Philosophy of Biology

First published Fri Jul 4, 2008; substantive revision Mon Jun 1, 2020

The growth of philosophical interest in biology over the past forty years reflects the increasing prominence of the biological sciences in the same period. There is now an extensive literature on many different biological topics, and it would be impossible to summarise this body of work in this single entry. Instead, this entry sets out to explain what philosophy of biology is. Why does biology matter to philosophy and vice versa? A list of the entries in the encyclopedia which address specific topics in the philosophy of biology is provided at the end of the entry.

Three different kinds of philosophical inquiry fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology. First, general theses in the philosophy of science are addressed in the context of biology. Second, conceptual problems within biology itself are subjected to philosophical analysis. Third, appeals to biology are made in discussions of traditional philosophical questions.

Philosophy of biology can also be subdivided by the particular areas of the life sciences with which it is concerned. Biology is an extremely diverse set of disciplines, ranging from historical sciences such as paleontology to engineering sciences such as biotechnology. Different philosophical issues occur in each field. The latter part of the entry discusses how philosophers have approached some of the main disciplines within biology.

1. Pre-history of Philosophy of Biology

As is the case for most apparent novelties, closer inspection reveals a pre-history for the philosophy of biology (Grene & Depew 2004). In the 1950s the biologist J. H. Woodger and the philosopher Morton Beckner both published major works on the philosophy of biology (Woodger 1952; Beckner 1959), but these did not give rise to a subsequent philosophical literature (though see Ruse 1988). Some philosophers of science also made claims about biology based on general epistemological and metaphysical considerations. One of the most famous examples is J. J. C. Smart’s claim that the biology is not an autonomous science, but a technological application of more basic sciences, like “radio-engineering” (Smart 1959, 366). Like engineering, biology cannot make any addition to the laws of nature. It can only reveal how the laws of physics and chemistry play out in the context of particular sorts of initial and boundary conditions (for more recent discussions of biological laws, see Beatty 1995; Brandon 1997; Mitchell 1997; Sober 1997; Waters 1998). Even in 1969 the zoologist Ernst Mayr could complain that books with ‘philosophy of science’ in the title were all misleading and should be re-titled ‘philosophy of physics’ (Mayr 1969). It is worth noting however that philosophers of science such as Carl G. Hempel (1965) and Ernest Nagel (1961) offered accounts of functional explanation as found in the biological sciences. The encouragement of prominent biologists such as Mayr and F. J. Ayala (Ayala 1976; Mayr 1982) was one factor in the emergence of the new field. Another factor was that several philosophers of science including Robert Brandon, Phillip Kitcher, Elisabeth Lloyd, Sahotra Sarkar, Elliott Sober, and William C. Wimsatt did research at Harvard University with the likes of Stephen Jay Gould, Richard Lewontin, and Richard Levins (Callebaut 1993). The first sign of philosophy of biology becoming a mainstream part of philosophy of science was the publication of David Hull’s Philosophy of Biological Science in the prominent Prentice-Hall Foundations of Philosophy series (Hull 1974). From then on the field developed rapidly. Robert Brandon could say of the late 1970’s that “I knew five philosophers of biology: Marjorie Grene, David Hull, Michael Ruse, Mary Williams and William Wimsatt.” (Brandon 1996, xii–xiii) By 1986, however, there were more than enough to fill the pages of Michael Ruse’s new journal Biology and Philosophy. This trend has only increased with the introduction of additional journals such as Biological Theory, Philosophy and Practice of Biology, History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences, and Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences.

2. Three Types of Philosophy of Biology

Three different kinds of philosophical inquiry fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology. First, general theses in the philosophy of science are addressed in the context of biology. Second, conceptual (or theoretical) problems within biology itself are subjected to philosophical analysis. Third, appeals to biology are made in discussions of traditional philosophical questions. The first major debate in the philosophy of biology exemplified the first of these, the use of genetics to explore reductionism and anti-reductionism in the philosophy of science. Kenneth F. Schaffner applied the logical empiricist model of theory reduction to the relationship between classical, Mendelian genetics and molecular genetics (Schaffner 1967a; Schaffner 1967b; Schaffner 1969). David Hull argued that the lesson of this attempt was that Mendelian genetics is irreducible to molecular genetics (Hull 1974; Hull 1975). This debate reinforced the near-consensus in the 1970s and 1980s that the special sciences are autonomous from the more fundamental sciences (Fodor 1974; Kitcher 1984). However, the apparent absurdity of the claim that the molecular revolution in biology was not a successful instance of scientific reduction also led the formulation of increasingly more adequate models of theory reduction (Wimsatt 1976; Wimsatt 1980; Schaffner 1993; Waters 1994; Rosenberg 1997; Sarkar 1998).

In another important early debate philosophers set out to solve a conceptual problem within biology itself. The concept of reproductive fitness is at the heart of evolutionary theory, but its status has always been problematic. It has proved surprisingly hard for biologists to avoid the criticism that, “[i]f we try to make laws of evolution in the strict sense we seem to reduce to tautologies. Thus suppose we say that even in Andromeda ‘the fittest will survive’ we say nothing, for ‘fittest’ has to be defined in terms of ‘survival’” (Smart 1959, 366). This came to be know as the “tautology problem”. Alexander Rosenberg and Mary B. Williams argued that fitness is an irreducible primitive which derives its meaning from its place in an axiomatic formulation of evolutionary theory (Rosenberg 1983; Sober 1984a; Williams and Rosenberg 1985). If correct, this would solve the tautology problem since axioms are often thought of as tautologous. In the 1970’s the new generation of philosophers of biology offered a different solution to the tautology problem in two steps. First, they began by arguing that fitness is a supervenient property of organisms: the fitness of each particular organism is necessarily dependent on some specific set of physical characteristics of the organism and its particular environment, but two organisms that have the same fitness may do so in virtue very different sets of physical characteristics (Rosenberg 1978). Second, they argued that this supervenient property is a propensity – which is a probabilistic disposition represented by a probability distribution over possible numbers of offspring (Mills and Beatty 1979). Although fitness is defined in terms of reproductive success, it is not a tautology that the fittest organisms have the most offspring, any more than it is a tautology that dice produce even numbers more often than they produce sixes. The propensities of fit organisms to survive and of dice to fall equally often on each side both allow us to make fallible predictions about what will happen, predictions that become more reliable as the size of the sample increases. It remains unclear, however, whether it is possible to specify a probability distribution or set of distributions that can play all the roles actually played by fitness in population biology (Beatty & Finsen 1989, Sober 2001; Pence & Ramsey 2013).

The phrase ‘conceptual problems’ should be understood very broadly. The conceptual work done by philosophers of biology in many cases merges smoothly into theoretical biology. It also sometimes leads philosophers to examine and criticize the chains of argument constructed by biologists, and thus to enter directly into ongoing biological debates. In the same way, the first kind of philosophy of biology we have described – the use of biological examples to work through general issues in the philosophy of science – sometimes feeds back into biology itself through specific recommendations for improving biological methodology. It is a striking feature of the philosophy of biology literature that philosophers often publish in biology journals and that biologists often contribute to philosophy of biology journals. The philosophy of biology also has a potentially important role as a mediator between biology and society. Popular representations of biology derive broad lessons from large swathes of experimental findings and theoretical work. Philosophers of science have an obvious role in evaluating these interpretations of the significance of specific biological findings (Stotz and Griffiths 2008). As two important examples, philosophers of biology have provided a great deal of clarity regarding creationism/intelligent design (Kitcher 1982; Ruse 1982; Pennock 2000; Sarkar 2007) and sociobiology/evolutionary psychology (Kitcher 1985; Buller 2006; Richardson 2010; Barker 2015).

A third form of philosophy of biology occurs when philosophers appeal to biology to support positions on traditional philosophical topics, such as ethics or epistemology. The extensive literature on biological teleology is a case in point. After a brief flurry of interest in the wake of the “modern synthesis”, during which the term ‘teleonomy’ was introduced to denote the specifically evolutionary interpretation of teleological language (Pittendrigh 1958), the ideas of function and goal directedness came to be regarded as relatively unproblematic by evolutionary biologists. In the 1970s, however, philosophers started to look to biology to provide a solid, scientific basis for normative concepts, such as illness, disorder, or malfunction (Wimsatt 1972; Wright 1973; Boorse 1976). Eventually, the philosophical debate produced an analysis of teleological language fundamentally similar to the view associated with modern synthesis (Millikan 1984; Neander 1991; Godfrey-Smith 1994). According to the “selected effects” theory of function, the functions of a trait are those activities in virtue of which the trait was selected. The idea of proper function has become part of the conceptual toolkit of philosophy in general and of the philosophy of language and the philosophy of mind in particular (Dretske 1991, 1997; Millikan 1995, 2004, 2005; Papineau 1987, 1993; Neander 2017; Garson 2019).

3. Philosophy of Evolutionary Biology

Philosophy of biology can also be subdivided by the particular areas of biology with which it is concerned. Until recently, evolutionary biology has attracted the lion’s share of philosophical attention. This work has sometimes been designed to support a general thesis in the philosophy of science, such as the “semantic view” or model-based view of theories (Beatty 1980; Lloyd 1988; Thompson 1988). But most of this work is concerned with conceptual problems that arise inside the theory itself, and the work often resembles theoretical biology as much as pure philosophy of science. For example, Elliott Sober’s classic study The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus (Sober 1984b) marks the point at which many philosophers became aware of the philosophy of biology. Sober analyzed the structure of population genetics via an analogy with Newtonian mechanics and the composition of forces, treating the actual change in gene frequencies over time as the result of several different “forces”, such as selection, random genetic drift, mutation, and migration. Several philosophers of biology have challenged this interpretation of evolutionary theory in favor of a “statistical” approach (Sterelny & Kitcher 1988; Matthen and Ariew 2002; Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002), and this debate continues. Another instance of a conceptual problem in evolutionary theory concerns the nature of random genetic drift. How are selection and drift distinct (Beatty 1987)? We typically think of drift occurring when there is random fluctuation of gene frequencies, but selection in a changing environment can produce the very same pattern. Thus, some philosophers of biology have argued we must distinguish selection and drift as processes rather than just as patterns. One way to do this is through a distinction between indiscriminate and discriminate sampling processes (Millstein 2002; Brandon 2005; Millstein 2005). The question becomes whether the trait of interest is causally irrelevant or relevant to changes in gene frequencies. These examples of careful, methodological analysis of population genetics, the mathematical core of traditional evolutionary theory, continue to give rise to interesting results (Pigliucci and Kaplan 2006; Plutynski 2006; Okasha 2007; Sarkar 2011).

The intense philosophical interest in evolutionary theory in the 1980’s can partly be explained by two controversies (Segerstråle 2000). First, there was a controversy over “sociobiology” that was provoked by the publications of E.O. Wilson’s eponymous textbook (Wilson 1975) and his Pulitzer prize winning popular book (Wilson 1978). One extremely important critique of this application of evolutionary biology to human social behavior came from Stephen Jay Gould and Richard Lewontin (Gould and Lewontin 1979). The debates over adaptationism turned out to involve a diffuse set of worries about whether evolution produces adaptations, the role of optimality models, and the methodology of evolutionary theory (Amundson 1994; Orzack and Sober 1994; Brandon and Rausher 1996; Godfrey-Smith 2001; Millstein 2007; Forber 2009; Potochnik 2009; Lloyd 2015). Philosophical work has helped to distinguish these strands in the debate and reduce the confusion seen in the heated and polemical biological literature for and against adaptationism (Orzack and Sober 2001). Second, there was the appearance of George Williams’ Adaptation and Natural Selection (Williams 1966) and Richard Dawkins’ The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1976). They claim that the unit of selection is the individual Mendelian allele rather than the organism, group of organisms, or species. This created an explosion of early philosophical work on the “units of selection” question (Brandon and Burian 1984). The early debates concerned whether there was a determinate unit of selection and what criteria should be used for determining what it is in a given case (Hull 1980; Wimsatt 1980a, 1980b; Brandon 1982; Sober & Lewontin 1984; Lloyd 1988; Sterelny & Kitcher 1988). As multi-level selection models and the Price equation appeared, close attention turned to how those models should be interpreted (Godfrey-Smith & Lewontin 1993; Godfrey-Smith & Kerr 2002; Lloyd 2005; Waters 2005; Okasha 2006; Birch 2017). For example, for any group selection model, is there an empirically equivalent individual selection model (similarly for genotypic and genic models)? If so, do they represent the very same causal structure? Is kin selection a form of group selection? Arguably, philosophers made a significant contribution to the rehabilitation of some forms of “group selection” within evolutionary biology in the 1990s, following two decades of neglect or contempt (Sober and Wilson 1998).

4. Philosophy of Systematic Biology

Philosophical discussion of systematics was a response to a “scientific revolution” in that discipline in the 1960s and 1970s. This revolution saw the discipline transformed from phenetics and evolutionary taxonomy alongside the application of quantitative methods. The successor was the “cladistic” approach due to Willi Hennig (1966), which argues that the sole aim of systematics should be to represent “natural” groups of organisms. Cladists took natural groups to be monophyletic groups (where a monophyletic group includes an ancestor species and all of its descendant species). Thus, a cladistic approach only represents phylogeny, which is the pattern of common descent. Philosopher David L. Hull was an active participant in scientific debates throughout these two revolutions; in fact, he was president of the Society of Systematic Zoology in 1984–1985 and of the Philosophy of Science Association in 1985–1986 (Hull 1965; Hull 1970; Hull 1988; Sober 1988). Additionally, a great deal of conceptual work appeared on the nature of phylogenetic inference. Phylogenies are commonly represented with phylogenetic trees. Discovering phylogenies presents the familiar problem of underdetermination of theory by evidence. For example, if we have four taxa, there are fifteen possible rooted trees. However, only one of those trees corresponds to the actual historical lineage. Additionally, the phylogeny of given taxa cannot be directly observed, and so must be inferred. Thus, the problem of phylogenetic inference is how to justify such historical hypotheses. The original phylogenetic method of choice was parsimony, which says to choose the tree which proposes the fewest evolutionary events. Some phylogenetic systematists argued for this approach using Sir Karl Popper’s falsificationism (Wiley 1975, Farris 1983). In the 1970’s, Joseph Felsenstein demonstrated that lineages with a certain topology were subject to a systematic error in parsimony analysis (Felsenstein 1978, 2004). This is the problem of “long-branch attraction” in which taxa at the end of long branches are mistakenly grouped together by parsimony analysis, instead of with taxa with which they share a more recent common ancestor (Haber 2008). Felsenstein proposed using statistical techniques (in particular maximum likelihood methods) to avoid this problem. Debates between the camps continue (Sober 2004).

The biologist Michael Ghiselin piqued the interest of philosophers when he suggested that systematics was fundamentally mistaken about the ontological status of biological species (Ghiselin 1974). Species were not natural kinds in the way that chemical elements are. Instead, they are historical particulars like nations or galaxies. They have a beginning through speciation, they have parts that are integrated over time by biological relations, and they cease to exist by going extinct (Mishler & Brandon 1987). Additionally, individual organisms are not instances of species, as a wedding ring is an instance of gold. Instead, they are parts of species, as one is a part of a family. As Smart had earlier noticed, this has the implication that there can be no “laws of nature” about biological species per se, at least in the traditional sense of ‘laws of nature’ (Smart 1959). David Hull further developed and argued for the “species as individuals” thesis. He explored its implications for a variety of topics including species names, laws of nature, and human nature (Hull 1976, 1978, 1986).

However, the view that species are individuals leaves other important questions about species unsolved and raises new problems of its own (Kitcher 1984, 1989). For example, suppose you are a population biologist and you need to census the individuals in a population of species. How do you decide what entities to count? Philosophers and biologists have provided a variety of criteria for answering questions like this including reproduction, life-cycles, genetics, sex, developmental bottlenecks, germ-soma separation, policing mechanisms, spatial boundaries or contiguity, immune response, fitness maximization, cooperation and/or conflict, codispersal, adaptations, metabolic autonomy, and functional integration (Clarke 2013). So, the question of what a biological individual is indeed a pressing one (Wilson 2005; Okasha 2006; Clarke 2011; Pradeu 2012; Bouchard and Huneman 2013; Clarke 2013; Godfrey-Smith 2013; Wilson and Barker 2013).

Biologists have been, and are still, deeply divided over the species category (Ereshefsky 1992b; Wheeler and Meier 2000; Coyne and Orr 2004; Wilkins 2009). Consider Ernst Mayr’s famous biological species concept (BSC). He writes, “Species are groups of interbreeding natural populations that are reproductively isolated from other such groups” (Mayr 1963, 89). There are lots of concerns regarding the BSC (Ehrlich and Raven 1969; Sokal and Crovello 1970; Van Valen 1976; Wiley 1978). Asexual organisms do not interbreed. Thus, on the BSC, there are no species of asexual organisms. Many species exhibit some introgression, and thus cannot be distinct species. Last, the BSC is extremely difficult to apply to species in the fossil record since sex organs do not normally fossilize, and reproductive behavior is difficult to corroborate. In light of the problems with the BSC (and for other reasons), biologists have put forward other species concepts. Species pluralism is the claim that there is no single correct species concept that classifies organisms exactly the same (Ereshefsky 1992a); rather, there are several correct species concepts. That is, for some organisms, different species concepts will correctly place them in distinct species. Species monism is the claim that there is a single correct species concept. Some allege species pluralism is temporary because we will eventually find the single best concept (Hull 1999). The debate between pluralists and monists rages on (Wilson 1999).

Biological species are often given as one of the classic examples of a “natural kind”. The philosophy of systematics has had a major influence on recent work on classification and natural kinds (Dupré 1993, 2002; Wilson et. al. 1997; Boyd 1999; Griffiths 1999; Wilson 1999; Okasha 2001; Walsh 2006). For example, can there be a notion of natural kind or essentialism consistent with the “population thinking” found in biology (Mayr 1975, Sober 1980; Ariew 2008)?

5. Philosophy of Molecular Biology

We mentioned above that the reduction of Mendelian genetics to molecular genetics was one of the first topics to be discussed in the philosophy of biology. The initial debate between Schaffner and Hull was followed by the so-called “anti-reductionist consensus” (Kitcher 1984). The reductionist position was revived in a series of important papers by Kenneth Waters (1990, 1994) and debate over the cognitive relationship between the two disciplines continues today. However, the question is not now framed as a simple choice between reduction and irreducibility (Griffiths 1999; Kitcher 1999; Sober 1999). Rather, a variety of concepts have been introduced and discussed including multiple realizability, realization, and mechanism (Wilson 2005, Craver 2007; Polger & Shapiro 2016). These have been important in thinking about genetics but also neuroscience and cell biology more generally. For example, Lindley Darden, Schaffner and others have argued that explanations in molecular biology are not neatly confined to one ontological level, and hence that ideas of ‘reduction’ derived from classical examples like the reduction of the phenomenological gas laws to molecular kinematics in nineteenth century physics are simply inapplicable (Darden and Maull 1977; Schaffner 1993). Moreover, molecular biology does not have the kind of grand theory based around a set of laws or a set of mathematical models that is familiar from the physical sciences. Instead, highly specific mechanisms that have been uncovered in detail in one model organism seem to act as “exemplars” allowing the investigation of similar, although not necessarily identical, mechanisms in other organisms that employ the same, or related, molecular interactants. Darden and others have argued that these “mechanisms” – specific collections of entities and their distinctive activities – are the fundamental unit of scientific discovery and scientific explanation, not only in molecular biology, but in a wide range of special sciences (Machamer, Darden et al. 2000; Craver & Darden 2013; see also Bechtel and Richardson 1993). There is an interesting question about whether the notion of mechanism aptly applies in other areas of biology (Skipper & Millstein 2005; Havstad 2011).

Another important topic in the philosophy of molecular biology has been the concept of the gene (Beurton, Falk and Rheinberger 2000; Waters 2000, 2004; Griffiths and Stotz 2007). Philosophers have also written extensively on the concept of genetic information, the general tenor of the literature being that it is difficult to reconstruct this idea precisely in a way that does justice to the apparent weight placed on it by molecular biologists (Sarkar 1996; Maynard Smith 2000; Godfrey-Smith 2001; Griffiths 2001; Jablonka 2002; Rosenberg 2006). For example, does DNA actually carry semantic information (Shea 2007)? If it does not, is this a useful fiction, or is it hindering molecular biology (Levy 2001)?

6. Philosophy of Developmental Biology

The debates over adaptationism in the 1980’s made philosophers familiar with the complex interactions between explanations of traits in evolutionary biology and explanations of the same traits in developmental biology. Developmental biology throws light on the kinds of variation that are likely to be available for selection, posing the question of how far the results of evolution can be understood in terms of the options that were available (“developmental constraints”) rather than the natural selection of those options (Maynard Smith, Burian et al. 1985). The debate over developmental constraints looked at developmental biology solely from the perspective of whether it could provide answers to evolutionary questions. However, as Ron Amundson pointed out, developmental biologists are addressing questions of their own, and, he argued, a different concept of constraint is needed to address those questions (Amundson 1994). The emergence in the 1990’s of a new field promising to unite both kinds of explanation, evolutionary developmental biology, has given rise to a substantial philosophical literature aimed at characterizing this field from a methodological viewpoint (Gray 1992; Griffiths and Gray 1994; Oyama 2000a, 2000b; Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001; Maienschein and Laubichler 2004; Robert 2004; Amundson 2005; Brandon and Sansom 2007). For example, developmental systems theorists (Gray 1992; Griffiths and Gray 1994; Oyama 2000a, 2000b; Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001) argue for “parity” between genes and non-genetic factors. First, organisms inherit a “developmental matrix” and not just genes (e.g. “epigenetic inheritance”). Second, the role of genes is in the development of traits is not causally unique – insofar as genes “carry information” or are “copied” the same can be said of other factors. That is, genes and developmental factors causally covary with phenotypic traits. However, defenders of “extended replicators” argue that genes uniquely carry information in a teleosemantic sense (Sterelny et. al. 1996). Another source of philosophical controversy in developmental biology concerns whether any traits are innate and what innateness might be (Ariew 1999; Griffiths 2002; Mameli and Bateson 2006). Philosophers have contributed to clarifying the difference concepts at issue.

7. Philosophy of Ecology and Conservation Biology

Until recently this was an extremely underdeveloped field in the philosophy of biology. This is surprising, because there is obvious potential for all three of the approaches to philosophy of biology discussed above. There is also a substantial body of philosophical work in environmental ethics, and answering the questions that arise there would require a critical examination of ecology and conservation biology (Brennan 2014). Over the last twenty years, this field has developed rapidly (Colyvan et. al. 2009).

Philosophers have started to remedy the neglect of ecology and a number of major books have appeared (Cooper 2003, Ginzburg and Colyvan 2004, Sarkar 2005, MacLaurin and Sterelny 2008). The discussions have focused on several topics including the complicated and sometimes troubled relationship between mathematical models and empirical data in ecology (Shrader-Frechette & McCoy 1993; Ginzburg and Colyvan 2004; Odenbaugh 2005; Weisberg 2012), whether there are distinctive ecological laws (Cooper 2003; Mikkelson 2003; Lange 2005; Eliot 2011b, Linquist et. al. 2016), the nature and reality of ecological communities and ecosystems (Sterelny 2006; Odenbaugh 2007; Eliot 2011), the “robustness“ of ecological principles (Odenbaugh 2003; Weisberg & Reisman 2008; Justus 2012), the idea of ecological stability and the “balance of nature” (Odenbaugh 2001; Cooper 2003; Mikkelson 2001; Justus 2008), the definition of biodiversity (Sarkar 2005; MacLaurin and Sterelny 2008; Santana 2014), and the relationship between ecology and conservation biology (Linquist 2008). Recently, there has been interesting work done on functions in ecology as well (Jax, 2005; Odenbaugh 2010; Nunes-Neto et. al. 2014; Dussault & Bouchard 2017). Most ecologists and evolutionary biologists do not think communities or ecosystems are units of selection, and thus the selected-effects account of functions does not readily apply. So, philosophers of ecology have been exploring alternatives.

8. Methodology in Philosophy of Biology and Future Directions

Most work in the philosophy of biology is self-consciously naturalistic, recognizing no profound discontinuity in either method or content between philosophy and science. Ideally, philosophy of biology differs from biology itself not in its knowledge base, but only in the questions it asks. The philosopher aims to engage with the content of biology at a professional level, although typically with greater knowledge of its history than biologists themselves, and fewer hands-on skills. It is common for philosophers of biology to have academic credentials in the fields that are the focus of their research, and to be closely involved with scientific collaborators. Philosophy of biology’s naturalism and the continuity of its concerns with science itself is shared with much other recent work in the philosophy of science, perhaps most notably in the philosophy of neuroscience (Bechtel, Mandik et al. 2001).

Even the distinction between the questions of biology and those of philosophy of biology is not absolutely clear. As noted above, philosophers of biology address three types of questions: general questions about the nature of science, conceptual problems within biology, and traditional philosophical questions that seem open to illumination from the biosciences. When addressing the second sort of question, there is no clear distinction between philosophy of biology and theoretical biology. But while this can lead to the accusation that philosophers of biology have abandoned their calling for ‘science reporting’ it can equally well be said that a book like The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1976) is primarily a contribution to philosophical discussion of biology. Certainly, the professional skills of the philosopher are as relevant to these internal conceptual puzzles as they are to the other two types of question. All three types of question can be related to the specific findings of the biological sciences only by complex chains of argument.

There is a great deal of new work being in done in the philosophy of biology. As examples, there is a rich philosophical literature emerging around cancer (Plutynski 2018), cultural evolution (Sterelny 2012; Lewens 2015; O’Connor 2019), human nature (Machery 2008; Ramsey 2013; Kronfeldner 2018), microbiology (O’Malley 2014), and paleobiology (Turner 2011; Currie 2018). Philosophy of biology still remains one of the most dynamic and interesting areas of the philosophy of science and philosophy more generally.


Recent textbooks include Elliott Sober’s Philosophy of Biology (Sober 1999), Kim Sterelny and Paul Griffiths’s Sex and Death: An Introduction to Philosophy of Biology (1999), Marjorie Greene and David Depew’s The Philosophy of Biology: An Episodic History (2004), Brian Gavey’s Philosophy of Biology (2007), Alexander Rosenberg and Daniel McShea’s Philosophy of Biology: A contemporary introduction (2008), and Peter Godfrey-Smith’s Philosophy of Biology (2014).Valuable edited collections designed to supplement such a text are Elliott Sober’s Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology (Sober 2006) which collects the classic papers on core debates, David Hull and Michael Ruse’s The Philosophy of Biology which aims at a comprehensive survey using recent papers (1998), and the Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology (Hull and Ruse 2007), The Handbook of Philosophy of Biology (Matthen and Stephens 2007), and Blackwell Companion to the Philosophy of Biology (Sarkar and Plutynski 2008) which all consist of essays on key topics by leading authors.

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  • Ariew, A., 1999. “Innateness is Canalization”, in V. Hardcastle (ed.) Where Biology Meets Psychology, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
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  • Brandon, R. N. (ed.), 1996. Concepts and Methods in Evolutionary Biology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1997. “Does biology have laws? The experimental evidence”, PSA 1996 (Volume 2), 444–457.
  • –––, 2005. “The Difference between Selection and Drift: A Reply to Millstein,” Biology & Philosophy, 20(1): 153–170.
  • Brandon, R. N. and Burian, R. M. (eds.), 1984. Genes, Organisms, and Populations, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Brandon, R., and M. D. Rausher, 1996. “Testing adaptationism: A comment on Orzack and Sober,” The American Naturalist, 148: 189–201.
  • Brandon, R. N. and Sansom, R. (eds.), 2007. Integrating Evolution and Development, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brennan, A., 2014. Thinking about Nature (Routledge Revivals): An Investigation of Nature, Value and Ecology, London: Routledge.
  • Buller, D. J., 2006. Adapting Minds: Evolutionary Psychology and the Persistent Quest for Human Nature, Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
  • Callebaut, W., 1993. Taking the Naturalistic Turn, or How Real Philosophy of Science is Done, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Colyvan, M., Linquist, S., Grey, W., Griffiths, P. E., Odenbaugh, J., & Possingham, H. P., 2009. “Philosophical Issues in Ecology: Recent Trends and Future Directions,” Ecology and Society, 14(2): 22; online publication.
  • Cooper, G., 2003. The Science of the Struggle for Existence: On the foundations of ecology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Coyne, J. A. and Orr, H. A., 2004. Speciation, Sunderland, MA: Sinauer Associates, Inc.
  • Craver, C. F., 2007. Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Craver, C. F., & Darden, L., 2013. In Search of Mechanisms: Discoveries Across the Life Sciences, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Currie, A., 2018. Rock, bone, and ruin: An optimist’s guide to the historical sciences, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Darden, L. and Maull, N., 1977. “Interfield theories,” Philosophy of Science, 44(1): 43–64.
  • Dawkins, R., 1976. The Selfish Gene, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dretske, F., 1991. Explaining Behavior: Reasons in a World of Causes, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1997. Naturalizing the Mind, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Dupré, J. (ed.), 1987. The Latest on the Best: Essays on Optimality and Evolution, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1993. The Disorder of Things: Metaphysical Foundations of the Disunity of Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2002. “Is ‘Natural Kind’ a Natural Kind Term?“ Monist, 85(1): 29–49.
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