Ibn ‘Arabî

First published Tue Aug 5, 2008; substantive revision Fri Aug 2, 2019

Ibn ‘Arabî (1165–1240) can be considered the greatest of all Muslim philosophers, provided we understand philosophy in the broad, modern sense and not simply as the discipline of falsafa, whose outstanding representatives are Avicenna and, many would say, Mullâ Sadrâ. Salman Bashier (2012) has even argued that “the story of Islamic philosophy” depicts an initial rationalistic phase and culminates with an “illuminative phase” best represented by Ibn ‘Arabî. Most Western scholarship and much of the later Islamic tradition have classified Ibn ‘Arabî as a “Sufi”, though he himself did not; his works cover the whole gamut of Islamic sciences, not least Koran commentary, Hadith (sayings of Muhammad), jurisprudence, principles of jurisprudence, theology, philosophy, and mysticism. Unlike al-Ghazâlî, whose range of work is similar to his, he did not usually write in specific genres, but tended rather to integrate and synthesize the sciences in the context of thematic works, ranging in length from one or two folios to several thousand pages. Nor did he depart from the highest level of discourse, or repeat himself in different works. The later Sufi tradition called him al-Shaykh al-Akbar, the Greatest Master, a title that was understood to mean that no one else has been or will be able to unpack the multi-layered significance of the sources of the Islamic tradition with such detail and profundity.

Ibn ‘Arabî’s writings remained unknown in the West until modern times, but they spread throughout the Islamic world within a century of his death. The early Orientalists, with one or two exceptions, paid little attention to him because he had no discernable influence in Europe. His works, moreover, are notoriously difficult, making it easy to dismiss him as a “mystic” or a “pantheist” without trying to read him. Not until books by Henry Corbin (1958) and Toshihiko Izutsu (1966) was he recognized as an extraordinarily broad-ranging and highly original thinker with much to contribute to the world of philosophy. These two scholars, however, limited their attention almost entirely to one of his short works, Fusûs al-hikam (“The Ringstones of the Wisdoms”). Although Ringstones was the focus of a long tradition of commentary, it represents but a tiny fraction of what he offers in his massive al-Futûhât al-makkiyya (“The Meccan Openings”). More recently, scholars have begun to look at this work (which will fill an estimated 15,000 pages in its modern edition), but relatively little of it has been translated into Western languages and what has been translated is still in need of further explanation, interpretation, and contextualization in the history of philosophy (for a stab at the last, see Ebstein 2013).

Several scholars have pointed to parallels between Ibn ‘Arabî and figures like Eckhart and Cusanus (Sells 1994, Shah-Kazemi 2006, Smirnov 1993, Dobie 2009), and others have suggested that he anticipates trends in physics (Yousef 2007) or modern philosophy (Almond 2004, Coates 2002, Dobie 2007). The most serious attempt to fit him into the history of Western philosophy argues that his notion of barzakh (see section 3.4) offers a viable solution to the problem of defining the indefinable, which has dogged epistemology from the time of Aristotle and led to the despair of modern philosophers like Rorty (Bashier 2004). Other scholars have compared him to Eastern thinkers like Shankara, Zhuangzi, and Dôgen (Shah-Kazemi 2006, Izutsu 1966, Izutsu 1977). Nor were the similarities to Eastern thought lost on premodern scholars; during the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, the Muslims of China established a Chinese-language school (the Han Kitab) that drew from Ibn ‘Arabî’s legacy and presented the Islamic worldview in terms drawn from Confucian thought (Murata et al. 2008). Implications of his thought for contemporary concerns have been addressed by a diverse array of scholars and devotees in the Journal of the Muhyiddin Ibn ‘Arabi Society, which has been published since 1983. All the attention he has been receiving, and specifically from scholars and thinkers labelled “perennialists,” has led some to question the validity of the modern lenses through which he is often read (Lipton 2018). What follows is an outline of some of the topics he addresses.

1. Life and Works

Ibn ‘Arabî referred to himself with fuller versions of his name, such as Abû ‘Abdallâh Muhammad ibn ‘Alî ibn al-‘Arabî al-Tâ’î al-Hâtimî (the last three names indicating his noble Arab lineage). He was born in Murcia in 1165 to the family of a minor official and received the standard education of a literatus, without any special attention to religious topics. In his early teens he underwent a visionary conversion “at the hands of Jesus” (albeit the Jesus of the Koran), and this resulted in an “opening” (futûh) of his soul toward the divine realm. Shortly thereafter, in about 1180, his father took him to meet his friend Averroes. Ibn ‘Arabî recounts an elliptical conversation in which he explained to the philosopher the limits of rational perception. Corbin has taken this event as a symbolic parting of ways between Islam and the West: with the help of Latin Averroism, Western thinkers were soon to pursue an exclusively rationalistic path leading “to the conflict between theology and philosophy, between faith and knowledge, between symbol and history” (Corbin 1969, 13). In contrast, Muslim intellectuals tended rather to ignore Averroes, though Avicenna, Suhrawardî, and other philosophers continued to be read, annotated, and improved upon. At the same time, no one could fail to notice Ibn ‘Arabî’s challenge to merely rational understanding, and many Muslim philosophers followed paths that undertook the harmonization of reason, mystical intuition, and revelation.

Ibn ‘Arabî studied the Islamic sciences with numerous teachers in Andalus and North Africa. In 1201 he left the Muslim West to perform the pilgrimage to Mecca and did not return. He traveled extensively in Iraq and Anatolia, finally settling down in Damascus in 1223, where he trained disciples and wrote prolifically until his death in November 1240.

Among his several hundred books and treatises, Ringstones and Openings are the most famous. Ringstones became the standard text to transmit his teachings and, during the next six centuries, was the object of more than a hundred commentaries. Among his many talented disciples, the most influential was his stepson Sadr al-Dîn Qûnawî (1210–74), who began the process of systematizing his teachings and elucidating his perspective in conversation with contemporary philosophy, even initiating a correspondence with Nasîr al-Dîn al-Tûsî, the important reviver of Avicenna (Qûnawî, al-Murâsalât).

2. Methodology

Qûnawî differentiates Ibn ‘Arabî’s position from that of falsafa and scholastic theology (Kalam) by calling it mashrab al-tahqîq, “the school of realization”. Tahqîq is indeed the cornerstone of Ibn ‘Arabî’s vast corpus, so it is important to have a sense of what it means. The word is derived from the same root as haqq and haqîqa, key terms in all the sciences. Haqq means true, real, right, worthy, and appropriate (in modern times, it is used to speak of human “rights”); haqîqa means reality and truth. The Koran uses haqq, the conceptual opposite of bâtil (false, vain, unreal, inappropriate), in a variety of senses, not least as a divine name, “the Real, the True”, and to designate the content of revelation (the Koran and earlier scriptures). Haqîqa is not a Koranic term, but it was used in the Hadith literature and given special attention in philosophy. Tahqîq or “realization” means to speak, affirm, and actualize haqq and haqîqa—truth, reality, rightness, appropriateness. Ibn ‘Arabî finds its role in human becoming encapsulated in the Prophet’s saying, “Everything has a haqq, so give to each that has a haqq its haqq”. In other words, everything in the universe, society, and the soul has a rightness and an appropriateness, and the human task vis-à-vis each thing is to act rightly and appropriately; or, everything has rights, and people have the responsibility (that is, the haqq “against them”, ‘alayhim) to observe those rights.

Another hadith explains that the primary haqq, upon which all other haqqs are based, is that “There is no god but God”, which is to say that there is nothing truly real but the Real, there is nothing truly right but the Right. In Islamic theology, understanding this notion is called tawhîd or “the acknowledgement of [divine] unity” and is considered the first of the three principles of faith; tawhîd also underlies the standpoints of the philosophers, even if some of them seldom spoke of God per se, preferring terms like the First, the Good, and the Necessary. This particular hadith tells us that God’s haqq against people (that is, their responsibility toward him) is for them to acknowledge tawhîd, and, if they do so, their right against God (his responsibility toward them) is for them to receive everlasting happiness, sa‘âda—the term philosophers used to translate eudaimonia.

From earliest times, Muslim philosophers recognized that haqq—truth, reality, rightness—was basic to the quest for wisdom and the happiness of the soul. Already al-Kindî, at the beginning of his most famous work, On First Philosophy, writes that the goal of the philosopher is to reach haqq and to practice haqq. Scholars translate the word here and in similar contexts as “truth”, but doing so suggests that the issue was logical and epistemological, when in fact it was ontological and existential; for the philosophers, the goal of the quest for wisdom was transformation of the soul, and that could not be achieved simply by logic and argumentation. Al-Kindî’s statement is in fact an early definition of tahqîq, and the term itself became common in philosophical texts, though it seldom has the same urgency that it has in Ibn ‘Arabî’s works. For him it is the guiding principle of all knowledge and activity and the highest goal to which a human soul can aspire. It means knowing the truth and reality of the cosmos, the soul, and human affairs on the basis of the Supreme Reality, al-Haqq; knowing the Supreme Reality inasmuch as it reveals itself in the haqqs of all things; and acting in keeping with these haqqs at every moment and in every situation. In short, the “realizers” (muhaqqiqûn) are those who fully actualize the spiritual, cosmic, and divine potential of the soul (Chittick 2005, chap. 5).

Some of the implications of tahqîq can be understood when it is contrasted with its conceptual opposite, taqlîd, which means imitation or following authority. Knowledge can be divided into two sorts, which in Arabic were often called naqlî, transmitted, and ‘aqlî, intellectual; or husûlî, acquired, and hudûrî, presential. Transmitted knowledge is everything that one can learn only by imitating others, like language, culture, scripture, history, law, and science. Intellectual knowledge is what one comes to know by realizing its truth within oneself, like mathematics and metaphysics, even if these are initially learned by imitation. Mullâ Sadrâ calls intellectual knowledge “non-instrumental” (al-ghayr al-âlî), because it accrues to the soul not by the instruments of sense perception, imagination, and rational argumentation, but by the soul’s conformity with reason or intelligence (‘aql), which, in its fullest reality, is nothing but the shining light of the Real. In short, Ibn ‘Arabî, like many of the Islamic philosophers, holds that real knowledge cannot come from imitating others, but must be discovered by realization, which is the actualization of the soul’s potential. Ibn ‘Arabî differs from most philosophers in maintaining that full realization can only be achieved by following in the footsteps of the prophets.

2.1 Divine Speech

It is difficult to overestimate the importance of the Koran as Ibn ‘Arabî’s source of inspiration (Chodkiewicz 1993a). Far more than either the theologians or the philosophers, he dedicated his efforts to absorbing God’s word and being absorbed by it, and his writings are suffused with quotations and terminology from the text. As the divine speech (kalâm), the Koran is understood as nonmanifest and indistinct from the Divine Essence, though it becomes manifest in recitation and writing. God’s speech reveals itself not only in scripture, but also in the universe and the soul. The homologies among cosmos, soul, and scripture follow easily on the Koran’s imagery. In several verses it speaks of God’s creative act as his command “Be!”, and it alludes to the individual creatures as his words (kalimât). The identity of speech and creativity is also seen in the Koran’s frequent use of the term “sign” (âya) to designate the phenomena of the universe, the interior events of the soul, and its own verses. In effect, when God speaks—and he speaks because the Infinite Real cannot but display its qualities and characteristics—he voices three books, each of which is made up of signs/verses. As Ibn ‘Arabî says of the cosmos, “It is all letters, words, chapters, and verses, so it is the Great Koran” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 4:167.22).

In one of his best known explications of the nature of things, Ibn al-‘Arabî looks at God’s creativity as an analogue of human speech. Just as we create words and sentences in the substratum of breath, so God creates the universe by articulating words in the Breath of the All-Merciful (nafas al-rahmân), which is the deployment of existence (inbisât al-wujûd); indeed, existence itself is synonymous with mercy (rahma). His most elaborate cosmological scheme (among several) depicts the basic levels of cosmic deployment as corresponding with the twenty-eight letters of the Arabic alphabet, each representing a specific modality of articulated existence (Burckhardt 1977, Chittick 1998).

The pivotal importance of the written Koran rests on the fact that it voices the divine names and the signs/verses in human language, thereby providing the key to deciphering the other two books. By interpreting the Koran, we also interpret the cosmos and ourselves. Ibn ‘Arabî typically begins any discussion with a verse or two, and he then proceeds to draw out meanings that have a bearing on whatever the context may be. He insists that readings must conform to the Arabic language as spoken by the original recipients of the Book, but more often than not he offers surprising and highly original interpretations. On close examination, these are seen to be consistent with the language, even when they fly in the face of common sense. It is precisely his ability to stick to the transmitted sources and simultaneously bring out new meanings—which, once expressed, seem almost self-evident—that has convinced the later tradition of his exceptional mastery. He tells us that the author of the Koran intends every meaning understood by every reader, and he reminds us that human authors cannot have the same intention. Moreover, he tells us that if someone re-reads a Koranic verse and sees exactly the same meaning that he saw the previous time, he has not read it “properly”—that is, in keeping with the haqq of the divine speech—for the meanings disclosed in the Three Books are never repeated.

God’s words, like our own spoken words, dissipate quickly, so he renews them constantly, “at every breath” (ma‘ al-anfâs). This is to say that “everything other than God” (the standard definition of the cosmos) is re-created at each instant (tajdîd al-khalq fi’l-ânât) and all things undergo constant change. The notion that “There is no repetition in [God’s] self-disclosure” (lâ takrâr fi’l-tajallî) is a basic principle of Ibn ‘Arabî’s thought. He sees it as a straightforward application of tawhîd. By acknowledging the unity of the Real, we recognize that it is one and unique in its every act, which means that each created thing and each moment of each thing is one and unique; nothing can ever be repeated precisely because of each thing’s uniqueness and the divine infinity.

2.2 Deiformity

Ibn ‘Arabî’s basic project is to map out the possibilities of human becoming, to clarify the distinction between haqq and bâtil—truth and falsehood, reality and unreality, right and wrong—and to point his readers toward perfection, that is, realization of the Real “to the extent of human capacity” (‘alâ qadr tâqat al-bashar), as the philosophers liked to put it. This in turn requires becoming characterized by the divine names (al-takhalluq bi asmâ’ Allâh), a process discussed by al-Ghazâlî among others and called by Avicenna al-ta’alluh, being like unto God, or deiformity. God created human beings in the form of the name Allah itself, which is called “the all-comprehensive name” (al-ism al-jâmi‘), because it is the referent of all other divine names. Realization is then the process of actualizing knowledge of the Three Books and bringing the soul into perfect harmony with the Real, a harmony that becomes apparent in the transformation of character and the flowering of virtue. The science of “ethics” (akhlâq, pl. of khuluq, character) does not concern itself simply with knowledge of right behavior, but aims rather at understanding the soul’s rootedness in the divine names and mapping out the path of becoming characterized by them. The Koran sets up Muhammad as the perfect model here with the words it directs at him, “You have a magnificent character [khuluq ‘azîm]” (68:4). This can be nothing but the full realization of the divine speech, “the magnificent Koran” (al-qur’ân al-‘azîm, 15:87). According to Ibn ‘Arabî, this is why Muhammad’s wife ‘Â’isha said about him, “His character was the Koran.”

2.3 Names and Relations

The Koran often speaks of God’s “names” (asmâ’), and it mentions a good number of them—not “ninety-nine”, as is traditionally said, but anywhere between seventy and twice as many, depending on the criteria used in counting. The names, which are often called “attributes” (sifât), provide the points of reference for Islamic theology. Ibn ‘Arabî distinguishes between “the names of the names” (asmâ’ al-asmâ’), which are the names voiced in human language, and the names in themselves, which are realities in divinis. Theologians wrote many books listing the names and explaining their significance for God, the cosmos, and the human soul. Ibn ‘Arabî devoted a book-length chapter of the Openings specifically to them, and he composed an independent treatise summarizing their role in human becoming (Ibn ‘Arabî, Kitâb kashf al-ma‘nâ).

Names are basic to the quest for deiformity because the Real in itself, in its very Essence (dhât), is known only to itself. “Others” (ghayr), which are the signs/verses written out in the Three Books, know the Essence only inasmuch as it reveals itself to them. In other words, although everything is a “face” (wajh) of God—“Wherever you turn, there is God’s face” (Koran 2:115)—to make distinctions among the omnipresent faces we need to know their names and recognize their haqqs.

The word used to designate the Essence, al-dhât, is a pronoun meaning “possessor of”. Originally it was an abbreviation for dhât al-asmâ’, “the possessor of the names”; hence the synonymous term, al-musammâ, “the Named”. The Koran refers to the Essence as “He” (huwa), which alerts us only to the fact that something is there. The word can just as well be translated as “It”, of course, because the Essence is beyond gender, but Arabic grammar classifies all nouns and pronouns as either masculine or feminine (indeed, when speaking of the Essence, Ibn ‘Arabî and others use the pronoun hiya, “She”, because dhât is feminine, and they sometimes explain why the Essence is more properly feminine than masculine; Murata 1992, 196–99). What we know from the names is that “He/She” is merciful, knowing, alive, and so on, but in itself the Essence remains unknown. Each name designates a specific quality that becomes manifest the moment there is talk of the Real (al-haqq) and creation (al-khalq). Hence Ibn ‘Arabî says that the divine names can properly be called relations (nisab).

The unique characteristics of human beings derive from their ability to name things, which in turn results from the fact that they alone were created in the form of the all-comprehensive name. A proof-text is the verse, “God taught Adam the names, all of them” (Koran 2:30). This means not only the names of the particulars—God’s signs in the Three Books—but also the names of the universals, which the Koran calls God’s “most beautiful names” (al-asmâ’ al-husnâ). Human beings in any case have the potential to know all names, but not the Essence named by the names. About that one can only know “that it is” (the fact of its existence), not “what it is” (its quiddity). Inasmuch as the names correspond to the Essence, their meanings remain unknown, so they are simply markers of transcendence or “incomparability” (tanzîh). Inasmuch as they denote an added quality, such as mercy, knowledge, life, forgiveness, or vengeance, they indicate God’s immanence or “similarity” (tashbîh). In short, Ibn ‘Arabî’s theological vision combines the apophatic and kataphatic approaches.

3. Ontology

Foremost among the technical terms of philosophy that Ibn ‘Arabî employs is wujûd, existence or being, a word that had come to the center of philosophical discourse with Avicenna. In its Koranic and everyday Arabic sense, wujûd means to find, come across, become conscious of, enjoy, be ecstatic. It was used to designate existence because what exists is what is found and experienced. For Ibn ‘Arabî, the act of finding—that is, perception, awareness, and consciousness—is never absent from the fact of being found. If on the one hand he speaks of wujûd in the standard Avicennan language of necessity and possibility, he simultaneously talks of it—in terms long established by the Sufi tradition—as the fullness of divine presence and human consciousness that is achieved in realization (Dobie 2007).

Among the Koranic divine names is “Light” (al-nûr), for God is “the light of the heavens and the earth” (24:35). Naming God “Light” is tantamount to naming him Being, for, as Qûnawî explains, “True Light brings about perception but is not perceived”, just as True Being brings about manifestation and finding but is neither manifest nor found. Qûnawî continues by saying that True Light is “identical with the Essence of the Real in respect of Its disengagement from relations and attributions” (Qûnawî, al-Fukûk, 225). In other words, True Light is Nondelimited Being (al-wujûd al-mutlaq), and it discloses itself as delimited being (al-wujûd al-muqayyad). It is precisely this Light that brings about finding, awareness, and perception. Just as there is no true being but God, so also there is no true finder but God and nothing truly found but God. As Ibn ‘Arabî explains:

Were it not for light, nothing whatsoever would be perceived [idrâk], neither the known, nor the sensed, nor the imagined. The names of light are diverse in keeping with the names of the faculties…. Smell, taste, imagination, memory, reason, reflection, conceptualization, and everything through which perception takes place are light. As for the objects of perception… they first possess manifestation to the perceiver, then they are perceived; and manifestation is light…. Hence every known thing has a relation with the Real, for the Real is Light. It follows that nothing is known but God. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:276–77)

3.1 Wahdat al-Wujûd

Ibn ‘Arabî has typically been called the founder of the doctrine of wahdat al-wujûd, the Oneness of Being or the Unity of Existence, but this is misleading, for he never uses the expression. Passages in his writings that approximate it have no special significance, nor are they out of place in the general trend of contemporary philosophy and theology, both of which affirmed the unity of the Necessary Being. Why wahdat al-wujûd was singled out to typify Ibn ‘Arabî’s position is not clear. Part of the reason is that he highlights tawhîd as his guiding principle and gives wujûd a special prominence in his vocabulary. It was utterly obvious to him that there is no Real Being but God and that everything other than God is unreal being; this is another way of saying what Avicenna says, that all things are possible or contingent save the Necessary Being. In short, Ibn ‘Arabî, and even more so his followers like Qûnawî, focused on the Real Wujûd as the one, unique reality from which all other reality derives. On the rare occasions when his immediate followers used the expression wahdat al-wujûd, they did not give it a technical sense. The first author to say that Ibn ‘Arabî believed in wahdat al-wujûd seems to have been the Hanbalite polemicist Ibn Taymiyya (d. 1328), who called it worse than unbelief. According to him, it means that no distinction can be drawn between God and the world. His attack set in motion a long controversy over the term, often with little or no attempt to define it. At least seven different meanings were ascribed to it in the later literature, and Orientalists followed suit, declaring that Ibn ‘Arabî invented the doctrine, and then interpreting it negatively (à la Ibn Taymiyya) or, less commonly, positively (à la ‘Abd al-Rahmân Jâmî [d. 1492], the first of Ibn ‘Arabî’s defenders to embrace the expression) (Chittick, 1994b).

3.2 Nondelimitation

To call Real Being “one” is to speak of the unity of the Essence. In other terms, it is to say that Being—Light in itself—is nondelimited (mutlaq), that is, infinite and absolute, undefined and indefinable, indistinct and indistinguishable. In contrast, everything other than Being—every existent thing (mawjûd)—is distinct, defined, and limited. The Real is incomparable and transcendent, but it discloses itself (tajallî) in all things, so it is also similar and immanent. It possesses such utter nondelimitation that it is not delimited by nondelimitation. “God possesses Nondelimited Being, but no delimitation prevents Him from delimitation. On the contrary, He possesses all delimitations, so He is nondelimited delimitation” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:162.23).

3.3 Imagination

Imagination (khayâl), as Corbin has shown, plays a major role in Ibn ‘Arabî’s writings. In the Openings, for example, he says about it, “After the knowledge of the divine names and of self-disclosure and its all-pervadingness, no pillar of knowledge is more complete” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:309.17). He frequently criticizes philosophers and theologians for their failure to acknowledge its cognitive significance. In his view, ‘aql or reason, a word that derives from the same root as ‘iqâl, fetter, can only delimit, define, and analyze. It perceives difference and distinction, and quickly grasps the divine transcendence and incomparability. In contrast, properly disciplined imagination has the capacity to perceive God’s self-disclosure in all Three Books. The symbolic and mythic language of scripture, like the constantly shifting and never-repeated self-disclosures that are cosmos and soul, cannot be interpreted away with reason’s strictures. What Corbin calls “creative imagination” (a term that does not have an exact equivalent in Ibn ‘Arabî’s vocabulary) must complement rational perception.

In Koranic terms, the locus of awareness and consciousness is the heart (qalb), a word that has the verbal sense of fluctuation and transmutation (taqallub). According to Ibn ‘Arabî, the heart has two eyes, reason and imagination, and the dominance of either distorts perception and awareness. The rational path of philosophers and theologians needs to be complemented by the mystical intuition of the Sufis, the “unveiling” (kashf) that allows for imaginal—not “imaginary”—vision. The heart, which in itself is unitary consciousness, must become attuned to its own fluctuation, at one beat seeing God’s incomparability with the eye of reason, at the next seeing his similarity with the eye of imagination. Its two visions are prefigured in the two primary names of the Scripture, al-qur’ân, “that which brings together”, and al-furqân, “that which differentiates”. These two demarcate the contours of ontology and epistemology. The first alludes to the unifying oneness of Being (perceived by imagination), and the second to the differentiating manyness of knowledge and discernment (perceived by reason). The Real, as Ibn ‘Arabî often says, is the One/the Many (al-wâhid al-kathîr), that is, One in Essence and many in names, the names being the principles of all multiplicity, limitation, and definition. In effect, with the eye of imagination, the heart sees Being present in all things, and with the eye of reason it discerns its transcendence and the diversity of the divine faces.

He who stops with the Koran inasmuch as it is a qur’ân has but a single eye that unifies and brings together. For those who stop with it inasmuch as it is a totality of things brought together, however, it is a furqân…. When I tasted the latter…, I said, “This is lawful, that is unlawful, and this is indifferent. The schools have become various and the religions diverse. The levels have been distinguished, the divine names and the engendered traces have become manifest, and the names and the gods have become many in the world”. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:94.16)

When Ibn ‘Arabî talks about imagination as one of the heart’s two eyes, he is using the language that philosophers established in speaking of the soul’s faculties. But he is more concerned with imagination’s ontological status, about which the early philosophers had little to say. Here his use of khayâl accords with its everyday meaning, which is closer to image than imagination. It was employed to designate mirror images, shadows, scarecrows, and everything that appears in dreams and visions; in this sense it is synonymous with the term mithâl, which was often preferred by later authors. Ibn ‘Arabî stresses that an image brings together two sides and unites them as one; it is both the same as and different from the two. A mirror image is both the mirror and the object that it reflects, or, it is neither the mirror nor the object. A dream is both the soul and what is seen, or, it is neither the soul nor what is seen. By nature images are/are not. In the eye of reason, a notion is either true or false. Imagination perceives notions as images and recognizes that they are simultaneously true and false, or neither true nor false. The implications for ontology become clear when we look at the three “worlds of imagination”.

In the broadest sense of the term, imagination/image designates everything other than God, the entire cosmos inasmuch as it is contingent and evanescent. This is what Ibn ‘Arabî calls “Nondelimited Imagination” (al-khayâl al-mutlaq). Each of the infinite words articulated in the All-Merciful Breath discloses Being in a limited form. Everything without exception is both God’s face (wajh), revealing certain divine names, and God’s veil (hijâb), concealing other names. Inasmuch as a thing exists, it can be nothing but that which is, the Real Being; inasmuch as it does not exist, it must be other than the Real. Each thing, in Ibn ‘Arabî’s most succinct expression, is He/not He (huwa/lâ huwa)—Real/unreal, Being/nonexistence, Face/veil. “In reality, the ‘other’ is affirmed/not affirmed, He/not He” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:501.4).

In a narrower sense of the word, imagination denotes what Corbin calls the mundus imaginalis (‘âlam al-khayâl). Like most traditions, Islam conceives of the cosmos as a hierarchy of worlds, usually two or three; the Koran contrasts the Unseen (ghayb) with the Visible (shahâda), and these are typically called the world of spirits and the world of bodies, or, in philosophical terms, the intelligible and the sensible realms. The Koran also speaks of “heaven, earth, and everything in between”, and one of Ibn ‘Arabî’s contributions was to bring out the full implications of the in-between realm, which in one respect is unseen, spiritual, and intelligible, and in another respect visible, corporeal, and sensible. This is precisely the mundus imaginalis, where spiritual beings are corporealized, as when Gabriel appeared in human form to the Virgin Mary; and where corporeal beings are spiritualized, as when bodily pleasure or pain is experienced in the posthumous realms. The mundus imaginalis is a real, external realm in the Cosmic Book, more real than the visible, sensible, physical realm, but less real than the invisible, intelligible, spiritual realm. Only its actual existence can account for angelic and demonic apparitions, bodily resurrection, visionary experience, and other nonphysical yet sensory phenomena that philosophers typically explain away. Ibn ‘Arabî’s foregrounding of the in-between realm was one of several factors that prevented Islamic philosophy from falling into the trap of a mind/body dichotomy or a dualistic worldview.

The third world of imagination belongs to the microcosmic human book, in which it is identical with the soul or self (nafs), which is the meeting place of spirit (rûh) and body (jism). Human experience is always imaginal or soulish (nafsânî), which is to say that it is simultaneously spiritual and bodily. Human becoming wavers between spirit and body, light and darkness, wakefulness and sleep, knowledge and ignorance, virtue and vice. Only because the soul dwells in an in-between realm can it choose to strive for transformation and realization. Only as an imaginal reality can it travel “up” toward the luminosity of the spirit or “down” toward the darkness of matter.

3.4 The Barzakh

In discussing the ontological role of image/imagination, Ibn ‘Arabî often uses the term barzakh (isthmus, barrier, limit), which in the Koran is that which stands between the sweet and salty seas (25:53, 55:20) and prevents the deceased soul from returning to the world (23:100). Generally, theologians understood it to be the “location” of the soul after death and before the Day of Resurrection. Ibn ‘Arabî employs the term to designate anything that simultaneously divides and brings together two things, without itself having two sides, like the “line” that separates sunlight and shade. He uses the term Supreme Barzakh (al-barzakh al-a‘lâ) as a synonym for Nondelimited Imagination. It is, in other words, the cosmos, the realm of possible things, which in themselves are neither necessary nor impossible, neither infinite nor finite. Or, it is the Breath of the All-Merciful, which is neither Nondelimited Being nor articulated words.

The Real is sheer Light and the impossible is sheer darkness. Darkness never turns into Light, and Light never turns into darkness. The created realm is the barzakh between Light and darkness. In its essence it is qualified neither by darkness nor by Light, since it is the barzakh and the middle, having a property from each of its two sides. That is why He “appointed” for man “two eyes and guided him on the two highways” (Koran 90:8–10), for man exists between the two paths. Through one eye and one path he accepts Light and looks upon it in the measure of his preparedness. Through the other eye and the other path he looks upon darkness and turns toward it. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:274.28)

4. Things and Realities

The divine names designate the universal qualities that suffuse existence, such as life, knowledge, desire, power, speech, generosity, and justice (these often being called “the seven leaders” among the names). These qualities are found in everything, because they pertain to the very Essence of the Real and accompany its self-disclosure. They remain largely nonmanifest, however, because each thing has its own preparedness (isti‘dâd) or receptivity (qâbiliyya), and none can display the Real per se. Although each thing is a face, each is also a veil; He/not He.

God says, “The giving of your Lord can never be walled up” (Koran 17:20). In other words, it can never be withheld. God is saying that He gives constantly, while the loci receive in the measure of the realities of their preparedness. In the same way, you say that the sun spreads its rays over the existent things. It is not miserly with its light toward anything. The loci receive the light in the measure of their preparedness. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 1:287.10)

What then determines the measure of preparedness? This goes back to a thing’s “reality” (haqîqa), its “whatness” or “quiddity” (mâhiyya). This is determined not by our definitions, but by God’s knowledge, because he knows the thing always and forever, whether or not it exists in the cosmos. Ibn ‘Arabî commonly refers to the realities simply as “things” (ashyâ’, pl. of shay’) or “entities” (a‘yân, pl. of ‘ayn). They do not exist in themselves, because nothing truly exists but the Real Being, so they are “the nonexistents” (al-ma‘dûmât). In philosophical terms, they are “possible” (mumkin), so they may or may not come to exist, in contrast to the Real Being, which is necessary (wâjib), so it cannot not exist.

What exactly are things? They are the concomitants (lawâzim) of Being, or the potentialities of manifestation latent in Infinite Possibility, or the never-ending delimitations of the Nondelimited. If a thing is found in the cosmos, it is a specific self-disclosure of Real Being, a face of God, a word articulated in the All-Merciful Breath, a color made visible by the radiance of Light. Inasmuch as things appear, they display Being and its attributes; inasmuch as their receptivity is delimited and defined, they act as veils. Each is a barzakh, an imaginal thing, simultaneously an image of Being and an image of nothingness.

There is no true being that does not accept change except God, for there is nothing in realized Being but God. As for everything other than He, that dwells in imaginal being…. Everything other than the Essence of the Real is intervening imagination and vanishing shadow. No created thing remains upon a single state in this world, the next world, and what is between the two, neither spirit, nor soul, nor anything other than the Essence of God. Rather, each continuously changes from form to form, constantly and forever. And imagination is nothing but this…. So the cosmos only became manifest within imagination…. It is it, and it is not it. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:313.12)

The philosophers and theologians commonly debated God’s knowledge of the particulars. The Koran says repeatedly that God knows everything. “Not a leaf falls”, it says, “but God knows it” (6:59). Ibn ‘Arabî holds that God’s knowledge of both universals and particulars pertains to the Essence and does not change. God knows the falling leaf always and forever, and when it is time for it to fall, he says to it, “Fall!” So also are all things: “His only command, when He desires a thing, is to say to it ‘Be!’, and it comes to be” (Koran 36:82).

In themselves the known things are nonexistent (like ideas that have no existence outside our minds), but when God issues the “engendering command” (al-amr al-takwînî)—the word “Be!” (kun)—they enter into being (kawn). Ibn ‘Arabî calls the thingness of the things in the divine knowledge “the thingness of fixity” (shay’iyyat al-thubût), because the things in themselves never change. Despite appearances, the engendering command does not remove them from their fixity, for nothing becomes manifest but Being, though delimited and defined by the thingness of the things. The common example is light: When it shines through a piece of colored glass, it appears as colored, but light alone is manifest.

4.1 Fixed Entities

Most famously, Ibn ‘Arabî discusses the things known to God as “fixed entities” (a‘yân thâbita). Early translators opted for expressions like immutable or permanent “archetypes” or “essences”, without noting that there is no difference in whatness between “fixed entities” and “existent entities” (a‘yân mawjûda). The fixed entities are the things inasmuch as they are nonexistent in themselves but known to God; the existent entities are the exact same things inasmuch as they have been given a certain imaginal or delimited existence by the engendering command. The fixed entities are not the “archetypes” of the existent entities but are rather identical (‘ayn) with them; nor are they “essences”, if by this is meant anything other than the entities’ specific whatness.

By having recourse to the fixity of entities in the divine knowledge, Ibn ‘Arabî is able to say that the dispute between theologians and philosophers over the eternity of the world goes back to their perception of the entities. Those who maintain that the world is eternal have understood that “the Real is never qualified by first not seeing the cosmos, then seeing it. On the contrary, He never ceases seeing it.” Those who maintain that the world is qualified by new arrival (hudûth) “consider the existence of the cosmos in relation to its own entity”, which is nonexistent. Hence they understand that it must have come into existence (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:666.35).

Followers of Ibn ‘Arabî sometimes distinguished between divine names and entities by calling the former “universal names” and the latter “particular names”. Ibn ‘Arabî observes theological norms when he declares that the divine names are “conditional” (tawqîfî), which is to say that we should call God only by those names that he himself uses in scripture. Ibn ‘Arabî also acknowledges, however, that every single thing is a divine name, because each designates the Nondelimited in respect of a certain delimitation. In this sense, each thing, each entity, is a “specific face” (wajh khâss) of God that differentiates it from every other thing. After quoting the prophetic saying that God has “ninety-nine” names, Ibn ‘Arabî explains that these names designate the “mothers” of the names, which give birth to all the rest. He continues:

Every one of the possible entities has a specific divine name that gazes upon it and gives it its specific face, thereby distinguishing it from every other entity. The possible things are infinite, so the names are infinite, for new relations arrive with the new arrival of the possible things. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 4:288.1)

4.2 The Reality of Realities

Ibn al-‘Arabî calls the word shay’, thing, “one of the most indefinite of the indefinites” (min ankar al-nakirât), because it can refer to anything whatsoever, existent or nonexistent, real or unreal. Nonetheless, he tells us that he avoids using it in reference to God because God does not use it to name himself. He does call God an entity, however, especially in the phrase “the One Entity” (al-‘ayn al-wâhida), typically in contexts that bring to mind what the later tradition sometimes called the doctrine of the Oneness of Being. For example:

Through Him we [existent entities] become manifest to Him and to us. In one respect we are through Him, but He is not through us, since He is the Manifest, and we remain with our own root [i.e., nonexistence], even if we bestow—through the preparedness of our entities—certain affairs that belong to our entities, and even if we are named by names that the veiled person supposes to be our names, such as Throne, Footstool, Intellect, Soul, nature, sphere, body, earth, heaven, water, air, fire, inanimate object, plant, animal, and jinn. All this belongs to One Entity, nothing else. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 1:691.14)

Ibn ‘Arabî does in fact refer to God as a thing in one passage of an early work, and this has caught the attention of several observers, because he mentions there “the third thing”, a notion that seems to throw light on his whole approach (Takeshita 1982, Bashier 2004). At first he seems to be talking in the standard Avicennan language of necessity and possibility, but then he brings up the notion of barzakh to explain how these two can be interrelated. Things, he says, can be divided into three sorts. The first sort is qualified by wujûd in its very essence, and this is the Necessary Being, God, who is nondelimited in existence (mutlaq al-wujûd) and who bestows existence on all things. The second sort is existent (mawjûd) through God, namely delimited existence (al-wujûd al-muqayyad), which is the cosmos, everything other than God. “As for the Third Thing”, he writes:

it is qualified neither by existence nor by nonexistence, neither by new arrival nor by eternity…. The cosmos becomes manifest from this Third Thing, for this thing is the Reality of the Universal Realities of the cosmos, which are intelligible to the mind…. If you say that this thing is the cosmos, you speak the truth, and if you say that it is the Eternal Real, you speak the truth. If you say that it is neither the cosmos nor the Real but rather an added meaning, you speak the truth. (Ibn ‘Arabî, Inshâ’, 16–17)

Given the detailed description of the Third Thing provided in the full passage, it is clear that Ibn ‘Arabî is discussing Nondelimited Imagination as the Supreme Barzakh. The Third Thing, however, never became established as a technical term, in contrast to the synonym that he mentions in this same passage, the Reality of Realities, also called the Universal Reality and the Muhammadan Reality. Reality (haqîqa), as already noted, is used to mean entity, quiddity, thing, and possible thing, though it is commonly used more broadly as well. Thus God’s Koranic names are called realities, but not entities or things.

There is no existent possible thing in everything other than God that is not connected to the divine relations and lordly realities that are known as the Most Beautiful Names. Therefore every possible thing is in the grasp of a divine reality. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:115.27)

By mentioning “universal” realities in talking about the Third Thing, Ibn ‘Arabî means the divine names and attributes, which become manifest through the particular realities, the entities. He has in view a version of the Tree of Porphyry, though he never uses the expression: Each individual (leaf) is a member of a species (twig), which in turn belongs to a genus (branch), and so on, until all are eventually subsumed under the genus of the genera, the Reality of Realities. This Reality is neither the Necessary Being nor the cosmos. In God it is the divine knowledge of all things, and as such is eternal; in the cosmos, it is the ever-changing totality that is temporal creation. Drawing from terminology he uses elsewhere, his followers call this Reality in God “the Most Holy Effusion” (al-fayd al-aqdas), and they define it as God’s self-disclosure to himself in himself, or the self-knowledge by which he knows every concomitant of his own infinity. They contrast it with “the Holy Effusion” (al-fayd al-muqaddas), the creative act that brings all realities and entities into manifestation.

4.3 Entification

Qûnawî gave currency to a technical term, ta‘ayyun or “entification”, that plays a major role in discussions of the Reality of Realities among Ibn ‘Arabî’s followers. The word is derived from ‘ayn, entity, and it means to become an entity. Given that an entity is a thing, one might translate it as “reification”, not in the sense of a human cognitive process, however, but as a designation for the manner in which Nondelimited Being becomes determined, limited, defined, and “thingish” in the process of disclosing itself as everything other than God. Thus all things are entifications or delimitations or determinations of the Nondelimited Real, which is then called “the Nonentification” (al-lâ ta‘ayyun). As for the Reality of Realities, it is the First Entification, because all other entifications follow in its wake.

In her lengthy, though far from complete, study of Ibn ‘Arabî’s technical terms, Su‘âd al-Hakîm mentions forty synonyms for the Reality of Realities, all under the heading al-insân al-kâmil, “the Perfect Man”. This notion, which can perhaps best be understood in Western terms as the Divine Logos through which all things are created, stands at the center of Ibn ‘Arabî’s worldview and integrates all its disparate dimensions. Hakîm does not mention the Third Thing as one of the synonyms, but the continuation of the passage in which Ibn ‘Arabî speaks of it does make clear that the Reality of Realities is indeed the reality (or the fixed entity) of the Perfect Man:

Man has two perfect relations, one through which he enters into the divine level, and one through which he enters into the cosmic level…. He is as it were a barzakh between the cosmos and the Real, bringing together and embracing both creation and the Real. He is the dividing line between the cosmic and divine levels, like the dividing line between shadow and sunlight. This is his reality. So he has nondelimited perfection in both new arrival and eternity, while God has nondelimited perfection in eternity and does not enter into new arrival—high exalted is He!—and the cosmos has nondelimited perfection in new arrival and does not enter into eternity—it is too base for that! Thus man is all-comprehensive. (Ibn ‘Arabî, Inshâ’, 22)

5. The Return

After tawhîd, the remaining two principles of Islamic faith are prophecy (nubuwwa) and the Return (ma‘âd), a word that is often translated loosely as eschatology. For both philosophers and Sufis, discussion of prophecy focused on human deiformity, and the issues they raised led theologians and jurists to accuse them of claiming to be greater than the prophets; Ibn ‘Arabî in particular was the center of a long controversy over the relative merits of prophet and saint (Chodkiewicz 1993b).

Both schools of thought also had a great deal to say about the Return, which was viewed in two respects: compulsory and voluntary. From the standpoint of the compulsory Return, the cosmos unfolds following its own ineluctable laws, and human beings go back to God in a series of stages that mirror the stages of cosmogenesis. From the standpoint of the voluntary Return, free will allows human beings to play a role in determining the trajectory of their own becoming. To a certain degree they are co-creators of their own souls and the posthumous realms, which are experienced in karmic terms, that is, as the result of a chain of causality set in motion by their own individual understandings, character traits, and activities. Ibn ‘Arabî marks a watershed in the discussion of both sorts of Return, not least because his explications of the mundus imaginalis allowed him to provide rational arguments for issues like bodily resurrection that, according to Avicenna, could not be understood by reason but can only be accepted on the basis of faith (Avicenna, al-Shifâ’, 347–48; Avicenna, al-Najât, 3:291). Ibn ‘Arabî’s leads were expanded on by later thinkers, most exhaustively by Mullâ Sadrâ in the fourth book of his magnum opus, al-Asfâr al-arba‘a, on the topic of the soul and its unfolding (Mullâ Sadrâ 2008).

5.1 The Circle of Existence

When the theologians discussed the Return, they tried to prove the accuracy of the Koranic depictions of the Day of Resurrection, hell, and paradise, mainly by appealing to the authority of God’s word. They had little to say about the actual nature of the soul, the structure of the cosmos, or the ontological status of the posthumous realms. In contrast, both philosophers and Sufis were intensely interested in these issues, as well as in the complementary question of the Origin (mabda’). Origin and Return became major themes in both schools of thought, but, in contrast to the philosophers, Sufis highlighted the exemplary role of Muhammad. Thus, for example, they drew a favorite image from a Koranic verse related to the Prophet’s “night journey” (isrâ’, also called the mi‘râj or “ladder”), when he was taken up through and beyond the heavens to encounter God: “He was two-bows’-length away, or closer” (53:9). In Arabic the word qaws or bow, like Latin arcus, also means the arc of a circle, so the two bows can be understood as two arcs. These came to be called “the descending arc” (al-qaws al-nuzûlî), that is, the path of increasing delimitation and darkness that leads away from the Origin, and “the ascending arc” (al-qaws al-su‘ûdî), the ever-increasing disengagement (tajarrud) and luminosity of the soul on the path of the Return.

5.2 Stages of Ascent

It was noted that one of Ibn ‘Arabî’s cosmological schemes describes the universe in terms of twenty-eight letters that articulate words in the All-Merciful Breath. Twenty-one of these letters correspond to stages of the descending arc, which reaches its lowest point with the four elements. The remaining letters designate the stages of the ascending arc, beginning with minerals, going on to plants, animals, angels, and jinn, and then on to man, the twenty-seventh letter. The twenty-eighth and final letter designates “the levels, stations, and stages”, that is, the invisible degrees of perfection achieved by the unfolding of human souls on the path of the Return.

The decisive difference between animals and humans lies not in speech or rationality, but rather in the fact that man was created in the form of God per se, that is, God as designated by the all-comprehensive name. Everything else was created under the care of less comprehensive names. Adam’s divine form is God’s all-inclusive face, the Reality of Realities that embraces the full range of possible entifications of Nondelimited Being. The human microcosm has the potential to realize—that is, to actualize the reality of—everything present in the Book of the Cosmos and the Book of Scripture. Just as the visible, corporeal world came into manifestation by way of several stages of entification, beginning with the Reality of Realities and descending by way of the invisible worlds until it reached the minerals, so also the “levels, stations, and stages” come into existence through the on-going self-disclosure of Real Being in the invisible realms of the ascending arc and reach their fruition when they return to the Origin. It is at that point that the circle of existence is completed, the dividing line disappears, and the imaginal distinction between Real and creation is effaced. As Ibn ‘Arabî writes:

“He was two-bows’-length away.” Nothing makes the two bows/arcs manifest from the circle save the imagined line. It is sufficient that you have said that it is “imagined”, since the imagined is that which has no existence in its entity… . The cosmos, next to the Real, is something imagined to have existence, not an existent thing. The existent thing and existence are nothing but the Entity of the Real. This is His words, “Or closer.” The “closer” is the removal of this imagined thing. When it is removed from imagination, nothing remains but a circle, and the two arcs are not entified. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 4:40.9)

Human embodiment at the visible level represents an essential stage in the manifestation of the Reality of Realities, but realization of that Reality takes place within the soul, that is, on the imaginal and spiritual levels. The possibilities of manifestation represented by plants and animals are relatively limited; external appearance reveals their secrets to observers, and no one confuses a cabbage with a carrot, or a horse with a donkey. But such is not the case with human beings, whose external uniformity conceals an unlimited inner diversity. The imaginal and spiritual contours of human souls, their awareness and character traits, can never be judged by the body’s appearance; human virtue and vice pertain to unseen realms. Culture, art, literature, politics, science, technology, and other peculiarly human accomplishments are the soul’s exteriorizations. Ibn ‘Arabî is not concerned, however, with every human possibility, because the paths that lead away from the full and balanced realization of the divine form are legion. Rather, he wants to delineate the broad contours of the perfections of deiformity, for it is these that lead to harmony with the Real in the posthumous realms. Even on this level, however, it is impossible even to enumerate these perfections, given that, as he tells us, their archetypes number 124,000, in keeping with the number of prophets from the time of Adam.

5.3 The Two Commands

Ibn ‘Arabî often addresses the cosmic uniqueness of human beings in terms of the command (amr), an important Koranic term that has a strong bearing on the way in which theologians and philosophers addressed the issue of determinism and free will, or nature and nurture. It was said earlier that the “engendering command” (al-amr al-takwînî) is the creative word “Be!” (kun) and that it turns nonexistent entities into existent entities. God addresses this command to all existent things without exception, and everything is obedient to it. It provides no way to distinguish between right and wrong, good and evil, better and worse, because all things are exactly what they must be. Everything manifests the Real, al-Haqq, and each is a specific face of God with its own haqq. From this standpoint, nothing in the cosmos is bâtil—false, vain, or wrong.

The fact is, however, that human beings, created in the form of God’s all-comprehensive name, are always faced with choices. Rational investigation is handicapped in its ability to choose the good over the bad, the right over the wrong, the beautiful over the ugly, the haqq over the bâtil, because, without outside help, it cannot transcend the evanescent images that make up the appearance of the cosmos. It has no access to the ultimate criteria whereby the haqq of things—their reality, truth, rightness, and appropriateness vis-à-vis the Real—can be discerned. In other words, the cosmic and human books cannot be interpreted rightly (bi’l-haqq) without guidance (hudâ) from the Real (al-haqq), the author of the engendering command. Guidance is precisely the function of the prophets, by means of whom God issues commandments and prohibitions. This act of issuing is called “the prescriptive command” (al-amr al-taklîfî), because it sets down principles and directives that need to be followed in order to discern the haqqs of things and act appropriately.

The engendering command brings the cosmos into existence, but the divine attributes demand much more than life, awareness, desire, power, and other qualities that are presupposed by the existence of minerals, plants, and animals. Among the ontological possibilities actually present in the Essence and actually manifest in the universe are mercy, love, compassion, forgiveness, justice, fairness, wisdom, and many other moral and ethical traits whose significance only becomes clear in human activity and interactions. All these are ontological qualities, but, in order for them to become fully manifest, the engendering command must give rise to the prescriptive command, which instructs people in the haqq of love, mercy, beneficence, kindness, and other traits. Becoming rightly characterized by the divine names does not happen simply by the natural course of events; it calls for the engagement of the will. Only by choosing the haqq over the bâtil, right over wrong, good over evil, can people realize the full possibilities of their own deiformity.

By making guidance available, the prescriptive command also provides the possibility of error and misguidance. It is the occasion, in other words, for the actualization of various possibilities of being and becoming that are demanded by divine attributes such as severity, wrath, pride, and vengeance, not to speak of forgiveness and pardon. In any case, human beings, through their own freedom, play a role in actualizing possibilities of the Divine Infinity that otherwise would have no raison d’être, paradise and hell being the most salient examples. Distinguishing between the two commands allows us to grasp the difference between fact and value, between what is and what ought to be. But these are two sides of the same self-disclosure of Being. By issuing commands and prohibitions, the Real introduces causal factors that force human beings to assume responsibility for what they will become on the moral and spiritual levels. This is why Ibn ‘Arabî says that people are “compelled to be free” (majbûr fî ikhtiyârihim). The degree to which they conform to the letter and spirit of the prescriptive command determines “the levels, stations, and stages” that they will reach in the ascending arc of the Return; posthumously, their levels and stages will become differentiated in the ascending levels of paradise and the descending levels of hell. Without human (or analogous, all-comprehensive, free beings), an infinity of ontological possibilities would not find their actualization. As Ibn ‘Arabî puts it, “If not for us, the next world would never become differentiated from this world” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:253.21).

6. Human Perfection

Like the philosophers, Ibn ‘Arabî sees the human soul as an unlimited potential and understands the goal of life to lie in the actualization of that potential. Avicenna sums up the philosophical view in a passage found in two of his major works:

The perfection specific to the rational soul is for her to become an intellective world within which is represented the form of the All, the arrangement intelligible in the All, and the good that is effused upon the All…. She turns into an intelligible world, parallel with the entire existent world, and witnesses what is unconditioned comeliness, unconditioned good, and real, unconditioned beauty while she is unified with it, imprinted with its likeness and guise, strung upon its thread, and coming to be of its substance. (Avicenna, al-Shifâ’, 350; Avicenna, al-Najât, 3:293)

Ibn ‘Arabî agrees with this general picture, but he considers it barren, because it fails to take into account those dimensions of reality—the vast majority of dimensions, as he sees it—that do not properly belong to the world of intellection; all the intermediary realms, not to speak of the sensible realm itself, are essentially imaginal, not intelligible. He insists, in fact, that “Imagination is the widest known thing” because “it exercises its properties through its reality over every thing and non-thing. It gives form to absolute nonexistence, the impossible, the Necessary, and possibility; it makes existence nonexistent and nonexistence existent” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 1:306.17, 306.6).

In several passages, Ibn ‘Arabî describes the ascent of the soul on the ladder (mi‘râj) to God. One of these is Chapter 167 of the Openings, called “On the true knowledge of the alchemy of happiness”. Here he contrasts the parallel ladders of a philosopher and a prophet’s follower. In each stage, the follower meets what Muhammad met in his Night Journey, but the philosopher finds only what his knowledge of the natural world allows him to find; in short, when seekers pass through the ascending realms of the mundus imaginalis, they gain what accords with their own cognitive preparation. In the first heaven, for example, the follower meets the prophet Adam, whom God had “taught all the names”, and he benefits from Adam’s omniscience, but the philosopher meets only the moon. In each successive level, the follower encounters a prophet and assimilates his knowledge, but the philosopher finds the celestial spheres (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, Chapter 167, 1997, 2019). It is worth noting that Avicenna himself had written an interpretation of Muhammad’s night journey in philosophical terms that runs parallel to what Ibn ‘Arabî ascribes to the philosopher here, but the text was in Persian, so Ibn ‘Arabî would not have seen it (Heath 1992).

6.1 The Station of No Station

Each of “the levels, stations, and stages” represents an actualization of a potential deiformity, or an instance of becoming characterized by one or more divine names. Each divine attribute and each prophetic archetype sets up a “station” (maqâm) in which human beings can stand and from which they can observe the nature of things. There are countless stations of knowledge and spiritual perfection, and each bestows specific character traits and points of view. Ibn ‘Arabî often tells us that such-and-such a chapter of the Openings pertains to the standpoint of Moses, or Jesus, or Abraham. In the same way, he divides Ringstones into twenty-seven chapters, each of which is dedicated to a prophet or sage who is presented as a word or logos (kalima) embodying the wisdom (hikma) of a specific divine name. His ultimate purpose in describing the various standpoints is to highlight the Station of No Station (maqâm lâ maqâm), also called “the Muhammadan Station”. This is full realization of the Reality of Realities; it embraces all stations and standpoints without being determined and defined by any of them. “The people of perfection have realized all stations and states and passed beyond these to the station above both majesty and beauty, so they have no attribute and no description” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:133.19).

Perfect Man, standing in the Station of No Station, is in effect the human analogue of Nondelimited Being, which assumes every delimitation without itself becoming limited. Qûnawî sometimes calls this station “the point at the center of the circle of existence” because it has no dimensions in itself, but all of manifest reality is arranged in reference to it. He also explains it in terms of the contrast between Being and quiddity (i.e., fixed entity). Everyone other than Perfect Man has a specific whatness, distinguishing him from everyone else, which is to say that each person stands in a defined “level, station, and stage”. Perfect Man, however, manifests the Real per se, so his whatness is identical with Being, not with this or that. Qûnawî writes:

No one tastes this and reaches its source except him whose essence has come to be nondelimited. Then the bonds—the contingent properties, states, attributes, stations, configurations, acts, and beliefs—are loosened, and he is not confined by any of them. By his essence he flows in everything, just as existence flows in the realities of all things without end or beginning…. When the Real gave me to witness this tremendous place of witnessing, I saw that its possessor has no fixed entity and no reality. (Qûnawî, al-Nafahât, 265–66; cited in Chittick 2004)

6.2 Perfect Man

As the model of human possibility, Perfect Man represents the individual who has traversed the circle of existence, reached the station of Two-Bows’ Length, and returned to his origin, the Reality of Realities. Standing in the Station of No Station, he is He/not He, Eternal/newly arrived, Infinite/finite. He alone functions as God’s “vicegerent” (khalîfa) or representative, the intermediary between God and creation, which is precisely the role for which Adam was created (Koran 2:30). Qûnawî writes:

The true Perfect Man is the barzakh between Necessity and possibility, the mirror that brings together in its essence and level the attributes and properties of Eternity and new arrival… . He is the intermediary between the Real and creation… . Were it not for him and the fact that he acts as a barzakh no different from the two sides, nothing of the cosmos would receive the divine, unitary effusion, because of the lack of correspondence and interrelationship. (Qûnawî, al-Fukûk, 248)

To put this in another way, Perfect Man is the spirit that animates the cosmos. This is the theme that begins the first chapter of Ibn ‘Arabî’s Ringstones, which explains the manner in which Adam—the human being—manifests the wisdom of the all-comprehensive name. In a parallel way, he writes in the Openings:

The whole cosmos is the differentiation of Adam, and Adam is the All-Comprehensive Book. In relation to the cosmos he is like the spirit in relation to the body. Hence man is the spirit of the cosmos, and the cosmos is the body. By bringing all this together, the cosmos is the great man, so long as man is within it. But, if you look at the cosmos alone, without man, you will find it to be like a proportioned body without a spirit. (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:67.28)

6.3 Divine Presences

Ibn ‘Arabî’s followers often summarized the notion of Perfect Man by having recourse to a scheme that came to be known as “the Five Divine Presences” (al-hadarât al-ilâhiyyat al-khams). Ibn ‘Arabî uses presence (hadra) to designate any realm in which Being (i.e., finding and being found) becomes manifest under the auspices of a general quality; in this sense it is roughly synonymous with world (‘âlam) or level (martaba). In one passage, for example, he explains that the cosmos is made up of two worlds or two presences, that of the Unseen and that of the Visible, “though a third presence is born between the two from their having come together”, and that is the world of imagination (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 3:42.5). Most commonly, as in his chapter on the divine names in Openings, he uses presence to designate a name’s realm of influence and then describes various ways in which the properties and traces of the name are displayed in the cosmos and human beings; one might say that he is describing how things participate in Platonic ideas. The most inclusive of these presences is the “divine” (al-hadrat al-ilâhiyya), that is, the realm that comes under the sway of the all-comprehensive name. Concerning it Ibn ‘Arabî writes, “There is nothing in Being/existence [wujûd] but the Divine Presence, which is His Essence, His attributes, and His acts” (Ibn ‘Arabî, al-Futûhât, 1911 edition, 2:114.14).

Qûnawî seems to have been the first to speak of “the Five Divine Presences”, and the expression soon became commonplace, though several different schemes were proposed. He uses the expression to explain how the Reality of Realities, or the First Entification, embraces all entifications and thereby becomes manifest in five basic realms. The first presence is the Reality of Realities in divinis, embracing the divine knowledge of the cosmos. The second, third, and fourth presences are the same three worlds about which Ibn ‘Arabî spoke: the unseen (spiritual), the imaginal, and the visible (corporeal). The fifth presence is Perfect Man in his all-comprehensive deployment, embracing the other four presences in a synthetic whole: his fixed entity is identical with the Reality of Realities, his spirit with the unseen world, his soul with the imaginal world, and his body with the visible realm (Chittick 1984). In this way of conceiving of man, the role that the Logos plays in giving birth to the cosmos is clear. Qûnawî puts it in a nutshell: Perfect Man is “the perfected human reality of the Essence, one of whose levels is the Godhead [al-ulûhiyya]; all existent things are the loci of manifestation for his differentiated qualities and properties” (Qûnawî, al-Nafahât, 66–67).


Primary Texts

Texts by Ibn ‘Arabî

  • ‘Anqâ mughrib fî khatm al-awliyâ’ wa shams al-maghrib, G. T. Elmore (trans.), Islamic Sainthood in the Fullness of Time: Ibn al-‘Arabî’s Book of the Fabulous Gryphon, Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1999.
  • Fusûs al-hikam, A. ‘Afîfî (ed.), Beirut: Dâr al-Kutub al-‘Arabî, 1946.
  • Fusûs al-hikam, Binyamin Abrahamov (trans.), Ibn al-‘Arabî’s Fusûs al-hikam: An Annotated Translation of “The Bezels of Wisdom”, London: Routledge, 2015.
  • Fusûs al-hikam, R. W. J. Austin (trans.), Ibn al’Arabî: The Bezels of Wisdom, Ramsey: Paulist Press, 1981.
  • Fusûs al-hikam, C. K. Dagli (trans.), The Ringstones of Wisdom, Chicago: Kazi, 2004.
  • al-Futûhât al-makkiyya, Cairo, 1911; reprinted, Beirut: Dâr Sâdir, n.d.
  • al-Futûhât al-makkiyya, 14 volumes, O. Yahia (ed.), Cairo: al-Hay’at al-Misriyyat al-‘Âmma li’l-Kitâb, 1972–91.
  • al-Futûhât al-Makkiyya: Textes choisis/Selected Texts, M. Chodkiewicz, W. C. Chittick, C. Chodkiewicz, D. Gril, and J. Morris (trans.), Paris: Sindbad, 1989; also available as The Meccan Revelations, 2 vols., New York: Pir Press, 2002–4.
  • al-Futûhât al-makkiyya, Chapter 167, L’alchimie du bonheur parfait, S. Ruspoli (trans.), Paris: Berg International, 1997.
  • Inshâ’ al-dawâ’ir, in H. S. Nyberg, Kleinere Schriften des Ibn al-‘Arabî, Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1919.
  • Inshâ’ al-dawâ’ir, “The Book of the Description of the Encompassing Circles”, P. B. Fenton and M. Gloton (trans.), in Muhyiddin Ibn ‘Arabi: A Commemorative Volume, Hirtenstein, S. and M. Tiernan (eds.), Shaftesbury: Element, 1993, pp. 12–43.
  • al-Isfâr ‘an natâ’ij al-asfâr, D. Gril (ed. and trans.), Le dévoilement des effets du voyage, Combas: Editions de l’Éclat, 1994.
  • Ittihâd al-kawnî: The Universal Tree and the Four Birds , Angela Jaffray (trans.), Oxford: Anqa, 2006.
  • Kitâb kashf al-ma‘nâ ‘an sirr asmâ’ Allâh al-husnâ, P. Beneito (ed. and trans.), El secreto de los nombres de Dios, Murcia: Editora Regional de Murcia, 1997.
  • Mashâhid al-asrâr al-qudsiyya, S. Hakim and P. Beneito (ed. and trans.), Las Contemplaciones de los Misterios, Murcia: Editora Regional de Murcia, 1994.
  • Mashâhid al-asrâr al-qudsiyya, P. Beneito and C. Twynch (trans.), Contemplation of the Holy Mysteries, Oxford: Anqa, 2001.

Other Primary Texts

  • Avicenna (Ibn Sînâ), al-Najât, M. S. al-Kurdî (ed.), Cairo: Matba‘at al-Sa‘âda, 1938.
  • –––, al-Shifâ’: The Metaphysics of The Healing: A Parallel English-Arabic Text, M. E. Marmura (ed. and trans.), Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2005.
  • Mullâ Sadrâ, 2008, Spiritual Psychology: The Fourth Intellectual Journey in Transcendent Philosophy, tr. Latimah-Parvin Peerwani, London: ICAS Press.
  • Qûnawî, Sadr al-Dîn, al-Fukûk, M. Khwâjawî (ed.), Tehran: Mawlâ, 1992.
  • –––, al-Murâsalât: Annäherungen: Der mystisch-philosophische Briefwechsel zwischen Sadr ud-Dîn-i Qônawî und Nasîr ud-Dîn-i Tûsî, G. Schubert (ed.), Beirut: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1995.
  • –––, al-Nafahât al-ilâhiyya, M. Khwâjawî (ed.), Tehran: Mawlâ, 1996.
  • –––, “al-Nusûs: The Texts,” William C. Chittick (trans.), An Anthology of Philosophy in Persia, vol. 4: From the School of Illumination to Philosophical Mysticism, S.H. Nasr and M. Aminrazavi (ed.), London: I.B. Tauris, 2012, pp. 416–34.

Secondary Literature

  • Addas, C., 1993, Quest for the Red Sulphur: The Life of Ibn ‘Arabî, Cambridge, England: The Islamic Texts Society.
  • Almond, I., 2004, Sufism and Deconstruction: A Comparative Study of Derrida and Ibn ‘Arabi, London: Routledge.
  • Asín Palacios, M., 1931, El Islam cristianizado, Madrid. French trans. as L’Islam christianisé: Étude sur le Soufisme d’Ibn ‘Arabî de Murcie, Paris: Guy Trédaniel, 1982.
  • Akti, Selahattin, 2016, Gott und das Übel: Die Theodizee-Frage in der Existenzphilosophie des Mystikers Muhyiddin Ibn Arabi, Lucerne: Chalice Verlag.
  • Bashier, S., 2004, Ibn al-‘Arabî’s Barzakh: The Concept of the Limit and the Relationship between God and the World, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 2012, The Story of Islamic Philosophy: Ibn ‘Arabî, Ibn Tufayl, and Others on the Limit between Naturalism and Tradition, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Böwering, G., 1994, “Ibn ‘Arabî’s Concept of Time”, in God is Beautiful and He Loves Beauty: Festschrift in Honour of Annemarie Schimmel, Alma Giese and J. Christoph Bürgel (eds.), New York: Peter Lang, pp. 71–91.
  • Burckhardt, T., 1977, Mystical Astrology According to Ibn ‘Arabi, Gloucestershire: Beshara Publications.
  • Chittick, W. C., 1982, “The Five Divine Presences: From al-Qûnawî to al-Qaysarî”, The Muslim World, 72: 107–28.
  • –––, 1989, The Sufi Path of Knowledge: Ibn al-‘Arabî’s Metaphysics of Imagination, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 1994a, Imaginal Worlds: Ibn al-‘Arabî and the Problem of Religious Diversity, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 1994b, “Rûmî and Wahdat al-wujûd”, in Poetry and Mysticism in Islam: The Heritage of Rûmî, A. Banani, R. Hovanisian, and G. Sabagh (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 70–111.
  • –––, 1996, “Ibn ‘Arabî” and “The School of Ibn ‘Arabî”, in History of Islamic Philosophy, S. H. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 497–523.
  • –––, 1998, The Self-Disclosure of God: Principles of Ibn al-‘Arabî’s Cosmology, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 2004, “The Central Point: Qûnawî’s Role in the School of Ibn ‘Arabî”, Journal of the Muhyiddin Ibn ‘Arabi Society, 35: 25–45.
  • –––, 2005, Ibn ‘Arabi: Heir to the Prophets, Oxford: Oneworld.
  • –––, 2013, “Ibn ‘Arabî on the Ultimate Model of the Ultimate”, Models of God and Alternative Ultimate Realities, Jeanine Diller and Asa Kasher (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 915–29.
  • Coates, P., 2002, Ibn ‘Arabi and Modern Thought: The History of Taking Metaphysics Seriously, Oxford: Anqa.
  • Chodkiewicz, M., 1993a, An Ocean Without Shore: Ibn ‘Arabî, the Book, and the Law, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 1993b, The Seal of the Saints, Cambridge, England: The Islamic Texts Society.
  • Corbin, H., 1958, L’imagination créatrice dans le soufisme de Ibn ‘Arabî, Paris: Flammarion; trans. Ralph Manheim, Creative Imagination in the Sûfism of Ibn ‘Arabî, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1969; re-issued by Princeton University Press as Alone with the Alone, 1998.
  • Dagli, Caner, Ibn al-‘Arabî and Islamic Intellectual Culture, London: Routledge.
  • DeCilis, Maria, 2013, Free Will and Predestination in Islamic Thought: Theoretical Compromises in the Works of Avicenna, al-Ghazali and Ibn ‘Arabi, London: Routledge.
  • Dobie, R. J., 2007, “The Phenomenology of Wujud in the Thought of Ibn ‘Arabi”, in Timing and Temporality in Islamic Philosophy and Phenomenology of Life, A. T. Tymieniecka (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 313–22.
  • –––, 2009, Logos & Revelation: Ibn ‘Arabi, Meister Eckhart, and Mystical Hermeneutics, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Ebstein, Michael, 2013, Mysticism and Philosophy in al-Andalus: Ibn Masarra, Ibn al-‘Arabî and the Ismâ`îlî Tadition, Leiden: Brill.
  • Ghandour, Ali, 2018, Die theologische Erkenntnislehre Ibn al-Arabis, Hamburg: Editio Gryphus.
  • Hakîm, S. al-, 1981, al-Mu‘jam al-sûfî, Beirut: Dandara.
  • Heath, P., 1992, Allegory and Philosophy in Avicenna (Ibn Sînâ), With a Translation of the Book of the Prophet Muhammad’s Ascent to Heaven, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Izutsu, T., 1966, A Comparative Study of the Key Philosophical Concepts in Taoism and Sufism, Tokyo: Keio University; second edition, Sufism and Taoism, Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1983.
  • –––, 1977, “The Concept of Perpetual Creation in Islamic Mysticism and Zen Buddhism”, in Mélanges offerts à Henry Corbin, S. H. Nasr (ed.), Tehran: Institute of Islamic Studies, pp. 115–48; reprinted in Izutsu, Creation and the Timeless Order of Things, Ashland, Oregon: White Cloud Press, 1994, pp. 141–73.
  • Knysh, A. D., 1999, Ibn ‘Arabi in the Later Islamic Tradition: The Making of a Polemical Image in Medieval Islam, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Lala, Ismail, 2019, Knowing God: Ibn ‘Arabî ‘Abd al-Razzâq al-Qâshânî’s Metaphysics of the Divine, Leiden: Brill.
  • Lipton, Gregory A., 2018, Rethinking Ibn Arabi, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Mayer, T., 2008. “Theology and Sufism”, The Cambridge Companion to Classical Islamic Theology, T. Winter (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 258–87.
  • McAuley, D. E., 2012, Ibn ‘Arabî’s Mystical Poetics, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Morris, J., 1986–87, “Ibn ‘Arabi and his Interpreters”, Journal of the American Oriental Society, 106: 539–51, and 107: 101–19.
  • –––, 2003, “Ibn ‘Arabî’s Rhetoric of Realisation: Keys to Reading and ‘Translating’ the ‘Meccan Illuminations,’” Journal of the Muhyiddin Ibn ‘Arabi Society, 33: 54–99, and 34: 103–45.
  • –––, 2005, The Reflective Heart: Discovering Spiritual Intelligence in Ibn ‘Arabî’s Meccan Illuminations, Louisville: Fons Vitae.
  • Murata, Sachiko, 1992, The Tao of Islam: A Sourcebook on Gender Relationships in Islamic Thought, Albany, State University of New York Press.
  • –––, Chittick, W. C., and Tu Weiming, 2008, The Sage Learning of Liu Zhi: Islamic Thought in Confucian Terms, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Nettler, R. J., 2003, Sufi Metaphysics and Quranic Prophets: Ibn ‘Arabi’s Thought and Method in the Fusus al-Hikam, Oxford: Islamic Texts Society.
  • Rahmati, Fateme, 2007, Der Mensch als Spiegelbild Gottes in Der Mystik Ibn ‘Arabis, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz.
  • Rosenthal, F., 1988, “Ibn ‘Arabî between ‘Philosophy’ and ‘Mysticism’”, Oriens, 31: 1–35.
  • Sells, M. A., 1994, Mystical Languages of Unsaying, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Shah-Kazemi, R., 2006, Paths to Transcendence: According to Shankara, Ibn Arabi, and Meister Eckhart, Bloomington: World Wisdom.
  • Smirnov, A. V., 1993, “Nicholas of Cusa and Ibn ‘Arabî: Two Philosophies of Mysticism”, Philosophy East and West, 43: 65–86.
  • Stelzer, S., 1996, “Decisive Meetings: Ibn Rushd, Ibn ‘Arabî, and the Matter of Knowledge”, Alif, 16: pp. 19–55.
  • Takeshita, M., 1982, “An Analysis of Ibn ‘Arabî’s Inshâ’ al-Dawâ’ir with Particular Reference to the Doctrine of the ‘Third Thing’”, Journal of Near Eastern Studies, 41: 243–60.
  • –––, 1987, Ibn ‘Arabî’s Theory of the Perfect Man and its Place in the History of Islamic Thought, Tokyo: Institute for the Study of Languages and Cultures of Asia and Africa.
  • Todd, Richard, 2014, The Sufi Doctrine of Man: Sadr al-Dîn al-Qûnawî’s Metaphysical Anthropology, Leiden: Brill.
  • Yousef, M. H., 2007, Ibn ‘Arabi—Time and Cosmology, London: Routledge.
  • Zargar, C. A., 2011, Sufi Aesthetics: Beauty, Love, and the Human Form in the Writings of Ibn ‘Arabi and ‘Iraqi, Columbia, S.C.: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Zine, Mohammed Chaouki, 2010, Ibn ‘Arabi: Gnoséologie et manifestation de l’être, Beirut: Arab Scientific Publishers.

Copyright © 2019 by
William Chittick <william.chittick@stonybrook.edu>

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