Questions about faith have inspired centuries of philosophical and theological reflection, particularly, though by no means exclusively, as faith is understood within the Christian branch of the Abrahamic religions. What is faith? What makes faith reasonable or unreasonable, valuable or disvaluable, morally permissible or impermissible, virtuous or vicious? How does faith relate to psychological states such as belief, desire, trust, and hope? How does faith relate to action? To what extent is faith under our voluntary control? Because answers to these further questions depend on what faith is, as well as on assumptions about relevant evaluative norms and the philosophical psychology and theory of action applicable to faith, this entry focusses on the nature of faith, while also touching upon implications of various models of faith for assessments of its reasonableness and value.
‘Faith’ is a broad term, appearing in locutions that point to a range of different phenomena. We speak of ‘having faith that you will succeed, despite setbacks,’ ‘having faith in democracy,’ ‘putting faith in God,’ ‘believing that God exists by faith,’ ‘being a person of faith,’ ‘professing and keeping the faith (or losing it),’ ‘keeping (or failing to keep) faith with someone’, and so on. At its most general ‘faith’ means much the same as ‘trust’. Uses of ‘faith’ and ‘faithfulness’ closely parallel ‘trust’ and ‘trustworthiness’ and these are often used interchangeably. Yet one of the striking and intriguing facts about theorizing in this area (the study of faith, faithfulness, and related phenomena), is that people have offered radically different accounts of what faith is—to such an extent that there remains disagreement even about the basic ontological category to which faith belongs. Is it a psychological state and, if so, is it cognitive, affective/evaluative, or perhaps some combination of both? Is it an act or disposition to act—or is there at least some sort of connection to action essential to faith and, if so, to what sorts of acts?
This entry will focus on religious faith as paradigmatic—or, rather, it will focus on the kind of faith exemplified in theistic faith (i.e., faith in God, faith that God exists, and commitment to a theistic interpretation of reality), while leaving open whether faith of that same general kind also belongs to other, non-theistic, religious contexts, or to contexts not usually thought of as religious at all. The question of faith outside of a theistic context, such as whether it is apt to speak of the faith of a humanist, or even an atheist, using the same general sense of ‘faith’ as applies to the theist case, is taken up in the final Section (11).
Philosophical reflection on theistic religious faith has produced markedly different accounts or models of its nature. This entry organizes discussion of accounts or models of faith around key components that feature in such accounts—with varying emphases, and with varying views about how these components relate to one another. These components are the cognitive, the affective, the evaluative, and the practical (volitional, actional and behavioural). Models of faith may also be usefully categorized according to further principles, including
- how the model relates faith as a state to the actional components associated with faith;
- whether the model takes the object of faith to be exclusively propositional (e.g., faith that such and such) or not (e.g., faith in persons or ideals);
- the type of epistemology with which the model is associated—whether it is broadly ‘internalist’ or ‘externalist’, ‘evidentialist’ or ‘fideist’;
- whether the model is necessarily restricted to theistic religious faith, or may extend beyond it.
The entry proceeds dialectically, with later sections presupposing the earlier discussion. The section headings are as follows:
- 1. Models of faith and their key components
- 2. The affective component of faith
- 3. Faith as knowledge
- 4. Faith and reason: the epistemology of faith
- 5. Faith as belief
- 6. Faith as an act of trust
- 7. Faith as doxastic venture
- 8. Venturing faith, without belief
- 9. Faith and hope
- 10. Faith as a virtue
- 11. Faith beyond (orthodox) theism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
While philosophical reflection on faith of the kind exemplified in religious contexts might ideally hope to yield an agreed definition in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions that articulate the nature of faith, the present discussion proceeds by identifying key components that recur in different accounts of religious faith. It also aims to identify a focal range of issues on which different stances are taken by different accounts. There is a plurality of existing philosophical understandings or models of faith of the religious kind. This discussion therefore aims to set out dialectically an organisation of this plurality, while also giving indications of the reasons there may be for preferring particular models over others. Since ‘religion’ itself may well be a ‘family resemblance’ universal, essentialism about faith of the religious kind might be misplaced. Nevertheless, the concept of faith as found in the Abrahamic, theist, religious traditions is widely regarded as unified enough for an inquiry into its nature to make sense, even if a successful real definition is too much to expect (this kind of faith might conceivably be a conceptual primitive, for example).
Note that some philosophers approach the target of religious faith by first classifying and analysing ordinary language uses of the term ‘faith’ and locutions in which that term occurs. See, for recent examples, Audi 2011 (Chapter 3, Section I), who identifies seven different kinds of faith, and Howard-Snyder (2013b), who attempts a general analysis of ‘propositional’ faith—i.e., faith that p is true, where p is a relevant proposition. The present discussion, however, deals directly with the target notion of the kind of faith exemplified in religious faith, assuming the background of a working grasp of the notion as deployed in religious forms of life, and specifically in those belonging to the theist traditions. Insights from the analysis of faith understood more broadly may, nevertheless, be important in constructing models of faith of the religious kind, as will emerge below in the discussion of religious faith as a kind of trust (Section 6).
The notion of religious faith as the possession of a whole people is familiar, and arguably theologically primary in the theist traditions. Philosophical accounts of theistic faith typically focus, however, on what it is for an individual person to ‘have faith’ or be ‘a person of faith’. An initial broad distinction is between thinking of faith just as a person’s state when that person ‘has faith’, and thinking of it as also involving a person’s act, action or activity. Faith may be a state one is in, or comes to be in; it may also essentially involve something one does. An adequate account of faith, perhaps, needs to encompass both. In the Christian context, faith is understood both as a gift of God and also as requiring a human response of assent and trust, so that their faith is something with respect to which people are both receptive and active.
There is, however, some tension in understanding faith both as a gift to be received and as essentially involving a venture to be willed and enacted. A philosophical account of faith may be expected to illuminate this apparent paradox. One principle for classifying models of faith is according to the extent to which they recognise an active component in faith itself, and the way they identify that active component and its relation to faith’s other components. It is helpful to consider the components of faith (variously recognised and emphasised in different models of faith) as falling into three broad categories: the affective, the cognitive and the practical. There are also evaluative components in faith—these may appear as implicated in the affective and/or the cognitive components, according to one’s preferred meta-theory of value.
One component of faith is a certain kind of affective psychological state—namely, having a feeling of assurance or trust. Some philosophers hold that faith is to be identified simply with such a state: see, for example, Clegg (1979, 229) who suggests that this may have been Wittgenstein’s understanding. Faith in this sense—as one’s overall ‘default’ affective attitude on life—provides a valuable foundation for flourishing: its loss is recognised as the psychic calamity of ‘losing one’s faith’. But if foundational existential assurance is to feature in a model of faith of the kind exemplified by theists, more needs to be added about the kind of assurance involved. The assurance of theistic faith is essentially a kind of confidence: it is essentially faith in God. In general, faith of the kind exemplified by theistic faith must have some intentional object. It may thus be argued that an adequate model of this kind of faith cannot reduce to something purely affective: some broadly cognitive component is also required. (For an account that takes faith to be fundamentally affective, while allowing that it might also involve cognitive aspects, see Kvanvig 2013.)
What kind of cognitive component belongs to faith, then? One possibility is that it is a kind of knowledge, but there is then a question about the kind of knowledge that it is: e.g., is it knowledge ‘by acquaintance’, or ‘propositional’ knowledge ‘by description’, or both? One type of model of faith as knowledge identifies faith as propositional knowledge of specific truths, revealed by God. A model of this type has received prominent recent defence in the work of Alvin Plantinga, who proposes an account which he regards as following in the tradition of the reformers, principally John Calvin (see Plantinga 2000, 168–86). Calvin defines faith thus: ‘a firm and certain knowledge of God’s benevolence towards us, founded upon the truth of the freely given promise in Christ, both revealed to our minds and sealed upon our hearts through the Holy Spirit’ (John Calvin, Institutes III, ii, 7, 551, quoted by Plantinga (2000, 244)).
Appeal to a special cognitive faculty
‘Reformed’ epistemologists have appealed to an externalist epistemology in order to maintain that theistic belief may be justified even though its truth is no more than basically evident to the believer—that is, its truth is not rationally inferable from other, more basic, beliefs, but is found to be immediately evident in the believer’s experience (see Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983, Alston 1991, Plantinga 2000). On Plantinga’s version, (basic) theistic beliefs count as knowledge because they are produced by the operation of a special cognitive faculty whose functional design fits it for the purpose of generating true beliefs about God. Plantinga calls this the sensus divinitatis, using a term of Calvin’s. (For discussion of the extent to which Plantinga’s use of this term conforms to Calvin’s own usage see Jeffreys 1997 and Helm 1998.) This quasi-perceptual faculty meets functional criteria as a mechanism that, when functioning in the right conditions, confers ‘warrant’ (where warrant is whatever must be added to true belief to yield knowledge) and, granted theism’s truth, it probably yields ‘basic’ knowledge because God designs it just for that purpose. In defence of specifically Christian belief, Plantinga argues that the same warrant-conferring status belongs to the operation of the Holy Spirit in making the great truths of the Gospel directly known to the believer.
The welcome certainty of faith
This appeal to a God-given ‘higher’ cognitive faculty is found (in the early 12th Century) in al-Ghazâlî’s Deliverance from Error, where it provides the key to the ‘Sufi’ resolution of his religious crisis and his sceptical doubts about the deliverances of sense perception and unassisted human reason. Faith is thus understood as a kind of basic knowledge attended by a certainty that excludes doubt. But faith will not be exclusively cognitive, if, as in Calvin’s definition, faith-knowledge is not only ‘revealed to our minds’ but also ‘sealed upon our hearts’. For, on this model, faith will also have an affective/evaluative component that includes a welcoming of the knowledge received.
Practical aspects of faith on this model
This model of faith as a kind of knowledge, certain and welcome, exhibits faith as essentially something to be received, something delivered by the proper functioning of a special cognitive faculty. Nevertheless, the model may admit a practical component, since an active response is required for reception of the divine gift. Such a practical component is implied by the real possibility that faith may be resisted: indeed, Christians may hold that in our sinful state we will inevitably offer a resistance to faith that may be overcome only by God’s grace. It is, however, a further step for persons of faith to put their revealed knowledge into practice by trusting their lives to God and seeking to obey his will. On this ‘special knowledge’ model of faith, however, this activity counts as ‘acting out’ one’s faith rather than as a part of faith itself. Persons of faith thus act ‘in’, ‘through’ or ‘by’ faith: but, on this model, their faith itself is the welcomed revealed knowledge on which they act.
Models of faith as knowledge may be thought lacking because they admit no actional component in faith itself. Faith seems essentially to involve some kind of active venture in commitment and trust, even if talk of a ‘leap of faith’ may not be wholly apt. Many have held that faith ventures beyond what is ordinarily known or justifiably held true, in the sense that faith involves accepting what cannot be established as true through the proper exercise of our naturally endowed human cognitive faculties. As Kant famously reports, in the Preface to the Second Edition of his Critique of Pure Reason: ‘I have … found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith’ (Kant 1787 [1933, 29]). Theist philosophers do, however, typically defend the claim that faith is not ‘contrary to reason’. On models of faith that take a cognitive component as central, and construe faith’s object as propositional, reasonable faith therefore seems subject to a general evidentialist principle—‘a wise man ... proportions his belief to the evidence’, as Hume puts it (Hume 1748 , “Of Miracles”, 80). And W. K. Clifford elevates evidentialism to the status of an absolute moral requirement, affirming that ‘it is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything upon insufficient evidence’ (Clifford 1877 [1999, 77]. Faith’s venturesomeness may thus seem in tension with its reasonableness, and models of faith differ in the way they negotiate this tension in response to evidentialist challenges. Another way to classify models of faith, then, is in terms of their associated epistemology—and, in particular, whether and according to what norms of ‘evidential support’, they accept that faith’s cognitive component needs to meet a requirement to be grounded on available evidence.
The Reformed epistemologist model of faith as ‘basic’ knowledge (outlined in Section 3) generates an epistemology under which, although ordinary cognitive faculties and sources of evidence do not yield firm and certain inferred knowledge of theistic truths, there is (if Christian theism is true) a ‘higher’ cognitive faculty that neatly makes up the deficit. This model seems thus to secure the rationality of faith: if faith consists in beliefs that have the status of knowledge, faith can hardly fail to be rational. And, once the deliverances of the special cognitive faculty are included amongst the believer’s basic experiential evidence, an evidential requirement on reasonable belief seems to be met. (Note that Plantinga originally expressed his defence of ‘properly basic’ theistic belief in terms of the rationality of believing in God ‘without any evidence or argument at all’ (Plantinga 1983, 17). He does respect an evidential requirement, however, holding that it may be fully met through what is basically, non-inferentially, evident in the believer’s experience. Hence Plantinga’s insistence that his Reformed epistemology is not fideistic (Plantinga 2000, 263).)
Reflective faith and the question of entitlement
It is not clear, however, whether Reformed epistemology’s model of faith can achieve all that is needed to show that theist faith is reasonable. From the perspective of reflective persons of faith (or would-be faith), the question of entitlement arises: are they rationally, epistemically—even, morally—entitled to adopt or continue in their faith? This question will be existentially important, since faith will not be of the kind exemplified by religious faith unless its commitments make a significant difference to how one lives one’s life. Reflective believers, who are aware of the many options for faith and the possibility of misguided and even harmful faith-commitments, will wish to be satisfied that they are justified in their faith. The theist traditions hold a deep fear of idolatry—of giving one’s ‘ultimate concern’ (Tillich 1957 ) to an object unworthy of it. The desire to be assured of entitlement to faith is thus not merely externally imposed by commitment to philosophical critical values: it is a demand internal to the integrity of theistic faith itself. Arguably, believers must even take seriously the possibility that the God they have been worshipping is not, after all, the true God (Johnston 2009). But, for this concern to be met, there will need to be conditions sufficient for justified faith that are ‘internalist’—that is, conditions whose obtaining is, at least indirectly if not directly, accessible to believers themselves. And, as already noted, those conditions are widely assumed to include an evidentialist requirement that faith is justified only if the truth of its cognitive content is adequately supported by the available evidence.
The Reformed epistemologist model as leaving the question of entitlement unanswered
It may be argued, however, that, if the Reformed epistemologist’s model is correct, those who seek to meet an evidentialist requirement will be unable to satisfy themselves of their entitlement to their faith. Theistic truths may be directly revealed, and experienced as immediately evident, yet, on reflection, one may doubt whether such experiences are genuinely revelatory since competing ‘naturalist’ interpretations of those experiences seem available. Furthermore, there are rival sources yielding contrary claims that equally claim to be authentically revelatory. It may be true, as Plantinga’s Reformed epistemology maintains, that if God exists then certain basic theist beliefs meet externalist criteria for knowledge, even though the truth of the propositions concerned remains open to reflective ‘internalist’ doubt. On an externalist account, that is, one might lack independent evidence sufficient to confirm that one has knowledge that God exists while in fact possessing that very knowledge. One may thus refute an objector who claims that without adequate evidence one cannot possess knowledge. But this consideration is still insufficient to secure entitlement to theistic faith—if, as may be argued, that entitlement requires that one has evidence adequate to justify commitment to the truth that God exists. For, one has such evidence only conditionally on God’s existence—but it is precisely entitlement to believe that God exists that is at issue (Kenny 1992, 71; Bishop and Aijaz 2004). For a wider discussion of the possibility of religious knowledge that, inter alia, endorses the present point, see Zagzebski 2010.
If faith is not ‘firm and certain’ basic knowledge of theistic truths, then a model of faith as having a propositional object may still be retained by identifying faith with belief of relevant content—and the question whether a faith-belief may have sufficient justification to count (if true) as (non-basic) knowledge may remain open. To have theist faith might thus be identified with holding a belief with theological content—that God exists, is benevolent towards us, has a plan of salvation, etc.—where this belief is also held with sufficient firmness and conviction. Richard Swinburne labels this the ‘Thomist view’ of faith, and expresses it thus: ‘The person of religious faith is the person who has the theoretical conviction that there is a God’ (Swinburne 2005, 138). (Aquinas’s own understanding of faith is more complex than this formulation suggests, however, as will be noted shortly.)
The rationality of faith on this model will rest on the rationality of the firmly held theological beliefs in which it consists. As Swinburne notes, if such beliefs are founded on evidence that renders their truth sufficiently more probable than not, then the beliefs concerned may amount to knowledge on a contemporary ‘justified true belief’ fallibilist epistemology, even though they fall short of knowledge on Aquinas’s own criteria, which require that what is known be ‘seen’ (i.e., fully and directly comprehended) (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 4 & 5 (Aquinas 1265–1273 , 27)). In any case, the reasonableness of faith on this model of faith as (non-basic) theological belief depends on the beliefs concerned being adequately evidentially justified. The claim that this condition is satisfied is defended by John Locke in The Reasonableness of Christianity (1695 ), and, in contemporary philosophy, by Richard Swinburne’s Bayesian approach to the epistemology of Christian belief (see, for example, Swinburne 2003).
Some argue, however, that the truth of theism is ‘evidentially ambiguous’—that is, that our total available evidence is equally viably interpreted from both a theist and a naturalist/atheist perspective (Hick 1966 and 1989; Davis 1978; Penelhum 1995; McKim 2001). This thesis of evidential ambiguity may be supported as the best explanation of the diversity of belief on religious matters, and/or of the persistence of the debate about theism, with philosophers of equal acumen and integrity engaged on either side. Or the ambiguity may be considered systematic—for example, on the grounds that both natural theological and natural atheological arguments fail because they are deeply circular, resting on implicit assumptions acceptable only to those already thinking within the relevant perspective. (In relation to Swinburne’s Bayesian natural theology, in particular, this objection surfaces in criticism of assumptions about how to set the prior probabilities implicated in calculations of, for example, theism’s probability on the evidence of the ‘fine-tuning’ of the Universe’s basic physical constants, or of the probability, on all our evidence, of the truth of the Resurrection.) If the ambiguity thesis is correct, then—assuming evidentialism—firmly held theistic belief will fail to be reasonable.
On this model of faith as non-basic belief, all that characterizes faith apart from its theological content is the firmness or conviction with which faith-propositions are held true. Firm belief in the truth of a scientific theoretical proposition, for example, fails to count as faith only through lacking the right kind of content. This model therefore shares with the Reformed epistemologist model in taking its theological content as essential to what makes theistic faith faith, and so rejects the suggestion that faith of the same sort as found in the theist religious traditions might also be found elsewhere.
Furthermore, in taking faith to consist in non-basic belief that theological propositions are true, this model invites the assumption that theological convictions belong in the same category of factual claims as scientific theoretical hypotheses with which they accordingly compete. That assumption will lead those who think that theological claims are not reasonably accepted on the evidence to regard faith as worthless and intellectually dishonourable—at best, ‘a degenerating research programme’ (Lakatos 1970). (On this negative assessment of faith’s evidential support, persons of faith come perilously close to the schoolboy’s definition mentioned by William James: ‘Faith is when you believe something that you know ain’t true’ (James 1896 [1956, 29]). Or, if persons who have theistic faith readily abandon theological explanations whenever competing scientific ones succeed, their God gets reduced to ‘the God of the gaps’.) These misgivings about the model of faith as firmly held factual theological belief dissolve, of course, if success attends the project of showing that particular theological claims count as factual hypotheses well supported by the total available evidence. Those who doubt that this condition is or can be met may, however, look towards a model of faith that understands faith’s cognitive content as playing some other role than that of an explanatory hypothesis of the same kind as a scientific explanatory hypothesis.
Aquinas’s account of faith
Though firmly held theological belief is central to it, Aquinas’s understanding of faith is more complicated and nuanced than the view that faith is ‘the theoretical conviction that God exists’. Aquinas holds that faith is ‘midway between knowledge and opinion’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 2 (Aquinas , 11)). Faith resembles knowledge, Aquinas thinks, in so far as faith carries conviction. But that conviction is not well described as ‘theoretical’, if that description suggests that faith has a solely propositional object. For Aquinas, faith denotes the believer’s fundamental orientation towards the divine. So ‘from the perspective of the reality believed in’, Aquinas says, ‘the object of faith is something non-composite’ (hence, definitely not propositional)—namely God himself. Nevertheless, grasping the truth of propositions is essential to faith, because ‘from the perspective of the one believing … the object of faith is something composite in the form of a proposition’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 2 (Aquinas , 11 & 13), our emphases).
A further problem with describing as Thomist a model of faith simply as firm belief that certain theological propositions are true is that Aquinas takes as central an act of ‘inner assent’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 2, 1 (Aquinas , 59–65)). This is problematic because, (i) in its dominant contemporary technical usage belief is taken to be a mental (intentional) state—a propositional attitude, namely, the attitude towards the relevant proposition that it is true; (ii) belief in this contemporary sense is widely agreed not to be under volitional control—not directly, anyway; yet (iii) Aquinas holds that the assent given in faith is under the control of the will. Aquinas need not, however, be construed as accepting ‘believing at will’, since assent may be construed as an act that has to be elicited yet terminates a process that is subject to the will—a process of inquiry, deliberation or pondering that involves mental actions, or, in the case of theist faith, a process of divine grace that can proceed only if it is not blocked by the will.
Most importantly, however, Aquinas says that assent is given to the propositional articles of faith because their truth is revealed by God, and on the authority of the putative source of this revelation. Terence Penelhum puts it like this: ‘Thomas tells us that although what one assents to in faith includes many items not ostensibly about God himself, one assents to them, in faith, because they are revealed by God … It is because they come from him and because they lead to him that the will disposes the intellect to accept them’ (Penelhum 1989, 122: see Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 1 & 2 (Aquinas , 5–15)). So, Aquinas’s model of faith is of believing (assenting to) propositional truth-claims on the basis of testimony carrying divine authority. John Locke follows the same model: ‘Faith … is the assent to any proposition … upon the credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication’ (Locke 1698 [1924, 355]; compare also Alston 1996, 15).
The unanswered question of entitlement—again
Theist faith as assent to truths on the basis of an authoritative source of divine revelation is possible, though, only for those who already believe that God exists and is revealed through the relevant sources. Might such faith, then, have to rest on a prior faith—faith that God exists and that this is God’s messenger or vehicle of communication? Those foundational claims, it might be maintained, are held true on the grounds of adequately supporting evidence, such as putatively provided by arguments of natural theology and the claimed evidence for miraculous endorsement of a prophet’s authority. Theist faith might then have a purely rational foundation. But this could hardly be so for every person of faith, since not everyone who believes will have access to the relevant evidence or be able to assess it properly. Besides, and more importantly, although Aquinas allows that rational assessment of the available evidence may lead a person to faith, he does not think that such an assessment could ever elicit assent itself—only demonstration could achieve that and so high a level of proof is not here available (see Aquinas , footnote 2b, 58–9). Aquinas’s view is thus that all believers stand in need of God’s grace: ‘the assent of faith, which is its principal act … has as its cause God, moving us inwardly through grace’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae 6, 1 (Aquinas , 167)). It follows, then, that, on Aquinas’s view, believing that God exists and is revealed in specific ways is itself a matter of faith, and not a purely rationally evidentially secured prolegomenon to it.
Aquinas’s model of faith thus shares with the Reformed epistemologist model the problem that it leaves unanswered the reflective believer’s concern about entitlement. Attempting to settle that concern by meeting the evidential requirement leads to circularity: theological truths are to be accepted on divine authority, yet the truth that there is such an authority (historically mediated as the relevant tradition maintains) is amongst those very truths that are to be accepted on divine authority—indeed, it is the crucial one. As Descartes puts it in the Dedication to his Meditations, ‘It is of course quite true that we must believe in the existence of God because it is a doctrine of Holy Scripture, and conversely, that we must believe Holy Scripture because it comes from God. … But this argument cannot be put to unbelievers because they would judge it to be circular’ (Descartes 1641 [Cottingham et al. 1984, 3]). Thus, although they differ on the question whether the firm beliefs of faith count as knowledge, both Aquinas and Calvin understand faith as essentially involving accepting the truth of propositions as revealed through willingly receiving God’s gracious gift of that very revelation. The question remains how accepting this gift could be epistemically rational. The externalist account of how Christian beliefs may have epistemic worth proposed in Plantinga’s model of faith (named ‘the A/C’ model because its sources are supposedly found in Aquinas as well as Calvin) offers some help with the required explanation, but (as noted in the final paragraph of Section 4 above) may arguably not by itself be sufficient.
Revelation—and its philosophical critique
The reasonableness of belief that God exists is a focal issue in the Philosophy of Religion. Theist traditions typically, or some would say essentially, make a foundational claim about an authoritative source, or sources, of revealed truth. What is salient includes belief or some related sort of affirmation, not just that God exists but associated content such as that this God exists, the God who is revealed thus and so (in great historical acts, in prophets, in scriptures, in wisdom handed down, etc.). The reasonableness of theism is therefore as much a matter of the reasonableness of an epistemology of revelation as it is of a metaphysics of perfect being. The question of how God may be expected to make himself known has gained prominence through recent discussion of the argument for atheism from ‘divine hiddenness’ (Schellenberg 1993; Howard-Snyder and Moser 2002). That argument holds that a loving God would make his existence clear to the non-resistant—but this claim is open to question. Perhaps God provides only ‘secret’ evidence of his existence, purposely overturning the expectations of our ‘cognitive idolatry’ in order to transform our egocentric self-reliance (Moser 2008); besides, there may be significant constraints logically inherent in the very possibility of unambiguous divine revelation to finite minds (King 2008).
Similarly, accounts of theistic faith will be open to critique when they make assumptions about the mechanisms of revelation. In particular, the model of faith as assent to propositions as revealed holds that, since God’s grace is required for that assent, when grace is effective the whole ‘package deal’ of propositional revealed truth is accepted. This yields the notion of ‘the Faith’, as the body of theological truths to be accepted by ‘the faithful’, and it becomes a sign of resistance to divine grace to ‘pick and choose’ only some truths, as heretics do (Greek: hairesis, choice; see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 5, 3 (Aquinas , 157–61)). For heresy to be judged, however, some human authority must assume it possesses the full doctrinal revelation, with God’s grace operating without resistance in its own case. Whether that assumption can ever be sufficiently well founded to justify condemning and purging others is an important question, whose neglect may be seriously harmful, as we are reminded by the fact that the phrase for ‘act of faith’ in Portuguese—auto-da-fé—came to mean the public burning of a heretic.
But the deeper assumption made by this model of faith as non-basic (justified) belief (as, too, by the model of it as basic knowledge yielded by the proper functioning of a special cognitive faculty) is that God’s self-revelation is primarily the revelation of the truth of propositions articulated in human language (compare Swinburne 1992). Alternative understandings of revelation are available, however. In particular, it may be held that it is primarily the divine itself that is revealed—the reality, not merely a representation of it. Propositional articulations of what is revealed may still be essential, but they need to be accepted as at a remove from the object of revelation itself, and therefore as limited. The development of propositional articulations expressing the nature and will of the self-revealing God—the doctrines of ‘the Faith’—will, of course, be understood as a process under providential grace. It is often assumed that that process can achieve ‘closure’ in a completed set of infallibly known creedal propositions. But this assumption about how divine inspiration operates may be contested, both on the theological grounds that it reflects the all-too-human desire to gain control over God’s self-revelation (to ‘pin God down once and for all’), and on the wider epistemological grounds that any attempt to grasp independent reality in human language will be in principle limited and fallible, subject to revision in the light of future experience.
Not all models of faith, however, identify it as primarily a matter of knowing or believing a proposition or a set of them, even with the addition of some affective or evaluative component. What is most central to theistic faith may seem better expressed as believing in God, rather than as believing that God exists. The Christian Nicene creed begins ‘Credo in unum Deum …’ and it is arguable that in this context ‘belief in’ is neither merely an idiomatic variant on, nor reducible to, ‘belief that’ (Price 1965). It may thus be held that theists’ acceptance of propositional truths as divinely revealed rests on believing in God—and it is this ‘believing in’, or ‘having faith in’, which is, fundamentally, the nature of faith. Noting that, while faith is held to be a virtue, believing as such is not, Wilfred Cantwell Smith argues that ‘faith is not belief’, ‘but something of a quite different order’ (Smith 1979, 128), requiring ‘assent’ ‘in the dynamic and personal sense of rallying to [what one takes to be the truth] with delight and engagement’ (142). Arguably, to put or to maintain faith in God involves a readiness to act, perhaps by relying on God in relevant ways and/or grounded in a practical commitment. Our considerations now shift, then, from propositional-attitude-focussed models of faith to those focussed on action, or what J. L. Schellenberg calls ‘operational’ models (2005, 126).
Judeo-Christian scripture envisions humans as actively engaged in a covenantal relationship with God. Their ongoing participation in, and commitment to, such a relationship paradigmatically involves both faith in God and faithfulness to God (McKaughan and Howard-Snyder 2021; Pace and McKaughan 2020). The kind of faith of which Christian faith is a paradigm case, then, may be understood as ‘action-centred commitment’ (McKaughan 2016, 78), e.g., to the Christian ‘way’. Arguably, faith understood as a combination of affective and cognitive elements would miss its essential active component. We now turn, then, to consider a fiducial model—a model of faith as trust, understood not simply as an affective state but as an action.
On a fiducial model, having faith in God is making a practical commitment—the kind involved in trusting God, or, trusting in God. (The root meaning of the Greek pistis, ‘faith’, is ‘trust’ (see Morgan 2015).) On such a model, faith’s active, practical component takes central place, though a cognitive component may be presupposed by it. Swinburne calls it the ‘Lutheran’ model, and defines it thus: ‘the person of faith does not merely believe that there is a God (and believe certain propositions about him)—he trusts Him and commits himself to Him’ (2005, 142). Yet, as noted earlier, Aquinas too takes the ultimate object of faith to be God, ‘the first reality’, and, furthermore, understands ‘formed’ faith as trusting commitment to God, motivated by, and directed towards, love of God as one’s true end (see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 4, 3; Aquinas , 123–7). It is true that Aquinas allows that the devils have faith in a certain sense, but this ‘faith’ amounts only to their belief that what the Church teaches is the truth, arrived at not by grace but ‘forced from them’ reluctantly by ‘the acumen of their natural intelligence’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 5, 2; Aquinas , 155 & 157). Aquinas’s account of ‘saving’ faith is thus also a fiducial model.
The venture of trust
As noted at the outset, there is a usage of ‘faith’ for which ‘having/placing faith in’ is (near enough) synonymous with ‘trusting’ or ‘trusting in’. If, moreover, faith of the religious kind is itself a type of trust, then we may expect our understanding of religious faith to profit from an analysis of trust in general. It is therefore worth considering what follows about the nature of faith of the sort exemplified in theistic faith from holding it to be a kind of active trust.
Conceptually fundamental to trust is the notion of a person (or persons)—the truster—trusting in some agent or agency—the trustee—for some (assumedly) favourable outcome (though what the trustee is trusted for is often only implicit in the context). Trust involves a venture; so too—it is widely agreed—does faith. So, if faith is trust, the venture of faith might be presumed to be the type of venture implicated in trust. A venture is an action that places the agent and outcomes of concern to the agent significantly beyond the agent’s own control. Trust implies venture. When we trust we commit ourselves to another’s control, accepting—and, when necessary, co-operating as ‘patient’—with the decisions of the trustee. Venturing in trust is usually assumed to be essentially risky, making oneself vulnerable to adverse outcomes or betrayal. Swinburne makes the point this way: ‘To trust someone is to act on the assumption that she will do for you what she knows that you want or need, when the evidence gives some reason for supposing that she may not and where there will be bad consequences if the assumption is false’ (2005, 143). Annette Baier makes no requirement for evidence that the trustee may prove untrustworthy, but nevertheless takes trust to involve ‘accepted vulnerability to another’s possible but not expected ill will (or lack of good will) toward one’ (Baier 1986, 235, our emphasis). Accordingly, it seems sensible to hold that one should trust only with good reason. But if, as is plausible, good reason to trust requires sufficient evidence of the trustee’s trustworthiness, reasonable trust appears both to have its venturesomeness diminished and, at the same time, to become more difficult to achieve than we normally suppose. For we often lack adequate—or even, any—evidence of a trustee’s trustworthiness in advance of our venture, yet in many such cases we suppose that our trust is reasonable (see, for example, Adams 1987). But, if adequate evidence of trustworthiness is not required for reasonable trust, how is reasonable trust different from ‘blind’ trust?
The answer seems clear: reasonable trust is practically rational trust. The question of when one may rationally trust another may thus be resolved by a decision-theoretic calculation, factoring in the extent to which one’s evidence supports the potential trustee’s trustworthiness and the utilities of the possible outcomes, given one’s intended aims. The exercise of practical reasoning does include mental acts which are epistemically evaluable, however. When one takes it to be true in practical reasoning that someone will prove trustworthy, that mental act may be more or less epistemically rational: it would break the evidentialist norm to employ in a decision-theoretic calculation a credence that does not match one’s available evidence. In many situations, it will be practically rational, given one’s intentions, to trust another person only if one believes, or, at least, believes with high probability, that the person will prove trustworthy. In such situations it is also often the case, as already noted, that we don’t have adequate evidence in advance that this person will be trustworthy in this particular respect. Yet, affording high credence to a person’s trustworthiness may still be epistemically rational given wider available evidence of, for example, the person’s past friendliness and trustworthiness in other matters, or, if the person is a stranger, of our shared social experience that trusting others generally elicits a trustworthy response. Nevertheless, it can still be rational—practically rational, that is—to trust another when we don’t have adequate evidence that they will prove trustworthy. In a life-threatening situation, for example, it may be rational to trust unlikely rescuers if they are the only ones available. Or, when we have wider aims, it may be practically rational to trust those without a record of trustworthiness, as with ‘educative’ and ‘therapeutic’ trust where people are trusted for the sake of their development or rehabilitation as trustworthy persons. Being in established relationships of friendship with others, too, can also require commitment to continue to trust them even in the face of evidence that, otherwise, would make it reasonable to believe them unworthy of trust.
On models that take faith of the theist kind to consist fundamentally in an act of trust, the analogy with interpersonal trust is suggestive. When one person trusts another there seems typically (though not uniformly) to be a doxastic aspect (the truster’s belief that the trustee is trustworthy). But what’s essential is the fiducial aspect, which consists in an active commitment or ‘entrusting’ to the other. Paul Helm proposes that theist faith similarly has importantly distinct doxastic and fiducial aspects: in addition to belief about God’s existence and trustworthiness for salvation held with a degree of strength proportional to the believer’s evidence, persons of faith must also entrust themselves to the one on whom they rely (Helm 2000). While it is widely agreed that theist faith must have a cognitive aspect, some philosophers hold that this need not be doxastic (as we shall see in Section 8).
There are significant differences, however, between the trusting involved in theistic faith and that involved in interpersonal trust. For one thing, trusting would seem not to risk any possibility of disappointment if God really is the trustee. Given the existence of the God of unchanging love, one trusts in ultimately perfect safety. But the venture of actually entrusting oneself to God seems to begin with the challenge of being able to believe or accept that, indeed, there is such a God. While some affirm that this claim is a matter of basic knowledge, and some that there is sufficient evidence to justify it, others, as already noted, hold that everyone has to confront the evidential ambiguity of foundational theistic claims. For those who reject the model of theist faith as basic knowledge and also think that the question of God’s existence cannot be settled intellectually on the basis of the available evidence, the venture involved in trusting in God (if such there be) may seem to include a doxastic venture: those who trust already venture beyond the available evidence, in their very believing or accepting that God exists and may be relied on for salvation. Trusting in God seems to presuppose, in other words, trusting that God exists. But, if so, the question becomes pressing whether, and under what conditions, one may be entitled to such an evidence-transcending venture in practical commitment to a particular view of ultimate reality and its implications for how we should live.
One way to relieve this pressure is to offer a non-realist analysis of theological claims. Trusting God will then not entail any commitment to reality’s being a certain way. Rather, on arguably the most sophisticated kind of non-realist view, theological beliefs arise because living ‘trustingly’ comes to be expressed and reinforced through a culturally constructed fiction about God and his great saving acts. This existential confidence may then be described, using the language of the fiction, as ‘trusting God’ (Cupitt 1980, Geering 1994). On such a non-realist account, the model of faith as trust brackets the cognitive component of faith, and risks becoming, in effect, a model of faith as purely a certain kind of affective state. But, in any case, non-realist models will be rejected by those who take faith to have a cognitive component that functions as a grasping—or would-be grasping—of how things really are.
Defending doxastic venture by analogy with interpersonal trust?
Assuming, then, that theist faith does include (under realist assumptions) a venture in practical commitment to truth-claims about ultimate reality, the justifiability of such a venture might yet be thought defensible by analogy with interpersonal situations where practical commitment seems justifiably to be made beyond one’s evidence to the claim that a person will prove trustworthy in some relevant respect. Reflecting on that proposal discloses further points of disanalogy, however. In cases of interpersonal trust, a venture is often needed in initially taking the trustee to be trustworthy, but evidence will inevitably later emerge which will either confirm or disconfirm the truth of that claim, and trust may, and rationally should, be withdrawn if the news is bad. But if—as we are here assuming—one ventures beyond evidential support in taking it to be true in practical reasoning that God exists and may be trusted for salvation, this may be a venture that is not confined to initial commitment but rather persists in needing to be made. This will be the case on accounts of the evidential ambiguity of theism that take the ambiguity to hold in principle, ruling out any possibility of evidential disambiguation. Those accounts may grant, of course, that continuing to journey in theistic faith may psychologically reinforce one’s commitment, providing subjective confirmation that the theist view of reality is correct. Yet these reinforcing experiences, which often involve faith renewed in the face of apparent failures of divine love, do not possess the uncontroversial status of evidence that independently and inter-subjectively confirms the initial venture.
Doxastic venture without doxastic voluntarism
Many dismiss the idea that one may venture in one’s very believing that God exists as committing a category error: ventures are voluntary, but propositional belief is not directly under voluntary control. Trusting God, however, entails practical commitment to the truth of theological faith-propositions, and commitment to the truth of a proposition in one’s practical reasoning may be under direct voluntary control.
It is one thing to be in the mental state of holding that the proposition that p is true; it is another to take it to be true that p in one’s practical reasoning (although these typically go together, since to hold that p is true is to be disposed to take it to be true that p in practical reasoning whenever the question whether p becomes salient). Practical commitment to a faith-proposition’s truth therefore could be a venture: there is no category error in allowing this possibility. Doxastic venturing—venturing in believing—is thus not a matter of willing oneself to believe without adequate evidential support; rather it is a matter of taking an already held belief to be true in one’s practical reasoning even though (as one may oneself recognise) its truth lacks such support.
The psychological possibility of doxastic venture
Some philosophers have argued, however, that one cannot (in full reflective awareness, anyway) believe that p while accepting that one has insufficient evidence for p’s truth (Adler 2002). The counterclaim that this is possible is defended by William James, in his controversial 1896 lecture, ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896 ). James agrees that belief cannot be directly willed and must be otherwise causally evoked (he later came to wish that he had used ‘The Right to Believe’ as his lecture’s title). James observes, however, that many beliefs have causes that do not constitute or imply an evidential grounding of their truth. James labels such causes ‘passional’—again, a potentially misleading term, since its intended referents include much more than emotional causes of belief. In particular, beliefs may be caused by ‘the circumpressure of one’s caste or set,’ of which one’s inherited religious tradition is a paradigm case (James 1896 [1956, 9]). James is thus able to explain the psychological possibility of doxastic venture: one already has a ‘passionally’ caused belief, which one then takes to be true in practical reasoning despite its lack of adequate evidential grounding (compare Creel 1994, who similarly describes ‘faith’ as a ‘non-evidential doxastic passion’).
Note that a doxastic venture model of theistic faith reconciles faith as gift with faith’s active components: taking a faith-proposition to be true in practical reasoning is a basic (mental) action (which leads on to further actions involved in trusting God and seeking to do God’s will); the gift provides the motivational resources for this basic action, namely a firm belief in the truth of the faith-proposition, despite its lack of adequate evidential support. (In the next section, the possibility is considered that the gift of these motivational resources might be effective yet not amount to actual belief.) It is also worth noting that those who find the focus on the individual something of a deficiency in analytical accounts of faith (Eklund 2015) may perceive in James’ account some acknowledgment of the social aspect of faith. Arguably, the standard ‘passional’ or ‘non-evidential’ cause of religious belief is cultural immersion within an historical faith-tradition. The motivational resources for faith-commitment may thus be an essentially social possession.
Examples of doxastic venture models
On the doxastic venture model, faith involves full practical commitment to a faith-proposition’s truth, despite the recognition that this is not ‘objectively’ justified on the evidence. Kierkegaard’s definition of faith as ‘an objective uncertainty held fast in an appropriation process of the most passionate inwardness’ in Concluding Unscientific Postscript (Kierkegaard 1846 [1968, 180]) is an example of a doxastic venture model. So too is Paul Tillich’s account of faith as ‘the state of being ultimately concerned’, since the claim of the object of one’s ultimate concern to ‘promise total fulfilment even if all other claims have to be subjected to it or rejected in its name’ cannot in principle be established on the basis of the evidence (Tillich 1957 [2001, 1 and 21]).
Aquinas’s model of faith, though widely thought of as conforming to an evidential requirement on belief, may arguably be open to interpretation as a doxastic venture model. As noted in Section 5, Aquinas holds that the available evidence, though it supports the truth of foundational faith-propositions, does not provide what Aquinas counts as sufficient (i.e., demonstrative) support to justify inner assent (in addition to references to the Summa Theologiae given previously, see 2a2ae. 2, 1 (Aquinas , 63); and compare also Penelhum 1989, 120). Now, whether practical commitment to the truth of a given faith-proposition does or does not venture beyond adequate evidential support will be relative to assumptions about (a) where the level of evidential support required for ‘adequacy’ should be set, and (b) just how firm and decisive propositional faith-commitment needs to be. On some such assumptions, for example those made by Bayesians, the support provided by the evidence Aquinas adduces—or, by a suitable contemporary upgrading of that evidence such as that provided in the works of Richard Swinburne—may be considered enough to make reasonable a sufficiently high degree of belief (or credence) in the truth of theistic faith-propositions so that believers need not venture beyond the support of their evidence. Interpreting Aquinas’s model of faith as conforming to evidentialism may thus be viable. Nevertheless, Aquinas’s own assumptions on these matters may leave him closer to Kierkegaard and Tillich than is commonly thought (consider Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 4, 1 and, once again, 2a2ae 6, 1 (Aquinas , 117–9 & 167)).
The special role of faith-propositions
Bayesians might argue that there is no occasion for faith as doxastic venture since, once practical commitment to the truth of propositions is recognised as a matter of degree, whatever the state of the available evidence relating to a given proposition, there will always (given initial credences) be a rational credence properly associated with that evidence, and hence there are no possible circumstances where ‘the evidence does not decide’, so that an evidentialist requirement can indeed apply universally. Note, however, Lara Buchak’s (2012, 2018) discussion of ways in which Bayesians might understand faith as going beyond the evidence, and her own proposal that faith-ventures essentially include an additional practical commitment, which may be rational under certain conditions, not to inquire further into evidence relevant to the truth of the propositions concerned for the sole purpose of deciding what to do. (For critical discussion of this kind of restriction on inquiry in connection with faith commitments, see Dormandy 2018 and Howard-Snyder and McKaughan 2022a. Katherine Dormandy has recently proposed a positive defence of evidentialism in considering the question of what makes it good to form positive beliefs about those you have faith in, including God (Dormandy 2022).)
If the domain of faith is, as Stephen Evans puts it, ‘the assumptions, convictions and attitudes which the believer brings to the evidence for and against religious truth’ (Evans 1985, 178), and faith’s cognitive component offers a ‘total interpretation’ of the world of our experience (Hick 1966, 154), then (foundational) faith-propositions function as ‘highest-order framing principles’ which necessarily cannot have their truth settled by appeal to the force of a body of independent evidence (Bishop 2007a, 139–44). Taking such a faith-proposition to be true, then, is not something that comes in degrees: either one ‘buys into’ the overall worldview (foundational) faith-propositions propose, or one does not. Such a choice is existentially important, and settling it raises anxiety about exercising a responsibility that cannot—without ‘bad faith’—be transferred onto the relatively impersonal function of one’s reason, since a venture beyond any inter-subjectively rational evidential confirmation is required. The doxastic venture model may thus be regarded as capturing the spiritual challenge of faith more satisfactorily than do models that conform to evidentialism. This is because, on the doxastic venture model, faith involves a deeper surrender of self-reliant control, not only in trusting God, but in accepting at the level of practical commitment that there is a God—indeed, this God—who is to be trusted.
Doxastic venture models of faith and epistemic concern
Doxastic venture in relation to faith-propositions can be justifiable, of course, only if there are legitimate exceptions to the evidentialist requirement to take a proposition to be true just to the extent of its evidential support—and only if the legitimate exceptions include the kind of case involved in religious, theistic, faith-commitment.
A possible view of theistic faith-commitment is that it is wholly independent of the epistemic concern that cares about evidential support. On this view, faith reveals its authenticity most clearly when it takes faith-propositions to be true contrary to the weight of the evidence. This view is widely described as ‘fideist’, but ought more fairly to be called arational fideism, or, where commitment contrary to the evidence is positively favoured, irrational or counter-rational fideism. Despite its popular attribution both to the church father Tertullian and to ‘the father of existentialism’, Kierkegaard, counter-rational fideism does not seem to have been espoused by any significant theist philosophers (passages in Tertullian and Kierkegaard that appear to endorse this position may be interpreted as emphasizing that Christian faith requires accepting, not logical contradiction, but ‘contradiction’ of our ‘natural’ expectations, wholly overturned in the revelation that the power of divine love is triumphant in the Crucified One).
Serious philosophical defence of a doxastic venture model of faith thus implies a moderate version of fideism, for which epistemic concern is not overridden and for which, therefore, it is a constraint on faith-commitment that it not accept what is known, or justifiably believed on the evidence, to be false. Rather, faith commits itself only beyond, and not against, the evidence—and it does so out of epistemic concern to grasp truth on matters of vital existential importance. The thought that one may be entitled to commit to an existentially momentous truth-claim in principle undecidable on the evidence when forced to decide either to do so or not is what motivates William James’s ‘justification of faith’ in ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896 ). If such faith is to be justified, its cognitive content will (on realist assumptions) have to cohere with our best evidence-based theories about the real world. Faith may extend our scientific grasp of the real, but may not counter it. Whether the desire to grasp more truth about the real than science can supply is a noble aspiration or a dangerous delusion is at the heart of the debate about entitlement to faith on this moderate fideist doxastic venture model.
A discussion of the debate between the moderate, Jamesian, fideist and the evidentialist is beyond this entry’s scope. Still, it is worth remarking that those who think that faith understood as doxastic venture may be justified as reasonable face the challenge of providing the tools for weeding out intuitively unreasonable forms of faith. On the other side, those evidentialists who reject doxastic venture as always impermissible have to consider whether taking a stance on the nature of reality beyond anything science can even in principle confirm may not, in the end, be unavoidable, and potentially implicated in the commitments required for science itself (see Bishop 2007a, Chapters 8 and 9). For a useful recent collection of articles on the wider theme of the relation of religious faith to intellectual virtue, see Callahan and O’Connor 2014.
Some accounts allow that faith centrally involves practical commitment venturing beyond evidential support, yet do not require (or, even, permit) that the venturer actually believes the faith-proposition assumed to be true. Such accounts may be described as proposing a ‘non-doxastic’ venture model of faith. F. R. Tennant holds a view of this kind: he takes faith to be the adoption of a line of conduct not warranted by present facts, that involves experimenting with the possible or ideal, venturing into the unknown and taking the risk of disappointment and defeat. Faith is not an attempt to will something into existence but rather treating hoped for and unseen things as if they were real and then acting accordingly (Tennant 1943 [1989, 104]). Swinburne refers to this as the ‘pragmatist’ model of faith (Swinburne 2005, 147–8; Swinburne 2001, 211; compare also Golding 1990, 2003 and McKaughan 2016). The origins of Swinburne’s pragmatist model are to be found in a much earlier paper, Swinburne 1969.
William Alston (1996) suggests that faith may involve an active ‘acceptance’ rather than purely receptive belief. A clearly non-doxastic venture model results if acceptance is understood on Jonathan Cohen’s account under which to accept that p is ‘to have or adopt a policy of deeming, positing, or postulating that p—i.e. of including that proposition … among one’s premisses for deciding what to do or think in a particular context, whether or not one feels it to be true that p’ (Cohen 1992, 4, our emphasis). The firmness of faith-commitment is then just the firmness of one’s ‘resolve to use [faith-claims] as a basis for one’s thought, attitude and behaviour’ (Alston 1996, 17): there is no firm assurance of their truth. Decisive commitment in the absence of such assurance may nevertheless be possible, motivated (as Swinburne suggested in the first edition of his Faith and Reason) by the evaluative belief that ‘unless [faith-propositions are true], that which is most worthwhile is not to be had’ (Swinburne, 1981, 117). A faith venture that lacks belief in the faith-proposition to which commitment is made need not, and probably could not, lack cognitive components altogether, as this suggestion of Swinburne’s indicates.
Andrei Buckareff (2005) and J. L. Schellenberg (2005, 138–9) propose non-doxastic (or, ‘sub-doxastic’) venture models of propositional faith, with Schellenberg emphasising the positive evaluation that persons of faith make of the truth-claim to which they commit themselves. In response to Daniel Howard-Snyder (2013a) Schellenberg allows that faith may in some instances involve belief while still maintaining that ‘non-doxastic religious faith … will turn out to be a particularly important way of having religious faith as we head into the future’ (2013, 262). Bishop (2005), in response to Buckareff, also agrees that authentic faith need not always be a specifically doxastic venture. There may, then, be an emerging consensus amongst proponents of venture models that faith, at its core, consists in suitably motivated persistent practical commitment ‘beyond the evidence’ to the positively evaluated truth of foundational faith-claims which may, but need not, actually be believed to be true.
Robert Audi (2011) has also defended a non-doxastic account of faith, contrasting ‘fiducial faith’ and ‘doxastic faith’, and arguing that authentic religious faith need only amount to the former. Audi’s account is not strictly a ‘venture’ model, however, since he does not take commitment beyond the support of adequate evidence to be essential. Audi’s account suggests that religious faith is sui generis, but capable of being understood through its relations with other psychological states and actions, such as beliefs, evaluations and practical commitments. Rational assessment of religious faith, Audi thinks, must avoid treating it as implying belief, while recognising that greater confidence attaches to it than to religious hope. For another version of a non-doxastic account of faith, as a person’s ‘affective orientation or stance’, see Jonathan Kvanvig (2013, 2018). The question whether faith entails belief (even if it may not consist purely in beliefs) remains a lively focus of debate. For defence of the view that faith entails belief, see Malcolm and Scott 2016 and Mugg 2021; for criticism see Howard-Snyder 2019.
Some philosophers have suggested that the epistemological challenges faced by accounts of faith as involving belief beyond the evidence may be avoided by construing theist commitment as hope. Theist hope seems not to be mere tenacity (‘clinging to one’s hopes’) (Taylor 1961), but a more complex attitude. James Muyskens suggests, for example, that one who hopes ‘keep[s] his life open or fluid with respect to [a faith-proposition] p—where (a) neither p nor not-p is certain for him, (b) he wants p and (c) he sees p as constructively connected with his own well-being and/or concept of himself as a person’ (1979, 35). Muyskens contrasts hope with faith (understood as belief), arguing that a religion of hope is both epistemically and religiously superior to a religion of faith. But faith is not generally understood as competing with hope (Creel 1993), and some philosophers identify faith with hoping that the claims of faith are true (Pojman 1986; 2003). Hope as such is an attitude rather than an active commitment, and, as Audi observes, it contrasts with the attitude of faith at least in this respect, namely, that surprise makes little sense as a response to discovering that the object of one’s faith is indeed the case, whereas there need be nothing inappropriate in surprise at the fulfilment of one’s hopes (see Audi 2011, 74).
A more adequate model of faith as hope, then, may rather take faith to be acting in, or from, hope. Such a model then comes close to a non-doxastic venture model of faith, differing only in so far as acting from hope that God exists differs from taking this claim to be true (albeit without belief) in one’s practical reasoning, but this difference may be undetectable at the level of behavioral outcomes (see McKaughan 2013). A model of faith as acting in hope shares with the doxastic and non-doxastic venture models in rejecting the view that faith requires cognitive certainty. But one can act in hope with firmness and resilience, given a strong affective/evaluative stance, even if one lacks belief that one’s hopes will be fulfilled. Hoping that p, however, does not involve taking a stand on its being true that p, which is widely thought to be essential to faith.
The ‘venture’ models of faith (with or without belief) and the model of faith as a venture in hope all fit the view that faith is consistent with doubt, and, indeed, impossible without doubt of some kind, though they allow that persons who have faith may give firm and sustained commitment to the truth of faith-propositions in practice (for discussion of different kinds of doubt and their compatibility or incompatibility with faith and belief see Howard-Snyder 2013b, 359). The ‘certainty’ of faith on these models is more a matter of the certainty that persons of faith find themselves conferring on the foundational claims of their faith, rather than a matter of discovering in themselves a certain knowledge or intellectual conviction of the truth of these claims. It is possible, then, on these accounts of faith, to be a committed person of faith and also an ‘agnostic’ in Thomas Huxley’s original sense of someone who does not claim as knowledge the commitments he or she nevertheless makes as a foundational practical orientation to reality.
Faith is traditionally regarded as one of the ‘theological’ virtues. If a virtue is a ‘disposition of character which instantiates or promotes responsiveness to one or more basic goods’, then theistic faith qualifies since it is ‘a responsiveness to practical hope and truth’, provided theistic faith-claims are indeed true (Chappell 1996, 27). Faith will not, however, be a virtue as such, if it is accepted that faith can be misplaced or, even, ‘demonic’, directed upon a ‘false ultimate’ (Tillich 1957 [2001, 21]). To be virtuous, faith must be faith in a worthy object: it is faith in God that is the theological virtue. More generally, faith is virtuous only when it is faith to which one is entitled. An account of the conditions under which faith is permissible is thus the key to an ethics of faith.
On models of faith as a (special) kind of knowledge, or as firmly held belief, it may seem puzzling how faith could be a virtue—unless some implicit practical component emerges when such models are further explicated, or, alternatively, a case may be made for the claim that what is involuntary may nevertheless be praiseworthy, with theist faith as a case in point (Adams 1987). (For discussion of how faith might be voluntary, even if faith entails belief, or indeed is a type of belief, and belief is not under our direct voluntary control, see Rettler 2018.) Furthermore, as already suggested (Sections 4 & 5 above), models of faith as knowledge or belief fail to provide non-circular conditions sufficient for entitlement, unless the truth of faith-propositions is established by independent argument and evidence. If faith is understood as, or as essentially including, beliefs held on insufficient evidence, it is also hard to understand why Abrahamic religious traditions have valued it so highly, let alone why God might be thought to make salvation contingent on such belief (Kvanvig 2018, 106; McKaughan and Howard-Snyder 2021).
Fiducial models of faith seem more attuned to exhibiting faith as a virtue, though a defence of the trustworthiness of the one who is trusted for salvation may be required. Doxastic and non-doxastic venture models of faith can vindicate faith as a virtue, provided they provide robust entitlement conditions, to ensure that not just any ‘leap of faith’ is permissible. The Jamesian account already mentioned (Section 7) aims to meet this need. James’s own view of what suffices to justify a faith-venture arguably needs an ethical supplement: both the non-evidential motivation for the venture and its content must be morally acceptable (Bishop 2007a, 163–6).
If faith of the religious kind is to count as valuable and/or virtuous, it seems there must be a suitable degree of resilience in the commitment made (see Howard-Snyder and McKaughan 2022b for arguments that faith requires resilience; on the rationality of resilient faith see Buchak 2017 and Jackson 2021). Persons of religious faith and faithfulness both put their faith in and are faithful to the object of their commitment, though the salient kind of faithfulness may be a matter of the continual renewal of faith rather than of maintaining it unchanged (Pace and McKaughan 2020). (See Audi 2014 for a discussion of faith and faithfulness in relation to virtue. Audi defends faithfulness as, like courage, an ‘adjunctive’ virtue, and argues that being ‘a person of faith’ counts as a ‘virtue of personality’.)
Faith is only one of the Christian theological virtues, of course, the others being hope and charity (or love, agapē): St. Paul famously affirms that the greatest of these is love (I Cor. 13:13). The question thus arises how these three virtues are related. One suggestion is that faith is taking it to be true that there are grounds for the hope that love is supreme—not simply in the sense that love constitutes the ideal of the supreme good, but in the sense that living in accordance with this ideal constitutes an ultimate salvation, fulfilment or consummation that is, in reality, victorious over all that may undermine it (in a word, over evil). The supremacy of love is linked to the supremacy of the divine itself, since love is the essential nature of the divine. What is hoped for, and what faith assures us is properly hoped for, is a sharing in the divine itself, loving as God loves (see Brian Davies on Aquinas, 2002). On this understanding, reducing faith to a kind of hope (Section 9 above) would eradicate an important relation between the two—namely that people of faith take reality to be such that their hope (for salvation, the triumph of the good) is well founded, and not merely an attractive fantasy or inspiring ideal. (See Jeffrey 2017 for discussion of the moral permissibility of faith, particularly in connection with hope.)
What is the potential scope of faith? On some models, the kind of faith exemplified by theistic faith is found only there. On models which take faith to consist in knowledge or belief, faith is intrinsically linked to theological content—indeed, in the case of Christian faith, to orthodox Christian theological content, specifiable as one unified set of doctrines conveyed to receptive human minds by the operation of divine grace. The venture models, however, allow for the possibility that authentic faith may be variously realised, and be directed upon different, and mutually incompatible, intentional objects. This pluralism is an important feature of accounts of faith in the American pragmatist tradition. John Dewey strongly rejected the notion of faith as a special kind of knowledge (Dewey 1934, 20), as did William James, whose ‘justification of faith’ rests on a permissibility thesis, under which varied and conflicting faith-commitments may equally have a place in the ‘intellectual republic’ (James 1896 [1956, 30]). Charles S. Peirce, another influential American pragmatist, arguably held a non-doxastic view of faith (Pope 2018).
Both Dewey and James defend models of faith with a view to advancing the idea that authentic religious faith may be found outside what is generally supposed to be theological orthodoxy. Furthermore, they suggest that ‘un-orthodox’ faith may be more authentic than ‘orthodox’ faith. ‘The faith that is religious’, says Dewey, ‘[I should describe as] the unification of the self through allegiance to inclusive ideal ends, which imagination presents to us and to which the human will responds as worthy of controlling our desires and choices’ (1934, 33). And James: ‘Religion says essentially two things: First, she says that the best things are the more eternal things, the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word. ... [and] the second affirmation of religion is that we are better off now if we believe her first affirmation to be true’ (James 1896 [1956, 25–6]). While some of what Dewey and James say about justifiable faith may appear non-realist, in fact they both preserve the idea that religious faith aspires to grasp, beyond the evidence, vital truth about reality. For example, Dewey holds that religious belief grounds hope because it takes something to be true about the real world ‘which carr[ies] one through periods of darkness and despair to such an extent that they lose their usual depressive character’ (1934, 14–5).
A general—i.e., non-theologically specific—account of the religious kind of faith may have potential as a tool for criticising specific philosophical formulations of the content of religious faith. The conditions for permissible faith-venture may exclude faith in God under certain inadequate conceptions of who or what God is. Arguably, the ‘personal omniGod’ of much contemporary philosophy of religion is just such an inadequate conception (Bishop 2007b). An understanding of what faith is, then, may motivate radical explorations into the concept of God as held in the theistic traditions (Bishop 1998; Johnston 2009; Bishop and Perszyk 2014).
Can there be faith of the same general kind as found in theistic religious faith yet without adherence to any theistic tradition? Those who agree with F. R. Tennant that ‘faith is an outcome of the inborn propensity to self-conservation and self-betterment which is a part of human nature, and is no more a miraculously superadded endowment than is sensation or understanding’ (1943 [1989, 111]) will consider that this must be a possibility. Tennant himself suggests that ‘much of the belief which underlies knowledge’—and he has scientific knowledge in mind—‘is the outcome of faith which ventures beyond the apprehension and treatment of data to supposition, imagination and creation of ideal objects, and justifies its audacity and irrationality (in accounting them to be also real) by practical actualization’ (1943 [1989, 100]). Faith in this sense, however, may not seem quite on a par with faith of the religious kind. True, scientists must act as if their ‘ideal objects’ are real in putting their theories to the empirical test; but they will ‘account them to be also real’ only when these tests do provide confirmation in accordance with the applicable inter-subjective norms.
If faith is understood as commitment beyond independent inter-subjective evidential support to the truth of some overall interpretation of experience and reality, then all who commit themselves (with sufficient steadfastness) to such a Weltanschauung or worldview will be people of faith. Faith of this kind may be religious, and it may be religious without being theistic, of course, as in classical Buddhism or Taoism. Some have argued that faith is a human universal: Cantwell Smith, for example, describes it as ‘a planetary human characteristic [involving the] capacity to perceive, to symbolize, and live loyally and richly in terms of, a transcendent dimension to [human] life’ (1979, 140–141). There may also, arguably, be non-religious faith: for example, ‘scientific atheists’ or ‘naturalists’ may be making a faith-venture when they take there to be no more to reality than is in principle discoverable by the natural sciences. The suggestion that atheism rests on a faith-venture will, however, be resisted by those who maintain ‘the presumption of atheism’ (Flew, 1976): if atheism is rationally the default position, then adopting it requires no venture.
An atheist’s faith-venture may, in any case, seem oddly so described on the grounds that it provides no basis for practical hope or trust. Providing such a basis may plausibly be thought necessary for faith—the truth to which the venturer commits must be existentially important in this way. (Note James’s requirement that faith-commitment is permissible only for resolving a ‘genuine option’, where a genuine option has inter alia to be ‘momentous’, that is, existentially significant and pressing (James 1896 [1956, 3–4]).) Truth-claims accepted by faith of the religious kind seem essentially to be ‘saving’ truths—solutions to deep problems about the human situation. And there may thus be arguments as to which religious tradition offers the best solutions to human problems (see, for example, Yandell 1990, 1999). J. L. Schellenberg (2009) argues that the only kind of religious faith that could be justified (if any is) is a sceptical ‘ultimism’, in which one ‘assents’ to and treats as real an imaginatively grasped conception of a metaphysically, axiologically and soteriologically ultimate reality.
Some may nevertheless argue that an existentially vital faith that grounds hope can belong within a wholly secular context—that is, without counting in any recognisable sense as ‘religious’. Cantwell Smith claims, for example, that ‘the Graeco-Roman heritage … and its fecundating role in Western life [can] be seen as one of the major spiritual traditions of our world’ (1979, 139). Annette Baier suggests that ‘the secular equivalent of faith in God, which we need in morality as well as in science or knowledge acquisition, is faith in the human community and its evolving procedures – in the prospects for many-handed cognitive ambitions and moral hopes’ (Baier 1980, 133). More broadly, some maintain that a meaningful spirituality is consistent with a non-religious atheist naturalism, and include something akin to faith as essential to spirituality. For example, Robert Solomon takes spirituality to mean ‘the grand and thoughtful passions of life’, and holds that ‘a life lived in accordance with those passions’ entails choosing to see the world as ‘benign and life [as] meaningful’, with the tragic not to be denied but accepted (Solomon 2002, 6 & 51). (For further discussion of faith in secular contexts, see Preston-Roedder 2018, Tsai 2017, and Ichikawa 2020.)
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The authors thank Sophie Milne and Selwyn Fraser for research assistance on this entry, and Imran Aijaz, Robert Audi, Thomas Harvey, Daniel Howard-Snyder, Katherine Munn Dormandy, Glen Pettigrove and John Schellenberg for helpful comments on drafts.