Global Democracy

First published Mon Feb 23, 2015

Global democracy is a field of academic study and political activism concerned with making the global political system more democratic. This topic has become a central area of inquiry for established literatures including political philosophy, international relations (IR), international law, and sociology. Along with global justice, global democracy has also been critical to the emergence of international political theory as a discrete literature in recent decades. Whereas global justice scholars tend to focus on how burdens and benefits should be distributed by international institutions, global democrats probe how political power can be legitimated beyond the nation-state. Global democracy is therefore concerned with how transnational decision-making can be justified and who should be entitled to participate in the formation of global rules, laws, and regulations.

This short entry contains four sections which elaborate upon the possibility and problems for global democracy. The first discusses how globalization impacts upon the nation-state and what this means for traditional conceptions of democracy. The notion of a global democratic deficit—in which individuals are removed from transnational decision-making in problematic ways—is introduced, and reasons to pursue global democracy are fleshed out. The second section outlines some prominent normative proposals for global democracy. Specifically, five ‘models of global democracy’ are presented and some general criticisms are formulated. The third section then highlights the recent turn toward pursuing ‘values of democratization’. This new direction for the literature has both methodological and substantive implications. The final section highlights persistent criticisms that should be addressed in future research on global democracy.

1. Democracy and the Global System

1.1 Democracy, Globalization, and the Nation-State

A review of global democracy must begin with how globalization has impacted the nation-state and the consequences for national democracy (Bray and Slaughter 2014). Although volumes have been written about the theory and practice of democracy, the concept remains difficult to define. Etymologically the term is simple enough: democracy means rule by the people (demos meaning ‘people’ and kratos meaning ‘rule’ or ‘power’). This basic definition can be extrapolated in many different ways. At its core, however, most scholars agree that democracy refers to a political practice in which individuals govern themselves through some form of equitable decision-making process. This leaves open two fundamental issues: who constitutes ‘the people’ and how ‘rule-making’ should occur.

Historically, democracy first took hold in the ancient city states of Mesopotamia and Greece through direct mechanisms such as sortition (Keane 2009). Since the 18th Century, though, the ideal of democracy has become wedded to rise of the nation-state. The modern state is a distinctive form of political organization based on sovereign autonomy over a delimited territory and population. Through a centrally organized government, the state wields a monopoly over the legitimate use of violence as well as the right to taxation (Giddens 1985). In exchange for these coercive powers, the state generates its legitimacy through democratic mechanisms: giving its citizenry equal say in how national laws and public policy are formed.

National democracy is typically institutionalized as a representative system that involves competitive elections and a publicly determined rule of law. Although there are many different national voting systems (majority rule, proportional representation, etc.), the basic idea is that each enfranchised citizen of the state has one vote at the ballot box and can thus freely choose their preferred representative, leader, or party. Through the American and French Revolutions, and the ‘Third Wave of Democratization’ (where representative democracy spread to Latin America, the Asia-Pacific, and the Eastern bloc), the notion that the nation-state is the natural container for democracy became dominant (Huntington 1991). Over time, then, ‘the people’ in democracy has been assumed to correspond neatly with the citizenry of each particular nation-state.

In recent years, however, the supposed alliance between democracy and the nation-state has come unstuck. This is due predominantly to globalization: the increased extent, velocity, and scope of cross-border interactions, transactions, and relations (Scholte 2000). Globalization intensifies social, political, and economic relations through technological changes and the flow of people, resources and ideas across state lines. The expansion of global connections has gone hand-in-glove with increased efforts to govern global affairs. Countless formal measures, informal norms and overarching discourses for regulating global affairs are now formulated and implemented through complex transnational networks that combine substate agencies, nation-states, regional bodies, global institutions, and non-state actors (Scholte 2014, 4). Although the state is often an active participant in globalization, many scholars have argued that increased transnational activity undermines national democracy (Sassen 2003). Globalization pierces the sovereignty of nation-states by subjecting domestic affairs to transnational decision-making. Moreover, citizens of each state are often said to be problematically excluded from global activities in ways that lead to a democratic deficit (expanded upon below).

1.2 The Global Democratic Deficit

The array of transnational institutions that govern social, political, and economic processes is bewildering. Formal institutions include international organizations (IO), intergovernmental organizations (IGO), non-governmental organizations (NGO), and private bodies (Tallberg et al. 2013). Informal institutions include epistemic communities, transnational networks, and the basic structure of transnational norms that make the world ‘hang together’ (Ruggie 1998).

As the number of these transnational institutions has increased with globalization, so too has their capacity to exercise authority (Zürn et al. 2012). Many scholars have noted that this authority often enables international institutions to wield pervasive forms of public power that impact (and potentially constrain) the lives of individuals (Macdonald 2008). This occurs through international law-making, regulatory standard-setting, and the promotion of new norms. As decisions are taken outside the state, national leaders are unable to control the forces which impact domestic institutions and citizens. Correspondingly, and resultantly, individuals within each state have no direct say in how global rules are forged. This undermines the notion that individuals can collectively govern their joint affairs. This gap—between individual rule-takers and transnational rule-makers—is referred to as the global democratic deficit.

The global democratic deficit is compounded by at least three additional factors. First is an issue of procedure: international bodies often operate with unaccountable and non-transparent processes. This makes it difficult to identify the steps in a causal chain which link transnational rule-makers with rule-takers. The second factor is scope: current arrangements of transnational institutions seem incapable of tackling the most pressing issues of a globalizing world —climate change, spread of infectious diseases, volatile financial markets, enormous poverty rates, unjust supply chains, just to name a few. Third is an issue of constituency: globalization is actually reshaping who constitutes ‘the people’ due democratic standing in decision-making processes. As Andrew Linklater (1998) notes, globalization generates postnational communities of fate not based on national boundaries but upon shared problems and mutual allegiances.

This final point bears emphasis because it has (re-)ignited debates in democratic theory over the so-called ‘boundary problem’: who is entitled to take part in democratic decision-making processes (Agné 2006)? This question is often thought to be paradoxical because democratic theory offers no internal solution for delineating ‘the people’: unless we already know who is eligible to participate in democratic procedures, we do not know who to include in the initial decision-making process. As globalization erodes the idea that the citizenry represents a natural embodiment of ‘the people’, we need to search for alternate ways to justify democratic inclusion.

Although a full survey is neither possible nor necessary here, two prominent responses have been advocated in the literature (Goodin 2007). First, all individuals subjected to rules, laws, and regulations should take part in writing those rules. Second, all individuals significantly affected by a decision-making process should have an equal say in how that power is exercised. While these two positions provide a basis for delineating the people in a globalizing world, there are clear differences between them. The former is relatively narrow: only individuals to whom rules actually apply should be part of the decision-making. By contrast, the latter is much broader: global decisions often have wide-reaching and indirect consequences beyond those subjected. To take a simple example: individuals in a country not a member of the WTO are not subjected to WTO rules, but they are affected by the general system of international tariffs that the WTO regulates. Should these individuals be entitled to a democratic right of participation in WTO decisions? From this, we can see that whether we chose subjectedness or affectedness matters because each criterion entails a significantly different domain of democratic inclusion. As such, further research is required to shed light on how, or even if, the boundary problem can be resolved, and its implications for global democracy.

1.3 Why Global Democracy?

Global democrats thus share the view that individuals should collectively rule themselves. To the extent that decision-making power migrates beyond the state, democracy should follow. There is, of course, a prior question about why individuals should have roughly equal say in decision-making in the first place. On one level, it is a simple definitional requirement of democracy. But this point simply begs the question: why should we pursue democracy at all? As with theoretical discussions of democracy, a variety of intrinsic and instrumental reasons for global democracy can be discerned in the literature. Intrinsic justifications point to democracy as a valuable method of decision-making in-and-of-itself. Instrumental claims hinge upon the outcome of democracy being beneficial, especially compared to alternatives.

The most common intrinsic claim relates to cosmopolitanism, which many proponents of global democracy have drawn upon as a moral foundation motivating the project (Kant 1991[1795]). Thomas Pogge (1992: 48–9) has argued that cosmopolitans share at least this set of beliefs: 1) that human beings are the ultimate units of moral concern; 2) this status applies to all humans equally; 3) everyone should be treated as ultimate units of concern by all others. Global democracy helps realize this cosmopolitan ideal by treating all individuals as moral beings capable of exercising equal control over shared destinies. It is important to note, however, that differences between global democrats exist in terms of the scope of their cosmopolitan commitment. While almost all global democrats see individuals as the fundamental object of concern, many proponents argue that relational qualities still matter in generating normative prescriptions (Miller 1995). As such, ‘national communities’ or ‘humanity’ may well be important groups that deserve standing in global democratic politics for moral or pragmatic reasons.

Several other intrinsic arguments, though, have been made in literature. These claims all suggest that global democracy is morally desirable irrespective of the benefits generated. For instance, many scholars have suggested that global democracy embodies equality, autonomy, non-domination, and human rights (see respectively: Erman 2012; Held 1995; Bohman 2007; Goodhart 2008). These fundamental rights should be valued for their own sake and therefore provide an additional moral foundation—related to, but sometimes distinct from, cosmopolitanism—for pursuing democracy beyond borders. These arguments are most common amongst liberal democrats and neo-Roman republicans (Pettit 1997).

Other scholars put instrumental considerations at the fore. In this vein, proponents have maintained that global democracy is required for epistemic, problem-solving, justice, and legitimacy-based reasons. John Dryzek (2000) has noted that democracy enables a wide-variety of perspectives to shape policy and thus increases the chances of making the ‘correct’ decision (see also Landemore 2013). Similarly, scholars in the pragmatist tradition of John Dewey have suggested that global democracy is required to generate compliance with international rules and thus solve collective action problems such as climate change (Bray 2013). By participating in the formation of law-making, individuals are more likely to comply with the agreement. Laura Valentini (2012) has claimed that global democracy is required for global justice. Democratic mechanisms need to be in place to sort out reasonable disagreements as to how resources should be allocated. Finally, Michael Zürn and his co-authors (2012) suggest that global democratic procedures can help provide IOs with important stocks of sociological legitimacy and hence avoid complications of politicization (see also Buchanan and Keohane 2006).

2. Models of Global Democracy

There are many different proposals for global democracy and, correspondingly, many different taxonomical divisions have been developed. For instance, Scholte (2014) divides the literature into ‘statist’ and ‘modern cosmopolitan’ approaches. Archibugi et al. (2012, 7) suggest a tripartite (ideal-typical) break between federalist (world state), confederalist (intergovernmental democratic states), and polycentric (pluralist) prescriptions for global democracy. And Gráinne de Búrca (2008, 117) identifies three strands in the current literature to which she affixes the nomenclature of a ‘denial approach,’ a ‘wishful thinking approach,’ and a ‘compensatory approach.’ This entry takes a different tack by presenting five different ‘models’ of global democracy. Models represent idealized theoretical constructions designed to express the normative qualities of a democratic system as well as its constitutive institutions. Models tend to fit together as whole pieces, and are thus relatively discrete and well-developed proposals. The following subsections outline five prominent models. Specific attention is paid to the normative underpinnings, institutional design, and problems of feasibility and desirability associated with each model.

2.1 Intergovernmental Democratic States

Proponents of this model contend that world politics is democratic to the extent that each sovereign state is internally democratic with a functioning government and rule of law. Citizens thus have democratic representation beyond the state through their national government. This tradition has been developed and continued by Immanuel Kant, Robert Dahl, Ingeborg Maus, John Rawls, and many others. The crucial normative ideal underpinning this model is liberal and cosmopolitan in orientation: all individuals deserve an equal chance to participate in the rule-making that governs their lives. This is necessary for citizens to have liberty and self-determination. Unlike other cosmopolitans, though, these theorists argue that the nation-state plays a key normative and practical role in global democracy.

Befitting a model that has a long history in democratic thought, different institutional designs have been offered. In Perpetual Peace, for instance, Kant (1991 [1795]) argued for a global federation of peoples composed of republican (i.e. democratic) states. In this federation, states would observe a cosmopolitan right to hospitality, aid, and territory. John Rawls (1999) similarly advocated an international ‘law of peoples’ in which liberal democratic states (and decent states) establish international laws that generate a peaceful and tolerant international order. Some scholars in this line, such as Robert Keohane, Andrew Moravcsik, and Stephen Macedo (2009), have gone even further and suggested that IOs can help keep peace between states (a core Kantian claim), and safeguard democracy, deliberation, and human rights. Transnational activities are democratically legitimate from the perspective of citizens so long as each nation-state maintains autonomy and sovereignty in global affairs. This allows supranational competences to be controlled and even revoked by member-states and their leaders (Zürn 2000).

Although this model has been prominent in the global democracy field, it has several problems. First, only around 50 per cent of nation-states today are democratic. As such, much of the world’s population is without democratic representation at either the national or transnational level. Second, nation-states do not have complete control over international institutions. IR scholars increasingly note that IOs, which are delegated authority from nation-states, suffer from ‘agency slack’. This means that actors within IOs (diplomats, bureaucrats, and so on) are able to carve out their own space for action. This power cannot easily be controlled or recaptured by member-states. Finally, transnational networks and private forms of governance have proliferated beyond the state. These agents often have the capacity to create global regulations which impact on domestic citizens. Nation-states typically have no direct say in these bodies. As such, the intergovernmental model provides many interesting insights, but has failed to keep pace with empirical developments.

2.2 Cosmopolitan Democracy

Cosmopolitan democracy is perhaps the most well-known model of global democracy. The core idea is to lift statist institutions to the global level in an on-going effort for democratization. David Held, Daniele Archibugi, and Simon Caney have all been prominent advocates. Normatively, the model rests on a foundation of autonomy: creating global political conditions that allow individuals to shape and direct their own lives. This requires, at the least, a system which protects human rights and provides democratic mechanisms for citizen input (Goodhart 2005). This model is also explicitly cosmopolitan as it is supposed to apply to all individuals across the globe.

Institutionally, cosmopolitan democracy stops short of a fully-fledged world government. As David Held (2003, 478) notes, “a cosmopolitan polity does not call for a diminution per se of state power and capacity across the globe. Rather it seeks to entrench and develop political institutions at regional and global level as necessary complements to those at the level of the state.” This occurs by replicating national democratic institutions at the transnational and global levels, such as the creation of a global parliamentary assembly, international courts, and a constitutional rule of law (Falk and Strauss 2001; Goodin 2010). These institutions provide a framework to shield human rights and exercise individual autonomy by voting in global elections. Moreover, these institutions are charged with effectively regulating transnational problems that national institutions cannot tackle alone: climate change, the diffusion of nuclear weapons, and financial markets. This particular model has given rise to a long-running campaign for the creation of a United Nations Parliamentary Assembly (see Other Internet Resources section).

This model is also not without complication. First, the proposals are often thought to be infeasible. By this, critics usually mean that there is a lack of political will to establish organizations such as a global parliament which would remove some sovereign powers from nation-states. Although Held (1995) and Archibugi (2008) often claim that cosmopolitan democracy should be separated into short-term targets and longer-term ideals, it is not always clear which agents would pursue the model nor how current institutional arrangements could be overcome (though see Archibugi and Held (2011) for some suggestions). Would the IMF, the World Bank, or the International Accounting Standards Board, for example, readily give up their control over global financial governance? Some critics also charge the cosmopolitan model with being undesirable. Although the project is designed to reduce the global democratic deficit, it does so by reproducing liberal democratic institutions beyond the state. Postcolonial arguments have been made against this reliance on liberal institutions which represent a specific form of (Western) democracy that emerged from Europe and the United State (Scholte 2014).

2.3 World Government

A world government has also been seen as a potential response to the global democratic deficit. Scholarship on world government has a long history in academia and social commentary: Hugo Grotius, Jeremy Bentham and Abbé de Saint-Pierre in the former camp; Albert Einstein, HG Wells, and Martin Luther King in the latter. Recently, the concept has seen a revival in the work of Luis Cabrera (2004), Andrew Kuper (2004), Torbjörn Tännsjö (2008), and Jürgen Habermas (2006). World government proposals are justified in terms of both intrinsic and instrumental concerns. On the intrinsic side, world government advocates take a cosmopolitan stance and demand equal respect for all individuals. As such, individuals should have equal say in how transnational rules are formed to reduce the global democratic deficit. This intrinsic claim is often coupled with justice-based arguments concerning a fairer distribution of resources (Marchetti 2008). On the instrumental side, those such as Tännsjö (2008) contend that a world government is necessary to overcome global problems such as war and ecological disaster.

World government proponents seek a highly centralized and federal global system. As Cabrera (2004, 71) notes, a world government would require a “restructuring of the global system to bring states under the authority of just supranational institutions.” A central government would sit at the core with autonomous and coercive decision-making potential. As with cosmopolitan democracy, a world government would also entail a directly-elected global parliament, empowered courts, and a singular global constitution which explicates basic rights and duties for all. In many cases, proponents stipulate that a world government could come about through a major recalibration of the United Nations General Assembly. Famously, Habermas has also argued for a three-tiered hierarchical global system in which supranational, transnational, and national institutions are implemented to secure rights, peace, and global democracy. Although Habermas might deny advocating a world government, William Scheuerman (2008, 148) argues that Habermas’s attempt to pursue stronger supranational governance combined with a global constitution would have that result.

Despite Alexander Wendt’s (2003) teleological claim that a world government is ‘inevitable’, many people deride the concept as infeasible. Without another major crisis (such as a world war) to prompt international action, it is difficult to envisage why states would readily give sovereign power to a global state and who precisely would take the lead in this process. Although UN reform is often cited as one pathway forward, the veto position held in the Security Council by the United States, China, Russia, France, and the United Kingdom undermines that option. From the perspective of desirability, moreover, opponents have argued that a world government would actually exacerbate the global democratic deficit. For example, Kant argued that a world government would become a ‘soulless despotism’ as global leaders abused their power without appropriate checks and balances. Other scholars have also suggested a world government—in which citizens have one vote from a constituency of seven billion—would be essentially meaningless and not enable individuals to participate meaningfully in their collective governance.

2.4 Deliberative Democracy

Global democracy scholarship has also been infused by myriad deliberative democratic proposals. This model suggests that global politics can be democratized by pursuing deliberation—the give and take of non-coercive and reasoned arguments—in various formal and informal sites. A vast number of authors have promoted this model, including John Dryzek, Seyla Benhabib, Karin Bäckstrand, and James Bohman. The fundamental normative ideal is that non-coercive, reciprocal, and generalizable deliberation should guide action, and that decision-making be justified to those affected (Forst 2011). Individuals should be free to put their ideas forward under egalitarian conditions, take on-board the ideas of others, and recalibrate preferences in line with ‘better arguments’. This helps to respect the autonomy of different agents while also enhancing the epistemic quality of decision-making. This model has clear connections with a ‘stakeholder model’ of global democracy, in which those individuals significantly affected by a global decision should be able to deliberate over how public power is exercised and how power wielders are held to account (Macdonald 2008).

This model seeks the deliberative democratization of informal and formal sites of existing governance arrangements from the local to the global level. As such, the institutional design task is usually about recalibrating current institutions and organizations to reflect non-coercive argumentation rather than creating new bodies. At the informal level, some deliberative democrats point to transnational public spheres as appropriate sites for democratic agency (Steffek 2010). Indeed, some claim that a global civil society has emerged which provides a space—separate from the state and the market—for individuals to deliberate, shape preferences, and create shared goals (Dryzek 2000). The model also calls for the deliberation democratization of formal sites, such as WTO negotiations, IMF loan deals, and regional treaty agreements (Bäckstrand 2006). By making negotiations more deliberative—responsive to the reasoned arguments of affected individuals—world politics becomes more democratic. At the intersection of formal and informal proposals, deliberative democrats often point to the increasing inclusion of non-state actors in formal organizations as a step toward global democracy (Dryzek 2012). As NGOs, youth groups, epistemic communities, and business organizations gain access to sites of international decision-making, this helps increase the diversity of viewpoints and provides non-state groups with a way to contest traditional IGO negotiations (Tallberg et al. 2013). Many actors in global civil society have accused IOs of suffering from a democratic deficit as a strategy to gain inclusion. This highlights the interconnections between academia and policy practice in terms of global democracy.

Global deliberative democracy has had many proponents and even more critics. A fairly standard complaint is that the model fails to provide a specific institutional design which can be sought or realized under existing conditions. Moreover, deliberation is said to suffer from a lack of decisiveness. Voting mechanisms always allow for individuals to cast their preferences with the understanding that 50 per cent plus one vote wins the election. Deliberation provides no mechanism for groups to make definitive decisions, and talking until agreement (consensus) is reached is both time-consuming and potentially unrealizable. In terms of desirability, Eva Erman (2012) has argued that deliberative democrats do not take the notion of equality seriously enough, thus undermining a core ideal of democracy. It is difficult to envisage, Erman suggests, how individuals can have equal opportunity for deliberation in a world of inequality. Relatedly, the inclusion of non-state actors in formal IOs is often seen as a form of cooptation in which civil society actually works in subservience to (and thus legitimates) the established system. This line of criticism could be classified as a ‘governmentality’ critique in the tradition of Foucault. As such, there is a concern that including civil society in deliberation with formal sites of global decision-making exacerbates—rather than reduces—the global democratic deficit.

2.5 Radical Democracy

This model is grounded in an ethics of revolution, in which autonomous, self-governing communities can resist and overthrow the global system of sovereignty and its hierarchical capitalist relations (Bray and Slaughter forthcoming, 158). Variants on this position have been promoted by Michael Hardt and Antonio Negri, Chantal Mouffe, and Jan Aart Scholte. The fundamental normative claim is that collectives can only be emancipated through the rejection of capitalism, property rights, and class-based notions of governance. In other words, these structures create systems of domination and alienation that need to be overcome. According to Hardt and Negri (2000), communities and social movements should challenge the current liberal order of politics and seek new forms of global governance based on cooperation, affection, and nature. This model has close connections with direct forms of democracy.

The institutional design of radical democracy is, almost by definition, underspecified. Proponents argue against the existing global system in which sovereignty has been eclipsed by empire: the subservience of politics to capitalism. It is therefore up to collectives to overhaul current arrangements and establish new forms of governance, the design of which can only emerge through the process of reconstruction itself. Both Chantal Mouffe (2009) and Jan Aart Scholte (2014) are clear that radical democracy entails the rejection of Western, liberal democratic institutions (such as parliaments and constitutions) and their reliance on individualism and capitalism. Rather, Scholte (2014) argues that we should open up our conception of how global democracy should look to take due consideration of transscalarity, plural solidarities, transculturality, egalitarian distribution, and ecology that constitute social and material life.

In terms of feasibility, it is difficult to know how radical global democracy might come about. Although we can point at potential examples—such as the Occupy Wall Street movement or the Zapatista Army—concrete institutional moments are difficult to come by. Moreover, radical democrats are often quick to note that globalization has been coopted by capitalism, and that it reinforces colonial legacies in developing countries. It is hard to comprehend how collectives of free and equal individuals can form in a transnational context where much of the global South is removed from the technological and communicative benefits of globalization. Paradoxically, then, the groups most in need of democratic revolution are precisely those groups with less access to means of transnational activism (the Internet, attending global protests, signing petitions, etc.). Finally, on the issue of desirability, there is little guarantee that a revolution will lead to a better state of global democracy. Revolutions are by definition disruptive, and although capitalism comes with many problems, it is conceivable that the revolutionary outcome of radical democracy may be more deleterious than the current state of affairs.

3. From ‘Model of Democracy’ to ‘Values of Democratization’

The preceding five models provide a brief schematic of how global democracy proposals have typically been crafted in the academic literature. In the recent few years, however, global democratic debates have taken a turn away from ‘models’ toward ‘values of democratization’. This section outlines the core impetus behind this turn and its methodological foundation, and then discusses several prominent examples in the literature.

3.1 Methodological Rationale

Democratic models, as should be clear, provide relatively parsimonious, holistic, and idealized packages that can be pursued at the global level. Archibugi et al. (2012) describe them as ‘terminal endpoints’ that can be strived toward. Although some models provide more detailed and exact institutional design than others, this general way of thinking has dominated global democracy scholarship. However, as Dryzek (2008, 471) has contended, while “models help in thinking, they also constrain thinking.” As such, various authors have argued that global democracy can more usefully be thought of as an on-going process of democratization in which a set of values are more or less fulfilled.

The core idea of this approach is that, instead of treating democracy as an idealized set of institutions which need to be induced beyond the state, we should think about the fundamental principles that democracy demands and strive for them under existing conditions. Such values may include inclusiveness, equality, popular control, transparency, accountability, deliberation, or something else. These values are supposed to be pursued in different institutional locations by various actors in an on-going process. It does not demand any specific ‘end-point’ to work toward. Global politics is more democratic the more these values are fulfilled. This approach has several key methodological advantages over pursuing models of democracy.

First, democracy is often understood as an essentially contested concept (Gallie 1956). Essential contestation does not just mean that different models have different strengths and weaknesses that require attention. Rather, it means that contestation over the meaning of democracy is inherent to the concept itself. Because models provide a holistic bundle of normative commitments and institutions, this is often thought to undercut the dynamic nature of democracy-building (Dryzek 2008). Moreover, because the international system is pluralistic and complex, absolute agreement on any one model to pursue seems unlikely. Focusing on how different democratic values arise in different contexts helps to allay this concern.

Second, engendering models of democracy beyond the state is often derided as being infeasible. This argument stands on several sub-claims (discussed above), but a general problem is that each model of democracy was developed within the national context. As is fairly obvious, the global system is not a state. As such, we cannot know in advance which model is best suited to the global system, or how to go about the initial stages of design. Although scholars such as Mathias Koenig-Archibugi (2011) have done terrific and laborious work showing how the necessary conditions for national democracy can all be met at the global level, it might still be preferable to open our conception of democracy and think about alternate ways, values, and procedures that should be pursued.

Finally, striving for values of democratization helps gain traction on the non-ideal conditions of world politics. Models are, by definition, idealizations and thinking about the transformative process toward any ideal is fraught with difficulties about the nature of the future. In this vein, Amartya Sen (2006) has recently argued that we should not aim for the full realization of any specified model, but rather we should seek to rank alternative values and arrangements derived from the normative concept in question. Erman (2012) has objected to the notion that democracy can be treated as an aggregate concept composed of different democratic values because it fails to recognize that the different values are inter-related. While this is true, other scholars have claimed that separating democracy into core values helps to “identify more clearly how different democratic values relate to each other, to what extent they are in conflict and how such conflicts should be resolved in particular circumstances” (Dingwerth 2014, 18).

3.2 Examples in the Literature

There are many ways to think about pursuing values of democratization in world politics. One prominent example comes from recent international political theory and the work of Adrian Little and Kate Macdonald (2013). These authors argue that the notion of ‘democratic practice’ should guide global reform. This approach frees itself from ‘institutionally-specific’ goals and rather seeks “a progressive process of democratization” (Little and Macdonald 2013, 749). These authors identify political control and popular equality as requisite values that should be employed to guide social critique and transformation. To the extent that individuals have more equitable control over how transnational political power is exercised, global democratization is enhanced. A similar approach is employed by Terry Macdonald and Kate Macdonald (2006) in their work on democratizing supply chain governance. These authors argue that global politics can be democratized through a series of decentralized, non-electoral mechanisms that help reassert public control over decision-making.

Values of democratization have also been promoted by international lawyers (Cohen and Sabel 2006). Gráinne de Búrca, in a 2008 article, advocates a ‘democracy striving approach’ which highlights the dynamic and inchoateness of democracy. The basic idea is to identify the core principles (or ‘building blocks’) of democracy and strive for those values beyond the state. De Búrca (2008, 129–36) identifies political equality, participation, and representation as key values. Nico Krisch, in a book from 2010, has argued that international law can be democratized by seeking accountability, deliberation, and contestation in different issue spaces. Krisch suggests that the heterarchical and uneven terrain of global legal orders actually allow these values to come to the fore, and underscores this argument through case study analysis of the European Human Rights regime, UN Security Council rulings on terrorism, and genetically modified food governance.

Finally, several IR scholars have also contended that global affairs can be democratized by pursuing democratic values in different ways. Karin Bäckstrand (2006), for instance, suggests that global climate governance could be democratized through a stakeholder model which blends deliberation, participation, and accountability. Jonathan Kuyper (2014) argues that different issue areas of world politics can likewise be democratized by pursuing values of equal participation, accountability, and revisability. This argument is tested and developed in the issue space of intellectual property rights governance. Magdalena Bexell and her co-authors (2010) focus on the values of participation and accountability in global governance and document how non-state actors help induce (or undercut) these desiderata.

Overall, the notion that world politics can be democratized by myriad agents pursuing different democratic values in diverse fora has emerged as a nascent way to think about reducing the global democratic deficit. While this approach has clear benefits, it also comes with complications. First, the lack of an institutional blueprint makes the design process much more opaque than several of the models offered previously. Second, it is not immediately clear why we should seek some values over others and what we should do when values conflict with one another. Finally, this approach might unnecessarily reify the status quo. Without systematic and comparative analysis, proponents risk ‘cherry picking’ good examples that highlight how democratic values can be attained while failing to elaborate how really difficult situations can be transformed. This all indicates that this turn in the literature requires much further research.

4. Persistent Criticisms and Future Research

Although democracy is widely regarded as an ideal worth attaining, critics of global democracy have been numerous and persistent (Miller 1995; Dahl 1999; Moravcsik 2004). A variety of strong objections have been raised to the fundamental project of global democracy, as well as specific criticisms about institutional proposals and methodology. It is not possible to undertake a survey of all criticisms in the literature (and several core issues have already been discussed in the previous sections). The final section, however, will outline two core issues that global democrats need to grapple with in current and future research. Both subsections relate to the issue of power.

4.1 Realism and Global Politics

Scholarship on global democracy is often charged with failing to deal with issues of power. This is particularly problematic because IR theorists have, for many years, highlighted the anarchical and power-laden nature of international politics (Morgenthau 1954). This view is especially prominent among realists and neo-realists who claim that states are the fundamental units of world politics, and that power—understood as material capabilities—is the main currency of transnational interaction. Drawing parallels with Hobbes’s state of nature, realists argue that anarchy forces states into a situation of self-help which, in turn, creates security dilemmas as states seek to defend their sovereign borders. International institutions, when they do exist, reflect the prevailing distribution of power and the interests of dominant states. Although neo-liberal theorists (such as Robert Keohane) and constructivists (such as Alexander Wendt) have argued that cooperation between states can be attained under anarchy, these camps still agree that power politics dominates transnational affairs.

Global democracy, as should be clear, requires the equal inclusion of individuals in transnational decision-making processes. For most IR theorists, this is simply impossible. States are the key players in world politics, and individuals have standing only through their national political system. Although Pareto optimal (i.e. mutually-beneficial) forms of international cooperation can occur in world politics, states will always strive for more power and exploit relative differentials in material capabilities to fulfill national preferences. The drive and desire of each national government to maximize their absolute and relative power vis-à-vis other states directly undercuts the cosmopolitan ideal upon which global democracy is (typically) predicated.

Although realist theories have much explanatory power, neo-liberal and constructivist scholars increasingly point to the constraining nature of law and ideas in world politics. Constructivists, in particular, have forcefully noted that ‘anarchy is what states make of it’ (Wendt 2003, 491). In other words, the realist interpretation of world politics is precisely that: a cultural and historical interpretation. The fundamental nature of international society can and does change over time, and therefore new forms of social and political interactions are always possible. This suggests that power politics is not some immutable condition of international affairs, but rather a situation that can be overcome through new forms of cognition, cooperation, and contestation. As such, cosmopolitan notions of global democracy are certainly conceivable. As Linklater (1998) argues, emerging dialogical communities of affected peoples are creating transnational social relations that are more universalistic, less unequal, and have greater sensitivity to cultural differences.

In sum, global democrats would do well to tackle more directly issues of power politics and engage with core debates in IR. This may allow for insights to be shed on both topics. IR schools—such as realism, neo-realism, neo-liberalism, constructivism, and communicative action—have traditionally been concerned with social-scientific, historical, and explanatory analysis. These camps have been less willing or able to question their own normative underpinnings or offer critical prescriptions for future design. Inversely, global democrats have had a predominantly normative orientation, but neglected to engage rigorously with social-scientific methodology or make full use of the empirical analysis offered by IR scholars. As such, fruitful cross-fertilization may be possible as we seek to understand how normative values can be pursued under existing conditions of material differentials where the threat of international and civil war, climate change disaster, financial crises, and many other issues still loom large.

4.2 Global Democracy, Legitimacy, and Justice

It is not just IR scholars who have accused global democrats of failing to deal adequately with issues of power. Increasingly within the broader field of normative international political theory, there is recognition that questions of power and conflict have been relegated in favor of global justice (Beitz 1979). Of course, global democrats are fundamentally interested in how transnational decision-making is exercised and who has a democratic say in the formulation of rules and norms. But these issues are often eclipsed by issues of poverty, resource distribution, and inequality (Pogge 1992).

When global democrats tackle the notion of power, they do so through a specific lens: they are interested, predominantly, in how ‘the people’ can collectively rule themselves and potentially check the exercise of arbitrary power (Bohman 2007). Recently, several scholars have complained that this focus is too narrow to take proper consideration of how power can be legitimated within the global system. Macdonald and Ronzoni (2012), following in the footsteps of Bernard Williams, suggest that legitimacy may be a value separable from—and not reducible to—democracy or justice. As such, we need to think about different ways of legitimating global power that take seriously the unique context of world politics. This might entail looking at values such as stability, sociological acceptance, juridification, or arbitration. Analyzing how these standards foster legitimacy in transnational institutions may actually help shed light on the fundamental constitutive features of the global political order (Macdonald and Ronzoni 2012, 525) and the limits of global democratization.

At any rate, much work remains to think about how justice, democracy, and legitimacy intersect and diverge in both theoretical and empirical terms (Dingwerth 2014). This will entail looking at whether the current arrangements of international institutions are sufficiently strong to trigger demands of justice, democracy, or both (Nagel 2005; Sangiovanni 2007). It will also require analysis of legitimacy as a separable virtue of global political institutions with its own character and composition that may only tangentially relate to democracy. Finally, questions remain over whether a demos—a group of individuals due democratic standing in the exercise of political power—can emerge across national borders in coherent and stable ways. These future directions for research—as well as many of the other issues addressed in this review—should ensure that global democracy remains an active, vibrant, and important field of practice and study in years to come.


  • Agné, Hans, 2006, “A dogma of democratic theory and globalization: why politics need not include everyone it affects,” European Journal of International Relations, 12(3): 433–458.
  • Archibugi, Daniele, 2008, The Global Commonwealth of Citizens: Toward Cosmopolitan Democracy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, Koenig-Archibugi, Mathias, and Marchetti, Raffaele (eds.), 2012, Global Democracy: Normative and Empirical Perspectives, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, and Held, David, 2011, “Cosmopolitan democracy: paths and agents,” Ethics & International Affairs, 25(4): 433–61.
  • Bäckstrand, Karin, 2006, “Democratizing Global Environmental Governance? Stakeholder Democracy after the World Summit on Sustainable Development,” European Journal of International Relations, 12(4): 467–498.
  • Beitz, Charles R., 1979, Political Theory and International Relations, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bexell, Magdalena, Tallberg, Jonas, and Uhlin, Anders, 2010, “Democracy in Global Governance: The Promises and Pitfalls of Transnational Actors,” Global Governance, 16(1): 81–101.
  • Bohman, James, 2007, Democracy across Borders: From Dêmos to Dêmoi, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Bray, Daniel, 2013, “Pragmatist Ethics and the Will to Believe in Cosmopolitanism,” International Theory, 5(3): 446–76.
  • –––, and Slaughter, Steven, 2014, Global Democratic Theory: Problems and Possibilities, Cambridge: Polity.
  • Buchanan, Allen and Keohane, Robert O., 2006, “The Legitimacy of Global Governance Institutions,” Ethics and International Affairs, 20(4): 405–437.
  • Cabrera, Luis, 2004, Political Theory of Global Justice: A Cosmopolitan Case for the World State, London: Routledge.
  • Cohen, Joshua and Sabel, Charles, 2006, “Global Democracy?” New York University Journal of International Law and Politics, 37(4): 763–797.
  • Dahl, Robert A., 1999, “Can international organizations be democratic? A skeptic's view,” In Ian Shapiro and Casiano Hacker-Cordón, (eds.) Democracy's Edges. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 19–36.
  • de Búrca, Grainne, 2008, “Developing Democracy Beyond the State,” Columbia Journal of Transnational Law, 46(2): 101–158.
  • Dingwerth, Klaus, 2014, “Global democracy and the democratic minimum: Why a procedural account alone is insufficient,” European Journal of International Relations, 20(4): 1124–1147. doi:10.1177/1354066113509116
  • Dryzek, John, 2000, Deliberative Democracy and Beyond: Liberals, Critics, Contestations, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2008, “Two paths to global democracy,” Ethical Perspectives, 15(4): 469–486.
  • –––, 2012, “Global civil society: the progress of post-Westphalian politics,” Annual Review of Political Science, 15: 101–19.
  • Erman, Eva, 2012, “In Search of Democratic Agency in Deliberative Governance,” European Journal of International Relations, 19(4): 847–68.
  • Falk, Richard, and Strauss, Andrew, 2001, “Toward Global Parliament,” Foreign Affairs, 80(1): 212–20.
  • Forst, Rainer, 2011, The Right to Justification: Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Gallie, Walter B., 1956, “Essentially contested concepts,” Proceedings of the Aristotelean Society, 56: 167–198.
  • Giddens, Anthony, 1985, A Contemporary Critique of Historical Materialism, Vol. 2: The Nation State and Violence, Cambridge: Polity.
  • Goodhart, Michael, 2005, Democracy as Human Rights: Freedom and Equality in the Age of Globalization, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2008, “Human Rights and Global Democracy,” Ethics & International Affairs, 22(4): 395–420.
  • Goodin, Robert E., 2007, “Enfranchising All Affected Interests, and Its Alternatives,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 35(1): 40–68.
  • –––, 2010, “Global democracy: in the beginning,” International Theory, 2(2): 175–209.
  • Habermas, Jürgen, 1996, Between Facts and Norms: Contributions to a Discourse Theory of Law and Democracy, W. Rehg (trans.). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. [German, 1992b]
  • –––, 2001, The Postnational Constellation, M. Pensky (trans., ed.). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. [German, 1998c]
  • –––, 2006, The Divided West, C. Cronin (trans.). Cambridge: Polity. [German, 2004].
  • Hardt, Michael, and Negri, Antonio, 2000, Empire. , Cambridge, MA and New York: Harvard University Press.
  • Held, David, 1995, Democracy and the Global Order, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • –––, 2002, “Cosmopolitanism: Globalization Tamed?” Review of International Studies, 29(4): 465–480.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1986 [1651], Leviathan, Markham: Penguin.
  • Huntington, Samuel, 1991, The Third Wave: Democratization in the Late Twentieth Century, Oklahoma: University of Oklahoma Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1991 [1795], “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose” and “Perpetual Peace: A Philosophical Sketch,” in Political Writings, H. B. Nisbet (trans.), Hans Reiss (ed.), 2nd ed., New York: Cambridge University Press, 41–53 and 93–130.
  • Keane, John, 2009, The Life and Death of Democracy, London: Simon & Schuster.
  • Keohane, Robert O., Macedo, Stephen, and Moravcsik, Andrew, 2009, “Democracy-Enhancing Multilateralism,” International Organization, 63(1): 1–31.
  • Koenig-Archibugi, Mathias, 2011, “Is Global Democracy Possible?” European Journal of International Relations, 17(3): 519–542.
  • Kuper, Andrew, 2004, Democracy beyond Borders: Justice and Representation in Global Institutions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kuyper, Jonathan W., 2014, “Global Democratization and International Regime Complexity,” European Journal of International Relations, 20(3): 620–46.
  • Landemore, Hélène, 2013, Democratic Reason: Politics, Collective Intelligence, and the Rule of the Many, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Linklater, Andrew, 1998, The Transformation of Political Community, Columbia: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Little, Adrian, and Macdonald, Kate, 2013, “Pathways to Global Democracy? Escaping the Statist Imaginary,” Review of International Studies, 39(4): 789–813.
  • Macdonald, Terry, 2008, Global Stakeholder Democracy: Power and Representation Beyond Liberal States, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, and Macdonald, Kate, 2006, “Non-Electoral Accountability in Global Politics: Strengthening Democratic Control within the Global Garment Industry,” European Journal of International Law, 17(1): 89–119.
  • –––, and Ronzoni, Miriam, 2012, “Introduction: the idea of global political Justice,” Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 15(5): 521–33.
  • Marchetti, Raffaele, 2008, Global Democracy: For and Against, New York: Routledge.
  • Miller, David, 1995, On Nationality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Moravcsik, Andrew, 2004, “Is there a ‘democratic deficit’ in world politics? A framework For analysis,” Government and Opposition, 39(2): 336–363.
  • Morgenthau, Hans J., 1954, Politics among Nations: The Struggle for Power and Peace, 2nd ed., New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
  • Mouffe, Chantal, 2009, “Democracy in a multipolar world,” Millennium, 37(3): 549–561.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 2005, “The Problem of Global Justice,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 33(2): 113–147.
  • Pettit, Philip, 1997, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pogge, Thomas, 1992, “Cosmopolitanism and Sovereignty,” Ethics, 103(1): 48–75.
  • Rawls, John, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1999, The Law of Peoples, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ruggie, John, G., 1998, “What Makes the World Hang Together? Neo-Utilitarianism and the Social Constructivist Challenge,” International Organization, 52(4): 855–85.
  • Sangiovanni, Andrea, 2007, “Global Justice, Reciprocity, and the State,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 35(1): 3–39.
  • Sassen, Saskia, 2003, “Globalization or denationalization?” Review of International Political Economy, 10(1): 1–22.
  • Scheuerman, William E., 2008, “Global Governance without Global Government? Habermas on Postnational Democracy,” Political Theory, 36(1): 133–151.
  • Scholte, Jan Aart, 2000, Globalization: A Critical Introduction, New York: St. Martin's.
  • –––, 2014, “Reinventing Global Democracy,” European Journal of International Relations, 20(1): 3–28.
  • Sen, Amartya, 2006, “What do we want from a theory of justice?” The Journal of Philosophy, 103(5): 215–38.
  • Singer, Peter, 1973, Democracy and Disobedience, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Steffek, Jens, 2010, “Public accountability and the public sphere of international governance,” Ethics and International Affairs, 24(1): 45–67.
  • Tallberg, Jonas, Thomas Sommerer, Theresa Squatrito, and Christer Jönsson, 2013, The opening up of international organizations, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tännsjö, Torbjörn, 2008, Global Democracy: The Case for a World Government, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Valentini, Laura, 2012, “Assessing the global order: Justice, legitimacy, or political justice?” Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 15(5): 593–612.
  • Wendt, Alexander, 2003, “Why a World State is Inevitable,” European Journal of International Relations, 9(4): 491–542.
  • Zürn, Michael, 2000, “Democratic Governance Beyond the Nation-State: The EU and Other International Institutions,” European Journal of International Relations, 6(2): 183–221.
  • –––, Binder, Martin, and Ecker-Ehrhardt, Mattias, 2012, “International Authority and its Politicization,” International Theory, 4(1): 69–106.

Copyright © 2015 by
Jonathan Kuyper <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free