Ibn Sina's Natural Philosophy

First published Fri Jul 29, 2016

Ibn Sīnā (980–1037)—the Avicenna of Latin fame—is arguably the most important representative of falsafa, the Graeco-Arabic philosophical tradition beginning with Plato and Aristotle, extending through the Neoplatonic commentary tradition and continuing among philosophers and scientists in the medieval Arabic world. Avicenna's fame in many ways is a result of his ability to synthesize and to extend the many intellectual trends of his time. These trends included not only the aforementioned Greek traditions, but also the Islamic theological tradition, Kalām, which was emerging at the same time that the Greek scientific and philosophical texts were being translated into Arabic. Avicenna's own unique system survives in no fewer than three philosophical encyclopedias—Cure (or The Healing), The Salvation and Pointers and Reminders. Each provides a comprehensive worldview ranging from logic to psychology, from metaphysics to ethics (although admittedly, ethics is treated only scantly). At the middle of this Avicennan worldview is natural philosophy or physics (ʿilm ṭabīʿī). The significance of natural philosophy, Avicenna's physics in particular, is twofold. First, it represents Avicenna's best attempt to explain the sensible world in which we live and to provide the principles for many of the other special sciences. Second, Avicenna's natural philosophy lays the foundations for a full understanding of his advancements in other fields. Examples of this second point include, but are certainly not limited to, the ramifications of logical distinctions for the sciences, the physical basis of psychology (as well as the limitation of physicalism for a philosophy of mind) and the introduction of key problems that would become the focal points of metaphysical inquiry. In all cases, Avicenna assumes his readers know their physics.

As others before him, Avicenna understands natural philosophy as the study of body insofar as it is subject to motion. Thus the present study, after an overview of medieval physics generally, turns to Avicenna's account of the nature of body followed by his account of motion. Central to an account of bodies is whether they are continuous or atomic, and so one must consider Avicenna's critique of atomism and his defense and analysis of continuous magnitudes. The discussion of motion follows in two steps: one, his account of motion and, two, his account of the conditions for motion. The section on motion concentrates on Avicenna's unique understanding of the Aristotelian definition of motion as the first actuality of potential as potential, while the conditions for motion involve his understanding of time and place.

1. Medieval Physics

For Avicenna, the proper subject of natural philosophy, in its broadest or most general sense, is body insofar as it is subject to motion. Beyond general physics (al-samāʿ al-ṭabīʿī), the physical sciences are further divided into various special sciences distinguished according to either the kind of motion investigated or the kind of body treated. While Avicenna himself does not explicitly identify his decision procedure for dividing the special natural sciences, it is evidenced in the way that he divides up the books of his monumental encyclopedia of philosophy and the sciences, The Cure (al-Shifāʾ). For example, his book On the Heavens and Earth (Fī l-Samāʾ wa-l-ʿālam) from The Cure generally treats rectilinear and circular motion; On Generation and Corruption (Fī l-Kawn wa-l-fasād) deals with change as it occurs in the Aristotelian category of substance, whereas On Actions and Passions (Fī l-Afʿāl wa-l-infiʿālāt) concerns how bodies are affected and affect one another with respect to, for example, the primary qualities of hot-cold and wet-dry, which they possess. Avicenna distinguishes additional special natural sciences according to the specific sort of body being considered, namely, whether the body is inanimate—generally the subject matter of Meteorology (al-Maʿādin wa-l-āthār al-ʿulwiyya)—or the body is animate—the subject of psychology (literally, the science of the soul or animating principle). Avicenna further divides treating living bodies into general psychology (ʿilm al-nafs), botany (al-nabāt) and zoology (ṭabāʾiʿ al-hayawān). The focus of the present study is limited primarily to Avicenna's general natural philosophy, although at times the discussion is supplemented with developments in the special physical sciences.

1.1 Physical Causes and the Principles of Nature

The hallmark of natural philosophy and indeed of any science (sing. Gk. epistēmē, Ar. ʿilm) for Avicenna and the entire Aristotelian tradition is to uncover and to grasp the basic causes (sing. ʿilla) of the phenomenon under consideration. Like Aristotle before him, Avicenna identifies four sorts of causes: the matter, form, agent (or efficient cause) and end (or final cause) (Avicenna, [Ph], 1.10 and Avicenna, [MPh], bk. 6). For Avicenna the material cause is a wholly inert substratum for form, which explains any passivity or potentiality to be acted upon that a body might have. The form (ṣūra) is the cause, primarily, of a body's being the actual kind or species that it is and performing the various actions associated with that species; secondarily, a form might be the cause of the accidental features and determinations that belong to that body (Avicenna occasionally uses hayʾa for this second sense of the form). In general then, the form is the cause of any actuality, that is positive features or actions, that the body has or does. The efficient cause accounts for a body's undergoing motion and change (or even for its existence), while the final cause is that for the sake of which the form occurs in the matter.

Unlike Aristotle, Avicenna also recognizes a broader division of causes into physical causes and metaphysical causes (Avicenna, [Ph], 1.10 [3]). The distinction is best approached by considering the Aristotelian division between substances and accidents as found in the ten categories. (Within the Aristotelian tradition, including Avicenna, the ten categories purport to provide the broadest classification of ways things are found (mawjūd) in the world; Avicenna, [Cat], 1.1 and [MPh], 3.1.) The primary category is that of substance, which for Avicenna is the existence that belongs to a thing through itself, for example, the existence that belong to a human as human or a dog as dog (Avicenna, [MPh], 2.1 [1–2]). Accidents are what exist in another, namely, in a substance, and include a substance's quantity, quality, relation, where, when, position, possession, activity and passivity. Metaphysical causes involve what accounts for the existence and continual conservation of a substance, or more exactly a concrete particular. Physical causes in contrast involve those factors that bring about changes in the accidental features of bodies, primarily changes of quality, quantity, location and position. For example, a father is responsible for seeing that his semen becomes located within the mother, and the mother ensures that the right womb temperature for the fetus is maintained and that the fetus is fed. Location, temperature, possession of nutriment and the like belong to categories of accidents, not to that of substance. Consequently, for Avicenna the father and mother are most properly physical agents, that is, the cause of accidental changes that prepare the matter for the form. As such the parents are not the cause of the existence of the offspring's species form by which it is the specific substance it is. Instead, the metaphysical agent—the one who imparts the species form to the matter such that there comes to be a substance of the same kind as the parents—is a separate (immaterial) agent, which Avicenna calls the Giver of Forms.[1]

Regardless of whether one is considering physical or metaphysical causes, any motion or change (whether of existence itself or just of some new accident), Avicenna explains, requires three things: (1) the form that comes to be as a result of the change, (2) the matter in which that form comes to be and (3) the matter's initial privation of that form (Avicenna, [Ph], 1.2 [12–13]). These three—the form, matter and privation—are frequently referred to, following Aristotle, as “principles of nature” (cf. Aristotle, Physics, 1.7). While Avicenna happily agrees that these three factors are present in every instance of something's coming to be after not having been, he is not as happy as to whether all three of these features are equally “principles” (sing. mabdaʾ). His concern is that, strictly speaking, causes and principles exist simultaneous with their effects, whereas privation is only ever prior to the change and passes away with the change (Avicenna, [Ph], 1.3 [14]; McGinnis 2012, Lammer 2016, §3.3). More properly speaking, Avicenna contends, privation is a precondition for change rather than a principle. Still, he concedes that if one is lax in one's use of “principle” so as to understand a principle as “whatever must exist, however it might exist, in order that something else exists, but not conversely” (ibid) privation would count as a principle of change. Avicenna reasons thusly: The elimination of the privation from something as changeable renders that thing no longer changeable, whereas the elimination of that changeable thing itself does not eliminate the privation. In other words, insofar as something is changeable, it depends on or requires that there be some privation. Conversely, privation does not depend on and does not require that there be anything changeable. Thus privation has a certain ontological priority to the changeable. There can be privation without the changeable, but there cannot be the changeable without privation.

1.2 Nature

Closely related to causes and principles is the notion of a nature (Gk. phusis, Ar. ṭabīʿa), for Aristotle defined a nature as “a principle of being moved and being at rest in that to which it belongs primarily, not accidentally but essentially” (Aristotle, Physics, 2.1, 192b21–3). In the same place, Aristotle further adds that trying to prove that natures exist is a fool's errand, since it is self-evident that things have such (internal) causes. Before proceeding to Avicenna, however, it should be noted that there is a certain ambiguity in Aristotle's overall treatment of nature. The ambiguity involves whether nature should be taken in a passive sense: is nature a cause of a substance's being moved? Or, alternatively, should nature be taken in an active sense: is a nature a cause of a substance's (self) motion? In Physics, 2.1, the text where Aristotle defines nature, he suggests, although does not explicitly claim, that nature can be understood in both senses: a passive nature, which corresponds with a substance's matter, and an active nature, which corresponds with the form of that substance, and so a cause of its motion. In contrast, later in the Physics, he argues that natures should be understood exclusively as passive (Aristotle, Physics, 8.4, 192b21–3). This conclusion follows upon Aristotle's principle that everything that is moved must be moved by something, which he established at Physics, 7. The principle is significant for a key element in Aristotle's his natural philosophy, namely, his proof for an unmoved mover. (The unmoved mover is intended to explain why there is motion at all.) The aforementioned principle is significant because if all natural substances were capable of self motion, it is no longer clear that there is a need for an unmoved mover to account for the motion of the cosmos. This ambiguity in Aristotle account of nature, namely, whether nature is an active source of moving or a passive factor of being moved, was the source of much discussion among Aristotle's subsequent Greek commentators, who included Alexander of Aphrodisias (ca. 200 CE) and the late Christian, Neoplatonic Philosopher John Philoponus (ca. 490–570). (For more detailed studies of this tradition see Macierowski & Hassing 1988, Lang 1992, 97–124 and Lammer 2015, 2016, ch. 4).

In his chapter “On Defining Nature” from The Cure (Avicenna, [Ph], 1.5), Avicenna begins by distinguishing between the motions and actions that proceed from a substance owing to external causes and those that proceed from a substance owing to the substance itself. For instance, water becomes hot as a result of some external heat sources, whereas it becomes cool of itself. Avicenna next identifies two sets of parameters for describing those motions and actions that proceed from a substance owing to that substance itself. They may either proceed from the substance as a result of volition or without volition. Additionally they may proceed either uniformly without deviation or non-uniformly with deviation. Thus there are four very general ways for dividing and describing all the motions and actions that are found in the cosmos.

volitional non-volitional
non-uniform animal soul plant soul
uniform celestial soul nature

(1) Motions and actions may proceed as a result of volition and do so in a uniform and unvarying way, such as the motion of the heavenly bodies. The internal cause in these cases, Avicenna tells us, is a celestial soul.[2] (2) Other motions and actions may proceed as a result of volition but do so in a non-uniform and varying way, like the motions and actions of animals; the internal cause in these cases is an animal soul. (3) Again, other motions and actions may not proceed as a result of volition and are non-uniform and varying, like plant growth; the internal cause in these cases is a plant soul. Finally (4) some motions and actions may proceed without volition while doing so in a uniform and unvarying way, like the downward motion of a clod of earth and the heating of fire; the internal cause in these cases is a nature.

Before turning to a full analysis of what a nature is, Avicenna first chides Aristotle (and Philoponus) for cavalierly asserting that the existence of natures is self-evident. While we are immediately aware of motions and actions that seemingly proceed from substances of themselves, that there truly exist internal causes of these actions and motions is certainly in need of demonstration. Indeed, one who first encounters the motion of a magnet, Avicenna gives as an example, might imagine that its motion is a result solely of itself rather than of iron in the vicinity. Moreover, during Avicenna's time the question of whether natures existed at all was a hotly debated topic between philosophers in the Graeco-Arabic tradition, like Avicenna, and thinkers in the Kalām tradition, the tradition of Islamic speculative theology and cosmology.

Proponents of the Kalām tradition, such as al-Bāqillānī (950–1013) and al-Ghazālī (1058–1111), had a two-stage critique. First, anticipating Hume by at least 700 years, these thinkers noted that observation alone could not distinguish between causal connections and mere constant conjunctions. (A contemporary example often found in statistic classes is that the summer sun's heat seems to be causally connected with ice cream's melting, whereas eating ice cream is only constantly conjoined, at least in the US, with an increase in violent crimes.) Observation alone, these thinkers warn us, cannot determine, for example, whether the cotton's burning, which follows upon placing fire in the cotton, or intoxication, which follows upon imbibing alcohol, is causally connected with the natures of fire and alcohol respectively, or whether these sets of events are merely constantly conjoined. Indeed the concurrence of two events may be a result of God's habit or custom (ʿāda or sunna) of causing the one event together with the other. While one might think that appealing to God to explain the various mundane events that we constantly observe around us is extravagant, Kalām thinkers countered that it was in fact the philosophers who are ontologically profligate. This point leads to the second stage of the Kalām critique of natures. God's (omnipotent) causal power extends to every actual or even possible event. God's causal power is either sufficient to produce these effects or it is not. If God's power is not sufficient, then either the deity needs the added “boost” of natural powers, or it needs natures as a tool or instrument, etc. This later position flirts with impiety. If, however, God's causal power is sufficient to produce every effect and there are also natures, functioning as internal causes, every event is over-determined. Indeed it is not clear at all what causal role natures have to play. A principle of parsimony, so the Kalām critique concludes, suggests that natures be jettisoned and one reserve all causal power to God alone. While Avicenna addresses the issue of the existence of natures and offers up a demonstration for their existence in the Metaphysics (4.2, 9.2 & 9.5), he also notes that the science of physics is not the proper place to undertake such an enterprise. That is because the existence of a science's subject matter, Avicenna notes following Aristotle, is never demonstrated within that very science itself but only in a higher science.

Having set aside the issue of whether natures exist and for present purposes posits that they do, Avicenna now unpacks Aristotle's definition. Aristotle's definition of nature as it came down to Avicenna in Arabic literally translates into English as “the primary principle of motion and rest in that to which it belongs essentially rather than accidentally” (quoted in Avicenna, [Ph], 1.5 [4]).[3] A “principle of motion,” Avicenna tells us, means “an efficient cause from which proceeds the production of motion in another, namely, the moved body” (ibid). Immediately we recognize that a nature for Avicenna can be understood as an active cause that produces motion. Such a position is to be contrasted with Aristotle's claim at Physics 8.4 that a nature is not an internal cause of a thing's motion, but of its being moved.[4] Next we learn that “primary” in the definition means that the nature causes the motion in the body without some further intermediary cause. As for “essentially,” (Gk. kath hauto, Ar. bi-dhātihi) it is an equivocal notion with two senses, Avicenna tells us. In one sense, “essentially” is predicated relative to the mover, while in another sense it is predicated relative to what is subject to motion, namely, the body. Thus, on the one hand, when “essentially” is said relative to the mover, a substance's nature, as efficient cause, essentially produces those motions and actions that typify the substance as the kind that it is. On the other hand, when “essentially” is said relative to the body, it refers to the body's essentially being subject to those naturally characteristic motions and actions. In effect, by distinguishing the two relative senses of “essentially,” Avicenna has made room for Aristotle's definition to include nature as active and as passive. To sum up, for Avicenna, a substance's nature is the immediate efficient cause for all of the naturally characteristic actions and motions it produces (active nature) as well as explaining why the body is subject to those characteristic actions and motions (passive nature).

2. Bodies and Magnitudes

2.1 General Background

With the distinction between nature as active and nature as passive in place, it becomes clear why Avicenna identifies the proper subject matter of natural philosophy with body insofar as it is subject to motion, for the science of physics studies nature in both of its active and passive senses. Nature as passive refers to that which is subject to motion, namely, bodies, while nature as active refers to the causes and conditions of the motions and actions that bodies naturally undergo. In this section, I begin with Avicenna's general introduction to bodies. I then take up his critique of atomism, specifically as that theory was developed within Kalām. Thereafter, I turn to Avicenna's theory of the continuity of magnitudes and his conception of infinity, concluding with a brief survey of his theory of the elements.

Sensible bodies (sing. jism or occasionally jirm), one can assume, are aggregations of parts. Avicenna, starting from this assumption, identifies two sets of parameters for describing the parts that make up sensible bodies (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.1 [1]). One set of parameters is that bodies are composed of either a finite or an infinite number of parts. The second is that either the parts exist within the body as actually distinct parts, like two or more planks of wood glued together to make a single beam, or the parts exist merely potentially, like the left and right parts of a single solid plank of wood. These two sets of parameters provided the logical spaces for a theory of sensible bodies. Given these parameters, sensible bodies, Avicenna continues, may be aggregates of (1) a finite number of actual parts, a position identified with that of the atomists; (2) an infinite number of actual parts, a position identified with that of Ibrāhīm al-Naẓẓām (c. 775–c. 845); (3) a finite number of potential parts, a position not held by anyone in Avicenna's time but apparently adopted by ʿAbd al-Karīm al-Shahrastānī (1086–1153) after him; or (4) an infinite number of potential parts, a position associated with the Aristotelian tradition and the contention that bodies are continuous and so potentially divisible ad inifinitum.

Avicenna makes short work of (2), al-Naẓẓām's position (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 1, ch. 2; and [Ph], 3.4 [1]). The parts are units of the whole, which must have either no magnitude or some magnitude. If the units have no magnitude, then while multiplying them may increase the number of units present in a body, it will not increase the size of the body. Consequently, bodies would not have any magnitude, an obviously false conclusion. If the units have some magnitude, be it ever so small, and the body is composed of an actual infinity of these units, then complains Avicenna, “the relation of the finite units to the infinite units would be the relation of a finite to a finite, which is an absurd contradiction” (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 1, ch. 2, p. 162). For instance, assume that al-Naẓẓām's unit measures some extremely small yet positive amount of distance, for example, 1.5 x 10-35 of a meter, then:

∞ al-Naẓẓām's-units : 1 m :: 1.5 x 10-35 al-Naẓẓām's-units : 1 m.

Thus ∞ : 1.5 x 10-35, that is, an infinite is proportional to a finite, which, as Avicenna notes, is absurd.

As for position (3), the composition of bodies out of a finite number of potential parts, Avicenna again does not treat it specifically. Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī (1201–1274), commenting Avicenna, notes that since these potential parts are finite in number within the body, they can be treated like atoms, which is the subject of the next section (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 1, ch. 3, p. 163).

2.2 Avicenna on Atomic/Discrete Magnitudes

2.2.1 Kalām Atomism

Aristotle had in his physical writings addressed and critiqued atomism (e.g., Aristotle, Physics, 6.1 and On Generation and Corruption, 1.2). In the time between Aristotle and Avicenna, however, there were a number of developments in atomic theory both by Epicurus, one generation after Aristotle, and by Muslim theologians, that is, proponents of Kalām, most of whom were atomists (Dhanani 1994, 2015). As a result, Avicenna's critique of atomism needed to address new innovations and challenges. One such innovation, which can be traced back to the Greek world, is a distinction between physical divisibility and conceptual divisibility. Thus, for example, the atoms of Democritus (d. 370 BCE) have as one of their properties shapes. If atoms have a shape and to have a shape is to have definite limits, then one might reason that Democritean atoms have distinct limits into which they can at least be conceptually divided, even if not physically divided. Aristotle in fact exploited this point in his critique of Democritus. In contrast, the minimal parts of Epicurus (d. 270 BCE) had no shape, and so were not subject to the same criticism. Indeed, Epicurean minimal parts are purportedly not merely physically indivisible but also conceptually indivisible. To provide a rough and ready image of an Epicurean minimal part, one might think of the surface thickness of a plank, and the plank itself as the aggregation of such surfaces. For example, then, when the surfaces of two planks are brought together tightly, intuitively one may think that the two surfaces remain two distinct physical things; the bottom of the top plank, for instance, is distinct from the top of the bottom plank. When some enormous number of these surfaces is aggregated, a plank with a definite thickness, one might imagine, results. So how thick are these surfaces? One cannot fathom, but again being so thin that dividing it further is inconceivable is the very point of Epicurus' minimal parts. Whatever the chain of transmission, it was Epicurus' minimal parts that Muslim atomists identified with their atoms, or more precisely, indivisible parts (sing. al-juzʾ alladhī lā yatajazzaʾu)—a spatial magnitude that was not merely physically indivisible but also conceptually indivisible.

Another difference between the theory of atomism that Aristotle addressed and the one that Avicenna does is the very nature of the atoms themselves. Democritus' atoms with their differences in shapes as well as differences in possible arrangement and positions are best considered as corpuscles, that is, small bodies. Thus when speaking of Democritus, we can speak of “corpuscular atomism.” Such is not necessarily the case with Epicurean minimal parts or Kalām atoms, which, while making up the parts of bodies, were not themselves bodies. While there is some dispute about this point concerning Epicurus, Kalām atomists are fairly consistent in saying that the sole property of their atoms is that they occupy space (mutaḥayyiz) but otherwise lack any other determinations. In fact, Kalām atoms might best be thought of as a matrix making up all space, with the individual atom representing the smallest spatial magnitude necessary for the occurrence of some co-incidental event, determination or accident, like being red or hot or wet or even possessing power. In this respect, Kalām atoms are comparable to the pixels on a modern-day TV or computer screen. The two are comparable in that both are the smallest relevant units in which a sensible effect occurs, whether some color for modern pixels or any accident more generally for Kalām atomists. Consequently, this variety of atomism might be called “pixelated atomism” to contrast it with the corpuscular atomism that had been the target of Aristotle's criticisms. The significant point is that Avicenna could not simply appeal to Aristotle and his attack on corpuscular atomism when critiquing atomism as he found it.

Regardless of what form of atomism one endorsed, a common argument in atomism's favor appeals to the notion of a sensible body's being an aggregation of parts. The argument is directed against the idea that a sensible body can be potentially divisible ad infinitum. The most general form of the argument rests on two principles: (1) the impossibility of an actual infinity, a premise that even most Aristotelians accepted; and (2) an analysis of potentiality in terms of an agent's power, namely, to say that some action φ is potential is to say that there exists an agent who has the power actually to do φ. As part of a reductio-style argument, one is asked to assume (3), bodies are potentially divisible infinitely. In that case, from (2), there must exist some agent (e.g., God) that can actually bring about the division. So let the agent enact the potential division. Either the result is an actually infinite number of parts or a finite number of parts. From (1), recall, an actual infinity is impossible. Therefore, the totality of potential parts that actually can be produced from the division is finite, but it was assumed that they were infinite, a contradiction. Since (1), (2) and (3) are mutually incompatible, one of these assumptions must be false. The atomists point to the assumption of infinite divisibility and a potentially infinite number of parts. Thus, the argument concludes, the parts from which sensible bodies are aggregated must be finite, whether actually or potentially.

2.2.2 Avicenna's Criticisms of Atomism

Avicenna's response to this argument against the potentially infinite divisibility of bodies is considered when discussing his theory of continuity. Prior to that, his reasons for rejecting atomism must be examined. To start, Avicenna accepts that division with respect to body is of two sorts: physical division and conceptual division. In physical division, there is the actual fragmentation of a body, with the parts of the body becoming physically separated and at a distance from one another. For example when one takes a single quantity of water and places part of it in one vessel and the other in another vessel. Avicenna concedes that it well may be the case that bodies have some physical limit beyond which they no longer can be physically divided and still remain the same sort of body. To provide an example of Avicenna's point, our quantity of water can be divided as water until one reaches a single water molecule; division beyond that point, while producing hydrogen and oxygen atoms, does not produce smaller particles of water. A single water molecule, then, is physically indivisible as water; it no longer remains as water after any further division. Still, inasmuch as a single water molecule occupies some space, however small, one can conceive of half of that water molecule, and so it is conceptually divisible qua magnitude. Whether there actually are such physically indivisible units, Avicenna insists, requires proof, which I consider when looking at Avicenna's elemental theory.

The form of atomism that Avicenna rejects is that there exist minimal parts that cannot even be conceptually divided further. These are the minimal parts of Epicurus and the atoms of Kalām. Avicenna's arguments against this conception of atomism takes two forms: one, arguments showing that there is a physical absurdity with such atoms and, two, arguments showing that this form of atomism is incompatible with our best mathematics, namely, that of Euclidean geometry. The following two examples give one a sense of how Avicenna's physical-style and mathematical-style criticisms work (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 1, ch. 1 and [Ph], 3.4; Lettinck 1988). While all the arguments considered are specifically directed toward a theory of pixilated atomism, they apply equally well to corpuscular atomism. Additionally, Avicenna has a series of arguments, not considered here, showing the absurdities that would follow on the purported motion of corpuscular atoms.

While some of Avicenna's physical-style arguments are quite complex and sophisticated, showing that the aggregation of bodies would simply be impossible on the Kalām atomists' view (an example can be found in Section 2.3 of the entry on Arabic and Islamic natural philosophy and natural science), the following thought experiment is perhaps more intuitively obvious. Posit a sheet of conceptually indivisible atoms between yourself and the sun. Certainly the side facing the sun is distinct from the side facing you, for if the side that the sun is illuminating is the very same side upon which you are gazing, there is no sense in which the sheet of atoms is between you and the sun. Thus on the assumption that it is physically possible for this sheet to exist between you and the sun, all the atoms composing the sheet have a sun-side and a you-side, and these two sides are distinct. Purportedly, conceptually indivisible atoms have been divided, a contradiction.

Avicenna's mathematical-style critique of Kalām atomism frequently appeal to issues associated with incommensurability. In this vein he argues that such geometrical commonplaces as diagonals and circles would be impossible on the assumption of conceptually indivisible atoms. For example, in the pixilated atomism of the Kalām, the atoms might be thought to form a three-dimensional Cartesian coordinate system with each atom corresponding to some ordered triplet on this space. A two-dimensional plane, then, would look something like a chessboard. Avicenna now has us describe a right isosceles triangle on this chessboard, setting the two equal sides, for instance, at 3 units. Given the Pythagorean Theorem, A2 + B2 = C2, we should be able to solve for the length of the hypotenuse, which is √18 ≈ 4.25. Avicenna, next observes that assuming Kalām atomism, the hypotenuse of our triangle must fall either well below the solution given by the Pythagorean theorem—namely, it would be 3 units if one just counts the 3 squares along the diagonal of a 3x3 chessboard—or significantly exceed it—for instance 6 units, if the atoms can somehow be stair stepped. Alternatively, one might consider units smaller than the atoms, but such a move is to give up atomism. Kalām atomism, then, cannot even approximate the answer of the Pythagorean Theorem, and yet the Pythagorean Theorem is arguably the most well-proven theorem in the history of mathematics. Given the choice between a dubious physical theory and our best mathematics, Avicenna sides with Euclidean geometry and its assumption of continuous magnitudes.[5]

2.3 Continuity

Having rejected atomism, with its central claim that sensible bodies must be aggregates of a finite number of conceptually indivisible parts, Avicenna must explain and defend his preferred account of bodies. Avicenna adopts a modified form of Aristotle's theory of the continuity of bodies. Aristotle himself had provided no fewer than three different accounts of continuity (Gk. sunecheia, Ar. ittiṣāl):

  1. AB is continuous iff AB can be divided into things always capable of further division (De Caelo, 1.1)
  2. A is continuous with B iff the extremities of A and B are one and the same (Physics, 6.1)
  3. A is continuous with B iff there is a common boundary at which they join together (Categories, 6)

Precisely because these three accounts are different, Avicenna starts his own discussion of continuity, claiming that “being continuous is an equivocal expression that is said in three ways” (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.2 [8]). Two of these senses, he continues, are relative notions, while only one, i.e., (3) above, identifies the true essence of what it is to be continuous. In fact, he even goes as far as to say that account (1) is not truly a definition of being continuous at all; rather, it is a necessary accident of the continuous that must be demonstrated, a point to which I return when I look at what Avicenna considers to be the proper account of continuity.

As for the relative notions of continuity, the explanations can be quick. First, discrete objects might be said to constitute a continuous whole relative to a motion. For example, all the connected cars on a moving locomotive are clearly distinct and separate things, and yet they move together as a continuous whole. Second, discrete objects might be said to be continuous according to Aristotle's definition (2) relative to some shared extremity. For example, for any angle ∠ABC greater than or less than 180°, the lines AB and BC share one and the same extremity, B, and yet are distinct and jointed. Neither of these senses is strictly speaking the target of the atomist's critique nor the thesis concerning the continuity of bodies and magnitudes that Avicenna (or other Aristotelians) is keen to defend. Thus for Avicenna only (3), that two things are continuous if and only if there is a common boundary at which they join together, captures the proper definition of continuity.

A continuous sensible body (or any magnitude), Avicenna insists, must ultimately lack any parts and instead must be considered entirely as a unified whole. Admittedly, one can posit parts in this unified whole, like the left-part and the right-part, but such accidental parts are wholly the result of one's positing and vanish, claims Avicenna, with the cessation of the positing.

[Such parts are] like what happens when our estimative faculty imagines or we posit two parts for a line that is actually one, where we distinguish one [part] from the other by positing. In that way, a limit is distinguished for [the line] that is the same as the limit of the other division. In that case, both are said to be continuous with each other. Each one, however, exists individually only as long as there is the positing, and so, when the positing ceases, there is no longer this and that [part]; rather, there is the unified whole that actually has no division within it. Now, if what occurs through positing were to be something existing in the thing itself and not [merely] by positing, then it would be possible for an actually infinite number of parts to exist within the body (as we shall explain), but this is absurd (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.2 [8]).

To press Avicenna's point a bit further, a continuous body has no parts in it, not even potential parts, if by “potential parts” one means points or the like latent within the body waiting for some power to actualize them or divide the body at them. To appreciate Avicenna's point here fully, a few words must be said about his conception of the form-matter constitution of bodies and the relation of his view of continuity to psychological processes.

Like Aristotle and other Aristotelians both before and after him, Avicenna is convinced that bodies are constituted of matter and form. If one considers just body as such, that is, disregarding any specific kind of body it might be, then this absolute body, Avicenna tells us, is a composite of matter (hayūlā) and the form of corporeality (ṣūra jismiyya). Avicenna conceives matter as wholly passive, having no active qualities or features. (For discussion's of Avicenna theory of matter see Hyman 1965; Buschmann 1979; Stone 2001; McGinnis 2012; but also see Lammer 2016, §3.2 for corrections of some of these earlier views.) In fact, Avicennan matter has no positive characterizations of its own at all by which it can be defined; rather, for Avicenna, matter is best understood solely in relation to the forms by which it is actualized and informed. Avicenna's matter, then, is intimately linked with relative privation, that is, some lack, which under the right conditions can be realized. Given matter's essentially privative character, it, then, cannot be the explanation for a sensible body's having the positive characteristics of being unified and one, nor the cause of that body's being extended so as to be subject to division. Instead, according to Avicenna, what makes a body a unified whole and subject to division is its form of corporeality.

For a determinate body to exist at all, Avicenna believes, it must have a determinate shape, and so be three dimensional, and so be localized in space. Both of these features are the result of its corporeal form (For a fuller discussion see Hyman 1965; Shihadeh 2014; Lammer 2016, §3.1). When the form of corporeality comes to inform matter, there comes to be a single unified body, existing on account of its particular and individual form of corporeality. Should the body be physically divided, the particular and individual form of corporeality is not so much divided as destroyed and replaced with two new particular and individual forms of corporeality corresponding with two new bodies. It is essentially the form of corporeality that unifies and makes a body numerically and actually one. Additionally, while the form of corporeality makes the body actually one, it also makes the body potentially many. That is to say, the form of corporeality is the cause of a body's being three-dimensional such that one can posit such divisions as right-side and left-side in it.

We are now led to the role of psychological processes in Avicenna's account of a continuous body's infinite divisibility. While it is true for Avicenna that continuous bodies can conceptually be divided without end, such a feature is not the result of any positive attribute within the body. This potentiality for division does not correspond with any positive features latent within the body. Instead the potentiality for infinite division refers to a privation in the matter of the body. The matter, extended and possessing quantity as a result of the form of corporeality, does not preclude or prevent one from positing imagined divisions within the body as small as one wants. Indeed, this psychological process of imaging or positing divisions in principle has no end. Thus, looking at, for example, a meter stick, one can posit a halfway point, then the halfway point of one side and then a further halfway point and so on as long as one likes; however, as soon as one stops the process of imagining halfway points, the imagined points (regardless of how many one has imagined) do not magically remain but altogether cease with the cessation of their being posited. The body remains as it always was, a unified whole, whose unity is only ever lost by actual physical division, not conceptual division.

With this conception of continuity in place, the Kalām argument against potential divisibility ad infinitum dissolves. Again that argument assumed two principles: (1) the impossibility of an actual infinity; and (2) an analysis of potentiality in terms of an agent's power, namely, the view that some action φ is potential if and only if there is an agent who has the power actually to do φ. In point of fact, Avicenna rejects both principles (his conception of infinity is discussed at 2.4); for now he simply questions the theologians' inference from something's being potential to the possibility of its being realized all at once at some moment or other. The original Kalām argument assumed that a potential infinity of divisions existed in a continuous body. In that case, the argument continued, let God actualize that potential, and one is confronted with an actual infinity. Avicenna in contrast understands the potential infinite divisibility of bodies in terms of an ongoing process of positing successive divisions within the magnitude, a process that by definition has no end. Of course, there is a contradiction here in assuming that some agent, even God, can get to the end of some process that has no end, but such a contradiction does not tell against Avicenna's theory of continuous bodies. In fact, Avicenna's conception of potential infinite divisibility is compatible with (2), since there is no immediate contradiction in saying that God eternally and without ceasing posits ever-decreasing halfway points in some magnitude. Still even in this case, there never is an actual infinity of such halfway points, as the proponents of Kalām atomism maintain.

2.4 Infinity and the Shape of the Cosmos

With the introduction of continuity and its corresponding notion of infinite divisibility one is also obliquely introduced to the notion of infinity (lā nihāya). Avicenna, following Aristotle's account of the infinite (apeiron) at Physics, 3.6, defines it as “that which whatever you take from it—and any of the things equal to that thing you took from it—you [always] find something outside of it” (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.7 [2]). In natural philosophy, the immediate issue is whether infinity exists either in quantities that posses some position or in numbers in an ordered series (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.7 [1]). The mutakallimūn, that is, the proponents of Kalām, were for the most part opposed to predicating the infinite of anything other than God. This opposition included both actual infinity and potential infinity. While it is notoriously difficult to give a precise account of the difference between the actual as opposed to the potential infinite, a rough characterization is this: In the case of an actually infinite magnitude, all the parts of that magnitude are somehow simultaneously and fully present, whereas in the case of the potentially infinite there is an going process or succession in which the units come to be, never wholly existing as actual at some given point or moment. While Avicenna happily accepts the reality of potential infinities, he denies that there are material instances of either actually infinite qualities, like infinitely large bodies, or numbers, like infinitely large sets of bodies, all of which exist simultaneously.[6]

Avicenna has a number of arguments attempting to show that an actual infinity in nature is impossible. These arguments can be divided into those that appeal to motion as part of the proof, and those that do not appeal to motion. Here I merely consider one of Avicenna's non-motion proofs against an actual (spatial) infinity. The argument, which I present, is not the preferred proof in either The Cure or The Salvation, although he had toyed with it in The Cure (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.8 [5–7]). Still it is his preferred and indeed only argument against an actual infinity in his shorter and last philosophical encyclopedia, Pointers and Reminders (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 1, ch. 11, p. 183–90).[7] Moreover, the proof is a uniquely Avicennan one.

The argument asks one to posit some actually infinite ray, AB and then another actually infinite ray, AC, so as to form an acute angle ∠BAC. Next Avicenna asks one to consider the gap, BC, between the two rays. The farther from A that BC is, the larger BC is. Since the two rays are actually infinitely extended, BC should, in principle, also be actually infinite; however, BC always lies between AB and AC and of necessity terminates at them, so BC is finite. Thus, there is a contradiction: BC is both finite and infinite and, claims Avicenna, what produced the contradiction is the assumption that there is actually infinite space. Whether Avicenna's new argument is successful became a matter of intense debate in post-classical Islamic natural philosophy, with such notables as Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī (1080–1165) and Najm al-Dīn al-Kātibī al-Qazwīnī (ca. 1203–1277) finding it wanting, whereas Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī (1201–1274) and Mullā Ṣadrā (1571–1636) considered it defensible.

Avicenna's arguments against an actual infinity in nature are in general all directed against the possibility of infinite spatial magnitude. Consequently, since space must be finite (i.e., limited), all bodies must be limited, and in being limited they have shape. This conclusion holds for the cosmos as a whole as well. As for the shape of the cosmos, while such a topic takes us slightly afield from a discussion of infinity, it does round out Avicenna's abstract discussion of body. For a number of reasons, Avicenna thinks that the shape of the cosmos must be spherical. While in some ways Avicenna takes this claim to be a matter of empirical observation, he also argues that since the nature of the heavenly bodies is completely homogeneous and unvarying, there cannot be dissimilarities in a heavenly body such that a part of it would be angular and another part rectilinear or such that part of it has one sort of curve and another part a different sort (Avicenna, [DC], 3; also Avicenna, [Ph], 1.8 [2] provides the general argument, albeit there applied to showing the sphericity of the Earth). Inasmuch as the cosmos is spherical, it must have some center, which, at least from the point of physics, Avicenna identifies with the Earth. (Strictly speaking the Earth is a bit off center in accordance with the demands of the Ptolemaic astronomy, which Avicenna adopts.)

We thus now have a general picture of Avicenna's conception of body in the abstract. Body is not composed of conceptually indivisible atoms but must be continuous and finite. In the next section I briefly consider body not in the abstract, but particular kinds of bodies, namely, the so-called elements.

2.5 Simple Bodies and the Elements

When Avicenna speaks of elements (sing. usṭuquss) and (material) components (sing. ʿunṣur), he means simple bodies, that is, bodies that are not composed of other sorts of bodies in the way that flesh, blood and bones, for example, are composed of more basics elements. Despite being simple, the elements are form-matter composites (Avicenna, [DC], 1). On account of their form and matter, elements have two powers: an active power following upon the element's form and a passive power following upon its matter.

2.5.1 The Motions and Qualitative Powers of the Elements

Additionally, Avicenna specifies different kinds of elements based upon three kinds of natural motions. The three kinds of natural motion are (1) motion around the center, (2) motion toward the center and (3) motion away from the center (Avicenna, [DC], 2). Celestial bodies are in turn identified with those bodies whose natural motion is around the center. Terrestrial bodies are identified with those undergoing rectilinear motion either toward or away from the center. By convention, what moves away from the center moves upward, while what moves toward the center moves downward. Avicenna believes that moving around the center, circular motion, is generically simple inasmuch as he thinks that there is no contrary to circular motion (Avicenna, [Ph], 4.6 [7–11] & [DC], 2).[8] Consequently, the very nature of a celestial body is to move circularly (Avicenna, [PR], namaṭ 2, ch. 12). As for the terrestrial bodies, moving upward and downward are also generic descriptions; however, Avicenna continues, each of these genera also has two species, corresponding with the different termini of the motion. Thus, for example, those bodies that move downward are generically alike in that they move away from the surrounding celestial sphere; however, they can differ in that some have the center as their proper place or terminus for their motion, whereas the terminus of other downward-moving bodies falls short of the center. Any body that has the center as its proper place has absolute downward motion, while a downward-moving body whose terminus falls short of the center has relative downward motion. The same holds mutatis mutandis for bodies that move upward. Those that have the limit of the surrounding celestial spheres as their terminus have absolute upward motion, while those whose terminus falls short of that limit have relative upward motion.

In order to explain the specific differences of the terrestrial elements, Avicenna, following a long tradition, which can be traced back at least as far as Hippocrates (460–370 BCE), appeals to certain basic qualitative powers. These qualitative powers are hot/cold, which are seen as active powers following upon the form, and wet/dry, which are seen as passive powers, following upon the matter (Avicenna, [DC], 1). Additionally, Avicenna claims, the downward motion of those elements so naturally inclined, namely, earth and water, is the result of their being qualitatively cold and being directed to their natural places, that is, toward the center. Analogously, the upward motion of those elements so naturally inclined, namely, fire and air, is the result of their being qualitatively hot and being directed to their natural places, that is, away from center. The elements, earth and water's natural inclination (mayl) downward is referred to as their heaviness, while fire and air's natural inclination upward references their lightness (Avicenna, [DC], 2). As for the qualities, wet and dry, these passive powers refer to a body's susceptibility or lack thereof to the impressions and actions of some form. For example, what is wet or fluid more easily receives the impression of a form (just think of wet clay). In contrast, what is dry, while more readily retaining any impressions made in it, does not easily yield to being impressed (now think of kiln-dried clay). Given these differences in motions and qualitative powers, Avicenna, again following in this tradition, identifies four terrestrial elements: (1) fire, which is hot and dry with an absolute upward motion, (2) air, which is hot and wet with a relative upward motion, (3) water, which is cool and wet with a relative downward motion and (4) earth, which is cool and dry with an absolute downward motion. Finally, and for completeness, (5) celestial bodies are neither hot nor cold (and so neither heavy nor light) nor wet nor dry, but instead are solely identified in term of their natural circular motion.

2.5.2 Natural Minimums

In section 2.2.2, it was noted that while Avicenna denied the possibility of conceptually indivisible atoms, he allowed for the possibility of physically indivisible natural minimums. In other words, there might be limits beyond which some specific kind of natural body cannot be divided further and remain that same kind of body. It was further noted that a proof was required whether there actually were such natural minimums. We are now in a position to consider Avicenna's proof for this thesis (Avicenna, [Ph], 3.12). Recall that for Avicenna there are two forms of division. One involves merely positing imagined divisions within a magnitude, so as never actually to destroy the continuity of the body. The second involves actually fragmenting and separating parts of the body such that the parts are at a distance from one another. Avicenna's proof for natural minimums involves this second form of division, namely, bringing about a separation of the parts. It additionally presupposes the theory of elements just presented and particularly the qualitative powers that are the necessary concomitants of the terrestrial elements.

While the details and argumentation of Avicenna's theory are complex, the heart of the theory can be grasped through the following example. (For a discussion of the history and details of Avicenna's account of natural minimums see McGinnis 2015.) Avicenna first observes that the smaller something is compared with its surrounding environment, the faster and more easily that environment acts on what is surrounded. For example, a blast furnace melts a kilogram of ore more readily than it does a metric ton of ore. Now, the example continues, isolate some relatively small quantity of water, e.g., a milliliter, in a beaker. The water qua the element water has the essential qualities of being cold and wet. Additionally, inasmuch as the water is isolated, and so not part of a lake or the like, it is surrounded by ambient air, which, according to the elemental theory that Avicenna adopts, is hot and wet. Provided that the quantity of water is sufficiently large, it can counteract the heating influences of the surrounding air; however, as one physically separates off smaller and smaller quantities of the water, the natural heat of the surrounding air more readily and effectively acts on the diminishing quantity of water. At some point, the heat of the surrounding air fully overcomes the coolness of the small quantity of water such that the coolness is replaced with the same degree of heat as the surrounding air. In that case, there is no longer a cold-wet element but a hot-wet element, and so there comes to be air. What the example indicates is that there are natural limits of smallness beyond which the qualitative concomitants of water can no longer be sustained in isolation, and instead a new set of concomitants, now associated with air, come to be. These limits beyond which a particular kind of body cannot be physically divided and remain the same kind of body are the natural minimums.

3. Motion

Again the proper subject matter of physics is body inasmuch as it is movable. We have just looked at Avicenna's conception of body and associated issues. I now turn to his theory of motion, followed by discussions of some of the conditions necessary for motion, like time and place. Avicenna's theory of motion is best understood against the background of Aristotle's account of motion and developments surrounding that account in the later Greek world. (For detailed discussions of Avicenna's theory of motion see Hasnawi 2001; McGinnis 2006a; and Ahmed forthcoming).

3.1 Motion as First Actuality

In Physics, 3.1, Aristotle defines motion (Gk. kinēsis, Ar. ḥaraka) as the entelecheia of potential as potential. Aristotle himself apparently coined the term entelecheia, which might mean either “actualization,” as in a process, or “actuality,” as in the completion of a process. Given the ambiguity of this term, it was a matter of some concern among later Greek commentators to understand Aristotle's precise meaning. The details of the Greek debate need not concern us unduly, since the issue for philosophers in the medieval Islamic world was all but settled by the choice of the Arabic translator of Aristotle's Physics, who rendered entelecheia as “perfection” or “completion” (kamāl). Consequently, for philosophers such as Avicenna, motion was understood as a sort of actuality or perfection, as opposed to an actualization or a process.

Greek commentators provided additional glosses on the term entelecheia, which proved significant in Avicenna's own account of motion. Drawing upon other Aristotelian texts (e.g., De anima, 2.5), these commentators identified both a first actuality and second actuality. A first actuality is like the student who actually knows a particular language but is not speaking it at that moment, whereas the second actuality is like that student when actually speaking that language. Avicenna follows suit and formally defines motion as “a first perfection of what is in potential insofar as it is in potential” (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.1 [3]). To clarify, Avicenna notes that in every category there are those things that are actual and other things that, while actual in one respect, are potential in another. In the case of motion with respect to x (where x is some possible location or quantitative or qualitative feature of a body), the body before the motion is in potentiality to x—as well as any number of other states, y, z, etc. After the motion, the body is in a state of second actuality with respect to x, that is, x has been fully and completely actualized. During the motion, then, the body is in a state of first actuality with respect to x. Avicenna understands this first actuality as a type of “being directed toward” x (mutawajjih) as opposed to being directed toward y or z. There is motion as long as the body is directed toward x and there still remains some potentiality with respect to x, that is, the state of x has not been fully actualized. For example, as long as I sit in my home, there are any number of places that I might visit; however, once I get up and begin going to the pub, as long as I remain directed toward the pub but have not yet reached it, there is the motion that is my walking to the pub.

3.2 Two Senses of Motion: Traversal and Medial Motion

Thus far, Avicenna's discussion of motion is little more than a sophisticated commentary on Aristotle's definition of motion. Avicenna's analysis goes beyond Aristotle's inasmuch as Avicenna recognizes that “motion” is an equivocal term with two senses. He identifies these two senses of motion with a traversal and a medial motion. As for motion qua traversal, we sometimes speak of motion as the whole continuous magnitude stretching from the initial potential state to the final actual state, such as my complete walk from my home to the pub. Now at no point does the whole of my walk exist in the way that the whole of the spatial distance covered between my house and the pub exists. Indeed, no sooner do I step outside the door of my home on my way to the pub than the initial potential state (being in my house) ceases to be and is replaced with some new medial potential state (being on my porch). The same is true for each subsequent state of the walk. Instead, observes Avicenna, the whole and complete walk only ever exists as whole and complete in the mind, namely, I remember my being at home and then relate that mental impression with my being in the pub. In other words, motion qua traversal has no extra-mental existence but only ever has a mental existence.[9]

In contrast, medial motion corresponds with motion inasmuch as it exists extra-mentally in the moving body itself. In other words, medial motion refers to the form that every moving body must have at any moment it is in motion in order to explain its being in motion. Avicenna describes this form thus:

This is the form of motion existing in the moved thing—namely, an intermediacy between the posited starting and end points inasmuch as at any limiting point at which it is posited, it did not previously exist there nor will it exist there afterwards, unlike [its state at] the points of the two extreme limits (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.1 [6]).

While Avicenna is careful to avoid using any overtly temporal language, like “time,” “instant” or “now,” what he has described is motion at an instant as opposed to the extended conception of motion captured in motion qua traversal. In other words, motion as it exists extra-mentally occurs just in case a body exists at some point or in some state for only an instant. For if a body is at some point or in some state for only an instant, then at any subsequent instant it must be at some new point or in some new state, and consequently must have changed or undergone motion. Such a position is not to concede that spatial, kinematic or temporal magnitudes are composed of points. They are not, for again natural magnitudes are continuous according to Avicenna. Instead, Avicenna means that as one can considers a smaller and smaller uniform motion over a smaller and smaller spatial magnitude, the elapsed time of the motion becomes proportionally smaller too. At the limit (ṭaraf) of this process of considering smaller and smaller increments of motion, there is motion at an instant, or, more in keeping with Avicenna's description, at any point you posit the body in the continuum, it was not there before nor will it be there after. “This,” Avicenna concludes, “is, in fact, the first perfection,” which is motion (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.1 [6]).

3.3 Motion and the Categories

3.3.1 The Genus and Species of Motion

Avicenna dedicates two chapters of the Physics of The Cure (2.2 & 2.3) to motion's relation to the categories: one to motion's genus and the other to the species of motion. As for the first issue, Avicenna attempts to identify to which category motion generically belongs inasmuch as the categories supposedly provided the most generic ways that (material) things might exist. While in the end he concedes that given the canonical ten categories, motion seems most aptly to fall under passion (Gk. paskhein; Ar. infiʿāl), he is also uncertain whether Aristotle's ten categories are truly exhaustive and at least suggests that motion might be sui generis (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.2 [8]; Hasnawi 2004; and McGinnis 2006a).

As for the species of motion (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.3), Aristotle and the tradition up to Avicenna had recognized only three specific kinds of motion. These include motion with respect to the categories of quantity, quality and place. Motion with respect to quantity involves augmentation and diminution, while motion with respect to quality includes such changes as alterations in color, temperature and the like. Finally, on the traditional categorization, there is change of place, that is, locomotion, which for a number of reasons was believed to be the most significant or even primary species of motion. Avicenna accepts all three kinds of motion identified by the tradition. He additionally adds to these three, motion with respect to the category of position, that is, the rotation of an object that remains in the same place, like a spinning orb. The reason for his addition is obvious on consideration; for clearly an orb spinning in place is not changing its quantity or quality and by supposition it is remaining in the same place, yet clearly it is moving. Thus what kind of change is it undergoing? Only the relative position of its parts, claims Avicenna, is changing, and thus he concludes rotating objects must be changing with respect to the category of position.

3.3.2 An Analysis of Positional Motion

The introduction of positional motion, however, brings with it a new challenge. According to Avicenna, motion always involves a terminus a quo, that is, a “from which,” (mā minhu) and a terminus ad quem, that is, a “to which” (mā ilayhi) (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.1 [12 & 20–22]). His reason for insisting on this point is that motion, as noted, is the actuality of potential as potential, where the initial state of potentiality corresponds with the terminus a quo and the final state of actuality corresponds with the terminus ad quem. The difficulty is that there need be no starting and ending point for rotation, particularly if, as Avicenna believes, the rotation of the heavens has neither beginning nor end. Avicenna's response to this challenge involves a sophisticated analysis of the various ways of understanding actuality and potentiality (including an appeal to the first and second actuality already noted but also introducing a notion of remote and proximate potentiality). Without going into the details, the general intuition of his response is simple enough (for a detailed account see McGinnis 2006b). As a matter of supposition, one can posit within the continuous rotational motion of, say, a celestial sphere some point, for example, the sun's position when it is directly overhead. In positing that point, one by supposition indicates an initial terminus a quo of the motion, but that same point also indicates a terminus ad quem for that motion (although the two termini are in a sense also different since there is a difference in time between the two instances of being at that point). Thus, for example in our case, a complete sidereal day is actualized when the sun moves from a position directly overhead—the terminus a quo—and then returns to that position—the terminus ad quem. Of course, nothing about this analysis requires that the rotation must cease once this sort of terminus ad quem, which is a proximate potency, has been actualized. Indeed it can be posited as a new terminus a quo for a new rotation. In short, rotational motion still has a terminus a quo and a terminus ad quem corresponding with a potentiality and actuality, even though such motion need have no absolute beginning or ending point.

An added benefit of Avicenna's introduction of this new species of motion is that it provides him an easy answer to what has been called “la grande question” of ancient celestial physics (Hasnawi 1984). As a bit of background to the problem, Aristotle defined a thing's “where,” or place, with the outermost containing limit of the surrounding body (Aristotle, Physics, 4.4, 212a20) and Avicenna followed Aristotle faithfully on this point (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.9 [1–3]; Lammer 2016, §§5.1–2). Thus, only a body that has a body outside of it and containing it can have a place. Consequently the outermost celestial sphere “beyond” which there is absolutely nothing, by definition cannot have a place. The problem, then, is this: We observe the outermost celestial sphere apparently making a complete rotation once approximately every twenty-four hours, but what specific sort of motion is the outermost celestial sphere undergoing? Aristotle and the earlier tradition had identified only three species of motion: motion with respect to quantity, quality and place. Clearly the motion of the heavens is not a change in quantity or quality, but neither can it be change of place, since, as we have seen, the outermost celestial sphere has no place. Avicenna's introduction of positional motion provides an obvious solution: the outermost celestial sphere is moving with respect to the category of position. Moreover, Avicenna's solution is not ad hoc, since he has integrated his account of positional motion into his general analysis of motion and motion's relation to the categories.

4. Conditions for Motion

Again physics is the study of bodies insofar as they are subject to motion. We have just seen Avicenna's account of motion and before that considered his views about bodies and magnitude more generally. A discussion of Avicenna's treatment of certain necessary conditions associated with motion and moving bodies is now in order. These necessary conditions are, one, how to identify the place of a body and, two, the time required for motion.

4.1 Place and Void

An account of place is particularly significant given that motion with respect to place was frequently viewed as the primary species of motion (although Avicenna would rank positional motion along side local motion, if not above it). The reason for giving priority to place or position is that change in quantity involves the increase or decrease of the place that a body occupies; and change in quality involves a body's coming into proximity with some cause that brings about the alteration, where “coming into proximity” refers to a change of place either in the body or in the cause (Avicenna, [Ph], 4.9).

As noted when discussing positional motion, Avicenna follows the Aristotelian tradition and identifies the technical definition of place (Gk. topos, Ar. makān) with “the surface that is the extremity of the containing body” (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.9 [1]). The general structure of his argumentation for this thesis involves showing that all other candidates for what place might be are wanting in some way. To this end, Avicenna provides us with, as it were, the logical space for an account of place (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.6 [2]). Place can be either intrinsic or extrinsic to body, that is, essential or accidental to it. If place is intrinsic to a body, then it is either (1) the matter or (2) the form of the body, whereas if it is extrinsic, then the place is either (3) what the body exactly encompasses, that is, an interval (buʿd) or (4) what exactly encompasses the body, that is, the surface that is the extremity of the containing body.[10] Avicenna quickly eliminates (1) and (2). That is because a body can change with respect to place, that is, depart from one place to another, whereas a body cannot depart from either its matter or form without undergoing generation and corruption. Hence only (3) and (4) are truly live options. Account (4) is just the Aristotelian one, which Avicenna himself prefers. As for (3), namely that a body's place is the interval it occupies, Avicenna believes that it ultimately stands or falls with whether a void (khalāʾ), an empty interval, is possible. Avicenna dedicates a long chapter (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.8) to showing that a void is impossible. If his argument there is successful, then (4), namely, place is the innermost limit of the containing body, remains the only viable definition of place.

Aristotle before Avicenna had also dedicated a long section of his Physics (4.6–9) to a refutation of the void. Aristotle's arguments might all best be described as physical ones inasmuch as they all appeal to physical concerns associated with the void. More specifically, Aristotle's arguments attempt to show that motion would be impossible on the assumption of a void. Avicenna reproduces many of Aristotle's physical arguments, often giving them his own unique twist. Additionally, however, Avicenna develops what might be called a conceptual critique of the notion of void. In this critique, Avicenna attempts to show that the very idea of a void is conceptually vacuous or a vain intelligible. The criticism begins with a logical/physical principle: Anything that actually exists within the natural order can be defined in terms of a genus and difference. (The general idea is that the things that make up the physical world must be of some kind or species if they exist at all, and it is the genus and difference that identify the kind or species.) He then adds one further qualification: Inasmuch as these actual existents positively make up the world around us, their genus and difference must refer to positive (as opposed to negative) notions; a species properly understood answers the question “what is it?” and a genus or difference given in negative terms simply would not tell us what something is, but what it is not. (For a discussion of Avicenna's theory of genus and difference and how it relates to his criticism of the void see McGinnis 2007b.)

With these preliminaries in place, Avicenna's conceptual critique begins (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.8 [1–4]; also see McGinnis 2007a, 2007b; and Lammer 2016, §5.3). He first asks whether the void actually exists or is absolutely nothing. If one says that the void is absolutely nothing, Avicenna happily agrees; for if it is absolutely nothing, then it does not actually exist. Those who affirm that the void actually exists, then, cannot simply say that it is nothing, but must provide some positive features about it. Avicenna next notes that void space is frequently described as being of either a greater or lesser extent, for the void space between two cities on Earth, for example, is less than the void space between the Earth and the heavens. This property of being more or less is none other than that of quantity. Thus if a void should exist, it would possess some quantity either essentially or accidentally. If quantity belongs to void accidentally, and every accident must belong to a substance, then void is joined to a substance possessing quantity. The quantity in question is necessarily three-dimensional, but as noted when discussing continuity, three-dimensionality follows upon the form of corporeality. The form of corporeality, however, causes the existence of a body. Thus void belongs to a body as an accidental feature of it, a seeming contradiction.

In contrast, if the quantity is not accidental to the void but is essential to it, then void would be a species of quantity. Avicenna now challenges the defenders of void to provide some positive difference that would make up void's species. It cannot be that void is a material quantity, since again a material quantity is body. If one claims that void is immaterial quantity, Avicenna demands some non-negative difference, for while there are immaterial substances, like angels, one can provide a positive characterization of them as intellectual substances. Avicenna offers a number of suggestions, but finds every attempt wanting or ultimately telling us what void is not rather than what it is. Since no definition of void can be given in terms of a positive genus and difference, Avicenna concludes that our idea of void is nothing but empty imaginings.

Again, place had to be either (1) the matter or (2) the form of the body, or either (3) what the body exactly encompasses or (4) what exactly encompasses the body (i.e., the surface that is the innermost extremity of the containing body). As noted (1) and (2) are non-starters, and as just argued, (4) involves a conceptual confusion. Consequently, Avicenna concludes place must be the innermost surface of the surrounding body.

4.2 Time and the Age of the Universe

Among the conditions associated with motion, time (Gk. chronos, Ar. zamān) is at least as important as that of place and void, for it is a necessary concomitant of motion. (A number of studies on various aspects of Avicenna's temporal theory exist and include Shayegan 1986; McGinnis 1999; Mayer 2007; and Lammer 2016, ch. 6.) In order to appreciate time's relation to motion, there is a more basic question that must be answered first: Does time exist? An affirmative answer will seem obvious to many, but Aristotle at Physics, 4.10 had offered a series of objections, four in all, that cast doubt on the reality of time. Moreover, in his own positive account of what time is, Aristotle does not address all of the objections or even provide a general proof that time must exist in light of the objections. One may then criticize Aristotle's account of time in light of his own theory of science: Aristotle has proceeded to a theory of what time is before providing us with a proof that time is.[11]

After presenting the objections to and opinions about time, Avicenna begins his own account of time (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.10–13) by filling this lacuna in Aristotle's presentation. Avicenna's general strategy is to take as empirically obvious certain facts about motion and then show that these facts cannot be explained unless there is associated with motion a certain magnitude, which we commonly identify with time. Only having shown that time exists does Avicenna then provide a scientifically adequate explanation of what time is.

Avicenna's proof that time exists assumes these initial facts about moving bodies:

  1. If two moving bodies, which have the same speed, start and stop on the same mark (say a blast of a horn), then they traverse the same distance;
  2. If two moving bodies, which again have the same speed, both stop on the same mark, but start on two different marks, the body that started on the second mark traverses less distance than the body that started on the first mark;
  3. If two moving bodies, which now have different speeds, start and stop on the same mark, then the slower moving body traverses less distance than the faster moving body.

On the basis of these facts, Avicenna observes that associated with moving bodies there is a certain possibility or capacity (imkān) to traverse some spatial magnitude. Moreover, this capacity corresponds with the starting and stopping of the motion (that is, a kinematic magnitude). When the body is moving slower, a greater amount of this possibility is required to cover the same spatial magnitude as that of a faster moving body. Given this possibility's relation and correspondence with both spatial and kinematic magnitudes, Avicenna concludes that this capacity must be some magnitude that stands in some relation to the distance and speed. This magnitude is neither the magnitude of the body, whether the body's bulk or weight, nor the magnitude of the motion, whether the speed or motivity, nor the magnitude of the distance traversed. Instead, this magnitude—again, the possibility belonging to a moving body to cover more or less distance at a fixed speed—concludes Avicenna, is what we call time (zamān).

Avicenna goes on, following Aristotle, to identify this magnitude with a “number of motion when it is differentiated into prior and posterior parts” (cf. Aristotle, Physics 4.1, 219b1–2). In all three of Avicenna's philosophical encyclopedias—The Cure, The Salvation and Pointers and Reminders—he notes that, more precisely, time is a magnitude of circular motion with respect to the prior and posterior. His insistence on circular motion rather than just motion in general is that only circular motion can potentially have neither beginning nor end. In other words, only circular motion can be infinitely extended into the past and future.

While Avicenna has any number of arguments for the eternity of time and the world, his proof for the existence of time in terms of a possibility to traverse greater or lesser spatial magnitudes at a fixed velocity provides the basis for one of his central physical arguments for that thesis. The argument, which is a reductio ad absurdum has one assume that God created time, and so motion and moving bodies, at some first moment, x, in the finite past, for example, 10,000 years ago. Prior to x nothing but God existed, not even time. (Here let years be measured in solar rotations as measured by the apparent motion of our sun, i.e., 30 km/s. Also let the 10,000 solar rotations have reached right now so that the the present moment is the second terminal point for this motion.) Avicenna next observes that it is certainly possible that God could have made a time, and so motion and moving bodies, 20,000 solar rotations in duration, where this possible duration again reaches to the present moment. In this second scenario, 10,000 years of the full 20,000 year duration would exactly correspond with the 10,000 years in the first scenario, namely, the period extending from the present moment back to x. The remaining duration of this possible 20,000-year motion would correspond with the possibility for 10,000 solar rotations, which now would terminate at x rather than beginning at x. (We can intuitively say that this remaining possibility is prior to or earlier than x, although Avicenna is careful not to beg any questions.) Now to say that there is a possibility for 10,000 solar rotations (prior to x) is just to say that (prior to x) there exist a possibility for a sun (or other body) to traverse a certain distance (that is, number of rotations) at a fixed speed. From Avicenna's earlier proof for the existence of time, however, recall that the possibility for a moving body to traverse a given distance at a fixed speed refers to time. Consequently, since this possibility exists, time must exist. Yet in order for time to exist, as Avicenna argued, motion and moving bodies must exist. Therefore, concludes Avicenna, when nothing but God existed, time, motion and a moving body also would have necessarily existed, a blatant contradiction. It is the assumption that time is finite, claims Avicenna, that gives rise to the contradiction. Since this same argument applies to any finite duration of time, during which one may suppose the world to exist, Avicenna concludes that time, and so motion and moving bodies, must have existed infinitely into the past. (For the same reason mutatis mutandis time, and so motion and moving bodies, also must exist infinitely into the future.)

While I have only scratched the surface of the riches of Avicenna's natural philosophy, the above discussions provide a number of the most basic points of his thought.


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