First published Fri Mar 18, 2016; substantive revision Fri Dec 3, 2021

Galen (Galēnos, 129–c. 200 CE) was primarily a medical author, but had a deep engagement with and influence on the philosophical debates of his time. He wrote many works of logic and ethics, and also addressed those and other philosophical areas—especially of epistemology, causation in the natural world, and philosophy of mind—in his medical-scientific writings. His medical, and in some contexts his philosophical, work had enormous influence throughout the medieval period and even later, both in Europe and (through Arabo-Islamic transmission) beyond. Largely ignored by the intellectual world, including philosophers, since the Scientific Revolution, he has recently attracted considerable scholarly attention, especially for his work on scientific knowledge, his contribution to logic, and his discussions of ethics, moral psychology and the mind–body relationship.

Galen was one of the most prolific intellectuals of western antiquity, his works extending to 21 volumes of roughly 1000 pages each in the standard Greek edition (with a few additional works surviving only in Arabic, Syriac, Hebrew or Latin translations)—a total of more than 4 million words. While most of his scientific and medical writings survive, many of his specialist works of philosophy do not. He is an extremely adversarial author, a vigorous participant in the highly rhetorical and learned competitive intellectual culture of second-century-CE Rome (the so-called “Second Sophistic”); and he is extremely prone to digression. He often expresses his own views through the twin media of polemic against his opponents and textual interpretation and commentary on his intellectual heroes, especially Plato and Hippocrates. And, in spite of his profound knowledge of the Greek philosophical tradition and “classic” philosophical texts and his use of philosophical terminology and modes of argument, he does not define himself as a philosopher, often expressing hostility towards “school” practitioners of philosophy.

The above very brief introduction to the study of “Galen the philosopher” may also serve as a preliminary warning of the peculiar challenges that any such study faces: the vast body of texts, many both diffuse in structure and unexamined by modern scholarship; the wide range of genres (most not primarily philosophical), dialectical contexts and rhetorical arguments from which his philosophical views must be reconstructed; his eclectic and decontextualized use of philosophical terminology for his own purposes; certain specific losses amongst his specialist treatises of philosophy.

1. Life

Galen was born into the intellectual and social elite of the culturally Greek city of Pergamon, near the northwest coast of Roman Asia, in present-day Turkey, in 129 CE, the son of an architect. (Further on his biography and intellectual background see Nutton 1973; Gill et al. 2009; Boudon-Millot 2013; Mattern 2013; Singer 2019a.) He lays great stress on his own early education in mathematics and geometry, and on his passion for logic (Lib. Prop. 14/11; Aff. Pecc. Dig. I.8), seeing these disciplines as providing a model of secure proof lacking from the philosophical debates of the post-Hellenistic schools which were dominant in his day, as well as an antidote to the lures of Skepticism. From the age of fourteen he embarked on his formal education in philosophy. This involved attendance at the closely text-based lecture courses of professors of one or more of the four established philosophical schools: Platonist, Aristotelian, Stoic, Epicurean: Galen mentions an adherent of each as part of his early education. (On Galen’s philosophical eclecticism see Donini 1992; Hankinson 1992.) From the age of sixteen he also commenced his medical studies, although study of philosophy continued concurrently. After his father’s death in 149 he undertook an educational journey of several years, involving periods in Smyrna, Corinth and Alexandria, to study with the foremost medical teachers of the time. This study also involved a strong textual element. Alexandria retained its status as a centre for anatomical research and teaching (although dissection at this period was restricted to non-human animals), but also for scholarship on “classical” texts. It seems likely that it was here that Galen acquired his in-depth training both in anatomy (von Staden 1992; Grmek and Gourevitch 1994) and in the tradition and practice of commentary on texts of his predecessors, those of the “Hippocratic” corpus in particular, which became a central element in his writing and in his intellectual self-positioning (Lloyd 1993; von Staden 1997, 2009; Manetti and Roselli 1994; Singer 1996, 2021a; Vegetti 1999).

In 157 he returned to his home city, taking up an official post as doctor to the gladiators, before moving to Rome in the early 160s, where—after one more brief period back in Pergamon—he settled permanently. At Rome Galen seems to have developed his status very quickly amongst the socio-intellectual elite—which significantly included devotees of philosophy, in particular Aristotelians (Singer 2014). He soon shone as a self-publicizing medical practitioner; he also gave public lectures and anatomical demonstrations in a highly competitive intellectual environment (see Lib. Prop. 1; Praen. 4–5; Barton 1994; von Staden 1995, 1997; Mattern 2008; Gleason 2009; Salas 2020). Much of his anatomical work, as well as the inception of two great works central to the establishment of his reputation, The Function of the Parts of the Body (UP) and The Doctrines of Hippocrates and Plato (PHP), belongs to this early period. The former text aims to establish the purposive, indeed divine, construction, understood in relation to its particular function (chreia), of every anatomical feature of the body (see further section 5 below), and explicitly models itself on Aristotelian biological work. The latter constitutes both an exposition of Platonic tripartite psychology, with a vigorous polemic against the Stoic monist alternative, and a synthesis of this Platonic view with Galen’s physiology of brain, heart and liver (see further below, section 7); it contains an account of the famous experiment whereby the function of the brain—in Galen’s terms, the fact that it is the seat of the “leading-part” of the soul—is demonstrated by ligation of the spinal cord of a live pig.

Adopted as court physician by the emperor Marcus Aurelius (who ruled 161–80), Galen was also fortunate to be left in Rome during the emperor’s lengthy military campaign in central Europe; to this period (169–76), indeed, he ascribes the writing-up of a large number of his major works in scientific and medical theory (Lib. Prop. 3).

Galen’s court career apparently continued through the reigns of Marcus’ successors, Commodus (180–92) and Septimius Severus (193–211); this later phase of his career includes some of his major medical writings, including the completion of the magnum opus The Method of Healing (MM), as well as the production of much of his extremely voluminous series of works on drugs, and equally voluminous body of commentaries on Hippocrates (together constituting nearly half his extant output). Galen lived through both Commodus’ notorious reign of terror and a disastrous fire, in 192, in which he lost a substantial personal library: both experiences are described in a recently-discovered ethical work, Avoiding Distress (Ind.), which also adds to our knowledge of his extraordinary scholarly activity, including not least his work on the Aristotelian tradition (see Petit 2019). It is possible, but not certain, that Galen’s extant ethical writings should also be dated to this later phase of his life (after 192). Towards the end of his life, certainly, he wrote a “philosophical testament”, My Own Doctrines (Prop. Plac.), which gives a concise but important insight into his attitudes to a range of philosophical questions (see below, §3.4).

Galen amassed a large fortune, including a second home in Campania; he must have had considerable intellectual influence on medical life at Rome, although such influence is not attested until a considerably later period. The traditional date of his death is around 200, but some later sources suggest that he was still alive more than ten years after this (Nutton 1984).

2. Philosophy and the Galenic Corpus

2.1 Role of Philosophy in the corpus

We may identify three central roles of philosophy in Galen’s work. One, to which he himself gives particular prominence, is the theory of demonstration: this underlies explanations and accounts in the natural world, enables the person trained in it to distinguish secure from merely probable or downright fallacious arguments, and guarantees the reliability of propositions arrived at through its correct application. A second is that Galen’s scientific and medical accounts themselves—of the theory of physical elements, for example, or of causation and change—engage with existing philosophical debates (e.g., between continuum theorists and atomists, or between teleologists and mechanists); and that he here relies strongly on philosophical explanatory categories (e.g., telos, the form–matter distinction). Philosophical technical language and argumentation are also to the fore in specifically medical realms, such as the theory of health or the classification of types of pulse, disease or massage: here too we find a constant drive towards definition and linguistic disambiguation, highly complex schemes of subdivision, and the employment of philosophical vocabulary in their pursuit (e.g., ousia, sumbebēkos, genos, eidos, diaphora).

Thirdly, there are those areas of philosophy which are not of direct importance to scientific or medical knowledge, but constitute separate intellectual domains, in which Galen nevertheless wishes to make a distinctive contribution. Particularly relevant here is the domain of ethics; one may regard some of his efforts in logic and linguistic studies in the same light.

The area of “psychology” or philosophy of mind, meanwhile, in a sense comes under both the second and the third heading: Galen’s discussions of mind or soul (psuchē) are situated in a complex relationship both with the philosophical, especially Platonic, tradition and with his own medical and physiological theories.

2.2 Corpus and Curriculum

The role of philosophy in Galen will be better understood through a consideration of the order of his own books which the author suggests to the aspiring doctor, a sort of ideal curriculum of study which at the same time implies an “order of knowledge”, a conceptual relationship between different intellectual areas, and is set out especially in My Own Books (Lib. Prop.) and The Order of My Own Books (Ord. Lib. Prop.); see Singer 2019b.

First comes demonstration. Knowledge of demonstration is necessary for reliable scientific knowledge and for the discernment of fallacious arguments. But it is noteworthy that Galen envisages two possible pathways for this first phase of the curriculum (Ord. Lib. Prop. 1–2). For one who aspires to true knowledge, a thorough grounding in Galen’s logical magnum opus, Demonstration, is essential. But there is a more practical compromise: the less logically ambitious or adept may—taking as his starting-point the “introductory” methodological work, Sects for Beginners (SI)—proceed to the next stage without that thorough grounding. Some logical training is envisaged here too; but Galen is optimistic about the ability of the non-philosophical layperson to arrive at the truth on the basis of common conceptions and a basic ability to follow arguments (such ability being contrasted with the tendency of sectarian philosophers to create or succumb to sophistic fallacies); key here is that the person in question should have acquired a solid education in the traditional Greek “fundamentals”, which involved mathematics and logic (Aff. Pecc. Dig. II.3; Lib. Prop. preface). But this latter person will—following a Platonic distinction—only be able to aspire to correct opinion, not to secure knowledge.

The next stage is represented by anatomy, which is in turn followed by the study of the function (chreia), capacities (dunameis) and activities of the parts which anatomy reveals. Capacities both “of nature” (phusikai) and “of the soul” (psuchikai) are considered here: the important work Natural Capacities (Nat. Fac.) is especially relevant to the former, PHP and The Motion of Muscles (Mot. Musc.) to the latter; study of UP should follow here too.

Galen then proceeds—under the heading “necessary to read before the The Method of Healing”—to take a new starting-point, in physical theory. Study of the fundamental elements of the cosmos and biological world, discussed in Elements according to Hippocrates (Hipp. Elem.), should be followed by their study in the specifically animal, and human, context, in Mixtures (Temp.)—a major and very influential work of Galenic theory. From this point there is again a dual pathway: the third book of Temp., with its discussion of the nature of change brought about by drugs, may lead into specialist pharmacological study; alternatively, the latter may be bypassed in favour of a series of works on health and disease in the human body, which in turn lead into works on clinical practice, and on diagnostic and prognostic procedures.

Galen thus envisages an intellectual progression from the study of the abstract and fundamental to the particular and individual, and recommends that, at least ideally, a secure knowledge of demonstration should underlie the whole paedagogic procedure. In clinical and diagnostic/prognostic contexts, however, knowledge will be stochastic and “for the most part”, not secure and certain as in the context of the propositions provided by demonstrations.

There are then also works and areas of enquiry which stand outside this curriculum, and which Galen lists under separate headings. Such, in particular, are the works of ethics; Galen lists more than 25, of which only two (Aff. Pecc. Dig. and Ind.) survive in full, although PHP also contains much relevant material. (Some of the titles are tantalizing, in terms of what we have lost from Galen’s ethics: What Follows from Each Chosen Aim in Life; The Epicureans; Against Favorinus’ Attack on Socrates.)

Also outside the main curriculum is a huge body of works on logic and linguistic matters—again, nearly all lost. The titles testify to an exceptional engagement, not only with logical and methodological questions, but also with specific texts of “the ancients” in logic: those of Aristotle and his school, especially, but also those of the Stoics; and further texts were devoted to Plato’s argumentation.

3. Epistemology: Demonstration, Scientific Method, Human Knowledge

Central to Galen’s notion of scientific knowledge and method is the theory of demonstration. We shall therefore begin our discussion of Galen’s epistemology with a consideration of his theory and practice of demonstration, before proceeding to consider other aspects of his views on scientific method, and, finally, his views on the nature, limits and purpose of human knowledge more generally.

3.1. Demonstration (apodeixis): Theory and Practice

We shall best understand Galen’s notion of demonstration in relation to scientific knowledge by considering some examples of what he presents as demonstrative in actual argumentative contexts; but first let us consider the key theoretical features. (See Barnes 1991; Hankinson 1991 and 2008a; Havrda 2015; Morison 2008; Tieleman 1996, Ch. 1; Havrda 2021.) Galen believes that the highest-level, most reliable kind of knowledge (epistēmē) is arrived at through “scientific demonstration” (epistēmonikē apodeixis). A crucial criterion for Galen is that the premisses employed for a demonstration in relation to a subject, X, must be “taken from the essence itself” of X (e.g., PHP II.2, 108; Temp. II.2, 53). Here, the Aristotelian term “essence” (ousia) is closely related to the notion of definition: the requirement is that when attempting a demonstration, any premiss one puts forward which purports to have general validity in relation to Xs must be a proposition which relates to what Xs in their fundamental nature or definition are, not one about Xs’ incidental features (let alone—a recurrent concern—one based on some misunderstanding due to a homonymous usage of the term “X”). Further, the premisses for an epistēmonikē apodeixis must be propositions the truth of which is evident, either to reason or to sense-perception.

Following the methodology of Aristotelian logic, moreover, Galen is committed to the project of presenting such demonstrations in syllogistic form.

A central example of Galenic demonstration is the extended proof of the location of the parts or principles of the soul, in PHP. These are three: the rational (logistikon) or leading-part (hēgemonikon), located, Galen argues, in the brain; the “spirited” (thumoeides), located in the heart; and the desiderative (epithumētikon), located in the liver. Galen claims that the proof that the hēgemonikon resides in the brain (and not, as in particular the Stoics think, the heart) admits of scientific demonstration.

In a passage late in the work (VIII.1, 484–6), summing up its central argument, the demonstration is formulated in the following syllogism:

where the source of the nerves is, there is the hēgemonikon
but the source of the nerves is in the brain
the hēgemonikon, then, is in the brain.

This formulation indicates not only Galen’s commitment to the demonstrative-syllogistic method of presentation, but also some of the problems that arise from that commitment. First, if we consider this syllogism in the light of the conceptual features outlined above, we would expect the first premiss to be, or to result from, a proposition evident to reason; that is to say, this premiss should be either self-evident or follow directly from the accepted nature, or definition, of hēgemonikon. The second premiss, then, contributes the results of some empirical observation—something evident to sense-perception. The conclusion will follow inescapably from the conjunction of the two. But can the first premiss here be regarded as definitional or analytic in the required sense? The nerves are not, surely, part of an accepted definition or common conception of what the hēgemonikon is in its very nature—or at least, could only become so after a considerable length of argument, itself involving empirical inputs and various forms of reasoning (for example from plausibility and from analogy). Nor could one say, conversely, that the statement is evident to the senses: that would be to conflate a statement of empirical information with a statement derived in abstract terms from one of our fundamental conceptions (the nature of the hēgemonikon), as well as to trespass on the domain of the second premiss in this particular syllogism, for it is this that contains the result of the anatomical and physiological observations in animals.

In fact, Galen’s view of the definition, or fundamental conception, of the hēgemonikon is given much earlier in the work: it is “the source of perception and of voluntary motion” (PHP II.3, 110, also VII.1, 430). It is on this conception, which Galen takes to be universally agreed, even by his opponents, that the greater part of the argument against those (cardiocentric, monist) opponents and in favour of Galen’s (encephalocentric, tripartite) theory depends: cardiocentrism is shown to be wrong on the basis of that agreed conception. Thus, Galen’s demonstration in PHP proceeds largely by taking the universally agreed conception of a term (hēgemonikon), and showing that a particular factual proposition about that term—namely, that the hēgemonikon is in the brain—follows from that conception, in conjunction with further evidence (partly empirical evidence, partly further agreed conceptions). The process of reasoning from that universally agreed perception to the cast-iron syllogism with which Galen presents us at the culmination of the argument, however, is a complex one, much less clearly accessible to representation in formal logical terms. The relative role of “starting-points taken directly from the ousia of the subject” and empirical observations or further evidence seems much more complex than the theoretical syllogistic framing of them would allow.

This point leads us to some further consideration of the nature of the “evident” starting-points. Allowing that Galen is justified in his reliance on empirical evidence, things evident to the senses (see further below on his anti-Skeptical arguments), we still need to analyse further what propositions may count as evident to reason. Relevant here is his own classification, already mentioned, of different grades of argument on the basis of different kinds of premiss. In language indebted to Aristotle (in particular to his Sophistical Refutations and Topics) and the Aristotelian tradition, though in its precise formulation apparently unique to Galen, he lists four: epistemonic, dialectical, rhetorical and sophistic (PHP II.3, 110–12; II.8, 156–8). This last type, which relies on ambiguity or linguistic confusion, need not detain us further. The first type corresponds to the category which we have already considered, that of “proceeding directly from the ousia itself of the subject under enquiry”. Dialectical premisses are ones which do not proceed thus directly from the ousia of the subject, but which may nonetheless be useful for the training of the young, for refuting sophists, for leading to discoveries or for producing aporia. Rhetorical premisses derive from generally accepted (endoxa) or everyday examples or inductions, or from the evidence of witnesses (which may include laypersons, poets or philosophers).

Moreover, there are propositions which Galen firmly believes, and which indeed are central to his physiological system, which he does not claim to be able to establish on the basis of epistemonic premisses; these “do not have such an evident demonstration” as the former (PHP VI.3, 373; cf. VIII.1, 486–8), yet it seems in these cases that the lower-grade demonstration is regarded as adequate. Such, in particular, are the proofs of the location of the remaining two parts of the soul, the spirited (in the heart) and the desiderative (in the liver). The proof of the location of the rational in the brain—which famously involves vivisectional experiments on animals, showing their loss of speech and mobility when the spinal cord is ligated—Galen takes to be epistemonic. The propositions that the heart is in the seat of the spirited, meanwhile, and that the liver is the seat of the desiderative, rely on premisses which are not based directly on the ousia of the subject, but rather (again using Aristotelian terminology), on its “specific properties” (sumbebēkota idiai). What this means in effect is that Galen must here rely on proofs from plausibility and analogy. For example, the proposition that the heart is the seat of the spirited part of the soul—the part involved in responses of anger and indignation—gains plausibility from the fact that one observes perturbations of the heart in certain particular excited states of mind. The proposition that the liver is the seat of the desiderative, which may be equated with the nutrititive and reproductive, is supported by the liver’s role as source of the veins; and this in turn relies for its plausibility on an analogy with plants: the bigger (trunk) is the source of the smaller (branches).

Yet how clear-cut is the distinction between the first and the second, or even between the first and the third, categories of premiss? To put it another way: might not a proposition which Galen defines as proceeding directly from the essence of the subject, that is to say, presumably, as evident to reason, from a different perspective be defined as dialectical or indeed rhetorical? To take Galen’s clearest specific example in PHP, that the hēgemonikon is the source of perception and voluntary motion, the only explicit grounds given for accepting it are that it is accepted universally, even by Galen’s opponents (II.3, 110). This, one might think, would put it in the category of endoxon; or at least, it is difficult to see on what grounds Galen might be able to advance the distinction between endoxic propositions and irrefutably self-evident ones. To put it simply, at a certain point arguments from consensus seem to be involved in the justification of propositions as “evident to reason”.

There are parallel problems for the role of demonstration in another important Galenic area, that of fundamental physical theory. Galen wishes to present his view as having been “demonstrated”, especially by the text of Elements According to Hippocrates (Hipp. Elem.), and indeed the first part of that work is an attempt to establish a rigorous logical method for the foundation of the theory (see Leith 2014; Kupreeva 2014; Singer 2021a). The problem is that this form of clear logical argumentation takes us only as far as the refutation of Atomism (as Galen understands it); that is, it is a proof of the plurality of types of fundamental component of the universe. When he moves from that argument against Atomism/Monism, or for pluralism in general, to the argument for the specific number and nature of the elements of his own theory, however, the argument is much less straightforward. Again, it seems clear that he takes his theory, at least in its essentials, to be not only true but deducible from evident facts and/or common conceptions; but the precise nature and status of the arguments—and indeed of Galen’s claims for them (see further §3.4, paragraph 2)—seem much less clear.

3.2 Medical-Scientific Method: Empiricism Versus “Rationalism”

We have considered Galen’s views on the establishment of secure theoretical knowledge about the natural world. We turn to his views on scientific method in the more specifically medical context. Galen names three medical “sects”, in relation to which he positions his own methodology: the Dogmatists or Rationalists (dogmatikoi, logikoi), the Empiricists (empeirikoi) and the Methodists (methodikoi); and he explores the differences between them especially in SI. In fact, only the latter two names correspond to self-styled groupings with explicit school doctrines; the term Rationalist or Dogmatist, meanwhile, is a catch-all referring to any doctor who functions with a (non-Methodist) theory regarding the internal workings of the body. (See Walzer and Frede 1985, introduction; Hankinson 1991a, 2008a.) The Methodists are a theoretically minimalist sect, who conceptualize the pathology of the body in terms of two basic “commonalities” (koinotētes), consisting in increased fluidity or increased restriction through the pathways (poroi) of the body; the Empiricists avoid any statement about physiology, their treatments being based on an inductive procedure from similarity with past cases, the “transition from the similar” (metabasis tou homoiou), with no commitment to any physiological theory; a Dogmatist may be any (non-Methodist) physician with a theory about the internal workings of the body and about disease aetiology.

Galen’s greatest hostility is towards Methodists: their theory (such as it is) is simply wrong. The extremity of Galen’s reaction here seems in part related to the very simplicity of their theory. For Galen, medicine is a large and complex art requiring years of training in both logical and clinical disciplines; the Methodists, possibly a consciously anti-intellectual movement representing a non-elite group in society, provocatively claimed that the art could be taught in six months; their minimalist theoretical framework hugely reduces the range of both empirical inputs and theoretical distinctions that can be considered relevant.

Galen believes that the Empiricist position, avoiding any statement about unseen entities and basing itself entirely on experience (empeiria, peira), will lead to the correct therapeutic result in many cases. Faced with a choice between being a pure Empiricist and adopting an erroneous theory, one should infinitely prefer the former. However, Galen’s view remains that theoretical knowledge of the internal workings of the body is possible—that is, one can deduce facts about the non-evident (adēla) on the basis of one’s observations. Further, this knowledge of the workings of the body, its phusis, gives one an understanding of pathology—in particular, a differentiated pathology based on a knowledge of the different internal parts and the different forms diseases may take in them, despite superficially similar symptoms—which will in some cases enable one to make the right diagnosis, and therefore prescribe the correct treatment, where the Empiricist would not.

3.3 Levels of Epistemic Certainty

Galen is committed to the possibility of secure knowledge of the physical world. In The Best Teaching (Opt. Doc.), in response to contemporary Greek epistemological debates and in particular to Academic Skepticism, he rejects arguments that encourage us to doubt one’s natural evaluative faculty (kritērion), or to advance arguments on both sides of any proposition in order to reach suspension of judgement; he also attacks the Stoic terminology of the “apprehensive” or “kataleptic” (katalēptikē) impression, a kind of cognitive experience which is so clear as to be self-guaranteeing. (But he seems to regard the distinction between “kataleptic” and his preferred term, “securely knowable”, as purely verbal, rather than of philosophical interest. Relatedly, he mentions, but does not seem to feel a serious philosophical challenge from, the Skeptical objection that one may believe one has a reliable perception also in dreams or in mentally deranged states.)

Galen is exercised to assert the reliability of one’s fundamental intuitions and sense-perceptions (what is trustworthy in itself, ex heautou pista), on the one hand, while giving an explanation of human disagreement on matters of fact and theory, on the other. His view is that while we are endowed with a naturally reliable evaluative faculty (kritērion), there is a right and a wrong way of training this; the former will, in particular, enable one to distinguish true from false arguments. (Training of the individual faculties of sense perception—for example, touch—is also of great importance, especially for the aspiring doctor.) Galen uses an analogy with other specialist skills (technai): a music teacher or gymnastic trainer, equally, relies on the pupil’s trust in his own natural kritērion, but this does not mean that performance will be error-free. Rather, teaching in these contexts—as in that of logical argument and knowledge acquisition—is a constant process of supervision and correction of errors.

Galen also theorizes in an original way the relationship between empirical inputs and the conceptual framework within which they are assessed; in particular, with his concept of “qualified experience” (diōrismenē peira; see van der Eijk 1997; Hankinson 2021; Singer 2021b) he asserts that empirical data can only lead to the truth in the context of a theoretical framework arrived at through reason.

We have considered the role of logical demonstration. We should consider further the role of mathematics and geometry: Galen looks to these as providing a model of the possibility of certain knowledge, and a refutation of Skepticism. He recommends a training in these disciplines, where “the fact itself bears witness of its truth, once discovered”—i.e., where one cannot doubt the rightness of the solution one has reached—for anyone interested in truth-giving enquiry (Aff. Pecc. Dig. II.3, 290–2; II.4–5, 299–305). A paradigmatic case is that of the construction of a sundial: if one has done it correctly, the facts themselves confirm that. That is, one can simply observe that the sun hits the first line at daybreak and the last at sunset; moreover, the correctness of the positioning of the remaining lines can be checked against a simply constructed water clock.

So, Galen is optimistic about the attainability of reliable knowledge. Yet the examples of mathematics and geometry at the same time point to the most obvious challenge to this epistemological optimism. For, surely, the gulf between the level of certainty available in those areas and that possible in the study of the biological world, let alone in the medical examination of individual cases, is an enormous one.

Yet Galen seems remarkably confident about the possibility of secure knowledge, even in areas where he is able to produce little that looks like a “demonstration”: to the above case of element theory we might add, for example, the confident classification of pathological states and their signs or, indeed, the quantificatory account of drugs and their dosages in the pharmacological work. In all such cases, Galen seems convinced, a method proceeding from reliable empirical starting-points and applying sound logical method (and where relevant training the perceptual senses) may lead to secure knowledge; see van der Eijk 2015; Singer 2021b.

On the other hand, in clinical practice we make the transition from propositions of universal validity—the sort which Galen believes himself able to arrive at in the way seen above, through the application of logical method on the basis of evident starting-points—to the particular case; and Galen problematizes this difference between the general or universal (katholou) and the individual or particular (idion) (Chiaradonna 2013, van der Eijk 2008). Each individual case is different; moreover, the existence is acknowledged of empirical experiences which are not expressible in words (Dig. Puls. III.3, 914). This suggests a conclusion of considerable epistemological interest, namely that there are individual phenomena which cannot be fully incorporated in the universal scientific account (see Singer 2021b).

Central to the understanding of clinical practice, too, is that we are here dealing with a system of symptoms or signs; and inference from signs cannot give one the same kind of secure knowledge that is available for propositions arrived at through demonstration. Galen here engages in what was already a complex and sophisticated area of discussion, drawing on both Hippocratic texts (see the discussion of signs in his commentary on the Hippocratic Prognosticon) and debates in Hellenistic philosophy and medicine (Allen 2001, Hankinson 2008a, van der Eijk 2008). As we have seen Galen, unlike the Empiricists, believes that the observation of bodily signs—a complex range, for the ancient doctor—enables the expert to make inferences about the underlying bodily state and causal conditions. The term endeixis here refers to the “indication” that the observed body gives, both of what has caused its present state, and of the appropriate treatment.

Galen remains confident about epistemic success in this area too; yet it is important to make the appropriate distinctions in relation to certainty and demonstrability.

3.4 Limits and Purposes of Knowledge

Galen claims that in his youth—partly in response to the confusion caused by mutually contradictory philosophical sects, all claiming certainty on unprovable issues—he nearly succumbed to the lures of Skepticism (Lib. Prop. 14/11, 18). The above possibility of certainty, as provided by mathematics and geometry, is what saved him. But an understanding of the limits of human knowledge is as important as the project of acquiring it in those areas where that is possible. Galen is scathing about those who commit themselves rashly on insufficient evidence, and about philosophers who debate propositions on which demonstrative knowledge is impossible (such as the existence and nature of the void outside the cosmos) (Aff. Pecc. Dig. II.6–7, 308–13). Here, one criterion to which he appeals in refusing to make pronouncements on certain questions is their lack of relevance to “medicine or ethical/practical philosophy” (e.g., Prop. Plac. 15, 120; PHP IX.9, 600).

Yet the value of knowledge is not justified purely in pragmatic terms. In Prop. Plac., Galen puts forward a more subtle, tripartite division of areas of knowledge: (1) matters on which he claims that it is possible to have, and that he has, certain knowledge; (2) matters on which he claims no knowledge; and (3) matters on which he claims only to be able to advance to the “plausible”, but where the attempt to gain knowledge is still worthwhile, even though they are not of direct practical value (Prop. Plac. 14, 114–17). This last category is in a sense the most interesting and Galenically distinctive. Such knowledge, he suggests, “would adorn the art, if knowledge could be obtained”; he seems here to associate this category with element theory. If so, this acknowledgement of a limitation on certainty will affect our view of Galen’s “demonstrations” in this area (§3.1 above). Perhaps, although it is not apparent from his dedicated—and highly polemical—discussions in Hipp. Elem. and in HNH, this is after all an area where he admits to something less than scientific certainty, at least in detail.

One area in which Galen openly asserts his ignorance is that of the “substance/essence (ousia) of the soul”: is it a non-bodily substance, as Plato thought, or composed of physical elements? (See further §6.4 on ousia and 7 on soul-theory.) In spite of some strong apparently physicalist statements in this area, Galen consistently throughout the corpus denies that he knows the answer to this question (Donini 2008; Singer 2013: 32–33 and Ch. 4). The case is similar in response to the question, how information is transmitted into the embryo in the process of conception and foetal development. That one needs to invoke some form of “intelligent design” is, to Galen, absolutely clear. But precisely who or what is responsible? How does the infant acquire, from birth or even before, the ability to perform all its innate functions? In an interestingly open-ended discussion in The Shaping of the Embryo (Foet. Form. 6, 196–201), Galen ends with a genuine aporia: all existing options within the tradition—the Platonic “world soul” extending throughout matter, the presence of a rational soul in a pre-rational animal, a plurality of souls for each individual muscle function—have consequences which make them unattractive; but he does not himself claim to have the answer.

We are left with a challenging and distinctive epistemological position, explicitly asserting the limitations to human knowledge in certain metaphysical or higher-level physical areas of enquiry, but anti-Skeptic and committed to the fundamental knowability of the physical world, as well as to the value of the quest for knowledge in areas where reasoning on the basis of clear empirical observation and/or truths evident to reason makes that possible.

3.5 The Notion of Scientific Progress

Galen explicitly states that, using theoretical reasoning in conjunction with empirical evidence, progress in knowledge is possible. At the same time—a perception typical within Graeco-Roman culture—he regards the pathway from the “ancients”, in particular Hippocrates, to the moderns as in general a downward one, and “more recent”, in relation to medical or scientific authors, is usually a term of disapprobation. He does, however, claim that progress in relation to the ancients is possible, and indeed that he has achieved it, in two chief senses. One is that, for example in anatomy, he has made certain specific discoveries unknown to his predecessors; the other, more substantial in his presentation, is the project of giving solid demonstrative form to propositions which (according to Galen) were known to the ancients, but either stated by them without demonstration, or actually omitted from their writings (Opt. Med. 4, 34; Hankinson 1994a).

It is important to consider the historically specific attitude to authority—to “the ancients”—that is in play here. As we have seen, Galen apparently regards certain propositions as evident to reason which we might rather think are “endoxic”, or indeed simply well established in traditional thought. More specifically, Galen has an enormous explicit admiration for certain authors already regarded as classical in his time, most especially Hippocrates and Plato, and devotes lengthy texts to their exegesis. He is both influenced by previous authors and exercised to present his own views as consistent with a body of traditional thought. But his latter process is not a straightforward or uncritical one: different sets of authors are lined up as authority in different contexts; and authors highly respected in certain contexts become the object of fierce criticism in others. (On these issues see Lloyd 1988, 1993; Singer 1996, 2013, Ch. 4, 2021a; Vegetti 1999; von Staden 2009.) Galen explicitly states that he does not rely on Hippocrates, “as others do”, uncritically or reverentially, but rather quotes him because he sees “that his demonstrations are secure” (QAM 9, 399–400). So, too, with Plato: although agreeing with much of Platonic doctrine as he understands it, and in a sense appearing to present himself “tribally” as a Platonist, Galen is quite capable of disagreeing with Plato on points of detail.

Yet the very fact that Galen’s major treatise on psycho-physiology, PHP, is formally presented as a reconciliation of Hippocrates’ and Plato’s views is telling—as indeed is the huge volume of exegetical work on Hippocrates, and on Aristotelian logic. In practice, arguments from authority have considerable value for Galen, at least as a persuasive tool, in spite of his explicit denials of that authority status; and there are undoubtedly cultural and historical reasons for his devotion to Plato and Hippocrates in particular (see von Staden 1997; Vegetti 1999; Gill et al. 2009). However, his claim not to be a slavish sectarian is borne out; and no one—not Aristotle, not Plato, not even Hippocrates—is exempt from criticism in particular contexts.

4. Logic: Historical Contribution

We have devoted considerable attention to the importance of logic for Galen in relation to the theory of demonstration and early intellectual training. Some account should also be given of his contribution to the broader theoretical study of logic, because—although not of similar relevance to epistemology or the theory of science—this contribution is, at least arguably, of considerable historical importance.

Certain caveats must be given at the outset. Galen’s most important work in this area, Demonstration, is lost to us except for fragments (though a shorter work, the important Introduction to Logic (Inst. Log.), does survive); and the precise nature of Galen’s innovations, and final views, is a matter of debate amongst experts (for an overview, as well as an account of different views, see Morison 2008). In an area of great technical complexity and interpretive difficulty, we can here attempt no more than the briefest summary of the main issues and points of discussion. These may be said, broadly, to revolve around the questions of the nature and extent of the originality of Galen’s contribution, and of the way in which he draws upon the work of both Aristotle and the Stoics.

Galen’s commentary on Aristotle (in a way consistent with the approach considered in §3.5) involves not just explication but also addition. He claims that in his commentary on the Categories (again, unfortunately lost) he added an eleventh category to Aristotle’s ten: that of “composition”. In the context of Aristotelian syllogistic logic, meanwhile, there is some suggestion that he felt it necessary to posit a fourth figure in addition to the Aristotelian three. In fact, there seems considerable doubt concerning both the value of such a fourth figure and Galen’s authorship of it (Morison 2008: 85–91); a preferable interpretation may be that references to this “fourth syllogism” are not to a new categorization within the system of Aristotle’s simple syllogisms, but rather (more interestingly) to an original attempt at the analysis of compound syllogisms, which Galen apparently carried out with specific reference to certain arguments in Plato.

No less interpretively challenging is the material concerning the other main areas of Galen’s contribution, those relating to hypothetical logic and to the “relational syllogism”. The subject again resists non-specialist summary; but it seems uncontroversial, at least, (a) that Galen engages in detail with Stoic hypothetical syllogistic; (b) that he attacks the Stoics for particular aspects of their use of it; and (c) that this attack is in some way related to his own insistence on the priority of “things” over “expressions” (a motto which runs through much of Galen’s other work, too, in the context of discussions of language). A final area of complexity and doubt concerns the relational syllogism, the introduction of which Galen claims as his innovation at Inst. Log. 16. What seems clear is that Galen brought this new type of syllogism forward in response to what he perceived as inadequacies in both Aristotelian and Stoic logic; also that he believed it to be of particular relevance for proofs in geometry and mathematics. An example of a relational syllogism—from which such relevance is indeed clear—is:

Theo has twice as many possessions as Dio;
but Philo has twice as many possessions as Theo;
therefore, Philo has four times as many possessions as Dio.

(One puzzling feature of relational syllogisms as presented by Galen is that he apparently sometimes does and sometimes does not mention the relevant axiom on which the syllogism depends, as part of the syllogism.)

Experts have found Galen’s theoretical contribution to logic not only interpretively problematic (although see Bobzien 2004), but also ultimately frustrating in its failure both to give a clear and consistent account of itself and to fulfil its ambition systematically to provide what is missing in the pre-existing tradition. What does seem clear is that Galen made a distinctive and in some ways influential and challenging contribution in this area, responding in an original way to both the Aristotelian and the Stoic logical tradition; and that even in the most abstract realm of logical analysis he retained a concern for the practical value of logic and its relatedness to things.

5. Causation

In strongly Aristotelian terms, Galen insists on the importance of identifying the teleological cause, the “for the sake of the better”, in accounts of the natural world, especially those which involve animals and human beings; he also seems strongly indebted to Aristotle in his presentation of material causation, specifically of the four-quality or four-element theory which is central to his accounts of change in the natural world, the biological world in particular. These two types of causal account run through the Galenic corpus, receiving different formulations in different contexts; in §5.2 below we shall consider them in more detail, and the nature of their relationship with each other and with other causal schemes. First, we shall consider Galen’s own explicit discussions of causal schemes and causal terminology.

5.1 Explicit Categorizations of Causes

Galen’s causal accounts bear very clear echoes of Aristotle, both linguistically and in the fundamental approach to causal explanations in the natural world. At the same time, where Galen gives a listing of the number of different causes that may be used in such explanations, he refers explicitly to Plato and seems indebted to the Platonic tradition. In a passage of UP—the work which has the strongest Aristotelian echoes in this teleological sense—he gives a list of five causes, which seems closely related to one attested elsewhere in Platonist writing: final, efficient, material, instrumental, formal (UP VI.12; see Hankinson 1994b and 1998). On the other hand, the list comes in a dialectical context, and Galen is certainly not in general concerned to give accounts which mention all five. Of those in this “official” list, it is the teleological and material that recur and are of most significance elsewhere. One might ask about the role of the two other “Aristotelian” causes, the formal and the efficient. Explicitly, Galen has little role for the latter (although it is mentioned in an account of the demiurge’s construction of the body; see further below). As for the formal: certainly, forms (eidē) are of great importance in Galen’s biology, where an account of both form and matter is necessary in the description of animals and their development. Forms, indeed, have a close conceptual relationship with the teleological cause, as the way in which design or structure enters the physical world; at the same time, their relationship with matter and in particular with the concept of mixture is difficult to extricate (see further §6).

Galen also makes use of a further set of causal categories, which are derived partly from the Stoic philosophical and partly from the medical tradition. Of particular importance—especially in medical contexts—are the concepts of “antecedent” (prokatarktikai) and “preceding” (proēgoumenai) causes; the further category of “containing” or “cohesive” (sunektikai) causes is also discussed. (Galen devoted two works explicitly to these causal concepts, CP and CC; see further Hankinson 1994b, 2008a.) While rejecting the specific Stoic theory to which this last category belongs, namely that objects require this type of cause as explanation of their persistence, Galen employs the concept to a limited extent, allowing that something productive of a particular effect, and co-temporal with that effect, may be considered its “containing cause”; he finds the category of some value for example in the analysis of the pulse.

The other two categories are of more significance. They help, for example, to explain how certain things may be called “causes” even though they do not always bring about the effect in question. Antecedent causes are conditions which raise the likelihood of an outcome in a body (say, the occurrence of a disease); these are typically external conditions, for example extreme ambient heat or moisture. But the presence of such causes does not guarantee the outcome; this will depend on internal differences in the constitution of the bodies in question, and in particular a preceding cause will be required as trigger. Galen explores the problem through the example of a person who contracts fever as a consequence of exposure to heat in a public stadium. Not everyone present in the stadium at the same time was similarly affected; but this does not mean that exposure to heat was not correctly identified as a (part) cause. It is, namely, an antecedent cause, which will only produce the pathological outcome in conjuction with the relevant preceding (internal) cause. Again, Galen uses this framework in an epistemologically optimistic way, highlighting the ability of the expert to predict or correctly analyse such an outcome, given sufficient understanding of all the relevant causal features.

5.2 Causation in the Natural World: Teleological, Demiurgic, Material

There is a strong emphasis on teleology in nature, and on the inadequacy of causal accounts that omit this. The major context for this is UP, a text explicitly inspired by Aristotle. In this 17-volume magnum opus, Galen goes through the parts of the body one by one, in each case giving an account which justifies the proposition of the purposive nature of its construction. Taking Aristotle’s approach (especially that of Parts of Animals), and the motto “Nature does nothing in vain”, as starting-points, he is concerned to prove the perfect, providential nature of the construction of parts for the benefit of the animal, especially in the context of humans. Important, from the outset, is to insist upon the correct direction of causation: we have hands, etc., because we are intelligent (the view he attributes to Aristotle), not the other way round (the view he attributes to Anaxagoras) (UP I.3, 69–70).

As so often in Galen, the polemical aim is of major importance for the formulation of the argument. The recurrent target is that group of thinkers who deny intelligence or purpose as an explanans, and omit it from their causal accounts. Here Galen lumps together: a variety of ancient Atomist theorists; the followers of the Hellenistic medical author Erasistratus; and those of the more recent Asclepiades of Bithynia. All are accused of giving accounts which omit intelligence in the relevant sense, relying entirely on either spontaneous motions of bodies or mechanistic explanations of biological processes to explain the formation and maintenance of the complex processes of the human body.

There are further, distinctive features of the teleological account in UP. One is that—in a highly intriguing and individualistic discussion which however is not developed in any detail (UP XI.14)—Galen introduces the notion of the aesthetic alongside that of function. Some features of the human body are to be explained not just in terms of its being better for them to be so, but in terms of their making the body more beautiful. (Examples are the male foreskin and the buttocks, both of which hide what would otherwise be unsightly, and the beard in men.)

The same chapter is also interesting for the explicit contrast it makes between intelligent design as Galen, in the post-Platonic Greek tradition, understands it, and intelligent design as understood in the Jewish tradition. Here Galen famously contrasts his (Platonic) view with what he describes as that of the “Mosaic philosophy”, the creation ex nihilo in which God’s will is the only relevant cause, to which there is no limitation.

For Galen, the purpose of the divine Craftsman is, certainly, the most important cause, but the material cause must also be mentioned in a full account: matter represents the building-blocks used to realize the design, and in a sense provides a limitation to it. This interaction between design and material—and the assertion of the final cause in opposition to those who deny it—are the central features of Galen’s account. In the (strikingly anthropomorphic) account of the Craftsman’s construction of the human body at UP VI.13, however, Galen does indeed incorporate the five causes listed above. The Craftsman constructs the organs of the body as they are “because it is better so”, thus also bringing about the best possible “form”: this covers both final and formal causes. We must then see how he employs both “instruments” and “matter” to do so: this will take account of both instrumental and material causes, and although the distinction between these too may seem somewhat fluid, it it is further clarified that we should understand the wet and the dry as providing the material cause, while the hot and the cold are the “active instruments” which the Craftsman uses to shape these. This corresponds to the Aristotelian distinction between the active and the passive pair amongst the fundamental elements (see below, §6.1). In summarizing the five causes at the end of this passage, Galen uses the phrase “from the Craftsman” instead of “efficient”.

Galen explicitly characterizes UP as a hymn to the divine creator (XVII.2–3, 732–33). This, of course, is not religion in any conventional sense: rather, it is the fact that one has gained detailed, in-depth knowledge, both of anatomy and of the chreia of the parts revealed in anatomy—that is, of the close, detailed relationship between their their structure and their functional purpose—that enables one to celebrate the creator appropriately.

The question arises, both within the teleological analysis of UP, and much more broadly throughout the Galenic corpus, of the relationship between the different causes. Some scholars have seen a tension between teleology and material causation in Galen (and some, such as Moraux 1984, even believed that they could identify a chronological development, from the “early” position of UP, with its clear Aristotelian “instrumentalism”, to the apparent physicalism or materialism of the “late” QAM—on which see §7 below). For further exploration of these issues see Singer 1997b; Havrda 2017; van der Eijk 2017; Singer and van der Eijk ad loc. on the passages from Temp. cited below.

To put it at its weakest, we may say that there are discussions of biological phenomena in which the teleological account appears to recede and an account in material terms seems to be all that is thought relevant. But it seems possible to go further. Whereas—at the risk of simplifying a highly complex topic—interpretations of Aristotle would tend to stress the co-existence and co-operation of the different causes, or at least of the material and the final and/or formal, in causal accounts in the natural world, certain Galenic passages seem to suggest (while making specific reference to Aristotle) that different types of causal account may be applicable at different levels within the natural or biological world. Considering, in the context of this discussion of bodily mixture, what constitutes perfection in a human being, Galen states:

the man … must not just be at the median of moisture and dryness, but must also have the best possible construction [or “shaping”: diaplasis]—something which is perhaps a consequence of that good balance of the four elements, but may have some higher cause of a more divine nature (Temp. I.9, 229);

later, he attacks

the failure to regard the natural cause of our construction as a craftsmanlike power, whereby the parts are formed in a way suited to the characters of our souls,

and goes on to claim that Aristotle raised a doubt as to whether this craftsmanlike power

should be attributed to some more divine cause, rather than just to hot, cold, dry, and wet (Temp. II.6, 261).

It seems that material causation is adequate in some areas, while design-based causation needs to be invoked at a higher level, in particular when one needs to explain animal and in particular human structures and their operations.

Whereas one would think (on Aristotelian grounds) that an account in terms of the elements should require the simultaneous presence of a formal or final account, that is, that these pick out different aspects of the reality, matter always requiring a certain sort of organization, which corresponds to the formal or final—and, further, such a perception is arguably borne out by QAM, with its suggested equation of bodily mixture with eidos, implying that the formal account will includes material elements in an appropriate way (see §7.2 below)—the above-cited texts seem to suggest that there is a higher-level cause which is added to the material cause in certain contexts, in particular, those that involve organic and higher-level structures.

Relatedly, Galen at times makes a distinction between bodily features which were intended as part of the primary design or rationale (kata prōton logon) and those which follow by necessity, through physical causation, as a by-product of that design (Temp. II.5, 253; cf. UP XI.14, 534–36 on how providential design takes account of necessary physical consequences). Again, the consequence of such an analysis would seem to be that not all features of an animal can be equally part of a teleological account, or not part of it in the same sense. Certain things seem to happen spontaneously, or to follow unavoidably from the purposive cause, though not themselves intended.

This leads us to a broader question. To what extent can lower-level, elemental, descriptions constitute full accounts of higher-level phenomena in the body? (Compare the related discussion at §6.4.) Two examples might be used to highlight the question: would a sufficiently full account of the nature of the mixture of the brain be an exhaustive account of what is happening in the psuchē? And could a sufficiently full account of the balance of qualities—the most basic physical level—in a human body constitute an exhaustive account also (i) of its higher-level constituents, (ii) of the inception and (iii) of the nature of the diseases that befall the animal in that state, e.g., of a particular fever, or other disease state?

We shall return to the former question under §7.2. The answer to the latter is complex, partly because of tendency for different conceptual areas to be discussed separately (e.g., the accounts of the composition and “mixture” (krasis) of the human body, though it includes an account of “bad-mixtures” (duskrasiai), is separate from that of fevers, or of melancholy).

But the three subsections of this question may yield somewhat different answers. (i) Galen clearly distinguishes three levels of bodily analysis: qualities/elements; humours and homoeomerous or uniform parts; and organs. (Humours, such as blood or bile, are in a sense uniform, although in a more detailed distinction of levels, they may constitute a further layer, between elements and uniform parts, see Hipp. Elem. 8, 126–7.) Here, too, Galen is heavily indebted to Aristotle (in particular to book II of the Parts of Animals). A formulation which Galen uses in relation to this three-level analysis is that the organic parts arise from the “composition, amount, magnitude and shaping” of the uniform parts, which in turn depend on a correct balance of the elements hot, cold, wet and dry (San. Tu. I.1, 3). It seems clear, although it is not always explicitly stated, that analysis at the organic level should, in principle, involve the teleological cause; as we have seen, this may not always be the case of analysis at lower levels, though Galen is exercised by the problem of how biological substances or low-level organisms contain within them the principles which bring about the relevant teleological or functional aims (see further §6.2).

In the pathological area it seems more difficult to see the relevance of the teleological cause. (ii) Galen does seems to think that a sufficiently full account of the internal and external low-level conditions should be fully predictive of the disease outcome (this, then, will be a question of understanding in sufficient detail the preceding and antecedent causes). (iii) Certainly fevers are hot diseases and, moreover, their individual differences—as well as the treatment indicated—are to a considerable extent explicable in terms of the terminology of the fundamental qualities. Yet once they take hold, they function according to a complex rationale (Galen sometimes uses the term idea, “form” or “structure”, related to the Aristotelian term for form, eidos, in reference to such disease entities) and appear to have their own causal powers; the best interpretation of the Galenic picture may, however, well be that such powers would in theory (via some complex hypothetical account which Galen understandably does not feel the need to consider) be fully explicable in terms of the states and interactions of fundamental qualities.

It is worth pursuing this line of enquiry a little further, in relation to Galen’s account of primary and secondary properties and of emergent properties. On the one hand, all properties discernible by the senses can be understood on the basis of the primary qualities that exist at the elemental level. On the other, it is an essential part of Galen’s theory of the composition of living bodies from elements that there are qualitatively different properties at higher levels—that there are, in our terms, emergent properties. The fact that we experience pain and sensation, whereas elemental bodies do not, shows that there has been a fundamental transformation in their nature, in the process of the composition of higher-level bodies from lower-level ones. In principle, then, we might think, the fact that hot, cold, wet and dry are the relevant explanatory terms at the lowest level would not necessarily mean that they are helpful terms at the highest level—that of everyday experience. After all, we talk in perceptual terms of substances being sharp, acrid, bitter, etc.—and indeed Galen talks in such terms—without in each case finding it important to give the causal explanation of those secondary properties in elemental terms. More than that: we might expect it to be the case that the use of these elemental terms was simply not helpful or relevant, precisely because of the Galenic theorization, just noted, of higher-level or secondary qualities as different in their nature from the primary ones.

Yet what is striking is that in spite of that theoretical apparatus, which would in principle mean that one might abandon talk in terms of hot, cold, wet and dry at higher levels of explanation—in particular, in the advanced medical realm of disease description and treatment—precisely these terms remain the central ones. Other descriptive and experiential terms are used, of course; but it is remarkable that, precisely in that area where Galen makes his most elaborate attempt to classify substances according to their properties and effects, namely in his extremely lengthy accounts of drugs—accounts which include, one should add, a significant element of quantificatory analysis—the “scientific” terms of description remain precisely these: hot, cold, wet and dry.

6. Physical Theory and Biological Concepts

We have already considered Galen’s physical analysis in the broader context of his causal theory, as well as in relation to his notions of demonstration. This section will give more detail on that physical theory, considering further aspects of Galen’s account of change in the physical and biological world, as well as the relevance of the concepts of form and matter, of substance, and of powers.

6.1 Elements, Principles, Matter, Pneuma

The fundamental constituents or elements (stoicheia) of physical bodies are—theoretically—earth, air, fire and water. However, it is also legitimate to state that the elements are the hot, the cold, the wet and the dry; and indeed it is this latter model which is of the greatest explanatory value for Galen, and which he employs almost universally in his accounts of bodies and their physical change (for example in Temp., and more generally in his work on health, disease and pharmacology). He tends to present the difference between the two forms of analysis as philosophically unimportant: it is just a question of whether one prefers to talk in terms of qualities (poiotētes, i.e., the hot, etc.) or of bodies (sōmata, i.e., fire, etc.). However, the formulation in terms of the cosmic elements (fire, earth, air, water) is important for Galen, because it is central to his argument that the only coherent way in which a theory of elements in the body can be understood is in terms of the extremes of qualities; and, further, that (since, e.g., the extreme of hot is fire) such an understanding automatically entails the equivalence of those elements in the body with the elements outside the body, in the cosmos: fire, earth, air and water.

In fact, there is some complexity in Galen’s precise view of elements, and in particular as to the relationship of fire, air, earth, water (which henceforward, for convenience, I shall term “element-bodies”) with hot, cold, wet, dry (henceforward, “element-qualities”); see Hankinson 2017; Singer 2021a. Although at times he uses the term stoicheia for both element-bodies and element-qualities, in his most detailed account, in his Commentary on Hippocrates’ Nature of the Human Being (HNH) (I.3; cf. Hipp. Elem. 6, esp. 112–16), he clarifies that properly speaking the former are elements, stoicheia, in the sense that they cannot be physically separated into anything else, but that they are further conceptually divisible into different “principles” (archai): specifically, each of the element-bodies (stoicheia) must be understood as the outcome of the reception into a substrate, quality-less matter, of the extreme of a particular quality (that is, the element-qualities). Galen’s element theory seems in many respects closely modelled on Aristotle’s; but the view presented here of qualities entering or informing otherwise unformed matter may be seen as ultimately Platonic, based on the conception of matter and the receptacle in the Timaeus, while the terminology of “quality-less” (apoios) which he sometimes uses in this context is Stoic in origin (e.g. HNH I.3, 18; cf. the “matter (hulē) which underlies all the elements” at Hipp. Elem. 6, 114). The presence of an analogous concept is much less clear in Aristotle. Moreover, the precise relationship between specific element-bodies and specific element-qualities is somewhat confusing, both in terms of Galen’s explicit discussions of it and in terms of the relationship of his model to the Aristotelian and Stoic ones.

To summarize in an interpretively difficult area: Stoic theory has each element-body corresponding to the extreme of one element-quality (fire to the hot, etc.); Galen not only seems at times to highlight such one-to-one correspondences, focussing on the element-bodies as instantiating the element-qualities in their “uncombined and unmixed” states; such associations also seem epistemologically or heuristically crucial for the establishment of certain features of the human body and their relationship with the external world: the theoretical extreme of hot automatically leads one to the concept of fire, for example. On the other hand, it seems clear from certain passages in Hipp. Elem. and HNH that Galen remains committed to the Aristotelian view (as outlined in De generatione et corruptione), whereby each element-body arises from a pairing of element-qualities. (There also seems to be some vacillation as to which quality is present in its extreme form: is the extreme of moisture instantiated by water (the Stoic view) or by air (the Aristotelian view) – and relatedly is air hot or cold?)

One should also consider the distinction between the more active and the more passive elements. This (again Aristotelian) distinction seems not, in general, to be a feature of the Galenic elements; yet it does play a role in the account of the purposive construction of the body, whereby the hot and the cold function as instruments, the dry and the wet as mere material, for the Craftsman (see above, §5.2).

Finally, some account must be given of pneuma. This concept—literally “breath”, but endowed with various kinds of technical significance and explanatory power in the previous philosophical and medical traditions—stands in an important, though somewhat problematic, relation to the theories of both elements and the soul. Its precise connection with the former is not made entirely clear, and pneuma is not standardly mentioned in Galen’s various accounts of the constituents of the body and the changes which it undergoes in health and disease. However, it plays an important role in his physiology, especially in PHP and UP. Here, two forms of pneuma, the “vital” (zõtikon) and the “psychic” (psuchikon) correspond to two major organs and systems in the body. Vital pneuma communicates vital (involuntary) function and tension through the arteries, psychic pneuma communicates perception and voluntary motion from and to the brain, through the nerves. It is possible here again to posit a Stoic influence in the central role accorded to pneuma in the account of vital, and especially psychological, function. Galen even floats the notion of the identity of soul and pneuma; that, however, is not his considered view of the matter, which is rather that the pneuma functions as the soul’s “first instrument” (see §7.2 below). Moreover, Galen’s theory in this area is fundamentally anatomical in nature, and certainly does not adopt Stoic metaphysical views in this area; its connections with the anatomically based medical theories of Herophilus and Erasistratus seem much more relevant than that more abstract and metaphysically based understanding of pneuma and its function (see Singer 2020b; further von Staden 2000; Rocca 2020; van der Eijk 2020).

6.2 Form

In the description of higher-level bodies—that of animals, in particular—one must invoke the concept of their form (eidos). Again we have a Galenic version of an Aristotelian concept, with form understood as opposed to matter, on the one hand, and to the broader classificatory category, genos, on the other.

Form, we have seen, is a structural concept which for Galen is closely related to the notion of design and teleological explanation: a successful account of how the structure of a body is “for the better” will simultaneously involve an account of its form, i.e., of the particular way in which matter is purposefully structured within that body.

The precise way in which form relates to matter, however, is complex and resists easy summation. We might rather point to a few contexts in which Galen invokes form in physical explanations. In embryology, form represents the component of design (in modern terms, of information) which is transmitted to the embryo from the parents, as opposed to the matter out of which it is constructed. It thus becomes an explicit question (problematized in different ways both in the early text Semen (Sem.) and in the late one Foet. Form.), how the form is present in the matter, and what is the nature of the process of interaction. In the former text, for example, the process crucially involves the interaction of pneuma (breath, containing the formal element) and blood (containing the appropriate matter); and a distinction is made between ousia (in the material sense) and the power that moves and shapes it.

In the account of the different physical composition of different animals and human beings in Temp., meanwhile, eidos is the term used to refer to different species—each of which has its own different internal organization and range of typical qualities. This has a particular importance for accurate physical description, especially of the kind relevant for the doctor: it is by reference to this eidos that we meaningfully apply adjectives such as hot or cold to a body. It is not relevant whether they are hot or cold in some abstract sense, in relation to the whole cosmos, nor whether they possess those properties by comparison with members of a different eidos. The assessment of those qualities must be carried out in relation to a theoretical midpoint specific to that creature’s eidos, which will have its own possible range of mixtures, as well as its own optimal mixture. Mixtures themselves can be classified according to their eidos; and this same classificatory terminology (we might here use a term like “types”) is used in the classification of such theoretical items as diseases, and varieties of pulse or massage, according to the appropriate distinctions or differentiae (diaphorai). And in QAM (see below, §7.2) it is stated, with Aristotelian authority (or perhaps rather: the view is attributed to the school of Aristotle), that form, in the context of a certain level of biological analysis, means the same as mixture; and that this level of biological analysis is that relevant to the soul itself.

6.3 Mixture and Change

The coming-to-be of different physical substances in the world, as well as their various properties, is explained through the concept of mixture (krasis). Every physical thing in the world, in particular the biological world, is composed from mixtures of the fundamental elements; it is thus appropriately described in terms of the predominance of one or more qualities (hot, cold, etc.) within the mixture. Galen holds that higher-level properties come about through the alteration that may take place in this process of mixture; at the same time, the fundamental, low-level properties—hot, cold, wet and dry—which predominate in a given body remain powerful explanantia of its nature, at the macroscopic, perceptible level too; and this applies, for example, both to human bodies and to the various things they may eat and drink, including both food substances and drugs.

We should say a little more about the nature of mixture and change. As in many areas, Galen here tries to avoid intricate and undecidable metaphysical debates, while insisting on certain fixed points. One of the latter, as we have seen, is the four-element theory; another is the understanding of the physical world as a continuum, rather than as some set of bodies interspersed with void. As to the nature of the change that takes place in mixture: krasis must be understood to be a process in which the elements involved undergo some fundamental change; it is not a mere placing alongside each other of tiny quanta of different substances (as might happen in mixing two powders), whereby those substances themselves remain in principle capable of being separated, and retain their original properties. What happens, rather, is that a new substance arises with distinct properties, and the smallest imaginable quantum of this new substance would have those distinct properties, not those of the elements from which it was mixed.

Here Galen again draws on Stoic terminology, and talks of the “total mixture” (krasis di’ holōn). In Stoic theory, this “total mixture” involves the notion that the two bodies mixed in this particular way co-inhabit one space. Galen does not commit himself on the precise metaphysical description, but seems to prefer the formulation that the qualities (poiotētes) undergo total mixture while the bodies do not.

This, then, is Galen’s account of how a new type of substance comes about through the combination of two other substances. And here he makes the distinction between the kind of change where a substance affects another in just one or other of its qualities—heating it, for example, or heating it and drying it—and another, observed particularly in the assimilation of food, which involves change in respect of the whole substance (kath’ holēn tēn ousian, and similar expressions); the distinction is elaborated in Temp. (III.1, 270; III.4, 277; cf. Hipp. Elem. 9, 132–9), as well as in Galen’s theoretical work on the action of drugs, SMT, III.4); at Prop. Plac. (9, 84–7), he talks of the “specificity” or “specific quality” (idiotēs) of the substance considered as a whole. This specific quality, apparently, inheres in the substance, as something separate from its components. Galen here comes close to articulating a notion of emergent properties: he uses these notions of holē ousia and idiotēs not only in the context of drug properties, but also occasionally in that of the higher-level physiological capacities of the body, or even the soul, in accounts of the way in which an entity or its active capacities are qualititatively different from the underyling elements that went into its composition (Singer 2020a).

6.4 Substances and Powers

This leads us to a more focussed discussion of the notion of substance, ousia, and also the role in Galen’s explanations of powers or capacities (dunameis). The notion of ousia in Galen is a complex one, because he uses the term both to refer to material stuffs of various kinds (as in the everyday contemporary English usage of the term “substance”), and in an Aristotelian metaphysical sense, to refer to something’s essence, what it defintionally is (see above, §3.1). Thus, ousia is used as synonymous with matter (hulē), and contrasted with form, in the embryological treatise Sem.; but the question, “what is the ousia of the soul?” admits of non-materialist as well as materialist answers.

Galen’s conception of ousia is complex and under-researched, involving a huge number of potentially relevant texts; his conception of dunamis is also subtle and difficult to summarize conclusively (see Hankinson 2014). One line of interpretation that seems plausible in relation to ousia is that its very homonymy is in fact significant for Galen’s metaphyics: that is to say, that although the Aristotelian sense of ousia is in principle distinct from the “everyday”, material one, there may be a tendency in Galen to elide the two usages, to conceive the answer to the question of something’s ousia in physical terms.

In either case, different ousiai are items that are definitionally different, different types of thing, not just qualitatively different versions or sub-categories of one thing. A relevant example is that of the three parts of the Platonic tripartite soul. Although typically referred to as different capacities (dunameis), it is more correct to state that they are three different substances (ousiai)—partly because, in fact, each one of them itself has a number of capacities (PHP VI.3, 374–5; cf. QAM 2, 377 and 4, 386). And, as we have seen, the notion of a change “in the whole substance” as opposed to a mere change in qualities is an important one in Galen’s physics; this gives an account of one type of thing’s turning into another.

So, a substance has capacities. This is important for Galen because it provides him with a way of formulating his natural philosophy in opposition to either Atomism (random motions of bodies which are themselves indistinguishable in their properties) or mechanism, in particular the view attributed to Erasistratus that all processes in the body can be causally reduced to the mechanical principle of horror vacui (pros to kenoumenon akolouthia)—a view attacked at length in Nat. Fac.

Rather, Galen insists, bodies (or substances) in the natural world have distinct capacities; in particular, there are four such capacities shared by all plant and animal bodies, the actions of which account for biological functions such as nutrition in a way which Atomist or mechanist views cannot. These capacities are: attractive, retentive, alterative, expulsive (e.g., Nat. Fac. III.4–8; UP IV.7; Temp. III.1, 269–70).

Again, we may think in terms of emergent properties: how these natural capacities come about is not something that Galen is able to explain in detail, but they are properties of higher-level bodies which are not present in the elements, and must somehow arise in the former through the process of composition from the latter. (These latter also have capacities, but fundamental ones: fire has the capacity of heating, water of moistening, etc.) It is noteworthy that in a passage already cited (Prop. Plac. 9, 84–7) the “internal management” (dioikein) of the parts according to the natural capacities is closely related to this notion of activities or functions belonging to a part of the body “in virtue of its whole substance”.

Galenic explanations in terms of capacities risk appearing circular; indeed, their post-Galenic descendants were famously mocked as such by Molière. Galen in fact admits openly that the statement that a substance or body “has an f-ic capacity” does not add anything to the statement that that substance or body “is capable of f-ing” (QAM 2, 377), even commenting that “we use the term ‘capacity’ when we do not know the substance (ousia!) of the active cause” (Nat. Fac. I.4).

The statement that bodies have capacities, then, can be understood simply as the acknowledgement of the existence of tendencies to perform specific activities of functional relevance for the organism. For Galen, of course, this acknowledgement is intimately linked with the assertion of purposive design and the denial that Atomism or mechanism could ever give a satisfactory account of such properties.

We can, however, go a little further, and state that there are points, at least, where Galen attempts to give some more concrete account of what a capacity is or how it works. At Praes. Puls. II.9, 305–6, he states that “the substance (ousia) of a capacity is nothing other than a certain mixture”. And we might relate that formulation to the central, if not definitional, role given to mixture in the account of the soul’s capacities (see §7.2).

7. Philosophy of Mind

Galen’s work on the soul (psuchē) (including his work on ethics, discussed in §8 below) presents one of the most interesting aspects of his philosophical-medical output, and has attracted considerable scholarly attention in the last 40 years; see especially Manuli and Vegetti 1988; Hankinson 1991b, 1993; Donini 2004, 2008; Gill 2010; Singer 2013 (with further bibliography), 2018; Havrda 2017; Marechal 2019; Vinkesteijn 2019; Devinant 2020. At the same time it is an area beset with interpretive complexities. Galen’s moral psychology, or philosophy of mind, bases itself strongly on Plato, while also attempting to do justice to the contemporary state of knowledge in anatomy and physiology, and also taking on much from both philosophical and medical traditions which tie the psuchē and its pathology closely to a theory of elements or humours, classifying or conceptualizing its pathology in terms of physical imbalances of the body (especially of the brain).

These complexities, and difficulties of interpretation, have led some to talk of the uneasy co-existence of different “models of the soul” in Galen (see Manuli 1986, 1988; Singer 2013: 18–33). Certainly, any study of Galen’s theoretical accounts of the soul must involve an analysis of many different texts, both those specifically devoted to the theory of the psuchē, and ones which touch on it in a wide range of different contexts (physiological, pathological, dietetic, pharmacological); it must also take account of the fact that these texts belong to quite different technical genres and draw upon a variety of traditions, intellectual approaches and specialist concepts and vocabularies; and of the fact that the focus of the argument is radically different in some of these different contexts. Again, in any attempt to summarize Galen’s “philosophy of mind”, the caution should be made that his primary motivation and intellectual concern throughout nearly all these texts are those of the practising physician, not those of the theoretical philosopher. (For a comprehensive account of the pathological and medical aspect of Galen’s work on the psuchē see now Devinant 2020.)

7.1 Model(s) of the psuchē

Galen is strongly Platonist in central areas of his thought; this applies in particular to his moral psychology, where he adopts the Platonic division of the soul into rational and non-rational parts, the latter being further divided into the spirited (thumoeides) and the desiderative (epithumētikon). This fundamental rational/non-rational distinction, and the further one between the two non-rational parts, are for Galen essential to a correct conceptualization of the soul and its internal workings, and in particular to a correct approach to ethics (see further §8 below).

Yet Platonic tripartition is also central to Galen’s physiology of the whole body. The three parts—rational, spirited, desiderative—correspond to and are located in, respectively, the brain, the heart and the liver. These are the central organs in Galen’s physiology, responsible respectively for: rational thought, perception and voluntary motion; involuntary motions (especially pulse and respiration) necessary to the maintenance of life; and blood-production and nutrition. Galen’s adaptation of the Platonic tripartite soul theory is strikingly original and intellectually ambitious. (He finds explicit textual justification for these bodily locations of the soul parts in a passage from Plato’s Timaeus—although that text is primarily concerned to give an ethically normative account of the internal balance of the soul, not to advance a serious or detailed physiology.)

We might thus think that, according to this scheme, the psuchē properly belongs within just one part of the “tripartite soul”, that located in the brain; and indeed Galen does also (especially in anatomical-physiological contexts) use psuchē and its cognates in this narrower sense to refer to the brain and its functions.

There may seem to be a problematic relationship between the tripartite soul as it is discussed in Galen’s specific ethical works, in particular Aff. Pecc. Dig., and this physiological conception (e.g., in PHP). The former ethical discussions give no significant account of a bodily aspect to psychic function, while in the latter context certain features central to that ethical account are absent or recede. The internal interrelation of the parts, so essential to the ethical account (see below) is not only absent from the physiological account; it is quite difficult to see how it could be mapped onto it.

The Greek psuchē is a broader concept than can be equated with either “mind” or “soul”: it is the vital principle—that the presence of which accounts for life in the body—as well as more specifically the locus of thought and moral activity. All vital activities, in this sense, can be defined as “of the psuchē”, which is thus responsible for both (in our terms) mental and physical function. The hēgemonikon is responsible for intellectual activity and memory, for voluntary motion and for perception; and each of these is also to be understood in terms of brain and/or nerve function. It is tempting, in view of the correlations that Galen explores, both between the functioning of the rational soul and states of the brain, and between emotional disturbances and states or activities of the heart and blood, to see him as advancing either some form of dual aspect theory or, indeed, a mind–body identity theory. It seems clear, however, that Galen does not in any clear or consistent way elaborate such a clear or unified scheme (see further §7.2).

It is important to understand the anatomical-medical, as opposed to narrowly philosophical, background here. Galen’s theory is heavily influenced by the work of the Hellenistic medical authors Herophilus and Erasistratus (fourth–third century BCE). This crucially included the discovery of the nervous system, as well as some detailed knowledge and theorization of the anatomy and functions of the brain (all, of course, quite unknown to Plato, with whose theory Galen attempts to harmonize them); see von Staden 2000. Galen’s conception of brain, heart and liver as “sources” (archai) of the three Platonic parts of the soul is inextricably linked with his anatomical understanding of the three sets of channels (nerves, arteries, veins) through which they operate.

It is also significant that Galen equates Plato’s logistikon (“rational”) with the hēgemonikon (“leading-part”): the concepts are (in origin at least) distinct and derive from different conceptions of the soul. The latter is a Stoic term, although probably also prominent in the Hellenistic medical authors just mentioned: it is the notion of a single “command centre” for the soul, which communicates to the rest of the body, both receiving the information of the different sense organs and giving the command (in Stoic language, the assent) for voluntary actions. Such a single command centre is not (at least explicitly) present in Plato; similarly, such a physically centralized psychic concept is at best vaguely present in Aristotle.

Galen is centrally concerned to refute the Stoic view of the hēgemonikon as located in the heart, as against the Platonic-Galenic view of its location in the brain. In the process, while asserting his allegiance to Platonic thought on the soul, it is at least arguable that he adopts a unitary view of the soul and its “command centre” which is conceptually much closer to the Stoic one (on this point see Gill 2010).

7.2 The Mind–Body Relation

Yet it is not quite as simple as that. The physical location of the other two Platonic soul-parts, spirited and desiderative (respectively, heart and liver) are important in Galen’s theory of the psuchē—and not just of the psuchē understood as responsible for vital functions. Galen is not able to make the same close connection, at least demonstratively (see §3.1), between these other two bodily locations and their psychological functions as he is for that of the brain; nevertheless, the fact that the thumoeides—a range of emotional reactions related to anger, indignation, shame, pride, anxiety, fear—is located in the heart is shown by a number of examples, both from everyday experience and from traditional thought.

Galen exemplifies and expounds this view at length in his refutation of Chrysippus in PHP II and III; such relationships between physical states and mental ones are also explored in a number of medical texts too (for a full range of such texts, and further discussion, see Singer 2017). Galen makes interestingly precise attempts at identifying physical correlates for a range of psychological or emotional states, in terms of the precise actions and states of heart or blood, e.g. fear involves a motion of the blood away from the surface of the skin, anger the opposite motion, both erotic excitement and anxiety cause significant disturbance to the pulse. Yet the texts in question are unclear on the precise nature of the causal (or identity) relationship. Relevant here too are the medical discussions in which it is clearly implied that certain types of physical state—e.g., excess of melancholic humours—are causative, if not constitutive, of certain mental states. At points Galen even suggests that the soul may actually be the physical substrate, in particular the blood and pneuma within the body (Symp. Caus. II.5, 191) or more specifically the pneuma within the brain (PHP VII.3, 443–5); he seems however ultimately to reject such a notion, preferring the formulation that the pneuma is the soul’s first instrument for all sensations of the animal and for its voluntary motions” (ibid.).

A stronger case for a mind–body identity theory in Galen, however, is provided by the discussion of the relationship between rational soul and physical features of the brain, especially in QAM. The central aim of that work is to demonstrate the extent of the influence of the body, specifically bodily mixture, on the soul; this Galen does with examples from medicine (e.g., mental derangements with physical causes) as well as everyday experience (drunkenness, effects of physical environment). How, he asks, could a soul which is not corporeal be be affected by such physical factors, and indeed be caused to leave the body as a result of certain physical conditions (QAM 3, 381)? In a number of passages, he suggests not just the dependence of the soul on bodily mixture, but the identity of the two:

  • (a) “Aristotle says that the soul is form of the body … it is necessary for him to posit the mixture of these qualities [sc. of matter] as the form, so that it seems as if the substance of the soul … will be some mixture …” (QAM 3, 380–1);
  • (b) “ … if the reasoning form of the soul is mortal, it too will be a particular mixture, namely of the brain” (ibid.);
  • (c) “… it is better to state … that the mortal part of the soul actually is precisely this: the mixture of the body” (QAM 4, 386);
  • (d) “Andronicus … says that [the soul] is either a mixture or a capacity dependent on the mixture; I disapprove of the addition of ‘capacity’ … it is not possible to say anything other than the mixture …” (ibid.).

On this basis, some have taken this assertion of the identity of soul and mixture as representing Galen’s final position, or at least that which he finds most plausible (see most recently Marechal 2019; Vinkesteijn 2019). A consideration of all the relevant evidence seems to lead to a less clear-cut picture. Interpretation of QAM must take into account the polemical nature and structure of the text, which is aimed at refuting the extreme denial of bodily influence by certain “self-styled Platonists”, and in that context proceeds by giving as strong a statement as possible of the physicalist aspect of the theories found in a range of medical and philosophical authorites (Hippocrates, Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics; see Lloyd 1988). More specifically, what look like the clearest identity statements ((a) and (d) above) come in dialectical contexts; it is at least arguable that Galen is here asserting the identity position not as his own but as the correct Aristotelian conclusion, on the basis of their equation of soul with form (Singer 2013, Ch. 4). (It should also be mentioned that the passages in question are not free from textual and interpretive problems.) Passages (b) and (c), meanwhile, clearly affirm the identity of the mortal parts of the soul with bodily mixtures. That, then, would be a definitive conclusion about the non-rational parts; but, within this same text, even after statement (d), Galen leaves open the Platonic possibility that the (rational) soul is a non-bodily substance. As we have seen (§3.4), such indeterminacy is consistent with his explicit statements of ignorance—including in texts probably later than QAM—on this very question, the “substance of the soul”. (Those other statements do not in fact specify that it is only the rational soul that is at issue; but, as we have seen, Galen may, somewhat confusingly, use “psuchē” with that narrower reference.) Other relevant evidence is the lack of clarity, in the medical texts mentioned above, as to the causal relation between mental events and physical correlates; and that some kind of interactionist picture seems implied by statements about the mutually beneficial relationship of soul and body and of their respective training (especially in San. Tu., e.g., I.8, 19–21). An important contribution to the discussion is Havrda 2017, arguing, on the basis of a wide range of texts, that for Galen mixture provides a sufficient causal account of all but a distinct range of goal-directed functions.

QAM also contains a striking statement of the problem of physical determinism versus moral responsibility: how can someone properly be praised or blamed for character qualities, when these are derived not “from himself” but from bodily mixture? (QAM 11, 405). This historically distinctive formulation seems to rely on a definite and uncompromising physicalist view; again, however, the statement in this form is unique within the Galenic corpus.

Any attempt to summarize Galen’s philosophy in this area risks failing to do justice to his own plurality of formulations. Two things, at least, are uncontentious: that he makes a strong statement of the extent to which mental capacities are physically conditioned; and that he explores the subject in an empirically and physiologically informed manner unique within Graeco-Roman thought.

8. Ethics

8.1 Overall Model and Approach

Galen’s theoretical ethics is closely related to his Platonist conception of the soul. Central is the view that rational and non-rational psychic capacities must be treated separately, both in terms of early discipline and education and in terms of our conceptualization and treatment of their pathologies. Virtues—although a full or systematic account of these is elusive—may be understood, Platonically, as consisting in the proper functioning of each soul part, and in the proper internal relationship of the parts within the whole. The non-rational (alogon), if not subject to the discipline of the rational, will lead the soul into pathos (“affection” or “passion”), causing actions of uncontrolled greed, lustfulness or anger. This part is not accessible to rational discourse, but must rather be subjected to a process of training and habituation which will make its appetites appropriate. Within the non-rational, however, there is the further division into desiderative (epithumētikon) and spirited (thumoeides); although non-rational (and in undisciplined cases the cause of uncontrolled rage), the latter also has an instinctive reaction of indignation against wrongdoing and shameful behaviour, and can so be made the ally of the rational in carrying out the discipline of the desiderative part. (This complex relationship within the tripartite soul enables—for Galen as for Plato—an account of how certain non-rational drives, in particular reactions of shame and indignation, may be in conflict with other non-rational drives, e.g., lust or greed.)

In Aff. Pecc. Dig., Ind. and Mor., Galen strongly suggests—in a way consistent with Platonic and Aristotelian perceptions—that early habituation and discipline, as well as the right natural endowments, are crucial to the production of this appropriate level of desires and right relationship between rational and non-rational drives within the soul. There are also quite close Platonic echoes in his commitment to various forms of early mathematical and musical training. At the same time, he describes in some detail, especially in Aff. Pecc. Dig. I, a process of moral self-discipline, involving elements of “cognitive therapy”, which may assist even the mature person prone to pathos and to distress to remedy his or her faults. The texts stand within a tradition of works on ethical therapy and self-improvement, exemplified by such authors as the Platonist Plutarch and the Stoics Marcus Aurelius, Epictetus and Seneca; they offer a range of practical approaches (Singer 2018): daily self-monitoring; adjustment of one’s expectations; the co-option of a neutral observer to give an objective assessment of the level of one’s faults and of one’s progress. (The relationship with this tradition is explored in detail by Gill 2010; see also Singer 2013, Ch. 3; and Kaufman 2014, arguing also for a strong Epicurean input, especially to the discussion of Ind.)

The focus is on the reduction or elimination of one’s pathē; here, in spite of the Platonist psychological framework, Galen is engaging in a discourse developed especially by Stoic authors, and to some extent adopting their technical language. This observation leads us on to some further consideration of Galen’s views and their relationship with the contemporary ethical discourse.

8.2 The pathē

A standard point of school conflict in the ethical discourse of Galen’s time was that between the Stoic insistence on the need for total eradication of the affections (related to the doctrinal position that any giving-in to pathos is in fact a form of madness) and the Platonic-Aristotelian advocacy of a “moderate level of affectedness” (metriopatheia). It is perhaps significant that this technical term, employed by Galen’s “Middle Platonist” contemporaries, does not appear in his own extant ethics; and indeed, much of the discourse of both Aff. Pecc. Dig. and Ind. seems consistent with the aim of eradication of the pathē. On the other hand, Galen comes down against the necessity of total eradication, especially in Ind.; here, explicitly engaging with this ethical question, Galen denies that he could be happy inside the Bull of Phalaris (a notorious instrument of torture as well as a stock Epicurean philosophical example), and takes issue with the Stoic Musonius for his reported welcoming of adversity.

On the one hand, Galen imposes very high standards in this area, claiming himself to have been “completely undistressed” by the fire in which he lost a huge number of valuables, including a major part of his own writings; in another sense, he manifests a realistic and down-to-earth approach, asserting that freedom from distress is possible so long as certain basic human needs are met. He acknowledges that certain circumstances might deprive him of his moral equilibrium—exile, for example, or injustice visited upon a friend—and hopes not to encounter those.

There is a broader point about pathos: in Aristotle the term is ethically neutral, referring to emotive or non-rational experience quite generally; thus, in the Nicomachean Ethics, virtues may be understood as involving a mean, between an excessive and an inadequate emotive response. Both the Aristotelian picture and the term metriopatheia entail an understanding of pathos as not in itself negative; Galen’s understanding of pathos, in the ethical context, seems rather in accord with the Stoic conception: it is in its nature undesirable, to be reduced or eliminated as far as possible—even if he does not follow the Stoics in asserting the necessity, or indeed practicability, of its complete eradication.

Against this, however, it should be observed that Galen adopts an Aristotelian-type mean theory in relation to physical excellence; that he suggests, e.g., in QAM, that physical states of good balance will accord with good ethical states, and that in at least one passage, in Temp. he invokes something like an Aristotelian mean theory in talking of this correspondence between physical and ethical good balance: the soul of the well-balanced man will “be at an exact balance between boldness and cowardice, hesitation and rashness, pity and envy” (Temp. II.1, 233).

8.3 Distress (lupē)

Galen’s approach to the pathē is not systematic, nor aimed at giving a detailed classification, as were some Stoic approaches; however, he does share with the Stoics some classificatory tendencies. He identifies what seems to be an over-arching category of pathos, that of distress (lupē). Distress has relevance to a whole range of individual pathē: grief at loss, envy of another’s greater success or wealth, annoyance at a servant’s careless behaviour, all may be considered either as instances of distress or as giving rise to distress. The ethical project of controlling the pathē can thus to a large extent, it seems, be understood as the project of avoidance of distress. “Freedom from distress” (alupia)—the title of a recently-discovered work which discusses personal experiences and approaches to the problem in vivid detail (Ind.)—thus begins to look quite similar to the Stoic aim of “unaffectedness” (apatheia). Such unaffectedness – with the caveats already made as to its achievability in all cases—does indeed seem to be a part of Galen’s ethical project. The desire to free oneself from distress, it is also suggested, may provide a practical starting-point for the ethical project, for the simple reason that no one actually wishes to live with distress (whereas people may be happy to live with vices which do not immediately cause this negative experience). (Further on Galen’s ethics as expounded in Ind. see Kaufman 2014; Singer 2019c.)

8.4 Rational Errors and the Good

Galen’s main extant ethical work, Aff. Pecc. Dig., explicitly addresses itself to the correction of both affections (pathē) and errors (hamartēmata)—that is to say, to the shortcomings of both the non-rational and the rational part of the soul. Galen is clear that the domain of ethics covers the identification and correction of both; yet in the latter area—that of ethical errors of reason—his discussion is much less clear. He prefers to focus on intellectual error and inadequate intellectual training more broadly, in a way which seems more relevant to the discovery of scientific than to that of ethical truth. Relatedly, it is difficult to find in Galen a clear answer to the question of the goal of life, or ultimate good for human beings. What seems clear is that although he regards freedom from distress—a condition which may seem very similar to Epicurean “untroubledness” (ataraxia) or Stoic “unaffectedness” (apatheia)—as a highly desirable state, this is at best a precondition for the good life, not constitutive of it. Galen is committed to the notion that human beings have a “higher” good than that implied in the Epicurean ideal; and it seems (though there are textual problems in the passages where he comes closest to addressing the question) that the good may be formulated (a) in terms of an approach to the divine, and/or (b) in terms of the human being’s fulfilment of his or her proper capacities through appropriate activity of body and soul.

Galen draws on diverse elements in the philosophical tradition, most specifically the Platonic tripartite soul and the Stoic pathē, to advance his own distinctive ethical position, which consists of two conceptually separate (though mutually reinforcing) elements. First, one’s non-rational drives must be subjected to appropriate discipline—a discipline which, without the unrealistic aim of total eradication of the pathē, nonetheless imposes high normative standards. Secondly, the rational part of the soul must be properly educated, and must fulfil its function appropriately; although a clear definition of the “aim of life” corresponding to the good of this rational part of the soul is absent (at least from the extant texts), it is at least strongly implied that scientific or intellectual enquiry constitutes the most appropriate, or highest, realm for this fulfilment of its function.

9. Theology

That Galen is some kind of theist is clear. His philosophical theology is seen especially in texts such as UP and Foet. Form., where he argues that the manifest suitedness of biological organisms and individual structures—especially those observed in anatomy—to their functions clearly proves their organization by some extraordinary, indeed divine, intelligence. In line with his epistemic caution, however (see §3.4 above), he is not able to be specific about the nature or identity of this divine intelligence. The key feature of Galen’s theology is the role it plays in teleological explanation (although, as we have seen, the teleological account is at times presented in quite strikingly anthropomorphic terms).

Yet there are traces of a more specific theological philosophy. The view of the heavenly bodies as intelligent appears both in QAM and in UP; and although it is presented in somewhat vague terms, it motivates specific philosophical arguments. The heavenly world is transcendently good and superior; yet it has an influence—at some remove—on our lower world. The way in which the heavenly bodies affect our world may also include astrological influence; although this is not a major part of Galen’s thought, the existence of such influence is explicitly asserted, in particular in Critical Days (Di. Dec.). Consideration of the relationship between the heavenly realm and our everyday world leads to two specific types of conclusion: one, that our consciousness of the operation of a higher intelligence in this lower world should make us aware how much more admirable and perfect must be its operation in that higher one (UP XVII.1, 730); two, that there is a problem in imagining how the highest intelligence could “stoop” to affect the operations of the lowest level of biological organisms (Foet. Form. 6, 201). It seems possible to draw connections between these views and those of the transcedence of the highest good, and hierarchy of gods, that appear in “Middle Platonism”, for example in Numenius and Alcinous (see Donini 1980; Frede 2003). Galen in UP speaks interchangeably of the purposive force of Nature (phusis) and of the Platonic Craftsman (dēmiourgos), and it may be argued that this entity corresponds to the second, rather than the highest, principle or god in that hierarchy.

Again, however, Galen is not to be forced into definitive formulations of metaphysical questions; and again the distinction must be made between the essentials about which Galen is certain—here, that there is a purposive intelligence manifest throughout the universe—and the specifics, speculation about which may lead ultimately to aporia.

Galen also claims to have had personal experience of interventions by individual gods of the Greek polytheistic world within human affairs, most notably by Asclepius, the god of medicine (see Pietrobelli 2013; Singer 2019a). If it seems difficult to reconcile such a conventional, anthropomorphic manifestation of religion with the philosophical view of God as a teleological cause or as immanent Nature, it should perhaps be said that such a co-existence of abstract theology with traditional individual gods is by no means confined to Galen, amongst Graeco-Roman philosophical writers (one could mention both Plato and Epictetus in this context). In any case, it is to the divine intelligence manifest throughout the universe, rather than to any individual god, that Galen constantly returns; it is this intelligence which is the object of his religious—and by the same token of his intellectual, indeed his scientific—fervour.


A. Primary Sources

A.1 Sources of the Texts

A.1.1 Original Greek Sources

Page numbers given in references in the article are those of the translation or, in the absence of translation, of the Greek edition, cited here.

Corpus Medicorum Graecorum, various editors, Leipzig: Teubner, and Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1914– ; CMG available online.

C. Galeni Opera Omnia, ed. C.G. Kühn, 20 volumes, Leipzig: C. Cnoblochii, 1821–33, repr. Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1964–65; Kühn available online.

C. Galeni Pergameni Scripta Minora, ed. J. Marquardt, I. Müller and G. Helmreich, 3 volumes, Leipzig: Teubner, 1884–93; SM available online.

A.1.2 Collections of Translations
  • Singer, P.N., 1997a, Galen: Selected Works, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Singer, P.N. (ed.), 2013, Galen: Psychological Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Walzer, R. and M. Frede, 1985, Galen: Three Treatises on the Nature of Science, Indianapolis: Hackett.

N.B. In several cases, noted below, translations also appear alongside the Greek text in the CMG edition.

A.2 Texts by Galen

[Aff. Pecc. Dig.]
Affections and Errors of the Soul (De propriorum animi cuiuslibet affectuum et peccatorum dignotione et curatione), ed. W. de Boer, CMG V 4.1.1, 1937; English trans. in Singer 1997a and 2013.

Containing Causes (De causis contentivis), ed. and English trans. M. Lyons, K. Kalbfleisch, J. Kollesch, D. Nickel, and G. Strohmaier, CMG, Supplementum Orientale II, 1969.

Antecedent Causes (De causis procatarcticis), ed. and English trans. R.J. Hankinson, Galen on Antecedent Causes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.

[Di. Dec.]
Critical Days (De diebus decretoriis), ed. and English trans. G. M. Cooper, Galen, De diebus decretoriis, from Greek into Arabic, Ashgate, 2011.

[Dig. Puls.]
The Distinction between Pulses (De dignoscendis pulsibus), ed. Kühn VIII, pp. 766–961.

[Foet. Form.]
The Shaping of the Embryo (De foetuum formatione), ed. and German trans. D. Nickel, CMG V 3.3, 2001; English trans. in Singer 1997a.

[Hipp. Elem.]
Elements According to Hippocrates (De elementis ex Hippocrate), ed. and English trans. P. de Lacy, CMG V 1.2, 1996.

Commentary on Hippocrates’ “Nature of the Human Being” (In Hippocratis De natura hominis), ed. J. Mewaldt, CMG V 9.1, 1914.

Avoiding Distress (De indolentia), ed. and French trans. V. Boudon-Millot and J. Jouanna, with A. Pietrobelli, Galien: Oeuvres, IV, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2010; English trans. by V. Nutton in Singer 2013.

[Inst. Log.]
Introduction to Logic (Institutio logica), ed. K. Kalbfleisch, Leipzig: Teubner, 1896, Inst. Log. available online; English trans. J. S. Kieffer, Galen’s Institutio Logica, Baltimore, 1964.

[Lib. Prop.]
My Own Books (De libris propriis, ed. and French trans. V. Boudon-Millot in Galien: Oeuvres, I, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007; English trans. in Singer 1997a.

The Method of Healing (De methodo medendi), ed. Kühn X, pp. 1–1021; English trans. I. Johnston and G.H.R. Horsley, 3 vols., Loeb Classical Library, 2011.

Character Traits (De moribus), Arabic text ed. P. Kraus, “Kitāb al-Akhlāq li-Jālīnus”, Bulletin of the Faculty of Arts of the Egyptian University, 5.1 (1937): 1–51; English trans. by D. Davies in Singer 2013.

[Mot. Musc.]
The Motion of Muscles (De motu musculorum), ed. and Italian trans. P. Rosa, Pisa and Rome: Fabrizio Serra, 2009.

[Nat. Fac.]
Natural Capacities (De naturalibus facultatibus), ed. G. Helmreich, SM III, 1893; English trans. A.J. Brock, Loeb Classical Library, 1916.

[Opt. Doc.]
The Best Teaching (De optima doctrina), ed. and Italian trans. A. Barigazzi, CMG V 1.1, 1991.

[Opt. Med.]
The Best Doctor is Also a Philosopher (Quod optimus medicus sit quoque philosophus), ed. and French trans. V. Boudon-Millot in Galien: Oeuvres, I, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007; English trans. in Singer 1997a.

[Ord. Lib. Prop.]
The Order of My Own Books (De ordine librorum propriorum), ed. and French trans. V. Boudon-Millot in Galien: Oeuvres, I, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007; English trans. in Singer 1997a.

The Doctrines of Hippocrates and Plato (De placitis Hippocratis et Platonis, ed. and English trans. P. de Lacy, CMG V 4.1.2, 1978–84, 2nd edn. 2005.

Prognosis (De praenotione ad Epigenem), ed. and English trans. V. Nutton, CMG V 8.1, 1979.

[Praes. Puls.]
Prognosis by the Pulse (De praesagitione ex pulsibus), ed. Kühn IX, pp. 205–430.

[Prop. Plac.]
My Own Doctrines (De propriis placitis), ed. and English trans. V. Nutton, CMG V 3.2, 1999 (ed. and French trans. of fuller Greek text V. Boudon-Millot and A. Pietrobelli, “Galien Ressuscité: Édition Princeps du Texte Grec du De Propriis Placitis”, Revue des Études Grecques, 118 (2005): 168–213).

The Capacities of the Soul Depend on the Mixture of the Body (Quod animi mores corporis temperamenta sequantur), ed. I. Müller, SM II, 1891; English trans. in Singer 1997a and 2013.

[San. Tu.]
Matters of Health (De sanitate tuenda), ed. K. Koch, CMG V 4.2, 1923.

Semen (De semine), ed. and English trans. P. de Lacy, CMG V 3.1, 1992.

Sects for Beginners (De sectis ad eos qui introducuntur), ed. G. Helmreich, SM III, 1893; translation in Walzer and Frede 1985.

The Powers of Simple Drugs (De simplicium medicamentorum temperamentis ac facultatibus), ed. Kühn XI, pp. 379–892 and XII, pp. 1–377.

[Symp. Caus.]

The Causes of Symptoms, ed. Kühn VII, pp. 85–272.

Mixtures (De temperamentis), ed. G. Helmreich, Teubner, 1904, [Temp. available online]. English trans. in Singer 1997a and Singer and van der Eijk 2013.

The Function of the Parts of the Body (De usu partium), ed. G. Helmreich, Teubner, 1907–9, [UP available online]; English trans. M.T. May, Galen on the Usefulness of the Parts of the Body, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1968.

B. Secondary literature

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The author wishes to acknowledge the support of both the Wellcome Trust and the Alexander von Humboldt Foundation for funding of the research project in the course of which this article was written.

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P. N. Singer <>

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