Emotional Responses to Fiction

First published Wed Feb 21, 2024

Imagine that you are reading The Fellowship of the Ring. Tolkien introduces you to a strange new world where, amongst other magical occurrences, you fictionally encounter monsters. Your responses to the orcs, giant spiders, and other monstrosities are probably nothing like what they would be if you encountered them in real life; you would fear the orcs rather than feel curious or intrigued by them and you would run away from the creature rather than remain in your comfy chair. Indeed, we often don’t intentionally react to the objects we see on a screen or stage or read about in a novel beyond mere reflexes and basic physiological responses. Our intentional behavior to fictional entities is much different from how we would behave towards their real-life counterparts, emotionally, morally, and functionally.

The asymmetry between our behaviors and emotional responses to real-life versus fictional characters has drawn a great deal of philosophical attention. The nature of our emotional responses to fiction bears on debates in ontology, philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, epistemology, ethics, as well as philosophy of art. Emotions about fictional entities are also central to many peoples’ lived experience: isn’t it both strange and fascinating that we care so deeply for certain characters, such as dear Frodo, even though we know they aren’t real?

The central philosophical puzzle concerning fiction and emotions is captured by the paradox of fiction, first introduced by Colin Radford (1975). This paradox captures an interesting tension concerning emotional responses to fiction, for surely we only have genuine emotional responses to things we believe to be real! In these debates, “fiction” occurs in literature, motion pictures, TV shows, opera, theater, and perhaps even some works of music (e.g., SZA’s pop song “Kill Bill”) or paintings (e.g., The Lady of Shalott by John William Waterhouse). All such works have the power to emotionally move audiences, but the nature of the psychological states and processes involved is the subject of debate. Recently, though, philosophers have moved past questions concerning the nature of emotions about fiction to concerns about the social and moral ramifications of emotional responses to fiction (Feagin 2011).

The majority of this article focuses on the psychological foundations of our emotional responses to fiction and the paradox of fiction. §1 covers several different scholarly perspectives on the nature of our emotional responses to fictional entities. §2 addresses the paradox of fiction and a variety of approaches that scholars have taken to dissolve it. §3 provides a brief introduction to several further puzzles concerning emotion and fiction, including the sympathy for the devil phenomenon, the paradox of painful art, and the puzzle of imaginative resistance, and how these puzzles inform and build on those addresses in the previous sections.

Further reading: Carroll 2011; Currie 1995; Gendler & Kovakovich 2006; Tullmann & Buckwalter 2014; Walton 1978 & 1990.

1. The psychology of emotions about fiction

Typically, if harm comes to someone I care about, I would feel a great deal of sorrow and concern for that person. I may also feel anger at whomever or whatever harmed them and would be motivated to act on their behalf. However, we generally won’t have such reactions during our emotional engagement with works of fiction. To borrow an example from Radford (1975: 70), I do not weep over Mercutio’s body after he is killed while watching a theatrical production of Romeo & Juliet. I do not seek revenge or challenge Tybalt to a duel. I do, however, feel very strongly about Mercutio’s death. It’s the behavioral responses to our emotions about fictional characters and reality that vary wildly. In this section, we will explore some of the ways to explain this asymmetry and, in general, the nature of our emotional responses to fiction. Ultimately, one’s response to the “asymmetry problem” depends on further commitments concerning the nature of emotions and other mental states. The views expounded here—theories of make-believe, simulation theory, and theories of empathy—all explain emotional responses to fiction in relation to real-life emotional responses. The views differ with respect to the psychological framework they emphasize, be it imagination, offline processing, or a range of empathetic practices.

1.1 The distinct attitude view (DAV)

Some scholars argue that a solution to the asymmetry problem requires a distinctive mental attitude that we employ during our engagements with fiction. The nature of the distinct attitude varies by the theorist. Quite often, a mental “box” or mechanism is posited that we utilize exclusively when considering non-actual objects, including fictional ones (see, for example, Nichols & Stich 2003), as well as hypothetical and counterfactual thought, mental activities involving deliberation and decision-making, mental imagery, and mindreading (attributing mental states to other people).

Alternatively, we may use largely the same mental processes as in real-life situations, but these processes are run “offline”, disconnected from their typical functional and inferential output. The result is a different kind of mental state than we would have if we considered a real-life or actual object. We adopt pretend (Searle 1975; see also Kripke 2011 & 2013), simulated (e.g., Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Walton 1997), or imaginary beliefs, desires, emotions, and thoughts toward non-actual objects (e.g., Schroeder & Matheson 2006; Weinberg & Meskin 2006). These states are isomorphic to genuine mental attitudes and may sometimes be phenomenologically indistinguishable from them. While pretense, simulation, and imagination differ in important ways, each view trades on the idea that our mental attitudes concerning fiction differ in content and functional role from those concerning actual events or objects—even if, phenomenologically, the experience of each is similar (see Friend 2022 for a comment on and critique of this asymmetry).

All proponents of the distinct attitude view argue that mental states such as emotions can be identified in terms of their characteristic functional roles. Consider beliefs. It is generally understood that our beliefs about real-life and non-actual objects utilize many of the same causal and inferential pathways. However, they have significantly different inputs and result in very different outputs. Our real-life, everyday beliefs are about things that we can or might in principle see, touch, and hear—things that exist concretely, or spatiotemporally. These objects act as the input for our everyday, stereotypical beliefs (see Fitzpatrick 2016; García-Carpintero 2019; Lewis 1978; Plantinga 1974; Quine 1948 [1953]; Sainsbury 2010; Salmon 1998; Schiffer 1996; B. Smith 1980; Thomasson 1999 & 2003; Walton 1990). In contrast, beliefs about fiction (and other non-actual objects) do not take actual, concrete objects as their object. Rather, they are about fictional things, however that might be cashed out ontologically. The output of our mental processing about actual and fictional objects is also different; they result in different kinds of behaviors. So, while our beliefs about real life and our beliefs about works of fiction are similar in many ways, proponents of the DAV hold that they are different enough to constitute a distinct kind of mental state. The result, on this view, is that we have belief-like (or imaginary, or simulated) attitudes towards the content of fiction, but not beliefs simpliciter.

Consider Currie and Ravenscroft’s (2002) argument for imaginary mental states. They maintain that mental states such as emotions and beliefs serve as part of an inferential network, motivating not only action, but also other mental states. The authors posit that beliefs about fiction are run offline, disconnected from their normal behavioral and cognitive networks. The same goes for other activities with non-actual content, such as hypothetical thought and pretend play. These states are not stereotypical beliefs, but rather imaginative ones because stereotypical beliefs are understood in terms of the behavior that they produce.

The psychologist Paul Harris (2000) provides further evidence for this view, particularly in terms of our emotional responses to imaginings. Very young children tend to be overcome by the emotions caused by their imaginative activities—e.g., fearing the monster under the bed or witches that they saw in a movie—even if they know that the fiction is not real. Older children and adults are generally able to regulate and override these emotions, but still may often become absorbed in their imaginative activity. We get “lost” in a film or novel and experience strong emotional reactions, emotions that color our real-life activities. We generally do not act on these emotions, though, which suggests that they are distinct from the everyday emotions we experience in response to real-life objects and events.

Further reading: Camp 2009; Damasio 1994; Fontaine & Rahman 2014; Gendler & Kovakovich 2006; Gilmore 2020; Goldman 2006a; Kosslyn 1997; Kosslyn et al. 1993; LeDoux 1996; Meinong 1904 [1960]; Moran 1994; O’Craven & Kanwisher 2000; Stecker 2011; Toon 2010a, 2010b, 2012; Tullmann 2022; van Leeuwen 2013.

1.2 Theories of make-believe

One way of explaining the asymmetry problem from a distinct attitude perspective is a fictional theory of make-believe, popularized by Kendall Walton (1978 & 1990). According to a theory of make-believe, our engagements with fiction draw on our capacities for imagination and pretense. While reading a novel, for example, we play a game of make-believe, creating a “fictional world” in which the propositions presented in the novel are fictionally true. On this view, each reader is the participant and creator of her own fiction-based game. Fictional worlds are similar to the imaginary worlds that children create during their pretend play (Walton 1990; Currie 1990, Harris 2000). Works of fiction prescribe imaginings: words on a page, for instance, invite imaginative engagement with a work. Pretense, here, involves acts of behaving and thinking as if some proposition or state of affairs is true while knowing that it is not. In their games of make-believe, a child may pretend that a couch is a house, underneath a dining room table is a dungeon, and a baseball bat is a magnificent sword—all while knowing that none of these are the case. Rather, the imaginative game of make-believe makes it fictionally true that the dining room contains a dungeon and that the baseball bat is a sword.

Theories of make-believe hold that something similar occurs when adults engage with fiction, but this time the props are largely imaginative. While reading the Lord of the Rings series, we pretend that there is a world like our own in which wizards, elves, and dwarves exist alongside good-natured hobbits and an evil dark lord. The novel itself acts as a prop, each line feeding into our fictional world and adding layer upon layer of detail to our game of make-believe. The game of make-believe extends to our psychological states: we pretend to believe that Frodo defeated the Dark Lord by tossing the Ring of Power into the fires of Mount Doom, for instance. Importantly, we have fictional emotions about Frodo and his crew and fictional desires for the young hobbit to vanquish Sauron. Stacie Friend (2022) points out that Walton does not deny that we have some genuine emotional responses to fiction. Rather, he seems to deny that we have genuine fear, pity, joy, etc. Instead, we experience a different kind of emotion that is bound by the imaginative game; these emotions are different in kind from everyday emotions because they are functionally and cognitively “quarantined” (to borrow Friend’s term) from cognitive and functional states about real life things.

A theory of make-believe attempts to explain two things: the ontology of fiction and the nature of our psychological states about them. Let’s begin with the ontological question. Do fictions and fictional characters exist? What are fictional entities such that we can think about them, speak about them, etc.? Theories of make-believe have a ready response to these questions: fictional entities do not, strictly speaking, exist outside of one’s game of make-believe. Instead, when we discuss fictional entities, we make pretend illocutions concerning pretend objects. Like an actor in a performance of Hamlet, we do not make genuine assertions when we speak about the goings-on of fiction. We merely pretend to do so as a part of the game. Fictional entities are not objects that can be found in space or time, even if the images or words used as props can be (a painted figure, a film image of a person, or words that describe a villain).

Walton contrasts his view with a realist Meinongian theory, according to which fictional entities exist eternally as abstracta, similar to Platonic forms (1990; see also Sainsbury 2010 and Wolterstorff 1980). On this view, fiction entities are not created, but rather drawn upon and put together in creative ways by authors, filmmakers, dramatists, etc. Meinongian theories have come under strong attack, and rightly so—it is counterintuitive that fictional entities are Platonic ideals that are not created by the author, for instance (see Thomasson 1999). However, contrasting a pretense theory with the Meinongian position ignores the more fine-grained issues concerning the existence of fictional entities. The middle ground includes other broadly realist theories, such as the possible objects view (Lewis 1978, which holds that fictional entities are denizens of far-off possible worlds) or the abstract artifact view favored by Kripke (2011 & 2013), Salmon (1998), Schiffer (1996), and Thomasson (1999), which holds that fictional entities are non-corporeal but created entities whose existence and persistence depends on the practices of people in the real world.

However, neither realist nor pretense-based ontology entails that our mental states about fiction are distinct in type. It could be that we merely pretend that fictional objects exist when we think about and discuss them. Our mental states about those objects are the standard mental states, about something fictional. That is one possible way in which to understand the ontological and psychological questions of fiction: an anti-realist ontology of fictional entities coupled with a genuine attitude view of mental states. Unfortunately, this view raises a host of questions concerning the possibility of referring to nonexistent objects.

For this reason, many anti-realists about fictional entities favor the DAV according to which our mental states towards fictional entities are not stereotypical mental states. One popular way in which to ground a psychology of make-believe is to adopt some form of simulation theory (ST), which we will explore further in the next subsection. ST is typically used in cognitive science to explain how we attribute mental states to others, especially to predict their behaviors and understand their emotional state (see Goldman 2006a; Gordon 1986; Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Nichols, Stich, et al. 1996; Prinz 2002). Currie and Ravenscroft (2002) argue that imagination essentially involves the capacity to put ourselves in the place of another or our self in another place or time. Importantly, both Walton and Currie/Ravenscroft hold that the mental attitudes we adopt in our imaginings are substitutes for genuine ones; we have imaginative or fictional beliefs about fiction instead of beliefs simpliciter. On their view, imagining simulates the role of other states, such as the role beliefs play in inferential processes (2002: 49).

The upshot of a theory of make-believe—combining anti-realism about fictional entities and ST to explain our psychological states towards them—is that it allows proponents of the distinct attitude view a theoretically cohesive and elegant means by which to solve the puzzles of fiction described below. For example, we can solve the paradox of fiction by arguing that we do not possess ordinary types of beliefs about fictional entities, rejecting the premise of the paradox that states we have genuine beliefs about fictions. We feel “sympathy for the devil” because that emotion is distinct from our normal cognitive processing, which allows us to experience unique emotional and moral responses towards entities that do not match how we would respond to their real-life counterparts.

Further reading: Kroon 1994; Levinson 1993; Mothersill 2002; Searle 1975; Summa 2019; Toon 2010a & b, 2012.

1.3 Simulation theory

Simulation theory gained prominence in the late 1980s with the work of philosophers like Alvin Goldman (1989, 1993, 2006a,b), Robert Gordon (1986 & 1996), and Jane Heal (1996) and has been adopted in a variety of fields, including aesthetics, to explain our mental processing about other persons’ mental states. ST holds that we utilize our own perceptual, emotional, and cognitive mechanisms while mindreading (attempting to understand the mental states of others). We project or imagine ourselves in the situation of the observed person. As with the cases of mental states about fiction mentioned above, these mental mechanisms are run offline, disconnected from their typical functional output (see Currie & Ravenscroft 2002). This results in simulated mental states that are distinct from stereotypical mental states. In fictional cases, audiences utilize simulated input (non-genuine emotions, for example) and garner simulated output (a pretend emotion about what a character thinks or feels) when simulating the mental states of a fictional entity.

Consider Alvin Goldman’s version of ST (1993 & 2006a). Goldman argues that we attribute mental states to another after we recognize our own mental states under actual or imagined conditions. I transform myself, imaginatively, into her based on my understanding of how I would feel or think in the same situation. I imaginatively take on what I imagine to be her relevant beliefs, desires, emotions, and perspective to determine further mental states and behavioral predictions. This is called enactive imagining—or, e-imagining, for short—because I utilize my own mental processes for simulative imagining. Once I e-imagine myself as the target, I can introspect what I feel during this particular situation. I then judge that the target feels the same way.

Gregory Currie’s version of ST provides another elegant explanation for psychological states about fiction. Currie has backed away from a strong simulative approach in some of his recent work, but the general assumption of offline ST remains the same (see Currie & Ravenscroft 2002). Like Walton, Currie argues that our basic psychological interactions with fiction involve games of make-believe, games that are based on imaginatively simulating fictional actions and the minds of fictional characters. On this view, audiences imaginatively take on the mental states of others as closely as possible and run their own “mental economy” to see how they would feel in a comparable situation. This view also adopts a version of the DAV; our mental attitudes about imaginings are not stereotypical mental attitudes, but rather pretend/imaginary ones. This is because these states lack their typical functional role.

According to Currie’s ST, audiences are intended to adopt imaginative attitudes toward fictional characters and situations (Currie 1990). Currie distinguishes between primary imagining and secondary imagining. Primary imaginings involve what is true in a story, “those things which it makes fictional” (1995: 255). We adopt the fictional beliefs necessary to maintain a coherent fictional world while disregarding those which contradict it. I disregard my real belief that eagles are not large enough to carry humans while reading The Lord of the Rings, for instance. I also adopt the imaginative belief that there exists large, perambulating tree folk. When I watch the film adaptation of The Fellowship of the Ring and come to learn of the danger and power of the One Ring, I do not acquire a new belief that “there is One Ring desired by Sauron”, but rather a “belief-like imagining” of this proposition.

Secondary imagining is a form of simulation that occurs when we engage in an empathetic reenactment of a character’s situation (Currie 1995: 256). First, I put myself into a fictional character’s position: I imagine what it would be like to be Frodo learning about the ring from the wizard Gandalf. Then I reflect on what I currently feel as the result of this imagining: surprised and scared. Once I identify my thoughts, desires, and feelings, I then imagine that that is how Frodo feels in this situation as well. In this sense, secondary imagining helps us to identify and empathize with fictional characters. I then remove myself from the simulation, so to speak, and attribute these same feelings to Frodo. The assumption is that all or most of this mental processing occurs both offline and unconsciously, so we do not act on our emotion-like imaginings and are not necessarily aware when they occur.

Further reading: Blanchet 2020; Cochrane 2010; Gallese 2019; Gordon 1992; LeBar 2001; Nichols & Stitch 2003; Short 2015; Spaulding 2016.

1.4 Empathy

Finally, some philosophers contend that the primary way by which we emotionally engage with fictional entities is through empathy (see Agosta 2010; Bailey 2021; Coplan & Goldie 2011; Gallagher 2012; Maibom 2014; Prinz 2011; Stueber 2011; Vetlesen 1994; Walton 2015). Arguments about fiction and empathy are very similar to those concerning simulation and make-believe; in each case, audiences are thought to imaginatively put themselves in the situation of the character, consider how they would feel in a similar context, and infer that must be how the character feels as well However, empathy can take on a variety of forms, some which are quick, seemingly automatic and outside of conscious control and appear rather different from the simulation theories described above. Other forms of empathy are slower and more deliberate, like those that may be part of games of make-believe.

Martin Hoffman (2008) identifies processes like mimicry, mirroring, and direct association as three forms of fast, unconsciously activated empathy. Mimicry involves an “innate, involuntary, isomorphic response to another’s expression of emotion” (2008: 441). There are two steps involved in mimicking the emotion of a target. First, there is an automatic change in the subject’s facial expression, voice, and posture at the same time as a corresponding change in the target’s facial expression, vocal intonation, posture, etc. These changes then trigger similar feelings in the target as those present in the target. Mirror neurons may be the neural basis of mimicry. These neurons are triggered when one person observes the actions or emotional expressions of another. This results in the same kind of neural pattern in the subject as if she were performing the observed action or having the same emotion herself (2008: 441; see also Freedberg & Gallese 2007; Clay & Iacoboni 2011; Decety & Meltzoff 2011; Goldman 2006a).

There is also some evidence that subjects can mirror the motor intentions of a target; witnessing a movement in another (or even in a statue!) results in the subject’s motor cortex being activated as if she were the one moving (Freedberg & Gallese 2007).

Finally, direct association occurs when we perceive a target who undergoes an event that is similar to one that we have experienced in the past (Hoffman 2008: 441). For example, a friend of mine has recently lost her pet dog and displays sorrow-related signals (crying, having a “long face”, slouched posture, etc.). My memory of a similar situation in which I lost my pet parrot makes me also express these signals and even consciously experience sadness. I make this association unconsciously, without thinking about it or planning to do so.

While some of our social cognitive abilities seem to occur automatically, there are other cases in which understanding a target’s mental state requires slower, more thoughtful, and deliberate processes. Sometimes we may need to deliberately take on a target’s perspective to know how they feel or what they will do next. Perspective-taking seems especially important in ambiguous scenes in which we do not know enough about a person or her context and so we have difficulty judging how she feels or what she believes or desires. Sometimes perspective-taking is simply equated with empathy. When subject X empathizes with a target, Y, they imaginatively take on Y’s mental states as closely as possible. X shares in Y’s mental state and, further, that X’s responses are caused by and involve the same type of state as Y’s. In taking another’s perspective, I “put myself in their shoes”, and imagine what they must think or feel in a particular situation.

Each of these forms of empathy is relevant to how audiences emotionally engage with fictional characters. To continue the Lord of the Rings example, audiences may have to take Frodo’s perspective to fully appreciate how he feels the moment he discovers how dangerous Bilbo’s old ring really is. Mirroring Frodo’s facial expression (while watching the movie) may engender similar feelings of fear and surprise in me. These are both instances of empathy, each of which, arguably, helps audiences better appreciate the work of fiction and characters within.

Further reading: Carruthers 1996; Goldman 1993& 2006a; Freedberg & Gallese 2007; Clay & Iacoboni 2011; Decety & Meltzoff 2011; Hoffman 2008.

1.5 Alternate views

The above views—make-believe, simulation, and empathy—explain interactions with fiction in a similar manner: we engage with fiction by utilizing similar pathways to real-life interactions but with non-real objects. Our mental states about fiction may not be genuine sorrow, anger, etc. The differences between the views are in the details of how the psychological states concerning fiction are cashed out—whether the best explanation for engagement with fiction stems from simulation theory, a theory of imagination, or a theory of empathy.

Some philosophers have rejected simulation theories and theories of make-believe as the primary way to understand the psychological mechanisms involved in our emotional responses to fiction (Carroll 2008; Matravers 2014; Tullmann 2022; Wilson 2011). Philosophers such as Noël Carroll (2008) contend that simulation, make-believe, and empathy are generally not required for understanding fictional entities. Authors, filmmakers, and other fictional content creators often make the inner lives of characters obvious to their audiences. For instance, in the Frodo and the Ring example, it is clear that Frodo is scared by his words, actions, and facial expression—no make-believe or simulation is required!

The main theoretical support for the DAV stems from a folk psychological and functionalist understanding of the nature of mental attitudes. Beliefs, desires, judgments, etc. have characteristic behavioral and inferential roles, understood in terms of inputs from stimuli and their cognitive and behavioral outputs. As we have discussed, real-life emotions and their imaginative counterparts might utilize much of the same causal and inferential pathways to bring about certain responses, but they employ significantly different inputs and result in very different outputs (see, e.g., Currie 1990; Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Weinberg & Meskin 2006; Schroeder & Matheson 2006). Furthermore, research in psychology and cognitive neuroscience seems to support the idea that engaging with non-actual objects utilizes many, but not all, of the same neural pathways as our mental activities concerning actual things (Kosslyn, Thompson, & Alpert 1997; Kosslyn, Thompson, & Ganis 2006). These studies help to explain why our reactions to imaginative activity are often so robust but may also suggest that we utilize a distinct attitude in our engagements with fiction (Damasio 1994; Schroeder & Matheson 2006).

As we’ve also seen, theorists generally try to explain the distinctness of our imaginative attitudes in terms of functional role (behavioral outputs) or inferential role (mental outputs); our mental states towards fiction do not lead to the kinds of thoughts and behaviors that they would for real-life objects. This problematically assumes a straightforward functionalist view of mental states that, while attractive in terms of folk psychology, may not accurately capture the nature of how mental states motivate action or inferential processes. However, if mental states are not individuated in terms of functional role, then the case could be made we may in fact have standard mental states towards fiction, despite the fact that we do not act towards fictional objects as we do towards real-life ones (see Buckwalter & Tullmann 2017). One can argue from a principle of parsimony that there is no need to posit a distinct mental attitude if typical ones have the same explanatory power.

Finally, the DAV (especially one utilizing a theory of make-believe or simulation theory) does not seem to be able to account for our actual phenomenological—that is, conscious, possibly introspectable—experiences with fiction. Our emotions, beliefs, desires, and other mental states towards fiction feel natural and relatively automatic, not like we are playing a game of make-believe or simulating a possible course of action. The assumption, here, is that there is something it is like to engage in a game of make-believe; we knowingly and willingly begin games of make-believe and do not explicitly do so with works of fiction. The proponent of the DAV may dismiss the phenomenological worry by arguing that the game of make-believe or simulation takes place unconsciously and, after some practice, quite rapidly. Some of the imaginings involved in a game of make-believe are deliberate and consist of conscious, occurrent mental states. But others are spontaneous, unconscious, and automatic. We do not tell ourselves to begin imagining what is going to happen to our favorite television character. We simply do it, sometimes without realizing it. Walton says that when this happens our imaginings “have a life of our own” and we feel less like an author than a spectator to the imagining (Walton 1990: 14).

Stacie Friend (2022) has recently put forth another approach to the psychology of fiction that provides nuance to the debate concerning genuine and fictional emotions. For Friend, emotions about fiction and those about real life cannot be so easily separated in terms of functional role, motivation, and phenomenological experience. Some emotions about fiction are motivational and some emotions about real life are not (admiration, for instance). Walton and Friend deny that there is a phenomenological difference in kind between the two types of emotion: we cannot say, for instance, that our sorrow over the death of Anna Karenina is less intense than sorrow about the death of a real-life friend—or, at least, the intensity does not differ so much to warrant a distinct type of mental attitude. In general, Friend states:

Emotions are multidimensional, and each dimension—physiological, phenomenological, motivational or evaluative—is complex, admitting of a variety of degrees and distinctions. There is no dimension along which a dichotomy between “fictional” and “ordinary” emotions can be sustained. (2022: 262).

The upshot of this view is that discussions concerning emotions and fiction can move past debates concerning the nature of fictional emotions to questions about the appropriateness, rationality, and social/moral implications of those emotions, as we will see in §3 below.

Further reading: Carruthers 1996 & 2011; Friend 2020; Gopnik 1993; Gopnik & Schulz 2004; Fodor 1983; Robinson 2005.

2. The Paradox of Fiction

The nature of the mental architecture for imaginary and fictional contexts grounds some of the pressing puzzles concerning our emotional responses to fiction—most prominently, the so-called paradox of fiction. Cognitive belief-based theories of emotions were in full sway when the paradox was first introduced (Radford 1975; Walton 1978; Currie 1990). According to these views, an emotion about an object X requires that we have some relevant belief Y concerning X’s relation to our well-being. For example, experiencing fear requires that I believe that there is an object in my environment that could harm me or someone I care about. We lack the emotion if the relevant belief is absent (Solomon 1976 [1993]).

The wording of the paradox reveals an adherence to a belief-based theory of emotions. One version of the paradox states:

  1. We have genuine emotions about fiction all the time.
  2. We do not believe that fictional characters exist.
  3. We can only have genuine emotions about things we believe to exist.

Different authors word the three propositions slightly differently—and, indeed, this formulation is not found in Radford’s original 1975 piece—but the tension between belief and fiction is the same across versions. The paradox is intended to capture a very natural thought concerning our emotions: if we know that we are engaged with a work of fiction, we should not have the emotionally relevant belief. No emotion should arise. Nevertheless, we have emotional experiences about fiction all the time, whether these are genuine emotions or not.

Responses to the paradox typically proceed by either accepting the irrationality of emotions about fiction or dismantling one of the propositions of the paradox. Some reject the paradox out of hand. This section explores each of these responses in turn.

Further reading: Buckwalter & Tullmann 2017; Langland-Hassan 2020; Cova & Teroni 2016.

2.1 Emotional responses are irrational

One interpretation of the paradox states that there is something fundamentally irrational about our responses to fictional entities. Colin Radford (1975) accepts (variations on) each of the paradox’s propositions, arguing that our emotions towards fiction force the reader into adopting two contradictory beliefs: we both believe and do not believe that the fictional object of our emotion exists. Radford states:

I am left with the conclusion that our being moved in certain ways by works of art, though very “natural” to us and in that way only too intelligible, involves us in inconsistency and so incoherence (1975: 78).

It isn’t immediately clear what Radford meant by this inconsistency and incoherence. One way of understanding this statement is to suggest that Radford contends that we hold two contradictory beliefs (about the existence of a fictional entity) at the same time. Fabrice Teroni (2019) suggests that Radford simply means that our emotions about fiction do not make sense, because they ought to dissipate once we acknowledge that the object is fictional—similar to Radford’s case in which it would be irrational to continue to feel sorrow about the death of one’s sister once one comes to realize that the belief in one’s sister’s death is false. Still, it does seem that, to Radford, it is just a brute fact of human psychology that we have emotion-like responses to fiction. We are sad when our favorite character dies and are righteously angry when they are harmed. But these are not genuine emotions, because most, if not all, genuine emotions require a belief in the existence of their object. Radford doesn’t treat the irrationality of emotional responses to fiction as a problem, however. In fact, he argues that we have these sorts of incoherent responses all the time: when we cheer for our favorite sports team, fully knowing that nothing we do on our couch at home influences the game, or when we fear death even while acknowledging that it is nothing more than a dreamless sleep (to use Radford’s example, 1975: 79).

While not explicitly addressing the paradox of fiction, other philosophers have taken up the question of the rationality of emotions in ways that could be relevant to a response to the paradox of fiction (Gendler & Kovakovich 2006; de Sousa 2002 & 2004; D’Arms & Jacobson 2000a & 2000b). There are several ways in which emotions can be understood as being rational. First, emotions can be correct. Friend (2022) states that “It is correct to respond emotionally only if the object of emotion exists” (2022: 264). This would seem to imply that emotions about fictional entities are incorrect since the object of the emotion does not exist. In contrast, Teroni (2019) states “Correct emotions for fictional entities are emotions that correspond to truths about these fictional entities supplied by the relevant fictions” (2019: 125). To use Teroni’s example, one’s fear of a dog is correct if the dog is dangerous. For the fictional case, emotions are correct if the work of fiction gives reasons to believe that the fictional entity or event warrants that emotion. Fear about the fate of the hobbits at the end of the Lord of the Rings trilogy is correct if the text provides evidence to suggest that the hobbits are in danger.

Even if an emotion with a fictional object is incorrect (on Friend’s view), that doesn’t entail that the emotion is irrational. Teroni’s conception of emotional correctness has a stronger normative component than Friend’s—that is, conditions for which emotions might be apt. The former view might be likened to an understanding of emotional fit: how an emotional response may fit its object (see D’Arms & Jacobson 2000a). An emotion fits its object if we have some good reason to feel it; the emotion accurately represents its object. We can compare the fit between an emotion and its object to that of a true belief and a state of the world. Both spiders and battlefields may be fitting objects of fear; this evaluation is apt in some way, as being proper formal objects. Our colleague’s promotion may be a fitting object of jealousy. An off-color joke may be a fitting object of amusement. On this view, emotions fit their object in case we have some reason to have them for that object (compare this to D’Arms and Jacobson’s slightly different account of fit, which they characterize in terms of a response-dependent feature of the object that does not require reasons or norms, 2000a).

Finally, we can also speak of an emotion’s propriety. “Propriety” carries significant normative implications; it suggests that there are appropriate contexts in which one can or should have certain emotions. This way of understanding the aptness of emotions moves beyond reasons for belief and into the appropriateness of those emotions. The latter has significant social and moral implications, some of which are captured in the puzzles mentioned below in §3. Importantly, correctness, fit, and propriety may not always match in any particular object. An emotion may fit its object, but not necessarily be the proper response to take. For example, even if a battlefield is a fitting object of fear, it may not be proper for a soldier to feel if he or she has an important task to fulfill. If our colleague is also our friend it may be improper for us to be jealous of her promotion—we should be happy for her—even if it is fitting for us to be, since, perhaps, we were also due for a promotion and did not get one. When we conflate the fit and propriety of emotions, we commit the moralistic fallacy: taking the morally normative implications to be built into our emotional responses towards things in our environment (D’Arms & Jacobson 2000a & b).

Recent literature in cognitive science has begun to debunk the traditional bifurcation between rationality and emotions, showing that emotions are often necessary (or at least useful) for planning, making important decisions, and making moral judgments (Ben-Ze’ev 2000; Damasio 1994; Gordon 1986; Nichols 2004; Solomon 1976 [1993], etc.). However, it is debatable whether these benefits extend to our emotions about fiction. The central question remains whether it is rational (fit or proper) to have emotional responses to things that have no bearing on our actual lives. Moreover, Currie (1995) points out that the concept of epistemic emotional rationality is puzzling because fiction presents audiences with a great deal of false information. This could undermine one’s ability to function in the real world if one takes it literally (see Best 2020 & 2021). If this view is right, then Radford’s paradox highlights an important aspect of human psychology.

Further reading: Adair 2019; Greenspan 1988; Roberts 1992; Song 2020.

2.2 Against the first proposition

One popular way of responding to the paradox is to argue that our emotions about fictions are not genuine—we do not have genuine emotions about fictional entities all the time. While initially counter-intuitive, this view makes sense when thought of in terms of a theory of make-believe or simulation as described in §1. Perhaps the most influential view on these lines comes from Kendall Walton (1978 & 1990), who, as we have seen, has argued that our engagements with fiction are akin to childhood games of make-believe. Some of our emotional responses to fiction are genuine, but some are imaginary or make-believe. As described in §2, Walton holds that emotional responses we have towards fictional objects are very similar to emotions we have about real-life objects but are not typical emotions. This explains both why we do not act on those emotional responses and why we may seek out fictions that elicit negative emotions such as anger or sadness.

The central issue with this view is that it certainly feels as though our emotional responses to works of fiction are real. When I watch a horror film such as Get Out or Hereditary, I may cover my eyes with my face, my heart rate accelerates, I break out into a cold sweat, and involuntarily scream. These are all embodied indications of fear that I’m not faking. I really do feel terrified. According to the current response to the paradox, however, the fear responses and phenomenal states that I experience in such cases aren’t full-fledged emotions. They are “quasi” emotions. Importantly, on this view, feelings and bodily responses are not emotions themselves. While Walton is not explicitly cognitivist about emotions, he does make certain statements that seem to suggest cognitivism. For instance, in “Fearing Fictions” (1978), Walton states:

It seems a principle of common sense … that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger; (1978: 6, 7)

and also that “Charles does not believe that he is in danger; so he is not afraid” (1978: 7; see Friend 2022 for more on Walton’s view and reception). This view suggests that emotions proper are cognitive. They involve a belief or other cognitive mental state, such as a judgment or thought (more on this in the next subsection). Specifically, this view accepts the idea that a genuine emotion—say, sorrow over a friend’s death—requires a belief that our friend actually died. Imagine that a family member informs you of the death of a beloved family friend. You feel sad because you believe that your friend no longer lives. Suppose now that your family member was merely playing a cruel trick on you—the family friend isn’t dead! Your belief about the friend’s death would be overruled. However, the feelings of sorrow may linger, the way that anxiety or fear lingers after waking from a dream that we know isn’t real. Would it still make sense to say that you are sad about your friend’s death? No; most people would likely say that emotion goes away—probably replaced with anger about your family member’s cruel trick.

According to belief-based theories of emotion, something similar is happening with our emotional responses to works of fiction. One may have all the embodied reactions related to fear while watching a fictional film, but without the belief in the actuality of the fearful object, none of those reactions amount to genuine fear.

Further reading: Dos Santos 2017; Vendrell Ferran 2022; Humbert- Droz et al. 2020; Williams 2019.

2.3 Against the second proposition

Few contemporary philosophers opt to eliminate the second proposition of the paradox of fiction. Doing so implies that a reader or viewer of fiction would genuinely believe that the fiction is real while she reads or watches it. Theorists who opt to reject the second proposition of the paradox must somehow square the “suspension of disbelief” with the contradictory beliefs and actions we seem to have in response to fiction. The notion of suspending disbelief was first introduced by the British Romantic poet Samuel Coleridge, who argued that we suspend our disbelief in the nonexistence of fictional objects during our engagement with fictional stories (Coleridge 1817; see also Hurka 2001). This supposedly explains our emotional responses to fictional entities; we emotionally respond to them because we believe that they concretely exist in the time that we engage with the artwork.

While it’s certainly true that we sometimes become very absorbed in fiction, it is a genuine question whether we forget or are tricked into believing that fictional characters and events exist. Some contemporary philosophers have followed this line of thought and argued for some kind of illusion theory about fiction (see Quilty Dunn 2015; Kivy 2011). We know that the objects in fictional films are nonexistent, just like we know that a magician’s “magic” isn’t real. The question is whether we can be tricked, perhaps momentarily, into believing otherwise. Noël Carroll (Carroll 2008) characterizes this challenge as the illusion thesis: we fall prey to some kind of illusion during our engagements with fiction. So far, we have been discussing one type of illusion, concerning belief. Carroll characterizes two types of illusions:

  1. The Cognitive Illusion Thesis: one might come to believe that fictional events or characters actually occur or exist.
  2. The Perceptual Illusion Thesis: we are committed to the existence of the represented fictional objects on a perceptual level.

Different artistic media may commit us to one or both of these illusions. For example, reading a novel might subject one to a cognitive illusion, but not a perceptual illusion. Perceptual illusions generally apply to visual fiction, although we can imagine someone listening to an audiobook in her car falling prey to the perceptual illusion that the fictional person being narrated is an actual person. Moreover, while neither of these theses addresses emotional responses per se, we can think of a similar type of argument in which emotions about fiction are illusory, like the phantom limb pain phenomenon or the rubber hand illusion (Richardson 2009; de Vignemont 2007).

Many philosophers reject both versions of the illusion thesis out of hand since they seem to entail that we would act towards a character in just the same way that we would act towards a real person. As Katherine Thomson-Jones (2008) points out:

I am able to appreciate the vivid depiction of an army of zombies surging forward with arms outstretched, the use of special effects or highly emotive music, the importance of the scene for the narrative, and so on. Surely, if I had suspended my belief that the zombies are fictional, I would be too frightened to appreciate film in this way. (2008: 107)

Moreover, most of our behaviors towards fiction (or lack thereof) are inconsistent with the idea that we even temporarily suspend our disbelief about the reality of fiction—this is the asymmetry problem, once again. We do not act as if we believe that the fiction is real. The same idea works for other mental attitudes, such as desires and emotions. Moreover, our conscious experience of watching a film is also antithetical to the cognitive illusion thesis. If asked, we would deny that fictional entities are real. We would also deny that we have been tricked into believing otherwise.

Carroll also rejects the perceptual illusion thesis, arguing that it our visual experiences do not meet the first criterion. Our perception of movie screens and actual objects are not identical, or even sufficiently similar to the perceptual experience of real-life objects, to suggest a perceptual illusion. There are surface interferences—scratches and dirt on a film strip, hair on the projector slide, the size and shape of the screen, framing devices, etc.—which make the viewer aware of the screen and remind her that the objects in the movie are not really in front of her. Carroll also points out that we typically perceive edge phenomena; we can see around the edge of an object as we move but we don’t experience such phenomena in our visual perception of film. We cannot look around a character to see what is going on behind her. We can provide a similar explanation for other fictional media. We do not visually perceive plays in the same way that we do real-life people and events, because of the stage and other spatial and physical discrepancies between them. Pictures are always framed and are not subject to edge phenomena, just like films (see also Derrida 1978 [1987] and Foucault 1966 [1970]). Even listening to an audiobook will probably not sound identical to listening to real people give an account of their lives.

In contrast, Jake Quilty-Dunn (2015) provides one way to argue for a version of the perceptual illusion thesis. In this view, film viewers deploy many of the same perceptual capacities that we do in real life. We may form isomorphically similar perceptual beliefs (beliefs formed on the basis of perception rather than other cognitive states) about a face we encounter while watching a film that we would the same face in real-life. The visual processing that leads to such beliefs is, in effect, under the illusion that there is an actual face being perceived. This leads to contradictory beliefs: the cognitive belief that the person we perceive does not exist and the perceptual belief that, implicitly, suggests that they do. In turn, our emotional responses to that face are genuine emotions, but the belief in the existence of the person is perceptual, not cognitive (see Siegel 2010). In this case, the perceptual illusion theory may stand to explain certain aspects of the paradox of fiction (at least for visual artworks).

Further reading: Fish 2009 & 2010; Lopes 2015; McMahon 1996; Stokes 2014.

2.4 Against the third proposition

Many philosophers opt to eliminate the third proposition of the paradox. There are several ways to do this. First, one can deny that beliefs are a necessary component of emotions, but still maintain a cognitivist position that emotions are comprised of thoughts (Carroll 1990 & Lamarque 1981) or judgments (Solomon 1976 [1993]). For example, when we engage with fiction, we generally have various thoughts about the characters. While watching The Conjuring, I may contemplate the nature of the demon that possesses one woman. This thought fills me with terror. Importantly, thoughts do not have the same assertoric requirement that beliefs do; we do not need to believe that the object of our thought exists in order to contemplate and respond emotionally to it.

Alternatively, one can deny that any higher-order cognition is required for emotions. This is the route taken by non-cognitive perception and feeling-based theories of emotions. According to these views, emotion does not require that we have a thought, judgment, or belief about an object in our environment. Conscious feelings, bodily changes, or perceptions of those changes, constitute an emotion (Goldie 2000; James 1890; LeDoux 1996; Prinz 2004a & b; Robinson 2005). Here, the ontological status of the emotion’s object is irrelevant to whether the emotion itself is a stereotypical state; if the feeling or perception of bodily changes is genuine, then the emotion is as well.

Non-cognitive theories of emotion track with the phenomenological experience of emotional responses to fiction described in §2.1. in response to the first proposition of the paradox.

A folk psychology of emotions contends that emotions involve a conscious feeling. Prima facie, we identify our emotions by how they feel; sorrow, anger, joy, jealousy, pride, etc. all feel a certain way to us. One could ask whether someone really does feel sorrow over the loss of a family member if they never consciously felt that sorrow. For our purposes, feelings are the qualitative bodily responses that are typically consciously experienced (but see Prinz 2004a; Berridge & Winkielman 2003; Rosenthal 2008). Chocolate has a particular conscious taste and red has a specific qualitative look; similarly, emotions have a conscious qualitative character. As William James (1890) noted, feelings put the “emotionality” in the emotion, making it salient and important to our lives.

Philosophers, psychologists, and neuroscientists alike all generally accept that emotions involve some kind of judgment. Emotions are evaluative. When we have an emotion, it is because something in our environment—or something that we think, remember, or imagine—bears significance on our lives or the life of someone we care about. This may be a very quick, automatic evaluation, like when we suddenly fear a loud noise behind us or are afraid that we will slip on an unseen staircase. Or the evaluation could be quite complex, like when we experience jealousy towards someone in our workplace.

In cases of fiction, the non-cognitivist about emotion would suggest that our feelings and other bodily reactions to a terrifying monster are sufficient evidence for genuine fear. These emotions are evaluative in that they indicate and are responses to things we care about. I feel elated when Frodo finally throws the ring into Mount Doom because I care about the narrative and character. Still, one could argue that we do not have the right kind of evaluative relationship with fictional objects to justify that we have genuine emotions about them. Fictional characters may not be the kind of thing that we can genuinely care about, empathize with, feel sympathy for, etc. One might respond that we seem to care about and identify with fictional objects all the time. We feel very strongly for our favorite television, film, and literary heroes. We want them to succeed, and we feel frustrated, sad, or angry when they do not. This perspective ties back to the epistemic significance of emotional responses to fiction: whether it is appropriate or rational to care about fictional entities to begin with.

Further reading: Helm 2010; Huebner et al. 2009; LeDoux 1996; Loaiza forthcoming; Zajonc 1984.

3. Further puzzles

While the paradox of fiction still holds sway in contemporary research and thought, other interesting philosophical puzzles concerning fiction and emotions have gained prominence over the past several decades. This section introduces a few of them: the puzzle of imaginative resistance, the “sympathy for the devil” phenomenon, and the paradox of painful art. While not strictly puzzles concerning emotions, the puzzle of imaginative resistance and sympathy for the devil phenomenon is nevertheless related to emotional responses to fiction, insofar as emotions such as disgust, anger, or pride may coincide with, cause, or even constitute moral judgments (Prinz 2007; Nichols 2004; Slote 2009; Schroeder 2011; Gill 2007).

3.1 The puzzle of imaginative resistance

Near the conclusion of “Of the Standard of Taste”, David Hume makes several remarks on the moral status of fiction that are particularly relevant when thinking about emotional and moral responses to fiction:

[Where] the ideas of morality and decency alter from one age to another, and where vicious manners are described, without being marked with the proper characters of blame and disapprobation; this must be allowed to disfigure the poem, and to be a real deformity. I cannot, nor is it proper that I should, enter into such sentiments; and however I may excuse the poet, on account of the manners of his age, I never can relish the composition. And whatever indulgence we may give to the writer on account of his prejudices, we cannot prevail on ourself to enter into his sentiments, or bear an affection to characters, which we plainly discover to be blameable.

The case is not the same with moral principles, as with speculative opinions of any kind. These are in continual flux and revolution. The son embraces a different system from the father. Nay, there scarcely is any man, who can boast of great constancy and uniformity in this particular. Whatever speculative errors may be found in the polite writings of any age or country, they detract but little from the value of those compositions. There needs but a certain turn of thought or imagination to make us enter into all the opinions, which then prevailed, and relish the sentiments or conclusions derived from them. But a very violent effort is requisite to change our judgment of manners, and excite sentiments of approbation or blame, love or hatred, different from those to which the mind from long custom has been familiarized (Hume 1757a, paragraph 32–33 [1994: 90–91]).

Hume’s statement here has been taken to capture an interesting puzzle about moral responses to fiction, what Tamar Gendler (2000) termed the puzzle of imaginative resistance. Although we may be willing to accept factual or metaphysical discrepancies in fiction, we may be loath to accept deviant moral values and practices that are treated positively by the work.

Several philosophers have pointed out that the puzzle of imaginative resistance if it is to be considered a puzzle at all (see Walton 2006), should be thought of as several discrete puzzles (Walton 2006; Weatherson 2004). The first is the aesthetic puzzle: if an artwork in some way embodies moral defects, do those defects detract from the aesthetic value of the work? Walton believes that this puzzle may be only indirectly related to moral resistance (Walton 2006).

Second, the fictionality puzzle states that there are certain propositions can or should be made fictional. Walton writes:

We easily accept that princes become frogs, or that people travel in time, in the world of a story, even, sometimes, that blatant contradictions are fictions. But we balk…at interpretations of stories of other fictions according to which it is fictional that (absent extraordinary circumstances) female infanticide is right and proper…or that a dumb knock-knock joke is actually hilarious. (2006: 140).

The fictionality puzzle concerns any sort of value judgment, not just moral ones. People may often deny that a value that they reject in the real world is correct in the fictional world (or vice versa). We may refuse to accept that the dumb knock-knock joke could possibly be funny, even in a fictional world. We may also be unable to accept that female infanticide is morally permissible in another world because we don’t believe that it is in ours.

Finally, the imaginative puzzle does not concern what is or is not fictional, but rather what we can or can’t imagine to begin with. We might be able to imagine a situation in which female infanticide is morally acceptable, even if we do not accept that it this could ever be fictionally true. Alternatively, we might not even be able to imagine that female infanticide is morally acceptable. We are unable to conceive of a world in which it is morally acceptable to kill one’s female child because she is female. In other words, the fictionality puzzle concerns what we can accept as true in the world of the work. The imaginative puzzle concerns the limits of our imagination.

Philosophers have responded to the puzzle(s) of imaginative resistance in several ways. Gendler (2000) argues that there are two basic ways to explain the imaginative puzzles: we can be “cantians”, “wontians”, or some hybrid of the two. Cantians about resistance argue that we are often unable to imagine certain kinds of impossibilities or evaluative deviances. Wontians hold that resistance arises because we are unwilling to imagine a situation in which a certain impossibility or deviance is acceptable. Gendler argues that imaginative barriers arise when the principles and background knowledge the reader has accepted in the story leave no way for the impossible or deviant proposition or situation to be true (Gendler 2006). This makes Gendler a cantian about the imaginative puzzle. We are unable to imagine some deviant moral scenarios. However, Gendler is a wontian concerning the fictionality puzzle. Even if we could imagine some deviant evaluative response in a fiction, we often will not allow ourselves to believe that the value judgment is true in the fiction. That is, we may be able to imagine that some moral or aesthetic value could conceivably differ from that we hold in the real world, but to actually imagine that, for instance, female infanticide is morally acceptable even in a fictional world would make some readers balk.

Walton takes the opposite approach: whereas Gendler is a cantian about the imaginative puzzle and a wontian about the fictionality one, he argues for the reverse (Walton 2006). I may not imagine a solid gold mountain or a round square, because I have an inability to imagine such a thing. The difficulty in imagining in these cases has to do with one’s imagistic and conceptual limitations. I do not imagine female infanticide is right, because I am unwilling to do so. So, Walton is a wontian when it comes to the imaginative puzzle (see also Moran 1994). Graham Priest (1997), another wontian, argues that we can understand stories that contain inconsistencies like both occupied and unoccupied boxes; if we do not imagine them, it is because we are unwilling to.

Further reading: Black & Barnes 2017; Flory 2013; Levy 2005; Liao 2016; Miyazono & Liao 2016; Nanay 2009; Tooming 2018; Tuna 2020; Stock 2005; Yablo 2002

3.2 Sympathy for the devil

Why do consumers of fiction find themselves drawn to morally deviant characters, whose real-life counterparts we would find abhorrent? Following Noël Carroll (2004 & 2008), we call this the sympathy for the devil phenomenon (hereafter, SDP). The SDP covers any of our pro-attitudes towards immoral or unlikeable fictional entities including, but not limited to, sympathy. Other pro-attitudes include emotions such as admiration, compassion, empathy, pity, pride, and joy. We may admire morally deviant characters for their wily ways or feel compassion for them once we learn of their difficult upbringing. Sometimes audiences come to feel pro-attitudes toward an anti-hero, a hero who is characterized by moral and personal flaws, but nevertheless is shown throughout a text or film to have sympathetic characteristics (Carroll 2008). Anne Eaton also describes the “Rough Hero”: a flawed protagonist whose flaws “are always moral, conspicuous and grievous” and whose flaws, in contrast with the anti-hero, are “an integral part of his person” (Eaton 2010: 516). It is often an aesthetic achievement, according to Eaton, for an artwork to get an audience to feel pro-attitudes toward Rough Heroes, whose character and actions ought to be reviled.

Philosophers have responded to the SDP in a variety of ways. One way to explain the SDP is to adopt a simulation/distinct attitude approach, along the lines of Gregory Currie (1997). One this view, we imagine or simulate moral propositions and judgments that we normally would not in our actual lives. This would allow us to feel (imaginary or make-believe) sympathy for a morally bad character, such as Milton’s Satan, Mad Men’s Don Draper, or Breaking Bad’s Walter White.

Matthew Kieran (2006 & 2010) points out that we can sympathize with an immoral character because we suppose that the character inhabits a fictional world that is quite different from our own. This fictional world encompasses a different land with different rules, including moral rules. Call this the distancing approach. Kieran contends that imaginative distancing amounts to a psychological distance between an audience and a devilish character (Kieran 2010). We feel free to allow ourselves to feel pity, compassion, and sympathy for someone like Hannibal Lecter or Milton’s Satan because of this psychological distance.

Carroll’s own view is that authors of fiction intend for their audiences to sympathize with a fictional character, and so create their work in such a way to achieve this end. Carroll calls this process “emotional prefocusing” (Carroll 2008; see also Smuts 2014). An author may intend for her audience to feel pro-attitudes toward a particular character. This character is often morally corrupt or deviant in some way but, for whatever reason, the author desires the reader to sympathize with her. So, the author “prefocuses” the work to highlight some of the character’s more morally positive attributes or goes to lengths to suggest ways that their behavior might be justified or excused. Our emotional responses to characters are often a matter of how a narrative is constructed and how the details of a story influence our feelings about particular characters. Carroll suggests that the reason we feel sympathy for Tony Soprano of The Sopranos, Tyrion Lannister of A Song of Ice and Fire, or Ethan Edwards in The Searchers is because, despite their flaws, they are morally better off than the other characters in the fiction. Tony is surrounded by an astonishing array of violent, manipulative, power-hungry mobsters. Tyrion is a clever, witty, well-meaning louse with rotten family members. Ethan Edwards is gruff and brutal, but also loyal and in possession of a certain code of honor. So, when we search the fictional world for an emotional allegiance, these are the characters we choose.

Another view holds that fascination is the key to understanding our pro-attitudes towards immoral, fictional characters (see also M. Smith 1999). Katie Tullmann (2016) argues that immoral characters in works of fiction are often attractive, interesting curiosities. Immoral characters are compelling, often more compelling than the more morally good characters. Take the Count of Monte Cristo: a revenge-driven, cruel, mysterious, and charming noble. Many readers probably think that the Count’s tactics of carefully planned revenge against those who had him imprisoned are not morally justified. Still, audiences are fascinated by immoral actions (consider also the recent popularity of the true crime genre). Readers are willing to imaginatively explore immoral actions in the safe environment of fiction (see Mar 2018 for a similar view). Perhaps we think that by taking an interest in this character we can expand our folk psychology to include the vengeful and obsessive mindset the Count represents. So, on this view, fascination is the pre-condition for our sympathy towards immoral characters. Audiences need to be fascinated by immoral characters before we feel sympathy for them. Fascination is achieved by how the character is portrayed in the narrative as possessing exotic and curious traits. Once this is achieved, other aspects of the narrative will cause us to feel sympathy for them.

Further reading: Clavel-Vázquez 2023; Dain 2021; Friend 2022; Harold 2008; Setiya 2010.

3.3 Paradox of painful art

The ability of fiction to engage with an audience’s emotions is irrefutable. We seek out certain works of fiction for exactly this reason: to make us joyful, to make us laugh, to make us feel connected to others around us. Less intuitive, but no less deniable, is the idea that audiences seek out works of fiction that make them feel negative emotions such as sorrow or fear. Consider Hume, again, this time on tragedy:

It seems an unaccountable pleasure, which the spectators of a well-written tragedy receive from sorrow, terror, anxiety, and other passions, that are in themselves disagreeable and uneasy. The more they are touched and affected, the more are they delighted with the spectacle; and as soon as the uneasy passions cease to operate, the piece is at an end (1757b, paragraph 1 [1987: 216])

The “paradox” of painful art is just this: we seek out works of art with the intention of feeling negative emotions such as anger, sorrow, or fear, when we wouldn’t seek out comparable real-life situations. Indeed, people try to avoid these negative emotions as much as possible. Hume himself argued that the pleasures of the imagination and emotional expression outweigh the negative emotional responses such as sorrow—the former “predominates” over the latter. Susan Feagin (1983) argues that there are two types of (emotional) responses to fiction: direct responses and meta-responses. Feagin defines the meta-response as “how one feels about and what one thinks about one’s responding (directly) in the way one does to the qualities and content of the work” (1983: 97). Direct responses to tragedies are often negative: sorrow over the death of a beloved character; anxiety about the future of another character. The pleasure of tragedy, Feagin argues, stems from our meta-response to our direct, negative responses: we receive satisfaction from the fact that we are the kind of people that can feel anger, sorrow, fear, etc., and can respond negatively to moral ills in works of fiction.

Carroll (1990) posits another response to what he calls the paradox of horror: if horror fictions are characterized by fearful monsters and disgusting circumstances, why do many of us seek them out? Carroll states: “the imagery of horror fiction seems to be necessarily repulsive and, yet, the genre has no lack of consumers” (1990: 160). Like other forms of tragedy, works of horror fiction are both repulsive and attractive. One potential explanation for this puzzle is that audiences can experience all the terror of horrifying situations but with none of the personal risk (1990: 167). The emotion is “detached” from reality. Carroll’s own account is that works of horror are constructed in a way to engage other emotions, in addition to fear and disgust—namely, fascination with the imagery and plot structures that surround the fearful elements.

Each of the additional puzzles concerning emotions about fiction highlights the curious ways in which an audience’s emotional responses to fiction belie one’s endorsed moral beliefs about the actual world in which we live. The puzzles continue to hold sway in our cultural understanding of the importance of fictional artworks. Relationships with fictional entities are often deeply important to us—consider the widespread emotional responses to scenes like the “Red Wedding” in the Game of Thrones television show, or the death of a certain prominent character in the final season of the show Succession. Such responses implicate and reveal our deepest values and beliefs. It is no wonder, then, that philosophers continually try to explain and, indeed, justify these emotions’ appropriateness and authenticity.

Further reading: Bantinaki 2012; Contesi 2016; Gaut 1993; Friend 2007; Schwarz 2022; Smuts 2009.


  • Adair, Heather V., 2019, “Updating Thought Theory: Emotion and the Non‐Paradox of Fiction”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 100(4): 1055–1073. doi:10.1111/papq.12294
  • Agosta, Lou, 2010, Empathy in the Context of Philosophy, London: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1057/9780230275249
  • Bailey, Olivia, 2021, “Empathy with Vicious Perspectives? A Puzzle about the Moral Limits of Empathetic Imagination”, Synthese, 199(3–4): 9621–9647. doi:10.1007/s11229-021-03219-z
  • Bantinaki, Katerina, 2012, “The Paradox of Horror: Fear as a Positive Emotion”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 70(4): 383–392. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6245.2012.01530.x
  • Ben-Zeʼev, Aharon, 2000, The Subtlety of Emotions, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Berridge, Kent and Piotr Winkielman, 2003, “What Is an Unconscious Emotion? (The Case for Unconscious ‘Liking’)”, Cognition and Emotion, 17(2): 181–211. doi:10.1080/02699930302289
  • Best, John, 2020, “Reading Literary Fiction: More Empathy, but at What Possible Cost?”, North American Journal of Psychology, 22(2): 269–288.
  • –––, 2021, “To Teach and Delight: The Varieties of Learning From Fiction”, Review of General Psychology, 25(1): 27–43. doi:10.1177/1089268020977173
  • Black, Jessica E. and Jennifer L. Barnes, 2017, “Measuring the Unimaginable: Imaginative Resistance to Fiction and Related Constructs”, Personality and Individual Differences, 111: 71–79. doi:10.1016/j.paid.2017.01.055
  • Blanchet, Robert, 2020, “Empathy as the Opposite of Egocentrism: Why the Simulation Theory and the Direct Perception Theory of Empathy Fail”, Topoi, 39(4): 751–759. doi:10.1007/s11245-018-09630-5
  • Buckwalter, Wesley and Katherine Tullmann, 2017, “The Genuine Attitude View of Fictional Belief”, in Art and Belief, Ema Sullivan-Bissett, Helen Bradley, and Paul Noordhof (eds.), (Mind Association Occasional Series), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 194–210 (ch. 11).
  • Camp, Elisabeth, 2009, “Two Varieties of Literary Imagination: Metaphor, Fiction, and Thought Experiments: Two Varieties of Literary Imagination”, Midwest Studies In Philosophy (Special Issue: Philosophy and Poetry), 33: 107–130. doi:10.1111/j.1475-4975.2009.00186.x
  • Carroll, Noël, 1990, The Philosophy of Horror, or, Paradoxes of the Heart, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203361894
  • –––, 2004, “Sympathy for the Devil”, in The Sopranos and Philosophy: I Kill Therefore I Am, Richard Greene and Peter Vernezze (eds.), (Popular Culture and Philosophy 7), Chicago: Open Court, 121–136 (ch. 11).
  • –––, 2008, The Philosophy of Motion Pictures, (Foundations of the Philosophy of the Arts 2), Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
  • –––, 2011, “On Some Affective Relations between Audiences and the Characters in Popular Fictions”, in Coplan and Goldie 2011: 162–184 (ch. 11).
  • Carruthers, Peter, 1996, “Simulation and Self-Knowledge: A Defence of Theory-Theory”, in Carruthers and Smith 1996: 22–38 (ch. 3). doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597985.004
  • –––, 2011, The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199596195.001.0001
  • Carruthers, Peter and Peter K. Smith (eds.), 1996, Theories of Theories of Mind, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597985
  • Clavel-Vázquez, Adriana, 2023, “On the Ethics of Imagination and Ethical-Aesthetic Value Interaction in Fiction”, Ergo an Open Access Journal of Philosophy, 9: article 56. doi:10.3998/ergo.3119
  • Clay, Zanna and Marco Iacoboni, 2011, “Mirroring Fictional Others”, in The Aesthetic Mind: Philosophy and Psychology, Elisabeth Schellekens and Peter Goldie (eds.), Oxford University Press, 313–329 (ch. 18).
  • Cochrane, Tom, 2010, “A Simulation Theory of Musical Expressivity”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 88(2): 191–207. doi:10.1080/00048400902941257
  • Coleridge, Samuel Taylor, 1817 [1985], Biographia Literaria, London: Rest Fenner. Collected in Samuel Taylor Coleridge, H. J. Jackson (ed.), (Oxford Authors), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1985.
  • Contesi, Filippo, 2016, “The Meanings of Disgusting Art”, Essays in Philosophy, 17(1): 68–94. doi:10.7710/1526-0569.1544
  • Coplan, Amy and Peter Goldie (eds.), 2011, Empathy: Philosophical and Psychological Perspectives, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199539956.001.0001
  • Cova, Florian and Fabrice Teroni, 2016, “Is the Paradox of Fiction Soluble in Psychology?”, Philosophical Psychology, 29(6): 930–942. doi:10.1080/09515089.2016.1164306
  • Currie, Gregory, 1990, The Nature of Fiction, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511897498
  • –––, 1995, “The Moral Psychology of Fiction”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 73(2): 250–259. doi:10.1080/00048409512346581
  • –––, 1997, “The Paradox of Caring: Fiction and the Philosophy of Mind”, in Hjort and Laver 1997: 63–77 (ch. 4).
  • Currie, Gregory and Ian Ravenscroft, 2002, Recreative Minds: Imagination in Philosophy and Psychology, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198238089.001.0001
  • Dain, Edmund, 2021, “Sympathy for the Devil: The Puzzle of Imaginative Resistance, the Role of Fiction in Moral Thought, and the Limits of the Imagination”, Philosophy, 96(2): 253–275. doi:10.1017/S0031819120000431
  • Damasio, Antonio R., 1994, Descartes’ Error: Emotion, Reason, and the Human Brain, New York: G.P. Putnam.
  • D’Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson, 2000a, “Sentiment and Value”, Ethics, 110(4): 722–748. doi:10.1086/233371
  • –––, 2000b, “The Moralistic Fallacy: On the ‘Appropriateness’ of Emotions”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 61(1): 65–90. doi:10.2307/2653403
  • Decety, Jean and Andrew N. Meltzoff, 2011, “Empathy, Imitation, and the Social Brain”, in Coplan and Goldie 2011: 58–81 (ch. 5).
  • Derrida, Jacques, 1978 [1987], La Vérité en peinture, (Champ philosophique), Paris: Flammarion. Translated as The Truth in Painting, Geoff Bennington and Ian McLeod (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987.
  • De Sousa, Ronald, 2002, “Emotional Truth”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 76: 247–263. doi:10.1111/1467-8349.00098
  • –––, 2004, “Emotions: What I Know, What I’d Like to Think I Know, and What I’d Like to Think”, in Solomon 2004: 61–75 (ch. 4).
  • De Vignemont, Frederique, 2007, “Habeas Corpus: The Sense of Ownership of One’s Own Body”, Mind & Language, 22(4): 427–449. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0017.2007.00315.x
  • Dos Santos, Miguel F., 2017, “Walton’s Quasi-Emotions Do Not Go Away: Walton’s Quasi-Emotions Do Not Go Away”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 75(3): 265–274. doi:10.1111/jaac.12385
  • Eaton, A.W., 2010, “Rough Heroes of the New Hollywood”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 64(254 [4]): 511–524.
  • Feagin, Susan L., 1983, “The Pleasures of Tragedy”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 20(1): 95–104.
  • –––, 2011, “Empathizing as Simulating”, in Coplan and Goldie 2011: 149–161 (ch. 10).
  • Fish, William, 2009, Perception, Hallucination, and Illusion, (Philosophy of Mind), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195381344.001.0001
  • –––, 2010, Philosophy of Perception: A Contemporary Introduction, (Routledge Contemporary Introductions to Philosophy), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781351049504
  • Fitzpatrick, Noel, 2016, “The Question of Fiction – Nonexistent Objects, a Possible World Response from Paul Ricoeur”, Kairos. Journal of Philosophy & Science, 17(1): 137–153. doi:10.1515/kjps-2016-0020
  • Flory, Dan, 2013, “Imaginative Resistance and the White Gaze in Machete and The Help”, in Race, Philosophy, and Film, Mary K. Bloodsworth-Lugo and Dan Flory (eds.), (Routledge Studies in Contemporary Philosophy 50), New York: Routledge, 17–34 (ch. 1).
  • Fodor, Jerry A., 1983, Modularity of Mind: An Essay on Faculty Psychology, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fontaine, Matthieu and Shahid Rahman, 2014, “Towards a Semantics for the Artifactual Theory of Fiction and Beyond”, Synthese, 191(3): 499–516. doi:10.1007/s11229-013-0287-z
  • Foucault, Michel, 1966 [1970], Les Mots et les choses: une archéologie des sciences humaines, (Bibliothèque des sciences humaines), Paris: Gallimard. Translated as The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences (World of Man), New York: Pantheon Books, 1970.
  • Freedberg, David and Vittorio Gallese, 2007, “Motion, Emotion and Empathy in Esthetic Experience”, Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 11(5): 197–203. doi:10.1016/j.tics.2007.02.003
  • Friend, Stacie, 2007, “The Pleasures of Documentary Tragedy”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 47(2): 184–198. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayl055
  • –––, 2020, “Fiction and Emotion: The Puzzle of Divergent Norms”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 60(4): 403–418. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayaa010
  • –––, 2022, “Emotion in Fiction: State of the Art”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 62(2): 257–271. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayab060
  • Gallagher, Shaun, 2012, “Empathy, Simulation, and Narrative”, Science in Context, 25(3): 355–381. doi:10.1017/S0269889712000117
  • Gallese, Vittorio, 2019, “Embodied Simulation. Its Bearing on Aesthetic Experience and the Dialogue Between Neuroscience and the Humanities”, Gestalt Theory, 41(2): 113–127. doi:10.2478/gth-2019-0013
  • García-Carpintero, Manuel, 2019, “Semantics of Fictional Terms”, Teorema: International Journal of Philosophy, 38(2): 73–100.
  • Gaut, Berys, 1993, “The Paradox of Horror”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 33(4): 333–345. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/33.4.333
  • Gendler, Tamar Szabó, 2000, “The Puzzle of Imaginative Resistance”, The Journal of Philosophy, 97(2): 55–81. doi:10.2307/2678446
  • –––, 2006, “Imaginative Resistance Revisited”, in Nichols 2006: 149–174 (ch. 9). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.003.0009
  • Gendler, Tamar Szabó and Karson Kovakovich, 2006, “Genuine Rational Fictional Emotions”, in Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art, Matthew Kieran (ed.), (Contemporary Debates in Philosophy 5), Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, 242–253 (ch. 15).
  • Gill, Michael B., 2007, “Moral Rationalism vs. Moral Sentimentalism: Is Morality More Like Math or Beauty?”, Philosophy Compass, 2(1): 16–30. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2006.00052.x
  • Gilmore, Jonathan, 2020, Apt Imaginings: Feelings for Fictions and Other Creatures of the Mind, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldie, Peter, 2000, The Emotions: A Philosophical Exploration, Oxford/New York: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0199253048.001.0001
  • ––– (ed.), 2010, The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Emotion, (The Oxford Handbooks Series), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199235018.001.0001
  • Goldman, Alvin I., 1989, “Interpretation Psychologized”, Mind & Language, 4(3): 161–185. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0017.1989.tb00249.x
  • –––, 1993, “The Psychology of Folk Psychology”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 16(1): 15–28. doi:10.1017/S0140525X00028648
  • –––, 2006a, “Imagination and Simulation in Audience Responses to Fiction”, in Nichols 2006: 41–56 (ch. 3). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.003.0003
  • –––, 2006b, Simulating Minds: The Philosophy, Psychology, and Neuroscience of Mindreading, (Philosophy of Mind), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195138929.001.0001
  • Gopnik, Alison, 1993, “How We Know Our Minds: The Illusion of First-Person Knowledge of Intentionality”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 16(1): 1–14. doi:10.1017/S0140525X00028636
  • Gopnik, Alison and Laura Schulz, 2004, “Mechanisms of Theory Formation in Young Children”, Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 8(8): 371–377. doi:10.1016/j.tics.2004.06.005
  • Gordon, Robert M., 1986, “Folk Psychology as Simulation”, Mind & Language, 1(2): 158–171. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0017.1986.tb00324.x
  • –––, 1992, “The Simulation Theory: Objections and Misconceptions”, Mind & Language, 7(1–2): 11–34. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0017.1992.tb00195.x
  • –––, 1996, “‘Radical’ Simulationism”, in Carruthers and Smith 1996: 11–21 (ch. 2). doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597985.003
  • Greenspan, Patricia S., 1988, Emotions & Reasons: An Inquiry into Emotional Justification, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315831848
  • Harold, James, 2008, “Immoralism and the Valence Constraint”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 48(1): 45–64. doi:10.1093/aesthj/aym038
  • Heal, Jane, 1996, “Simulation, Theory, and Content”, in Carruthers and Smith 1996: 75–89 (ch. 5). doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597985.006
  • Harris, Paul L., 2000, The Work of the Imagination, (Understanding Children’s Worlds), Oxford/Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Helm, Bennett W., 2010, “Emotions and Motivation: Reconsidering Neo‐Jamesian Accounts”, in Goldie 2010: 303–324 (ch. 13). [Helm 2009 available online (pdf)]
  • Hjort, Mette and Sue Laver (eds), 1997, Emotion and the Arts, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hoffman, Martin L., 2008, “Empathy and Prosocial Behavior”, in Handbook of Emotions, Michael Lewis, Jeannette M. Haviland-Jones, and Lisa Feldman Barrett (eds), third edition, New York: The Guilford Press, 440–455 (ch. 17).
  • Huebner, Bryce, Susan Dwyer, and Marc Hauser, 2009, “The Role of Emotion in Moral Psychology”, Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 13(1): 1–6. doi:10.1016/j.tics.2008.09.006
  • Humbert-Droz, Steve, Amanda Garcia, Vanessa Sennwald, Fabrice Teroni, Julien Deonna, David Sander, and Florian Cova, 2020, “Lost in Intensity: Is There an Empirical Solution to the Quasi-Emotions Debate?”, Aesthetic Investigations, 4(1): 54–76. doi:10.58519/aesthinv.v4i1.11925
  • Hume, David, 1757a, “Of the Standard of Taste”, in his Four Dissertations, London: A. Millar. Also in his Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary, Part 1, Essay XXIII, 1758. Collected in Art and Its Significance: An Anthology of Aesthetic Theory (SUNY Series in Philosophy), third edition Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1994: 77–92. [1757a available online]
  • –––, 1757b, “Of Tragedy”, in his Four Dissertations, London: A. Millar. Also in his Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary, Part 1, Essay XXII, 1758. The latter collection is reprinted Eugene Miller (ed). Indianapolis, IN: Liberty Fund. 216—225. [Hume 1757b available online]
  • Hurka, Thomas, 2001, Virtue, Vice, and Value, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195137167.001.0001
  • James, William, 1890, The Principles of Psychology, 2 volumes, New York: H. Holt and company. Reprinted 2007, New York: Cosimo.
  • Kieran, Matthew, 2006, “Art, Morality and Ethics: On the (Im)Moral Character of Art Works and Inter‐Relations to Artistic Value”, Philosophy Compass, 1(2): 129–143. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2006.00019.x
  • –––, 2010, “Emotions, Art, and Immorality”, in Goldie 2010: 681–704 (ch. 30).
  • Kind, Amy (ed.), 2016, The Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of Imagination, (Routledge Handbooks in Philosophy), London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315657905
  • Kivy, Peter, 2011, Once-Told Tales: An Essay in Literary Aesthetics, (New Directions in Aesthetics 11), Chichester, UK/Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell. doi:10.1002/9781444397666
  • Kosslyn, Stephen M., Nathaniel M. Alpert, William L. Thompson, Vera Maljkovic, Steven B. Weise, Christopher F. Chabris, Sania E. Hamilton, Scott L. Rauch, and Ferdinando S. Buonanno, 1993, “Visual Mental Imagery Activates Topographically Organized Visual Cortex: PET Investigations”, Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience, 5(3): 263–287. doi:10.1162/jocn.1993.5.3.263
  • Kosslyn, Stephen M., William L. Thompson, and Nathaniel M. Alpert, 1997, “Neural Systems Shared by Visual Imagery and Visual Perception: A Positron Emission Tomography Study”, NeuroImage, 6(4): 320–334. doi:10.1006/nimg.1997.0295
  • Kosslyn, Stephen M., William L. Thompson, and Giorgio Ganis, 2006, “The Case for Mental Imagery”, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195179088.001.0001
  • Kripke, Saul A., 2011, “Vacuous Names and Fictional Entities”, in his Philosophical Troubles: Collected Papers, Volume 1, New York: Oxford University Press, 52–74. Delivered at the conference “Language, Intentionality, and Translation Theory”, held at the University of Connecticut in March of 1973 but not previously published in full.
  • –––, 2013, Reference and Existence: The John Locke Lectures, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kroon, Frederick, 1994, “Make-Believe and Fictional Reference”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 52(2): 207–214. doi:10.2307/431167
  • Lamarque, Peter, 1981, “How Can We Fear and Pity Fictions?”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 21(4): 291–304. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/21.4.291
  • Langland-Hassan, Peter, 2020, “Consuming Fictions Part III: Immersion, Emotion, and the Paradox of Fiction”, in his Explaining Imagination, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 234–261 (ch. 11). doi:10.1093/oso/9780198815068.003.0011
  • LeBar, Mark, 2001, “Simulation, Theory, and Emotion”, Philosophical Psychology, 14(4): 423–434. doi:10.1080/09515080120088094
  • LeDoux, Joseph E., 1996, The Emotional Brain: The Mysterious Underpinnings of Emotional Life, New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Levinson, Jerrold, 1993, “Making Believe”, Dialogue, 32(2): 359–374. doi:10.1017/S0012217300014499
  • Levy, Neil, 2005, “Imaginative Resistance and the Moral/Conventional Distinction”, Philosophical Psychology, 18(2): 231–241. doi:10.1080/09515080500169660
  • Lewis, David, 1978, “Truth in Fiction”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 15(1): 37–46.
  • Liao, Shen-yi, 2016, “Imaginative Resistance, Narrative Engagement, Genre”, Res Philosophica, 93(2): 461–482. doi:10.11612/resphil.2016.2.93.3
  • Loaiza, Juan R., forthcoming, “Functionalism and the Emotions”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, first online: 30 April2021. doi:10.1086/715207
  • Lopes, Dominic McIver, 2015, “Perception and Art”, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Perception, Mohan Matthen (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 871–884 (ch. 45).
  • Maibom, Heidi Lene (ed.), 2014, Empathy and Morality, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199969470.001.0001
  • Mar, Raymond A., 2018, “Stories and the Promotion of Social Cognition”, Current Directions in Psychological Science, 27 (4): 257–262. doi: 10.1177/0963721417749654
  • Matravers, Derek, 2014, Fiction and Narrative, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199647019.001.0001
  • McMahon, Jennifer A., 1996, “Aesthetic Perception”, Communication and Cognition: An Interdisciplinary Quarterly Journal, 29(1): 37–64. [McMahon 1996 available online]
  • Meinong, Alexius, 1904 [1960], “Über Gegenstandstheorie”, in Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie [Investigations in Theory of Objects and Psychology], A. Meinong (ed.), Leipzig: J. A. Barth 1–51. Translated as “The Theory of Objects” in R. M. Chisholm (ed.), Realism and the Background of Phenomenology, Glencoe, IL: Free Press, 1960; reprint: Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview, 1981, 76–117.
  • Miyazono, Kengo and Shen-yi Liao, 2016, “The Cognitive Architecture of Imaginative Resistance”, in The Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of Imagination, Amy Kind (ed.), London/New York: Routledge, 233–246. [Miyazono and Liao 2016 available online]
  • Moran, Richard, 1994, “The Expression of Feeling in Imagination”, The Philosophical Review, 103(1): 75–106. doi:10.2307/2185873
  • Morton, Adam, 2011, “Empathy for the Devil”, in Coplan and Goldie 2011: 318–330 (ch. 18).
  • Mothersill, Mary, 2002, “Make-Believe Morality and Fictional Worlds”, in Art and Morality, José Luis Bermúdez and Sebastian Gardner (eds.), (International Library of Philosophy), London/New York: Routledge, 74–94.
  • Nanay, Bence, 2009, “Imaginative Resistance and Conversational Implicature”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 60(240): 586–600. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9213.2009.625.x
  • Neill, Alex, 1991, “Fear, Fiction and Make-Believe”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 49(1): 47–56. doi:10.2307/431648
  • –––, 1993, “Fiction and the Emotions”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 30(1): 1–13.
  • Nichols, Shaun, 2004, “Imagining and Believing: The Promise of a Single Code”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 62(2): 129–139. doi:10.1111/j.1540-594X.2004.00146.x
  • ––– (ed.), 2006, The Architecture of the Imagination: New Essays on Pretence, Possibility, and Fiction, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.001.0001
  • Nichols, Shaun and Stephen P. Stich, 2003, Mindreading: An Integrated Account of Pretence, Self-Awareness, and Understanding Other Minds, (Oxford Cognitive Science Series), Oxford: Clarendon. doi:10.1093/0198236107.001.0001
  • Nichols, Shaun, Stephen Stich, Alan Leslie, and David Klein, 1996, “Varieties of Off-Line Simulation”, in Carruthers and Smith 1996: 39–74 (ch. 4). doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597985.005
  • Oatley, Keith and Maja Djikic, 2018, “Psychology of Narrative Art”, Review of General Psychology, 22(2): 161–168. doi:10.1037/gpr0000113
  • O’Craven, Kathleen M. & Kanwisher, Nancy, 2000, “Mental Imagery of Faces and Places Activates Corresponding Stimulus-specific Brain Regions”, Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience, 12: 1013-23.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, 1974, The Nature of Necessity, (Clarendon Library of Logic and Philosophy), Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0198244142.001.0001
  • Priest, Graham, 1997, “Sylvan’s Box: A Short Story and Ten Morals”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 38(4): 573–582. doi:10.1305/ndjfl/1039540770
  • Prinz, Jesse J., 2002, Furnishing the Mind: Concepts and Their Perceptual Basis, (Representation and Mind), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. doi:10.7551/mitpress/3169.001.0001
  • –––, 2004a, Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotion, (Philosophy of Mind Series), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2004b, “Embodied Emotions”, in Solomon 2004: 44–58 (ch. 3).
  • –––, 2006, “The Emotional Basis of Moral Judgments”, Philosophical Explorations, 9(1): 29–43. doi:10.1080/13869790500492466
  • –––, 2007, The Emotional Construction of Morals, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, “Against Empathy”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 49(s1): 214–233. doi:10.1111/j.2041-6962.2011.00069.x
  • Quilty-Dunn, Jake, 2015, “Believing Our Eyes: The Role of False Belief in the Experience of Cinema”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 55(3): 269–283. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayv016
  • Quine, Willard V., 1948 [1953], “On What There Is”, The Review of Metaphysics, 2(5): 21–38. Collected in From a Logical Point of View, W. V. Quine (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1953, 1–19.
  • Radford, Colin, 1975, “How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina? I”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 49: 67–94. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/49.1.67
  • Richardson, Cliff, 2009, “Phantom Limb Pain; Prevalence, Mechanisms and Associated Factors”, in Amputation, Prosthesis Use, and Phantom Limb Pain, Craig Murray (ed.), New York, NY: Springer New York, 137–156. doi:10.1007/978-0-387-87462-3_10
  • Roberts, Robert C., 1992, “Review of Emotions and Reasons: An Inquiry into Emotional Justification, by Patricia S. Greenspan”, Philosophical Books, 31(4): 233–235. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0149.1992.tb00654.x
  • Robinson, Jenefer, 2005, Deeper than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art, Oxford: Clarendon. doi:10.1093/0199263655.001.0001
  • Rosenthal, David M., 2008, “Consciousness and Its Function”, Neuropsychologia, 46(3): 829–840. doi:10.1016/j.neuropsychologia.2007.11.012
  • Sainsbury, R. M., 2010, Fiction and Fictionalism, (New Problems of Philosophy), London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203872567
  • Salmon, Nathan, 1998, “Nonexistence”, Noûs, 32(3): 277–319. doi:10.1111/0029-4624.00101
  • Schiffer, Stephen, 1996, “Language-Created Language-Independent Entities”:, Philosophical Topics, 24(1): 149–167. doi:10.5840/philtopics199624117
  • Schroeder, Mark, 2011, “Moral Sentimentalism”, The Philosophical Review, 120(3): 452–455. doi:10.1215/00318108-1263710
  • Schroeder, Timothy and Carl Matheson, 2006, “Imagination and Emotion”, in Nichols 2006: 19–40 (ch. 2). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.003.0002
  • Schwarz, Lucia, 2022, “The Paradox of Rape in Horror Movies”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 62(4): 671–686. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayac035
  • Searle, John R., 1975, “The Logical Status of Fictional Discourse”, New Literary History, 6(2): 319–332. doi:10.2307/468422
  • Setiya, Kieran, 2010, “Sympathy for the Devil”, in Desire, Practical Reason, and the Good, Sergio Tenenbaum (ed.), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 82–110 (ch. 5). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195382440.003.0005
  • Short, Tim, 2015, Simulation Theory: A Psychological and Philosophical Consideration, (Explorations in Cognitive Psychology Series), London: Psychology Press. doi:10.4324/9781315746371
  • Siegel, Susanna, 2010, The Contents of Visual Experience, (Philosophy of Mind Series), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195305296.001.0001
  • Slote, Michael, 2009, Moral Sentimentalism, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195391442.001.0001
  • Smith, Barry, 1980, “Ingarden vs. Meinong on the Logic of Fiction”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 41(1/2): 93–105. doi:10.2307/2107393
  • Smith, Murray, 1999, “Gangsters, Cannibals, Aesthetes, or Apparently Perverse Allegiances”, in Passionate Views: Film, Cognition and Emotion, Carl R. Plantinga and Greg M. Smith (eds), Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 217–238 (ch. 11).
  • Smuts, Aaron, 2009, “Art and Negative Affect”, Philosophy Compass, 4(1): 39–55. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2008.00199.x
  • –––, 2014, “Painful Art and the Limits of Well-Being”, in Suffering Art Gladly: The Paradox of Negative Emotion in Art, Jerrold Levinson (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan UK, 123–152 (ch. 7). doi:10.1057/9781137313713_7
  • Solomon, Robert C., 1976 [1993], The Passions, Garden City, NY: Anchor Press/Doubleday. Second edition, The Passions: Emotions and the Meaning of Life, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1993.
  • ––– (ed.), 2004, Thinking about Feeling: Contemporary Philosophers on Emotions, (Series in Affective Science), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Song, Moonyoung, 2020, “Aptness of Fiction-Directed Emotions”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 60(1): 45–59. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayz028
  • Spaulding, Shannon, 2016, “Simulation Theory”, in Kind 2016: 262–273. [Spaulding 2016 available online]
  • Stecker, Robert, 2011, “Should We Still Care about the Paradox of Fiction?” British Journal of Aesthetics, 51 (3): 295–308.
  • Stock, Kathleen, 2005, “Resisting Imaginative Resistance”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 55(221): 607–624. doi:10.1111/j.0031-8094.2005.00419.x
  • Stokes, Dustin, 2014, “Cognitive Penetration and the Perception of Art”, Dialectica, 68(1): 1–34. doi:10.1111/1746-8361.12049
  • Stoner, Ian, 2020, “Barbarous Spectacle and General Massacre: A Defence of Gory Fictions”, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 37(4): 511–527. doi:10.1111/japp.12405
  • Stueber, Karsten R., 2011, “Imagination, Empathy, and Moral Deliberation: The Case of Imaginative Resistance”, The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 49(s1): 156–180. doi:10.1111/j.2041-6962.2011.00065.x
  • Summa, Michela, 2019, “Is Make-Believe Only Reproduction? Remarks on the Role of Fiction in Shaping Our Sense of Reality”, Social Imaginaries, 5(1): 97–119. doi:10.5840/si2019516
  • Teroni, Fabrice, 2019, “Emotion, Fiction and Rationality”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 59(2): 113–128. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayz015
  • Thomasson, Amie L., 1999, Fiction and Metaphysics, (Cambridge Studies in Philosophy), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511527463
  • –––, 2003, “Speaking of Fictional Characters”, Dialectica, 57(2): 205–223. doi:10.1111/j.1746-8361.2003.tb00266.x
  • Thomson-Jones, Katherine, 2008, Aesthetics and Film, (Continuum Aesthetics), London/New York: Continuum.
  • Tooming, Uku, 2018, “Imaginative Resistance as Imagistic Resistance”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 48(5): 684–706. doi:10.1080/00455091.2017.1378534
  • Toon, Adam, 2010a, “The Ontology of Theoretical Modelling: Models as Make-Believe”, Synthese, 172(2): 301–315. doi:10.1007/s11229-009-9508-x
  • –––, 2010b, “Models as Make-Believe”, in Beyond Mimesis and Convention: Representation in Art and Science, Roman Frigg and Matthew Hunter (eds.), (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science 262), Dordrecht/London/New York: Springer, 71–96. doi:10.1007/978-90-481-3851-7_5
  • –––, 2012, Models as Make-Believe: Imagination, Fiction and Scientific Representation, London: Palgrave Macmillan UK. doi:10.1057/9781137292230
  • Tullmann, Katherine, 2016, “Sympathy and Fascination”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 56(2): 115–129. doi:10.1093/aesthj/ayw003
  • –––, 2022, “Mental Theorizing about Fictional Characters”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 56(2): 78–100.
  • Tullmann, Katherine and Wesley Buckwalter, 2014, “Does the Paradox of Fiction Exist?”, Erkenntnis, 79(4): 779–796. doi:10.1007/s10670-013-9563-z
  • Tuna, Emine Hande, 2020, “Imaginative Resistance”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2020 edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2020/entries/imaginative-resistance/>.
  • Van Leeuwen, Neil, 2013, “The Meanings of ‘Imagine’ Part I: Constructive Imagination”, Philosophy Compass, 8(3): 220–230. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2012.00508.x
  • Vendrell Ferran, Ingrid, 2022, “Sham Emotions, Quasi-Emotions or Non-Genuine Emotions? Fictional Emotions and Their Qualitative Feel”, in Phenomenology of Phantasy and Emotion, Thiemo Breyer, Marco Cavallaro, and Rodrigo Sandoval (eds), Darmstadt: WBG Academic, 231–259. [Vendrell Ferran 2022 available online]
  • Vetlesen, Arne Johan, 1994, Perception, Empathy, and Judgment: An Inquiry into the Preconditions of Moral Performance, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Walton, Kendall L., 1978, “Fearing Fictions”, The Journal of Philosophy, 75(1): 5–27. doi:10.2307/2025831
  • –––, 1990, Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1997, “Spelunking, Simulation, and Slime: On Being Moved by Fiction”, in Hjort and Laver 1997: 37–49 (ch. 2).
  • –––, 2006, “On the (So‐called) Puzzle of Imaginative Resistance”, in Nichols 2006: 137–148 (ch. 8). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.003.0008
  • –––, 2015, “Empathy, Imagination, and Phenomenal Concepts”, in his In Other Shoes: Music, Metaphor, Empathy, Existence, New York: Oxford University Press, 1–16.
  • Weatherson, Brian, 2004, “Morality, Fiction, and Possibility”, Philosopher’s Imprint, 4(3): article 3.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan M. and Aaron Meskin, 2006, “Puzzling over the Imagination: Philosophical Problems, Architectural Solutions”, in Nichols 2006: 175–202 (ch. 10). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199275731.003.0010
  • Williams, Christopher, 2019, “Why Quasi‐Emotions Should Go Away: A Comment on Dos Santos”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 77(1): 79–82. doi:10.1111/jaac.12606
  • Wilson, George M., 2011, Seeing Fictions in Film: The Epistemology of Movies, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199594894.001.0001
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 1980, Works and Worlds of Art, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Yablo, Stephen, 2002, “Coulda, Woulda, Shoulda”, in Conceivability and Possibility, Tamar Gendler and John Hawthorne (eds), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 441–492.
  • Zajonc, Robert B., 1984, “On the Primacy of Affect.”, American Psychologist, 39(2): 117–123. doi:10.1037/0003-066X.39.2.117

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2024 by
Katie Tullmann <Katherine.tullmann@nau.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free