Kinds and Origins of Evil

First published Fri Dec 10, 2021

Unde malum? What is evil—if it is anything at all—and whence does it arise? Is evil just badness by another name? Is it the inevitable “shadow side” of the good? Or is it more substantial: an active, striving force that is opposed to the good in a Star Wars, Manichean kind of way?

Does evil always originate in the causal powers of nature? Is it sometimes based in the choices of moral agents? Or, perhaps most disturbingly, does evil sometimes have its source in something non-human and impersonal—a malevolent tendency in the universe not just to general winding-down but also to outbreaks of targeted hellishness?

Finally, what is radical evil, and how does it differ from other kinds of evil?

These are some of the key metaphysical questions that philosophers have raised concerning evil. The goal of this entry is to provide a taxonomy of the most prominent answers: the main theories of evil’s kinds and origins on offer in the western philosophical tradition. This is meant to supplement the discussion in the entry on the concept of evil, although Section 1 begins with some conceptual and semantic issues.

Section 2 introduces two key distinctions that are then further developed in Sections 3 and 4. The first distinction has to do with the kinds of evil: insofar as evil is anything at all, is it a deep metaphysical feature of things, or is it always (or at least sometimes) merely an empirical phenomenon? The second distinction has to do with the origins of evil: is evil ever (or always) based in entirely natural phenomena, or does it sometimes (or always) have a moral or supernatural origin?

Sections 5 through 7 consider some puzzling cases of hard-to-categorize evils: systemic evil; symbolic evil; and so-called “radical” evil.

1. Speaking of Evil

“Evil” and related terms in the Germanic branch of Indo-European have referred, at various points, to suffering and wrongdoing, but also to defecation, latrines, spoiled fruit, diseases, prostitution, and (oddly enough) forks.

The Greek term “kakos” may be related to the Proto-Indo-European term “kakka”—“defecation”. But only the first two meanings survive in English, and non-ironic uses of the term are relatively rare outside of ceremonial and literary contexts. Indeed, speaking of evil nowadays often feels like an exercise in anachronism—like speaking of wickedness, abomination, uncleanness, and iniquity.

The Oxford English Dictionary explains:

In modern colloquial English it [evil]; is little used, such currency as it has being due to literary influence. In quite familiar speech the adjective is commonly superseded by bad; the noun is somewhat more frequent, but chiefly in the widest senses, the more specific senses being expressed by other words, such as harm, injury, misfortune, disease, etc. (“evil, adj. and n.1”, under A., abbreviations expanded, OED Online, accessed September 2021)

This trend is found in other modern languages, but not in all. Ruppel (2019) notes that in German-speaking lands “das Übel” declined just like “evil” did in England, but was soon replaced by “das Böse”, which is still alive and well in Germany.

This slow erasure of “evil” and its cognates from many European languages, which began in the seventeenth century, was due to the rejection of the concept of evil, especially by elites. Doctors, moral philosophers, natural scientists, and even theologians shied away from evil—preferring more tractable notions like badness, harm, and misfortune, or quasi-quantifiable concepts like pain, suffering, trauma, and disutility. Traditional views of ontologically substantive and supernatural evil—something able to possess a body or terrorize a soul—came to be seen as quaint, unscientific, embarrassing (Ruppel 2019).

Philosophers of religion are a half-exception to the rule. They did and do continue to speak of evil, at least when discussing the “problem” thereof. (See the entry on the problem of evil.) If pressed, though, they typically admit that this is because the great framers of the problem—Augustine, Aquinas, Leibniz, Bayle—used the term (in Latin or French), and then proceed to gloss it generically as, in Michael Tooley’s words, “any undesirable states of affairs” (2002 [2019]). Philosophers of religion in the broadly Continental tradition are less likely to assimilate evil to more general or anodyne notions in this way, and more likely to discuss the nature of evil as opposed to the “problem” it raises for theism (e.g., Kearney 2001 and Matuštík 2008).

Despite this widespread squeamishness about “evil” in both scientific culture and common parlance, there are moments when the pull of the ancient lexicon is irresistible—at the very least expressively, in the mode of both condemnation and lament. Premeditated mass shootings aren’t just bad or traumatic; rather, they are something else: here people still reach for “evil” or even “radical evil”. The years-long imprisonment and rape of children by their parents is a misfortune that produces negative utility, to be sure, but the transfixing horror of it seems only to be captured by the invocation of “evil”. The same is true of most instances of genocide, sex-trafficking, torture-slaying, terrorism, serial killing, and slavery: these are one and all bad, harmful, and traumatic activities, but they are also something else—something excessive, mesmerizing, and revolting all at once (see Stone 2009 for a psychologist’s account). In the face of such acts, we—along with our spiritual leaders, newscasters, and politicians—are still willing to speak, preach, and tweet about “pure evil”.

Thus after a school shooting in February 2017, Donald Trump (@realDonaldTrump) tweeted that “we must keep ‘evil’ out of our country”. (Despite the quotation marks, it was clear that he meant evil the entity, and not “evil” the word.) After the Las Vegas mass shooting in October 2017, Trump and many others in leadership referred to the event as “an act of pure evil” (Matuson 2017). Less recently, George W. Bush referred to Iran, Iraq, and North Korea as the “Axis of Evil” in a state of the union address on 29 January 2002 (see Other Internet Resources), and Ronald Reagan repeatedly characterized the Soviet Union as “the evil empire”, famously at a speech on 8 March 1983 to the National Association of Evangelicals (see Other Internet Resources).

But when we do this—when we speak of evil, das Böse, il male nowadays—what is it that we are referring to, and where does it come from?

Pressed with such questions, many people (philosophers included) revert to the more tractable terms. Of course what we are really talking about (whispering about, thundering about, shaking our heads about) in those moments of condemnation and lament is an extreme instance of suffering or disutility. Of course “evil” is to “bad” what “wicked” is to “immoral”: a conceptual vestige of a pre-scientific, credulous past that we invoke for the sake of solemnity, empathy, or emphasis. A concept that—outside of horror films and fiction—is best analyzed in terms of nature’s frustration of the basic needs of sentient creatures, or as the effects of illness and ill-parenting. Yes, evil happenings have an excessive, egregious quality that makes them notable, even transfixing. But they are not, in the end, sui generis or metaphysically mysterious: neuroscience, medicine, psychology, and law have domesticated evil. Taken to its logical extreme, the doctrine that characterizes this camp would be that all evil is “natural” (a product of various causal processes in nature).

Others prefer to answer the questions about the origins of evil in terms of choice, agency, and will. For people in this camp, evil consists in malevolent intentions, malice with forethought, and self-conscious cruelty that leads to extreme suffering and tribulation. They may allow that there are contributing factors and preconditions, but ultimately hold the agents themselves responsible for evil. Note, however, that the appeal to human free will can also be seen as an effort to domesticate evil—to make it explicable in terms of familiar concepts, to set it on a continuum with other, familiar acts and events. Taken to its logical extreme, the doctrine held by people in this camp is that all evil has “moral” origins—it is a product of choice or agency of some sort.

This debate about the roots of evil plays out not only in philosophy seminar rooms and psychology labs, but also on cable news stations and op-ed pages. People in the second camp tend to the political right, and sometimes even make a show of using “evil” because they think that people in the first camp (who tend to the political left) are uncomfortable with the idea of personal responsibility and blameworthiness.

I said these were the two opposing camps. In truth there is another one—one that used to be very popular but now seems sparsely populated, at least among philosophers. People in this third camp eschew efforts to domesticate evil; for them, what we mean by “evil” is not equivalent to what we mean by “bad” or “wrong” or even “very very very bad” or “very very very wrong”. In other words, evil is not just illness, misfortune, or malevolent choices by another name but rather a positive, substantial rottenness in the universe. It is, or has its origin in, some non-agential force or shadow side of reality—something spooky, imperceptible, but out there (“in them woods”).

2. Two Distinctions in Evil: Kinds and Origins

The late antique (Plotinus, Proclus, Augustine, Boethius), medieval (Anselm, Ibn Sina, Aquinas), and early modern (Descartes, Leibniz, Bayle, Kant) eras contain sophisticated traditions of reflection on questions about evil—about its being or non-being, its intrinsic features and natural manifestations, and its origins in nature, will, or supernature. Over the course of that centuries-long discussion, two main distinctions emerged.

The first main distinction has to do with the nature or kinds of evil: is evil at bottom just an empirical phenomenon—something that is given in the causal, phenomenal world of our experience? Or is there a deeper, metaphysical aspect to some evils? Note that this is not an exclusive distinction: people who endorse the idea of metaphysical evil typically assume that it also has an empirical character or manifestation.

Suppose, for example, we come across the sort of scene that drove Friedrich Nietzsche mad in Turin: a coachman mercilessly beating his horse (Prideaux 2018). In this version of the case, however, suppose that the coachman’s cruelty is a response to his having been recently diagnosed with terminal cancer. So here there is certainly some empirical evil: the cancerous disruption to the body, the cruelty of the man, the pain of the horse. Some philosophers will say that there is also metaphysical evil: neither the man nor the horse is metaphysically perfect, and so on the Absence Theory considered below (section 3.1.1) both are in that respect evil. We might also regard the body and character of the man as corrupted and conclude that he is metaphysically evil in a “privative” way too (see section 3.1.3). Metaphysical evils like these are distinct from the empirical evils of the cancer, the cruelty, and the suffering of the horse, though on many accounts they are the ground of the latter.

The second main distinction has to do with the origins of evil, and tracks the differences between the three camps mentioned above. The first option here is to say that a specific evil arises entirely from natural phenomena for which no one is responsible. In the case of the man and his horse, it is common to think that their metaphysical finitude and incapacities, as well as the cancerous tumor and the canine pain, are “natural” in this way: they seem to be based in facts about the natures, events, and causal laws involved.

An alternative is to say that a specific evil has its origin in moral actions and intentions. Applied to our case, it is common to think that the man’s agency—the choice to beat his vulnerable steed—is the origin of the cruelty and the pain. If there is metaphysical evil here, then it too might have a moral origin: on some religious pictures, for instance, the corrupted human nature that leads to disease, cruelty, and enmity between him and other creatures is a result of free choice on the part of his primordial ancestors. (If there is agency in any non-human creatures—animals or angelic—then it would also fit here.)

The third (and now-quite-unpopular) view about origins says that a specific evil arises ultimately not from nature or from choice but from something that is both supernatural and non-agential (call this a “spooky non-agential” origin). On such views there is a dark force or side of reality that is the ultimate origin of, say, the metaphysical evil in the man’s nature. It may also be the ultimate source of the empirical evil involved.

Three further preliminary notes:

  1. The second main distinction here is often regarded as exclusive with respect to a specific evil, since we are asking about its ultimate origin. If the man’s cancer and ill-treatment of the horse originate entirely in the causal powers of the physical universe, then they are not also based in either free choice or supernatural spookiness (and vice versa). “Typically” here is key, however, since a compatibilist picture of free will (O’Connor & Franklin 2018 [2021]) says that free choices themselves are determined by natural causes. On that view, perhaps, the origin of the man’s cruel act is both moral and natural. Compatibilisms between natural and spooky origins are also conceptually possible.
  2. Although some theorists think that all instances of evil (whether metaphysical or empirical) are grounded in just one of these ultimate origins, most will allow that different evils have different ultimate origins. For instance, someone might coherently think that the man’s cancer has a natural origin, that his cruelty has a moral origin, and yet that the ferociousness of the beating has a spooky or “dark force” origin. Section 4 considers some historical efforts to suggest that all evils are ultimately moral in origin.
  3. Although these conceptual distinctions are fairly clear, there is terminological variation in the historical and contemporary literature with respect to the term “natural evil”. Some philosophers and theologians use “natural evil” to refer not to an origin but to a kind—the kind that is here called “empirical evil”. When the distinctions are maintained, however, it should be clear that they are orthogonal: both metaphysical evil and empirical evil can have natural, moral, or spooky origins (see Figure 1).
Origins: Natural Moral Spooky non-agential
Metaphysical The finitude, susceptibility to pain and disease, and other incapacities essential to the coachman and the horse and that are ultimately based in facts about natures The finitude, susceptibility to pain and disease, and the inclination to cruelty that are essential to the man and the result of damage to his nature and/or that of his species, which damage is ultimately based in facts about immoral acts and intentions (e.g., Original Sin) The finitude, and susceptibility to pain and disease in the coachman and the horse, and the corruption in the coachman’s nature and/or that of his species, and that are ultimately based in facts about a dark force or shadow-side principle in reality
Empirical The cancer of the coachman, whose ultimate explanation consists in causal facts about natural phenomena The cruelty of the coachman and the suffering of the horse, whose ultimate explanation consists in facts about the man’s immoral acts and intentions. The cancer, anger, cruelty, and suffering of the coachman and the horse whose ultimate explanation is based in facts about a dark force or shadow-side principle in reality.

Figure 1. The Table of Evils, applied to Nietzsche case

The distinctions represented in the Table of Evil are the topics of Sections 3 and 4. Sections 5 through 7 look at three varieties of evil (systemic, symbolic, and radical) whose positions within the Table are more difficult to discern.

3. Kinds of Evil: Metaphysical and Empirical

The first key distinction is concerned with the kinds of evil—with what evil is or consists in, and thus with where and how it manifests. Again, the distinction is not exclusive: someone might hold that there is both metaphysical evil and empirical evil, and that the latter is typically a manifestation of metaphysical evil. Someone else, however, might hold that there is no such thing as metaphysical evil, and that all evils can be accounted for at the empirical, causal level.

3.1 Metaphysical Evil

Many of the traditional kakologists believed in metaphysical evil—i.e., evil that has to do with the way things exist or fail to exist. Typically, metaphysical evil is supposed to be a function of a thing’s nature and characterized by a kind of unintelligiblity. As we have seen, many such theorists also typically assume that metaphysical evil has empirical manifestations.

Both metaphysical and empirical evil have been described in terms of four main theory-templates: Absence, Matter, Privation, and Real Property. These templates are laid out in more detail in the discussion of metaphysical evil in this section, and applied again in section 3.2’s discussion of empirical evil.

3.1.1 Absence Theory

The Absence Theory of Evil has its origins in the Platonic idea that there are different “degrees of being” corresponding to the number and kinds of capacities a thing has. Roughly speaking, the more numerous and impressive a thing’s capacities, the more real and thus better it is, metaphysically-speaking. A dog cannot stand erect; an ape can. A rock cannot pass through walls; an angel can. These lacks or absences are essential to being the kind of finite creature that a dog or a rock is; miracles aside, a rock is just the kind of thing that cannot pass through walls. All the same, the lack of that ability is an evil.

Absence theorists typically add a “plenum” thesis here: it is fitting, or beautiful, or perhaps even necessary, that all the different degrees of being are exemplified, and thus that every link in the “great chain of being” is occupied. Evil is a function of the way things ought to be or even must be.

Absence Theory was popular across antiquity, but it was particularly attractive to philosophers in monotheistic traditions because it allowed them to say that evil is not a thing—and thus not some thing that a good, all-powerful God created or sustains. Anselm writes in On the Fall of the Devil:

Just as nothing that is not good comes from the Supreme Good, and every good is from the Supreme Good, likewise nothing that is not being [essentia] comes from the Supreme Being [essentia], and all being is from the Supreme Being. Since the Supreme Good is the Supreme Being, it follows that every being is a good thing and every good thing is a being. Therefore, just as nothing and non-being [non esse] are not being [essentia], likewise they are not good. So, nothing and non-being are not from He from whom nothing is unless it is good and being. (De Casu Diaboli, v.1, 235; translation by Sadler [Other Internet Resources])

A lingering problem in the theistic context, however, is that Absence Theory entails that finite things have a degree of evil just in virtue of not being at the top of the chain. So even if God does not create evil (because absence is uncreated), God creates beings that are essentially evil.

3.1.2 Matter Theory

Plotinus rejects Absence Theory for a related reason: it compels us

to say that there are evils in the higher world too; for there the Soul is inferior to Intellect, and Intellect is lesser than [the One]. (Enneads I, 8, 13)

For Plotinus, it is not merely being lower than the highest One that makes something evil; rather, evil consists in being so low as to be associated with matter. Indeterminate or “unformed matter” is the final term on the cosmic chain from being to non-being—it is as far away from intelligence as possible, and thus equally far away from goodness. This is the Matter Theory of Evil that was influential in various gnosticisms, early Christian heresies, and late antique platonisms (see O’Meara 2019).

3.1.3 Privation Theory

Augustine, as well as many scholastics and early moderns, rejected Matter Theory on religious grounds. God created matter, and so it cannot be bad in itself. Instead of reverting to pure Absence Theory, however, these monotheists developed the Privation Theory of Evil. This can be construed as Absence Theory plus the Aristotelian idea that goodness is relative to a thing’s kind. Individuals of different kinds have different ends dictated by their natures: as long as the dog achieves the ends set out by its nature, it counts as fully good of its canine kind, even if it essentially lacks the good-making capacities (or “realities”) of beings higher on the chain. (For more on Augustine’s version, see King 2019; on Aquinas, see Davies 2019).

Privation Theory thus reduces pressure on monotheism: evil is not a being but rather an absence, and so God did not create it. Moreover, evil is the kind of absence that is not a function of the essential natures of things, and so God cannot be faulted for creating things that are essentially evil. Failing to accomplish the end set out by one’s nature—failing to be the way one ought to be—is a privation, however, and so it is evil.

Friends of Privation Theory offer different accounts of how and why things fail to accomplish their natural end. Most ascribe the failure to something in the individual creature—culpable ignorance, Original Sin, free agency—rather than to God, thereby grounding metaphysical evil in moral evil (on which see section 4.1 below). The extent to which these appeals to privation succeed in getting God off the hook is, naturally, controversial.

Plotinus’s view is effectively a hybrid of Privation Theory and Matter Theory: for him, privation only occurs when some of the matter in something is unformed or unmastered by a form (see Enneads I, 8, 5, 19–26). But even if other Privation Theorists do not view privation in this way, the conception of evil as infinitely distant from reason and intelligibility survives. In other words, Ignorance, Original Sin, and other misuses of freedom are not necessarily a function of irrational matter, but they are still opposed to rational mind. Descartes is illustrative here: for him, the only teleology (and privation) in the world relates to the souls—and in particular the wills—of human beings. Material substance is mechanistic, and aggregates of it (in the forms of animals and plants) can be explained mechanistically, without invoking teleology or kind-relative values (compare Newlands 2019).

3.1.4 Real Property Theory

A fourth major account of the nature of metaphysical evil takes it to be something more substantive than absence, privation, or unformed matter. Call this the Real Property Theory of Evil: evil is some sort of reality—a determinate feature of certain finite beings (see J. Russell 1977, 1981, and Frankfurter 2006). Some versions of this picture say that evil is ultimately dependent on the good. Other, more Manichaean versions take the two to be coeval and independent, locked in an eternal axiological struggle. Although the relevant “property” here is supposed to have more reality or substance than mere absence or privation, there is still a kind of unintelligibility to it. The evil side of reality, the dark force, or the malevolent will is a kind of black hole for the “natural light” of reason—positively real, but inaccessible to complete explanation.

3.2 Empirical Evil

Empirical evil is a capacious category: it covers bodily pain, damage, and disease as well as the psychological concomitants or effects of these physical phenomena—suffering, terror, depression, mental illness. Traditionally, it has also included social ills such as oppression, poverty, and structural injustice (see Sharpe 1909). Philosophers who believe in metaphysical evil often take them to manifest in empirical evils. Philosophers who reject metaphysical evil, by contrast, take the empirical kind to be fundamental.

Calling pain an evil might raise eyebrows, since clearly some pain is beneficial: it protects us from collisions, diseases, and predators. But the idea is that, whatever instrumental uses it has, pain qua phenomenal quality—the feeling of it—is intrinsically bad (setting aside for these purposes tricky cases like that of the masochist who takes pleasure in experiencing pain). Pain in the horrendous amounts and kinds that we encounter in human history as well as in the “charnel house” of evolutionary history is sickeningly and obviously bad (Murray 2008; Martin & Watkins 2019).

The templates used to characterize metaphysical evil above can be applied to empirical evil, too. An Absence Theory of empirical evil construes it simply as the absence of physical-psychological states of pleasure, health, stability, justice, and even life. Matter Theory regards pain, disease, mental malaise, and social ills as effects of our standing as material beings, vulnerable to the “matter” in our organism breaking down or coming into conflict with other parts of material creation. Privation Theory says that empirical evil is the absence of some such good which ought to exist. There will then be different accounts of why the good ought to exist, and why it doesn’t—some of these will be based in a theory of metaphysical evil.

A Real Property Theory of empirical evil, by contrast, insists that pain and suffering are positive realities and not mere absences (it is thus compatible with Matter Theory, but not with Absence or Privation Theory). As Malebranche notes, this is problematic in theological contexts, since God is supposed to be the ground of all positive beings (see Malebranche 1674–5 [1997: 348 and 392]). In a letter to a mathematician named Arnold Eckhard, G.W. Leibniz discusses this issue, and suggests “with some scruples” that “pain too is a perfection” (1677 [1969: 177]). That is a fairly unusual view, one that is made particularly poignant by the fact that Leibniz himself spent the last few years of his life in immense pain. He apparently had a habit of sleeping in a chair near his writing desk, and it

led to his having an open sore on his right leg. This caused him difficulty in walking; he tried to remedy it, but only by putting blotting paper on it. Later, to reduce the pain and to make the nerves insensitive he had a number of wooden clamps made, and these he screwed onto himself wherever he felt pain. I suspect that by doing this he so damaged his nerves that eventually he could no longer use his feet and had to stay in bed. (Guhrauer 1842 [1966: vol 2, p.336]; quoted in Mates 1989: 29)

Although such pain is a “perfection” and thus a real property, for Leibniz, it still involves a kind of weakness or imperfection in the person who has it, and so God cannot, in the end, exemplify this “perfection”. Rather, God’s possession of maximal pleasure is somehow sufficient to ground the “reality” that is found in both pleasure and pain (Leibniz 1677 [1969: 177]). This seems fishy, and other philosophers argue against Leibniz that if pain is a real property (rather than a mere absence), then God as the “ground of all reality” must indeed exemplify it. Some recent theologians and philosophers even welcome this idea, arguing that a conception of God as grounding empirical evil by suffering it has advantages for projects in theodicy (Hartshorne 1984; Wolterstorff 1988).

Mental illnesses can be classified as “empirical evils” if we assume that they have empirical causes and neural bases (Bhattacharjee 2018). Such illness often generates further empirical evil in the form of inexplicably cruel or destructive behavior to self and others, as will be familiar to anyone who has tried to live (or love someone) with mental illnesses like posttraumatic stress disorder (PTSD), borderline personality disorder, schizophrenia, and so on. It is unclear whether the theologians just mentioned would want to say that this kind of empirical evil, too, must have its ground in the divine by way of exemplification. The theological consequences of such a suggestion seem unattractive, to say the least.

4. Origins of Evil: Moral and Natural

4.1 Moral Evil

Moral evil is metaphysical or empirical evil that arises out of the acts or intentions of agents: other traditional terms for it include “sin”, “wickedness”, “trespass”, and “iniquity”.

Philosophers in the Abrahamic tradition typically hold that we can be damaged by moral evil even before we have performed any actions whatsoever. Augustine, for example, characterizes Original Sin as a result of a primordial choice that damaged our very nature such that each member of the species is born already worthy of infinite punishment and strongly inclined to engage in further moral evil. So this is a case of metaphysical evil that has its origin in moral evil: bad choices on the part of the forefather led to damaged natures all the way down the spermatic line.

Such metaphysical evil will often manifest in empirical evil (although it need not do so); it also makes it likely that there will be further metaphysical evil. Thus an initial moral choice starts off a kind of snowballing into hellishness. It is clear why ancient and medieval and even some contemporary responses to the “Unde Malum?” question focus on how a morally uncorrupted creature (Adam, Eve, or Lucifer) could have started the process in the first place (see, e.g., Anselm De Casu Diaboli, vol.1 and Johnston forthcoming).

Kant appropriates this idea in a modern context, arguing that we are all originally afflicted by a propensity to moral evil (Hang zum Bösen), even apart from any specific actions that we perform. This “radical evil”—the metaphysical evil at the root of our nature (“radix” = Latin for “root”)—is something for which not Adam but we as individual agents (or perhaps the species itself) are somehow responsible. And this is reflected even in garden-variety peccadillos: any act that subordinates commitment to the moral law to something else is an expression of radical evil. This makes it clear that people who use “radical evil” to refer to something particularly horrendous or awful (Arendt 1951, Bernstein 2002) are departing from the Kantian concept (see Section 7 below). That said, whether it is intelligible to say that we are culpable for a status that is not temporal is a notoriously open question in Kant-interpretation (see Card 2010, Wood 2010, and other essays in Anderson-Gold & Muchnik 2010).

Although moral evildoing often leads to empirical evil, it needn’t do so, at least on non-utilitarian accounts. Some crimes can be “victimless” at the empirical level.

Once again, the four traditional theoretical templates can be used to further characterize the evil acts and intentions that make an evil “moral”. Absence Theory says that the absence of a good will—either because something lacks a will altogether, or because its will is not good—is evil just by way of being an absence. Privation Theory says that a will is evil when it ought not have the absence of good orientation that it does. Matter Theory says that our embodiment and other engagements with matter explain the misorientation of our will. Real Property Theory insists that a will that is oriented to the bad is a real thing, and that its orientation to the bad is a real feature of it, not just a privation.

Declaring that moral evil is rooted in the will does not fully explain it. We would need a further account of how evil choices are made—of what sort of moral psychology could explain them. For Kant, explanation ceases at some point; evil choices, at bottom, are irrational—surds that we can identify and impute, but never fully explain. “There is no conceivable ground for us, therefore, from which moral evil could first have come in us” (Kant 1793 [AK 6:43; 1998: 64]).

Other philosophers offer partial explanations. Augustine says that although there is no determining cause of the devil’s choice, it is able to be partly “rationalized” in terms of Satan’s self-obsessed delight in his own powers (see King 2019). This is an early version of what is now called a “dispositional” account of evil agency (L. Russell 2014: ch.10; Kamtekar 2019). Early Islamic interpreters of the Qu’ran, by contrast, offer explanations in terms of ignorance: there is something that the supremely evil agent (Iblis) didn’t realize, or an inference that he failed to make, and this is what explains his orientation to the bad (see Germann 2019).

Moral evil is what contemporary people—including philosophers—tend to have in mind when they talk of “evil”. Extreme forms of it are viewed by many philosophers view as “unintelligible”—as defying ordinary explanation in significant and threatening ways. Such extreme and unintelligible moral evils are what many philosophers (though not Kant) are referring to when they speak of “radical” evil (Arendt 1951; L. Russell 2014; see also Section 7).

4.2 Natural Evil

Natural evil refers to metaphysical and/or empirical evils whose origins are “natural”—i.e., grounded in the natures of things and/or the natural laws. The very nature of a horse makes it incapable of language: if that incapacity is a metaphysical evil (as it would be on Absence Theory), then given its origin it also counts as a natural rather than a moral evil. Likewise, cancer, pandemics, earthquakes, meteor strikes, aging and perhaps even death itself are (typically) regarded as natural rather than moral evils. In the tradition there are characterizations of natural evil that use one or more of the four templates discussed earlier: Absence, Privation, malfunctions in Matter, or some other Real Property.

Outside of religious contexts, however, many philosophers (and people generally) will be reluctant to characterize hurricanes, diseases, and meteor strikes as a source of “evil”. The very idea of natural evil seems most at home in theological debates: can the Author of Nature be supremely good, wise, and powerful and yet still create a world that contains so much pain and suffering, not to mention Category Five hurricanes, animal predation, and Alzheimer’s Disease?

There are different kinds of responses to the problem of natural evil in theological traditions: Aesthetic responses say that we don’t presently have the right perspective to see the overall beauty of the natural system, and thus that there really is no natural evil; Soul-making responses say that this present vale of natural evil is justified because it gives us the chance to become virtuous; Skeptical theistic responses say that given our limited faculties we cannot reasonably expect to understand why God would allow natural evils. (For more on these responses see M. Adams 1998, Tooley 2002 [2019]).

A very different kind of response involves recharacterizing at least some natural evils as moral evils. For instance, we might focus on ways in which human activity has set in motion the kinds of environmental, climatic, microbial, and biospheric changes that lead to “natural” disasters, pandemics, famines, and other empirical evils. Or, in a more religious context, we might seek to explain the suffering and misery caused by “nature” by appeal to sin, karmic law, or divine justice.

On some versions of this view, the morally responsible agent can be someone other than the victim: Adam sins, and now the non-human “creation has been growning” (Romans 8:22, NRSV)—and makes the rest of us groan along with it. Or: we emit the greenhouse gasses, and our descendants three generations later suffer.

Other versions insist that the fault lies with the victim of natural evil himself: Eliphaz the Temanite says to Job

Think now, who that was innocent ever perished?
Or where were the upright cut off?
As I have seen, those who plow iniquity
and sow trouble reap the same.
By the breath of God they perish,
and by the blast of his anger they are consumed.
The roar of the lion, the voice of the fierce lion,
and the teeth of the young lions are broken.
(Job 4: 7–10, NRSV)

Eliphaz suggests that if Job continues to suffer, then there must be some explanation for these natural evils in Job’s own past behavior. The risk in this kind of doctrine will be obvious to less ancient sensibilities: to suggest that a victim of natural evil must be morally responsible for it seems like the very definition of adding insult to injury.

Another way to recharacterize natural evil as moral evil is by appealing to the actions of moral agents who are neither divine nor human. This appears to have been Augustine’s position in places; more recently, it has been invoked by Alvin Plantinga as an at least broadly logically possible scenario which could be used in a “defense” against the logical problem of evil (Tooley 2002 [2019]). The scenario says that

[n]atural evil is due to the free actions of nonhuman persons; there is a balance of good over evil with respect to the actions of these nonhuman persons; and it was not within the power of God to create a world that contains a more favorable balance of good over evil with respect to the actions of the nonhuman persons it contains. (Plantinga 1989: 58)

A final way to recharacterize natural evil as moral would simply be to hold God alone morally blameworthy for it, since God created a world in which sentient creatures suffer so terribly. Obviously this would not be a winning strategy if the goal is a successful theodicy. Indeed, some theistic traditions block this route a priori by saying that it is conceptually impossible for God to do wrong: a perfect creator is either unbound by moral principles, or essentially incapable of violating them (see Murphy 2017).

If these efforts to locate a moral basis for natural evil (whether empirical or metaphysical) are unsuccessful, then “natural” remains a distinct category of evil’s origin.

Here again is our Table of Evils, now with more examples that go beyond Nietzsche’s horse case:

Origins: Natural Moral Spooky non-agential
Metaphysical The finitude and other limitations that are essential to an individual or species-nature and that are ultimately based in facts about natures. The finitude, limitations, and corruption that are essential to an individual or species-nature and the result of damage to natures, which damage is ultimately based in facts about immoral acts and intentions (e.g., Original Sin) The finitude, limitations, and corruption that are essential to an individual or species-nature and are ultimately based in facts about a dark force or shadow-side principle in reality.
Empirical Pain, suffering, and illness (including mental) whose ultimate explanation consists in causal facts (e.g., aging, accidents, genetic defects, disasters and other natural phenomena). Pain, suffering, and illness (including mental) whose ultimate explanation consists in facts about immoral acts and intentions (e.g., interpersonal violence, social ills, self-harm) Pain, suffering, and illness (including mental) whose ultimate explanation consists in facts about a dark force or shadow-side principle in reality.

Figure 2. The Table of Evils, with general examples

Some types of evil do not seem to fit nicely in the Table of Evils. The three dealt with in what follows are systemic evil, symbolic evil, and radical evil. The nature and the origins of such evils are difficult to discern, and may require an expansion of the Table.

5. Systemic Evil

Systemic evil is the kind of evil that exists at the level of systems or groups rather than merely at the level of individuals. Organized structures like governments, corporations, teams, and religious institutions can be evil in this way; so can more loosely-organized systems such as “Academia”, “White Supremacy”, and “Wall Street”. Indeed, Google includes the motto “Don’t Be Evil” in its Company Code of Conduct (for the origins of this, see Chang 2019); disgruntled employees later sued the company alleging that it had violated that pledge (Allyn 2021).

Systemic evil seems empirical rather than metaphysical, but its origins are difficult to identify. It does not appear to be a merely natural phenomenon, or a spooky non-agential one, and yet its supra-agential character makes it seem not entirely moral either.

Hannah Arendt’s early work on totalitarianism (1951) depicts systemic evil as a kind of empirical evil for which no individual or even collection of individuals is fully responsible. The cogs in the machine, as well as the leader or leadership, may be the origin of some of the harms involved, but the evil of the whole structure (on Arendt’s view) is somehow greater than the sum produced by its parts.

Racism is another prominent example of systemic evil. Recent accounts of entrenched racist structures in certain societies (the United States, for instance) suggest that such evil has its origin not merely in actions and intentions but also in omissions and passivity: people who do not explicitly support the systemic evil can count as agents of it. If this is right, then active work against the evil in question—“anti-racist” activity rather than “non-racist” activity, for example—becomes morally required (Kendi 2019). But even such active opposition efforts may not be sufficient to avoid complicity in systemic evil: some theorists argue that even anti-racist people living in racist societies are “tainted” by its evil all the same (Rothstein 2017). That leads to the next kind of problem case.

6. Symbolic Evil

Symbolic value is a less familiar idea in philosophy than it is in Anthropology, Religious Studies, and the other social sciences that deal with production, exchange, and consumption. The main idea is that an object or act can have far more “symbolic” value to a certain individual than its exchange or monetary value on some market or other, typically because of its causal history. That bauble given to you by a now-deceased friend has far more symbolic value (to you, at least) than the monetary or exchange value that it would fetch at auction. This is because the gift had its origin in the generosity of a friend who has since died, has the ability to invoke his memory, and so on.

Symbolic disvalue works in an analogous way. Products that fetch a certain monetary value on an open market may have significant symbolic disvalue that is not reflected in their price. This disvalue often arises, again, from the product’s provenance: an industrial chicken sandwich is a result of the obscene degradation of animals, workers, and the environment on the part of an industry that pays revolving-door lobbyists to promote food policy that, in turn, keeps production costs and prices artificially low, in part by externalizing most of the harms it causes. In some cases, such disvalue may be significant enough to make purchasing the product wrong, even if doing so does not lead, causally, to any actual harm or rights-infringement (see Chignell 2016).

The term “evil” is typically only applied in cases of symbolic disvalue when there is something excessive about them. Stepping on a flag or consuming a chicken sandwich might have some symbolic disvalue, but it would be strange to say that these are cases of symbolic evil. Having anything to do with soap made from the body fat of people murdered at the Stutthof concentration camp, by contrast, seems downright evil, even if the intended consequences (i.e., getting oneself clean) are good. Indeed, the symbolic evil attached to such a product may “touch” everyone who was part of the society that permitted its manufacture, whether they were directly involved or not. The evil of sustained chattel slavery may have a similar sort of symbolic power, even generations later.

Both the nature and the origins of symbolic evil are hard to characterize; thus it is hard to see where it fits in the Table of Evils. Is there a metaphysical aspect to symbolic evil, or is it fully empirical? Is its origin entirely natural, or moral, or is there something spooky and non-agential about it? A related set of difficulties has to do with the fact that, in some contexts anyway, the transfer of symbolic disvalue operates via the complex logic of “taint”, contagion, or uncleanness. Some philosophers who write about symbolic value argue that the only way to avoid being “touched” by such evil is via active and explicit dissociation—a symbolic “standing with the good” (R. Adams 1999). In other words, even if our abstinence does not make a difference, we must symbolically oppose an evil practice by, say, explicitly signaling opposition and (where possible) refusing to consume or benefit from its results (see Hill 1983; Appiah 1986).

7. Radical Evil: Four Conceptions

Kant is the source of “radical evil”, but his way of using the term is now out of favor. In fact, most people writing on this issue use the term in a precisely non-Kantian way to refer to something spectacularly excessive—an act or event whose badness is deeper and more mysterious than the badness of ordinary states or activities (Bernstein 2002).

In her famous account of the trial of Adolf Eichmann in Jerusalem, Arendt (1963) promoted the idea that even the worst evils can be “banal” and bureaucratical. A decade earlier, however, she conceived of “radical evil” quite differently. In a March 1951 letter to Karl Jaspers she wrote:

We know that the greatest evils or radical evil has nothing to do anymore with humanly understandable, sinful motives. What radical evil is I don’t know, but it seems to me to somehow have to do with the following phenomenon: making human beings as human beings superfluous. (Arendt & Jaspers 1992: 166, emphasis added)

Arendt went on in the letter to insist that “making human beings as human beings superfluous” is not the same as treating them as “mere means to an end”. She thus rejected the Kantian view that radical evil—no matter how benign or awful the effects—has its root (Latin: radix) in the willful violation of the categorical imperative by individual free agents (see Louden 2010: 98).

Jaspers’s view of radical evil, by contrast, was consistently non-exotic and Kantian: “there is evil because there is freedom. It is only possible for the will alone to be evil” (Jaspers 1947 [1958: 532], emphasis added). According to one commentator, this focus on human freedom as the root of all evil is “significant and commendable”:

Kant [and following him Jaspers] refuses to cater to our prurient craving for a special account that applies especially to the most extreme cases of evil…. He fears that occupying our imaginations with extreme cases of evil may be merely a way of indulging some of our nastier human traits—rationalizing our resentment and vindictiveness by supplying it with an object that would seem to justify it. (Wood 2010: 157)

The concerns expressed in these passages are common in discussions of the nature and origins of evil. Call them Jaspersian concerns for short. They are second-order concerns about how we should conceive and speak of evil, especially when calling it “radical”. The concerns fall into two broad kinds: (1) concerns about exoticizing wrongdoing with excess-locutions like “evil” and “radical”; and (2) concerns about tainting people and things that are touched by such evil, beyond the straightforward condemnation of the perpetrators (for more on such concerns, see Card 2002, Cole 2006, and Calder 2013 [2018]).

The Kantian conception of radical evil is considered in the next sub-section. Sections 7.2–7.4 survey three other conceptions and look at how each might raise Jaspersian concerns.

7.1 Radical Evil as Violation of the Moral Law

Kant argues in Religion within the Bounds of Reason Alone (1793) that free choices against the moral law are unintelligible in the sense that they are irrational; our propensity to make them is thus an inexplicable mystery at the “root” (radix) of our moral psychology. The post-Kantian idealist F.W. J. Schelling, picking up the refrain, rejects the Privation Theory of radical evil in favor of the view that it has its origin in the positive, irrational decision to prefer self-advantage over the moral law, though “just how the decision for good or evil comes to pass in the individual, that is still wrapped in total darkness” (Schelling 1809 [1936: 59]).

On the Kantian view of radical evil, then, there is a normative sense in which it is “unintelligible”: it is an irrational propensity and thus cannot be “understood” in the sense that it cannot be sanctioned by proper reason. Likewise, an immoral choice cannot be fully explained: full explanations appeal to good reasons, and there are no good reasons for wrongdoing.

There is a broader sense of “understand” or “explain”, however, in which such evil is no mystery at all: it is the most depressingly familiar thing in the world. Everyday immoral agents presumably see what they are doing under the aspect of some good or other—good for their company, good for their bonuses, good for their reelection efforts—even if they also know that what they are doing is ultimately wrong. If we interpret the war cry of Milton’s Satan—“Evil be thou my good!” (1667, Paradise Lost, Bk IV, line 110)—as implying that he is taking evil under the guise of the good, then it is not absurd. But it is still not wholly intelligible, either.

The Kantian conception of radical evil, then, says that that the unintelligibility of wrongdoing does not prevent us from assigning blame, holding perpetrators responsible, and refusing to taint the innocent. This explains why Jaspers found the conception so attractive:

To rank the will to happiness, which dominates among men’s motives, above the unconditioned law that shows itself in reason—that is the root of evil, the “propensity” which Kant calls “radical evil”. (Jaspers 1962: 321)

7.2. Radical Evil as Choosing Evil for its own Sake

Some philosophers, and more than a few novelists and screenwriters, find the view that agents are always choosing under “the guise of the good” as inadequate to the psychology of extreme malevolence. It may have suited the melioristic conceptions of the Enlightenment, but the well-publicized, mechanized horrors of the recent past allegedly demand a bleaker picture of perpetrator psychology. Serial killers, murderous dictators, torturers, derivatives traders: the idea is that at least some of these malign actors see their own actions as atrocious—as making the world worse rather than better on the whole (and sometimes worse for themselves)—and yet still choose to perform them. They are thus not saying “Evil be thou my good”, at least on the interpretation just offered. Rather, they are self-consciously male-volent: they will the bad under the aspect of the bad. And yet they are not insane—this is what makes their actions especially difficult for the rest of us to understand. This is a second common way in which the term “radical evil” is used. (See Pauer-Studer and Velleman 2015 for a reading of Milton according to which Satan’s war cry is interpreted in this way.)

Augustine reports in his Confessions that during the pears incident he took pleasure in

the theft and sin itself.… Behold, now, let me heart tell Thee what it was seeking there, that I should be gratuitously wanton, having no inducement to evil but the evil itself. It was foul, and I loved it … I loved my own error – not that for which I erred, but the error itself. (Confessions Bk 2, Chap. IV, paragraph 9 [1876: 30])

It is tempting to say that in “loving the sin itself”, Augustine was in some sense taking it to be good. But he at least gestures here at this second conception of radical evil: some acts can be performed under the aspect of their own abject deformation and rottenness—as ultimately bad even for the agent himself.

As we have seen, the Prussian philosopher who coined the term “radical evil” 1400 years later did not think that it can involve choosing evil for its own sake. In fact, Kant argues that such a “diabolical” conception of evil is incoherent or at least psychologically inapplicable to human beings. Kant’s skepticism, however, did not prevent Dostoyevsky from composing Notes from the Underground (1864) as an extended and somewhat plausible portrait of one man’s effort to choose evil qua evil. And there are more recent accounts of people who confess—in private diaries or braggadocios depositions—that they did what they did because it was evil.

In this context, consider (if you can bear it) Stone 2009’s portraits of the worst serial killers: although some perpetrators report that they take what they are doing to be good—ridding the world of “garbage women”, giving someone his “just deserts”, correctly following the orders of the voices in their head, and so on—others openly admit that what they are doing is bad, wrong, evil, despicable, and so on. In such cases, the perpetrators are not making a series of unsound inferences, or mistaking the bad for the good. Rather, they seem to be engaged in a self-conscious turning away from anything that could be regarded as good by anyone. Radical evil on this conception is sometimes described as a self-conscious turning away from being itself (Eagleton 2009: 16; L. Russell 2014: 23).

If Augustine’s confessions about the pears—or these more spectacular recent confessions—are accurate, then there may be (contra Kant) a baffling diabolical state that some people can fall into, and that the rest of us cannot entirely fathom. The unintelligibility here thus threatens to raise Jaspersian concerns about exoticization and taint.

7.3. Radical Evil as Repudiation of the Moral Law

A third conception of “radical evil” takes the term to refer to acts or practices (like slavery and genocide) that do not merely violate rational principles but also constitute an effort to repudiate moral rationality altogether, or at least to transcend it. When we steal or lie, there is a sense in which we might be failing to treat others with the respect that they deserve. And as we have seen, Kant does not hesitate to view such irrational choices as stemming from our propensity to “radical evil”. But radical evil on this third conception is different: it involves an intentional refusal to acknowledge that some group of persons has any moral standing at all—the kind of moral standing that would prohibit us from instigating or complying with their humiliation, degradation, or extinction.

Radical evil of this sort, in other words, denies the universal scope—and thus, perhaps, the very existence—of the moral sphere altogether. It is anti-rational rather than merely irrational: this is what threatens to make it incomprehensible or inexplicable in a unique way. This is also presumably what the early Arendt means when she says that radical evil involves making human beings “superfluous”.

By way of analogy: suppose that ordinary moral wrongdoing is like making a bad move in chess, or like cheating by moving one’s pieces in an illegal way when one’s opponent isn’t looking. A radically evil act on the present conception, by contrast, would be like crushing all of the opponent’s pieces and upending the table. The player who does the latter is no longer or perhaps never was a player: she cannot explain her behavior by saying that she was trying to win by making what turned out to be a bad move or a cheat. She cannot explain her behavior in terms of chess at all. Likewise, a radically evil act is supposed to transcend the terms of moral rationality.

The analogy extends only so far, however. That’s because there are still some reasonable explanations left to our non-player—explanations external to the game:

I was hungry, so I crushed all of your pieces and swept them off the board in the hopes that you would suggest lunch.

By contrast, it is not obvious how there can be any credible reason given for doing something that constitutes a denial of reason altogether. That is why radical evil in the repudiative sense threatens to be uniquely unintelligible and troubling. If someone—not a beast or a machine, but a human being—acts in a way that entirely disclaims not just an awareness of moral authority but also the basic rules of moral reason altogether, he effectively places himself in an antelapsarian state, unburdened with the knowledge of good and evil. His act asserts that he has transcended entirely the moral sphere—that what he does cannot be wrong.

Can human beings really perpetrate radical evil in this sense? Richard Ramirez, the “Night Stalker” serial killer in 1980’s Los Angeles, certainly took himself to be doing so. He repeatedly snuck into people’s houses to rape and kill them, sometimes cutting off body parts and taking them with him. After his fourteenth murder, he was caught and then boasted to his captors:

You don’t understand me… you are not capable of it. I am beyond good and evil…I love to kill people. I love to watch them die. I would shoot them in the head and they would wiggle and squirm… I love all that blood. (quoted in Stone 2009: 208).

This idea—that a human being could do something that would enact his own transcendence of moral norms, make other persons superfluous, and establish his own status as somehow “beyond good and evil”—is what concerned Karl Jaspers, and what he was hoping Arendt would resist. In her face-to-face confrontation with the quotidian, bureaucratic evil of Adolf Eichmann, she seems to have changed her mind (though see Cesarani 2007 and Margalit 2019 for a portrait of Eichmann that resists her famous “banality thesis”). But even if Arendt ultimately repudiated the repudiative conception of radical evil, others remain sympathetic to some version of it (e.g., Bernstein 2002 and Motzkin 2019).

7.4. Radical Evil as Systemic Evil: Human Beings Made Superfluous in Another Way

“Systemic” or “structural” evil exists at the level of groups, networks, races, and collectives rather than merely at the level of individuals (see section 5). The fourth conception of “radical evil” applies the concept to particularly rampant or entrenched evils of the systemic sort.

Although Arendt’s interest was in totalitarian state systems, contemporary philosophers are equally interested in non-state but still super-human systems: corporations, collectives, markets, artificial intelligences. These are now some of the most potent sources of value and disvalue at work in the world. As noted in section 5, the nature of systemic evil is empirical, but its origin is more difficult to grasp. Corporations have boardrooms and executive suites, and are even treated as persons by some legal systems, but (as investigation after investigation indicates) it is hard to find the heart of their darkness when assigning responsibility. Still-powerful systems of white supremacy are based in structures of which no individual human mind was or is fully aware (Rothstein 2017). Likewise, markets, algorithms, blockchains, and various forms of artificial intelligence arise out of innumerable individual human efforts, but are also designed to make human beings superfluous in a literal and unprecedented way. Some of this is and will be for the good—there are already fewer back-broken menial laborers in the fields or exhaust-guzzling toll collectors on the highways. But some will surely be for the bad, and in ways that are not foreseeable. Radical systemic evil—especially in a technological age—does not seem natural or spooky, but it does not seem fully moral either.

In sum: although natural, moral, and spooky non-agential conceptions of the origins of evil were the focus of most traditional discussions of the origins of evil, it looks like some varieties of radical evil have a different origin altogether—one that is not entirely intelligible. This raises Jaspersian concerns: a world in which (non-Kantian) radical evils are widespread is one in which ascriptions of moral responsibility are increasingly difficult to make.


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Other Internet Resources


The author wishes to thank participants in a workshop at the Princeton Project in Philosophy and Religion, as well as Brendan Kolb and an anonymous referee, for helpful comments on an earlier draft. Thanks also to Oxford University Press for permission to incorporate some passages from Chignell 2019a and 2019b into this entry.

Copyright © 2021 by
Andrew Chignell <>

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