Port Royal Logic

First published Tue Jul 22, 2014; substantive revision Thu May 12, 2022

La Logique ou l’art de penser (Logic, or the Art of Thinking) is better known as the Port-Royal Logic (hereinafter Logic). It was one of the most influential pieces of philosophy written in the early modern period. This influence took two main forms. It was in many ways the most widely read text in formal logic from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century. It emphasized general principles of careful thinking over the memorization of complicated formal rules found in traditional texts. The result is a relatively compact work written in vernacular instead of the imposing Latin tomes otherwise available. Its readability is enhanced by long digressions devoted to moralizing and to recent advances in scientific understanding. As a result serious readers, “can read and understand in seven or eight days”, or so the authors claim (Logic, 13). It also served as a kind of handbook of some basic aspects of Cartesian and post-Cartesian science and philosophy.

The authors were Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, philosophers and theologians associated with the Port-Royal Abbey, a center of the heretical Catholic Jansenist movement in seventeenth-century France. The first edition appeared in 1662; during the authors’ lifetimes four major revisions were published, the last and most important in 1683. The 1981 critical edition by Pierre Clair and François Girbal lists 63 French editions and 10 English editions (the 1818 English edition served as a text at the Universities of Cambridge and Oxford). The work treats topics in what are now regarded as the theory of knowledge, metaphysics, philosophy of language, grammar, philosophical logic, and both formal and informal logic. The Logic is a companion to General and Rational Grammar: The Port-Royal Grammar, written primarily by Arnauld and “edited” by Claude Lancelot, which had previously appeared in 1660.

Section 1 of this article briefly explains Arnauld’s connection to the Port-Royal Abbey and the Jansenist movement. This is important background for understanding the outlook Logic adopts toward its subject matter. For the same reason, general aspects of the Logic’s relationship of Cartesian philosophy are reviewed in Section 2. An overview of the work’s four part structure follows in Section 3. Each part of the book is then covered in turn.

In this article, references to the Logic are given by the Part, Chapter, and page number in Buroker’s 1996 English translation listed in the Bibliography.

1. Antoine Arnauld, Jansenism, and the Port-Royal Abbey

Antoine Arnauld, the primary author of the Logic, was born in Paris, on 8 February 1612, to Antoine and Catherine Arnauld. His father was one of the most famous lawyers of his time. The son Antoine, the youngest of their 20 children, originally wanted to study law, but because his father had died in 1619, he decided to honor his mother’s wish that he study theology. He entered the Sorbonne, becoming a disciple of Lescot, the confessor of Cardinal Richelieu. In addition to the Port-Royal Grammar and the Logic, Arnauld is best known as the author of the Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. He also engaged in lengthy correspondence with Leibniz, carried on a polemic against Malebranche in the Treatise on True and False Ideas, and wrote several theological essays, including The Perpetuity of the Faith. Pierre Nicole, the secondary author, was born at Chartres in 1625. His father was also a prominent lawyer, with ties to literary circles in Paris. Nicole studied theology at the Sorbonne, where he came into contact with teachers inclined towards Jansenism. When Jansenism came under attack at the Sorbonne, he withdrew and went to the abbey at Port-Royal-des-Champs. He eventually became one of the most prominent Jansenist writers of the seventeenth century; his Moral Essays (1671–7) was at that time his most famous work.

Jansenism was a radical reform movement within French Catholicism based on Augustine’s views of the relation between free will and the efficacy of grace. The movement was named after Cornelis Jansen (or Cornelius Jansenius), a Dutch theologian born in 1585 who studied at the Sorbonne. He became the Bishop of Ypres in the Spanish Netherlands in 1636 and died two years later. His major work Augustinus was published posthumously in 1640. A second figure in Jansenism was the Abbot of Saint-Cyran, born Jean Duvergier de Hauranne in 1581. He received his M.A. in theology at the Sorbonne in 1600, where he met Jansen. The two worked together from 1611–1617 on scriptural questions. The issues bringing Jansenism into conflict with Catholic orthodoxy concerned the efficacy of grace, the role of free will in salvation, and the nature of penitence. The attack on Jansen began with Isaac Habert’s sermons and writings during 1643–44. By 1653 Pope Innocent X issued an encyclical, Cum occasione, declaring five propositions in Augustinus to be heretical. They expressed the views that a just person who wishes to obey God’s commandments cannot do so without the necessary grace to carry them out; that in the state of corrupt nature one can never resist interior grace; and that meritorious actions require only a liberty exempt from constraint rather than one exempt from necessity.

Although he did not agree with all of Jansen’s views on grace and free will, Arnauld devoted several major works to defending aspects of Jansenism, including On Frequent Communion, the Defense of Monsieur Jansenius and a Second Defense. These writings resulted in a trial and his expulsion from the Sorbonne in 1656. In 1661 the Council of State decreed that all churchmen must sign a formulary drawn up in 1657, condemning the heretical propositions in Jansen’s work Augustinus. Arnauld and Nicole had taken the position that the propositions were heretical but did not appear in the Augustinus. From 1669 to the late 1670s there was a truce between the Catholic Church and the Jansenists. But in 1679, after attacks had resumed, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands; he died at Brussels on 8 August 1694. Nicole had joined Arnauld in exile, but he returned to Paris in 1683 where he reconciled with the authorities. He died in Paris in 1695.

2. The Cartesian Background

Although Augustine shaped the theology of Jansenism, René Descartes’ influence predominates in the philosophical aspects of the Logic. Arnauld’s insightful and respectful set of “Objections” to Descartes’ Meditations along with Descartes’ “Replies” were first published in 1641 (see Descartes 1984 for English translation, abbreviated CSM). This exchange confirmed Arnauld in his belief that Descartes’ system of philosophy was very well suited to furthering his own version of the Port-Royal theological program. He was impressed by Descartes’ frequent insistence that natural science, metaphysical speculation, and even mathematics and logic were to be subordinated to ethical and religious ends (Lachterman 1989, Jones 2006). Especially important was Descartes’ project of demonstrating that the foundations of natural science are compatible with, and in fact depend on God. The dualism of mental and corporeal created substances made it possible to conceive the natural world mechanically without recourse to any of the additional quasi-spiritual entities posited by Aristotelians. Geometrically construed matter requires only God’s creative activity to be the subject matter of Cartesian physics. The Logic’s introductory “First Discourse” announces the intention to choose examples throughout the book that promote both correct religious morality and the best (i.e., Cartesian) science. Examples of how reason favors Cartesian science over its competitors are accordingly sprinkled throughout the Logic.

The resources of Cartesian philosophy for repudiating skepticism also appealed to Arnauld. Cartesian knowledge is grounded in clear and distinct perceptions of reason alone. Truths delivered by reason alone cannot be doubted unless they are not clear and distinct and thus “confused” in Descartes’ terminology. For Descartes and Arnauld this means that skeptical denials of fundamental truths are merely verbal (Logic, First Discourse 7; also see Lennon 2008: 62–77). The soul surrenders to the truth whenever it is strongly penetrated by it just as eyes see whenever they are open and struck by sunlight (Logic, First Discourse, 8). For example, one who affirms that “It is doubtful that God exists” must fail to clearly and distinctly perceive God. The Logic sets itself against Montaigne and Pyrrhonian skepticism in particular, but also takes frequent opportunities to undercut skeptical threats from materialism and irreligion. Elsewhere, Arnauld wanted to emphasize along with Descartes himself that the latter’s “method of doubt” as presented in the Meditations “should be studied only by very intelligent and well-educated readers” (Replies to fourth set of objections [CSM II, 172]). This restriction was meant to avoid encouraging the very doubts that Descartes introduces as part of the specialized method for attaining certain knowledge.

Even more important for the Logic is Descartes’ attitude toward formal logic. In his early, incomplete Rules for the Direction of the Native Intellect (c. 1628) and the well-known Discourse on Method (1637), Descartes eschewed traditional logic in favor of techniques for acquiring knowledge in the first place. Syllogisms rarely accomplish that; they serve instead as a means of presenting what is already known. His view of deductive inference was accordingly based on his theory of the mind’s perceptions. From our contemporary perspective, it could be said that Descartes’ philosophical system replaced formal logic with epistemology and the philosophy of mind. The Logic does devote considerable space to a treatment of formal techniques, but the reader is repeatedly reminded that this is of secondary importance. The full title of the book is Logic, or the Art of Thinking, not the art of reasoning or the art of inferring. The book also contains a wealth of examples meant to illustrate moral and religious norms and

…almost as much metaphysics as one ought to know, although we do not claim not to have borrowed from anyone. (Logic, First Discourse, 12)

Because the Logic’s digressions into the non-logical territories of natural science and religion are often lengthy, they influence the character of the book. The authors claim that these features add to the book’s readability and that they are concrete applications of its general lessons to present knowledge about actual things.

3. Overview of the Structure of the Port-Royal Logic

The text of the Logic is organized around the four mental operations important to the “art of thinking”: conceiving ideas, affirming and denying propositions (judging), affirming and denying propositions on the basis of other propositions (reasoning, i.e., inferring), and ordering results of good reasoning. Logic is the sequential application of these operations. Conceiving ideas is the “first action” of the mind, propositions are formed from ideas, and reasoning involves propositions. Ordering these products of thought constitutes method. This organization reflects the point that logic is taken to be primarily a science of the activity of thinking in the pursuit of knowledge. This framework for understanding logic is now regarded as “psychologistic” in opposition to both earlier and post-Fregean approaches that focus on methods for dealing with formal aspects of reasoning.

Introductory material to the final (1683) edition includes a Preface (added 1683), a Foreword and First Discourse (1662), and a Second Discourse (added 1664). The First Discourse lays out the plan of the Logic, explaining that its main purpose is to educate judgment to make it more precise. This is seen as instrumental for making the speculative sciences more useful. Thus the Logic contains not only a treatment of correct reasoning, but also examples of how reasoning can go wrong. The Second Discourse offers a reply to objections made to the first edition. The main point is to justify the critical treatment of Aristotle on the ground that knowing how a great mind can err can help others avoid making the same mistakes. But it also takes pains to point out that the Logic owes some things to Aristotle’s Analytics and other works. The main text that then follows is about the four mental operations with one Part devoted to each.

Part I on ideas consists of 15 chapters devoted to five topics: the nature and origin of ideas (chapter 1); the objects ideas represent (chapters 2–4); simple versus compound ideas (chapter 5); the logical analysis of universal, particular, and singular ideas and the extension and comprehension of terms (chapters 6–8); and clear and distinct versus obscure and confused ideas, including a discussion of types of definition (chapters 9–15).

Part II on judgment consists of 20 chapters. Recognizing that the mind closely links ideas with the words that express them, their discussion begins with an analysis of parts of speech in chapters 1 and 2. Chapters 3 and 4 present a version of the Aristotelian theory of categorical proposition and the square of opposition. Chapters 5–14 treat the properties of simple, compound, and complex propositions, including how to identify and classify them. This section contains the famous distinction between restrictive (“determinative”) and non-restrictive (“explicative”) subordinate clauses (chapter 6), as well as a discussion of what we would now call logical connectives and non-truth-functional propositions (chapter 9). The theory of definition returns in chapters 15 and 16 in the context of scientific applications. Finally, chapters 17–20 on the conversion of propositions contain part of the Port-Royal version of the medieval doctrine of distribution.

Part III focuses on rules for syllogistic reasoning, and is divided into 20 chapters. Although the authors insist that most erroneous reasoning is based on false premises rather than incorrect inferences (Logic, 9), they believe the study of syllogistic forms can be helpful for exercising the mind. The Logic classifies syllogisms into simple and conjunctive, and simple syllogisms into complex and noncomplex (despite the awkward terminology). After defining terms in chapters 1 and 2, they present general rules for simple, noncomplex syllogisms in chapter 3. This chapter completes their reworked version of the theory of the distribution of terms, begun in the last four chapters of Part II. Chapters 4 through 8 explain with innovative compactness (albeit still with tedious detail) the figures and moods of simple syllogisms, again reproducing traditional Aristotelian and medieval results. In chapters 9 through 13 the Logic treats in a less formal way principles for recognizing validity in syllogisms that are not simple. Chapters 14, 15, and 16 discuss respectively enthymemes, sorites (syllogisms with more than three propositions) and dilemmas. Despite their view that the traditional theory of topics (the method for finding arguments) is especially lacking utility, the authors treat it in chapters 17 and 18. “Those who object to this can spare themselves by not reading them” (Logic, 11). Here they criticize Aristotle, Ramus, and the Scholastics. Finally, chapters 19 and 20 discuss sophisms and fallacies.

The Logic ends with Part IV on method. The first three Parts of the book correspond to the tripartite layout of traditional logic texts. Part IV, however, constitutes an innovation reflecting the authors’ enthusiasm for the philosophy of Descartes and Pascal. Chapter 1 lays the groundwork in Descartes’ and Augustine’s rationalism, criticizing the role of the senses in providing knowledge, as well as the claims of Academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics. After spelling out the methods of analysis and synthesis in chapter 2, chapters 3 through 10 focus on the methods of geometry, including rules of definitions, axioms, and demonstrations. Chapter 11 then recapituates eight rules of scientific method. Finally, chapters 12 through 16 contrast the nature of rationally obtained knowledge with faith or belief.

4. Ideas

In the Logic, ideas are the basic terms, or elements, of the art of thinking,

…the reflections we can make on our ideas are perhaps the most important part of logic, since they are the foundation for everything else. (I.1, 25)

All operations of the mind involve ideas. The Logic characterizes ideas in the Cartesian way. They are, in the first place, individuated by their objects. Ideas are “as it were the images of things” as Descartes wrote (Meditations, Third meditation [CSM II, 25]). The notion of an image is taken generally; some very important ideas, the idea of God for example, are not acquired by sensory perception. The Logic takes pains to emphasize this aspect of rationalist philosophy Thinking about a thing requires an idea that represents the thing. Because ideas are in this sense objective, i.e., of objects, they can be classified according to the metaphysical classification of their objects. In the Cartesian metaphysics of the Logic, there are three fundamental kinds of objects, substances, unchanging aspects of substances called “attributes”, and features that change over time called “modes”. Although Arnauld elsewhere takes up metaphysical questions about the relation between ideas and their objects, then are not taken up here (see Nadler 1989).

Descartes’ contrast between ideas that are clear and distinct as opposed to ideas that are obscure and confused is central to the Logic. It is primarily concerned with the ways in which thought arrives at the truth; the epistemic status of the ideas with which one thinks is more basic than rules for proceeding from one thought to another (Gaukroger 1989, Nelson 2017). Although Descartes is usually read as considering the clarity and distinctness of an idea to be a psychological criterion external to the idea itself (but see Lennon 2008: 137–48), the Logic agrees with Spinoza that perceptions of unconfused, true ideas are known as such without recourse to a criterion of the sort sought by ancient sceptics. A good example of the employment of clarity and distinctness is provided by the characterization of the attributes and modes of substances. Again following Descartes, according to the Logic an attribute is recognized by one’s inability to distinctly perceive a substance if one of its attributes is excluded from it. Extension, for example, is an attribute of bodies. Bodies cannot be distinctly perceived except as extended. A mode cannot be distinctly perceived except in relation to the substance of which it is a mode, but substances can be distinctly perceived while some particular modes are excluded from them. A mind can be distinctly perceived without the thought of a particular pain, but that particular thought is only confusedly perceived unless it is perceived as that mind’s thought.

Communication with others requires that ideas be expressed with words. Complex thought and the accumulation of personal knowledge are also hardly possible without recourse to words. Thinking and expressing thought with words with insufficient care, however, are the main sources of error. Much thinking takes place with exclusive attention to words without regard for the ideas signified by those words. It is also common for the association between words and ideas to drift in ways that damage the coherence of thought. The priority of thought to linguistic expressions is put in extreme terms.

If reflection on our thoughts never concerned anyone but ourselves, it would be enough to examine them in themselves, unclothed in words or other signs. (Logic, 23)

This has the practical result that most disputes are verbal. Disagreement about clearly and distinctly ideas themselves is virtually impossible. Careful assignment of words to ideas making use of explicit definitions when necessary minimizes disputes. This stresses the importance of precisely tracking how words are associated with ideas (I.12, 62).

Nevertheless, it is practically impossible to do all one’s thinking without words and other symbolic representations. And it would also be tiresome in a philosophical treatise to repeatedly explain whether the author is referring to words, or to the ideas for which they stand, or to both at once. The Logic depends on the reader to use context to make the appropriate disambiguations.

Ideas fall into classes that parallel the Cartesian ontology. Ideas of substances are conventionally associated with ideas of nouns and thus further associated with written and spoken words, which are themselves objects of the word-ideas. Ideas of attributes and modes are associated with abstract nouns such as “hardness” and “justice”, as well as by adjectives such as “hard” and “just” (I.2, 30–31). Words themselves signify objects only transitively, as it were, via ideas of words and then ideas of objects. The Logic often takes the shortcut of writing as though words directly signify things. It depends on the reader to keep the full chain of associations in mind. The logical distinction between general terms and particular or singular ones emerges from ideas of attributes and modes. As noted above, these ideas are most distinct when conceived along with the idea of the substance on which they depend. When they are conceived without attention to their substance idea, they can represent additional objects. This is illustrated with a geometrical example.

General or abstract ideas are an important class of ideas are derived from ideas of particular things. Although everything that exists is singular, ideas can represent more than one thing. The general idea of a triangle represents all particular triangles. Next, proper nouns which indicate single individuals, such as “Socrates”, “Rome”, “Bucephalus”, are distinguished from common or appellative nouns such as “man”, “city”, “horse”, which can indicate more than one thing. Throughout the text, the authors call both universal ideas and common nouns “general terms.” The mental process yielding the ideas associated with general terms is explained with a geometrical example.

… if I draw an equilateral triangle on a piece of paper, and if I concentrate on examining it on this paper along with all the accidental circumstances surrounding it, I shall have an idea of only a single triangle. But if I ignore all the particular circumstances and focus on the thought that the triangle is a figure bounded by three equal lines, the idea I form will, on the one hand, represent more clearly the equality of the lines and, on the other, be able to represent all equilateral triangles. (I.5, 38)

Similarly, one can ignore the equality of the lines and have a more abstract idea representing all triangles. Ignoring the number of lines enables one to represent all plane figures, and so on. It is easy to see how this works for ideas of modes such as red, loud, painful, etc. It is noteworthy that the authors affirm that all existences are particular. Their construal of abstract ideas and the words associated with them constitutes a thoroughgoing nominalism about the signification of abstract ideas and the words associated with them.

Medieval philosophers explained the significance of general terms by a complex theory of supposition (see Spade 1982). The Logic condenses this framework so that the significance of general ideas has two aspects: the comprehension and the extension. The comprehension consists in the set of attributes essential to the idea. For example, the comprehension of the idea “triangle” includes the attributes extension, shape, three lines, three angles, etc. The extension of the idea consists in the particular objects to which it applies, which includes “all the different species of triangles” (I.6, 39–40). Here the authors confuse matters by trying to incorporate the traditional terms “inferiors” and “species”, taking the latter for individual objects. Usually, however, they straightforwardly take the extension of a general idea to be the individuals possessing the attributes in its comprehension. There are three key features of this theory of signification. First, the comprehension rather than the extension is essential to the function of a general idea: one cannot remove an attribute without destroying it—making it into a different idea, whereas one can restrict its extension by applying it to only some of the objects that fall under it. Second, the comprehension governs the extension: the set of attributes determines the individuals in its extension. Finally, comprehensions and extensions are inversely related. In adding attributes to the comprehension of an idea one restricts its extension. For example, the comprehension of the idea “mammal” includes that of the idea “animal” so the extension of “animal” includes that of “mammal.” The Logic implicitly assumes this principle throughout the text. In recognizing these two modes of the signification of words—both the comprehension of the associated idea and the objects in the extension—it replaces the traditional distinction between incomplete and complete entities in the treatment of the signification of general terms.

It is tempting to interpret the Logic as providing a precursor of contemporary semantic theories in which comprehension is like meaning or Fregean sense and extension is like reference. The comprehension of a term does usually determine the objects in its extension. It must be remembered, however that it is psychological ideas and not words that have comprehensions. No ideas are identically shared among minds, so only in the case of innate ideas or complexes strictly defined in terms of innate ideas can communication result in something like transmission of meanings in the modern sense. Hacking (1975) argues that seventeenth-century texts, including the Logic, are primarily concerned with mental discourse and do not include a philosophy of language at all.

Moving to linguistic terms and their association with ideas, the authors first take up the noun system. This is mostly drawn from Part II of the Port-Royal Grammar. As explained in Part II of the Logic, nouns are names of objects, that is, substances and attributes. Substantive nouns such as “earth” and “sun” signify substances, and adjectival nouns such as “good” and “just” signify attributes, “indicating at the same time the subject to which they apply…”. Just as substances are ontologically prior to their manners or modes, nouns are prior to adjectives in the structure of language. From the adjective one then creates a secondary substantive, an abstract noun:

after having formed the adjective human from the substantive word man, we form the substantive humanity from the adjective human. (II.1, 74)

Thus there are three kinds of nouns: concrete substantives, adjectives, and abstract substantives. The Logic says that adjectives have two significations: a distinct signification of the mode or manner, and a confused signification of the subject. Although the signification of the mode is more distinct, it is indirect; by contrast the confused signification of the subject is direct (II.1, 74–75). This is because the idea of a mode is distinctly perceived only when its substance is perceived along with it. So every noun picks out or distinctly signifies one thing, either an individual, a collection of individuals, or an attribute. Concrete substantives distinctly signify complete objects, that is, individual substances: “man” distinctly signifies human beings. The adjective “human” distinctly signifies the attribute of being human. And abstract substantives such as “humanity” also pick out this attribute distinctly. But the adjective “human”, unlike the concrete substantive “man”, is linguistically incomplete, since it means “a human [being]”. Linguistically, adjectives are gappy and require completion by a substantive to signify. The Logic identifies this incomplete signification as the connotation or confused (but direct) signification of an adjective. So adjectives signify ideas of substances directly and confusedly, and ideas of attributes indirectly and distinctly. Because substantive nouns of both kinds are linguistically complete, they lack connotation and have only distinct and direct signification to the individual substances or attributes they name.

The production of general ideas from less general ones is, as we have seen, effected by the mind separating or deleting some components of the less general idea. The general idea of triangle could be produced by deleting equilaterality from the idea of an equilateral triangle. Similarly, ideas of greater complexity can be formed by combining less complex ideas. If, for example, one imagines a pink elephant, that idea is formed by combining an idea of an elephant with an idea of pink. The mental act of affirming or denying one idea of another is called judging. Mental operations of special importance to logic are those that result in propositions. This is the focus of the next part of the Logic.

5. Judgment and Propositions

The mental act of judging includes both affirming one idea agrees with another and denying such agreement. In affirmation, the result is a joining of the ideas; they are judged to agree with each other. In denial, the result is a separation of the ideas; they are judged to be “repugnant” to each other. “Agreement” and “repugnance” are unpacked in terms of the crucial notions of comprehension and extension. When one judges that “s is P”, affirms that the comprehension of s includes the comprehension of P and that s is included in the extension of P. Because ideas are characterized by their objects, a judgment is true when the ideas are related as the objects are related. As usual, this works straightforwardly only when the ideas are sufficiently clear and distinct. If one’s idea of Arnauld confusedly contains the attribute of being married, then one might erroneously judge that the idea of Arnauld agrees with the idea of being married.

Judgments are also called propositions, so propositions are mental entities. The priority of thought to language thus includes the point that linguistic expressions of mental propositions are propositions in a derivative, verbal sense. Verbal propositions are usually simply called “propositions” and the reader is expected to sort this out by context. Additionally supposing that the reader will not forget the distinction between thought and language, the authors use the terms “subject” and “predicate” to refer both to the ideas making up a judgment and to the linguistic expressions of the subject and predicate ideas. Because every simple judgment is composed of a subject idea and a predicate idea that are related by an act of affirmation or denial, the subject and predicate ideas are expressed linguistically in the simplest case by a proper or substantive noun and a common noun or adjective. The affirmation is expressed by a verb; expressions of denial add a negative word (II.3, 82–3). Arnauld and Nicole criticize Aristotle and other philosophers who combine the copula with features of the predicate (time) and subject (person); in a language mirroring Cartesian thought, there would be only one substantive verb, namely to be. In fact, natural languages often combine the predicate with the verb, as in “Peter lives”, and Latin verbs sometimes express all three elements of judgment in one word, as in cogito and sum. Such verbs as “lives” can always be expressed with verb phrases including “is” and a noun phrase. The proposition “Peter lives” for example, can be linguistically rendered as “Peter is living.”

The doctrine that judgment arises exclusively from mental acts of affirmation and denial raises some important philosophical questions. First, if it is an act of affirmation or denial that results in a proposition, there seems to be no room for doubting or suspending judgment on a proposition. The Logic proposes a “one act” theory of affirmation and denial. Another kind of theory would require two acts: first, the formulation of a judgment, and second, affirming or denying it. In much post-Fregean philosophy it is a requirement that propositions can be thought without asserting them and that mental “attitudes” such as believing, hoping, fearing, etc. can be taken regarding a proposition that is neither affirmed nor denied.

In the Logic, however, things are different because of the oft-cited sense in which thought is prior to language. Well formulated mental propositions can, in principle, be thought wordlessly—a linguistic sentence will rarely mirror the form of a thought with perfect accuracy. This means that to affirm a verbal proposition is not always to have a clear and distinct perception of it. In a generally Cartesian theory of the mind, what is plausibly called “entertaining” or “suspending judgment” on a proposition does not require a mental act apart from affirming or denying. Suppose one thinks the proposition, P, but simultaneously thinks much more clearly the proposition, “I should investigate the truth of P”, or the proposition Q where Q is incompatible withP. Those states of mind seems to answer at least as well to the description “merely entertaining P” as does a special mental act of entertaining or “suspending judgment on” P. The authors could even claim that one never does merely entertain a proposition P without the further concomitant judgment that P is to some extent doubtful, or that it would be rash to act on P without further investigating whether P is true, etc.

A second set of related questions is raised by the treatment of logical operations in modern quantificational logic.

Indeed, a loose chronicle of the role of the proposition in modern philosophy runs as follows: Most of the important Early Moderns conflated the formation of a thought that has propositional content with endorsement of that content and simply failed to see the disastrous logical and epistemological implications of this conflation. Part of Frege’s genius, the story goes, was to see through this mess and clearly distinguish propositional content from judgment from assertoric force. (Marušić 2014: 255)

Complex propositions are subject to a generalized version of what is now called the Frege-Geach problem. In a conditional proposition, for example, it might seem that one could affirm the conditional without separately affirming its components. But in the Logic, the propositions constituting the antecedent and consequent are formed by an act of affirmation (or denial). The proposition, “If the Earth is flat, then astronomy needs revision” should be affirmable without one’s accepting the antecedent as true, i.e., without affirming it.

The authors take no notice of this problem and do not directly address it. When discussing complex propositions, the Logic shifts from explicit considerations of comprehension and extension to truth conditions. A conditional is false when the antecedent is true and the consequent false and true when both are true; a conjunction is true when both conjuncts are true and false otherwise, and so on in the familiar way. Regarding conditional propositions, the Logic additionally relates them to inferences. To think “If P then Q” is to think of deducing the consequent from the antecedent (II.9, 100). From the perspective of Kant (for example), these problems stem from supposing that mental propositions are formed by merely combining or “fusing” elements together. If conditionalizing, disjoining, predicating, etc. are taken to be mental operations distinct from affirmation and denial, a closer connection between mental and verbal propositions becomes possible (see Section 1 of Kant’s theory of judgment).

A different device comes into play for modal judgments of possibility and necessity (II.8). Verbal propositions including modal terms such as “possible” and “necessary” express mental propositions in which the basic acts of affirmation and denial are modified. The ideas entering into modal propositions are not themselves modified (Van der Scharr 2008: 334–335; Marušić 2014: 277–278). The authors label such acts “tacit” or “virtual” affirmations (II.7, 93). It seems open to the authors to regard such complex thoughts as conditionals, conjunctions, and disjunctions as similarly involving modified affirmations, but they do not explicitly endorse this strategy.

Negation also raises interesting questions for the theory in the Logic. The act of denial extends to the entire judgment; this is expressed by the linguistic “not” attaching to the verb. As Frege points out in his essay “Negation” (1918), this account does not neatly fit with the requirement that a false thought be recognized as false. It seems that propositions must be affirmed (as true) or denied (as a true negation). For example, to recognize that “3 is greater than 5” is false requires having a complete thought, and not merely fragments of a thought. Similarly, there seems to be no room for true thoughts that have false thoughts as their components, such as true conditionals with false antecedents. In addition, the Logic seems to have trouble with double negation. If denying separates the thought into its parts, then double negation would function as a sword that magically unites the parts it had sundered (Frege 1918 [1952: 122–129]). From a modern perspective, the root problem in treating negation as denial is once again the failure to distinguish the thought or proposition that is grasped from the act of judging it.

Frege’s problems here stem from his requirement that the structure of thought conform perfectly with a notation for expressing the thought. The Logic “psychologistically” prioritizes the theory of thought over the theory of symbolization. If the authors had faced Frege’s objections, they could have insisted on inherent limitations in verbal expressions of thought. When one clearly and distinctly perceives that “5 is greater than 3” it is always affirmed. It is psychologically impossible to affirm “3 is greater than 5” unless the ideas are badly confused. If someone were to verbally assert “3 is greater than 5”, it would be a mystery what they were thinking unless it was a proposition about the words. Asserting a well-formed verbal expression corresponds to a well-formed thought only insofar as the thought is clear and distinct. Double negations are common in complex verbal propositions, but the Logic is not committed to these words signifying iterated “separations” that result in rejoinings. They can simply stand for affirmations. This means that when denial is described as “separating” ideas, that should be understood metaphorically. Denial in the Logic is perhaps better described as the recognition that the idea of the predicate is not among those included in the comprehension of the idea of the subject. And as usual, thoughts that are confused need to be sorted out before they can be precisely expressed. The same holds for triple negations and denials. (For a further discussion, see section 2.7.1 of the entry on Frege.)

The Logic’s view of proposition formation also suggests a problem for embedded generality (Buroker 1994). Subordinate clauses must be located in either the subject or the predicate. But some embedded clauses make assertions and some do not. Despite the two verbs in the complex proposition “Men who are pious are charitable”, for example, it is clear that one is not affirming of all men or even some men that they are pious. On the other hand, “God who is invisible created the world which is visible” permits three assertions, “God is invisible”, “The world is visible”, and “God created the world” (II.5, 87). The Logic explains the difference between these two kinds of embedding in terms of “determinative” and “explicative” subordinate clauses (or, as they say, relative pronouns, see II.6–8). Determinative subordinate clauses restrict the signification of the antecedent of the relative pronoun (e.g., “men who are pious”) whereas explicative clauses do not (e.g., “God who is invisible”). In fact both determinations and explications can be carried out as well without embedded or subordinate clauses, as in the sentences “Pious men are charitable” and “The invisible God created the visible world.” When working these cases out, as usual in the Logic,

it is often necessary to pay more attention to the meaning and the speaker’s intention than to the expression alone. (II.6, 90)

Part II on judgment concludes in Chapters 17–20 with rules for the conversion of verbal propositions, which is the exchanging of subject and predicate terms. These operations on propositions are the Logic’s reworking of the traditional theory of the distribution of terms which in turn depended on a complicated theory of “supposition” (Spade 1982, Parsons 2006, Martin 2020). In traditional logic, elaborate rules of conversion were necessary to relate the premises of a syllogism to each other and to the conclusion. This is mostly unnecessary in the Logic’s treatment of syllogistic inference in Part III, but the authors take the opportunity to display simplified conversion rules developed on the basis of a few “axioms” regarding the containment relationships between the comprehensions and extensions of terms.

6. Reasoning and Formal Methods

Part III begins with a preamble warning the reader not to accord too much importance to formal rules of reasoning.

The majority of people’s errors, as we have already said elsewhere [i.e., on p. 9], depend more on reasoning based on false principles, than from reasoning incorrectly from their principles. We rarely allow ourselves to be misled by arguments that are defective merely because the conclusion is badly drawn. And those who could not recognize a fallacy by the light of reason alone would usually not be able to understand the rules behind it, much less to apply them. (Logic, 135; also see III.9, 157 and IV.20, 203)

Here the authors stress that a good logic is a means for acquiring knowledge rather than a tool for organizing it into premises and conclusion. The final point is that when ideas are made properly clear and distinct, the natural light of reason requires no assistance from rules. We had been previously warned that primary utility of formal rules consists in the exercise of the natural light that might come from working through them. The authors continued that evaluation by pointing out that the chapter titles can guide readers in omitting this relatively unimportant “exercise” if they wish (Logic, 10). They thus regard Part IV on method as more important than Part III on formal reasoning.

The classification of syllogisms for formal treatment depends on the classification of propositions although the latter is in the service of the former. The Logic accordingly classifies simple categorical propositions into four forms: universal affirmatives (All S is P), universal negatives (No S is P), particular affirmatives (Some S is P) and particular negatives (Some S is not P). Simple categorical syllogisms are arguments with a major premise, a minor premise, and a conclusion. They contain only three terms. The major premise has the “middle” term and the attribute of the conclusion (the “major” term), while the minor premise has the middle term and the subject of the conclusion (the “minor” term). In Part II, the Logic prepares for this by adopting the theory of categorical propositions, classifying them in terms of quantity as universal, particular, or singular, and in terms of quality as affirmative or negative. It takes the traditional stand that singular propositions function logically like universals, so all simple propositions have one of the following four forms:

All S is P
No S is P
Some S is P
Some S is not P

Also following the tradition, the Logic treats the quantifiers “all” and “some” as part of the subject, so that “all men” and “some men” are logically significant units. In explaining the rules of conversion for subject and predicate terms, in Part II, chapter 17 they argue that predicates are implicitly quantified: when one says “All lions are animals”, one does not normally think that all lions are all the animals, but only some of the animals. So “All S is P” in general means “All S is (some) P” (II.17, 130).

Consider, for example this syllogism.

  • Every good prince is loved by his subjects.
  • Every pious king is a good prince.
  • Therefore every pious king is loved by his subjects. (III.2, 137)

Here, the term “good prince” is the middle term, because it appears in both premises but not in the conclusion. Traditional logic categorizes forms of syllogisms according to their “mood” and their “figure”. The mood is the arrangement of the three propositions in the A E I O forms. The figure is the arrangement of the major, minor, and middle terms in the three propositions.

Most propositions, however, are more complex than this classification suggests, for subjects and predicates need not be simple. In the proposition “God who is invisible created the world which is visible”, both the subject and predicate include subordinate clauses that appear to contain propositions (II.5–8). Because of the overall subject-predicate structure of all propositions, embedded propositions must be located in the subject or predicate. Because propositions can be complex, so can syllogisms. That becomes important in Part III when rules of inference are discussed, because all propositions, including conditionals and disjunctives, are forced into standard categorical forms. The treatment of verbal propositions, then, requires that subjects and predicates have unlimited complexity. There is, therefore, no basic inventory of simple linguistic parts permitting a recursive analysis, as in the modern classification of variables, function or predicate symbols, and logical symbols. On the classical view the proposition has a simple organic unity from the outside and a reiterable complexity from the inside. This again shows the importance of the authors’ commitment to the priority of thought over linguistic expressions of thought. Complexity is to be resolved in mental propositions by careful and attentive thinking instead of by perspicuous verbal notation.

With this treatment of classification in hand, the Logic proceeds to examine rules of formal inference. In traditional logic, the rules for syllogism are connected with rules for the conversion of propositions which in turn are connected with the distribution of terms. A term is distributed if it is “taken universally” or refers to all the individuals it denotes; otherwise it is undistributed (Kneale & Kneale 1962 [1984: 272]). As Parsons (2006: 61) puts it, the denotation of a term is its extension on its own, whereas its reference is its extension in a proposition. Thus the term “prince” denotes (i.e., is predicable of) all princes, but in the proposition “Some princes are just”, the quantifier “Some” restricts its extension in the proposition (its reference) to a subset of its extension on its own (denotation). According to the rules for distribution stated by medieval logicians, the subject terms of universal propositions and the predicates of negative propositions are distributed or taken universally throughout their extension; all other terms are undistributed. The Logic subsumes a streamlined version of these rules in chapters 17–20 of Part II, in its explanation of the conversion of propositions, accounting for them in terms of the comprehensions and extensions of the terms (II.17, 130–31).

Chapter 3 of Part III gives six rules for valid simple categorical syllogisms. These rules conform to standard medieval logic, but they are derived from the Part II rules mentioned above for converting propositions. The first two rules for syllogisms govern the distribution of terms.

  • Rule 1: The middle term cannot be taken particularly twice, but must be taken universally at least once.
  • Rule 2: The terms of the conclusion cannot be taken more universally in the conclusion than in the premises. (III.3, 139–40)

The remaining four rules express the standard views that

  1. at least one premise must be affirmative,
  2. the conclusion must be affirmative if both premises are affirmative,
  3. if one premise is negative the conclusion must be negative, and
  4. nothing follows from two particular premises (III.3, 141–42).

Chapter 4 begins a series of chapters that develops more specific rules for correctly drawing inferences. The three propositions of a syllogism can be in one of the four A E I O categories. This mathematically yields sixty-four arrangements into syllogisms: AAA, AAE, AAI, AAO, AEA, … OOO. Of these, only fifty-four are compatible with the six general rules for syllogisms. When these moods are duly arranged into figures, further rules are required to determine which have true premises and conclusions (III.4). The Logic thus emphasizes soundness over validity—presumably because arguments with false conclusions are “useless” in application. Much of the Logic’s subsequent importance as a work in formal logic is owing to what Kneale and Kneale (1962 [1984: 319]) refer to as the “quasi-mathematical” rigor with which these rules are derived and stated.

Chapter 9 moves on to complex syllogisms. These involve a complex conclusion in which the terms “are not always joined in their entirety to the middle term in each of the premises, but only to a part of one of these terms”. This example is provided in which the attribute of the conclusion is split across the attributes of the premises:

  • The sun is an insensible thing.
  • The Persians worshipped the sun.
  • Therefore the Persians worshipped an insensible thing. (III.9,158)

Traditional logic texts (and the first edition of the Logic) methodically discuss how to reduce complex syllogisms to simple ones. Later editions of the Logic abbreviate this “pedantry” in favor of a general principle for reducing complex syllogisms, or actually, to evaluate them directly without an explicit reduction. The general principle is that the conclusion must be contained in the premises. The principle is applied by making a characteristic Cartesian move. One is to come up with a “better known” proposition from which the conclusion follows—the “containing” proposition (III.10,163). Then one needs another proposition that shows that the conclusion is indeed contained in the containing proposition—this is the “applicative” proposition. Recall that the comprehension of a term contains all the attributes constituting it while the extension contains the objects that have those attributes.

The application of the general principle is not governed by any further rules; that would defeat its purpose. Instead, in Chapter 11 a series of examples is provided showing the general principle in action. Evidently, working through the examples is meant to provide an exercise in the direct deployment of their faculty for rationally “seeing” which inferences are valid. It is noteworthy that the examples proceed by taking the conclusion, the “question”, to be true. The authors are thus more interested in the soundness of useful arguments than they are in the more theoretical notion of validity. For a detailed examination of the general principle in action see Pariente (1985) and Wahl (2018).

The next chapters proceed to consider “conjunctive” syllogisms. Such syllogisms include, for example, a conditional proposition in a premise or the conclusion or a disjunction in the major premise. No new formal rules are introduced to deal with these. Instead, the Logic again runs through many examples which are treated by inspection (as we now say) making use of “the natural light of reason” (III.9, 158, see also p. 23). This is understandable given the scope of the general principle established in the preceding chapters.

Chapters 19 and 20 conclude Part III with an extended treatment of fallacious reasoning in learned contexts as well as in everyday life. Sophisms and fallacies are taxonomized, copiously illustrated, and attributed to specific flaws of intellectual character in those who propagate them. These chapters occupy nearly as many pages as the material on formal reasoning. With updated examples, these chapters could compete with textbooks currently in use in college courses on “informal logic”.

7. Method, Science, and Faith

Part IV begins by rehearsing the defense of metaphysical and scientific knowledge against skeptical philosophy. Following Descartes, it is argued that some items can be so distinctly perceived that they cannot be sincerely doubted. That one must exist in order to think, credited to Augustine rather than Descartes, is cited as an example. “The whole is greater than the part” and similar principles constitute another set of examples which were not much disputed. The same holds for geometrical propositions, but when Cartesians took these as being true of the essence of matter, sceptical resistance was plentiful. Against this, the authors’ only counter is that careful attention reveals the truth as they see it.

Chapter 2 introduces a version of the crucial distinction between the methods of analysis (sometimes called resolution) and synthesis (sometimes called composition). The authors regard analysis as more important method because it is a method for discovering truths. Synthesis is the presentation of knowledge as following from given premises. The material might be presented as formal deductions as in logic texts including Part III of the Logic. An alternative kind of synthetic presentation finds a conclusion in geometrical style as following from definitions and axioms. Descartes argued that the main function of synthesis is to instruct others in what is already known—especially to compel their assent if they are “argumentative or stubborn” (Meditations, Replies to second set of objections [CSM II, 110–111]).

An analytic treatment begins with the question under examination—the item that is to be analytically demonstrated. A successful analysis separates out what is contained in the question until some previously known items are found. One example the authors provide is a sketch of an analysis of magnetic phenomena, summarizing a case that Descartes dealt with in some detail (IV.2, 236; Descartes Rules, rule 12 [CSM I, 49–50] and Descartes 1644, Part 4 [CSM I, 276–279]. Carefully attending to a lodestone, the goal is to

distinctly conceive a certain combination of beings and natures that are known to us so as to produce all the effects we see in magnets.

If the previously known “beings and natures” are revealed to have been contained in the question and thus to analytically follow from it, the analysis is complete. If instead some absurdity or impossibility is contained in the question, the analysis shows it is false. Because analysis depends on this kind of careful attention to what is contained, the method “consists more in judgment and mental skill than in particular rules” (IV.2, 238).

This description is closely related to the general principle that the Logic laid down for the evaluation of syllogisms. That principle required that one take the conclusion of a syllogism as true and then examine or inspect what is contained in the conclusion in search of a more general truth from which the conclusion follows. Although the Logic does not explicitly state that formal rules for syllogisms should be valued less than the analytic method, it is clear that this is what the authors had in mind when saying that the only point in learning formal rules for syllogisms is obtaining mental exercise. Synthetic demonstrations are cheap because whenever one has successfully performed an analysis, one is trivially in possession of a synthesis as well. The methods of analysis and synthesis,

differ only as the route one takes in climbing a mountain from a valley differs from the route taken in descending from the mountain to the valley, or as the two ways differ that are used to prove that a person is descended from St. Louis. One way is to show that this person had a certain man for a father who was the son of a certain man, and that man was the son of another, and so on up to St. Louis. The other way is to begin with St. Louis and show that he had a certain child, and this child had others, thereby descending to the person in question (IV.2, 238)

The analogy is that if a proposition (or a genealogy) is unknown, then one ascends to more general truths (the ancestor), but if the proposition (or the genealogy) is known, then one descends to the conclusion (the descendants). In other words, the analysis and the synthesis of an item is just the same demonstration, the only difference being the route or direction, i.e., whether one begins or ends with the proposition in question (Rogers & Nelson 2015). This also makes clear the sense in which method is a matter of ordering knowledge. In analysis one puts the conclusion first in the order and proceeds to find the truths that it contains. Synthesis reverses this beginning with propositions that are already known and then understanding that the conclusion follows.

Chapters 3–10 are concerned in one way or another with axiomatic presentations of geometry. This is understandable given the reputation of Euclid’s Elements as a model of rigorous reasoning and certain results. It is interesting therefore that the Logic also, while acknowledging the virtues of the work of Euclid and other geometers, offers some pointed criticisms. Applying logical method to geometry was among Arnauld’s many special interests. He wrote a book entitled, New Elements of Geometry (1667) in which he attempted to remedy the faults discussed here in Part IV of the Logic. The authors treatment begins with some rules for synthetic demonstrations, especially in geometry. There are no surprises here. Terms must be scrupulously defined; propositions that are taken to be axiomatic must be completely certain, and so on. As stated, the rules might appear obvious, but they are elaborated in a decidedly Cartesian way. The point of rules for definitions, for example, is to ensure that linguistic terms become precisely associated with distinct ideas. It follows that definitions will be useless for those who do not have prior access to the ideas in question. Regarding rules for axioms, the main point that emerges is that they must be distinctly perceived in the Cartesian sense put forward in Part I on ideas and Part II on propositions. This means that axioms derive from innate resources and not from sensory experience and that attributes must be clearly and distinctly perceived as included in subjects. It also means that no sincere skeptical questions can arise from properly chosen axioms. A good deal of Part IV recapitulates Descartes’ unfinished manuscript, Rules for the Direction of the Native Intellect (c. 1628). This was unpublished in Latin until after the fifth edition of the Logic, but Arnauld had access to at least part of some version of the manuscript. Chapter 7 offers as examples of “some important axioms” others provided by Descartes in his replies to the second set of objections to the Meditations (CSM II, 116–117).

The rules for synthetic demonstrations lead to a list of criticisms of “geometers”. Chapter 4 notes some equivocations in Euclid’s use of “angle”, “ratio”, and “proportion.” Later mathematicians are criticizes for not respecting the distinction between nominal and real definitions. The former should be stipulations about how words are associated with ideas. The latter should characterize the nature of the object being defined. Examples are given about disputes among prominent mathematicians over nominal definitions as if they were real (IV.5). Another mistake the authors find geometers making is “proving things that do not need to be proved” (IV.9, 254). This mistake is attributed to inattention to the connection between truth and clear and distinct perception. Euclid proves that that any two sides of a triangle are greater than the third side. Because this is immediately evident, the proof violates method by mis-ordering what is known. Another mistake Euclid makes in ordering is tacking back and forth from more general to more specific cases; a number of examples are provided. Proper order requires always moving from more simple items to more complex ones. A more significant disagreement with geometrical practice is about indirect proofs by reductio ad absurdum. Because the denial of a true proposition is always confused, the derivation of a contradiction will usually offer no insight into why the conclusion is true (IV.9, 255–56). It is conceded, however, that indirect proofs might be necessary when no direct proof can be found, and they can be useful when a result is already obtained directly.

The Logic ends in a way befitting a treatise associated with the Port-Royal abbey. The last four chapters consider how to fit into the method the deliverances of knowledge derived from authority instead of from reason. Knowledge from authority is of two kinds: knowledge from God, which is called faith, and knowledge from humans “worthy of credence”, which is called belief or opinion (IV.12, 260). God’s deliverances are infallible, but human authorities differ in their reliability. The best opinions come from the constant testimony of many sources. These can reach moral certainty, i.e., all the certainty that is required for practical purposes. Faith and opinion are, however, underwritten by reason because, according to the authors, reason reveals that God is infallible and that skepticism about reliable human authority is groundless.

There follow some commonsensical rules for handling opinions. For example, for a proposition to be accepted as true, it need not be necessary and the possibility of a proposition’s truth should not automatically lead to its acceptance. These rules are applied to evaluating claims of miracles. One should take care to evaluate all of the available evidence before accepting a particular claim. Outstanding authorities should be generally trusted. The miracles related by Augustine, for example, will be accepted as such by “a person of good sense” (IV.14, 267). In Chapter 15, the commonsensical principles for evaluating testimony are applied to some cases of then current interest regarding the disputed authorship of various letters and texts. Chapter 16 concludes the Logic with the topic of judgments regarding the future. The authors point out that it is a common error to overemphasize great future harms or benefits when these outcomes are very unlikely and to underemphasize small harms or benefits that are very likely or repeatable. Infinite benefits require a different strategy. The observation that the authors view as most important is the case made famous by fellow Jansenist, Blaise Pascal.

Only infinite things such as eternity and salvation cannot be equalled by any temporal benefit. Thus we ought never balance them off against anything worldly. This is why the slightest bit of help for acquiring salvation is worth more than all the goods of the world taken together. And the least peril of being lost is more important than all temporal harms considered merely as harms.

That is enough to make all reasonable people draw this conclusion with which we will end this Logic: that the greatest of all follies is to use one’s time and life for something other than what may be useful for acquiring a life that will never end, since all the goods and harms of this life are nothing in comparison to those of the other life, and the danger of falling into those harms, as well as the difficulty of acquiring these goods, is very great (IV.16, 275)

The book’s conclusion one again stresses that formal logic and even science are at best instrumental to the goal of living well.


Recent Editions of the Port-Royal Logic

All quotations and citations to the Port Royal Logic are to the Buroker translation, 1996, listed below.

  • Arnauld, Antoine et Pierre Nicole, La Logique ou l’art de penser, édition critique par Pierre Clair et François Girbal, Paris. J. Vrin, 1981.
  • Arnauld, Antoine et Pierre Nicole, La Logique ou l’art de penser, édition critique par Dominique Descartes, Paris: Champion, 2011.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, The Art of Thinking, Port-Royal Logic, translated by James Dickoff and Patricia James, New York: Library of Liberal Arts, 1964. [Watson (1967) argues that using this translation requires caution.]
  • [Logic] Arnauld, Antoine and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, translated by Jill Vance Buroker, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. References are to part, chapter, and page number. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139166768

Works Cited or Recommended

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  • –––, 1994, “Judgment and Predication in the Port-Royal Logic”, in The Great Arnauld and some of his Philosophical Correspondents, Elmar J. Kremer (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • –––, 1996, “Arnauld on Judging and the Will”, in Interpreting Arnauld, Elmar J. Kremer (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam, 1966 [2009], Cartesian Linguistics: A Chapter in the History of Rationalist Thought, New York: Harper & Row. Third edition, James McGilvray (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511803116
  • Clark, Ruth, 1932 [1972], Strangers and Sojourners at Port Royal; Being An Account of the Connections Between British Isles and the Jansenists of France and Holland, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Reprinted 1972 New York: Octagon Books, 1972.
  • Descartes, René, c. 1628, Regulae ad Directionem Ingenii (Rules for Direction of the Mind), manuscript. Translated in CSM I: 7–78.
  • –––, 1637, Discours de la Méthode pour bien conduire sa raison, et chercher la vérité dans les sciences (Discourse on the Method), Leiden. Translated in CSM I: 111–151.
  • –––, 1641, Meditationes de prima philosophia, in qua Dei existentia et animae immortalitas demonstrantur (Meditations on First Principles, Paris: Michel Soly. Translated in CSM II.
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  • [CSM] –––, 1984–91, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 volumes, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch (trans. and eds) and Anthony Kenny (volume 3 only), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [abbreviated CSM I/II].
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  • Jones, Matthew L., 2006, The Good Life in the Scientific Revolution: Descartes, Pascal, Leibniz, and the Cultivation of Virtue, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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Other Internet Resources

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Alan Nelson <anelson@unc.edu>
Jill Buroker

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