Human rights are norms that aspire to protect all people everywhere from severe political, legal, and social abuses. Examples of human rights are the right to freedom of religion, the right to a fair trial when charged with a crime, the right not to be tortured, and the right to education.
The philosophy of human rights addresses questions about the existence, content, nature, universality, justification, and legal status of human rights. The strong claims often made on behalf of human rights (for example, that they are universal, inalienable, or exist independently of legal enactment as justified moral norms) have frequently provoked skeptical doubts and countering philosophical defenses (on these critiques see Lacrois and Pranchere 2016, Mutua 2008, and Waldron 1988). Reflection on these doubts and the responses that can be made to them has become a sub-field of political and legal philosophy with a very substantial literature (see the Bibliography below).
This entry addresses the concept of human rights, the existence and grounds of human rights, the question of which rights are human rights, and relativism about human rights.
- 1. The General Idea of Human Rights
- 2. The Existence and Grounds of Human Rights
- 3. Which Rights are Human Rights?
- 4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices
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1. The General Idea of Human Rights
This section attempts to explain the general idea of human rights by identifying four defining features. The goal is to answer the question of what human rights are with a description of the core concept rather than a list of specific rights. Two people can have the same general idea of human rights even though they disagree about which rights belong on a list of such rights and even about whether universal moral rights exist. The four-part explanation below attempts to cover all kinds of human rights including both moral and legal human rights and both old and new human rights (e.g., both Lockean natural rights and contemporary human rights). The explanation anticipates, however, that particular kinds of human rights will have additional features. Starting with this general concept does not commit us to treating all kinds of human rights in a single unified theory (see Buchanan 2013 for an argument that we should not attempt to theorize together universal moral rights and international legal human rights).
(1) Human rights are rights. Lest we miss the obvious, human rights are rights (see Cruft 2012 and the entry on rights ). Most if not all human rights are claim rights that impose duties or responsibilities on their addressees or dutybearers. Rights focus on a freedom, protection, status, or benefit for the rightholders (Beitz 2009). The duties associated with human rights often require actions involving respect, protection, facilitation, and provision. Rights are usually mandatory in the sense of imposing duties on their addressees, but some legal human rights seem to do little more than declare high-priority goals and assign responsibility for their progressive realization. One can argue, of course, that goal-like rights are not real rights, but it may be better to recognize that they comprise a weak but useful notion of a right (See Beitz 2009 for a defense of the view that not all human rights are rights in a strong sense. And see Feinberg 1973 for the idea of “manifesto rights”). A human rights norm might exist as (a) a shared norm of actual human moralities, (b) a justified moral norm supported by strong reasons, (c) a legal right at the national level (where it might be referred to as a “civil” or “constitutional” right), or (d) a legal right within international law. A human rights advocate might wish to see human rights exist in all four ways (See Section 2.1 How Can Human Rights Exist?).
(2) Human rights are plural. If someone accepted that there are human rights but held that there is only one of them, this might make sense if she meant that there is one abstract underlying right that generates a list of specific rights (See Dworkin 2011 for a view of this sort). But if this person meant that there is just one specific right such as the right to peaceful assembly this would be a highly revisionary view. Human rights address a variety of specific problems such as guaranteeing fair trials, ending slavery, ensuring the availability of education, and preventing genocide. Some philosophers advocate very short lists of human rights but nevertheless accept plurality (see Cohen 2004, Ignatieff 2004).
(3) Human rights are universal. All living humans—or perhaps all living persons—have human rights. One does not have to be a particular kind of person or a member of some specific nation or religion to have human rights. Included in the idea of universality is some conception of independent existence. People have human rights independently of whether they are found in the practices, morality, or law of their country or culture. This idea of universality needs several qualifications, however. First, some rights, such as the right to vote, are held only by adult citizens or residents and apply only to voting in one’s own country. Second, the human right to freedom of movement may be taken away temporarily from a person who is convicted of committing a serious crime. And third, some human rights treaties focus on the rights of vulnerable groups such as minorities, women, indigenous peoples, and children.
(4) Human rights have high-priority. Maurice Cranston held that human rights are matters of “paramount importance” and their violation “a grave affront to justice” (Cranston 1967). If human rights did not have high priority they would not have the ability to compete with other powerful considerations such as national stability and security, individual and national self-determination, and national and global prosperity. High priority does not mean, however, that human rights are absolute. As James Griffin says, human rights should be understood as “resistant to trade-offs, but not too resistant” (Griffin 2008). Further, there seems to be priority variation within human rights. For example, when the right to life conflicts with the right to privacy, the latter will generally be outweighed.
Let’s now consider five other features or functions that might be added.
Should human rights be defined as inalienable? Inalienability does not mean that rights are absolute or can never be overridden by other considerations. Rather it means that its holder cannot lose it temporarily or permanently by bad conduct or by voluntarily giving it up. It is doubtful that all human rights are inalienable in this sense. One who endorses both human rights and imprisonment as punishment for serious crimes must hold that people’s rights to freedom of movement can be forfeited temporarily or permanently by just convictions of serious crimes. Perhaps it is sufficient to say that human rights are very hard to lose. (For a stronger view of inalienability, see Donnelly 2003, Meyers 1985).
Should human rights be defined as minimal rights? A number of philosophers have proposed the view that human rights are minimal in the sense of not being too numerous (a few dozen rights rather than hundreds or thousands), and not being too demanding (See Joshua Cohen 2004, Ignatieff 2005, and Rawls 1999). Their views suggest that human rights are—or should be—more concerned with avoiding the worst than with achieving the best. Henry Shue suggests that human rights concern the “lower limits on tolerable human conduct” rather than “great aspirations and exalted ideals” (Shue 1996). When human rights are modest standards they leave most legal and policy matters open to democratic decision-making at the national and local levels. This allows human rights to have high priority, to accommodate a great deal of cultural and institutional variation among countries, and to leave open a large space for democratic decision-making at the national level. Still, there is no contradiction in the idea of an extremely expansive list of human rights and hence minimalism is not a defining feature of human rights (for criticism of the view that human rights are minimal standards see Brems 2009 and Raz 2010). Minimalism is best seen as a normative prescription for what international human rights should be. Moderate forms of minimalism have considerable appeal, but not as part of the definition of human rights.
Should human rights be defined as always being or “mirroring” moral rights? Philosophers coming to human rights theory from moral philosophy sometimes assume that human rights must be, at bottom, moral rather than legal rights. There is no contradiction, however, in people saying that they believe in human rights, but only when they are legal rights at the national or international levels. As Louis Henkin observed, “Political forces have mooted the principal philosophical objections, bridging the chasm between natural and positive law by converting natural human rights into positive legal rights” (Henkin 1978). Theorists who insist that the only human rights are legal rights may find, however, that the interpretations they can give of universality, independent existence, and high priority are weak.
Should human rights be defined in terms of serving some sort of political function? Instead of seeing human rights as grounded in some sort of independently existing moral reality, a theorist might see them as the norms of a highly useful political practice that humans have constructed or evolved. Such a view would see the idea of human rights as playing various political roles at the national and international levels and as serving thereby to protect urgent human and national interests. These political roles might include providing standards for international evaluations of how governments treat their people and specifying when use of economic sanctions or military intervention is permissible (see Section 2.3 Political Conceptions of Human Rights below).
Political theorists would add to the four defining elements suggested above some set of political roles or functions. This kind of view may be plausible for the very salient international human rights that have emerged in international law and politics in the last fifty years. But human rights can exist and function in contexts not involving international scrutiny and intervention such as a world with only one state. Imagine, for example, that an asteroid strike had killed everyone in all countries except New Zealand, leaving it the only state in existence. Surely the idea of human rights as well as many dimensions of human rights practice could continue in New Zealand, even though there would be no international relations, law, or politics (for an argument of this sort see Tasioulas 2012). And if in the same scenario a few people were discovered to have survived in Iceland and were living without a government or state, New Zealanders would know that human rights governed how these people should be treated even though they were stateless. How deeply the idea of human rights must be rooted in international law and practice should not be settled by definitional fiat. We can allow, however, that the sorts of political functions that Rawls and Beitz describe are typically served by international human rights today.
2. The Existence and Grounds of Human Rights
2.1 How Can Human Rights Exist?
A philosophical question about human rights that occurs to many people is how it is possible for such rights to exist. Several possible ways are explored in this section.
The most obvious way in which human rights come into existence is as norms of national and international law that are created by enactment, custom, and judicial decisions. At the international level, human rights norms exist because of treaties that have turned them into international law. For example, the human right not to be held in slavery or servitude in Article 4 of the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (Council of Europe, 1950) and in Article 8 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (UN 1966) exists because these treaties establish it. At the national level, human rights norms exist because they have through legislative enactment, judicial decision, or custom become part of a country’s law. For example, the right against slavery exists in the United States because the 13th Amendment to the U.S. Constitution prohibits slavery and servitude. When rights are embedded in international law we speak of them as human rights; but when they are enacted in national law we more frequently describe them as civil or constitutional rights.
Enactment in national and international law is clearly one of the ways in which human rights exist. But many have suggested that this cannot be the only way. If human rights exist only because of enactment, their availability is contingent on domestic and international political developments. Many people have looked for a way to support the idea that human rights have roots that are deeper and less subject to human decisions than legal enactment. One version of this idea is that people are born with rights, that human rights are somehow innate or inherent in human beings (see Morsink 2009). One way that a normative status could be inherent in humans is by being God-given. The U.S. Declaration of Independence (1776) claims that people are “endowed by their Creator” with natural rights to life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness. On this view, God, the supreme lawmaker, enacted some basic human rights.
Rights plausibly attributed to divine decree must be very general and abstract (life, liberty, etc.) so that they can apply to thousands of years of human history, not just to recent centuries. But contemporary human rights are specific and many of them presuppose contemporary institutions (e.g., the right to a fair trial and the right to education). Even if people are born with God-given natural rights, we need to explain how to get from those general and abstract rights to the specific rights found in contemporary declarations and treaties.
Attributing human rights to God’s commands may give them a secure status at the metaphysical level, but in a very diverse world it does not make them practically secure. Billions of people do not believe in the God of Christianity, Islam, and Judaism. If people do not believe in God, or in the sort of god that prescribes rights, and if you want to base human rights on theological beliefs you must persuade these people of a rights-supporting theological view. This is likely to be even harder than persuading them of human rights. Legal enactment at the national and international levels provides a far more secure status for practical purposes.
Human rights could also exist independently of legal enactment by being part of actual human moralities. All human groups seem to have moralities in the sense of imperative norms of interpersonal behavior backed by reasons and values. These moralities contain specific norms (for example, a prohibition of the intentional murder of an innocent person) and specific values (for example, valuing human life.) If almost all human groups have moralities containing norms prohibiting murder, these norms could partially constitute the human right to life.
The view that human rights are norms found in all human moralities is attractive but has serious difficulties. Although worldwide acceptance of human rights has been increasing rapidly in recent decades (see 4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices), worldwide moral unanimity about human rights does not exist. Human rights declarations and treaties are intended to change existing norms, not just describe the existing moral consensus.
Yet another way of explaining the existence of human rights is to say that they exist most basically in true or justified ethical outlooks. On this account, to say that there is a human right against torture is mainly to assert that there are strong reasons for believing that it is always morally wrong to engage in torture and that protections should be provided against it. This approach would view the Universal Declaration as attempting to formulate a justified political morality for the whole planet. It was not merely trying to identify a preexisting moral consensus; it was rather trying to create a consensus that could be supported by very plausible moral and practical reasons. This approach requires commitment to the objectivity of such reasons. It holds that just as there are reliable ways of finding out how the physical world works, or what makes buildings sturdy and durable, there are ways of finding out what individuals may justifiably demand of each other and of governments. Even if unanimity about human rights is currently lacking, rational agreement is available to humans if they will commit themselves to open-minded and serious moral and political inquiry. If moral reasons exist independently of human construction, they can—when combined with true premises about current institutions, problems, and resources—generate moral norms different from those currently accepted or enacted. The Universal Declaration seems to proceed on exactly this assumption (see Morsink 2009). One problem with this view is that existence as good reasons seems a rather thin form of existence for human rights. But perhaps we can view this thinness as a practical rather than a theoretical problem, as something to be remedied by the formulation and enactment of legal norms. The best form of existence for human rights would combine robust legal existence with the sort of moral existence that comes from widespread acceptance based on strong moral and practical reasons.
2.2 Normative Justifications for Human Rights
Justifications for human rights should defend their main features including their character as rights, their universality, and their high priority. Such justifications should also be capable of providing starting points for justifying a plausible list of specific rights (on starting points and making the transition to specific rights see Nickel 2007; see also Section 3 Which Rights are Human Rights? below). Further, justifying international human rights is likely to require additional steps (Buchanan 2012). These requirements make the construction of a good justification for human rights a daunting task.
Approaches to justification include grounding human rights in prudential reasons, practical reasons, moral rights (Thomson 1990), human well-being (Sumner 1987, Talbott 2010), fundamental interests (Beitz 2015), human needs (Miller 2012), agency and autonomy (Gewirth 1996, Griffin 2008) dignity (Gilabert 2018, Kateb 2011, Tasioulas 2015), fairness (Nickel 2007), equality, and positive freedom (Gould 2004, Nussbaum 2000, Sen 2004). Justifications can be based on just one of these types of reasons or they can be eclectic and appeal to several (Tasioulas. 2015).
Grounding human rights in human agency and autonomy has had strong advocates in recent decades. For example, in Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Application (1982) Alan Gewirth offered an agency-based justification for human rights. He argued that denying the value of successful agency and action is not an option for a human being; having a life requires regarding the indispensable conditions of agency and action as necessary goods. Abstractly described, these conditions of successful agency are freedom and well-being. A prudent rational agent who must have freedom and well-being will assert a “prudential right claim” to them. Having demanded that others respect her freedom and well-being, consistency requires her to recognize and respect the freedom and well-being of other persons. Since all other agents are in exactly the same position as she is of needing freedom and well-being, consistency requires her to recognize and respect their claims to freedom and well-being. She “logically must accept” that other people as agents have equal rights to freedom and well-being. These two abstract rights work alone and together to generate equal specific human rights of familiar sorts (Gewirth 1978, 1982, 1996). Gewirth’s aspiration was to provide an argument for human rights that applies to all human agents and that is inescapable. From a few hard-to-dispute facts and a principle of consistency he thinks we can derive two generic human rights—and from them, a list of more determinate rights. Gewirth’s views have generated a large critical literature (see Beyleveld 1991, Boylan 1999).
A more recent attempt to base human rights on agency and autonomy is found in James Griffin’s book, On Human Rights (2008). Griffin does not share Gewirth’s goal of providing a logically inescapable argument for human rights, but his overall view shares key structural features with Gewirth’s. These include starting the justification with the unique value of human agency and autonomy (which Griffin calls “normative agency”), postulating some abstract rights (autonomy, freedom, and well-being), and making a place for a right to well-being within an agency-based approach.
In the current dispute between “moral” (or “orthodox”) and “political” conceptions of human rights, Griffin strongly sides with those who see human rights as fundamentally moral rights. Their defining role, in Griffin’s view, is protecting people’s ability to form and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life—a capacity that Griffin variously refers to as “autonomy,” “normative agency,” and “personhood.” This ability to form, revise, and pursue conceptions of a worthwhile life is taken to be of paramount value, the exclusive source of human dignity, and thereby the basis of human rights (Griffin 2008). Griffin holds that people value this capacity “especially highly, often more highly than even their happiness.”
“Practicalities” also shape human rights in Griffin’s view. He describes practicalities as “a second ground” of human rights. They prescribe making the boundaries of rights clear by avoiding “too many complicated bends,” enlarging rights a little to give them safety margins, and consulting facts about human nature and the nature of society. Accordingly, the justifying generic function that Griffin assigns to human rights is protecting normative agency while taking account of practicalities.
Griffin claims that human rights suffer even more than other normative concepts from an “indeterminacy of sense” that makes them vulnerable to proliferation (Griffin 2008). He thinks that tying all human rights to the single value of normative agency while taking account of practicalities is the best way to remedy this malady. He criticizes the frequent invention of new human rights and the “ballooning of the content” of established rights. Still, Griffin is friendly towards most of the rights in the Universal Declaration of Human Rights. Beyond this, Griffin takes human rights to include many rights in interpersonal morality. For example, Griffin thinks that a child’s human right to education applies not just against governments but also against the child’s parents.
Griffin’s thesis that all human rights are grounded in normative agency is put forward not so much as a description but as a proposal, as the best way of giving human rights unity, coherence, and limits. Unfortunately, accepting and following this proposal is unlikely to yield effective barriers to proliferation or a sharp line between human rights and other moral norms. The main reason is one that Griffin himself recognizes: the “generative capacities” of normative agency are “quite great.” Providing adequate protections of the three components of normative agency (autonomy, freedom, and minimal well-being) will encounter a lot of threats to these values and hence will require lots of rights.
2.3 Political Conceptions of Human Rights
Views that explain human rights in terms of the practical political roles that they play have had prominent advocates in recent decades. These “political” conceptions of human rights explain what human rights are by describing the things that they do. Two philosophers who have developed political conceptions are discussed in this section, namely, John Rawls and Charles Beitz (for helpful discussions of political conceptions and their alternatives see the collections of essays in Etinson 2018 and Maliks and Schaffer 2017).
Advocates of political conceptions of human rights are often agnostic or skeptical about universal moral rights while rejecting wholesale moral skepticism and thinking possible the provision of sound normative justifications for the content, normativity, and roles of human rights (for challenges to purely political views see Gilabert 2011, Liao and Etinson 2012, Sangiovanni 2017, and Waldron 2018).
John Rawls introduced the idea of a political conception of human rights in his book, The Law of Peoples (Rawls 1999). The basic idea is that we can understand what human rights are and what their justification requires by identifying the main roles they play in some political sphere. In The Law of Peoples this sphere is international relations (and, secondarily, national politics). Rawls was attempting a normative reconstruction of international law and politics within today’s international system, and this helps explain Rawls’s focus on how human rights function within this system.
Rawls says that human rights are a special class of urgent rights. He seems to accept the definition of human rights given in Section 1 above. Besides saying that human rights are rights that are high priority or “urgent,” Rawls also accepts that they are plural and universal. But Rawls was working on a narrower project than Gewirth and Griffin. The international human rights he was concerned with are also defined by their roles in helping define in various ways the normative structure of the global system. They provide content to other normative concepts such as legitimacy, sovereignty, permissible intervention, and membership in good standing in the international community.
According to Rawls the justificatory process for human rights is analogous to the one for principles of justice at the national level that he described in A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971). Instead of asking about the terms of cooperation that free and equal citizens would agree to under fair conditions, we ask about the terms of cooperation that free and equal peoples or countries would agree to under fair conditions. We imagine representatives of the world’s countries meeting to choose the normative principles that constitute the basic international structure. These representatives are imagined to see the countries they represent as free (rightfully independent) and equal (equally worthy of respect and fair treatment). These representatives are also imagined to be choosing rationally in light of the fundamental interests of their country, to be reasonable in seeking to find and respect fair terms of cooperation, and impartial because they are behind a “veil of ignorance”—they lack information about the country they represent such as its size, wealth, and power. Rawls holds that under these conditions these representatives will unanimously choose principles for the global order that include some basic human rights (for further explanation of the global original position see the entries on John Rawls and original position).
Rawls advocated a limited list of human rights, one that leaves out many fundamental freedoms, rights of political participation, and equality rights. He did this for two reasons. One is that he wanted a list that is plausible for all reasonable countries, not just liberal democracies. The second reason is that he viewed serious violations of human rights as triggering permissible intervention by other countries, and only the most important rights can play this role.
Leaving out protections for equality and democracy is a high price to pay for assigning human rights the role of making international intervention permissible when they are seriously violated. We can accommodate Rawls’underlying idea without paying that price. To accept the idea that countries engaging in massive violations of the most important human rights are not to be tolerated we do not need to follow Rawls in equating international human rights with a heavily-pruned list. Instead we can work up a view—which is needed for other purposes anyway—of which human rights are the weightiest and then assign the intervention-permitting role to this subset.
Charles Beitz’s account of human rights in The Idea of Human Rights (Beitz 2009) shares many similarities with Rawls’s but is much more fully developed. Like Rawls, Beitz deals with human rights only as they have developed in contemporary international human rights practice. Beitz suggests that we can develop an understanding of human rights by attending to “the practical inferences that would be drawn by competent participants in the practice from what they regard as valid claims of human rights.” Observations of what competent participants say and do inform the account of what human rights are. The focus is not on what human rights are at some deep philosophical level; it is rather on how they work by guiding actions within a recently emerged and still evolving discursive practice. The norms of the practice guide the interpretation and application of human rights, the appropriateness of criticism in terms of human rights, adjudication in human rights courts, and—perhaps most importantly—responding to serious violations of human rights. Beitz says that human rights are “matters of international concern” and that they are “potential triggers of transnational protective and remedial action.”
Beitz does not agree with Rawls’s view that these roles require an abbreviated list of human rights. He accepts that the requirements of human rights are weaker than the requirements of social justice at the national level, but denies that human rights are minimal or highly modest in other respects.
Beitz rightly suggests that a reasonable person can accept and use the idea of human rights without accepting any particular view about their foundations. It is less clear that he is right in suggesting that good justifications of human rights should avoid as far as possible controversial assumptions about religion, metaphysics, ideology, and intrinsic value (see the entry public reason). Beitz emphasizes the practical good that human rights do, not their grounds in some underlying moral reality. This helps make human rights attractive to people from around the world with their diverse religious and philosophical traditions. The broad justification for human rights and their normativity that Beitz offers is that they protect “urgent individual interests against predictable dangers (”standard threats“) to which they are vulnerable under typical circumstances of life in a modern world order composed of independent states.”
3. Which Rights are Human Rights?
This section discusses the question of which rights belong on lists of human rights. The Universal Declaration’s list, which has had great influence, consists of six families: (1) Security rights that protect people against murder, torture, and genocide; (2) Due process rights that protect people against arbitrary and excessively harsh punishments and require fair and public trials for those accused of crimes; (3) Liberty rights that protect people’s fundamental freedoms in areas such as belief, expression, association, and movement; (4) Political rights that protect people’s liberty to participate in politics by assembling, protesting, voting, and serving in public office; (5) Equality rights that guarantee equal citizenship, equality before the law, and freedom from discrimination; and (6) Social rights that require that governments ensure to all the availability of work, education, health services, and an adequate standard of living. A seventh category, minority and group rights, has been created by subsequent treaties. These rights protect women, racial and ethnic minorities, indigenous peoples, children, migrant workers, and the disabled.
Not every question of social justice or wise governance is a human rights issue. For example, a country could have too many lawyers or inadequate provision for graduate-level education without violating any human rights. Deciding which norms should be counted as human rights is a matter of considerable difficulty. And there is continuing pressure to expand lists of human rights to include new areas. Many political movements would like to see their main concerns categorized as matters of human rights, since this would publicize, promote, and legitimize their concerns at the international level. A possible result of this is “human rights inflation,” the devaluation of human rights caused by producing too much bad human rights currency (See Cranston 1973, Orend 2002, Wellman 1999, Griffin 2008).
One way to avoid rights inflation is to follow Cranston in insisting that human rights only deal with extremely important goods, protections, and freedoms. A supplementary approach is to impose several justificatory tests for specific human rights. For example, it could be required that a proposed human right not only protect some very important good but also respond to one or more common and serious threats to that good (Dershowitz 2004, Donnelly 2003, Shue 1996, Talbott 2005), impose burdens on the addressees that are justifiable and no larger than necessary, and be feasible in most of the world’s countries (on feasibility see Gilabert 2009 and Nickel 2007). This approach restrains rights inflation with several tests, not just one master test.
In deciding which specific rights are human rights it is possible to make either too little or too much of international documents such as the Universal Declaration and the European Convention. One makes too little of them by proceeding as if drawing up a list of important rights were a new question, never before addressed, and as if there were no practical wisdom to be found in the choices of rights that went into the historic documents. And one makes too much of them by presuming that those documents tell us everything we need to know about human rights. This approach involves a kind of fundamentalism: it holds that when a right is on the official lists of human rights that settles its status as a human right (“If it’s in the book that’s all I need to know.”) But the process of identifying human rights in the United Nations and elsewhere was a political process with plenty of imperfections. There is little reason to take international diplomats as the most authoritative guides to which human rights there are. Further, even if a treaty’s ratification by most countries can settle the question of whether a certain right is a human right within international law, such a treaty cannot settle its weight. The treaty may suggest that the right is supported by weighty considerations, but it cannot make this so. If an international treaty enacted a right to visit national parks without charge as a human right, the ratification of that treaty would make free access to national parks a human right within international law. But it would not be able to make us believe that the right to visit national parks without charge was sufficiently important to be a real human right (see Luban 2015).
3.1 Civil and Political Rights
The least controversial family of human rights is civil and political rights. These rights are familiar from historic bills of rights such as the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen (1789) and the U.S. Bill of Rights (1791, with subsequent amendments). Contemporary sources include the first 21 Articles of the Universal Declaration, and treaties such as the European Convention, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights, the American Convention on Human Rights, and the African Charter on Human and People’s Rights. Some representative formulations follow:
Everyone has the right to freedom of thought and expression. This right includes freedom to seek, receive, and impart information and ideas of all kinds, regardless of frontiers, either orally, in writing, in print, in the form of art, or through any other medium of one’s choice. (American Convention on Human Rights, Article 13.1)
Everyone has the right to freedom of peaceful assembly and to freedom of association with others, including the right to form and to join trade unions for the protection of his interests (European Convention, Article 11).
Every citizen shall have the right to participate freely in the government of his country, either directly or through freely chosen representatives in accordance with the provisions of the law. 2. Every citizen shall have the right of equal access to the public service of his country. 3. Every individual shall have the right of access to public property and services in strict equality of all persons before the law (African Charter, Article 13).
Most civil and political rights are not absolute—they can in some cases be overridden by other considerations. For example, the right to freedom of movement can be restricted by public and private property rights, by restraining orders related to domestic violence, and by legal punishments. Further, after a disaster such as a hurricane or earthquake free movement is often appropriately suspended to keep out the curious, permit access of emergency vehicles and equipment, and prevent looting. The International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights permits rights to be suspended during times “of public emergency which threatens the life of the nation” (Article 4). But it excludes some rights from suspension including the right to life, the prohibition of torture, the prohibition of slavery, the prohibition of ex post facto criminal laws, and freedom of thought and religion.
3.2 Social Rights
The Universal Declaration included social (or “welfare”) rights that address matters such as education, food, health services, and employment. Their inclusion has been the source of much controversy (see Beetham 1995). The European Convention did not include them (although it was later amended to include the right to education). Instead they were put into a separate treaty, the European Social Charter. When the United Nations began the process of putting the rights of the Universal Declaration into international law, it followed the same pattern by treating economic and social standards in a treaty separate from the one dealing with civil and political rights. This treaty, the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (the “Social Covenant,” 1966), treated these standards as rights—albeit rights to be progressively realized.
The Social Covenant’s list of rights includes nondiscrimination and equality for women in economic and social life (Articles 2 and 3), freedom to work and opportunities to work (Article 4), fair pay and decent conditions of work (Article 7), the right to form trade unions and to strike (Article 8), social security (Article 9), special protections for mothers and children (Article 10), the right to adequate food, clothing, and housing (Article 11), the right to basic health services (Article 12), the right to education (Article 13), and the right to participate in cultural life and scientific progress (Article 15).
Article 2.1 of the Social Covenant sets out what each of the parties commits itself to do about this list, namely to “take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation…to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant.” In contrast, the Civil and Political Covenant commits its signatories to immediate compliance, to “respect and to ensure to all individuals within its territory the rights recognized in the present Covenant” (Article 2.1). The contrast between these two levels of commitment has led some people to suspect that economic and social rights are really just valuable goals. Why did the Social Covenant opt for progressive implementation and thereby treat its rights as being somewhat like goals? The main reason is that many of the world’s countries lacked the economic, institutional, and human resources to realize these standards fully or even largely. For many countries, noncompliance due to inability would have been certain if these standards had been treated as immediately binding.
Social rights have often been defended with linkage arguments that show the support they provide to adequate realization of civil and political rights. This approach was first developed philosophically by Henry Shue (Shue 1996; see also Nickel 2007 and 2016). Linkage arguments defend controversial rights by showing the indispensable or highly useful support they provide to uncontroversial rights. For example, if a government succeeds in eliminating hunger and providing education to everyone this promotes people’s abilities to know, use, and enjoy their liberties, due process rights, and rights of political participation. Lack of education is frequently a barrier to the realization of civil and political rights because uneducated people often do not know what rights they have and what they can do to use and defend them. Lack of education is also a common barrier to democratic participation. Education and a minimum income make it easier for people near the bottom economically to follow politics, participate in political campaigns, and to spend the time and money needed to go to the polls and vote.
Do social rights yield a sufficient commitment to equality? Objections to social rights as human rights have come from both the political right and the political left. A common objection from the left, including liberal egalitarians and socialists, is that social rights as enumerated in human rights documents and treaties provide too weak of a commitment to material equality (Moyn 2018; Gilabert 2015). Realizing social rights requires a state that ensures to everyone an adequate minimum of resources in some key areas but that does not necessarily have strong commitments to equality of opportunity, to strong redistributive taxation, and to ceilings on wealth (see the entries equality, equality of opportunity, distributive justice, and liberal feminism).
The egalitarian objection cannot be that human rights documents and treaties showed no concern for people living in poverty and misery. That would be wildly false. One of the main purposes of including social rights in human rights documents and treaties was to promote serious efforts to combat poverty, lack of education, and unhealthy living conditions in countries all around the world (see also Langford 2013 on the UN Millenium Development Goals). The objection also cannot be that human rights facilitated the hollowing out of systems of welfare rights in many developed countries that occurred after 1980. Those cuts in welfare programs were often in violation of the requirements of adequately realizing social rights.
Perhaps it should be conceded that human rights documents and treaties have not said enough about positive measures to promote equal opportunity in education and work. A positive right to equal opportunity, like the one Rawls proposed, would require countries to take serious measures to reduce disparities between the opportunities effectively available to children of high-income and low-income parents (Rawls 1971).
A strongly egalitarian political program is best pursued partially within but mostly beyond the human rights framework. One reason for this is that the human rights movement will have better future prospects for acceptance and realization if it has widespread political support. That requires that the rights it endorses appeal to people with a variety of political views ranging from center-left to center-right. Support from the broad political center will not emerge and survive if the human rights platform is perceived as mostly a leftist program.
Do social rights protect sufficiently important human interests? Maurice Cranston opposed social rights by suggesting that social rights are mainly concerned with matters such as holidays with pay that are not matters of deep and universal human interests (Cranston 1967, 1973. Treatments of objections to social rights include Beetham 1995; Howard 1987; and Nickel 2007). It is far from the case, however, that most social rights pertain only to superficial interests. Consider two examples: the right to an adequate standard of living and the right to free public education. These rights require governments to try to remedy widespread and serious evils such as severe poverty, starvation and malnutrition, and ignorance. The importance of food and other basic material conditions of life is easy to show. These goods are essential to people’s ability to live, function, and flourish. Without adequate access to these goods, interests in life, health, and liberty are endangered and serious illness and death are probable. Lack of access to educational opportunities typically limits (both absolutely and comparatively) people’s abilities to participate fully and effectively in the political and economic life of their country.
Are social rights too burdensome? Another objection to social rights is that they are too burdensome on their dutybearers. It is very expensive to guarantee to everyone basic education and minimal material conditions of life. Frequently the claim that social rights are too burdensome uses other, less controversial human rights as a standard of comparison, and suggests that social rights are substantially more burdensome or expensive than liberty rights. Suppose that we use as a basis of comparison liberty rights such as freedom of communication, association, and movement. These rights require both respect and protection from governments. And people cannot be adequately protected in their enjoyment of liberties such as these unless they also have security and due process rights. The costs of liberty, as it were, include the costs of law and criminal justice. Once we see this, liberty rights start to look a lot more costly.
Further, we should not generally think of social rights as simply giving everyone a free supply of the goods they protect. Guarantees of things like food and housing will be intolerably expensive and will undermine productivity if everyone simply receives a free supply. A viable system of social rights will require most people to provide these goods for themselves and their families through work as long as they are given the necessary opportunities, education, and infrastructure. Government-implemented social rights provide guarantees of availability (or “secure access”), but governments should have to supply the requisite goods in only a small fraction of cases. Note that education is often an exception to this since many countries provide free public education irrespective of ability to pay.
Countries that do not accept and implement social rights still have to bear somehow the costs of providing for the needy since these countries—particularly if they recognize democratic rights of political participation—are unlikely to find it tolerable to allow sizeable parts of the population to starve and be homeless. If government does not supply food, clothing, and shelter to those unable to provide for themselves, then families, friends, and communities will have to shoulder this burden. It is only in the last hundred or so years that government-sponsored social rights have taken over a substantial part of the burden of providing for the needy. The taxes associated with social rights are partial replacements for other burdensome duties, namely the duties of families and communities to provide adequate care for the unemployed, sick, disabled, and aged. Deciding whether to implement social rights is not a matter of deciding whether to bear such burdens, but rather of deciding whether to continue with total reliance on a system of informal provision that distributes assistance in a very spotty way and whose costs fall very unevenly on families, friends, and communities.
Are social rights feasible worldwide? Another objection to social rights alleges that they are not feasible in many countries (on how to understand feasibility see Gilabert 2009). It is very expensive to provide guarantees of subsistence, measures to protect and restore people’s health, and education. Many governments will be unable to provide these guarantees while meeting other important responsibilities. Rights are not magical sources of supply (Holmes and Sunstein 1999).
As we saw earlier, the Social Covenant dealt with the issue of feasibility by calling for progressive implementation, that is, implementation as financial and other resources permit. Does this view of implementation turn social rights into high-priority goals? And if so, is that a bad thing?
Standards that outrun the abilities of many of their addressees are good candidates for treatment as goals. Viewing them as largely aspirational rather than as imposing immediate duties avoids problems of inability-based noncompliance. One may worry, however, that this is too much of a demotion for social rights because goals seem much weaker than rights. But goals can be formulated in ways that make them more like rights. They can be assigned addressees (the parties who are to pursue the goal), beneficiaries, scopes that define the objective to be pursued, and a high level of priority (see Langford 2013 and Nickel 2013; see also UN Human Rights and the 2030 Sustainable Development Goals). Strong reasons for the importance of these goals can be provided. And supervisory bodies can monitor levels of progress and pressure low-performing addressees to attend to and work on their goals.
Treating very demanding rights as goals has several advantages. One is that proposed goals that greatly exceed our abilities are not so farcical as proposed duties that do so. Creating grand lists of social rights that many countries cannot presently realize seems farcical to many people. Perhaps this perceived lack of realism is reduced if we understand that these “rights” are really goals that countries should seriously promote. Goals coexist easily with low levels of ability to achieve them. Another advantage is that goals are flexible: addressees with different levels of ability can choose ways of pursuing the goals that suit their circumstances and means. Because of these attractions it may be worth exploring sophisticated ways to transform very demanding human rights into goals. The transformation may be full or partial. It is possible to create right-goal mixtures that contain some mandatory elements and that therefore seem more like real rights (see Brems 2009). A right-goal mixture might include some rights-like goals, some mandatory steps to be taken immediately, and duties to realize the rights-like goals as quickly as possible.
3.3 Rights of Women, Minorities, and Groups
Equality of rights for historically disadvantaged or subordinated groups is a longstanding concern of the human rights movement. Human rights documents repeatedly emphasize that all people, including women and members of minority ethnic and religious groups, have equal human rights and should be able to enjoy them without discrimination. The right to freedom from discrimination figures prominently in the Universal Declaration and subsequent treaties. The Civil and Political Covenant, for example, commits participating states to respect and protect their people’s rights “without distinction of any kind, such as race, color, sex, language, political or other opinion, national or social origin, property, birth, or social status” (on minority and group rights see Kymlicka 1995, Nickel 2007).
A number of standard individual rights are especially important to ethnic and religious minorities, including rights to freedom of association, freedom of assembly, freedom of religion, and freedom from discrimination. Human rights documents also include rights that refer to minorities explicitly and give them special protections. For example, the Civil and Political Covenant in Article 27 says that persons belonging to ethnic, religious, or linguistic minorities “shall not be denied the right, in community with other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language.”
Feminists have often protested that standard lists of human rights do not sufficiently take into account the different risks faced by women and men. For example, issues like domestic violence, reproductive choice, and trafficking of women and girls for sex work did not have a prominent place in early human rights documents and treaties. Lists of human rights have had to be expanded “to include the degradation and violation of women” (Bunch 2006, 58; see also Lockwood 2006 and Okin 1998). Violations of women’s human rights often occur in the home at the hands of other family members, not in the street at the hands of the police. Most violence against women occurs in the “private” sphere. This has meant that governments cannot be seen as the only addressees of human rights and that the right to privacy of home and family needs qualifications to allow police to protect women within the home.
The issue of how formulations of human rights should respond to variations in the sorts of risks and dangers that different people face is difficult and arises not just in relation to gender but also in relation to age, profession, political affiliation, religion, and personal interests. Due process rights, for example, are much more useful to young people (and particularly young men) than they are to older people since the latter are far less likely to run afoul of the criminal law.
Since 1964 the United Nations has mainly dealt with the rights of women and minorities through specialized treaties such as the International Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination (1965); the Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (1979); the Convention on the Rights of the Child (1989), and the Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (2007). See also the Declaration on the Rights of Indigenous Peoples (2007). Specialized treaties allow international norms to address unique problems of particular groups such as assistance and care during pregnancy and childbearing in the case of women, custody issues in the case of children, and the loss of historic territories by indigenous peoples.
Minority groups are often targets of violence. Human rights norms call upon governments to refrain from such violence and to provide protections against it. This work is partly done by the right to life, which is a standard individual right. It is also done by the right against genocide which protects some groups from attempts to destroy or decimate them. The Genocide Convention was one of the first human rights treaties after World War II. The right against genocide is clearly a group right. It is held by both individuals and groups and provides protection to groups as groups. It is largely negative in the sense that it requires governments and other agencies to refrain from destroying groups; but it also requires that legal and other protections against genocide be created at the national level.
Can the right against genocide be a human right? More generally, can a group right fit the general idea of human rights proposed earlier? On that conception, human rights are rights of all persons. Perhaps it can, however, if we broaden our conception of who can hold human rights to include important groups that people form and cherish (see the entry on group rights). This can be made more palatable, perhaps, by recognizing that the beneficiaries of the right against genocide are individual humans who enjoy greater security against attempts to destroy the group to which they belong (Kymlicka 1989).
3.4 Environmental Rights
In spite of the danger of rights inflation, there are doubtless norms that should be counted as human rights but are not generally recognized as such. After all, there are lots of areas in which people’s dignity and fundamental interests are threatened by the actions and omissions of individuals and governments. Consider environmental rights, which are often defined to include rights of animals or even of nature itself (see the entry on environmental ethics). Conceived in this broad way environmental rights don’t have a good fit with the general idea of human rights because the rightholders are not humans or human groups.
Alternative formulations are possible, however. A basic environmental human right can be understood as requiring maintenance and restoration of an environment that is safe for human life and health. Many countries have environmental rights of this sort in their constitutional bills of rights (Hayward 2005). And the European Union’s Bill of Rights, the Charter of Fundamental Rights of the European Union, includes in Article 37 an environmental protection norm: “A high level of environmental protection and the improvement of the quality of the environment must be integrated into the policies of the Union and ensured in accordance with the principle of sustainable development.”
A human right to a safe environment or to environmental protection does not directly address issues such as the claims of animals or biodiversity, although it might do so indirectly using the idea of ecosystem services to humans (see Biodiversity and Human Rights. A justification for a human right to a safe environment should show that environmental problems pose serious threats to fundamental human interests, values, or norms; that governments may appropriately be burdened with the responsibility of protecting people against these threats; and that most governments actually have the ability to do this.
Climate change is currently a major environmental threat to many people’s lives and health, and hence it is unsurprising that human rights approaches to climate change have been developed and advocated in recent decades (see Bodansky 2011, Gardiner 2013, and UN Human Rights and Climate Change). One approach, advocated by Steve Vanderheiden accepts the idea of a human right to an environment that is adequate for human life and health and derives from this broad right a more specific right to a stable climate (Vanderheiden 2008). Another approach, advocated by Simon Caney, does not require introducing a new environmental right. It suggests instead that serious action to reduce and mitigate climate change is required by already well-established human rights because severe climate change will violate many people’s rights to life, food, and health (Caney 2010). One could expand this approach by arguing that severe climate change should be reduced and mitigated because it will cause massive human migrations and other crises that will undermine the abilities of many governments to uphold human rights (for evaluation of these arguments see Bell 2013).
4. Universal Human Rights in a World of Diverse Beliefs and Practices
Two familiar philosophical worries about human rights are that they are based on moral beliefs that are culturally relative and that their creation and advocacy involves ethnocentrism. Human rights prescribe universal standards in areas such as security, law enforcement, equality, political participation, and education. The peoples and countries of planet Earth are, however, enormously varied in their practices, traditions, religions, and levels of economic and political development. Putting these two propositions together may be enough to justify the worry that universal human rights do not sufficiently accommodate the diversity of Earth’s peoples. A theoretical expression of this worry is “relativism,” the idea that ethical, political, and legal standards for a particular country or region are mostly shaped by the traditions, beliefs, and conditions of that country or region (see the entry on moral relativism). The anthropologist William G. Sumner, writing in 1906, asserted that “the mores can make anything right and prevent condemnation of anything” (Sumner 1906).
Relativists sometimes accuse human rights advocates of ethnocentrism, arrogance, and cultural imperialism (Talbott 2005). Ethnocentrism is the assumption, usually unconscious, that “one’s own group is the center of everything” and that its beliefs, practices, and norms provide the standards by which other groups are “scaled and rated” (Sumner 1906; see also Etinson 2018 who argues that ethnocentrism is best understood as a kind of cultural bias rather than as a belief in cultural superiority). Ethnocentrism can lead to arrogance and intolerance in dealings with other countries, ethical systems, and religions. Finally, cultural imperialism occurs when the economically, technologically, and militarily strongest countries impose their beliefs, values, and institutions on the rest of the world. Relativists often combine these charges with a prescription, namely that tolerance of varied practices and traditions ought to be instilled and practiced through measures that include extended learning about other cultures.
The conflict between relativists and human rights advocates may be partially based on differences in their underlying philosophical beliefs, particularly in metaethics. Relativists are often subjectivists or noncognitivists and think of morality as entirely socially constructed and transmitted. In contrast, philosophically-inclined human rights advocates are more likely to adhere to or presuppose cognitivism, moral realism, and intuitionism.
During the drafting in 1947 of the Universal Declaration, the Executive Board of the American Anthropological Association warned of the danger that the Declaration would be “a statement of rights conceived only in terms of the values prevalent in Western Europe and America.” Perhaps the main concern of the AAA Board in the period right after World War II was to condemn the intolerant colonialist attitudes of the day and to advocate cultural and political self-determination. But the Board also made the stronger assertion that “standards and values are relative to the culture from which they derive” and thus “what is held to be a human right in one society may be regarded as anti-social by another people” (American Anthropological Association Statement on Human Rights 1947).
This is not, of course, the stance of most anthropologists today. Currently the American Anthropological Association has a Committee on Human Rights whose objectives include promoting and protecting human rights and developing an anthropological perspective on human rights. While still emphasizing the importance of cultural differences, anthropologists now often support cultural survival and the protection of vulnerable cultures, non-discrimination, and the rights and land claims of indigenous peoples.
The idea that relativism and exposure to other cultures promote tolerance may be correct from a psychological perspective. People who are sensitive to differences in beliefs, practices, and traditions, and who are suspicious of the grounds for extending norms across borders, may be more inclined to be tolerant of other countries and peoples than those who believe in an objective universal morality. Still, philosophers have been generally critical of attempts to argue from relativism to a prescription of tolerance (Talbott 2005). If the culture and religion of one country has long fostered intolerant attitudes and practices, and if its citizens and officials act intolerantly towards people from other countries, they are simply following their own traditions and cultural norms. They are just doing what relativists think people mostly do. Accordingly, a relativist from a tolerant country will be hard-pressed to find a basis for criticizing the citizens and officials of the intolerant country. To do so the relativist will have to endorse a transcultural principle of tolerance and to advocate as an outsider cultural change in the direction of greater tolerance. Because of this, relativists who are deeply committed to tolerance may find themselves attracted to a qualified commitment to human rights.
East Asia is the region of the world that participates least in the international human rights system—even though some important East Asian countries such as Japan and South Korea do participate. In the 1990s Singapore’s Senior Minister Lee Kuan Yew and others argued that international human rights as found in United Nations declarations and treaties were insensitive to distinctive “Asian values” such as prizing families and community (in contrast to strong individualism); putting social harmony over personal freedom; respect for political leaders and institutions; and emphasizing responsibility, hard work, and thriftiness as means of social progress (on the Asian Values debate see Bauer and Bell 1999; Bell 2000; Sen 1997; and Twining 2009). Proponents of the Asian values idea did not wish to abolish all human rights; they rather wanted to deemphasize some families of human rights, particularly the fundamental freedoms and rights of democratic participation (and in some cases the rights of women). They also wanted Western governments and NGOs to stop criticizing them for human rights violations in these areas.
At the 1993 World Conference on Human Rights in Vienna, countries including Singapore, Malaysia, China, and Iran advocated accommodations within human rights practice for cultural and economic differences. Western representatives tended to view the position of these countries as excuses for repression and authoritarianism. The Conference responded by approving the Vienna Declaration. It included in Article 5 the assertion that countries should not pick and choose among human rights: “All human rights are universal, indivisible and interdependent and interrelated. The international community must treat human rights globally in a fair and equal manner, on the same footing, and with the same emphasis. While the significance of national and regional particularities and various historical, cultural and religious backgrounds must be borne in mind, it is the duty of States, regardless of their political, economic and cultural systems, to promote and protect all human rights and fundamental freedoms.”
Perhaps the debate about relativism and human rights has become obsolete. In recent decades widespread acceptance of human rights has occurred in most parts of the world. Three quarters of the world’s countries have ratified the major human rights treaties, and many countries in Africa, the Americas, and Europe participate in regional human rights regimes that have international courts (see Georgetown University Human Rights Law Research Guide in the Other Internet Resources below). Further, all of the world’s countries now use similar political institutions (law, courts, legislatures, executives, militaries, bureaucracies, police, prisons, taxation, and public schools) and these institutions carry with them characteristic problems and abuses (Donnelly 2003). Finally, globalization has diminished the differences among peoples. Today’s world is not the one that early anthropologists and missionaries found. National and cultural boundaries are breached not just by international trade but also by millions of travelers and migrants, electronic communications, international law covering many areas, and the efforts of international governmental and non-governmental organizations. International influences and organizations are everywhere and countries borrow freely and regularly from each other’s inventions and practices.
Worldwide polls on attitudes towards human rights are now available and they show broad support for human rights and international efforts to promote them. Empirical research can now replace or supplement theoretical speculations about how much disagreement on human rights exists worldwide. A December 2011 report by the Council on Foreign Relations surveyed recent international opinion polls on human rights that probe agreement and disagreement with propositions such as “People have the right to express any opinion,” “People of all faiths can practice their religion freely,” “Women should have the same rights as men,” “People of different races [should be] treated equally,” and governments “should be responsible for ensuring that [their] citizens can meet their basic need for food.” Big majorities of those polled in countries such as Argentina, Ukraine, Azerbaijan, Egypt, Iran, Kenya, Nigeria, China, India, and Indonesia gave affirmative answers. Further, large majorities (on average 70%) in all the countries polled supported UN efforts to promote the human rights set out in the Universal Declaration. Unfortunately, popular acceptance of human rights ideas has not, however, prevented a recent slide in many of these same countries towards authoritarianism.
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Other Internet Resources
Guides to International Human Rights Law
- Georgetown Law Library Human Rights Law Research Guide
- United Nations Office of the High Commissioner for Human Rights
- University of Minnesota Human Rights Library.
The assistance of Adam Etinson, Pablo Gilabert, and Erin Sperry is acknowledged with gratitude.