Feminist Philosophy of Biology

First published Wed Jun 22, 2011

Practitioners of feminist philosophy of biology use gender as an analytic category to conduct philosophical investigations of the biological sciences. Feminist philosophy of biology deploys feminist philosophical methods to examine the categories of sex and gender (sex and gender will be explained below) and its focus can range from considerations of particular biological knowledge claims to considerations of foundational concepts and methodologies in biology, the philosophy of biology, and the philosophy of science. In doing so, feminist philosophers of biology often show that the philosophical investigations of a particular science are intertwined with both ethics and politics.

This entry is divided into five sections. The introductory section discusses some of the challenges of defining feminist philosophy of biology and highlights areas of commonality with non-feminist philosophy of biology. The second section explores the variety of motivations and epistemic perspectives found within feminist philosophy of biology. The third section considers, in some depth, two central examples of feminist analysis of biological research: a) sexual selection and b) sociobiology and evolutionary psychology of sex and gender. In section four I discuss feminist analyses of some foundational concepts within philosophy of biology and philosophy of science more generally, such as biological determinism and reductionism. Many of these foundational concepts are considered by both feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology. The entry concludes with a discussion of opportunities for further research in feminist philosophy of biology.

1. Introduction

Feminist philosophy of biology bears much in common with non-feminist philosophy of biology. Non-feminist philosophy of biology is highly interdisciplinary and has unclear disciplinary boundaries. Major contributors include scientists as well as philosophers. There are two general and often closely related approaches to the practice of philosophy of biology. First, philosophy of biology uses philosophical methods to address topics of central importance in the biological sciences, such as natural selection, fitness, adaptation, and the nature of genes. Second, philosophy of biology addresses central topics in the philosophy of science, such as reductionism, laws of nature, and theory change, from the perspective of the biological sciences instead of physics as is more traditional in philosophy of science. Philosophy of biology is often informed by a naturalistic approach, meaning that the work is closely tied to the actual history and practice of the science in question. It is not uncommon for philosophers of biology, at least at some point during their careers, to become significantly involved with the science itself, either in terms of conducting biological research or collaborating with biologists on research or pedagogical projects.

The boundaries of feminist philosophy of biology are similarly unclear. It is not clear whether the authors cited in this entry would primarily label themselves as philosophers of biology or science studies scholars or scientists. Not surprisingly, the two general approaches to philosophy of biology are also advanced in feminist philosophy of biology. First, many feminist philosophers of biology are concerned with biological concepts and knowledge claims regarding sex and gender (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender), as well as the influence of gender values on biological research. Sex refers to biological differences between males and females. Gender refers to the meanings that humans make of these biological differences, and the individual and social aspects of masculinity and femininity. Since it is with our bodies that we act, and since psychological and social causes can affect our bodies, there is much debate about the relationships between sex and gender. By ‘male’ and ‘female’ I am referring to the sex of human and non-human organisms and by ‘men’ and ‘women’ I am referring to the gender of humans. Feminist analysis is often performed as a control (in a sense to be explained below) to test for the unrecognized influence of gender values on the production of knowledge, in existing knowledge claims, and in the choices of research projects. These gender values can include sexism (devaluation, in practice primarily of women, based on traditional stereotypes of gender roles) and androcentrism (a focus on men or males and the neglect or exclusion of women or females). As I will explain in more detail below, feminist investigations of the relationships between gender values, and the practices and products of the biological sciences, can take place in a range of epistemological projects. Some projects focus on removing gender bias, and others focus on developing an understanding of the role of social values, including gender values, in biological research.

Second, feminist philosophy of biology considers the gendered nature of foundational concepts in biology, philosophy of biology and philosophy of science, such as reductionism (see section 4.2), determinism (see section 4.1) and the nature of objectivity (see the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science). As I will discuss below, some feminist philosophers of biology contend that gendered social values are not only intertwined with particular theories or knowledge claims, but can also support and be supported by these foundational concepts (Fehr 2004, Longino 1990). Since these concepts are of central concern in non-feminist philosophy of biology and philosophy of science more generally, there is ample opportunity for feminist and non-feminist philosophy of biology to become more closely related. There is also significant feminist work regarding scientific objectivity that is at least partially motivated by the presence and power of unacknowledged gendered assumptions, including androcentrism and sexism, in biological sciences ranging from genetics and cell biology, to sociobiology (for example Keller 1985, Longino 1990, 2002, Haraway 1989, Harding 1986).

2. Motivations, Epistemic Perspectives and Methods

2.1 Motivations

Work in feminist philosophy of biology can be motivated by a number of, often interrelated, goals including countering biological arguments supporting women's oppression, revealing and analyzing the role of gender values in the production of biological knowledge, and facilitating the production of maximally accurate accounts of female biology and gendered topics of study in the biological sciences.

The science of biology is of importance to many feminists because women's biology has been used to rationalize women's oppression. There is a wide range of biological arguments supporting the oppression of women. Take for example Edward H. Clarke's nineteenth century argument that intensive study would physically harm women by diverting energy from their uterus to their brain. He claimed that higher education would result in women with “monstrous brains and puny bodies … [and] abnormally weak digestion” (Clarke 1874, 41). This argument regarding women's inferiority has been a focus of feminist philosophy of biology (see for example Hubbard 1990). Similarly, evolutionary arguments that can provide foundational support for sexist or oppressive practices, for example, arguments for the adaptive nature of violence against women (see Palmer and Thornhill (2000) for a readable account of this research program), have drawn intensive feminist scrutiny (for example see papers in Travis 2003a). Harvard past-president Lawrence Summers was not the first or only person to use biological arguments about the different distributions of intelligence among men and women to justify the absence of women from positions of social power and from higher powered careers (Wilson 1978, Summers 2005—see the Other Internet Resources). Here also, there is a significant feminist response (Bleier 1984, Fausto-Sterling 1992, Fehr 2008).

Feminists have pointed out that much of the political power of these sorts of biological arguments arises from problematic assumptions of determinism (see section 4.1), or in other words, assumptions of a close connection between women's biology, in terms of genes, hormones, and physiology, and women's psychological attributes and social positions. The general notion is that biology, as opposed to culture, is static and fixed. As a result some contend that any political activity designed to change or improve women's condition is trying to create an ‘unnatural’ system that is doomed to fail. This position, while common in nineteenth and early twentieth century biology, can still be found in the work of some contemporary biologists, including some early and influential work in sociobiology (Wilson 1978). As a result feminists have been strongly motivated to analyze particular claims about female biology, to interrogate the assumption that genetic or biological nature implies fixity, and to reveal the wide range of interacting biological and social causes of women's phenotypes, including their psychological attributes and social positions. In section four I will discuss biological determinism in more detail.

Feminist philosophy of biology is also driven by epistemic motivations. For example, feminists such as Ruth Bleier (1984) and Anne Fausto-Sterling (1985/1992) reveal that sexist and androcentric biases can be found in the biological knowledge produced according to biological science's contemporary best practices or accepted epistemic standards. This can drive more general questions about the role that values in general, and gender values in particular, play in the production of scientific or biological knowledge (Longino 1990, 2002; Richardson 2008).

Finally, much feminist philosophy of biology is also very concerned with getting the biology right. Many feminist philosophers of biology were initially trained as scientists and are interested not just in critiquing, but also in improving the practice of science as it relates to sex and gender. Along similar lines, feminist philosophers have also documented the impact of feminism on improving the practices of the biological sciences themselves. For example, Donna Haraway's book Primate Visions (1989) documents the influence that the incorporation of feminist women in primatology had on the study of primate behavior and animal behavior more generally. Haraway shows that feminist primatologist Jeanne Altmann, instigated a quiet but powerful methodological revolution. In one of the most cited papers in the study of animal behavior, “Observational study of behavior: Sampling methods” (1974), Altmann evaluated a range of sampling methods and in doing so developed a method, focal-animal sampling, that undermined previous research generating sexist accounts of leadership and control, and enabled research on female primates and on novel topics such as mothering. Altmann, troubled by the androcentric focus in primatology and less than rigorous methodologies, brought her perspectives as a woman, a feminist, a mother, and a mathematically trained scientist to bear on improving research methods. Focal animal sampling provides an effective method for studying the social behavior of female primates and has become an important approach in animal behavior research in general. Haraway's description of Altmann's contributions to primatology and animal behavior provides an example of the positive impact of feminism and feminist scientists on the practices and products of scientific research.

Motivations to conduct research in feminist philosophy of biology include the drive to challenge biological justifications for women's oppression, interrogate the epistemic function of gender values in scientific practice, and improve the practices and products of biological research on sex and gender.

2.2 Epistemological Perspectives

Getting the biology ‘right’ can mean different things and there is a range of epistemological positions or objectives held by feminist philosophers of biology. These objectives include (1) revealing gender bias in biological accounts of sex and gender, (2) analyzing science as a social, value-laden practice and (3) exploring how the social and material situation of biologists affects knowledge production.

Bias. The largest body of work in feminist philosophy of biology concerns revealing and eliminating sexist and androcentric bias. Central and early work in the field documented the presence of assumptions of female passivity and male activity in a wide range of biological accounts of sex and gender. Examples include critique of research on sex determination (Birke 1986, Bleier 1984), fertilization (Martin 1991), human evolution (Bleier 1984, Fausto-Sterling 1985/1992, Hubbard 1990) and the discipline of primatology (Hrdy 1986, 1997, and Haraway 1989). More recently, Elisabeth Lloyd (1993, 2005) has studied biological explanations of women's orgasm. She demonstrates that these accounts often rely on two false assumptions, assumptions that involve (1) presupposing that these explanations need to be based on natural selection and (2) presupposing a tight link between women's sexuality and reproduction. Feminist research on sexist bias in biology focuses on eliminating myths of female biology that are colored by contemporary social values and facilitating the production of biological research that more accurately reveals the facts about sex and gender. In this sense a feminist perspective is seen as a sort of control, with the goal of removing gender bias, i.e., sexist and androcentric social values, from scientific research. For example, The Biology and Gender Study Group (1988, 61–62) write that,

We have come to look at feminist critique as we would any other experimental control. Whenever one performs an experiment, one sets up all the controls one can think of in order to make as certain as possible that the result obtained does not come from any other source. One asks oneself what assumptions one is making. Have I assumed the temperature to be constant? Have I assumed that the pH doesn't change over the time of the reaction? Feminist critique asks if there may be some assumptions that we haven't checked concerning gender bias. In this way feminist critique should be part of normative science. Like any control, it seeks to provide critical rigor, and to ignore this critique is to ignore a possible source of error.

The Biology and Gender Study Group (BGSG) point out that old models of sex determination simply assumed that female developmental patterns were neutral and passive, while male developmental patterns required some sort of active switch to initiate their development (1988). The BGSG refer with approval to the 1980's work of Eva Eicher and Linda Washburn, who created a developmental model that did not make the sexist assumption of female passivity and was based on genetic evidence. In this model both male and female development had passive and active components. Further, Eicher and Washburn demonstrate that although there had been significant research on testes determination, there had been practically no work on ovary determination. As a result of this androcentrism, claims about the passivity of female sexual development were made in the absence of evidence. The BGSG sees Eicher and Washburn as an example of a feminist-influenced critique of cell and molecular biology because they controlled for gender bias. This allowed them to be “open to different interpretations of one's data” and gave them “the ability to ask questions that would not have occurred within the traditional context” (68).

A focus on bias is only one of several epistemic approaches within feminist philosophy of biology. Sarah Richardson (2010), while pointing out the value of case studies of gender bias, is critical of tendencies to focus solely on revealing and removing bias. She points out that there is institutional pressure to work on bias: “within philosophy of science as a whole, the most central and widely-accepted philosophical question related to gender in science is the issue of gender bias in science.” Richardson argues that because it is customary in the philosophy of science to see good science as value neutral, analyses of bias fall clearly within a traditional philosophical approach. However, even in the face of these professional incentives, she argues that a primary or sole focus on bias is a limiting epistemic position. It is limited because it fails to take into account feminist work, in epistemology and philosophy of science, that considers how values, including gender values, not only limit but also facilitate knowledge production. Such an account complicates the traditional view that values should be identified solely in order to guard against their impact and leads to a second epistemic perspective, analyses of science as a social value-laden practice.

Science as a social value-laden practice. Helen Longino has developed an influential social account of scientific knowledge production, critical contextual empiricism (1990, 2002). Her development of this view is informed by her early work with Ruth Doell (1983) on a case study of biological models of the role of hormones in the development of sexual behavior. Longino points out that there is an inferential gap between a theory and the evidence researchers use to assess that theory. Longino argues that researchers close the gap between evidence and theories with background assumptions of which they may not be aware. Background assumptions include both epistemic and contextual values, and contextual values can include gendered social values. She argues that scientific communities maximize objectivity and justification when they (1) include members who differ from one another in terms of the background assumptions they hold and (2) take dissenting views seriously. Critical discourse among those who hold assumptions that differ from one another improves justification or objectivity because it can facilitate researchers becoming aware of and critically evaluating the background assumptions (including those that are sexist and androcentric) that inform their research practices. Communities can then decide whether or not those assumptions are acceptable given their research goals. Using examples including sex differences in human evolution, behavioral endocrinology and neurobiology, Longino demonstrates that gendered assumptions structure a range of research programs in biology. She writes “The long standing devaluation of women's voices and those of members of racial minorities means that such [racist and sexist] assumptions have been protected from critical scrutiny” (1990, 78–79). The implication is that these racist and sexist assumptions, had they received critical scrutiny, would have been deemed unacceptable.

Situated knowledge. Donna Haraway coined the term ‘situated knowledge’, this view has become very influential in academic feminism, including feminist epistemology. In her book Primate Visions (1989) she explores the ways that primatology constructs political narratives about the categories of nature, gender, and race, and the ways that those categories are integrated with particular perspectives situated in social and material locations. She also reveals the ways that feminist primatologists have turned primatology into what some call a feminist science.

In Haraway's account of situated knowledge, the knowing subject, including the biologist, is embodied, meaning that one has a particular material and social location (for example one's location can include being a woman, feminist, scientist, Anglo American, heterosexual,…). As a result Haraway argues that it is illusory to think that there is an impartial view from nowhere. Because of particularities of material and social location, the perspective(s) from which we know and the knowledge we produce are partial. According to Haraway, objectivity involves not only describing the world as faithfully as one can, but also acknowledging the particularities of one's perspective and being responsible for the partial perspective (chosen from the multitude of features of our location) that we employ. Haraway argues that there is a multitude of ways for dividing the world into objects and categories. One's perspective does not just influence one's interests, the questions one asks and the methods, theories and strategies that one uses to answer those questions; it also influences one's ontology, in terms of the objects and kinds of things that one investigates. The job of achieving objectivity then becomes one of negotiating or translating what we know across different subject locations, which can include different political, epistemic and ontological commitments.

Haraway's account of feminist primatologists shows not only that a partial (as opposed to impartial) feminist perspective was productive in terms of asking new questions, of illuminating new objects and categories of objects, and developing new theories. It also shows that what, at the time, were more mainstream perspectives were, as all viewpoints, also partial. If those more mainstream views seemed impartial, it was because those who held them had long possessed institutional and social power such that they did not need to consider the alternatives and because the discipline had previously excluded many who held different partial perspectives.

We can see situated knowledge in Jeanne Altmann's working from the perspective of a woman, a mother, and a feminist to develop methodologies that allowed for the systematic study of the often low-drama interactions among female primates and between mothers and their offspring, which were previously not salient to researchers. Another example from Primate Visions (1989) is Adrienne Zihlman's critique of associations of sexual dimorphism with, usually male, dominance. Zihlman, who is best known for her development, with Nancy Tanner, of Woman the Gatherer theory of early human evolution, consciously developed a feminist stance toward gender and science. Zihlman argued that sexual dimorphism was not a unitary phenomenon. Different species can be sexually dimorphic not only to different degrees, but in different ways, including bone length and structure, tendencies to build muscle or fat tissue, and/or canine size. These different kinds of sexual dimorphism can be related to differences in aggressive capacities and differences in foraging strategies, both of which had been associated with evolutionary accounts of gender differences. Zihlman's stance as a feminist scientist allowed her to focus on heterogeneity and complexity, which made generalizations about sexual dimorphism highly problematic and undermined associations of general sexual dimorphism with male dominance.

As discussed in this section, epistemic perspectives in feminist philosophy of biology range across work on gender bias, considerations of biology a social and value-laden practice, and Haraway's development and use of the idea of situated knowledge.

3. Feminist Analyses of Particular Areas of Biological Research

This section focuses on two areas of biological research that have received extensive feminist analysis, sexual selection theory, and sociobiology and evolutionary psychology.

3.1 Sexual Selection

Feminist interventions regarding evolutionary models of sexual selection are important for at least two reasons. First, the role of female organisms in evolution was generally neglected or misrepresented by biologists until the later part of the 20th century. Second, these models provide theoretical foundations for many biological accounts of human nature that support sexist and androcentric stereotypes, in particular accounts that portray women as passive and coy, and men as active and promiscuous.

3.1.1 What is sexual selection?

Evolution by natural selection happens when there are heritable differences among types of organisms in a population and, as a result of these differences, some types leave more offspring than others. This leads to changes in the frequencies of those different types of organisms in a population. Darwin described sexual selection in terms of “the advantage which certain individuals have over other individuals of the same sex and species, in exclusive relation to reproduction (1871, vol. 1 256). In other words, this advantage need not be one of physiological or mechanical efficiency or longevity, but rather concerns increasing reproductive potential. Darwin notes two kinds of sexual selection: male-male competition and female choice. This twofold characterization of sexual selection remains standard in current biological literature ranging from academic publications to textbooks to the popular press. Darwin writes that “the male is generally eager to pair with any female” whereas females tend to choose the most attractive partner (1859, 70; 1871, 582). Darwin considered the competition among males “for the possession of the other sex” to result in the improvement of sensory and locomotory features and the development of strong passions.

This theme is carried through in his discussion in Sexual Selection in Relation to Man, in which hunting, defense of self and community, and competition for mates result in the development of men's “observation, reason, invention and imagination.” Women obtain these traits because they inherit them from their fathers. Darwin writes that “It is, indeed, fortunate that the law of the equal transmission of characters to both sexes prevails with mammals; otherwise it is probable that man would have become as superior in mental endowment to women, as the peacock is in ornamental plumage to the peahen” (Darwin, 1871, 565). Whereas Darwin believed that male-male competition was generally thought to improve the species, female choice resulted in the development of beauty without utility: “a great number of male animals… have been rendered beautiful for beauty's sake” (Darwin 1859, 371); “the most refined beauty may serve as a charm for the female, and for no other purpose” (1871, vol. 2 92). In this view, the expensive and dangerous displays of the peacock are the result of the preference of females for males with the most beautiful display. It is worth noting that Darwin developed his notions of female choice to account for traits that seemed to be maladaptive from the perspective of natural selection alone.

Several feminist scholars, most especially Ruth Hubbard (1990), have clearly pointed out the close parallels of Darwin's account of eager males competing with one another for access to reticent and choosy females with Victorian gender values (see also, Fausto-Sterling 1985/1992). It is also noted that the activity of choice Darwin ascribed to females is caused by a female preoccupation with beauty and as such often has negative consequences for both male survival and the species itself. Nonetheless, feminists have revealed that Darwin was exceptional for theorizing that female choice had any evolutionary consequences at all. For example, as Helena Cronin (1991) points out, Darwin's contemporaries, especially Alfred Russell Wallace, (1) were skeptical that females had an aesthetic sense, (2) believed that if they did have one, it was unlikely to be stable enough to result in evolutionary change, (3) believed that female choice, if it did exist, would be swamped out by natural selection, and finally (4) believed that the excessive male displays were likely the result of the excess vigor possessed by male animals and not female choice. Darwin's theories of sexual selection and especially of female choice languished for nearly a century.

Contemporary thought regarding sexual selection is heavily influenced by the work of biologists Angus Bateman and Robert Trivers. Bateman (1948) hypothesized that variance in reproductive success would be greater among males than among females. Female reproduction is limited by the number of eggs a female produces and during a single reproductive cycle a female uses the sperm from one or a small number of copulations. According to Bateman's view, once the female has garnered the sperm needed to fertilize her eggs, she does not benefit from further mating. As a result a female ought to be picky about who she mates with and since, according to the theory, sperm is never in short supply, all females are assumed to produce about the same number of offspring. Male reproduction, on the other hand, is limited by the number of females that a male can inseminate. A male gains benefits from inseminating as many females as possible. This results in competition among males for access to females, with some males mating with many females and some males mating with few or no females. Bateman conducted an experiment with fruit flies in which he found higher variance in male reproductive success than female reproductive success.

Trivers (1972) added considerations of parental care to Bateman's argument. Trivers argues that females generally invest more than males in reproduction, not only in terms of creating large eggs, but also in the development and care of offspring. As a result, females ought to be even choosier regarding mates and become an even more limited resource for males. Again, it follows that males are motivated to mate with as many females as possible and females are motivated to resist male advances in the hope of choosing the best mate possible. This is correlated with and reinforces stereotypes of males as active, promiscuous, and competitive, and females as passive, coy, and nurturing. The rhetoric of the coy female and the promiscuous male is decreasing but is still common among many accounts of sexual selection.

Feminist philosophers of biology are deeply concerned about the wholesale application of this model of sexual selection without empirically testing its underlying assumptions and investigating the relationship between the underlying foundations of the model and cultural assumptions regarding gender. Whether or not it is intended to do so by researchers in the field, this model can offer support to current gender inequities. As Hubbard (1990, 110) points out, “from the seemingly innocent asymmetries between eggs and sperm flow such major social consequences as female fidelity, male promiscuity, women's disproportional contribution to the care of children, and the unequal distribution of labour by sex.” This model also provides a basis for arguments that rape is an evolved reproductive strategy among human males (Thornhill and Palmer 2000). And E. O. Wilson (1978, 103) proposes that because of arguments based on this model “even with identical education for men and women and equal access to all professions, men are likely to maintain disproportionate representation in political life, business, and science.”

3.1.2 Feminist interventions

The traditional theoretical perspective on sexual selection described above is an elegant model. However, it relies on several assumptions in order to be applicable to actual cases. Hrdy (1986) has described three broad categories of assumptions needed to successfully apply this model to real situations. The first assumption is that male investment in the production of offspring is small relative to female investment. Ruth Hubbard (1990) points out that the challenge here is determining the appropriate way to characterize and measure investment. Eggs are larger than sperm. So, if one simply considers gamete size, male investment is smaller. However, males do not use a microscopic eyedropper to dispense one sperm at a time. Hubbard questions whether investment ought to be measured at the level of the individual gamete. When one includes the total amount of energy and resources that are need to produce sperm and semen, the energy required to develop and maintain secondary sexual characteristics (differences between the sexes that are not directly linked to the reproductive system), the costs of male-male competition, the costs that males of many species invest in defending a territory, and the effort that the males of some species put into parental care, male costs may turn out to be higher than researchers have historically expected. These male costs may be further increased if one measures them over an individual's lifetime as opposed to a single reproductive event. It is important for researchers to justify their characterization of what counts as investment.

The second assumption is that there is greater variance in male than female reproductive success. While this is the case for many species, (for example, Bateman's fruit flies), it is an empirical matter whether or not this applies to other species. In some species, variance in female reproductive success is higher than has been assumed and in some species, variance in male reproductive success is lower than is often assumed. Hrdy (1981/1999, 1986) points out that there has been a lack of attention to ways that a female can end investment in a particular reproductive attempt, for example, female birds abandoning nests or spontaneous abortion among some species of mammals. Attention also needs to be paid to the effects of a female's physiological condition and social status on her reproductive output. Hrdy demonstrates that female primates have an impressive array of active strategies that they employ to control their own reproduction. For example, competition and systems of social alliances among female primates can lead to unexpected variance in female reproductive success. Hubbard (1990) allows that theoretically there could be greater variance in reproductive success among men than among women, but claims that generally most societies have the same number of men and women producing children and do not operate using a few “super-studs.” Hubbard points out that it remains to be demonstrated that weaker men, however one would measure this characteristic, have fewer children than powerful men and that women tend to have similar numbers of children.

The final assumption is that the only evolutionary benefit of sex for females is fertilization. As Sterelny and Griffiths (1999) report, the power of the model decreases as the gap between sex and reproduction increases. Hrdy (1986), focusing on primatology, points out that once the notion of female promiscuity and the idea that there can be more reasons for mating than simply gathering sperm from one high quality male, were considered, several new hypotheses regarding the benefits of female promiscuity emerged. Some of these hypotheses are still linked to reproduction, although the picture is more complicated than issues of female choice and male competition. For example, the diverse paternity hypothesis predicts that in unpredictable and changing environments a female's lifetime reproductive success can be improved by producing offspring with different fathers. Other hypotheses are not directly related to reproduction. Examples include the hypothesis that multiple matings and orgasms are physiologically beneficial to females and the hypothesis that females have sex with subordinate males to stop these males from leaving the social group. Hrdy writes that “all but one of these hypotheses…were arrived at by considering the world from a female's point of view” (127). She points out that when this change in perspective was happening, primarily in the 1970's, there was an increase in the proportion of women primatologists and that these women were paying attention to female primates. She doubts that it is just chance that led women scientists to look at female behaviors, writing in 1986 that “it is disconcerting to note that primatologists are beginning to find politically motivated females and nurturing males at roughly the same time that a woman runs for vice president of the United States and Garry Trudeau starts to poke fun at ‘caring males’ in his cartoons (137).”

More recent research on sexual selection has embraced a wider range of perspectives. In particular there is a growing body of feminist research on topics such as male mate choice, female-female competition, and the active female role in evolutionary reproductive conflicts between the sexes (see Hrdy 1999 and Gowaty 1992, 1997, 2004). Joan Roughgarden offers an alternative to sexual selection, social selection theory, that focuses on the direct ecological benefits of social behavior, including animal mating behavior (2004, 2009). These ecological benefits refer to the ways that social interactions can improve the number of offspring that an individual can raise. This theory can account for the empirical evidence that has been used to support sexual selection. It does not treat same sex sexuality as anomalous because these social interactions can provide ecological benefits that support reproductive success. This theory is the subject of lively debate. Sexual selection theory is an active field of research, in which there is lots of opportunity for further feminist analyses.

3.2 Sociobiology and Evolutionary Psychology

Broadly speaking, sociobiology, which arises out of work in population genetics, population ecology and ethology, is the evolutionary study of human and non-human social behavior. Sociobiologists postulate that some behaviors are traits, just like height or hair color, that are subject to evolution by natural selection. Ideally, to show that a behavior is an evolutionary adaptation, researchers must demonstrate that (1) the behavior is heritable, (2) there is or was behavioral variability among individuals in a population, and (3) that differential reproduction, caused by the presence of the behavior in question, led to an increase in the frequency of individuals tending to exhibit that behavior in a population. Since researchers cannot go back in time to directly observe the evolution of current behaviors, they most often rely on indirect evidence. Sociobiology is most often associated with E.O. Wilson, either his more general work exemplified in his book Sociobiology a New Synthesis (1975) or On Human Nature (1978), which focuses on human sociobiology. There is feminist work in sociobiology such as Sarah Hrdy's work on mother-infant relations (1981/1999, 1986).

Evolutionary psychology is sometimes described as psychology that is informed by evolutionary theory and sometimes described as the latest version of sociobiology. Evolutionary psychology differs from sociobiology in several respects. Instead of looking for adaptive explanations for particular behaviors, evolutionary psychologists develop adaptive hypotheses for psychological mechanisms that generate behaviors and tend to assume a modular theory of mind. Whereas there is incredible diversity of human behavior, many evolutionary psychologists postulate a smaller number of mechanisms or modules that are responsible for a range of behaviors. Much work in evolutionary psychology relies on evolutionary theoretical foundations and psychological empirical methods. Major themes in evolutionary psychological research include studies of social exchange (Cosmides 1989, Cosmides and Tooby 1992, Tooby and Cosmides (1992), family dynamics and conflict (including violence against stepchildren (Daly and Wilson 2005) and wives (Wilson and Daly 1998)), and human mate choice and sexual jealousy (Buss 2003, 2005).

Sociobiology and evolutionary psychology are prominent in popular books (ex. Wilson 1978, Buss 1994/2003, 2005) and can be found in popular media ranging from Business Week (Dotinga 2010) to WebMD (Denoon—see the Other Internet Resources). There are two major feminist concerns with much sociobiological and evolutionary psychological research on sex and gender. First the research presents a picture of human nature that exhibits androcentric, sexist, and capitalist social values. Feminist philosophers of biology have been motivated to carefully analyze this research and have found significant methodological problems. They have found several areas in which implicit and unacknowledged social values have influenced this research and have confounded our understanding of gender and behavior. For example, Thornhill and Palmer in their book, A Natural History of Rape (2000), argue that rape is either a by-product of male adaptations to desire multiple sexual partners, or an evolutionary adaptation itself. In the adaptation view, rape is a facultative reproductive strategy, meaning that rape is the result of natural selection favoring men who commit rape when its evolutionary benefits in terms of producing offspring outweigh its evolutionary costs (such as decreases in the number of offspring produced because of injury or punishment).

There is a significant feminist response to this research (see especially Travis 2003 edited volume). For example, Elisabeth Lloyd (2003) reveals gaps and unjustified assumptions in Thornhill and Palmer's evolutionary arguments. She points out that Thornhill and Palmer's view is problematically adaptationist, meaning that it exhibits an unjustified commitment to natural selection over other kinds of explanation (see Gould and Lewontin 1979 for the main explanation of, and argument against, adaptationism (see the entry on adaptationism), Further, Lloyd shows that they fail to demonstrate that the behavior in question is heritable or that it is the product of natural selection. Finally, Lloyd points out that Thornhill and Palmer make the unjustified assumption that rape is a unitary phenomenon in the face of the “striking disunity among the various acts that are classed as rape” (240).

Emily Martin (2003) also points out that Thornhill and Palmer make problematic assumptions in their definition of ‘rape’. She argues that they falsely assume that rape is a static trait not only across cultures, but across species, that they fail to see that characterizing a behavior as rape requires a culturally specific notion of consent and that cultural meanings of rape have changed over time. (See the entry on feminist perspectives on rape for a more detailed discussion of issues of consent. There remains an opportunity for feminist philosophy of biology concerning rape to be further integrated with feminist literature concerning rape.) Martin points out a second category of assumptions in Thornhill and Palmer's work regarding individualism, competition, and aggression, arising out of evolutionary theory itself. She points out the influence of Malthus' work on overpopulation and scarcity of resources and of Adam Smith's economics on Darwin's formulation of natural selection. She argues that evolutionary explanations tend to be based on notions of individual competition under conditions of scarcity, which are historically and culturally specific and need not hold. She writes, “As Thornhill and Palmer, as well as most who espouse the tenets of sociobiology, see the world, it is make up of highly individualized agents bent on maximizing their own advantage, defined as increasing their genetic stake in the next generation. Any means to that end, however ruthless, violent or aggressive, will be looked for and justified as necessary to increasing fitness, so defined” (375).

A second category of feminist concern regarding much research in sociobiology and evolutionary psychology involves problematic assumptions of a coarse causal connection between genes and behavior. These assumptions, coupled with the assertion that human behaviors are the result of natural selection, makes it seem as though, as Ruth Bleier (1984, 15) puts it, “we had best resign ourselves to the more unsavory aspects of human behavior.” The worry is that these studies of the evolution of human behavior cast behaviors such as violence against women, wives, and children, and the sexual division of labor as biologically determined, hence making attempts at social change seem futile.

For example, sociobiologist, David Barash writes, “There is good reason to believe that we are (genetically) primed to be much less sexually egalitarian than we appear to be” (1979, 47) and “Because men maximize their fitness differently from women, it is perfectly good biology that business and professions taste sweeter to them, while home and child care taste sweeter to women” (1979, 114). When it comes to sex, sociobiologist E.O. Wilson writes, “It pays for males to be aggressive, hasty, fickle and undiscriminating. In theory it is more profitable for females to be coy, to hold back until they can identify males with the best genes… Human beings obey this biological principle faithfully” (1978, 125).

Evolutionary psychologists tend to argue that the mechanisms that produce behaviors (modules), rather than the behaviors themselves, are adaptations. This allows them to introduce flexibility in the expression of behaviors, because some of these mechanisms may be triggered by specific environmental conditions that might not be present. In the example of the evolution of rape discussed above, the argument is not that all men rape, but rather that rape is adaptive in environments where its evolutionary benefits outweigh the costs. However, note that the claim is still that rape is a universal, cross-cultural adaptation, a mechanism ready and waiting to be triggered by the right environmental conditions.

Feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology have identified a range of problems common among much research in sociobiology and evolutionary psychology. (The list below is primarily drawn from Bleier 1984; see also Anne Fausto-Sterling 1997a, b, 2000; Kitcher 1985 and Sterelny and Griffiths 1999 offer a good overview and introduction to the non-feminist literature.) These problems include kinds of bias as well as methodological challenges.

Androcentrism. Historically female primates were studied only in their interactions with males or with infants. Women primatologists (see Haraway 1989) and sociobiologists (Hrdy 1986) who carefully observed females, as well as other members of primate groups, discovered new information that overthrew previously held beliefs regarding dominance hierarchies, mate selection, and female-female competition by focusing on female-female interactions.

Ethnocentrism. Much research on human behavior focuses on identifying and explaining behavioral traits that are universal among humans and have a cross-cultural meaning. For example, Buss argues that love is cross-cultural (1994/2003) and Wilson and Daly that marriage is cross-cultural (1992). However, human beings live in a wide variety of cultural and environmental contexts. John Dupré writes

Anthropologists describe systems of marriage that are monogamous, polygamous, occasionally polyandrous, hypergamous or hypogamous (women marrying up or down although equal status is said to be the commonest case), between people of the same sex, and is some cases as not involving sexual relations at all (2001, 59).

This makes it difficult to imagine what the cross-cultural universal could be. It also makes it very easy to make false assumptions about the nature of such a phenomenon based on a particular cultural perspective.

Anthropocentrism. There is room for unrecognized or implicit social values to enter into research when researchers make comparisons among species. It is easy to create circular arguments when researchers use loaded terms, defined in the context of particular human language and culture, to describe animal behavior and then use those descriptions to argue that human behaviors are innate because they are found in animals. For example, it is common to refer to ‘harems’ and ‘prostitution’ when describing the behavior of non-human primates. There is an extensive literature on the evolution of rape, with rape being ‘observed’ in flowers, scorpion flies, some species of fish and ducks, and then these observations are used to draw conclusions about the biological nature of rape in humans. An obvious problem is that rape in humans is defined as sex in the absence of consent or that is against the victim's will. The same notion of consent or will in flowers, flies, fish, and ducks is absent.

Lack of attention to limitations inherent in studying humans. Human behavior is a fraught area of study. On one hand it is seductive because there is a deep interest in trying to understand why we behave as we do. One the other hand, if researchers are trying to understand social behavior in general, there is little to recommend human beings as experimental subjects. First, it is unethical to perform the necessary controlled experiments on humans. Furthermore, such experiments are impractical because we live too long for researchers to conveniently follow the development and evolutionary consequences of particular behavioral traits and tendencies. In addition, a common evolutionary investigative technique is to compare traits among closely related species. However as Sterelny and Griffiths (1999) point out, human beings are evolutionary orphans. Even though there are several species of non-human primates that are extensively studied, they are simply not as numerous, nor do they form as closely a related group of species with humans, as can be found in, for example, groups of social ant or bee species. Finally, human behavior is complicated by intentionality, language and culture, which make comparisons between human and non-human animals challenging. For example, refer back Martin's (2003) critique of evolutionary explanations of rape. The notion of consent means something very different in a human as opposed to an animal context. As a result of limitations inherent to studying the evolution of human behavior, it is more challenging to draw conclusions about human behavior than about the behavior of many other groups of animals, and conclusions about human beings might need to be more tentative than conclusions about other organisms.

Lack of attention to changing environments. There is a lack of good information about the environment, including the social environment, in which humans evolved. We know that there are differences among the environments in which people currently live and between current environments and early human environments. Postulating evolutionary adaptations only makes sense in reference to a particular environment because adaptations are responses to particular environmental challenges. A behavior may be an adaptation to a past environment and not benefit individuals in a current environment. Alternatively, a behavior may benefit an individual without being the result of natural selection for that benefit. As a result, conclusions drawn about the evolution of human behavior need to be tentative.

Adaptationism (Failure to adequately consider causes of evolution other than natural selection). Causes of evolution other than natural selection must be tested. For example, even if there are behaviors that are correlated with specific genes it does not follow that the behavior is the result of natural selection and hence is an adaptation. Genes commonly have multiple effects and it is possible for natural selection to select for only one of those effects. In this case the other effect will increase in frequency in the population even though it is not selected for. A similar case can occur when two genes are linked on the same chromosome. In this way a behavior may be very common not because it confers an evolutionary advantage, but because it is associated with a different beneficial trait. Other causes of evolution include random drift, mutation, and immigration of individuals between populations. Recall that Elisabeth Lloyd (2003) identified adaptationism as a problem with Thornhill and Palmer's arguments about the evolution of rape.

Lack of clear definitions of behavior. Behavioral traits need to be clearly defined. For example, it is postulated that males are naturally more aggressive than females. What counts as aggression is unclear. Is it going to war, or punching another individual, or having very active adrenal function? The appropriate grain of analysis is not clear. If one lives in a culture in which males are considered more aggressive than females, then one may notice the higher proportion of men rather than women who commit violent crimes and not notice cases of females fighting to defend their offspring or competing with each other for resources. The issue of defining traits is not only a matter of clarity. Ontology is at stake because for evolutionary hypotheses to explain what exists in the world, our definitions must divide up the world into traits that are passed from generation to generation and on which natural selection can act.

Problematic choice of comparison species. The data one can gather and the conclusions one can draw about human behavioral evolution from non-human primates are highly dependent on the primate species to which one attends. For example, in mid-20th century primatology researchers chose species for study, such as savanna baboons, which had social structures that seemed similar to humans. In the 1970's feminist primatologists were instrumental in convincing the scientific community that chimpanzees were a more appropriate species for modeling key transitions in human evolution. This switch in model organism was supported by molecular phylogenetic, comparative anatomical, and paleontological data, but it was also a strategic feminist move, as chimpanzees are matrifocal creatures with complex social lives. This facilitated a research focus on mothering, which was consistent with the focus on maternal thinking and social motherhood in that period of western feminism (Haraway 1989). There are at least two kinds of recommendations that arise here. First, if one is focusing on removing bias, then one should take care not to falsely generalize across the diversity that can be found among primate species (Hrdy 1986). Second, one needs to take responsibility for one's choice of model organism, because it will have an impact on the kinds of knowledge that one can produce (Haraway 1989).

Evolutionary research regarding human behavior is especially difficult to do well. It is very easy to take an aspect of human social behavior that seems universal to a particular group of researchers, for example male aggression, and create a compelling but unsupported story about why that behavior enhances the survival and reproduction of individuals exhibiting it and hence ‘explains’ why it is currently ‘universal.’ In particular, there is little analysis of just what it is that makes these stories seem compelling or even commonsensical. It is important to note that these just-so stories predominantly support the social status quo and traditional Western, capitalist, patriarchal ‘virtues’ ranging from a tendency to be entrepreneurial and the inevitability of hierarchical social arrangements, to the naturalness of male promiscuity and violence against women. Although some feminists are very pessimistic about the possibility of conducting non-sexist research on the evolution of human behavior, there is not a general view within feminist philosophy of biology that all sociobiological research is problematic. In fact, some feminist critics and scientists use non-sexist sociobiological research on non-human animals (for example the work of Sarah Hrdy) to critique problematic evolutionary accounts of gendered behavior.

Sexual selection and evolutionary accounts of behavior that relate to sex and gender are examples of two areas of science that have been treated to extensive analysis by feminist philosophers of biology. This entry now turns to common themes in feminist philosophy of biology.

4. Conceptual Themes in Feminist Philosophy of Biology

4.1 Determinism

As previously stated, biological or genetic determinism is the view that individual, low-level and often genetic factors are the primary causes of biological phenomena. Feminists are concerned with determinism because it has been used to argue that political change is futile because sex and gender at the individual and social level are caused by a static, biological human nature. Feminists have criticized biological or genetic determinism in a number of biological disciplines. Within genetics and molecular biology researchers such as Evelyn Fox Keller (2000), Bonnie Spanier (1995) Ruth Hubbard (1990) and Anne Fausto-Sterling (1992) have pointed out the logical and empirical distance between an organism having a particular genotype and expressing a particular phenotype, including behaviors. Non-feminist philosophers of biology have also developed criticisms of biological determinism (an influential example is Richard Lewontin's book Biology as Ideology 1992).

For example, the causal relationship between genes and the particular proteins that result in phenotypes is called the Central Dogma. According to the Central Dogma, information flows from DNA to RNA to protein, and not in the other direction. DNA specifies messenger RNA in a process called transcription. Messenger RNA plays a role in specifying the amino acid sequence of a protein which is the fundamental structure of an organism's phenotype. Feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology, along with many biologists, have pointed out that this causal chain is extremely complicated and that a particular genotype can result in different phenotypes in different contexts. There are gene regulation mechanisms that turn genes on and off, and control the rate of transcription. There are hereditary mechanisms whereby once a portion of DNA is rendered inactive in a cell it remains inactive in all of that cell's descendents. The cellular environment affects what DNA is transcribed and the fate of particular DNA transcripts. A sequence of DNA does not uniquely specify a particular protein. The machinery of the cell processes the RNA transcript. During this processing different portions of an RNA strand can be spliced out resulting in a different end products, which means that same DNA sequence can result in different proteins and different phenotypic traits. The nature of the relationship between a sequence of DNA and the traits of an organism is complicated. Although genes make a difference in an organism's phenotype, they are not the sole causes determining that phenotype. Simple pictures of genetic determinism are not supported by molecular biology.

Feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology have made it clear that even if a trait is the result of evolution by natural selection, or in other words is an adaptation, it does not follow that the trait is uniformly expressed in a population or static in an individual over time. Some adaptive traits are almost always present and others require very specific environmental conditions in order to develop. One could have the genetic correlate of a trait and that trait could be the result of natural selection, and yet changing the environment could eliminate the expression of that trait. Some traits are adaptations to past environmental conditions and are not beneficial to organisms in current conditions. Some traits are present and very beneficial, and yet are not the result of natural selection and hence are not adaptations. Simple pictures of biological determinism are thus not supported by evolutionary biology (for example see Keller 2000).

Another aspect of biology that has been used to support determinist arguments involves differences in male and female brains, and the effects of sex hormones on the expression of behavioral traits. Feminist responses in these areas primarily consist of careful analysis of studies used to support these determinist arguments. For example, Bleier (1984) points out the futility of separating nature from nurture, or in other words the structural and hormonal aspects of brain development, from social learning and environmental influences on brain development. She points out that the fetal and postnatal development of the brain is highly influenced by environmental inputs, the human brain exhibits high levels of developmental plasticity, is sensitive to experience, and finally that humans are very good at learning. It is very difficult to determine whether or not sexually dichotomized behaviors, which may be correlated with genetic, hormonal or brain differences, are fixed or changeable.

Feminist philosophers of biology, such as Bleier (1984) and Fausto-Sterling (1992), reveal a series of problems with studies that purport to find sex differences in brain anatomy, brain lateralization, and hormones that are correlated with gender differences in behavioral traits and abilities. These critiques include pointing out that (1) for most of the behavioral traits in question there is more overlap than difference among populations of men and women, (2) these studies are often based on limited data and insufficient sample sizes, (3) these studies often involve unwarranted extrapolation from rodent models to humans, (4) there are problems with the biological conversion of androgens to estrogens in the body that make it difficult to interpret in vivo experiments, and finally (5) there is also a tendency to discount social causes of putative differences between the sexes (see also Fehr 2004).

4.2 Reductionism

Feminist analyses of reductionism in biology concern the tendency to employ methods that look for causes and explanations at low levels of biological organization and within the system being studied. This can lead researchers to ignore or undervalue the context in which a phenomenon is found, and hence to value genetic and physiological over social causes, and organismal over environmental factors. This view enables arguments for biological determinism, because it supports the idea that the most important causes for a phenomenon, including human behavior and social organization, are within a person and at the genetic level (Fehr 2004). Within a reductionist framework causes based on environmental influences such as learning and social structures are undervalued.

For example, feminists have scrutinized reductionism with regard to the role of hormones in developmental biology in one of the most ubiquitous model organisms, rats (Birke 1986, Longino and Doell 1983, Longino 1990). In an early model of this system, which Longino and Doell called the linear-hormonal model, prenatal and perinatal hormone levels are assumed to be the basis for behavioral sex differences. The assumption was that a gene on the Y chromosome triggers the development of testes, and that the hormones released by these brand new testes affect the structure of the rodent brain during a critical developmental period. The presence of testes and the hormones that they produce were assumed to cause the male brain to develop such that the male performs ‘stereotypical’ male sexual behavior; in the absence of testes and the hormones that they produce the female brain to develops in such a way as to cause the female to perform ‘stereotypical’ female behavior. Longino points out that in this explanatory model it is assumed that there is a “unidirectional and irreversible sequence of (biochemical) events” (Longino 1990, 135).

Birke writes of this early model:

Even if it is not always made explicit, the framework within which this line of reasoning has progressed is that hormones in early life are the prime determinants of adult patterns of sexual behavior. To a large extent this assumption still holds, and the existence of sex differences in behaviour in adults is frequently attributed to perinatal hormone effects. Now it may well be true that hormones exert a large effect. The problem is not there, but with the exclusive focus on hormones from the individual's own testes or lack of them which dominated research for several decades (Birke 1986, 96).

This is a powerful model because it fits within a reductive framework (Fehr 2004). Genes cause anatomical differences, which cause hormonal differences, which cause brain differences, which cause behavioral differences. Birke argues that the relationship between hormones and behavior is much more complicated than this tidy reductionist picture implies. She advocates an interactionist model instead of the linear-hormonal model. She points out that research is beginning to embrace a much more complex picture of the causes of sexual behavior, a picture that involves interactions among the mother, the fetus, the physiological and social environment as well as the genes, the internal anatomy and the brain structure of the developing fetus. In this model, before birth the pups are influenced by factors such as the sex of other members of the litter, the mother's environment, and the mother's hormonal states. Birke writes, “Even before birth… it is difficult to separate the individual pup and its hormones from a network of complex processes” (Birke 1986, 97). After birth, factors such as the pup's own hormones, maternal care (which is differential depending on the sex of the pup), the physical environment and the other pups influence adult sexual behavior. When the pup becomes an adult, factors in its physical and social environment as well as its hormonal states and its own behavior influence its sexual behavior. The interactionist model does not ignore low level causes, such as genes or hormones, it simply refuses to privilege them over what may be thought of as higher level environmental and social causes of behavior.

In this case, feminist analysis shows that uncritically embracing a reductive model overlooks other higher-level and environmental causes of behavior, and was involved in generating an alternative model that was empirically testable. It is an example of both the critical and the constructive sides of feminist philosophy of biology. Critiques of reductionism are also common in non-feminist philosophy of biology starting with the work of David Hull (1972,1974) (see the entry on reductionism in biology for a thorough review).

4.3 Metaphor

There is significant feminist work on the role of gender-laden language, and in particular of metaphor, in biology. Evelyn Fox Keller has done significant work on “Master Molecule” characterizations of DNA (1983, 1985). She has also argued that cultural norms enter into evolutionary biology, particularly mathematical ecology, due to a slippage between technical and colloquial uses of the word “competition,” and that the language of reproductive autonomy supports a bias towards individualism in biology (Keller 1992b). Emily Martin (1991) and the Biology and Gender Study Group (1988) both have shown that romantic metaphors play a confounding role in biological descriptions of fertilization. In some cases, supporting false assumptions of female passivity, the egg is cast in the role of Sleeping Beauty that is awakened by the valiant sperm, which struggled to beat out its rivals and awaken the egg. In stories that acknowledge the activity of the egg, it is cast in the role of femme fatale, snagging the hapless sperm and dragging it into its clutches. Both sets of stories cohere with female stereotypes and neither of them clearly describes the reciprocal interactions between the egg and the sperm during reproduction.

4.4 Pluralism

There is strong support for several aspects of pluralism in feminist philosophy of biology. This pluralism arises out of attention to the complexity and heterogeneity of biological phenomena and the different social and epistemic contexts in which research is conducted. It tends to focus on the multitude of ways that objects and categories can be constructed and the differences among the partial perspectives of biologists who are differently situated (for example those taking a feminist as opposed to a non-feminist perspective on their research) (Haraway 1988). This can result in a willingness to see multiple explanations for the same phenomena as a virtue that arises from attending to these ontological and/or epistemic possibilities (Longino 2002, Fehr 2004). For example, feminists have critiqued “man-the-hunter” theories of human evolution because they focus on a single cause, hunting, of a complex and varied evolutionary history (Bleier 1984). They point out that while hunting played a role, gathering was likely the primary source of nutrition, and that the reciprocal interaction of many factors, such as the development of language and culture, likely played important roles in the evolution of human beings.

Feminists have also been critical of tendencies to view nature in terms of sexualized dichotomies. This is evidenced in Anne Fausto-Sterling's research on sexuality and intersexed individuals (2000). She shows that biology and medicine, literally, surgically construct intersexed individuals to fit more closely into either one gender or the other. Feminist philosophers of biology have been particularly vigilant in pointing out the problems with the association of sexual dichotomies with male activity and female passivity. This is supported by analyses, discussed above, of how the narrative of the sleeping egg being awakened by the sperm distorted our understanding of fertilization. There has also been work along these lines in analyses of developmental biology in which it is assumed that embryos develop along a female path by default unless a gene of the Y chromosome switches on the male pattern of development (Gilbert and Rader 2001, Richardson 2008). Finally, there is significant non-feminist work on pluralism in the philosophy of biology (for example Dupré 1993, Kellert et al 2006, Fehr 2006).

5. Conclusion

There are at least three areas in which feminist philosophy of biology can be fruitfully developed. First, it is striking that there are many topics that feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology both address, but there is often a paucity of interactions between these two bodies of literature. For example, reductionism is a central area of investigation in both fields, and in both fields there is generally an anti-reductionist consensus, yet feminist and non-feminist philosophers of biology rarely cite each others' work (for an exception see Dupré 2001). There is a wide range of anti-reductionist arguments on which feminists could draw and non-feminists can be aided by careful considerations of the social and political impact of reductionism. More interaction between these groups of scholars could be mutually beneficial.

Second, there is room for further integrating feminist philosophy of biology with feminist epistemology and philosophy of science. Feminist philosophy of biology includes a vast body of literature documenting the impact of sexism and androcentrism in both the practice of biology and the knowledge produced by biologists. There are significant opportunities to further develop this work in light of advances in feminist and social epistemology. For example, it would be interesting to consider many of the feminist criticisms of gender bias in biology from the perspective of social accounts of knowledge production or using Haraway's notion of situated knowledges.

Finally, there are opportunities to develop feminist analyses on a wide range of topics in the biological sciences. These include more contemporary scientific research on topics covered by classic works in feminist philosophy of biology. For example Anne Fausto-Sterling (1992) and Ruth Bleier (1984) critiqued research on sexual selection, and related work in sociobiology and evolutionary psychology, for focusing on individual sperm as a unit for determining the male contribution to reproduction. Since then biological research on sexual selection and Darwinian feminist approaches to sociobiology and evolutionary ecology (although little in evolutionary psychology) have addressed this issue. There are opportunities for feminist philosophers of biology to engage this shift in scientific research focus. Opportunities also exist for feminist philosophy of biology to analyze other topics and groups of researchers in the biological sciences, including Darwinian feminist research on life history strategies and the evolution of male and female reproductive strategies. Finally there are opportunities to develop feminist analyses of topics that are relatively new such as research on genomics as it relates to gender (see the work Evelyn Fox Keller 2000). In all of these areas of investigation there is room to ask questions about the efficacy of the relevant scientific practices at producing maximally accurate representations of gender as well as epistemic questions rooted in recent work in feminist epistemology.


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Other Internet Resources

  • DeNoon, Daniel. “Promiscuity Differs by Gender: Men and Women are Hard-Wired for Short-Term Sex—But Must We Obey our Brains?” WebMD, [Available online] (accessed on August 31, 2010).

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Carla Fehr <carla.fehr@uwaterloo.ca>

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