First published Tue Nov 12, 2019

Telling fictional stories and engaging with the fictional stories of others is an important and pervasive part of human culture. But people not only tell and engage with fictional stories. They also reflect on the content of stories, and on the way these are told. Grappling with the many issues such reflection uncovers has long been a concern of professional academics in language departments and other academic programs with a focus on language. Philosophers should be included on this list. The concept of fiction gives rise to a number of intriguing and complex philosophical issues, and the philosophy of fiction has now become an acknowledged part of mainstream philosophy, with a history that goes back at least to the early debates about the role of poets and dramatists found in the works of Aristotle and Plato. The issues in question broadly relate to fiction as a mode of representation—a way of describing individuals and events—that is strikingly different from representation concerned with truth, the latter long a dominant theme in philosophy. Not only is faithfulness to truth in the ordinary sense not a requirement in fiction; fiction may even depart from truth in the things it talks about, which typically include nonexistent individuals and even members of nonexistent kinds (Holmes and hobbits, for example)—see the entry on fictional entities.

There are also more indirect reasons for taking fiction seriously as a philosophical topic. The last few decades have seen a surge of interest in interpreting prominent yet (arguably) philosophically problematic areas of enquiry—areas as far apart as mathematics and morality—as involving something akin to fiction, a position known as fictionalism about those areas. On such views, we should not believe the central claims of the area because of their commitment to entities like numbers and objective moral facts; instead we should treat them the way we treat a distinctively fictional claim like “Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective”: something we know not to be literally true (after all, there never was a Sherlock Holmes) but accept as true in some derivative or at least nonliteral sense (unlike “Holmes was a plodding policeman”, say). The continuing rise of fictionalism presents us with a new reason for treating fiction as a significant philosophical topic, since it is a position that is difficult to motivate independently of an understanding of what is distinctive about fiction (Armour-Garb and Woodbridge 2015). (For more on fictionalism and its ties to fiction, see the entry on fictionalism.)

One fundamental question raised by the notion of fiction is a conceptual one: What makes something a work of fiction as opposed to a work of non-fiction? A first attempt at saying what fiction is might portray it as a kind of writing whose product is a written text (a work of fiction) that misrepresents how the world actually is, although not in order to deceive intended readers. This opposes it to non-fiction; even if a work of non-fiction misrepresents the world, it is not intended by its author to be recognized as something that misrepresents the world.

It doesn’t take much to see that this rough characterization is in fact far too rough. A work of fiction needn’t be a written text, but could be a picture (or series of pictures) or a representation in some other medium like film. And the characterization lets in too much: a newspaper article attacking some political position by engaging in the relentless use of irony, say, is not a work of fiction but a work of non-fiction that uses irony.

The problem of saying how fiction differs from non-fiction is just one of the hard problems faced by the philosophical study of fiction. Another problem is that of specifying the sense in which a fictional sentence can be true despite misdescribing how matters stand in the world. (A sentence like “Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective”, for example, is not true if it is construed as a claim about brilliant detectives our world has known, but counts as true if it is stated as an answer to a quiz question “Who was Sherlock Holmes?” By contrast, “Sherlock Holmes was a plodding policeman” would count as false in this context.) But in what sense can the sentence be true, given that the world does not contain any such person as Sherlock Holmes? One promising thought is that when we hear the sentence as genuinely true we regard it as elliptical for something like “In the Holmes stories, Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective”. On this suggestion it is the truth of the latter prefixed sentence that provides the sense in which “Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective” counts as true. But even if this is right, what still needs explaining is what it is for such a prefixed sentence to be true. What makes “In the Holmes stories, Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective” true (but not “In the Holmes stories, Sherlock Holmes was a plodding policeman”), when there never was such a person as Sherlock Holmes? In addition to the problem of how to understand the notion of truth in a work of fiction, there is also a deep puzzle about the way we respond emotionally to such truths. When we engage with fiction, we often do so at a highly specific emotional level—we may not only be enthralled by elements of the plot but also affected by what befalls particular characters. Thus, we may find ourselves feeling pity for Anna Karenina as we near the end of Tolstoy’s novel because we are aware of Anna’s suffering. But the claim that we pity Anna Karenina is deeply puzzling: we know there is no Anna Karenina, and that it is only true in Tolstoy’s novel that Anna Karenina is suffering, so how can there be genuine pity for Anna? This is the so-called paradox of fiction, one of a batch of puzzles that have been raised in the philosophy of fiction about our engagement with works of fiction.

These are by no means the only philosophical questions thrown up by fiction. In fact, the paradox of fiction immediately suggests others. Taken at face value, a statment like “Sherlock Holmes was a brilliant detective” seems at best to be true in a work of fiction rather than true outright. By contrast, a statement like “Many readers pity Anna Karenina” seems to be true outright. (The same goes for other statements relating fictional characters to the real world, for example “Conan Doyle created Holmes”, “Frodo doesn’t exist”, and “Holmes is more famous than any real detective”.) This raises the thorny issue of the ontological commitments of talk involving fiction. If it is genuinely true that many readers feel pity for Anna Karenina or that Doyle created Holmes, then presumably there are things—Anna Karenina and Holmes—about whom this is true. But how is the claim that there are such objects consistent with the obvious truth that Holmes and Anna Karenina don’t exist? And what could such nonexistent objects be like? We leave detailed commentary on such ontological and metaphysical questions to the entry on fictional entities. The present entry is devoted to the nature of fiction and its “truths”, including our emotional engagement with these truths—topics that can be discussed independently of whether one is a realist or an antirealist about fictional entities. Before we begin, it is worth noting that the study of these topics is not the province of philosophers alone. Just what is fiction, for example, is a question that also engages narratologists and historians of fiction (see, e.g., Gallagher 2006, Walsh 2007), although they approach the issue from different academic perspectives, often with somewhat different aims in mind. The present entry focuses mainly on the work of philosophers.

1. The Nature of Fiction

In whatever way we characterize the fiction/non-fiction distinction, the distinction is widely recognized as important. We care which category a work belongs to. We read Lord Macaulay’s The History of England (1848) to learn about the overthrow of James II and its aftermath, and criticize Macaulay for departures from fact or for bias: these detract from its value as a work of non-fiction. Historical novels such as Tolstoy’s War and Peace (1865–1867) or Hilary Mantel’s Wolf Hall (2009) also display bias and they depart in numerous ways from fact, but the bias and inaccuracies don’t lessen their value as works of fiction. And when a writer passes off a work as a work of non-fiction, deliberately hiding the fact that much of its content was made up, we see that as fraudulent. (There are numerous examples. One famous case is “Jimmy’s World”, written for the Washington Post in 1980 by journalist Janet Cooke; the article won her a Pulitzer Prize that she later returned.)

Not everyone agrees that the distinction matters. Some have argued that all discourse is on a par, that there is no writing that is per se fictional or non-fictional. According to Stanley Fish, for example,

when we communicate, it is because we are parties to a set of discourse agreements which are in effect decisions as to what can be stipulated as a fact. It is these decisions and the agreement to abide by them, rather than the availability of substance, that make it possible for us to refer, whether we are novelists or reporters for the New York Times. (Fish 1980: 242)

Other writers make much of the fact that even non-fiction writers select and structure what they write about and how they write about it. But even if we grant all this, we don’t need to succumb to the kind of skeptical position such authors argue for. It remains the case that fiction writers by and large accept a distinction between the real world and the fictional worlds they generate. The generation of such worlds, which often contain individuals, objects, and even kinds of objects, that are very different from those in the real world, is not simply a consequence of broad principles about how we always stipulate and select and structure how we see the world. In short, even those inclined to a kind of constructivist anti-realist metaphysics on the basis of the sorts of arguments Fish appeals to might nonetheless still admit a robust fiction/non-fiction distinction.

1.1 Semantic and Linguistic Accounts

But what might such a distinction look like? What makes a representation like a written text a work of fiction? Dictionaries often contrast fiction with fact or reality, so one tempting thought is that something is a fiction just if it is false, or contains falsehoods: a purely semantic characterization of “fiction”. This seems to have been Nelson Goodman’s view: “Literal falsity distinguishes fiction from true report” (Goodman 1978: 124). As a number of authors have pointed out, however, being false may be one meaning of the word “fiction”, but it is not the only meaning, and it is not the meaning at play when we nowadays call something a work of fiction (Lamarque and Olsen 1994; Cohn 1999). If it were, then any work that contains mistakes, say a physics text book, would count as a work of fiction.

(This is not to say that there is no connection between these two meanings of “fiction”. Works of fiction typically contain numerous falsehoods, and some have even speculated that the negative meaning of fiction as falsehood may have “delayed the lexical move of calling novels ‘fiction’ to a time when this genre had become a well-established, highly respected literary form” [Cohn 1999: 3].)

Even if fiction in the intended sense can’t be defined in terms of the notion of falsity alone, it might be thought that more complicated semantic accounts will have a greater chance of success. Thus, Cohn herself thought that fiction in the intended sense was “a literary nonreferential narrative” (1999: 17), where being “nonreferential” means that the work need not, and does not exclusively, refer to the real world outside the text, and that any references when it does “are not bound to accuracy” (1999: 15).

But such an account inherits one problem that also affects the simpler view of fiction as falsehood. Not only is nonreferentiality, like falsity, not sufficient for a text to be a work of fiction (consider a history of science text that contains a description of a failed scientific theory like phlogiston theory); it is also not necessary. Works of fiction may be wholly true, and in that sense refer exclusively to the real world outside the text. Imagine a work of historical fiction written about real persons, where, unbeknownst to the author, the parts that the author thought she was making up capture exactly what really happened. That wouldn’t make the work a work of non-fiction (Currie 1990: 9). In addition, the idea that references to the real world outside the text are not bound to accuracy surely needs to be weakened. Historical novels depend on their being more or less right about a large part of their historical setting.

Problems such as these have made semantic accounts of fiction relatively unpopular with philosophers. The same is true of approaches that look for textual differences between works of fiction and non-fiction. There seems to be no feature of style or syntax that marks off a work as fictional rather than non-fictional. For any proposed feature, say the use of footnotes or indices in works of non-fiction or the use of the imperfect tense in fiction (cf. Recanati 2000), one can find works from the other category that simply mimic the feature. Certain literary scholars and linguists have suggested an exception should be made for free indirect discourse, a literary device whereby a character’s first-person take on events is presented via third-person narration (as in this line from Emma by Jane Austen, a master of this literary device: “He was afraid they should have a very bad drive. He was afraid poor Isabella would not like it. And there would be poor Emma in the carriage behind” [Austen 1815 [1841: 114]). These theorists think free indirect discourse is peculiar to fiction (see especially Banfield 1982). But there is substantial evidence to show that other writing may also display this feature (see Fludernik 1993); even Hemingway used it in his early journalistic writings (Blinova 2012), and it is prominent in works of New Journalism, such as Truman Capote’s In Cold Blood (1966). At best, the appearance of free indirect discourse suggests that the work is a work of fiction; it doesn’t imply it (Friend 2012). And the use of free indirect discourse is scarcely necessary for being a work of fiction. Many works show no sign of it.

1.2 Fiction as Making Up Stories

A more promising approach to understanding the fiction/non-fiction distinction focuses not on semantic notions or stylistic features, but on the author’s inventiveness in producing a text, whatever its semantic or stylistic character. The best known such account is Harry Deutsch’s “fiction as making up stories” (Deutsch 2000, 2013). Deutsch insists “we cannot be left without a sharp distinction between fact and fiction” (2000: 149) even if we think, as Goodman did, that facts are themselves fabricated. Crucial to the notion of fiction, he thinks, is that, unlike fact, it is the product of creative, imaginative activity on the author’s part, activity in which the author makes something up “out of whole cloth”. His own distinctive take on this view explains the kind of fabrication involved in fiction-making as the author’s stipulatively ascribing properties to individuals, but where these properties match properties possessed by pre-existing objects from the “fictional plenitude”, a domain that contains not only every conceivable object and event but also an enormous range of impossibilities (Deutsch 2000: 155–6).

Deutsch is particularly critical of a contrasting view, to be discussed later, according to which what is necessary and sufficient for a work to be a work of fiction is specified in terms of imaginative activity on the part of the work’s readers rather than its author (Deutsch 2013: 366ff). But focusing on the author seems to have its own problems. First, it suggests that works like Cooke’s “Jimmy’s World” and James Frey’s A Million Little Pieces (2003), both of which were substantially made up although passed off as works of non-fiction, thereby count as works of fiction, contrary to the usual classification of such works (see Friend 2012; Friend agrees that we might pejoratively call A Million Little Pieces “just one long fiction”, but sees this as an example of the ambiguity of the word “fiction”). In response, Deutsch insists that, whatever our judgment about Frey’s A Million Little Pieces, the case of Cooke is clear:

[she] exercised her authorial imagination. She did everything an author of fiction would normally do. … If there ever was a case of fiction masquerading as fact, this is it. (Deutsch 2013: 369)

A second point, to be discussed below, is that numerous works of non-fiction involve creative interpolations on the part of the author. If so, Deutsch’s approach faces the danger that all such works should be classified as part fiction, part non-fiction. But Deutsch denies that on such a “fiction as making up stories” approach the inclusion of salient fictitious elements is sufficient to make something a work of fiction (2013: 368)—it all depends on the level of imaginative activity exhibited by the work.

1.3 Fiction as Authorial Pretense

Deutsch’s view is not the only one to highlight the central role of the author in the definition of fictionality. A number of authors think that fiction-making involves a special kind of speech act on the part of the author, one that differs sharply from assertion (see especially Currie 1990, to which we return below). Unlike Deutsch’s account, such views have the capacity to classify works like “Jimmy’s World” as non-fiction on the grounds that authors assert the content of such works; even if much of this content is made up, authors intend readers to take it as factual. Just how to characterize a special speech act of fiction-making or story-telling is no easy matter, however. Take Nicholas Wolterstorff’s view that story-tellers engage in “presenting or offering for consideration” propositions for audiences to reflect on (Wolterstorff 1980). But even scientists do this when putting forward speculative theories, so it is hard to see how this sets fiction apart from non-fiction. John Searle has in fact argued that attempts to define a special illocutionary act of fiction-making are doomed to failure, since they entail that fictional discourse must differ in meaning from ordinary assertoric discourse (Searle 1975: 323–4; Predelli 2019 offers a sympathetic reconstruction of the argument). He proposes that we should instead understand fiction-making in terms of pretense: authors pretend to assert what they are saying (1975: 324). More generally,

the author of a work of fiction pretends to perform a series of illocutionary acts, normally of the representative type [such as assertion], (1975: 325)

but without any attempt to deceive. For Searle, therefore,

the identifying criterion for whether or not a text is a work of fiction must of necessity lie in the illocutionary intentions of the author

(that is, their presence in the case of non-fiction writing, their absence in the case of fiction-making), and not in features of the text (1975: 325).

Searle’s appeal to the notion of pretense has been very influential, but as stated the account seems inadequate in a number of ways. As he himself admits, many works of fiction contain claims that seem to be put forward as serious assertions (he cites the opening lines of Tolstoy’s Anna Karenina, 1877), and so his theory at best defines what makes a fragment of a work fictional, not what makes a work fictional (Searle 1975: 331–2). (Searle’s account shares this feature with a number of other accounts; we look at ways in which theorists have responded below.) Furthermore, not only is pretense not necessary for something to be (part of) a work of fiction, it is also not sufficient: one can pretend to engage in an illocutionary act for all kinds of reasons other than the fact that one is writing fiction—one might just be engaging in mimicry or verbal irony, for example (Currie 1990: 17).

Despite the latter problem, pretense has played, and continues to play, a large role in the way philosophers understand fiction. Kripke, for example, claimed as early as his 1973 John Locke Lectures that writing fiction involved pretense, a view he then used to argue against attempts to use fiction in the defense of a descriptivist theory of reference for names (Kripke 2013: 23). David Lewis too saw story-telling as pretense: in his seminal work on truth in fiction he claimed that “the story-teller [pretends] to be telling the truth about matters whereof he has knowledge” (Lewis 1978 [1983: 266]). Neither claimed to be defining fiction in terms of pretense, however. Lewis, for example, acknowledges that sometimes one pretends in order to deceive, unlike the story-teller (Lewis 1987 [1983: 266]).

1.4 Fiction as Make-Believe

The problems faced by pretense accounts of fiction that only consider what authors do have made some philosophers look instead at the role that readers play. Indeed, approaches that look at the role of readers (or, more generally, consumers) of fiction have now become standard in the literature. Kendall Walton’s version of such a view appeared in his ground-breaking Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts (Walton 1990). Walton focuses on the way a text can be used as a resource in games of make-believe in which participants pretend, imagine, or make believe that the world is as the text represents it as being. (Walton’s view, it should be stressed, applies to representational entities in general: dolls, globs of mud, paintings, sculptures, and so on, not just literary texts.) Just as children use tree stumps as props in a game of make-believe in which the stumps count as bears, so a community of readers can use a text as a prop in a game of make-believe in which the text is treated as a record of events, situations, conversations, etc. Any text whose function is to serve as a prop in a game of make-believe, thereby prescribing imaginings about its content, counts as a work of fiction for Walton. (Function is determined by a number of factors such as author’s intentions and views about how the work can be appropriately used; Walton 1990: 91.) If readers let their imaginings be directed in this way, they are then participating in a game of make-believe that is authorized by the work.

For Walton, then, what is necessary for a text to count as a work of fiction is that it is supposed to serve as a prop in a game of make-believe, one that requires readers of the text to make believe its content. Note that this does not exclude the author from having a similar attitude to the work. Authors too may imagine or make believe or pretend that what they are saying is true (cf. Searle), but what is crucial to a work of fiction is that this is a requirement on consumers of fiction. (For this reason, day-dreaming out loud does not count as fiction.) Walton argues that this make-believe view prevents most biographies, textbooks, newspaper articles, and the like, from being works of fiction, since it is

not [their] function, as such, to serve as props in games of make-believe. They are used to claim truth for certain propositions rather than to make propositions fictional. (1990: 70)

But there is a complication. Walton intends the account to provide a sufficient condition for being a work of fiction, not just a necessary condition. In proposing this, he self-consciously departs from our ordinary, intuitive concept of fiction, which he sees as only “a rough everyday classification” (Walton 1990: 72) in urgent need of refinement (among other problems, the ordinary concept of fiction is liable to treat certain works, for example, didactic dialogues like Berkeley’s Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713), as both non-fiction and fiction; Walton 1990: 72). But that means that his new way of construing the fiction/non-fiction distinction does not align with the usual way of understanding it, since many works of apparent non-fiction—many newspaper articles, biographies, real-life adventure tales, and so on—are written in a way that is designed to engage readers’ imagination and so satisfy the conditions for being works of fiction. Thus, he writes

Some histories are written in such a vivid, novelistic style that they almost inevitably induce the reader to imagine what is said, regardless of whether or not he believes it. (Indeed, this may be true of Prescott’s History of the Conquest of Peru.) If we think of the work as prescribing such a reaction, it serves as a prop in a game of make-believe. (Walton 1990: 71)

Similarly, there is

no doubt that [Norman Mailer’s The Executioner’s Song—a novelistic retelling of the execution of Gary Gilmore] … has the function of prescribing imaginings (Walton 1990: 80)

and so counts as fiction for Walton. Walton even thinks that any metaphor is a fiction since a metaphor prescribes imagining (Walton 1993), and that objects that were not produced to function in this way, such as naturally produced cracks in a rock, could be treated as props that prompt imaginings, and so could turn out to be a work of fiction (Walton 1990: 87).

1.5 Speech-Act Accounts

For many critics (e.g., Currie 1990: 36; Lamarque & Olsen 1994, 48; Davies 2001: 264; Stock 2017) these are unwanted consequences for an account of fiction. Excitingly told histories are still histories and so should be classified as non-fiction; and the fact that cracks in a rock might prompt imaginings just shows that the rock could be treated as a work of fiction, not that it could turn out to be a work of fiction. These critics worry that Walton’s conception of fiction is far broader than the traditional one (to mark this point, Friend 2008, 152, distinguishes what she calls “walt-fiction” from fiction in the usual sense), and insist that it is the latter notion that needs analysis or explication. In the case of this traditional notion, they think we should let the author’s intentions determine fictionality, just as Searle proposed, but, unlike Searle, they propose that this be done by focusing on how the author intends an audience to respond to a text rather than on the author’s own attitude to the text. One influential proposal of this type, defended by Greg Currie in The Nature of Fiction (1990), holds that authors engage in a special illocutionary act of fictive utterance, which Currie then proceeds to describe in terms of Gricean reflexive intentions (cf. Grice 1957). In a fictive utterance, the author produces a text with fictive intent, in the sense that he

intends that we make-believe the text (or rather its constituent propositions) and he intends to get us to do this by means of our recognition of that very intention. (Currie 1990: 30)

We can then say that

a work is fiction iff (a) it is the product of a fictive intent and (b) if the work is true, then it is at most accidentally true. (1990: 46)

The second clause is added because Currie thinks that truth alone does not disqualify a text from being fiction; an author may write a story that, quite by chance, ends up correctly describing actual events. But if it is no accident that the work is true—if the work is somehow the result of the represented facts being the way they are (for example, by the author recording these facts from memory, even repressed memory)—then the work is non-fiction rather than fiction (Currie 1990: 47).

Currie is aware that as it stands this account needs finessing, since many fictional works have a basis in actual fact. But for the most part Currie has remained true to this fictive utterance account of fiction. Later work changes some of the scaffolding of the theory, but not its essential structure. For example, Currie (1995a) introduces a broader philosophical conception of imagination—simulation—that covers both mental imagery and propositional imagining; he further suggests that “readers of fiction simulate the state of a hypothetical reader of fact” (Currie 1997: 144), and in doing so may also simulate the mental states of the characters with whom they (as simulators of the hypothetical reader of fact) are emotionally engaged. (Matravers 2014: ch. 3 criticizes the view that such simulation is distinctive of fiction.)

Other authors offer variations on Currie’s fictive utterance account. Lamarque and Olsen, for example, think that in the case of fiction an author presents sentences, aiming

for the audience to make-believe (imagine or pretend) that the standard speech act commitments associated with the sentences are operative even while knowing they are not. (Lamarque & Olsen 1994: 43)

To attend to the sentences in this way is to adopt the fictive stance towards them, and it is an author’s invitation that readers adopt the fictive stance that makes something a work of fiction rather than non-fiction. Readers who adopt the fictive stance towards the sentences can infer neither that the author believes them nor that they are true.

Lamarque and Olsen thus retain Currie’s view that there is a negative association between awareness that certain sentences are true and their status as fiction. But as we already saw when discussing semantic accounts of fictionality and, later, Searle’s pretense account, any such negative association highlights a further problem. Some works of fiction, perhaps most, make authorial pronouncements that are taken by both author and readers to be true (historical novels are an obvious example). Works of fiction often contain true descriptions of their geographical, historical, political, and social setting, while works that belong to particular genres require true descriptions of this kind if they are to be successful instances of the genres (consider the setting of historical fiction like Vidal’s Lincoln (1984) or social-political fiction like Sinclair’s The Jungle (1906), or the descriptions of the practice of policing and forensic science in Cornwell’s Scarpetta series, for example; see also Gibson 2007: ch. 5; Matravers 2014). So there are parts of many, if not most, works of fiction that are non-accidentally true, and so the works should not straightforwardly count as fiction according to the criteria set out by Currie and by Lamarque and Olsen.

Those in the fictive utterance tradition have responded to this problem in different ways. One response is to invoke a further distinction between the fictionality of statements contained in the work and the fictionality of the work itself, taking the former as fundamental. Currie, for example, claims that his account is primarily an account of the fictionality of statements contained in a work, with the fictionality of the work depending on the status of such statements “in some perhaps irremediably vague way” (Currie 1990: 49). Most fictional works, Currie thinks, are “a patchwork of fiction-making and assertion” (1990: 48–9). (For criticisms of such a “patchwork” theory of fiction, see, for example Friend 2008, 2011; Stock 2011, 2017.)

The second kind of response to this issue is more holistic. David Davies, for example, thinks that the primary focus of the fiction/non-fiction divide should be on narratives rather than whole works (works might contain a series of narratives). What makes a narrative fictional or non-fictional are the author’s purposes and the constraints she works under (Davies 2007). If, for example, she feels herself bound by the “fidelity constraint” (roughly, that one should only mention events that one believes to have occurred, in the order in which they occurred), she is writing non-fiction, whereas if she is motivated by some more general purpose in story-telling such as the desire to entertain her audience she is writing fiction. As a result, even a narrative that tracks actual events can be fiction if the author’s story-telling purposes override the fidelity constraint (Davies 2007: 47). (For criticism of Davies’s narrative view of fiction, see Friend 2008, Stock 2017.)

By contrast, Kathleen Stock’s account of fiction allows that fictions may include propositions that are put forward simply because they are important truths, and so material that should be believed and not just imagined (e.g., the comments on slavery and Christianity in Beecher Stowe’s Uncle Tom’s Cabin (1851)). For Stock, such beliefs are not outliers, for she thinks that even if a person imagines something that she also believes, she will (be disposed to) conjoin this in thought with other propositions that she does not believe (Stock 2011; 2017, 147). Stock then defines a fiction as, roughly, as a collection of fictive utterances in Currie’s sense that are subject to the condition that where there is more than one fictive utterance present, the author must also intend the reader or hearer to imagine them conjunctively. A fictional work, she thinks, is different. It is something usually carefully constructed and usually either written down for posterity, or performed publicly. By contrast, a fiction may be uttered only once, in a brief conversation with a single interlocutor (Stock 2017: 169–74).

These accounts all take authorial intention to be essential to being a fiction. For Walton, by contrast, the emphasis on authorial intention mistakes what are at best consequences of the author’s having constructed a fiction for an essential feature of fiction (Walton 1990: 87). He thinks that this is borne out by the fact that

[o]ne may well read a story or contemplate a picture (which is a fiction) without wondering which fictional truths the author or artist meant to generate. (1990: 88)

All this confirms, he thinks, that the basic concept of a fiction is best thought of as attaching to objects whose function is to serve as a prop of a certain sort in games of make-believe rather than to illocutionary actions (1990: 87). (For further discussion of Walton’s arguments on this point, see Stock 2017: ch. 7.)

1.6 Fiction, Pretense, and Cognitive Psychology

In the previous subsection we considered views, beginning with Currie’s, that take awareness that certain sentences are true to count against their status as fiction, or that look to more holistic features of the text to show why this awareness does not compromise their status as fiction. These views all hold that merely appealing to the imagination does not capture what is essential to fiction; they attempt in different ways to identify what else is necessary. In the next section we look at some influential new challenges to these views, but in the present section we adopt a different orientation. In order to narrow down the sense in which fiction on the ordinary, intuitive understanding prompts imaginings we describe some work on make-believe or pretense in the cognitive sciences. As we will see, there are some clear points of contact between this work and some of the views considered above.

Consider in particular the popular “multiple models” theory according to which an agent engaging in make-believe entertains a representational model—the pretend (or, more broadly, imaginary) model—that is different from the representational model she normally uses—the reality model. The reality model in this set-up represents how the agent believes things actually unfold, while the pretend model represents how things unfold in an imaginary world, a world of make-believe (Perner 1991). Nothing, however, prevents the pretend model from also storing actual beliefs, as may happen with fictions that import representations of the real world. The point is simply that once they are stored in the pretend model, those beliefs have to be evaluated with respect to the imaginary rather than the real world. The pretend model thus becomes part of an offline reasoning mechanism in which beliefs are disconnected from actions occurring in the real world. In particular, such beliefs don’t lead to the sort of actions that would result if they were part of an online reasoning mechanism, which is what the reality model is (Nichols & Stich 2003).

But there is a problem with seeing the availability of a two-model account as a sufficient condition for the relevant kind of make-believe. There are people suffering from various clinical syndromes who also activate distinct models of this kind, prompting them to exhibit incoherent patterns of behavior. Thus, consider people affected by the Capgras syndrome. While saying that a close relative has been replaced by an impostor, they also behave in a friendly manner towards this “impostor”. Such people are perhaps best interpreted as people whose odd beliefs are not integrated into a single belief system (Young 2000).

A friend of the two-model account may say that people affected in this way are to be classified differently from those engaging with fiction: their “imaginary” beliefs are not quarantined from their “real” ones. But note that the simultaneous yet distinct activation of the imaginary and reality models also accounts for the cognitive situation of agents who are somehow dissociated—subjects who experience a world of their own and still do not lose their grip on the real world. Sleepwalkers are a clear case. A sleepwalker may mobilize both the reality model, allowing her to avoid obstacles while walking, and an imaginary model, in which she represents the world she is dreaming about. Despite this, she is not engaged in make-believe (Meini & Voltolini 2010).

One way of answering this challenge is to invoke Leslie’s identification of fiction with metarepresentation (Leslie 1987). On this view, the required quarantining of imaginary beliefs involves a metarepresentational level. The difference between a subject who engages in make-believe and a dissociated subject lies in the fact that the former acknowledges that the representations entertained in the pretend model are not to be lumped together with the representations that she entertains in the reality model. Following a line of thought that can already be found in Vaihinger, who originally drew a connection between fiction and awareness (1911 [1924]: 80, 98–9), Lillard writes:

a pretender must be aware of the actual situation and the nonactual, represented one, or else (s)he is mistaken, not pretending. (2001: 497)

Proponents of such a view construe this kind of awareness as a second-order representation that operates on first-order representations; it involves a recognition that, insofar as the imaginary representations are stored in the pretend model, it can’t be inferred that they represent the real world. Note that Currie himself moves in this direction when arguing that metarepresenting is required for pretending, as a way of combining his intentionalist account of fiction with simulationist accounts (Currie 1998).

Some critics, however, think this idea is too demanding, that it presupposes too intellectualist a view of pretending and hence of fiction (see Perner 1991: 19–20, 35). For in order to have a metarepresentation of a representation, one surely needs to represent it to oneself as a representation, and young children in particular do not possess a notion of representation (1991: 19–20, 35). Others think this criticism presupposes a disputable conceptualist account of representing, and hence also of metarepresenting (Meini & Voltolini 2010). Perner himself recognizes that merely simultaneously entertaining distinct representations in different models is not sufficient for make-believe, and suggests that the two models have to be integrated into a single all-encompassing model which nests both the pretend and the reality models. It is far from clear, however, that this account is any less intellectualist than the metarepresentational one that Perner criticizes, given the way it appeals to the idea of nesting. Leslie had already pointed out that we invoke a nesting of this kind when, from outside of a fiction F and typically from the perspective of reality, we speak of F itself when we say “In fiction F, p” (Leslie 1987). Doing so, however, requires possession of a notion that is even more conceptually demanding than the notion of representation, namely the notion of fiction itself, so this appeal to nesting should not be seen as unproblematic (Meini & Voltolini 2010: 50).

1.7 New Challenges

The various accounts of fiction discussed so far in this section disagree on numerous points, and, although pretense or imagination-based accounts are probably the most widely supported, each one faces challenges and there is no consensus as to which version is correct. But perhaps the most radical challenge to all of these attempts to specify the nature of fiction has come from theorists who think that the enterprise of finding necessary and sufficient conditions for what it takes to be a work of fiction should be abandoned. Such theorists think that there are genuine borderline cases and cases that are, in some sense, admixtures of fiction and non-fiction, and that such cases show that it is wrong to try to capture the notion of fiction in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. (Note that the main target for this challenge are theorists who think that there are intuitive concepts of fiction and non-fiction that are worth articulating in the first place. As we saw earlier, Walton’s approach is different: he urges replacement of the traditional distinction.)

While Walton proposes replacing the intuitive fiction/non-fiction distinction, Derek Matravers urges another path (Matravers 2014): the philosophy of fiction should simply stop caring about this distinction and shift its focus to the distinction between “confrontations” (situations that involve our immediate environment, and thereby afford the possibility of action) and “representations” (situations represented to us as happening at other times or in other places, thereby denying us the possibility of action). On the surface, it is hard to see this way of cashing out representations as particularly illuminating, since it puts fictional representations in the same basket as some scientific representations (2014: 53) and even historical representations. But Matravers discerns one significant difference among representations: where they lie on the “thin” to “thick” continuum. Thin representations (say, a physics text) merely aim to pass on information and do not stimulate the imagination, while thick representations, such as exciting histories and vivid novels, do. But Matravers insists that nothing in the way we engage with thick representations separates fiction from non-fiction, and that this is amply borne out by empirical studies of text-processing by psychologists (see, for example, Green & Brock 2000):

The experience of reading de Quincey’s “The Revolt of the Tartars” is the same whether we believe it is non-fictional, believe it is fictional, or (as is most likely) we are ignorant of whether it is non-fictional or fictional. (2014: 78)

Because of this, Matravers finds

[t]he traditional distinction, between representations that are fiction and representations that are non-fiction, … entirely unhelpful. (2014: 47)

A number of commentators, however, have denied that such empirical studies really do have the implications that Matravers sees in them. For Lamarque, for example, the modes of reading of literary critics and historians involve different normative practices that determine what questions are asked and where attention is directed (Lamarque 2016). And Stacie Friend argues that even ordinary readers approach works of fiction and non-fiction with different expectations (Friend forthcoming).

Friend agrees, however, that our engagement with works of fiction and non-fiction alike involves a combination of imagining and belief. Some works of non-fiction contain striking invented and hypothetical elements (e.g., Tacitus’s Histories, which contains made-up battle scenes; Dutch (1999), Edmund Morris’s authorized biography of Ronald Reagan, in which Morris inserts himself into the story as the fictional narrator; and works of history that actively countenance the implications of certain counterfactuals). At the same time, facts about what actually happened are the dominant focus of some works of fiction such as Vidal’s Narratives of Empire series. Friend thinks that such cases undermine accounts of the fiction/non-fiction distinction by theorists like Currie, Lamarque & Olsen, Davies, and Stock (see Friend 2008, 2011, 2012, forthcoming).

To deal with these and other hard cases, Friend recommends against trying to find necessary and sufficient conditions for being a work of fiction, although not by relinquishing the emphasis on works in favor of more basic units like fictional statements and narratives. Instead, fiction and non-fiction should be regarded as very broad genres in which particular works are embedded, where a genre is a way of classifying representations that guides appreciation. Borrowing from ideas in Walton’s “Categories of Art” (Walton 1970), Friend argues that classifying a work as a work of fiction or non-fiction depends on a range of features. A feature is standard for a genre if possession of the feature tends to place the work in that genre; contra-standard if possession tends to exclude the work from the genre. (Features are variable if works can have or lack them without this affecting membership in the genre, such as the number of chapters a work contains). Thus, containing made-up material counts as standard for the genre of fiction but contra-standard for non-fiction, while being faithful to the facts counts as standard for non-fiction but contra-standard for fiction. (As Friend notes, such a classification may itself change over time; the kind of inventive embellishment found in Tacitus’s Histories, for example, was once regarded as standard for historical non-fiction, but is now regarded as contra-standard [Friend 2012: 192–3].)

A crucial claim of the ensuing genre theory of fiction/non-fiction is that having contra-standard features for a genre does not simply exclude a work from that genre. Capote’s In Cold Blood, for example, is a striking piece of non-fiction precisely because it possesses certain features that were, at the time of its writing, contra-standard for non-fiction. What explains the fact that we nonetheless class it as non-fiction has much to do with other features of the work, including the reliance we place on authorial intention: Capote took himself to be writing a kind of literary journalism (Friend 2012: 194), just as Tacitus took himself to be writing history after the fashion of his time. (Friend is somewhat unclear about the content of such intentions, however. Presumably they can’t be understood as intentions to write a certain kind of fiction or non-fiction, on pain of circularity, although it is hard to see how else to construe them.)

For Friend, then, the classification of a work as fiction or non-fiction may depend heavily on context: a weighing up of various standard and contra-standard features that is strongly, but defeasibly, influenced by authorial intentions. This opens the view to the objection that the classification is too subjective for the distinction to count as theoretically important (Voltolini 2016). Friend’s answer is that placement of a work in either the genre of fiction or non-fiction directs our attention to different aspects of the work, and even influences us to adopt a specific reading strategy appropriate to works in the genre (Friend 2012: 202ff.; Friend forthcoming)—a very different view from that of Matravers, who discerned no interesting way in which our engagement with fictional representation differs from our engagement with non-fictional representations.

Those who favor other accounts have not been quiet in their opposition to Friend’s proposal. Both Currie and Davies, for example, have defended their versions of the fictive utterance theory by offering more nuanced accounts of the way the fictional status of a work depends on the fictional status of its parts (Currie 2014; Davies 2015). Thus, Currie argues that a work’s fictional status supervenes on its intentional profile, which specifies the communicative intentions behind the utterances that produce the work (Currie 2014). One consequence of this view is that if a work uses as much imaginative reconstruction and invention of events as a fictional work does (on our current understanding of this notion), then all else being equal we should also count the first work as fiction. Currie takes this to imply that Tacitus’s Annals and Histories, with their many made-up elements, count as fiction rather than non-fiction—despite the fact that Tacitus took himself to be writing non-fiction history (for objections, see Friend 2012). By contrast, Davies again emphasizes that the fictional status of a work depends on the fictional narrative(s) found in a work, which he now construes as the fictive content readers are asked to make-believe of a real setting: if the narrative serves to comment on something asserted in the work then it is a work of non-fiction; if what is asserted serves to comment on the narrative the work is fiction (Davies 2015, esp. 54). On this criterion, he thinks, Tacitus wrote non-fiction.

Stock agrees. On her account, if a work contains utterances that are not fictive in her sense (that is, if they express propositions that readers are meant to believe but that they are not supposed to conjoin in thought with other propositions they are merely meant to make-believe), the work counts as non-fiction. It follows, she thinks, that we should count works like Tacitus’s Histories and Annals and Morris’s Dutch as non-fictional patchworks of the fictive and non-fictive (Stock 2017: 160). Manuel García-Carpintero (2013) offers another way of keeping a tight fiction/non-fiction distinction. He defends a version of Currie’s view that fiction-making prescribes imagining, but instead of appealing to the psychological attitudes of those engaged in fictive acts, as Currie does, he understands such prescriptions in terms of constitutive rules that specify the commitments someone incurs when engaging in fiction-making, as opposed to the constitutive rules that are involved in assertive acts. On this normative view, claims that are asserted as true can be part of a work of fiction, since, given the author’s purposes, one and the same fictive utterance may be subject to both the norm of fiction-making and the norm of assertion, as a performance of a direct as well as of an indirect speech act as it were (2013: 356f.). But García-Carpintero accepts that works of non-fiction can include invitations to imagine as well, and he thinks that works like Tacitus’s Histories and Annals straightforwardly count as a patchwork of fact and fiction. (For discussion, see Stock 2017: 161–3.)

2. Truth in Fiction

Whatever the right theory of the nature of fiction, (nearly) everyone agrees that there are paradigm cases of works of fiction. Many of the sentences in such works are, of course, not true since in paradigm cases of fiction much of the content is made up. For example, the sentence

It was the end of November, and Holmes and I sat, upon a raw and foggy night, on either side of a blazing fire in our sitting-room in Baker Street. (The Hound of the Baskervilles: ch. 15)

is not true at any real context of utterance since there is no Sherlock Holmes, and no Dr. Watson to utter the sentence. More generally, sentences that purport to describe the world depicted in a work of fiction are often false (or at least not true) since they misdescribe the world as it actually is; “Holmes was a detective living at 221B Baker Street, London”, for example. Still, this sentence sounds true, whereas a sentence like “Holmes was a short-order cook living in Paris” sounds false. One way of capturing this point is to say that fictional sentences are elliptic for sentences with an “in the story” prefix (Lewis 1978 [1983]): what is true is that in The Hound of the Baskervilles Dr. Watson and Sherlock Holmes sat reminiscing in their sitting-room in Baker Street on a raw and foggy night in November, just as it is true that in The Hound of the Baskervilles (and virtually all the Holmes stories) Holmes was a detective living at 221B Baker Street, London.

This shifts the problem of how to understand the kind of truth that sentences have in a work of fiction to the actual truth of sentences of the form “In work of fiction F, φ”. How should we understand such prefixed sentences? It can’t simply be that a such a sentence is true if and only if φ is explicitly stated in the text of F. For one thing, some things are not true in a work despite being explicitly stated—the internal narrator of a story may be highly unreliable (for example Charles Kinbote in Nabokov’s Pale Fire [1962]). In addition, to identify something as an (obvious) truth of fiction we often have to rely on various (uncontentious) interpretive moves that belong to the pragmatics rather than semantics of language – what is stated may go beyond what the words explicitly say (this is so even in the case of a paradigm fictional truth like “Holmes lived at 221B Baker Street”; see Hanley 2004).

Put the problem of the unreliable narrator aside for now, and assume that normal practices of interpretation apply when identifying the fictional truths stated in a work of fiction. Philosophers of fiction have been mainly interested in the second problem: that of characterizing what it is for a sentence to be true in a work despite not being stated in the work. A first attempt might focus on the background of actual fact that is available to readers of the work: given that London is the capital of Great Britain, the fact that the Holmes stories say that Holmes lived in London suggests that it is also true in the Holmes stories that Holmes lived in the capital of Great Britain. The simplest way to capture this thought would be to say that it is true in a fiction that p iff p is a logical consequence of the set of propositions that are represented as true in a story, combined with the set of all actual truths. But this suggestion won’t do. Many actual truths are inconsistent with what is stated in a story, and so can’t be drawn upon in this way to yield claims about what is true in the story. (It is actually true, for example, that London did not have as inhabitant a famous detective called “Holmes” who lived at 221B Baker St. But it is not true in the Holmes stories that Holmes lived in a city that did not have as inhabitant a famous detective called “Holmes” who lived at 221B Baker St.) We need to filter out the background that we can legitimately draw upon when we determine what is true in a work.

2.1 Truth in Fiction as Truth in the Worlds of Fiction

David Lewis provided the classic discussion of this issue in his “Truth in Fiction” (first published in 1978, reprinted with postscripts in 1983). His approach has two core ideas. The first is that we should adopt a pretense view of fiction. A fiction is a story told by a particular person on a particular occasion, and to tell a story is typically to pretend that one is relating an account of things that really did happen. The second core idea is the one mentioned above: stories are related against a background of (known) facts and beliefs, thereby ensuring that there is more to truth in fiction than is stated in stories. The novelty of Lewis’s approach is the way he understands this background and its impact in terms of the machinery of possible worlds and the semantics of counterfactuals. To put the point in technical jargon, Lewis treats in-the-fiction operators as special intensional operators.

Lewis offers two main analyses. On Analysis 1, the background against which a story is told is just actuality, appropriately filtered to remove whatever is at odds with the story. Truth in a fiction is just what would have been true had the fiction been told as known fact. In terms of Lewis’s possible world analysis of counterfactuals (Lewis 1973), this can be rendered as:

  • Analysis 1 A sentence of the form “In fiction F, φ” is non-vacuously true if and only if some world where F is told as known fact and φ is true differs less from our actual world, on balance, than does any world where F is told as known fact and φ is not true. (1978 [1983: 270])

Analysis 1 easily captures the fact that it is true in the Holmes stories that Holmes had a liver, for example (despite no mention being made of this in the stories). It also captures the fact that the fictional truth of many claims is simply left indeterminate (while it is true in the stories that Holmes had a liver, for example, it is not true in the stories that he had an average-sized liver). But the analysis also seems to catch too much (Lewis 1978 [1983]; Currie 1990; Phillips 1999; Walton 1990; Wolterstorff 1980). Given a story S, take any truth p that has no bearing on the events described in S. On Lewis’s Analysis 1 it will then be true in S that p, whether or not anyone believes that p. If, for example, Napoleon had exactly 100,001 hairs on his head at the battle of Austerlitz, it will then be true in the Holmes stories that he did.

If the unknown proposition p has implications for the events in the story, another problem arises. Take the example mentioned by Lewis. Suppose, as many think, that the swamp adder in “The Adventure of the Speckled Band” (1892) was intended by Doyle to be a Russell’s viper (Lewis 1978 [1983: 271]; but cf. Byrne 1993: 25, note 5). In the story, Holmes concludes that the murder victim in the story was killed by the snake’s climbing down a fake bell-rope. The Russell’s viper is a constrictor, however, so it cannot physically climb ropes, and hence Analysis 1 suggests that it is true in “The Speckled Band” that Holmes bungled (Lewis 1978 [1983: 271]). But this would clearly be the wrong conclusion to draw: what is true in the story is that Holmes was right. The fact that Conan Doyle was ignorant of a little known biological fact should not affect what is true in the Holmes stories.

This example suggests that it is (often) better to conceive the background in epistemic terms. (But maybe not always; as Lewis points out, there is a contested critical tradition that uses psychoanalytic views to interpret literary texts, as in the claim that Hamlet had an Oedipus Complex. Such a claim is probably best understood in terms of Analysis 1.) Lewis’s Analysis 2 provides such an epistemic orientation. It treats “background” as beliefs that are overt in the author’s community, where

a belief [is] overt for a community at a time iff more or less everyone shares it, more or less everyone thinks that more or less everyone shares it, and so on. (1978 [1983: 272])

Take the collective belief worlds to be the worlds where all the overt beliefs are true. Truth in fiction is what would have been true in the collective belief worlds, had the fiction been told as known fact:

  • Analysis 2 A sentence of the form “In fiction F, φ” is non-vacuously true iff whenever w is one of the collective belief worlds of the community of origin of F, then some world where F is told as known fact and φ is true differs less from w, on balance, than does any world where F is told as known fact and φ is not true. (1978 [1983: 273])

Analysis 2 rules out the case of the hairs on Napoleon’s head since there is no number h such that people collectively believed that Napoleon had h hairs at the battle of Austerlitz (at best they accepted very rough upper and lower bounds that allowed for 100,001 hairs but also considerably more or fewer). And the analysis rules out the case of the Speckled Band since the reception of the story by its readers showed that the relevant collective belief worlds are all worlds in which there is nothing to prevent swamp adders from climbing ropes. (In this case, the belief probably did not exist before people began reading the story, but was acquired as a result of trusting the author.) But the analysis also has some strikingly counterintuitive consequences. Take a typical Victorian novel that nowhere takes a stance on whether God exists. On Analysis 2 it will nonetheless be true in this novel that God exists, simply because Victorian England was overtly theistic so that the collective belief worlds are all worlds in which God exists (Walton 1990). Similarly, it will be true in many works that there are ghosts, and that women are markedly inferior to men.

In the later postscripts to his paper, Lewis considers some needed revisions to his two accounts. He conjectures, for example, that a story’s explicit content and background may need supplementing by “carry-over” of truths from other fictions if we are to capture what is true in a story (Lewis 1978 [1983]; Hanley 2004). But the most widely discussed revision that Lewis mentions, and the one that has generated most debate, concerns the case of impossible fictions—fictions that cannot be told as known fact in any possible world. We turn to this debate below (Sec 2.4) after reviewing two other influential accounts of truth in fiction.

Some final remarks about the notion of worlds that features in Lewis’s account and the many accounts inspired by his approach. Lewis’s worlds are possible worlds. He himself construes these as maximal connected spatio-temporal objects (Lewis 1986), although many others take them to be abstract entities of some kind (see the entry on possible worlds.) One can accept Lewis’s account of truth in fiction while preferring one of these alternative metaphysical conceptions of possible worlds. The important point is that the notion of a possible world, no matter how conceived, is a piece of modal machinery that has many other roles to play in metaphysics. It should not be confused with the notion of a fictional world, appealed to by philosophers and non-philosophers alike. Fictional worlds present themselves as realms, created by authors and generally incomplete and sometimes inconsistent, that are more or less distant from the real world but despite the distance are at least partially accessible from the real world (thus, we can know about Holmes and admire him from a distance, even if we can’t help him solve crimes). But although we often talk about fiction in terms of fictional worlds, making literal sense of such talk is fraught with difficulty (Pavel 1986 makes the attempt; Walton 1978 is a salutary reminder of what can go wrong), and philosophers have tended to take such talk with a grain of salt, construing fictional worlds instead as sets of fictional truths (Walton 1978; Walton 1990: 64–7) or as sets of worlds rather than single worlds (Lewis 1983: 270; Ross 1979: 49–54). Some have used the notion of a fictional world construed in some such way to provide a kind of linguistic counterpart to the mental reality and imaginary models discussed in 1.6, by appealing to the idea of a context of utterance or interpretation. (For more on the relevant notion of context, see the entry on theories of meaning.) On such a view, saying that a sentence is aimed at correctly representing a fictional world means that the sentence is to be interpreted relative to a context that contains the fictional world rather than the actual world as its world parameter. Consider a sentence like “Othello was jealous”. As uttered in a context that contains the actual world as its world parameter, this sentence is not true since “Othello” refers to nothing there. But the very same sentence is true in a fictional context that contains the fictional world of Othello as its world parameter, for at that world “Othello” refers to the jealous Venetian soldier of Shakespeare’s play. This account arguably also accommodates the problem of how fiction can contain real truths, as in historical fiction. In such cases, one and the same sentence, say “Napoleon invaded Russia”, can be both actually and fictionally true, keeping the very same content in both the real and the fictional context.

This kind of account yields an alternative construal of in-the-fiction operators. Rather than being a special kind of intensional operator, as it is on Lewis’s account, an in-the-fiction operator turns out to be a context-shifting operator. Take someone’s utterance of the sentence ‘In Shakespeare’s Othello, Othello was jealous’. The operator is context-shifting to the extent that the context relative to which we are to interpret the embedded sentence ‘Othello is jealous’ is different from the context of utterance of the sentence as a whole, since the latter is centered on the actual world, rather than the fictional world of Othello. (See Recanati 2000, Predelli 2005, Bonomi 2008. Predelli 2008 offers a variation on such accounts.)

2.2 Truth in Fiction as Make-Believe Truth

Walton’s account of truth in fiction rests on his distinctive account of a work of fiction as a prop in a game of make-believe, where the function of the prop is to prescribe imaginings. Unlike Lewis, he doesn’t place stress on the idea that fictional statements are implicitly prefixed with an in-the-fiction operator. For Walton, a proposition is fictional—true in the fiction—just in case participants in such a game of make-believe are supposed to imagine it as true (Walton 1990; for some recent reservations about this account, see Walton 2013, 2015). There are two types of fictional truth: the primary fictional truths are evident in the work itself, while the implied fictional truths are generated from the primary ones. The problem of how to generate implied fictional truths from primary fictional truths is essentially the problem that Lewis faced, and the principles that Walton describes—the Reality Principle and the Mutual Belief Principle—are close to Analysis 1 and 2, but without the commitment to the machinery of possible worlds. Letting \(p_1\)… \(p_n\) be the primary fictional truths of fiction F, the Reality Principle holds that it is true in F that q iff had \(p_1\)… \(p_n\) been the case, q would have been the case, while the Mutual Belief Principle holds that it is true in F that q iff the following was mutually and openly believed in the society from which F originated: had \(p_1\)… \(p_n\) been the case, q would have been the case.

Walton acknowledges that each principle has counterintuitive consequences (see Walton 1990: ch. 4 on the contrast and interplay between the two principles). Lewis himself noted this in the case of the Reality Principle, but as we remarked above the same seems true of the Mutual Belief Principle. In addition, neither principle seems able to handle cases in which genre conventions generate fictional truths. Consider an otherwise typical zombie story that never explicitly says that zombies move by stumbling forward rather than by running (Woodward 2011: 163). Because this way of moving is a conventional feature of zombies in the zombie story genre, it will be true in the story that zombies don’t run, even though the question “Do zombies run?” is probably not answerable by appeal to either principle (Woodward 2011: 163; Lewis 1978 [1983: 274]; Walton 1990: 161–9). Walton himself thinks that the moral to be drawn from such difficulties is that these principles are no more than rules of thumb, and that there is no single, general principle that governs the practice of critics and appreciators of fiction (1990: 139). A rather different approach to these problems is taken by Stacie Friend, who argues that problems ensue if we insist on principles, taken as ways of inferring implied fictional truths from primary fictional truths. Instead of defending the Reality Principle, she defends what she calls the Reality Assumption, the thesis that everything that is really true is also fictionally the case, unless it is excluded by the work (Friend 2017).

There is a further concern about the apparatus Walton employs, one that also affects Lewis’s account. To apply the above rules of generation, we need to be able to determine a work’s primary fictional truths, those that are evident in the work or, in Lewis’s terms, those that are part of what is told as “known fact”. These present no trouble if we have a reliable narrator, but what if the narrator is unreliable? With Lewis as his focus, Currie imagines a situation in which the Holmes stories are written in a “tone of understatement and irony”, so that Holmes appears only somewhat successful even though in the story he is “spectacularly successful” (Currie 1990: 70). Given that the worlds to be considered are worlds in which the story is told as known fact, the worry is that, for Lewis, Holmes is only somewhat successful in the stories. Walton’s answer to this kind of problem is to allow free rein to the kind of pragmatic interpretive moves that are used in ordinary communicative exchanges (see Walton 1990: ch. 4). If there is evidence of understatement and irony, we should make allowances for that when determining what is true. Lewis has a broadly similar answer. In a footnote Lewis points out that there are all kinds of ways of telling stories. Storytellers may present themselves as quite unreliable (mad, naïve, etc.), or as translators of some work rather than the person who wrote it, and so on. He adds that

in these exceptional cases also, the thing to do is to consider those worlds where the act of story-telling really is whatever it purports to be—ravings, reliable translation of a reliable source, or whatever—at our world. (Lewis 1978 [1983: 266 fn. 7])

Hence if the author pretends to be recounting a true story in a tone of understatement and irony, then the worlds of the story are those worlds in which the teller really does tell a true story in a tone of understatement and irony, not worlds where his actual words are to be taken literally (cf. Hanley 2004).

2.3 Truth in Fiction and the Role of “Authors”

Currie’s answer to the problem of the unreliable narrator is quite different. His account of what is true in fiction eschews any appeal to worlds in favor and appeal to the beliefs of someone he calls the fictional author:

  • C “In the fiction F, φ” is true iff it is reasonable for the informed reader to infer that the fictional author of F believes that φ (Currie 1990: 80).

Here the fictional author is “that fictional character constructed within our make-believe whom we take to be telling us the story as known fact” (Currie 1990: 76), and the “informed reader” is a reader who knows the relevant facts about the community in which the work was written (1990: 97). The view also offers a distinctive way of dealing with the problem of unreliable narrators. When the evidence suggests that a narrator is unreliable, we are supposed to construct a hidden, completely reliable and knowledgeable fictional author who is “speaking with the voice of one of the (unreliable) characters in the story” (1990: 125); the reader figures out what is true in the story by forming an impression of the beliefs of the author, based on the text of the story and facts about its community of origin. While many commentators have lauded the move away from possible worlds, a number have doubted that positing such an author is adequate to the task of explaining truth in fiction (e.g., Byrne 1993; Howard-Snyder 2002; Swirski 2014), even complaining that it seems gratuitous to postulate “some shadowy meta-narrator who has all true beliefs but is choosing not to reveal himself” just to deal with a narrator who is unreliable (Matravers 1995; see Currie 1995a, 1995b for further discussion, and Currie 2010 for a more sceptical perspective on internal narrators). Other philosophers have offered alternative accounts of the (real, hypothetical, …) authors whose beliefs or intentions determine what is true in fiction. Stock, for example, argues for an extreme intentionalism on which, with some important qualifications aside, what is true in a fiction is what the real author intends her audience to imagine as being true (Stock 2017). Others prefer more moderate appeals to the real author (e.g., Livingston 2005, for whom fictional truth rests on what it is appropriate to make believe, given a goal of understanding fictive utterances in the author’s artistic context).

Alex Byrne has a final criticism that he thinks affects Currie’s and Lewis’s accounts of truth in fiction in equal measure. It is easy to see that if F is a fiction then the sentence “In fiction F, F is told as known fact” is true for both Lewis and Currie. Byrne (1993) labels this consequence of the two views idealism, and he offers two objections. First, certain fictions are what Currie calls mindless: fictions in which there is no intelligent life, and so no one to tell the tale. In such stories, it is false that there is someone who is telling the story. Second, postulating knowing tellers would suggest quite extraordinary epistemic capacities on the part of these tellers in the case of fictions that carry detailed information about the psychology of characters, say. Currie’s response to the first kind of complaint is that the postulation of a teller for every tale is simply a staple of literary and aesthetic theory (Currie 1990: 75–6). If so, not worrying about how the teller got her information (it is enough that she must have got it somehow or other; cf. Hanley 2004) might be another such staple.

One worry about such a response is that it seems little different from saying we should treat the story as if it were told from a God’s eye point of view. But the response is probably best treated as an instance of something far more general: an appropriately dismissive attitude to certain sorts of questions. Walton calls questions of this type “silly questions”. One of his many examples concerns the way Othello is able to come up with superb verse—in English too!—despite his great distress; another one concerns the way narrators in literary works tell of events they could not possibly know about (Walton 1990: 174ff). In Walton’s view, we should simply stop worrying about the apparent threat posed by questions of this kind, perhaps by disallowing or de-emphasizing offending fictional truths (such as that Othello was a great literary talent, or that the narrator was somehow able to determine that the characters in a novel “lived happily ever after” (1990: 177–8)). Such questions are “largely if not entirely irrelevant to appreciation and criticism” (Walton 1990: 238). If this is right, there is little reason to think that idealism of the kind Byrne objects to constitutes a fatal defect in the approaches of either Currie or Lewis.

Byrne himself defines truth in fiction in terms of what a Reader can infer about what the Author invites him to make-believe, where the Reader and Author are idealised entities identified in terms of pragmatic principles of interpretation. This allows Byrne to explain how it can be true in a story that there is no one left to tell the tale and why it is rarely true in stories that there exists someone with unexplained and extraordinary epistemological powers who knows the deepest thoughts of others (Byrne 1993). The same conclusion is available on some other author-based views, such as those of Livingston 2005 and Stock 2017. In fact, all such approaches promise to deliver a fairly direct way of defusing “silly questions” concerning truth in fiction.

Whatever the best way of dealing with the issue of “idealism”, it is an issue that affects Lewis and Currie in equal measure. But there is another issue that some take to be an important reason for preferring an author-based account like Currie’s to a possible worlds-based account like Lewis’s, namely what sense to make of truth in impossible fictions, a topic we turn to next.

2.4 Impossible Fictions

Some works of fiction describe scenarios that are impossible: not just physically impossible (like fantasy stories), but metaphysically or logically impossible (like certain time-travel stories and stories that deny mathematical facts such as Ted Chiang’s “Division by Zero”, 1991). Early in his paper, Lewis completes Analyses 1 and 2 with the clause: “‘In fiction F, φ’ is vacuously true iff there is no possible world where F is told as known fact”. That clause implies that anything whatsoever is true in impossible stories. But he then notes that some such stories involve venial contradictions, contradictions due merely to a slip-up on the author’s part (the Holmes stories, for example, since these sometimes locate Dr. Watson’s old war wound in his leg and sometimes in his shoulder). To avoid the unpalatable conclusion that anything whatsoever is true in these stories as well, Lewis suggests towards the end of “Truth in Fiction” that any such story should be represented as a series of minimally revised consistent versions of the original, with truth in the story being truth in all the minimally revised consistent versions (Lewis 1978 [1983: 274–5])—what he later called the method of intersection. On this view, it is true in the stories that Dr. Watson had a war-wound, but it is not true in the stories that he had one on his shoulder and it is not true in the stories that he had one on his leg.

Postscript B to the original article shows a change of mind. To preserve what he calls the “distinctive peculiarity of inconsistent fiction” (Lewis 1983: 277), Lewis now suggests we adopt the method of union: what is true in a fiction is what is true in at least one consistent fragment, so that we can have “In fiction F, \(\phi\)” is true and “In fiction F, \(\neg \phi\)” is true, but never “In fiction F, \(\phi \land \neg\phi\)” is true.

Yet, as Lewis himself acknowledged, this account does not work with blatantly inconsistent stories whose contradictions are not venial, and with respect to these stories he takes a hard line: “we should not expect to have a non-trivial concept of truth in blatantly impossible fiction” (Lewis 1978 [1983: 275). Many disagree, offering examples of such stories where the issue of truth and falsity appears to arise much as it does for consistent stories. Currie’s (1990) example is of a story that turns on the hero’s disproof of Gödel’s incompleteness results. Such a story simply can’t be divided into consistent fragments. Similarly, consider Graham Priest’s story of Sylvan’s Box, which involves the discovery of a box belonging to the late Richard Sylvan that is at once empty and non-empty (Priest 1997, 2005). (Other examples may include stories about donkeys that talk and pigs who lead revolutions, as well as fictions in which actual people and fictional characters interact, for example, Pirandello’s Six Characters in Search of an Author [1921]; cf. Byrne 1993; Woodward 2011; for an even more radical take on the inconsistency in fiction, see Woods 2018.) Some bite the Lewisian bullet at this point. Hanley (2004), for example, argues that some such fictions may be susceptible to the method of union; in other cases, the best way to interpret them is simply to doubt the reliability of their narrators. Nolan (2007) similarly argues that our intuitive judgment of what is true in the fiction in such cases tracks the narrator’s beliefs rather than the represented facts.

Most writers agree, however, that there can be a coherent notion of truth in fiction even for “blatantly” inconsistent fictions (see, for example, Byrne 1993; Le Poidevin 1995; Phillips 1999; Gendler 2000; Weatherson 2004, Priest 2005, Proudfoot 2006). But even when there is agreement about this, there is no agreement about the resources needed to capture such a notion of truth. Some think that the best and perhaps most obvious solution to the problem of inconsistent fiction is a generalization of Lewis’s own approach: we should admit appropriately selected impossible worlds to the set of worlds that realize what is told in such a story (see Priest 1997, 2005; Woods 2003: ch. 6; Berto 2012: chs. 7, 8; Jago 2014; cf. also the entry on impossible worlds).

Impossible worlds, however, are for many a difficult pill to swallow. Lewis himself makes a throwaway remark that might suggest a moderate alternative – he adds:

or perhaps we should expect to have [a non-trivial concept of truth in blatantly impossible fiction] only under the pretense—not to be taken too seriously—that there are impossible possible worlds as well as possible possible worlds. (1978 [1983: 275])

(such a view would be a kind of extended modal fictionalism—see §1.5 of the entry on modal fictionalism). Lewis makes a further appeal to this idea in a letter to Graham Priest (9 January, 2001), although only to assert that the idea is of limited usefulness. In his words,

I agree with you about the many uses to which we could put make-believedly possible impossibilities, if we are willing to use them. The trouble is that all these uses seem to require a distinction between the subtle ones and the blatant ones (very likely context-dependent, very likely a matter of degree) and that is just what I don’t understand. (Lewis 2004: 177)

Currie’s diagnosis of the problem of truth in impossible fictions is very different. He thinks that worlds simply constitute the wrong currency for characterizing the notion of truth in fiction, even when authorial and community belief is added to the mix (as on Analysis 2). Currie thinks that once we understand the notion of truth in fiction in doxastic terms as what we can reasonably take the fictional author to believe (account C above), the case of radically inconsistent fiction presents no further problems. There is no bar, he thinks, to supposing that someone believes impossible propositions, even simple impossible propositions like \(7+5 ≠12\), and so there can be no objection to the claim that even blatantly impossible propositions can be true in a work of fiction.

But while this may work for the simplest cases, it is not clear that we can be so sanguine about others. Thus, consider stories like Gendler’s story of the Tower of Goldbach in which \(7+5 ≠ 12\) and \(7+5=12\) (Gendler 2000), or Priest’s story of Sylvan’s box, empty and non-empty at the same time. It is one thing to allow that such contradictory propositions are both true in the relevant story; understanding how it can be reasonable to attribute belief in both propositions to a fictional author may be more difficult. Or consider a story in which everything whatsoever is true (imagine a story in which God or Sylvan discloses this to Priest). Even those who think that there is no bar to believing impossible propositions are likely to reject as incoherent the thought that someone can believe all propositions (cf. Priest 2000).

Note that the problem of impossible fictions affects Walton’s make-believe account rather differently. Truth in fiction for Walton is a function of prescriptions to imagine, and he is relatively sanguine about such prescriptions in the case of impossible fictions. Even contradictions, he suspects, can be imagined in the relevant sense, but he adds that even if they can’t, his account of fictionality or fictional truth is safe. He offers two options: first, there might be prescriptions to imagine a contradiction even if actually imagining it is not possible; secondly, there might be separate prescriptions to imagine p and not-p, but not their conjunction (Walton 1990, 64–6).

The second way is an analogue of Lewis’s method of intersection. Perhaps the first way is needed to deal with the case of blatant contradictions, but as Walton notes even this is far from clear. While imagining a contradiction may well not be possible if imagination relies purely on mental imagery, the kind of imagining invoked in fiction is very different: what is at stake here is propositional imagining and it is difficult to motivate the claim that imagining even blatant contradictions is impossible. Attempts to do so tend to rest on quite contentious views of what propositional imagining must involve (cf. Everett 2013; cf. also Kung 2016 on the telescopic versus stipulative views of imagining).

3. Truth Through Fiction

After his discussion of truth in fiction, Lewis acknowledged in Postscript B that some people value fiction “mostly as a means for the discovery of truth, or for the communication of truth” (Lewis 1983: 278), that is, genuine truth, not merely fictional truth. It is possible that Lewis simply meant that sentences like “In the Holmes stories, Holmes is a detective” are really, and not just fictionally, true, for this fact captures the sense in which it is really true, say, that Holmes is a detective and really false that he is a rockstar. But the problem of whether fiction-involving sentences communicate truths does not end here. There are various other ways of understanding how fiction might make such a contribution. To begin with, some statements true in a work of fiction are also genuine truths, included because the author wanted an appropriately realistic setting for the work (e.g., historical statements in works of historical fiction) or in order to acquaint readers with facts that the author regards as morally or politically significant (consider, for example, the fiction of Charles Dickens, Upton Sinclair, or Aleksandr Solzhenitsyn). Whatever the reason, such cases suggest that fiction can serve as a means for readers to discover genuine truths.

Philosophers and literary theorists by and large agree with this claim (Friend 2006; Lamarque & Olsen 1994). Even on imagination-based theories of fiction, there is nothing to prevent statements that readers are invited to imagine as true from also being known as fact. This is consistent, however, with acknowledging that learning from fiction is not always easy, since it requires an ability to tell whether an apparently factual claim in a work of fiction has been included in the fiction because of its truth or for other reasons. More generally, a number of psychological studies suggest that readers often lack the ability to tell truth from falsehood in fiction, failing to adequately scrutinize information when engaging with fiction while being more careful in the case of non-fiction (see, for example, Prentice & Gerrig 1999; Wheeler et al. 1999; Butler et al. 2012). While this propensity on the part of readers doesn’t show that they are never able to gain factual knowledge rather than mere (true) belief from engaging with works of fiction, it may make it harder than it first appears. One plausible suggestion is that where there is knowledge rather than mere belief, this happens because readers have acquired a competence at reliably discriminating truth from falsity in works of that genre (Friend 2014).

But learning factual truths is not what philosophers and literary theorists usually have in mind when they think of fiction as a means for the discovery, or communication, of truth. They have in mind truth that has deeper human significance, like the universals that Aristotle claims in The Poetics to find in the works of poets, or the kind of truth about human nature, for example, that Samuel Johnson finds in Shakespeare (“he has not only shewn human nature as it acts in real exigencies, but as it would be found in trials, to which it cannot be exposed”; Johnson 1765). Many philosophers thus embrace what is commonly called (literary) cognitivism, which claims that literary fiction can contribute to readers’ knowledge in a way that adds to the literary or aesthetic value of a work (Davies 2007; Gaut 2005).

But knowledge in what sense? Like Aristotle, a number of cognitivists think that literature can form the basis of propositional knowledge, even if there is dispute about what kind of propositions can be known and how they are known (Novitz 1987; McCormick 1988; Carroll 2011; Kieran 2004; Kivy 1997; Elgin 2007; Mikkonen 2013). A common claim is that literature provides knowledge about moral values, especially about the particular moral requirements of concrete situations (cf. the appeal in Nussbaum 1990 to the later novels of Henry James). Some think literature can also provide a kind of conceptual knowledge, such as insight into a moral concept like sympathy (John 1998). Others have thought it can even teach deep psychological truths or truths about our place in the world. In many cases, however, the “truths” readers claim to find in literature will be quite contestable, with different works presenting different points of view. Even then, however, it might be argued that readers at least acquire knowledge of possibilities. Consider, for example, a work like Céline’s Journey to the End of Night (1932), whose underlying hypothesis is that all humans and their institutions are abhorrent. Even Putnam, who is broadly sympathetic to cognitivism, agrees that all we really learn from Céline’s work is how the world looks to someone who accepts that hypothesis, which is merely “knowledge of a possibility” (Putnam 1978).

Many cognitivists, however, think that the knowledge we acquire from literary fiction is not centrally a kind of propositional or even conceptual knowledge, but a kind of practical knowledge. For example, literature can cause us to attend to the world in a more focused way, enriching our perceptual experience and emotional and moral understanding (Diamond 1995; Nussbaum 1985, 1990, 2001; Gibson 2007; Robinson 1995 [1997]). One way it might do this is by being a source of what Davies calls categorial understanding (2007: 146), yielding new categories through which to understand the world, for example quixotic and Kafkaesque (Goodman 1978: ch. 4). It can also provide phenomenal knowledge: knowledge of what it is like to be a certain kind of person or be in a certain kind of situation, and so knowledge that can be put to use in planning or to help us understand other people or the moral complexity of situations (Kieran 1996; Currie 1998; Putnam 1978; Carroll 2002; Swirski 2007).

Many are sceptical. Anti-cognitivists think that, whether or not a work’s aesthetic or literary value would be enhanced by contributing knowledge. Echoing Plato’s famous charge in The Republic, Jerome Stolniz (1992) has argued that there is no proper domain of artistic knowledge: significant truths found in literary works are the proper subject of other areas of enquiry, not literature. Even if one does acquire beliefs from literary works, the works themselves don’t supply the warrant for the beliefs, and so can scarcely be said to yield knowledge. Furthermore, to the extent that we do learn from literature it is either hard to articulate what we learn, or the truths turn out to be cognitively trivial; Pride and Prejudice (1813), for example, may teach us little more than the banal “Stubborn pride and ignorant prejudice keep attractive people apart” (Stolniz 1992: 193). Others have raised doubts about the ability of literary fiction to yield the kind of substantial practical knowledge that is often claimed for it. Reading Styron’s historical novel, The Confessions of Nat Turner (1967) may make us think we know what it was like to be a black slave in early nineteenth century Virginia, but it is surely more likely that exposure of this kind simply generates the illusion of knowledge (Harold 2016).

Cognitivists have fought back in a number of ways. Propositional cognitivists have argued that literature does offer support for its knowledge claims, say by taking them as live hypotheses to be tested (Kivy 1996, Novitz 1987) or by allowing readers to draw on latent memories and other available resources (Carroll 2011) as well as argumentative resources explicitly found in the text (Mikkonen 2013). And both propositional and non-propositional cognitivists have acknowledged that there is no certain route to knowledge through literature; as in the case of our acquiring factual beliefs on the basis of reading fiction, literary works can make us less knowledgeable (believe falsely or behave unwisely) as well as more knowledgeable.

A final point. As we have seen above, literary cognitivists think that a work of literary fiction can contribute to readers’ knowledge in a way that adds to the value of the work; anti-cognitivists deny that it can contribute the kind of knowledge cognitivists focus on. More radically, however, one of the best-known concerns about literary cognitivism is that, even if literary works do provide readers with knowledge, the knowledge they yield doesn’t contribute to their literary value. Such a non-cognitivist view is associated in particular with the work of Lamarque and Olsen, who have offered an influential argument for a “no-truth” theory of literary fiction (Lamarque & Olsen 1994). On this view, while we may well be able to learn from literature, the truth of a claim made by a literary work is never relevant to the work’s literary value; all that is relevant is a work’s theme and how it is presented. Not surprisingly, this view has also proved highly contentious, with many commentators critical of the separation of theme and truth (see, for example, Rowe 1997; Gaut 2005; Kivy 2011).

4. The Paradox of Fiction

Whether works of fiction provides readers with knowledge (and, if so, what kind), there is little doubt that authors of such works often aim to communicate what they take to be salient truths in the hope of affecting their readers in some way. Upton Sinclair, for example, wanted readers of The Jungle (1906) to recognize the poor treatment of workers in Chicago slaughter-houses, and to respond to this treatment with anger. Even more familiar, however, is the way authors try to get readers of a work of fiction to respond emotionally to the fictional truths they encounter in the work, rather than any actual truths. To take a classic example, on reading Tolstoy’s Anna Karenina, a reader may feel deep pity for Anna Karenina because of her increasing despair as Vronsky distances himself from her, an emotion Tolstoy no doubt expected and intended. But this generates a famous puzzle: how can a reader feel pity for Anna, knowing that Anna doesn’t exist? This puzzle, commonly known as the paradox of fiction or the paradox of fictional emotions, involves a triad of seemingly compelling but incompatible claims about emotional responses generated by engaging with fiction. For a representative formulation:

  • (A) People experience emotions for fictional objects and situations, knowing them to be fictional
  • (B) People do not believe that fictional objects and situations exist
  • (C) In order to experience an emotion for an object or situation, one must believe that it exists

(A broadly equivalent formulation is found in Gendler’s entry on imagination.) The question is how best to resolve the inconsistency among these claims; that is, which of (A)–(C) to give up so that consistency is restored, and why these and not others.

Different solutions to the paradox provide different answers to such questions, although it is worth noting that the paper that introduced the paradox to the philosophical world, Colin Radford’s “How can we be moved by the fate of Anna Karenina?” (Radford 1975) took a rather different line from other solutions. His Irrationalist solution (our classification follows Levinson 1997) holds that people’s apparent ability to respond emotionally to fictional characters and events is “irrational, incoherent, and inconsistent” (Radford 1975: 75). They regard (C) as a normative constraint on rational agents, but their actual behavior and beliefs, as described in (A) and (B), show that they fail to conform to this constraint.

Dissatisfaction with Radford’s account resulted in numerous publications that have kept discussion of the problem alive. Most, in fact, favor a rejection of (A) or (C). Among those who reject (A), some deny (A) on the grounds that it misdescribes the nature of our affective responses. According to the Non-Intentionalist solution the affective states in question are not emotions but more akin to object-less states like moods or reflex reactions (Charlton 1970: 97), while for the more popular Surrogate-Object solution (A) misidentifies the target of emotional responses to fiction: they really have as their objects (parts of) the fictional work itself; or perhaps the descriptions or thought contents afforded by the fiction (Lamarque 1981); or on another formulation real individuals or phenomena that resemble the persons or events of the fiction (see, for example, Charlton 1984).

A third way of denying (A) is Kendall Walton’s well-known Make-Believe solution to the paradox (Walton 1990, 1997; see also Currie 1990). According to Walton, it is fictional in the imaginative games of make-believe that people play on the basis of their reading works of fiction that they experience emotions for fictional objects and situations. In reality they don’t. A reader of Anna Karenina (1877) doesn’t really pity Anna Karenina, but what she does experience are various characteristic psychological and bodily effects of her imagining that Anna Karenina has suffered greatly. Originally, Walton called states of this kind quasi-emotions (in this case, quasi-pity); the fact that a reader experiences quasi-pity in the course of her imagining is what makes it fictional in her game of make-believe that she feels genuine pity for Anna Karenina. A case of real pity, by contrast, requires the quasi-pity that an agent experiences to be the result of her genuine belief that someone is suffering or has suffered (Walton 1990: 251), and only when this is its cause will the quasi-pity also be accompanied by appropriate behavior: an attempt to console if consoling is within one’s power, say. (Walton’s classic example of the absence of appropriate behavior is that of not running out of the theatre, even though in the grip of quasi-fear, while watching a horror movie in which the Green Slime turns towards you.) Walton clarifies his view in Walton 1997, where he emphasizes that he regards fictional emotions not so much as special kind of states, but as emotions that are merely felt in the context of engaging with fiction rather than actuality. What Walton cannot allow, however, is that it is genuinely true that people have emotions in this sense towards fictional characters like Anna Karenina. No relational claims of this kind can be genuinely true for Walton, since he denies that there are any fictional characters. (Whether his rejection of fictional characters is required by his reasons for rejecting (A) is another question. For more on this question, see the entry on fictional entities.)

Walton’s view has been subject to much criticism (for a survey, see Neill 2005). Before we turn to its main rivals, it is worth observing that Walton’s main reason for not counting fictional emotions as real emotions (the lack of characteristic associated behavior) is also the main reason why few commentators nowadays accept the Suspension of Disbelief solution, which involves rejecting (B) and maintaining that when readers of fiction emotionally respond to the characters they read about they are acting on an implicit belief that these exist. (Samuel Taylor Coleridge, who coined the term, may have held a version of this view; cf. Coleridge 1817: ch. 14 [in vol. 2, p. 2].) For discussion, see Radford 1975, Schaper 1978, and Carroll 1990.)

Far more popular are views that reject (C) and hold that we have real emotions towards fictional objects despite believing that they don’t exist. A possible reason for this is that, unlike the two other statements of the triad, (C) strikes many as a piece of articulated theory (the so-called cognitive theory of emotion) rather than a commonsense claim (cf. Gendler 2008). One way of rejecting (C) is the Surrogate-Belief solution, which maintains that an emotional response to a fictional character requires no more than the belief that the character exists in the world(s) of the fiction (cf. Neill 1993). Another solution—and possibly the most widely accepted of all—is the Anti-Judgmentalist solution, which denies that emotional responses to objects logically require beliefs concerning the existence and emotion-prompting features of objects; instead, it is enough if we imagine, “mentally represent” (Lamarque 1981), or entertain, such objects “in thought” (Carroll 1990). (See also Stecker 2011, which regards this solution as in some sense the default solution; he thinks other solutions are nonetheless worth investigating because of the way they shed light on the way our reactions to fiction often differ from standard emotional reactions.) Versions of such “thought theories” are also defended in Moran 1994, Smith 1995, Feagin 1996, and Gendler 2008. But note that such views face the problem that the objects of the emotions mobilized by fiction are either understood in some nonstandard way, for example as thought contents (cf. the objection in Walton 1990 to Lamarque 1981) or, more generally, as abstract rather than concrete entities; or they are understood as nonexistent objects, a category many philosophers find ontologically problematic. (For a useful overview of the various solutions, see Gendler & Kovakovich 2006. See also the entry on fictional entities.)

5. Conclusion

This entry has focused on a number of central issues in the philosophy of fiction: the nature of fiction; what it means to say that something is a truth of fiction; what (and in what sense) we can learn from fiction; and how we can have emotional responses to characters of fiction. There are other issues in the philosophy of fiction that could have been discussed in this entry, a number of them the subject of related entries. Consider the question of what makes something a correct interpretation of a work of literary fiction. This topic, which is connected to the issue of truth in fiction, became of intense interest to both philosophers and literary theorists following the publication of Wimsatt and Beardsley’s “The Intentional Fallacy” (1946), although the topic of interpretation itself has a long history going back as far as Greek antiquity (see the entry on hermeneutics). There are also problems involving our reasons for seeking out works of fiction of various kinds. The previous section discussed the so-called paradox of fiction, but as it turns out this is a relative newcomer to the set of problems that involve our engagement with works of fiction. There is also the much-debated puzzle of why we enjoy works of tragedy (and even horror); sadness and fear are scarcely emotions that we would normally welcome, let alone enjoy, yet people readily engage with works of tragedy. (The so-called paradox of tragedy received a famous treatment, still debated in contemporary philosophy, at the hands of Aristotle in the Poetics, who also used tragedy as an example of how we can learn from fiction.) A newer problem, although discussion goes back to at least Hume, is the so-called problem of imaginative resistance: given the ease with which readers of fiction can entertain all kinds of implausible fictional scenarios, even impossible ones, what explains the impediments we face when asked to imagine certain sorts of situations, for example ones in which morally horrendous acts like torturing an innocent person are considered morally right? (For an overview of these puzzles, see the supplement to the entry on imagination). Juxtaposing these various problems and issues not only gives a good indication of the thematic richness of contemporary philosophy of fiction, but also reminds us of its long history.


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