Susan Stebbing

First published Mon May 8, 2017

Susan Stebbing was a leading figure in British philosophy between the First and Second World Wars. She made significant contributions to the development of the analytic tradition, both in establishing it institutionally and in showing how its ideas and techniques could be applied in a wide range of domains. Her early work focused on logic and during her lifetime she was celebrated chiefly for A Modern Introduction to Logic (1930), which offered an account of both traditional, Aristotelian logic and the new mathematical logic associated particularly with the work of Russell and Whitehead. She went on to be both an important proponent of what came to be known as the Cambridge School of Analysis and an advocate of the relevance of logic to everyday questions and problems. In her early work on logic and increasingly in her later work on thinking and reasoning, she stressed the ways in which language is used and misused in ordinary communication and argued that philosophers must pay heed to these uses and misuses. Stebbing felt increasingly compelled to engage with practical contemporary issues and to address a wider public audience. Philosophy and the Physicists (1937) and Thinking to Some Purpose (1939) offer, respectively, critiques of the language used in popular science communication and in everyday genres such as political speeches, advertisements, and newspaper editorials. Towards the end of her life, her interests in logic and language became increasingly socially directed and politically engaged. Stebbing’s work foreshadowed a number of important subsequent developments both in philosophy itself and in linguistics.

1. Life

Stebbing lived through some remarkably turbulent decades, in terms both of social and political upheavals and of philosophical developments, and these are reflected in the direction and development of her work. Her personal life and career, in contrast, were relatively uneventful. She was born in 1885 in North London, the youngest of six surviving children of a fish merchant. She went up to Girton College Cambridge in 1904, a time at which University study for women was very much the exception and long before Cambridge awarded degrees or even full University membership to women. Apparently her first interest was to study science, but this was deemed by her family to be too demanding for her on the grounds of her delicate health, so she matriculated in History. Whether or not it was a legitimate bar to scientific study, it is true that Stebbing suffered from ill health throughout her life. In particular, she was afflicted with Menière’s disease, a disorder of the inner ear which caused her fits of vertigo, severe headaches, and forced prolonged periods of bed rest.

While at Cambridge Stebbing developed an interest in philosophy, apparently after happening on a copy of F. H. Bradley’s Appearance and Reality (1893). After completing her studies in History she took the first part of the Moral Sciences Tripos at Cambridge and then moved to King’s College London to take an MA in Moral Science, graduating in 1912. After various short-term and part-time posts teaching in schools and universities, she was appointed to a lectureship at Bedford College for women, in the University of London, in 1920. In 1933 she made the national newspapers when she became the first woman in the UK to be appointed to a full professorship in philosophy, again at Bedford College. (Bedford College became coeducational in the 1960s but was merged with Royal Holloway College in 1985, though the philosophers there moved to King’s College London, which now has an established chair of philosophy named after her.) During the late 1930s and early 1940s she knew, or worked or corresponded with, many of the major figures in mid-twentieth century philosophy. At the same time she devoted a great deal of time, influence, and personal income, to securing the safety of refugees from Germany and Nazi occupied countries: both exiled scholars and orphaned or fugitive children. However, her health continued to deteriorate. She suffered and apparently recovered from one bout of cancer, but the cancer returned, and she died in 1943 at the age of 57.

Stebbing’s given names were “Lizzie Susan”. She disliked the “Lizzie” and was universally known throughout her life as “Susan”. In her writing and professional work, she generally preferred to use just initials, and at least to begin with, she published as “L. S. Stebbing”. One friend suggested that Stebbing preferred philosophical debates not to become side-tracked by details of gender or status that might be indicated by first names or titles. (For a full account of her life, see Chapman 2013.)

2. Logic

Stebbing’s first significant work, which established her reputation, was A Modern Introduction to Logic. First published in 1930, it was revised in 1933, and might justly be regarded as the first textbook of analytic philosophy: it went through several editions and was still being reprinted in the early 1960s. Its main aim was to introduce readers to the developments in logic that had taken place over the previous five decades, though she leads into this through discussion of traditional Aristotelian logic. Its title was “A Modern Introduction to Logic”, not “An Introduction to Modern Logic”. Divided into three parts, the first deals with topics that are now familiar in analytic philosophy, such as names and descriptions, logical form, the theory of descriptions, inference and implication, as well as offering an account of syllogistic theory. The second deals with scientific methodology, covering induction and causality, in particular. The third discusses definition, abstraction, and the nature and historical development of logic.

Stebbing’s conception of logic is made clear in the first and last two chapters of the book. Logical thinking is “directed” thinking, aimed at answering a question or solving a problem. As such it involves reasoning: identifying and articulating the premises by means of which, by valid argumentation, to arrive at relevant conclusions. Reasoning proceeds in accord with certain rules and exhibits certain forms of inference, and one of the tasks of logical theory is to articulate these rules and make explicit these forms of inference—as Aristotle first did in developing his theory of the syllogism. One reason that Stebbing included discussion of syllogistic theory was that the rules and forms are relatively simple, so that the dependence of the validity of an inference on its logical form, for example, could be more easily ascertained and elucidated. But she was also concerned to introduce modern logic. She explains the basic symbolism of Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica in chapter 8, for example, and the theory of relations in chapter 10. She does not give any systematic presentation of the predicate calculus, however. In keeping with her conception of directed thinking, her concern is primarily with explaining the various concepts and doctrines, such as the concept of a proposition and Russell’s theory of descriptions, which help us in understanding logical thinking and logical theory.

Logic, according to Stebbing, is not an art, understood as “a set of rules the learning of which may fit some one to do something”, but a science—the science of possible forms (1933b: 473–4). Insofar as the logical forms that the science of logic discovers are norms of thinking, logic can be described as a normative science. But its normativity is not its distinguishing feature, she argues, but is merely a by-product of the fact that norms are what are discovered in logic. She offers an account of the development of logic as the science of form in the final chapter of the book, tracing it from its roots in Aristotle’s Prior Analytics to Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica, in which it is finally shown, she claims, that “Demonstration as such is purely formal” (1933b: 488).

In 1934 Stebbing published Logic in Practice, a very short book directed at a more general audience. She continues to regard logic as the science of forms, the chief task of which is to make explicit the norms of reasoning. But she does indeed become more interested in the art of thinking. In the preface she writes:

The study of logic does not in itself suffice to enable us to reason correctly, still less to think clearly where our passionate beliefs are concerned. Thinking is an activity of the whole personality. Given, however, a desire to be reasonable, then a knowledge of the conditions to which all sound thinking must conform will enable us to avoid certain mistakes into which we are prone to fall. There is such a thing as a habit of sound reasoning. This habit may be acquired by consciously attending to the logical principles of sound reasoning, in order to apply them to test the soundness of particular arguments. (1934a: vii–viii)

Logic in Practice is intended to help people reason correctly, with stress laid on “the importance of considering language, which is an instrument of our thinking and is imperfect, as are all human creations” (1934a: viii). This marks a transition in Stebbing’s work: from the mid 1930s onwards she becomes more concerned with what would now be described as critical thinking.

3. Cambridge Analysis

By her own account, Stebbing was “converted” to analytic philosophy when she encountered G. E. Moore for the first time at a meeting in London:

In 1917 I read a paper to the Aristotelian Society [entitled “Relation and Coherence”], perhaps one of the most muddled papers that have ever been presented to that assembly. … At the outset of the discussion … a man whom I had never seen and took to be quite young, began to ask me questions with a vehement insistence that considerably alarmed me. “What ON EARTH do you mean by that?” he exclaimed again and again, thumping the table as he said “on earth” in a manner that clearly shewed he believed there was no earthly meaning in what I had said. Soon, however, my alarm faded; the vehement philosopher had made me forget not to be a philosopher—nothing mattered except trying to find out what I did mean. In spite of my stumbling replies he managed to elicit the reasons why I had been led to the views I was trying to defend; he shewed me the baselessness of many of my reasons, he unravelled the muddles and enabled me to see more clearly the grain of sense that had been at the back of my inept criticisms. That was my first meeting with Moore, whose name I discovered only towards the end of the discussion. I am inclined to think that this meeting of the Aristotelian Society was somewhat peculiar in the annals of the Society, for the reader of a paper was, before the end of the discussion, convinced that her main contentions were entirely wrong. One does not expect a philosophical society’s meeting to end in a conversion, yet such was the result in my case, owing mainly to the vehement and vigorous clarity of Moore and his patience in pursuing the question to its end … (1942: 530)

Stebbing kept in touch with Moore for the rest of her life, corresponding and meeting regularly in Cambridge. Chapter IX of A Modern Introduction to Logic, for example, was revised for the second edition in the light of criticisms she received from Moore, as she notes in its preface (1933b: vii).

One fundamental idea that Stebbing took over from Moore was the distinction between understanding a proposition and knowing its analysis. Moore had appealed to this distinction in arguing in “A Defence of Common Sense” (1925), for example, that one can know, with certainty, that various “common sense” propositions, such as that one exists, has a body, is a human being, and so on, are true even if one cannot give the analysis of them. All that is necessary to know that these propositions are true is to understand them (understand their meaning, as Moore put it). Indeed, Moore argued, one could not even raise the question of its correct analysis (or judge the correctness of any analysis that was offered) if one did not understand the proposition in the first place. This distinction is also fundamental to Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, though whether it was Wittgenstein who influenced Moore or Moore (in earlier thinking) who influenced Wittgenstein cannot be discussed here. Whatever their mutual influence, however, the distinction became central to the conception of analysis that was characteristic of what came to be known as the Cambridge School of Analysis, whose members included John Wisdom and Austin Duncan-Jones as well as Moore and Stebbing. It also included, or at least was influenced by the ideas of, Bertrand Russell, Frank P. Ramsey and C. D. Broad. (For further details, see Baldwin 2013.)

In 1932 Stebbing read another paper to the Aristotelian Society entitled “The Method of Analysis in Metaphysics”, in which she sought to spell out and justify the presuppositions of the conception of analysis of the Cambridge School. She identifies three main assumptions, which she formulates as follows (1932: 85):

  • (1) If p [standing for any proposition] is to be analysed, then p must be understood. It follows that there is at least one expression which unambiguously expresses p.
  • (2) If p is to be analysed, then it is not always the case that p is known to be false, and it is sometimes the case that p is known to be true.
  • (3) Directional analysis is possible.

The first, which she characterizes as logical, she defends by appealing to Moore’s distinction between understanding a proposition and knowing its analysis, making explicit the presupposition that if one can understand a proposition, then there must be some unambiguous formulation of it. The second, which she describes as metaphysical (though it is also epistemological), expresses the further—Moorean—assumption that any process of analysis must take it as granted that the proposition we are seeking to analyse can be known to be true. Stebbing here merely states that the assumption is plausible and that she has no reasons to reject it (1932: 92).

The third assumption gives her the most difficulty, however. She divides it into a number of more specific presuppositions, but what is crucial is the assumption that analysis must be “directed” towards, i.e., end in, what she calls “basic facts”—absolutely simple or atomic facts. Just such an assumption was made in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus as well as in Russell’s form of logical atomism, for example. But once Stebbing has made explicit all these presuppositions, she comes to the conclusion that not only are they unjustified but they are not even very plausible (1932: 86–7).

To illustrate the conception of metaphysical analysis that Stebbing is seeking to articulate, let us consider one of Stebbing’s examples:

  • (1) Every economist is fallible.

Let us suppose that we need to give some unambiguous formulation of this. Here is one possibility:

  • (2) For all x, if x is an economist, then x is fallible.

We can see this as providing a logical analysis of (1). It could be readily formalized in the predicate calculus as

\[ (\forall x) (Ex \rightarrow Fx) \]

But what is its metaphysical analysis? One suggestion might be that the analysis of (1) ends in a conjunction of propositions expressing the specific facts about the fallibility of each economist:

  • (3) Karl Marx is fallible and John Maynard Keynes is fallible and Muhammad Yunus is fallible and …

It seems clear that we can understand (1) without knowing the suggested analysis expressed in (3), so to this extent the Moorean distinction seems justified. To understand (3), taken as elliptical for the full conjunction, I would need to know the names of all the economists, and this is something that very few—if any—of us know. But if this is right, then can we really say that (3) analyses the “meaning” of (1), which is how Moore seemed to want to put it? Does (1) have the same “meaning” as (3)? Even if we take (1) as an abbreviation of the (full) conjunction expressed in (3), would we not at the very least have to add at the end “and that is all the economists there are”? And how should this last clause be analysed? What kind of fact does that express? In any case, can “facts” such as that Keynes is fallible, etc., be regarded as “basic”? Can they not be analysed further? (3) was only offered as one suggestion, natural as it might have seemed. Are there not other possible analyses, taking a rather different form? Might the truth (if such it is) of (1) not be grounded, instead, in facts about the nature of being an economist—that economists have to idealize situations and hence are bound to get some things wrong, for example?

There is room for argument, then, as to what the “metaphysical” analysis of a proposition such as (1) is; and in the early 1930s members of the Cambridge School did indeed debate the issue of the analysis of a whole range of types of proposition in great detail. Stebbing was at the centre of this debate. A distinction came to be drawn between logical and metaphysical analysis in just the way we have outlined: logical analysis was intended to give an “unambiguous” formulation and metaphysical analysis was intended to uncover the “basic facts” on which the meaning or truth of the proposition to be analysed was grounded. Logical analysis was alternatively described as “same-level” analysis and metaphysical analysis as “new-level” or “reductive” or “directional” analysis.

Once this distinction is drawn, it becomes possible to reject metaphysical analysis without rejecting analysis altogether. We can allow logical analysis to provide us with “unambiguous”—or at least clearer—formulations of the proposition we want to analyse. This may be sufficient to elucidate its logical form or to remove certain confusions to which it may give rise. This is what Max Black (1933), for example, advocated in a reply to Stebbing that he also read to the Aristotelian Society a few months later (see Beaney 2003). We can also allow “partial” metaphysical analyses. We might “reduce” propositions about the decisions of committees, for example, to propositions about the activities of its constituent members, which may be enough to explain the decisions that were made without having to further analyse what it is to be a member of a committee or indeed what it is to be a person (rational or otherwise). The correctness or usefulness of an analysis is relative to our purposes in seeking it. This purpose-relative approach to analysis was the one that Stebbing herself came to adopt. (For more on the debates about analysis in the 1930s, see Baldwin 2013; Beaney 2003, 2016.)

4. Logical Positivism

Stebbing played a major role in introducing logical positivism into Britain. She first met Moritz Schlick in Oxford in 1930 when they spoke in a panel together at the Seventh International Congress of Philosophy, and Schlick came to England again in 1932 to lecture at King’s College London. In 1934 she invited Rudolf Carnap to give a series of three lectures (later published as Philosophy and Logical Syntax) in London, where Carnap met Russell and A. J. Ayer for the first time. She was on the organization committee for the International Congress for the Unity of Science, which was held in Paris in 1935 and in Cambridge in 1938.

What Stebbing found attractive in logical positivism was its respect for science and the value it placed on logic. What she rejected was its repudiation of metaphysics. (She endorsed the “logical” and “empiricism” but not the “positivism”, in other words, of the movement for which both “logical empiricism” and “logical positivism” are used as names, more or less interchangeably.) We can see her 1932 paper, “The Method of Analysis in Metaphysics”, as seeking to defend the conception of metaphysical analysis of the Cambridge School in response to the logical positivists’ critique of metaphysics. But it is in a paper she read to the British Academy in March 1933, “Logical Positivism and Analysis”, that she attempts to engage directly with logical positivism and say what she finds objectionable about it. She takes “logical positivism” to include the views of Wittgenstein, as filtered through the reports and writings of various members of the Vienna Circle such as Schlick, Carnap, and Friedrich Waismann. Focusing especially on Carnap, she criticizes his conception of “logically constructed systems” (as found in his Aufbau of 1928, for example) for being too abstract. However useful such a system may be in showing what can be constructed with the fewest possible assumptions and primitive terms, she argues, the world itself is not such a system. She also attacks Carnap’s “methodological solipsism” on what she calls “the best of grounds … namely, that I know it to be false” (1933a: 77).

Stebbing’s assertion of what she knows is hardly likely to be seen by anyone other than a committed Moorean as a knockdown argument against any form of solipsism. She goes on to accuse Wittgenstein, and the logical positivists who were influenced by him, of confusing “direct experience” and “content”, but no evidence is offered for saddling Wittgenstein with the views she claims he had. However, in the last quarter of the paper, she makes clear that what is really at issue, in her view, is a conflict between two different conceptions of analysis, which she calls “directional analysis” and “postulational analysis”. Directional analysis is the form of analysis that she had attempted to defend in her 1932 paper. Postulational analysis is what is used “in the construction of a deductive system” (1933a: 80). Axioms are stipulated and everything else in the system is derived by the rules of inference.

What Stebbing means by a constructed system here is a system that is postulated as a replacement for a conceptual system used in our everyday life—in the way that set theory might be seen as postulating a replacement for our ordinary system of arithmetic. On this view, our everyday concepts and propositions are vague and need to be replaced—or “explicated”, to use Carnap’s later term—by precisely defined concepts, clearly stated axioms and logically derived propositions. Stebbing’s fundamental objection to this conception of postulational or explicatory analysis is that it misunderstands the role of analysis, which is “to understand something more clearly” (1933a: 81). Simply replacing our ordinary vague concepts by precise ones does not genuinely show what it was we understood. Consider, for example, the “replacement” of our ordinary concepts of colour by concepts scientifically defined in terms of the wavelengths of light, etc. Arguably, this can never do justice to what it is we experience when we see colours and describe them in the ordinary ways we do: it does not capture the phenomenology of our experience. In the same way, we might question whether defining numbers as sets genuinely shows what we “really mean” by number terms.

According to Stebbing, the logical positivists—and she specifically mentions Schlick in this regard—put “the pursuit of meaning” before the determination of the truth-value of propositions (1933a: 83). But this gets things precisely the wrong way around, on Stebbing’s Moorean view: we begin with propositions that we understand (in some sense) and can know to be true, and in seeking an analysis of these propositions, we aim to clarify that understanding by identifying the facts that make them true or false. This is precisely the conception of analysis that she had attempted to articulate and defend in her 1932 paper. On the explicatory conception (as Stebbing seems to construe it), on the other hand, we postulate something with a meaning that is intended to be clear once and for all, with the aim of thereby guiding or constraining our subsequent determinations of the truth-value of the relevant propositions.

At the very end of her lecture, in explaining how she disagrees with the “linguistic” approach of Wittgenstein and the logical positivists, Stebbing summarises her view as follows:

What we ordinarily say, we say unclearly. We speak unclearly because we think unclearly. It is the task of philosophy to render our thoughts clear. … We cannot clarify our thoughts by thinking about thinking, nor by thinking about logic. We have to think about what we were thinking about. The philosopher considers a given expression, and analyses it in order to find another expression which says more clearly what the original expression said less clearly. This investigation is not linguistic. We must first know what facts are the case before we can fruitfully employ analysis for the purpose of clarifying our thoughts about the world. Accordingly, Logical Positivism fails, I think, in so far as it attempts to start from a priori assumptions with regard to the nature of language and the principles of symbolism, and, by means of these, to draw limits with regard to what we can think. Their mistake is that they seek to make everything clear at once. But it is not in this way that philosophy can develop. We must proceed step by step, beginning with propositions which we know to be true, not ruling out initially what does not fit in. (1933a: 86)

What emerges from the two papers that Stebbing wrote on analysis in 1932 and 1933? As she admitted herself, some of her arguments might well seem unconvincing or inconclusive. On the one hand, she confesses that she can find no justification for the presuppositions of directional analysis, her favoured form of analysis, at least as far as the commitment to “basic facts” is concerned. On the other hand, her objection to postulational analysis seems to amount, at times, to no more than the charge that it is not directional analysis. (For a fuller account of her critique of logical positivism, see Beaney 2016.) In attempting to clarify both directional analysis and postulational analysis, and to defend the former and criticise the latter, however, she helped sharpen the issues in dispute between the Cambridge School and logical positivism. Furthermore, by encouraging dialogue between the two, in both her writings and her organizational activities, she also helped foster that critical engagement between the “ordinary language” and “ideal language” wings of analytic philosophy, as they later came to be called, which has continued to this day. In short, what she promoted, above all, was critical reflection on the nature of analysis and hence of the essential characteristics of the two main schools of thought that were to come together under the heading of “analytic philosophy”.

5. Politics and Critical Thinking

During the mid 1930s, Stebbing engaged increasingly with a general or even popular, as opposed to an exclusively philosophical or academic, audience. This development in her work was driven by her belief that the structures and principles of formal logic need not be seen as a closed, isolated system, but rather could profitably be applied to the problems and issues of modern life. This was coupled with a commitment to the practical analysis of the texts in which these problems were presented and discussed, in order to identify any illogical, flawed or misleading thinking. In Logic in Practice (1934) she had already aimed at a more general readership, including more overt political commentary than in A Modern Introduction to Logic, offering examples drawn from political speeches and newspaper reports to demonstrate examples of muddled argument and biased description. In Philosophy and the Physicists (1937), her focus was on the language used by scientists to explain their ideas—particularly by scientists who proposed to present these ideas in a way that was palatable, and indeed entertaining, to a popular audience. Stebbing worried that imprecise, impressionistic or sensational uses of language obscured the nature of recent scientific advances and, worse still, encouraged unjustified inferences and beliefs to be drawn from them.

One of Stebbing’s main targets was Sir Arthur Eddington, a then prominent public figure whose photographs of the eclipse in 1919 had helped to confirm Einstein’s theory of relativity. Eddington liked to grip his readers’ attention and their imagination by requiring them to consider everyday experiences in the light of scientific discoveries. In this passage from his popular book The Nature of the Physical World (1935), he is concerned with the atomic theory of matter:

I am standing on the threshold about to enter a room. It is a complicated business. In the first place I must shove against an atmosphere pressing with a force of fourteen pounds on every square inch of my body. I must make sure of landing on a plank traveling at twenty miles a second round the sun—a fraction of a second too early or too late, the plank would be miles away. I must do this whilst hanging from a round planet head outward into space, and with a wind of aether blowing at no one knows how many miles a second through every interstice of my body. The plank has no solidity of substance. To step on it is like stepping on a swarm of flies. Shall I not slip through? No, if I make the venture one of the flies hits me and gives a boost up again; I fall again and am knocked upwards by another fly; and so on. I may hope that the net result will be that I remain about steady; but if unfortunately I should slip through the floor or be boosted too violently up to the ceiling, the occurrence would be, not a violation of the laws of Nature, but a rare coincidence. (1935: 328)

Stebbing disliked this way of explaining physics, because of the casual misuse it made of everyday language, and also because of the much larger implications Eddington encouraged his reader to draw from it. In Philosophy and the Physicists she drew attention to these issues. She argued, for instance, that it simply made no sense to say “the plank has no solidity of substance”. The word “solid” just means having properties such as those of a plank. Whatever developments in physics may indicate, a plank with no solidity is simply a nonsense, or a contradiction. Science must find other language in which to express these findings, since using everyday language to do so will only mislead and confuse. In fact, although Eddington ignored or even concealed this fact, scientists had found it necessary to develop new and highly formal systems for expressing their findings, since they were describing a very different type of reality from that of everyday experience. Eddington’s persistent use of everyday language to describe scientific knowledge was designed to have an emotional rather than an informative impact on his readership. Here is Stebbing’s own version of the business of walking into a room:

I enter my study and see the blue curtains fluttering in the breeze, for the windows are open. I notice a bowl of roses on the table; it was not there when I went out. Clumsily I stumble against the table, bruising my leg against its hard edge; it is a heavy table and scarcely moves under the impact of my weight. I take a rose from the bowl, press it to my face, feel the softness of the petals, and smell its characteristic scent. I rejoice in the beauty of the graded shading of the crimson petals. In short—I am in a familiar room, seeing, touching, smelling, familiar things, thinking familiar thoughts, experiencing familiar emotions. (1937: 45)

Stebbing’s point is that ordinary language very adequately and indeed very accurately describes everyday experience. That description does not coincide with the scientific understanding of matter, and nor should it; for that a different type of language is necessary. The danger was that once Eddington had got his readership thinking about the scientific conception of matter in relation to everyday language, he was able to manipulate their understanding of the possible consequences of recent scientific developments for our understanding of other areas of human experience, including the spiritual and even the religious. Eddington argued that the behaviour of material objects was now shown to be random and unpredictable, rather than controlled by determinate laws of physics. Our understanding of the world around us as relatively stable and ordered was imposed on reality by our own perceptions. This is turn opened up the possibility of the scientific viability of other types of truth or reality, including the mental, the spiritual and, for Eddington, the divine.

If Philosophy and the Physicists was written to guard its readership against imprecise or misleading use of language by scientists, Stebbing’s next major publication had an even more earnest and urgent purpose. Thinking to Some Purpose was published in 1939. It was a direct result of the increasing pressure on Stebbing to become a more prominent commentator on current affairs and to contribute to public intellectual debate; the BBC commissioned a series of talks from Stebbing which she was unable to deliver because of ill health but which she published instead in the newly established Penguin series of “original non-fiction books on contemporary issues”. Although Stebbing was reluctant to play a prominent public role, she was committed to the necessity of academics contributing to the discussion of crucial social and political issues. Thinking to Some Purpose was written before the beginning of the Second World War, but it was produced at a time when Stebbing, like many others, was well aware of the gravity of the national and international situation, and of what was at stake. She was convinced that it was imperative that the electorate, now universally franchised and generally literate, should be equipped to deal with the type of rhetoric that was being directed at them:

the citizens must be able to think relevantly, that is, to think to some purpose. Thus to think is difficult. Accordingly, it is not surprising, however saddening it may be, that many of our statesmen do not trust the citizens to think, but rely instead upon the arts of persuasion. (1939: 14)

The book is full of analyses of actual uses of language by those trying to persuade others to take a particular course of action: advertisers, journalists, clergymen and, particularly, politicians. Stebbing urged readers to hone their critical skills in order to identify uses of language that introduce assumptions rather than make direct statements, or that hide parts of an argument that in logic would need to be made explicit. A repeated target is Sir Stanley Baldwin, several times Conservative Prime Minister. For instance, Stebbing quoted the following extract from a speech he gave while campaigning on behalf of the National Government in the 1931 General Election. Baldwin’s task was to explain how it would be possible for Liberals and Conservative to work together in Government.

There must undoubtedly be some difficulty over the question of tariffs. Liberals would approach the problem with a Free Trade bias but with an open mind to examine and decide whether there were measures of dealing with the problem apart from tariffs. Conservatives would start with an open mind but with a favour for tariffs. They would start with an open mind to examine alternative methods, and the Cabinet as a whole would sit down with perfect honesty and sincerity to come to a decision on that matter. (quoted by Stebbing 1939: 66)

Stebbing focussed on some of Baldwin’s specific lexical choices:

You will notice that Baldwin speaks of a Liberal bias for Free Trade and of a Conservative favour for tariffs. The word “bias” carries with it an emotional significance of having prejudged the matter in a way that could hardly be regarded as consistent with having an “open mind”. The word “favour” does not, I think, have this significance. (1939: 66–7)

In numerous other examples in Thinking to Some Purpose, Stebbing drew attention to the ways in which speakers and writers can potentially have a strong influence on the beliefs and actions of their audiences, not just through what they literally say but through how their choice of words introduces ideological assumptions or disguises necessary steps in an argument.

6. Last Work and Legacy

Soon after the outbreak of war, Stebbing moved to Cambridge as part of the general evacuation of Bedford College. During her last years, her work became increasingly socially and politically engaged, although she herself continued to shun public recognition or any suggestion of personal political activism. In Ideals and Illusions (1941) she urged the importance in all main spheres of life of identifying and pursuing specific ideals, and distinguishing these from potentially comforting but misleading illusions. She targeted a number of what she saw as such dangerous illusions, including both political and religious illusions, such as in cases where religion was used to condone or excuse social inequality or injustice. Stebbing struggled against ill health to finish A Modern Elementary Logic (1943), a textbook on logic that was aimed particularly at students who were starting out in their philosophical studies, perhaps without the benefit of philosophical instruction, as would be the case with those serving in the military. Her final philosophical contribution was Men and Moral Principles, delivered as a London School of Economics Hobhouse Memorial Lecture a few months before she died and published posthumously as a pamphlet in 1944. Stebbing defended the validity of moral discussion and the reality of moral principles, based on humanistic rather than religious credentials. She argued that moral judgments needed to be considered in their full context and on an individual basis. Her approach allowed for complete sets of ideals to be evaluated and compared in relation to complex real-life situations, but prompted some later criticism that it left her without an intellectual basis for her own condemnation of a number of political systems, including Fascism.

Stebbing’s obituaries focused largely on her logical and analytical work. This work is indeed still worth celebrating in its own right and on its own terms, particularly in her bringing together traditional and modern logic and in her accounts of the key ideas and doctrines of the Cambridge School of Analysis. Her role as an early British interpreter and critic of logical positivism and the dialogue she promoted between the two main branches of analytic philosophy are also extremely significant.

Subsequent developments in how language has been studied and discussed in both philosophy and linguistics, however, suggest other ways of evaluating Stebbing’s legacy and her significance. She combined her commitment to formal logic with a belief in the importance of practical analysis of everyday texts and as a result in the necessity of public engagement by philosophers, in a manner which was at the time rare in academia. She saw no discrepancy between the rigours of logical argument and the requirements of practical problem solving, and stressed the need for clarity and transparency in language use. In this, she championed the importance to philosophers of paying attention to ordinary language and the varieties of its everyday use somewhat in advance of the rise of “ordinary language philosophy” in Oxford after the Second World War.

In some ways, Stebbing went even further than the most committed philosophers of ordinary language such as Ryle, Austin and Strawson. She did not just argue that philosophers should pay attention to ordinary language; she illustrated her philosophical writings with a wealth of real life examples taken from everyday communicative interactions, including newspaper editorials, political speeches and advertising copy. Mary Warnock comments that Stebbing’s “determination to find in language both the source and sometimes the solution of traditional philosophical puzzles” was central to later developments in ordinary language philosophy, and highlights Stebbing’s early “understanding of the philosophical significance of this approach, which can properly be described as revolutionary” (1996: 93). Stebbing’s work was recognized at the time in this respect. Urmson (1953), in particular, praised her assault on Eddington for its insistence on attending to how people ordinarily use language; “solid” is used to describe properties such as those displayed by a plank of wood, so to describe a plank as having no solidity is simply nonsensical.

Further developments in the study of language, more recent in origin and associated with the discipline of linguistics rather than that of philosophy, have some striking resonances with Stebbing’s later writings, and suggest a modern re-evaluation of her contribution. Stebbing became increasingly interested not just in the significance and potentialities of everyday language but also in the social and ideological implications of how it is used in society, particularly by those in authority. A number of branches of recent and present linguistics share this commitment to studying language in context. Pragmatics, which can trace a direct descent from ordinary language philosophy through figures such as Austin and Grice, considers meaning in relation to the intentions, functions and contexts associated with the use of linguistic forms. Sociolinguistics is concerned with social influences on the use of language and with the effects of language use on society.

Perhaps the strongest affinities between Stebbing’s work and current linguistics are in the area of Critical Discourse Analysis (CDA). CDA emerged as an identifiable branch of linguistics during the final decades of the twentieth century. Its focus is on the close analysis of actual language use to reveal how specific choices made by speakers and writers can introduce ideological assumptions into texts, often assumptions that are concealed beneath the surface message of the text. Some of the methodological commitments and objectives of CDA are remarkably similar to the things that Stebbing was saying about language half a century or more earlier. For instance, CDA most commonly engages with examples of language use sourced from contemporary newspaper articles, advertisements and political speeches. It also has a specific agenda in terms of its intended effect, reminiscent of Stebbing’s mission to educated her readership as informed and responsible consumers and voters:

CDA aims to make its users aware of, and able to describe and deconstruct, vectors and effects in texts and semiotic materials generally which might otherwise remain to wield power uncritiqued. In these respects CDA may be a kind of wake-up call, or consciousness-raising, about the coercive or anti-democratizing effects of the discourses we live by (Toolan 2002: xxii).

7. Conclusion

Stebbing played a major role in the development of analytic philosophy in the 1930s, writing what was in effect the first textbook of analytic philosophy, A Modern Introduction to Logic (1930). Although she was a leading member of the Cambridge School of Analysis, with Moore the strongest influence upon her, she also sought to engage with logical positivism and thereby helped to bring the two together into the wider movement that we now know as analytic philosophy. In her later writings she sought to show the relevance of her logical and analytic work to everyday thinking and to social and political debate. Philosophy and the Physicists (1937) and Thinking to Some Purpose (1939), her two most important books addressed to a more general audience, can also be regarded as among the first books of critical thinking, anticipating developments in sociolinguistics, pragmatics and critical discourse analysis. Both her governing idea of “purposive thinking” and the emphasis she placed on clarity of thought and expression were manifested in all her writing, which was also characterized—as indeed, were her teaching and organizational activities—by an exceptional degree of intellectual honesty and moral integrity.


Primary Sources: Works by Stebbing

  • 1914, Pragmatism and French Voluntarism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1930, A Modern Introduction to Logic, London: Methuen.
  • 1932, “The Method of Analysis in Metaphysics”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 33: 65–94. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/33.1.65
  • 1933a, “Logical Positivism and Analysis”, Proceedings of the British Academy, pp. 53–87.
  • 1933b, A Modern Introduction to Logic, London: Methuen, 2nd edition.
  • 1934a, Logic in Practice, London: Methuen.
  • 1934b, “Analysis and Philosophy”, The Philosopher, XII: 149–155.
  • 1934c, “Constructions”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 34: 1–30. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/34.1.1
  • 1936, “Thinking”, in C. Day Lewis and L. Susan Stebbing, Imagination and Thinking, London: British Institute of Adult Education, pp. 14–29.
  • 1937, Philosophy and the Physicists, London: Methuen.
  • 1939, Thinking to Some Purpose, Harmondsworth: Penguin; reprinted 1959.
  • 1941, Ideals and Illusions, London: Watts and Co.
  • 1943, A Modern Elementary Logic, London: Methuen; reprinted 1961, London: Barnes and Noble.
  • 1944, Men and Moral Principles, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Secondary Sources

  • Aristotelian Society, 1948, Philosophical Studies: Essays in Memory of L. Susan Stebbing, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Baldwin, Thomas, 2013, “G. E. Moore and the Cambridge School of Analysis”, in Michael Beaney (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophyy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 430–50. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199238842.013.0010
  • Beaney, Michael, 2003, “Susan Stebbing on Cambridge and Vienna Analysis”, in Stadler 2003: 339–50. doi:10.1007/0-306-48214-2_27
  • –––, 2006, “Stebbing, Lizzie Susan (1885–1943)”, in A.C. Grayling, Andrew Pyle and Naomi Goulder (eds.), The Continuum Encyclopedia of British Philosophy, 4 vols. London: Thoemmes Continuum, IV, pp. 3023–8.
  • –––, 2016, “Susan Stebbing and the Early Reception of Logical Empiricism in Britain”, in Christian Damböck (ed.), Influences on the Aufbau (Vienna Circle Institute Yearbook 18), Switzerland: Springer, pp. 233–56. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-21876-2_12
  • Black, Max, 1933, “Philosophical Analysis”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 33: 237–58. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/33.1.237
  • Chapman, Siobhan, 2013, Susan Stebbing and the Language of Common Sense, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Eddington, Arthur, 1935, The Nature of the Physical World, London: J. M. Dent and Sons.
  • Janssen-Lauret, Frederique, 2017, “Susan Stebbing, Incomplete Symbols, and Foundherentist Meta-ontology”, Journal for the History of Analytical Philosophy, 5(2), URL = <>.
  • Milkov, Nikolay, 2003, “Susan Stebbing’s Criticism of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus”, in Stadler 2003: 351–363. doi:10.1007/0-306-48214-2_28
  • Moore, G. E., 1925, “A Defence of Common Sense”, in J. H. Muirhead (ed.), Contemporary British Philosophy: Personal Statements (Second Series), London: George Allen & Unwin, pp. 193–223.
  • Stadler, Friedrich (ed.), 2003, The Vienna Circle and Logical Empiricism (Vienna Circle Institute Yearbook 10), Netherlands: Springer.
  • Toolan, Michael, 2002, “General Introduction”, in Michael Toolan (ed.), Critical Discourse Analysis, London: Routledge, pp. xxi–xxvi.
  • Urmson, J. O., 1953, “Some Questions Concerning Validity”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 7: 217–29; reprinted in Antony Flew (ed.) 1956, Essays in Conceptual Analysis, London: Macmillan, pp. 120–133.
  • Warnock, Mary (ed.), 1996, Women Philosophers, London: Everyman.
  • –––, 2004, “Stebbing, (Lizzie) Susan (1885–1943)”, Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/ref:odnb/36259

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