First published Fri May 6, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jan 10, 2024

“Implicature” denotes either (i) the act of meaning or implying one thing by saying something else, or (ii) the object of that act. Implicatures can be determined by sentence meaning or by conversational context, and can be conventional (in different senses) or unconventional. Figures of speech such as metaphor and irony provide familiar examples, as do loose use and damning with faint praise. Implicature serves a variety of goals: communication, maintaining good social relations, misleading without lying, style, and verbal efficiency. Knowledge of common forms of implicature is acquired along with one’s native language.

Conversational implicatures have become one of the principal subjects of pragmatics. An important conceptual and methodological issue in semantics is how to distinguish senses and entailments from generalized conversational implicatures. A related issue is the degree to which sentence meaning determines what is said. Historical linguistics traces the evolution of conversational implicatures into idioms.

H. P. Grice developed an influential theory to explain and predict conversational implicatures, and describe how they arise and are understood. The Cooperative Principle and associated maxims play a central role. Neo-Gricean theories modify Grice’s principles to some extent, and Relevance theories replace them with a principle of communicative efficiency. Problems for such principle-based theories include overgeneration, lack of determinacy, clashes, and the fact that speakers often have other goals. An alternative approach emphasizes that implicatures can be explained and predicted in all the ways intentional actions and conventions can be.

1. Speaker Implicature

H. P. Grice (1913–1988) was the first to systematically study cases in which what a speaker means differs from what the sentence used by the speaker means. Consider (1).

Alan: Are you going to Paul’s party?
Barb: I have to work.

If this was a typical exchange, Barb meant that she is not going to Paul’s party by saying that she has to work. She did not say that she is not going to Paul’s party, and the sentence she uttered does not mean that. Grice introduced the technical terms implicate and implicature for the case in which what the speaker said is distinct from what the speaker thereby meant or implied.[1] Thus Barb implicated that she is not going; that she is not going was her implicature.

In (2), Carla is a dispatcher in Denver, where it is sunny and dry. Don is a truck driver trying to get over the continental divide during a blizzard.

Carla: How’s the weather over there?
Don: The weather’s lovely.

Don is using irony. He said that the weather is lovely, but he thereby meant that the weather is terrible. So he implicated that the weather is terrible. Implicating is an illocutionary speech act, something done in or by saying something (Austin 1962: 98–103). Since it involves meaning one thing by saying something else, it is an indirect speech act, albeit not one that Searle (1975: 265–6) analyzed.[2]

By “saying”, Grice meant not the mere utterance of words, but saying that something is the case, which Austin (1962: 94) called a locutionary act. Barb could have said the same thing by uttering different words. As Grice realized, “say” is used more or less strictly.[3] Thus if Ed says “The largest planet is a gas giant”, we will sometimes count him as saying that Jupiter is a gas giant. We will follow Grice in using “say” more narrowly, requiring that what a speaker says be something that the sentence uttered means or expresses in the context of use. So we will take Ed to have implicated that Jupiter is a gas giant by saying that the largest planet is. Stating or asserting that p entails both saying and meaning that p.[4] When Yogi Berra, famous for his malapropisms, said “Texas has a lot of electrical votes”, he said that Texas has a lot of electrical votes; but since that was not something he meant, it was not something he asserted. Don did not mean what he said for a different reason. So he too said but did not assert that the weather is lovely.

It is not possible to fully understand speakers without knowing what they have implicated as well as what they have said. Unless we know what Barb meant by saying that she has to work, we will not know that she has answered Alan’s question. Unless Carla knows what Don meant by saying that the weather is lovely, she might mistakenly infer that he will arrive on time. The difference between saying and implicating also affects how we evaluate speakers. If Barb knew she did not have to work, then she was lying in dialogue (1). If she knew she was going to Paul’s party, she might be guilty of misleading Alan, but not of lying or making a false statement.[5] In court, witnesses are typically required to answer questions directly. They cannot avoid perjury by implicating a falsehood rather than saying it.

What someone implicates is not given to us directly. We have to infer it from evidence. We would typically infer in (1) that Barb meant she is not going from what she said, what Alan asked, our assumption that Barb was responding to Alan’s question, and some background knowledge (e.g., that going to Paul’s party is not work). An implicature can be characterized as an inference (“something inferred”), but implicating is not itself inferring. To implicate something is to express a belief in a particular way. To infer something is to acquire or possess a belief in a particular way. Hearers have to infer what speakers implicate. But implicatures do not result from inferences. Furthermore, the fact that implicatures are inferred is not what makes implicating an indirect speech act. Implicature is indirect because to implicate something is to mean it by saying something else.

Even though it requires an inference, our recognition of what is meant is commonly automatic and effortless, whether it is said or implicated. In (1), for example, competent speakers will grasp immediately that Barb meant both that she has to work and that she is not going to Paul’s party. All speech acts have to be inferred from contextual evidence, including what was said and what words were uttered. Whether there is any significant difference in the kind of inference required to recognize an implicature is a matter of some debate, and may depend on the type of implicature.[6] While it is not our focus here, how competent hearers recognize---and language learners acquire the ability to recognize---what a speaker implicates is the subject of intensive experimentation and theorizing in the field of pragmatics.[7]

Grice used his technical term “implicature” for a way of expressing a proposition by saying that something is the case. It is also common to express propositions by asking questions or issuing imperatives (Geurts 2010: 32–3), to express attitudes and other things that are not propositions by saying something (Braun 2011; Sullivan 2023: §V), and to express things by not saying something (Swanson 2017). While these acts do not count as implicature as Grice defined his technical term, and are not the focus of his theory (or this entry), they are similar in many important ways.

2. Conversational and Conventional Implicature

The implicatures in (1) and (2) are conversational. They depend on features of the conversational context, and are not determined by the conventional meaning of the sentences uttered. A key feature in (1) was Alan’s question. Had he asked “What are you going to do today?”, Barb could have implicated something completely different (that she is going to work) by saying the same thing (that she has to work). Grice (1975: 25) contrasted a conversational implicature with a conventional implicature, by which he meant one that is determined by the meaning of the sentence used.[8] Here’s a variant of Grice’s example.

The queen is English and therefore brave.
The queen is English and brave.
Being brave follows from being English.

We will use parentheses to refer to the sentences in an example like (3), and brackets to refer to what the sentences express. So (3c) is the sentence “Being brave follows from being English” and [3c] is the proposition that being brave follows from being English. By using (3a) to say and mean [3a], speakers implicate [3c]. That is, by using (3a) to say and mean that the queen is English and therefore brave, speakers implicate that being brave follows from being English. They imply rather than say that being brave follows from being English. In contrast, (3b) would rarely if ever be used to implicate [3c]. The meaning of “therefore” generates the implicature of (3a). Other words “triggering” conventional implicatures are but, even, too, still, yet, already, again, stop, start, know, and regret.[9]

While Grice’s examples were triggered lexically, other conventional implicatures are triggered syntactically. Speakers who assert Ravel, a Spaniard, wrote Spanish-style music implicate that Ravel was a Spaniard—they imply but do not say that Ravel was a Spaniard. Hence their utterance is misleading but not a lie if they know Ravel was French. The implicature is conventional in that it is determined by the meaning of the sentence via the appositive construction. Other constructions that generate conventional implicatures are as-parentheticals (as a Spaniard) and parenthetical relative clauses (who was Spanish).

As (1) illustrates, when a conversational implicature is false, the speaker’s statement is misleading. Barb’s utterance would nonetheless be linguistically flawless. Because [3c] is false, on the other hand, the use of (3a) to make a statement is infelicitous and improper as well as misleading. The truth of [3c] is a precondition of properly using (3a) to assert what it says. Conventional implicatures like [3c] are presuppositions in the non-technical sense in which the question “Have you cheated again?” presupposes that you cheated before. The question is inappropriate, and cannot be given a straight “Yes” or “No” answer, unless you did cheat before. For the same reason, the question Is the queen English and therefore brave? is improper; answering either “Yes” or “No” implies a connection between being English and brave.[10]

Not all conventional implicatures are presuppositions in the same way. For example, Jack knows that 51 is prime entails and implicates that 51 is prime. So it is false and possibly a lie because 51 is not prime. Nevertheless, it is linguistically proper and felicitous. That 51 is prime is an implicature because speakers who use Jack knows that 51 is prime imply rather than say or assert that 51 is prime; they imply it by saying that Jack knows 51 is prime. In both cases, if and that’s a good (or bad) thing is added, that will refer to what is said but not what is implicated (cf. Geurts 2010: 6).[11]

Potts (2005: 35–6) claimed that a sentence cannot be used with its conventional meaning without implicating its conventional implicatures.[12] While this is a natural way to interpret Grice’s claim that conventional implicatures are determined by sentence meaning, examples like (4) show that it is too strong.[13]

If the queen is English, and being brave follows from being English, then the queen is English and therefore brave.
Trump, the stable genius, started a trade war (said ironically).

(3a) is used with its conventional meaning in (4a) as the consequent of a conditional. But because (3c) is a conjunct of the antecedent of that conditional, (4a) itself does not imply in any way that being brave follows from being English. A speaker asserting [4a] does not say [3a] and does not mean [3c]. So the speaker does not implicate that being brave follows from being English. The antecedent of [4a] prevents the conversational implicature of its consequent from “projecting”. The implicature triggered by the appositive in (4b) is not implicated for a completely different reason. When this sentence is used ironically, the speaker uses it with its conventional meaning and says that Trump, the stable genius, started a trade war. But because it is used to mock Trump’s claim that he is a stable genius, the speaker does not implicate that Trump is a stable genius. Indeed, he implicates the very opposite. The meaning of a sentence determines its conventional implicatures, but whether a speaker implicates them depends on how the sentence is used. What does entail implicating a sentence’s conventional implicatures is using it to assert what the sentence means or expresses. Doing that does not necessitate any conversational implicatures.

While Grice used “conventional” to denote an implicature determined by linguistic meaning, W. Davis (1998: Chs. 5–6) and Lepore & Stone (2015: Pt. II) argue that even conversational implicatures can be conventional in the non-technical sense in which it is conventional for women to wear a sari in India but not Mongolia, and for German speakers to use rot to mean “red” but not English speakers.[14] Conventions in this sense are common practices that serve a social interest, perpetuate themselves in certain ways, and are arbitrary in that other practices could have served the same purposes and perpetuated themselves. New speakers pick up conventions from prior speakers, often with no instruction. Consider (5):

Some athletes smoke.
Not all athletes smoke.

It would be unconventional (unusual, idiosyncratic, even unprecedented) for people who say “Some athletes smoke” to conversationally implicate that some physically fit people will develop bladder cancer, but conventional (customary, normal, standard practice) for them to implicate that not all athletes smoke. The customary implicature is not conventional in Grice’s sense, though. For “Not all athletes smoke” is not determined by the meaning of “Some athletes smoke”. Speakers can and often do say and assert (5a)[15] while implicating something other than [5b], as (6) will illustrate. The practice of using sentences of the form “Some NP VP” to mean “Not all NP VP” is not a semantic or syntactic convention. It is a pragmatic convention. To avoid confusion, I will describe implicatures that are conventional in Grice’s sense as semantic. When not modified by “in Grice’s sense”, “conventional” will have the broader sense of customary.[16]

Grice (1975: 37ff) called implicatures like [5b] generalized conversational implicatures (“GCIs”). The term is appropriate because (5a) can be used to implicate [5b] in a wide variety of contexts. Grice characterized generalized implicatures as those that “would normally (in the absence of special circumstances)” be carried by “the use of a certain form of words”. Levinson (2000: 11–12, 16–22, 42–46) characterized GCIs similarly as “default inferences”—implicatures we normally and automatically infer in the absence of evidence to the contrary.[17] These characterizations are too strong in one respect. There is nothing abnormal about the use of (5a) in (6), where Gina would normally implicate [6a] rather than [5b].

Fred: Do you know whether all athletes smoke?
Gina: Some athletes smoke.
I do not know whether all athletes smoke.

The fact that “Some athletes smoke” can be used to implicate [5b] in some contexts and [6a] in others shows that neither is the default, especially given that figurative use with a variety of implicatures is also a possibility (§4). The same fact also shows that neither is a conventional implicature in Grice’s sense. Having more than one GCI is compatible with them all being conventional in the broad sense, though. The word bank has several meanings in English, including “row”, as in bank of switches. So it is conventional to use bank to mean “row”, even though this cannot be described as its normal or default use.

Following Grice (1975: 39), it is widely accepted that generalized conversational implicatures differ from semantic implicatures in being cancelable, either explicitly or implicitly (contextually).[18] Whereas (3a) cannot be asserted without implicating [3c], (5a) can be asserted without implicating [5b]. The speaker may do this explicitly by adding “Indeed, all do” after uttering “Some athletes smoke”. Alternatively, the implicature may be cancelled implicitly by the utterance context, as when it is obvious that the speaker is either engaging in understatement or ignorant of further facts. An actual implicature is cancelable if it could have been canceled. In example (1), Barb would not have implicated that she is not going to Paul’s party if she had added “But I might be able to leave early.”

Whereas semantic implicatures are generally entailed by what is said, many believe that conversational implicatures cannot be.[19] As (1), (2), (5), and (6) illustrate, conversational implicatures are typically not entailments. But exceptions have been noted.[20] When a speaker responds to “Is Tom 65 or blind?” by asserting “Tom is 65,” the speaker may well have answered the question by implicating that Tom is 65 or blind. That is, the speaker may have meant that disjunction by saying that Tom is 65. Neale (1992: 529) believes the cancelability of conversational implicatures prevents them from being entailments. But while an entailed implicature cannot be explicitly canceled if the result would be incoherent (“Tom is 65, but is not 65 or blind”), it can at least be implicitly canceled. This can happen if the speaker answers the simple question “How old is Tom?” in a context in which no one is thinking about blindness. Even explicit cancellation is possible in some cases. A mathematician could implicate that Tom’s age is a prime number by saying that it is 67. One form of explicit cancellation (“Tom’s age is 67, but not prime”) would be necessarily false, and indicate that the speaker is not a math whiz, but it is not incoherent. Another form (“Tom’s age is 67, but I don’t know if that is prime”) only indicates ignorance.

Grice observed that conversational implicatures are typically connected to what is said rather than the way it is said, so that “it is not possible to find another way of saying the same thing, which simply lacks the implicature in question” (1975: 39). The implicature of (1) is thus said to be nondetachable. Grice allowed exceptions, though, “where some special feature of the substituted version is itself relevant to the determination of an implicature” (see Grice’s “maxim of Manner” in §6). Metalinguistic implicatures—those that refer to the particular words the speaker used[21]—are also detachable.

Harry: What is this species of bird called in English?
Irene: This is a widgeon.

In example (7), Irene used “This is a widgeon” to implicate that the English word for the species is “widgeon”. Had Irene used a German sentence with the same meaning (Dies ist eine Pfeife) she would have said the same thing while implicating something different (that it is called “Pfeife”). Semantic implicatures, in contrast, are nondetachable because they are determined by what the sentence means.

3. Sentence Implicature

As we observed in §1, Grice defined implicating as a form of speaker meaning. But Grice and others nevertheless began applying “implicate” to sentences, analogous to the way “imply”, “presuppose”, and “mean” apply to sentences as well as people.[22] If an implicature is conventional in either sense (that is, either semantic or generalized), we may say that the sentence implicates it, or has the implicature.[23] Even though Barb implicates that she is not going to Paul’s party, “I have to work” does not itself implicate this. But “Some athletes smoke” implicates that not all do even though speakers can use the sentence without implicating this. (Analogy: plane means “airplane” even though speakers can use plane without meaning “airplane”.) Similarly, (4b) implies that Trump is a stable genius even though speakers can use it without implying that.

Whereas knowledge of what speakers implicate is essential to fully understand speakers, knowledge of what sentences implicate is a critical component of our knowledge of a language. This is obvious for sentences with semantic implicatures like (3a). But speakers are not fully competent with “some” unless they know that it is related to “all” in a way it is not related to “several” or “two”. A man using (5a) may mislead others if he does not realize that it implicates [5b], and fail to communicate if he thinks it implicates “It is not the case that several athletes smoke”.

4. Common Forms of Conversational Implicature

Many forms of conversational implicature occur frequently in everyday speech and literature, with a wide variety of sentences and in all known languages. They are common ways of both using and understanding language. The forms are differentiated in part by the relationship between what is said and what is implicated. Knowledge of them is an important component of our linguistic competence, and is acquired at an early age.[24]

The most widely recognized forms of implicature are figures of speech (tropes). Irony, overstatement (hyperbole), understatement (meiosis and litotes), and metaphor have been known at least since Aristotle. They are taught in school as elements of style. When Don said in (2) The weather is lovely, he engaged in irony and implicated that the weather is awful. Don did so in part to make light of the awful weather. Don could have implicated the same thing by saying The weather is not good (litotes) or The weather is the worst in history (hyperbole).

Figurative speech is non-literal: users generally do not mean what they say, and expect their audience to recognize that. (Litotes is an exception.) Don did not mean that the weather is lovely. The obvious falsity of what is said is a typical clue that speech is figurative. Some figures also tend to be marked intonationally, including irony and hyperbole. Others are not, including metaphor and understatement. They are all used to make speech lively, interesting, and stylish (§10).

Many forms of implicature are not figures of speech, and have become widely recognized only since Grice (1975). (1) illustrates relevance implicature: the speaker implicates an answer to an expressed or implied question by stating something related to it by implication or explanation. [5b] is a quantity (or scalar) implicature: the speaker implicates the denial of a proposition stronger than the one said. (6) illustrates ignorance implicature: the speaker implicates that something stronger than what was said is unknown. (7) illustrates metalinguistic implicature: the speaker implicates that something has a certain name by using that name to describe it. These “modes of speech” (non-figurative forms of implicature) are not taught in school, and names for them are not in general use. Nevertheless, they are as frequent and natural as figurative speech, and are learned at the same time. Modes of speech are not marked intonationally, and the speech is literal. They are not used to make speech or writing lively. Speakers do not intend what they say to be obviously false, and generally do mean what they say.

Two modes of speech do have common names. One is damning with faint praise. Grice’s example has become classic:

A is writing a testimonial about a pupil who is a candidate for a philosophy job, and his letter reads as follows: “Dear Sir, Mr. X’s command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular. Yours, etc”. (Grice 1975: 33)

By saying so little, A implicated that Mr. X is a poor candidate for the job. The other named mode is loose use, or speaking loosely, illustrated by (8):

Linda: When will dinner be served?
Mike: At six o’clock.

If Mike’s response is typical, what he meant is only that dinner will be served close enough to six o’clock for current purposes. That would be typically be true if dinner will be served at 6:01. What Mike said, though, is that dinner will be served at 6:00, which would be false if dinner is served at 6:01.[25] If Mike gave the same response to a question about when a swimmer touched the wall in the final lap of an Olympic event, 6:01 may not be close enough.

The figures and modes of speech are common, socially useful practices. They perpetuate themselves through precedent following, social acceptance, individual habit and association, and traditional transmission from one generation of speakers to another. Precedent operates when hearers call on their knowledge of the forms speakers commonly use to either interpret speakers in new contexts, or to predict what hearers will understand. The forms are less arbitrary than lexical or syntactic conventions, but no one has to implicate rather than say things, or use one form of implicature rather than others.

Since these conventions do not attach implicatures to particular sentence forms, they do not give rise to sentence implicatures.

5. Pragmatics and Semantics

As our examples make clear, semantics, conceived as the study of the meaning of words and sentences, does not exhaust the study of meaning. The study of speaker meaning and implicature is included in pragmatics, which covers the broad range of speech acts performed by using words and sentences. Applied pragmatics arose from the recognition that second language learners cannot become fully proficient without mastering more than grammar and literal meaning (Kasper 2003; Zufferey et al 2019: Ch. 9). Forensic pragmatics studies the use of pragmatics in law enforcement and the courts (Solan & Tiersma 2005; Zufferey et al. 2019: §4.4). Clinical pragmatics studies communication disorders that arise from failure to master pragmatic rules (Cummings 2009, 2014; Graci 2023). Formal pragmatics uses formal models of utterances, contexts, and discourse to state precise rules specifying the interpretation of an utterance in a context, including what is both said and implicated (Roberts 2006; Rothschild 2013).

The phenomenon of Gricean conventional implicature (§2) shows further that standard truth-conditional semantics does not exhaust semantics (Barker 2003). For example, Ravel, a Spaniard, wrote Spanish-style music and Ravel was a Spaniard and wrote Spanish-style music have the same entailments. Yet they differ in meaning in such a way that the former but not the latter is infelicitous and improper because Ravel was French. “False” clearly applies to the latter but not clearly to the former.

Implicature is important even in truth-conditional semantics. For example, logicians customarily take sentences of the form “p or q” to be true provided “p” or “qor both are true. Thus “It is not the case that cats meow or purr” would be counted as false. But there are also cases in which speakers use “p or q” to mean that “p” or “q” is true but not both. This would be the natural way to interpret someone who said “John is going to invite Mary or Jane to the prom”. Some maintain that “or” is ambiguous in English, with an inclusive and an exclusive sense. But another possibility is that the exclusive interpretation is a generalized conversational implicature. One piece of evidence supporting the implicature hypothesis is that the exclusive interpretation seems cancelable. Thus “Jane will visit France or Germany this summer; indeed, she will drive through both on her way to Poland” has no contradictory interpretation. Some evidence against the implicature hypothesis is that after “p or q,” or both does not seem any more redundant than but not both. A methodological issue is to describe the evidence necessary to decide whether a particular interpretation is a sense or a generalized conversational implicature. A foundational issue to is describe exactly what the difference consists in.

Implicature continues to be invoked in this way to defend controversial semantic claims:

  • Knowledge. The standard of justification necessary to claim knowledge varies from context to context depending on what is at stake and salient. On contextualist theories, sentences of the form “S knows p” are indexical, with different truth conditions in different contexts (S. Cohen 1986, Lewis 1996, DeRose 2009). An alternative theory is that “S knows p” has a strict invariant semantics, but is used loosely to implicate that S is close enough to knowing for the purposes of the context (W. Davis 2007b). Another is that “S knows p” has a weak invariant semantics but its negation is used to implicate that contextually relevant alternatives cannot be ruled out (Rysiew 2001; Brown 2006; Hazlett 2007). Others argue that implicatures cannot account for the data (Blome-Tillman 2013b; Dinges 2018; 2021).[26]
  • Names. The Millian theory that the meaning of a name is its referent entails that coreferential names are synonymous, and that names without a referent are meaningless. This seems untenable in light of names like “Superman” and “Clark Kent”. Millians have proposed that the source of these linguistic intuitions is a difference in implicature (Salmon 1986; Soames 1989). One hypothesis invokes metalinguistic implicature, noting that “Clark Kent can fly” implicates that a man called “Clark Kent” can fly (McKay 1981; Berg 1988, 2012). One problem is its implication that the Chinese translation of “Lois Lane believes Superman can fly” should seem as false as “Lois Lane believes Clark Kent can fly”.
  • Negation. On the regular interpretation of (9) below, “some” is equivalent to “any”, and the whole sentence is contradictory:
The boy did not eat some of the cookies, he ate all the cookies.
  • But there is another interpretation, marked by intonation[27] and other features, on which the negation in (9) denies the “not all” implicature of “The boy ate some of the cookies”, and is thus consistent. The question is how to account for the two different interpretations of negations given that the word “not” seems unambiguous (Geurts 1998). Horn (1989: 362–4; 370–5) and Burton-Roberts (1989) propose that the marked interpretation of (9) is an implicature. W. Davis (2016: Ch. 6) argues that it is an idiom that plausibly evolved from a generalized conversational implicature. Soria-Ruiz (2023) proposes a neo-Stalnakerian account.

Implicature plays a well-attested diachronic role in grammaticalization and the origin of new meanings and idioms.[28] For example, metaphors have a typical life cycle: beginning as something a speaker means on a particular occasion; being picked up by others; catching on, which means becoming self-perpetuating and spreading through the population; and finally, dying and becoming a new lexical meaning or idiom. When dead, what used to be indirectly expressed is directly expressed. The term virus as applied to computers went through this evolution in the last few decades, originally denoting a biological organism that spreads from host to host, now having another meaning on which it denotes computer programs that spread from computer to computer in a similar fashion. When a dead metaphor has syntactic structure like go viral, it is an idiom. When metaphors become widespread and self-perpetuating, but are not yet idioms, they generate generalized conversational implicatures.[29]

6. Gricean Theory

In addition to identifying the phenomenon of implicature, and classifying its types, Grice developed a theory designed to explain and predict conversational implicatures and to describe how they are understood. Grice (1975: 26–30) postulated a general Cooperative Principle and four maxims specifying how to be cooperative. It is common knowledge, he asserted, that people generally follow these rules for efficient communication.

  • Cooperative Principle. Contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation.
  • Maxim of Quality. Make your contribution true; so do not convey what you believe false or unjustified.[30]
  • Maxim of Quantity. Be as informative as required.
  • Maxim of Relation. Be relevant.
  • Maxim of Manner. Be perspicuous; so avoid obscurity and ambiguity, and strive for brevity and order.

Grice viewed these not as arbitrary conventions, but as instances of general rules governing rational, cooperative behavior. For example, if Jane is helping Kelly build a house, she will hand Kelly a hammer rather than a tennis racket (relevance), more than one nail when several are needed (quantity), and straight nails rather than bent ones (quality); she will do all this quickly and efficiently (manner).

Relevance implicatures like (1) are thought to arise from the maxim of Relation. Barb would have infringed this maxim unless her contribution were relevant to the purpose of the conversation. If Barb was being cooperative, then she was trying to answer Alan’s question. Given that working is incompatible with partying, it is inferred that Barb must have intended to communicate that she is not going to the party. Grice (1975: 34) thought other implicatures arise by flouting maxims. This happens when what a cooperative speaker says so patently violates a maxim that the hearer must infer that the speaker means something different. Irony is thought to arise from flouting the maxim of Quality (§9).

Generalizing from such examples, Grice provided a theoretical account of conversational implicature that has been widely adopted.[31] A representative formulation goes as follows, with S the speaker and H the hearer.

Theoretical Definition: S conversationally implicates p iff S implicates p when:

  1. S is presumed to be observing the Cooperative Principle (Cooperative Presumption);
  2. The supposition that S believes p is required to make S’s utterance consistent with the Cooperative Principle (Determinacy); and
  3. S believes (or knows), and expects H to believe that S believes, that H is able to determine that (ii) is true (Mutual Knowledge).

This says that an implicature is conversational provided conditions (i)–(iii) are satisfied, where (ii) is the condition that S’s believing p is required for S to be in conformity with the Cooperative Principle. The Theoretical Definition does not entail that S implicated p is inferable from (i)–(iii). Calculability does that.

Calculability: Conversational implicatures must be capable of being worked out.[32]

Grice’s calculability principle says more than that hearers are generally able to infer what speakers implicate on the basis of the linguistic meaning of what they utter. That would not be distinctive of implicature given that the same is true of what people say.[33] To work out an implicature is to infer it in a specific way from the Cooperative Principle using particular facts about the meaning of the sentence uttered and the context of utterance.

To work out that a particular conversational implicature is present, the hearer will rely on the following data: (1) the conventional meaning of the words used, together with the identity of any references that may be involved; (2) the Cooperative Principle and its maxims; (3) the context, linguistic or otherwise, of the utterance; (4) other items of background knowledge; and (5) the fact (or supposed fact) that all relevant items falling under the previous headings are available to both participants and both participants know or assume this to be the case. A general pattern for the working-out of a conversational implicature might be given as follows: He has said that q; there is no reason to suppose that he is not observing the maxims, or at least the Cooperative Principle [Cooperative Presumption]; he could not be doing this unless he thought that p [Determinacy]; he knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I can see that the supposition that he thinks that p is required [Mutual Knowledge]; he has done nothing to stop me thinking that p; he intends me to think, or is at least willing to allow me to think, that p; and so he has implicated that p. (Grice 1975: 31; my emphasis and insertions)

Key steps of the working out schema have been named in brackets, corresponding to (i)–(iii) in the Theoretical Definition.[34]

In addition to postulating that the conversationality of an implicature depends on the Cooperative Presumption, Determinacy, and Mutual Knowledge conditions, and that the implicature can be inferred in part from their satisfaction, Grice claimed that the conditions give rise to or generate the implicatures. The implicatures exist because conditions (i)–(iii) are satisfied.[35] From his assumption that conversational implicatures can be explained and predicted on the basis of the Cooperative Principle, Grice drew a methodological conclusion:

Grice’s Razor: Other things equal, it is preferable to postulate conversational implicatures rather than senses, semantic implicatures, or semantic presuppositions because conversational implicatures can be derived from independently motivated psycho-social principles.[36]

The pithy formulation is “Senses are not to be multiplied beyond necessity”, alluding to Ockham. If a phenomenon can be explained and predicted in terms of psycho-social principles, then it is theoretically more economical to do so than to posit senses and the like, which cannot be so explained. Grice’s Razor is often invoked to support classifying the exclusive interpretation of “p or q” as an implicature rather than as a second sense (§5).

Following Grice, “conversational implicature” was defined in §2 to mean an implicature that depends on features of the conversational context and is not determined by the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered. On this definition, Grice’s Theoretical Definition and Calculability are empirical hypotheses that may turn out to be false. Indeed, we will review evidence against these hypotheses below. Many linguists and philosophers, however, take Calculability to be true by definition. They take “conversational implicature” to mean an implicature that can be worked out from what is said and the Cooperative Principle or its maxims.[37] If this definition is adopted, then what the evidence would show is that the implicatures illustrated in §§1–4 are not conversational, even those that are not conventional in Grice’s sense (cf. Lepore & Stone 2015: 6, 83, 148).

7. Theoretical Difficulties

While Grice viewed his ideas as tentative and exploratory, followers have taken the theory to be well established. Indeed, it has served as a paradigm for research in pragmatics. Serious difficulties have emerged, though.

According to Grice’s Theoretical Definition (§6), conversational implicatures depend on a presumption that the speaker is observing the Cooperative Principle. W. Davis (1998: §2.5) notes, however, that speakers can engage in implicature when there is no conversation. All the figures and modes of speech can appear in private journals or in manuscripts that have little hope of being read. [38]

The Cooperative Principle further assumes that the participants in every conversation strive only to achieve common goals. From the perspective of social psychology, evolutionary biology, and game theory, Pinker (2007) and Asher & Lascarides (2013) observe that pure cooperation is generally an unrealistic idealization or naive assumption. Conversations are often among adversaries, whose goals beyond communication are opposed. It would be foolhardy and possibly dangerous for an interrogator to presume that a prisoner of war or terrorism suspect is being cooperative. Even when participants are friends or relatives, they often have some divergent goals, and may give priority to other principles (§10). To the extent that they diverge, the speaker’s goals may be promoted and the hearer’s goals thwarted by withholding information, providing misinformation, going off on a tangent, or being obscure. Even when it is correctly presumed that a speaker is not being cooperative, the speaker may use all the figures and modes of speech. If the prosecuting attorney asks the defendant whether he was in the bank on the day of the robbery, the defendant might answer “I took my mother to the hospital that day”, thereby implicating that he was not at the bank. He may do this in the hope of misleading the jury as well as the prosecutor. The official purpose of the conversation is to get at the truth, the whole truth, and nothing but the truth. But the defendant’s purpose is to hide it.

Many conversations have goals other than the exchange of information. One is amusement, which speakers often pursue by making jokes (Lepore & Stone 2015: §11.3). Because the goal is not to provide information, the maxims of Quality, Quantity, and Relation do not apply. If for any of these reasons the Cooperative Principle does not apply, reasoning based on it will be unsound.

8. Overgeneration

Many have observed that for every implicature that appears to be correctly predicted by Gricean theory, others appear to be falsely predicted.[39] The schema used to “work out” observed implicatures can usually be used just as well to work out nonexistent implicatures. So the schema as formulated is invalid—an unreliable method of inferring implicatures. By a simple application of Mill’s Methods, it follows that the observed implicatures do not exist because of the Gricean factors.

We will illustrate using the case that has been most extensively studied, and is generally considered a paradigm application of Gricean theory: the derivation of quantity implicatures from the maxim of Quantity. Adapted to (5), here is Huang’s (2014: 34) formulation.

Since the speaker has used a semantically weaker expression (i.e., some) where a semantically stronger one (e.g., all) is available, he would contradict Grice’s Quantity Maxim if the semantically stronger sentence held. Consequently, he believes that the semantically stronger statement does not hold. Furthermore, he has not done anything to stop the addressee thinking that he so thinks, therefore he conversationally implicates that not all athletes smoke.[40]

In the typical case represented by (5), S says “Some athletes smoke” and implicates “Not all athletes smoke”. The stronger statement S does not make is “All athletes smoke”. There are countless relevant statements more informative than what S said, however, whose negations were not implicated, including Several athletes smoke, Some athletes smoke regularly, I know some athletes smoke, and 13% of all athletes smoke. The Gricean reasoning could be repeated using any of these stronger statements, with fallacious results. For example:

S said “Some athletes smoke”. If S were in a position to assert the stronger statement “Several athletes smoke” but did not, S would be in a breach of the maxim of Quantity unless S wished to convey that it does not hold. So S implicated that it is not the case that several athletes smoke.

But speakers who utter sentences of the form “Some S are P” rarely if ever implicate the denial of “Several S are P”.[41] Among the infinity of statements stronger than “Some athletes smoke”, “All athletes smoke” is highly unusual in that people commonly implicate its denial. Since the derivations have the same form whether or not their conclusions are observed to be true, Lepore & Stone (2015: 143ff) call this the “symmetry” problem.[42] The Gricean derivation seems plausible only because we knew antecedently that the conclusion is true.

An irony underscoring the ex post facto character of the Gricean calculation is that Grice himself derived an ignorance implicature from the maxim of Quantity.

A is planning with B an itinerary for a holiday in France. Both know that A wants to see his friend C, if to do so would not involve too great a prolongation of his journey:

A: Where does C live?
B: Somewhere in the South of France.

(Gloss: There is no reason to suppose that B is opting out; his answer is, as he well knows, less informative than is required to meet A’s needs. This infringement of the first maxim of Quantity can be explained only by the supposition that B is aware that to be more informative would be to say something that infringed the second maxim of Quality. “Don’t say what you lack adequate evidence for”, so B implicates that he does not know in which town C lives.) (Grice 1975: 32–33; example number deleted)[43]

It is plausible that B would have implicated this. But if Grice’s reasoning is valid, why shouldn’t Huang conclude that speakers uttering “Some athletes smoke” implicate they do not know whether all athletes smoke (an ignorance implicature)? If Huang’s reasoning is valid, why shouldn’t Grice conclude that B implicated C does not live in the southernmost part of France (a scalar implicature)?

Accounting for the differences in implicature described in this section is an outstanding problem for pragmatic theory.

9. Failures of Determinacy

Grice’s Determinacy condition states that S conversationally implicates p only if S has to believe (and implicate) p if S’s utterance is to be consistent with the Cooperative Principle. Determinacy is a key premise in the working-out schema, so Calculability depends on it. As §8 illustrated, however, there are normally many alternative ways to be cooperative, and contribute what is required by the conversation, even when the meanings and referents of the words used are taken as given.

Grice believed irony involves flouting Quality. Here is Grice’s oft-repeated “gloss” applied to (2), in which Don said “The weather’s lovely” during a blizzard.

It is perfectly obvious to Don and his audience (Carla) that what Don has said is something he does not believe, and the audience knows that Don knows that is obvious to the audience. So … Don must be trying to get across some other proposition than the one he purports to be putting forward. This must be some obviously related proposition; the most obviously related proposition is the contradictory of the one he purports to be putting forward. (After Grice 1975: 34).[44]

While irony often involves saying something obviously false, it need not have been obvious to Carla in (2) that Don believed the weather was unlovely. She may have had no independent source of information about his weather. Don would also have made a suitable contribution to the conversation if he had meant and believed that the weather is lovely. So Determinacy is unsatisfied in irony when the speaker could have been speaking literally, believing what was said (W. Davis 1998: §3.3; see even Grice 1978: 53).

Many have observed that the obvious falsity of what speakers say may signal that they mean something else, but it does not tell us what else they mean (e.g., Levinson 1983: 157–8; Lepore & Stone 2015: 38–9). Indeed, metaphor is another case in which Grice (1975: 34) takes the speaker to be flouting Quality (Huang 2014: 35–6). So the flouting of Quality does not tell us which figure of speech Don is using. He would have made a suitable contribution to the conversation if he had been engaging in metaphor instead of irony, meaning and believing that relations between he and his partner (the “weather” in the cabin) are fine.

Metaphors are often difficult to interpret. Suppose a commentator says “Iraq was Bush’s Vietnam”, referring to George W. Bush and the second Gulf War. Did she mean that the U.S. lost in Iraq the way it lost in Vietnam? That the reasons for going to war in Iraq were as misguided as those that got the U.S. into Vietnam? Or did she perhaps mean that even though the U.S. did not secure all its objectives, the Iraq war was still worth fighting? She could mean and believe any of these things and still be making a useful contribution. Lepore & Stone (2015: Ch. 10) describe such metaphors as inviting hearers to imagine all the things the speaker might have meant. Grice (1975: 39–40) himself acknowledged such cases when he said that

there may be many possible specific explanations … ; and if the list of these is open, the implicatum will have just the kind of indeterminacy that many implicata do in fact have.[45]

But to say this is to deny Determinacy and Calculability.[46]

Saul (2001, 2002, 2010) and M. S. Green (2002) suggested that “implicature” be defined normatively, as properly implicating something. W. Davis (2007a) replied that while determinacy is more plausible as a norm, similar considerations show that it is not required even for properly meaning one thing by saying something else. For example, a speaker who says “I ate some of the cookies” could properly be meaning either “I ate them all” (engaging in understatement), or “I did not eat them all” (quantity implicature), or “I do not know whether I ate them all” (ignorance implicature). None of these contributions is required given that all would be appropriate.

Rysiew (2000: 577–8) suggested weakening the determinacy condition by replacing “has to believe (and implicate) p” with “is likely to believe (and implicate) p”. As he notes, hearers commonly use abduction to figure out what speakers have implicated (cf. Hobbs et al. 1993; Geurts 2010: 34–5). Abduction is a specific form of inductive or non-demonstrative reasoning in which a hypothesis is inferred to be true from the fact that it provides the best explanation of the data. By their nature, non-demonstrative methods are not guaranteed to succeed. This fact of life is no reason to shun induction when seeking to discover implicatures. W. Davis (1998: 66–8) had observed, though, that an implicature can exist and be conversational even though the available evidence does not make that implicature (or belief) more likely than others. The problems of indeterminacy and overgeneration show, in particular, that the Gricean hypotheses provide neither the only nor the best explanations of the data, making the inferences fallacious instances of abductive reasoning.

10. Conflicting Principles

Grice (1975: 30) recognized that his maxims may “clash”. When they do, there is no way to determine what is required for conformity to the Cooperative Principle. In the case of irony, for example, Manner clashes with Quality. When Don said “The weather’s lovely”, we cannot interpret him as meaning what he said because on that interpretation he would be violating Quality. But we cannot interpret him as meaning the opposite because then he would be violating Manner (Wilson & Sperber 2012: 18–9). It is more perspicuous to explicitly state something than to implicate it.

We use irony and other figures in part because we have conversational goals other than the efficient communication of information (Lakoff 1977; Sainsbury 1984: 427–9). We observe not only the Cooperative Principle, but also the Principle of Style.

Principle of Style: Be stylish, so be beautiful, distinctive, entertaining, and interesting.

Clear and simple prose—“just the facts, please”—can be boring, tedious and dull. We liven up our writing with figures of speech. Metaphor in particular makes speech more interesting and insightful by engaging our imagination (Lepore & Stone 2015: Ch. 10). In the process, we sacrifice perspicuity (violating Manner). We sometimes “embellish” a narration to make it more interesting (violating Quality) and delete boring or ugly details even when they are important (violating Quantity).

The Gricean maxims often clash with the Principle of Politeness, emphasized by Leech (1983).[47]

Principle of Politeness: Be polite, so be tactful, respectful, generous, praising, modest, deferential, and sympathetic.

Speakers frequently withhold information that would be offensive or disappointing to the hearer, violating Quantity. Speakers often exaggerate in order to please or flatter, and utter “white lies” in order to spare the hearer’s feelings, violating Quality. People pick “safe topics” (e.g., the weather) to stress agreement and communicate an interest in maintaining good relations, violating Relation. Euphemisms avoid mentioning the unmentionable, but in the process violate Manner.

One common motive for implicating something is that it is often perceived to be more polite than asserting it (Pinker 2007; Huang 2014: 142; Haugh 2015: 2). In case (1), Barb may have answered Alan’s question indirectly because she thinks it is less likely to hurt his feelings, even if she realizes he will assume that is what she is doing.

Blome-Tillmann (2013a: 177) has suggested that problems such as overgeneration and conflicting principles can be avoided by understanding calculability not as a way of predicting and explaining implicatures, but merely as providing a criterion for them. But if a criterion always gives false positives (overgeneration) or false negatives (indeterminacy), or cannot be applied (due to clashes), then it is not a useful criterion.

11. Neo-Gricean Pragmatics

Prominent linguists have sought to improve on Grice’s formulation of the conversational principles, and provide a solution to the problem of clashes. Horn (2004: §4) replaces Quantity, Relevance, and Manner with two interrelated principles.[48]

Q Principle: Say as much as you can [given Quality and R].

R Principle: Say no more than you must [given Q].

Levinson (2000: 76, 114, 137) adopts similar principles, which he calls “Q” and “I” (for “Informativeness”).[49] Since Horn believes that interpretations like [10a] are derivable from the R-principle, he calls them “R-based implicatures”. The assumption is that there is no reason to make a stronger statement (say more) if the extra information can be contributed by implicature. Implicature [11b] is similarly described as “Q-based”. The assumption is that if the speaker did not make a stronger statement (say more), its denial was implicated.

He broke a finger.
He broke a finger of his own. (“R-based implicature”)
✗He did not break a finger of his own.
He entered a house.
✗ He entered his own house.
He did not enter his own house. (“Q-based implicature”)

Horn has clearly identified two distinct and very general patterns of meaning and interpretation. Critics maintain, however, that Horn’s two principles provide no reason to expect the two indicated interpretations rather than those we do not observe (Lepore & Stone 2015: §3.1; W. Davis 2016: §4.7). They ask how Q can predict [11b] without predicting [10b], and how [10a] can be derivable from R if [11a] is not. What in R predicts [10a] rather than other strengthenings, such as “He broke someone else’s finger”? [50]

Horn goes on to formulate what he calls the Division of Pragmatic Labor:

Given two expressions covering the same semantic ground, a relatively unmarked form—briefer and/or more lexicalized—tends to be R-associated with a particular unmarked, stereotypical meaning, use, or situation, while the use of the periphrastic or less lexicalized expression, typically more complex or prolix, tends to be Q-restricted to those situations outside the stereotype, for which the unmarked expression could not have been used appropriately. (Horn 2004: 16)

Horn illustrates this division with the contrast between (12) and (13).

She stopped the machine.
She stopped the machine in the usual way. (“R-based implicature”)
✗She did not stop the machine in the usual way.
She got the machine to stop
✗ She stopped the machine in the usual way.
She did not stop the machine in the usual way. (“Q-based implicature”)

Horn appears to be assuming, plausibly, that “stopped” and “got to stop” have the same meaning. If so, then it is difficult to see how either implicature could be derived from Q or R, which refer to what is said, not how it is said. (Recall Grice’s nondetachability criterion.) Levinson (2000: 136–7) therefore reinstated a version of Manner.[51]

M Principle: Indicate abnormal, nonstereotypical situations by using marked expressions that contrast with those you would use to describe the corresponding normal, stereotypical situations.

Levinson describes “got to stop” as “marked” because it is more complex and less lexicalized than “stopped”. W. Davis (2016: 160) notes, though, that when we look at clear cases in which a single word is synonymous with a less lexicalized phrase, we often find no difference in implicature (e.g., mare versus adult female horse). And the word often connotes an unusually good example of the kind (e.g., stallion in common parlance connotes an especially fast or dominant uncastrated adult male horse).

Horn sometimes describes Q and R as “antinomic forces” (e.g., Horn 2004: 14), which would be appropriate if the bracketed conditions were omitted. Without the conditions, Horn’s principles would clash as often as Grice’s.[52] Without independent means of determining antecedently which force will “prevail” in a given case, Horn’s principles would lack predictive or explanatory value. Lepore & Stone (2015: §3.1) suggest treating Horn’s principles as “simultaneous equations”, constraining but not determining the conversational implicatures. But this assumes the equations have a solution. Not all simultaneous equations do.

Levinson (2000: 157–64) sought to avoid clashes by stating an order of precedence: Q > M > R. Huang (2014: 49) reverses the ordering, saying that

the R-principle generally takes precedence until the use of a contrastive linguistic form induces a Q-implicature to the non-applicability of the pertinent R-implicature….

Such orderings make sense only if the bracketed clauses in Q and R are omitted. W. Davis (2016: 159) responds that Levinson’s ordering makes it is hard to see why (10) or (12) should have an R implicature rather than a Q implicature, while Huang’s ordering makes it hard to explain why (11) and (13) have Q implicatures.[53]

12. Relevance Theory

The most influential alternative to Gricean and neo-Gricean theory, called “Relevance theory”, was developed by Sperber and Wilson.[54]

We have proposed a definition of relevance and suggested what factors might be involved in assessments of degrees of relevance. We have also argued that all Grice’s maxims can be replaced by a single principle of relevance—that the speaker tries to be as relevant as possible in the circumstances—which, when suitably elaborated, can handle the full range of data that Grice’s maxims were designed to explain. (Wilson & Sperber 1986: 381)

“Relevance” is given a highly technical sense, in which the relevance of a proposition in a context is directly related to how many positive cognitive effects it has and inversely related to how much effort is required to process it (Wilson & Sperber 2012: 6, 62–3, 219).[55] “Positive cognitive effects” are “improvements in knowledge”, including “true contextual implications, or warranted strengthenings or weakenings of existing assumptions”. Contextual implications are propositions logically implied by the proposition and the cognitive context together but from neither alone. Propositions or assumptions are objects of belief or knowledge—cognitive representations. Wilson and Sperber illustrate their concept by imagining a doctor whose choice of true statements is confined to the alternatives in (14).

You are ill.
You have the flu.
You have the flu or 29 is the square root of 843.

They conclude that [14b] would be maximally relevant on the grounds that it entails everything [14a] does and more, while being as easy to process; [14c] has the same cognitive effects as [14b],[56] but is harder to process.

Example (14) is a special case in that either the effects or the effort are equal between alternative contributions. To know what is maximally relevant in other cases, a particular function of effects and effort must be specified (Hinkelman 1987). Sperber and Wilson specify one when describing the theory of cognition on which they ground their theory of communication. “Our claim is that all human beings automatically aim at the most efficient information processing possible” (Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 49). “Efficiency in cognition … involves processing inputs that offer the best possible cost/benefit ratio at the time”(Wilson & Sperber 2012: 62).[57] Selecting this function and formulating a principle in the style of Grice’s yields:

Principle of Maximal Relevance (Cognitive Efficiency): Contribute that which has the maximum ratio of positive cognitive effects to processing cost.[58]

We will see that Relevance theorists qualify this idea, but many important points can be made with the simpler principle.

While Grice’s maxims enjoin the speaker to contribute the required information and do so perspicuously and briefly, they do not require the speaker to maximize information, perspicuity, or brevity when other things are equal. For example, Grice’s maxims do not predict that Barb implicated I am not going anywhere in (1) even though it is more informative than I am not going to Peter’s party, and may have a greater effects/cost ratio. Or suppose that in a discussion of a new prescription drug benefit, someone comments “It will take some money to fund that program”. The speaker would normally be engaging in understatement, implicating “The program will be very expensive”. Relevance theorists account for this by saying that because the proposition explicitly conveyed is trivial, and thus has few positive cognitive effects, the hearer will “recover” the more informative proposition.[59] Critics respond that countless propositions are more informative than the one implicated, such as “The program will cost trillions”, and seem as easy to process. [60]

Conversely, Maximal Relevance does not imply or subsume Grice’s principles. For instance, nothing guarantees that the contribution with the most positive cognitive effects per unit processing cost is germane to the topic of the conversation or as informative as required (less informative contributions might have more positive cognitive effects per unit processing cost). As a result, Maximal Relevance does not predict what Barb implicated in example (1). The proposition I am not going to Peter’s party will have different effects than I am not going to Paul’s party, but seems as easy to process and could well have as many positive cognitive effects.[61] Only the proposition about Paul is relevant in the ordinary sense to what Alan asked, but this does not entail that it is maximally relevant in the technical sense of Relevance theory.[62]

Sperber and Wilson observe that Gricean theory provides no explanation for why Don would say in (2) that the weather is lovely if he wanted to express the opposite belief.[63] Maximal Relevance has the same problem: Don’s simply saying what he means would seem easier to process and thus more efficient. Wilson & Sperber (2004: 621) think saying something in order to mean the opposite would be “patently irrational”. Adler (1987: 710) observed, however, that it need not be irrational given how readily hearers recognize when speakers do so. Moreover, speakers engaging in irony are doing more than meaning the opposite of what they said. As Grice (1978: 53–4) later recognized, they are also pretending to mean and assert what they said,[64] and are expressing more than disbelief of what is said. Sperber and Wilson call it a “dissociative attitude—wry, skeptical, bitter, or mocking”.[65] Hearers readily recognize and commonly enjoy the performance of this complex speech act. The observation that irony involves expressing a dissociative attitude does not lessen the theoretical problem, however. There is no reason to think, for example, that “The weather is terrible and anyone who thinks it lovely is foolish” has the maximum effects/cost ratio. Processing just what Don actually said (that the weather is lovely) would seem to require even less effort; so that proposition could conceivably have a greater effect/cost ratio. And there is no reason to think an ironic interpretation has a greater effect/cost ratio than a hyperbolic or meiotic interpretation. If expressing a dissociative attitude involves something other than expressing a proposition, as seems plausible (cf. M. S. Green 2018: §5), it would not be a positive cognitive effect as defined, and thus would not affect the relevance ratio. For reasons such as these, Levinson (1989: 463–4) charged that the accounts offered by Relevance theorists are as ex post facto as Gricean accounts.

The explanations of loose use offered by Relevance theorists are problematic in another way. In (8), where Mike said “Dinner will be at six”, they explain why Mike did not say something true like “Dinner will be at six or shortly after” by saying that the strictly false statement has the same positive cognitive effects but is easier to process and so more relevant.[66] But that would erroneously imply that Mike did not mean and implicate that dinner will be at six or shortly after. Another reason the explanation is unsatisfactory is that there are other things Mike did not say with the same positive contextual effects that seem as easy to process as “Dinner will be at six”. including “Dinner will be around six”. This proposition has some true cognitive effects that “Dinner will be at six” lacks, including “Dinner may not be exactly at six”.

The recital example in §10 illustrates one reason why Relevance theories adopt Optimal rather than Maximal Relevance (Wilson & Sperber 2012: 64–5):

the communicator is manifestly limited by her own abilities (to provide appropriate information, and to present it in the most efficient way). Nor can she be expected to go against her own preferences (e.g., against the goal she wants to achieve in communicating, or the rules of etiquette she wishes to follow).


Since it is also manifest that the audience will tend to pay appropriate attention only to an utterance that seems relevant enough, it is manifest that the communicator wants her audience to assume that the utterance is indeed relevant enough. There is thus a minimal level of relevance that the audience is encouraged to expect: the utterance should be relevant enough to be worth the effort needed for comprehension.

Relevance theorists thus propose that every utterance conveys a presumption of its own optimal relevance, defined by (a) and (b):

Presumption of Optimal Relevance:
The utterance is relevant enough to be worth processing.
It is the most relevant one compatible with the communicator’s abilities and preferences.[67]

Because of its preference provision, Optimal Relevance does not clash with Politeness and Style the way Maximal Relevance does. The parents may say “Your performance wasn’t perfect” rather than “It was horrendous” because they strongly prefer not to hurt their daughter’s feelings.[68] This means, however, that Optimal Relevance would not predict that Barb meant I am not going to Paul’s party in (1) even if it is relevant enough to process and more relevant than the other alternatives. For Barb might have preferred to dodge Alan’s question. In (2), Don may have preferred an ironic utterance to ones with higher E/C ratios (Millikan 1987: 725).

We are focusing on Relevance theory as an alternative attempt to predict and explain what speakers implicate. The main focus of Relevance theorists, however, is the process by which hearers interpret utterances. The hearer’s aim, on their view, is “to find an interpretation of the speaker’s meaning that satisfies the presumption of optimal relevance”. They infer that the hearer “should follow a path of least effort, and stop at the first overall interpretation that satisfies his expectations of relevance” (Wilson & Sperber 2012: 7). It is unclear how to reconcile this with requirement that the optimally relevant utterance be the most relevant one compatible with the communicator’s abilities and preferences.

The ratio of positive cognitive effects to processing cost is zero when there are no positive cognitive effects at all. Given the definition of contextual implication, any proposition that is part of the cognitive context has no contextual implications. So both Maximal and Optimal Relevance seem to imply that speakers cannot mean or implicate anything already known, and must mean something else. Gerrig (1987: 718) and McCawley (1987: 724) find this implausible. If A and B are walking in torrential rain, A might well say “It is raining really hard”, stating the obvious, and B might respond “There is indeed some rain coming down”, engaging in understatement and implicating exactly what A said.

Many critics have observed, and Sperber and Wilson have acknowledged, that relevance as defined is not measurable.[69] Positive cognitive effects are non-denumerable. Anything a speaker might say or implicate will have infinitely many true contextual implications if it has any.[70] We do not know whether processing cost is measured by time, mental effort, electro-chemical energy, inferential steps, or some function of them all. We have no unit of measurement for mental effort, and do not yet know how to measure the energy consumed in processing an utterance. If relevance is not well defined and knowable, it cannot be used to account for specific implicatures.

13. Explicature and Impliciture

As observed in §1, Grice (1975: 24) introduced the technical term “implicature” to denote either (i) the act of meaning or implying one thing by saying something else, or (ii) what the speaker meant or implied. Grice (1975: 87ff) used “say” quite strictly, requiring what a speaker says to be closely related to what the sentence uttered means on that occasion. Indexicals provide cases in which what a speaker says is not what the sentence used means. When Barb uttered “I have to work” in (1), she said that she, Barb, has to work; but the sentence she used does not mean “She, Barb, has to work” even on that occasion. Ellipsis allows people to say things without even uttering sentences. If John asks “Where did Mary go?” and Sue answers “To the gym”, then Sue said that Mary went to the gym. The infinitive phrase she uttered was elliptical for a sentence meaning “Mary went to the gym” but does not itself mean that.

Sperber and Wilson (1986a: 182–3) introduced the parallel term explicature to mean what is “explicitly communicated”. Carston (1988: 33) initially identified this with “what is said, in Grice’s terms”.[71] On this definition, Barb’s explicature in (1) was that she has to work, and her implicature was that she is not going to Paul’s party. Carston’s (1988: 40) paradigm case is less clear.

Alice ran to the edge of the cliff.
Alice jumped.
Alice jumped off the cliff.

After saying or observing that Alice ran to the edge of the cliff, a speaker would typically use (15a) “Alice jumped” to mean that Alice jumped off the cliff [15b]. Carston counts this an explicature. It does resemble ellipsis, but a speaker who used (15a) to mean that Alice jumped up to the rescue helicopter said the same thing while meaning something different. And if the speaker knew that Alice jumped up to safety, the speaker might be accused of misleading the hearer but not of lying.

Carston’s (1988: 45; 2004a: 646–8) most influential argument is based on what are commonly called “embedded implicatures”. She would claim that if “Alice jumped off the cliff” were an implicature of “Alice jumped”, then we should not understand (16a) and (16b) as having the same truth conditions. Yet we do, Carston believes. The alleged implicature seems to fall within the scope of the logical operator. Yet it cannot given the definition of implicature (§1).[72]

If Alice ran to the edge of the cliff and jumped, she is probably dead.
If Alice ran to the edge of the cliff and jumped off, she is probably dead.

W. Davis (2016: §5.3) replies as follows. A speaker who used (15a) to mean [15b] would just as naturally use (16a) to mean [16b], and hearers would understand the speaker accordingly. But what the speaker said is not entailed by [16b]. What the speaker of (16a) said would be false in circumstances in which Alice was unlikely to jump off the cliff if she jumped. Hearers would focus on what the speaker meant, though, which would be true even in those circumstances. Since the speaker meant one thing [16b] by saying something else [16a], the speaker implicates [16b]. The speaker cannot implicate anything by uttering the antecedent of (16a) because the speaker does not say anything by uttering the antecedent, only by uttering the whole conditional. So there is really no embedding of implicatures when (16a) is uttered.

The relationship between (15) and (16) is special. In many other cases in which a sentence “p” conversationally implicates “q”, the conditional “If p then r” does not implicate “If p and q then r”. For example, If Bill got some problems wrong, he might have gotten them all wrong does not implicate “If Bill got some but not all problems wrong, he might have gotten them all wrong”.

A lively debate between Relevance theorists and neo-Griceans concerns numerical claims.

Peter has one child.
Peter has at least one child.
Peter has exactly one child.

All parties agree that a speaker can use (17) to mean either [17a] or [17b]. Horn (1972) and Levinson (2000: 87–90) further agree with Carston that (17) itself is unambiguous. But whereas the neo-Griceans hold that (17) means [17a] rather than [17b], Carston (1988: 46–7) maintains that (17) means neither but can be used to say both. So the neo-Griceans hold that (17) always says [17a] while sometimes implicating [17b]. Carston holds that (17) is sometimes used to explicate [17a] and sometimes [17b]; neither is an implicature. The thesis that sentence meaning leaves open what is said to this extent is called semantic underdetermination.

While still doubting that Carston’s view can fully account for cardinals, Horn (1989: 250–1; 2010: 314–5) now concludes that they do not behave like quantifiers. For example, if you know that everyone passed, you must answer “Did some students pass?” with “Yes”. But if you know that Peter has two children, you cannot answer “Does Peter have one child?” without knowing whether the speaker meant “at least” or “exactly”. Indeed, a case can be made that (17) is ambiguous, so that Neo-Gricean and Relevance accounts are both wrong (W. Davis 2016: §7.3).

Following Sperber & Wilson (1986a: 182), Carston (2004b: 635) later defines an explicature as a development of a logical form encoded by the sentence uttered, and an implicature as any proposition communicated by an utterance that is not an explicature.[73] The technical terms “development” and “logical form” are understood in such a way that [15b] is a development of [15a]. Thus understood, “explicature” covers much more than what is said, and “implicature” covers much less than what is implicated as defined in §1.

Bach (1994: 160) uses “say” even more strictly than Grice, meaning “strictly, literally, and explicitly say”. Since the speaker of (15a) did not explicitly say [15b], Bach counts “The speaker said that Alice jumped off the cliff” as false. Bach (1994: 125–6, 140–1; 2006: 28–9) agrees with Carston, though, in withholding the term “implicature” when what the speaker means is an “expansion” or “completion” of what is said. Bach introduces the term impliciture (with “i” rather than “a” after soft “c”) to cover such cases. Bach restricts “implicature” to cases in which what is meant is “completely separate” from what is said.

A thesis attributed to Grice is that what S says is determined by “decoding”, while what S conversationally implicates is determined by what S says together with an inferential, pragmatic mechanism (see, e.g., Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 182). An alleged problem, called “Grice’s Circle” (Levinson 2000: 173–4, 186–7), is that many of the processes involved in figuring out what is said, such as reference identification and ambiguity resolution, “involve exactly those inferential mechanisms that characterize Gricean pragmatics”.[74] Grice never talked about decoding however, and observed himself that conversational principles are involved in determining what is said (Grice 1957: 222). For example, if an ambiguous term is used, we naturally assume—in the absence of specific counterevidence—that the intended meaning is the one relevant to the conversation. In a discussion of snow, “There is a large bank on Main Street” is naturally interpreted as referring to a snow bank.

There is no circle on Grice’s view because what is said is the conclusion of one pragmatic inference, and is one of the premises in a further pragmatic inference to what is implicated.[75] The process is serial rather than parallel, although later conclusions may always lead to adjustment of earlier conclusions.

14. Speaker Implicature and Intention

W. Davis (2016: Ch. 2) describes ways of explaining and inferring conversational implicatures that do not rely on conversational principles. The methods he proposes for speaker implicature are described in this section and for sentence implicature in the next.

For a speaker to implicate something is for the speaker to mean something by saying something else (§1). It is generally agreed that what a speaker means is determined by the speaker’s intentions. When Steve utters “Kathryn is a Russian teacher”, whether Steve means that Kathryn is a teacher of Russian nationality or a teacher of the Russian language, and whether he is speaking literally or ironically, depends entirely on what Steve intends to convey. What “convey” means precisely is controversial, but is an independent issue.[76]

We most commonly explain why people do A with the intention of doing B by explaining why they believe they will do B by doing A, or why they want to do B. We can explain why speakers intend to convey a thought by uttering a sentence that says something else in the same ways. Why do speakers believe they can convey thoughts by means of the various figures and modes of speech identified in §4? One reason is that they have seen others doing so. Knowledge of the common forms of implicature is acquired along with knowledge of the semantics and syntax of our native language. Speakers pick up figures and modes of speech from other speakers, as they learn vocabulary and grammar. After speakers have become proficient, their own past success in using figures and modes of speech is a reason for them to believe they will succeed again. Knowledge of both figures and modes is as tacit as our knowledge of syntax and semantics. It is not knowledge of facts that define a language, but of how a language is used and understood. Since the figures and modes do not depend on a particular language, they can be used with any language.

Why do speakers want to engage in implicature? The main reasons are the reasons speakers make statements: to communicate, express themselves, and record their thoughts. These goals may serve to cooperate with others, or to oppose them. What goals are served by implicating rather than saying something? One is verbal efficiency (Levinson 2000: 28–31; Camp 2006: 3; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 62): through implicature we express two or more thoughts by uttering just one sentence. Another is to mislead without lying (Horn 2010: §4; 2017; Zufferey et al. 2019: 77–84). People often wish others to believe things that are false, and not only in situations of conflict and competition. And they nearly always prefer misleading to lying.[77] The greater deniability of implicature, and the fact that it enables us to veil our intentions, are often motivating factors (Brown & Levinson 1978: 137; Pinker 2007; Camp 2022). We observed in §10 how implicature promotes the goals of style and politeness.

It should also be recognized that people perform many even highly skilled actions automatically, spontaneously, or habitually. Such actions are done without deliberation or conscious planning. What speakers implicate as well as what they say commonly falls in this category.

Given that speaker meaning is a matter of speaker intention, it follows that speaker implicatures can be recognized or predicted by the methods we use to infer intentions from behavior, including abduction, analogy, and testimony. In example (2), Carla may suspect that Don means the weather is bad because irony is a common linguistic device (§4), and Don has been ironic in similar situations before. Don’s intonation may be a clue. On the other hand, if Don rarely speaks figuratively when reporting in, Carla may infer that he meant what he said.[78]

Conversational principles can play the same indirect role in implicature recognition that known tendencies or goals play in inductive inference generally. Since speakers commonly observe the Cooperative Principle, and hearers know this in a vague and tacit sort of way, hearers tend to assume that particular speakers are cooperating, in the absence of evidence to the contrary. If the hypothesis that Barb means she is not going to Paul’s party in example (1) fits better with the assumption that she is being cooperative than the hypothesis that she is not answering the question, Alan may by abduction infer she is implicating that. Further support for the hypothesis may be provided by the recollection that other speakers have implicated similar things in similar circumstances before. The fact that relevance implicature is a common practice thus provides analogical evidence (§4). Recognition of an unconventional form of implicature is more difficult, but no harder than recognizing when a speaker is using a sentence with an unconventional meaning. As Sterelny (1982: 192–3) observed, knowledge of the particular speaker is ultimately more important than knowledge of non-universal generalizations.

When S is being uncooperative, we have to use other generalizations or analogies. We are familiar with the ways defendants manipulate language in an effort to avoid self-incrimination.

15. Sentence Implicature and Convention

Whereas what a speaker implicates depends on the particular speaker’s intentions, what a sentence implicates on Davis’s theory depends on the conventions of the community of speakers who use the language. To know or explain sentence implicatures is to know or explain the relevant conventions. This is as true of generalized conversational implicatures as it is of implicatures that are conventional in Grice’s sense (§2).

When Grice talked about conventional implicatures he was referring to semantic implicatures, like [3c]. These exist because of conventions that give individual words or syntactic structures their meanings. The queen is English and therefore brave implicates “Being brave follows from being English” because it is conventional for English speakers to use “therefore” with a certain meaning, which determines the implicature. A conversational sentence implicature is not determined by the meaning of the sentence used, even when sentences with the same form are conventionally used with that implicature. It is a second-order convention: a convention to use a sentence of a given form with an implicature that is not part of its meaning. The common modes and figures of speech are also second-order conventions, but not restricted to sentences with a particular form. A language is defined by first-order lexical and syntactic conventions, not by second-order implicature conventions. In this respect conversational implicature conventions are like naming conventions, word formation rules, intonation rules, speech act rituals (e.g., saying “This is N” when answering a telephone), and indirect speech act conventions (e.g., asking “Can I get an N?” to request an N).[79] Second-order conventions are not as arbitrary, though, because there is always some antecedent relation between what the sentence means and the implicature that makes it natural to use one to convey the other. Implicature conventions promote style, politeness, and efficiency as well as communication.

Like other second-order linguistic conventions, conversational implicature conventions differ in their cross-linguistic spread. Whereas the quantity implicature of “some” has been found in all observed languages (Horn 1989), common metaphors differ as much from language to language as the idioms that evolve from them do. The fact that regularities in implicature obtain cross-linguistically is compatible with their being arbitrary and conventional. Witness the practice of using “?” and rising intonation to mark questions. Why some implicatures are common to more languages than others is an open question on any view. To the extent that implicatures are conventional, it is a question for historical linguistics.

Knowledge of sentence implicatures is a crucial component of linguistic competence.[80] Speakers unaware of them are likely to mislead their audience. Imagine the possibilities if an oblivious speaker said Your husband saw a woman to the subject’s wife. Hearers without such knowledge are likely to either misinterpret or fail to fully understand the speaker. Sentence implicatures, both semantic and conversational, resemble idioms and figures of speech in being picked up by native speakers from other speakers in the course of learning the language. Sentence implicatures thus perpetuate themselves from one generation to the next as sentence meanings do. Recent metaphors are special in being picked up by adults, and are liable to become idioms if they pass on to new generations.

An impressive body of research has attempted to discern general regularities in the multitude of conversational implicature conventions associated with a language. Wierzbicka (2003) has studied how implicature conventions reflect broader “cultural scripts”. Others study how the implicatures of a sentence are related to the implicatures of compound sentences in which the sentence is embedded (Gazdar 1979; Levinson 2000: §2.5.1; Sauerland & Stateva 2007)—the question raised by example (16).

The most influential work on conversational implicature conventions describes “Horn scales”.[81] Horn (1972, 1989) observed that the quantifiers all, most, many, some form a scale with the following properties. Instances of “___ S are P” with one term entail instances with any term to the right, but not to the left; the terms are thus ordered by logical strength. Moreover, the result of substituting one term implicates the denial of the result of substituting any term to the left, but not to the right. In the negative context “It is not the case that ___ S are P”, the logical and pragmatic relations are reversed. Other Horn scales are ⟨necessarily, actually, possibly⟩, ⟨certainly, probably, possibly⟩, and ⟨must, should, may⟩. Horn (1989: §4.5) correlates the existence of scales with the absence of certain lexical items, such as a quantifier meaning “not all”.[82] Levinson (2000: 156) looked for a generalization that would cover these cases but not scales like ⟨Over 90%, over 10%, some⟩ which have the same logical relations as Horn scales but not the pragmatic relations. One generalization is that the items on a Horn scale are widely and frequently used monolexemes. A companion problem is to explain why some common monolexemes with similar logical relations lack the pragmatic relations, as several illustrates. Given the conventional nature of generalized conversational implicatures, there may be no systematic (“synchronic”) explanation. All languages are “irregular” to some extent. For example, the regular pattern for adjectives in English is that of tall, taller, tallest. But there are exceptions, such as good, better, best. No one expects that anything other than a historical (“diachronic”) explanation exists for these facts.

The literature on implicature is enormous and still growing. This entry, regrettably, had to ignore many valuable contributions.


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