central concern was with the compatibility of the two principles. If benevolence requires that self-love be true for it to be true (or false), then the two must be consistent (assuming benevolence is).

One might challenge Jones’s response in two ways. One might question her assumption that the rule of benevolence presupposes self-love in precisely the way that the Golden Rule presupposes self-love. Broad (1930, 158–9), for example, held that benevolence has no such presupposition. On his view, the ethical hedonist (who advocates benevolence) and the rational egoist have different conceptions of the good—“my Good [says the egoist] and your Good… are not parts of a total Good.” Since they involve distinct conceptions of the good, the formulation of the one position cannot presuppose the truth of the other. Nonetheless, since they make conflicting commands regarding certain conceivable situations, we cannot rationally subscribe to both.

The other concern is that she has, at best, shown that one who embraces benevolence cannot consistently reject self-love. But this does not give us a positive argument for the rational egoist to accept benevolence. Jones does argue, in “Practical Dualism,” that as humans we are by nature empathetic, often, through an innate impulse, identifying our happiness with the happiness of others. While it may be possible to argue, on such a basis, that the mere possession of the concept of happiness makes us value it in others as much as we value it in ourselves, it remains the case that this is a psychological fact. While it may be so that we by nature are drawn to value in others what we value in ourselves, it does not follow that we rationally ought to do so simply because we do so—or even that we ought to do so—in our own case.

Ostertag and Favia (2020) presents a more comprehensive account of Jones’s responses. See Soames (2014, 263–69) and the entries on Henry Sidgwick and Bertrand Russell’s Moral Philosophy for more on the Sidgwickian background.

8. Women in Early Analytic Philosophy

Jones was not the only woman approaching philosophical logic and ethics from a broadly analytic perspective during this period: Peirce’s student, Christine Ladd-Franklin (1847–1930), made significant contributions to logic and psychology (see Russinoff 1999 for Ladd-Franklin’s contributions to the algebra of logic), and the writings of Lady Victoria Welby (1837–1912) on meaning were widely read. Indeed, Peirce wrote a joint review of her What is Meaning? and Russell’s Principles of Mathematics for The Nation. (Dale 1996 discusses Welby’s role in the development of the theory of meaning.) Later figures include the philosopher of science, Dorothy Wrinch (1894–1976), a Girton student who went on to study under Russell, and Susanne Langer (1895–1985), who wrote a dissertation under Alfred North Whitehead at Radcliff in 1926. Wrinch, who published papers in Mind on, among other things, the unity of the proposition and the theory of relativity, later abandoned philosophy for chemistry, teaching for many years at Smith College. Langer, who would achieve prominence in the philosophy of art beginning in the 1940s, published several technical articles on type theory and related topics early in her career (Langer 1926, 1927; McDaniel 2017 is a useful guide to her early work). Possibly the most prominent woman analytic philosopher of the first half of the twentieth century, however, was another Girton student, L. Susan Stebbing (1885–1943), Professor of Philosophy at Bedford College, London, and co-founder of the journal Analysis. Stebbing, through her most successful student, Max Black, is responsible for one of the largest “families” in Josh Dever’s Philosophy Family Tree (see Other Internet Resources).

Waithe (1995) is an important resource for research into these women, as well as numerous minor figures; see also van der Schaar and Schliesser (2017). On the larger question of the erasure of women from the history of philosophy, from antiquity to the French Revolution, Eileen O’Neill’s essay, “Disappearing Ink” (O’Neill 1998), remains indispensable.


Primary Sources

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Works Discussing Jones

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Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank Amanda Favia, Oliver Marshall, Frank Pupa and Rosemary Twomey for helpful comments on an earlier draft. Thanks also to Ben Caplan for helping sort out the date of Jones’s 1910 lecture to the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club. I remain indebted to Kenneth Blackwell, Rosalind Carey, Juliet Floyd, Nicholas Griffin, Kevin Klement and Consuelo Preti for their help on the first version.

Copyright © 2020 by
Gary Ostertag <gostertag@gc.cuny.edu>

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