Jaina Philosophy

First published Mon Feb 13, 2023

The Jains are those who consider that the teaching of the omniscient Jinas is the expression of the eternal essential nature of the universe. The only extant teaching is that of Mahāvīra (traditional dates 599–527/510 BCE, in Magadha, South of modern Bihar), the last Jina of the current cosmic period.

In their practice, Jaina renunciants follow a rigorous method towards salvation, in which a non-violent way of life, the renunciation from a worldly ego, the dissociation of self and non-self, and a gradual purification of the self towards unobstructed knowledge, become as many different facets of the same effort to access to a superior order of being in which each self manifests its true nature.

This path came to involve structured monastic and lay communities; sets of practices—ritual and devotional acts, ascetic practices, rules of life; as well as conceptions of the world deposited in canonical and post-canonical corpuses, in systematic treatises, or in narrative literature. Jaina Philosophy is the set of philosophical investigations developed by thinkers as they appear in these different corpuses (Malvania & Soni 2007; Potter & Balcerowicz 2013, 2014). While several trends can be observed from the canonical period to modern thinkers via the mystics, the following principles are shared: Jaina metaphysics is an atomist and dualist conception of the world, it focuses on the nature of the self, on that of karmic matter, as well as on their principles of association. Jaina ethics consists of practices focused on non-violence, non-absolutism and non-attachment, which aim to disentangle the self and karmic matter and which help one to reach omniscience. Besides, Jaina philosophers are particular renown for developing a realist epistemology centered on “many-sidedness”.

Jaina philosophy is composed in Ardhamāgadhī, Jaina Māhārāṣṭrī, Śaurasenī, Sanskrit, Apabhraṃśa, Braj Bhāṣā, Kannada, Tamil, Gujarati, Hindi, to quote only the main languages. This entry provides Sanskrit terms only, because Sanskrit became the lingua franca of philosophical inter-doctrinal discussions in South Asia at the turn of the common era.

1. Ethics of renunciation: from self-sacrifice to non-violence and omniscience

1.1 Escaping rebirths through self-sacrifice

Jaina teaching firstly aims to promote a type of behavior, a method to concretely modify an unsatisfying situation, not by modifying one’s environment, but by modifying oneself. More precisely, individuals aim at freeing themselves from the infinite cycle of painful rebirths. In order to achieve this, they are meant to progress within a spiritual path thanks to an internal sacrifice based on ascetic practices of renunciation. The Jain who aspires to final emancipation abandons worldly life, notably all her possession. This correct behavior (samyak carita) consists in an extreme self-control. Jainism is an arduous path, in which the disciple needs methods to assist her, as described in length notably in the Later Chapters (Uttarādhyayana, 2nd century BCE–1st century CE [Utt.]). One such method is an incitement to cultivate a pessimistic attitude towards the world. For example, the twelve contemplations (anuprekṣā), which are pre-meditative states, are incitements towards the contemplation of human beings and of their relation to the surrounding world, which prompt the awareness that:

  1. everything in the world is not enduring;
  2. all beings are helpless;
  3. when an individual is spiritually free, only she has been able to achieve it, and only she can enjoy it, no other individual can assist and share, each individual is isolated;
  4. all the relationships of an embodied self are temporary, not real;
  5. empirical reality from life to death to life is endless and full of calamities;
  6. the empirical universe is an abode for selves that do not know their real nature;
  7. embodied selves are bound in impure, rotten and stinking bodies;
  8. the influx of karmic matter is the main cause of miseries;
  9. the stoppage of the influx of karmic matter is possible by means of penances;
  10. the purification of karmic matter that is already bound is possible by means of penances;
  11. the doctrine (dharma) preached by the Jinas leads to spiritual freedom;
  12. human enlightenment is rare and difficult to obtain, it is an essential duty of all humans to get it prior to their death (Treatise on What There Is, TS 9.7).

1.2 Non-violence as a characteristic mark of Jainism

A peculiarity of Jainism is to essentially associate these renunciatory liberating practices with the imperative of non-violence (ahiṃsā) (Donaldson & Bajželj 2021). More precisely, at the heart of Jainism is the belief according to which each living being is the transitory embodiment of a permanent divine-like self (jīva), which is unobstructed consciousness. In this conception, a human being can clear her self from all the obstructions she currently experiences until she becomes the unobstructed consciousness she essentially is. Now, this conception also implies the non-harming (ahiṃsā) of the other divine-like selves which, in turns, implies a constant awareness of their presence and true nature, as well as self-mastery and careful behavior. In one of the most ancient Jaina texts, the Canonical Text on Behavior (Ācārāṅgasūtra, ĀS), written in early Ardhamāgadhī around the 4th–3rd centuries BCE, practices conducive to liberation are presented in the following way:

  • ĀS 1.1.21. For the sake of survival, for the sake of praise, honor, reverence, for the sake of birth, death, liberation, for the sake of prevention of miseries…
  • ĀS 1.1.22. …some monk either indulges himself in action causing violence to the beings or earth-body through various kinds of weapons, makes others to cause violence to the beings of earth-body, or approve of others causing violence to the beings of earth-body.
  • ĀS 1.1.23. Such an act of violence proves baneful for him. Such an act of violence deprives him of enlightenment.
  • ĀS 1.1.24. He (the true ascetic), comprehending it, becomes vigilant over the practice of self-discipline.
  • ĀS 1.1.25. Hearing from the Venerable Mahāvīra himself or from the monks, one comes to know: it (i.e., causing violence to the beings of earth-body), in fact, is the knot of bondage; it, in fact, is the delusion; it, in fact, is the death; it, in fact, is the hell.

Concretely, to get closer to the realization of our real nature consists of being aware of the presence of other selves in living beings around oneself and of acting in a non-harming way towards them. This gave rise to practices of renunciation:

  1. practices of non-violence, such as not eating meat, not drinking non-filtered water containing microscopic forms of life, or walking with extreme caution and restrictions;
  2. practices towards self-control, like meditation or mortification of the flesh;
  3. practices of abstinence, in the line of no sexual intercourse, no food for given periods of time, non-possession up to the nudity of some monks; and
  4. penances, today mainly consisting in fasts and recitation of prayers.

One can only notice the strict character of these norms of action. Jaina thinkers have developed thorough classifications as a backdrop of these norms (Balbir 1999). First, classifications on the types of violence to be avoided, that include not only direct harmful acts, but also delegated ones, as well as the bare fact of permitting a harmful act by letting it happen. Besides, acts can be physical, verbal or mental ones. This forms the ground of a moral theory in which our responsibility extends far beyond commonly shared conceptions.

Next to this, living beings are classified, from one-sensed beings, like earth-beings, water beings or plants, to five-senses beings, like humans, mammals, or gods. In this classification, only human beings can get liberated. So even if gods have more felicity than human beings, this is not the ultimately desired state. With such a conception, Jainism propounds a type of reasoned anthropocentrism, inasmuch as there is a unicity and rarity of the human life, without it being central. Besides, one should avoid to harm even the microscopic life forms present in the soil. This version of non-violence is so extreme that one’s restrained action is very close to one’s mere absence of act, since even breathing, drinking water, or walking can prove harmful.

On a methodological level, one can also only notice the thorough use of lists in this philosophical paradigm, the more striking example is probably to be found in the Canonical text on possibilities (Sthānāṅgasūtra, 3rd–2nd centuries BCE [Ṭhāṇ.]), in which philosophical considerations take the form of ordered lists of items, starting with singletons in chapter one (e.g., one Mahāvīra in this cosmic cycle), continuing with lists of two items in chapter two (e.g., the self versus non-self stuff), and so on up to the tenth chapter, that presents lists of ten items (e.g., there are ten characteristics of the Jaina path, namely patience, liberation, honesty, kindness, humbleness, truth, self-discipline, austerity, detachment and chastity).

The difficulty of following these norms of action gave rise to two important changes in Jaina conceptions of the world (Johnson 1995). First, in early canons, violent acts are the only direct factors of bondage; while in later canonical texts, passions came to play an important role, which means that one’s intention to harm is valued in the calculus of one’s bondage. In this dynamic, non-intentional harmful act can be forgiven. Second, the difficulty to follow these norms is one of the fields in which the many-sided perspectival stance of Jaina philosophers emerged, since an action can be qualified as harmful from a given perspective, while qualified as non-harmful—therefore permitted—from another perspective.

Now, next to be able to determine whether an act is harmful or not is the question to determine what is a self and what is not.

1.3 The categories of reality

The Treatise on What There Is (Tattvārthasūtra, TS), associated with the name of Umāsvāmin and probably written by multiple authors around 150–400 CE, is traditionally considered as the first work and main representative of classical Jaina philosophy. It is the oldest extant Jaina treatise in Sanskrit. It aims to integrate themes tackled in canonical literature in a coherent philosophical system. The Treatise on what there is, opens with the following verses:

  • TS 1.1. The path to liberation is constituted by right view (darśana), right knowledge, and right conduct.
  • TS 1.2. Right view is confidence in the categories.
  • TS 1.4. The categories are self, non-self, inflow [of karmic matter], bondage [with karmic matter], stoppage [of the inflow], destruction [of the bondage], liberation.
  • TS 5.1. The inanimate entities (= non-self) are medium of motion (dharma), medium of rest, space and matter.
  • TS 5.2. [These] together with the selves are the substances.
  • TS 5.38. (exists only in some textual traditions). Time is also a substance.

So, there are seven categories and six types of substance. The first category consists in selves, which are a type of substance, while the second category, the non-self stuff, encompasses the five remaining types of substance. These two categories will be dealt with in more depth in the section on metaphysics (§2.1). Next to these, are the inflow of harmful and harmless karmic matter into a sentient substance (āsrava); the mutual intermingling of sentient and non-sentient karmic matter caused by wrong belief, non-renunciation, carelessness, passions and vibrations set in the soul through mind, body and speech (bandha); the stoppage of the inflow of karmic matter into a sentient substance that results from right conduct (saṃvara); the gradual dissociation of karmic matter from a sentient substance (nirjarā); and the state of complete annihilation of karmic matter in the pure sentient substance (mokṣa). For this section on ethics, what is important to keep in mind is that five out of the seven elementary categories are not ontological ones, but define the way by means of which the self, which is primarily active consciousness, relates to things which are not conscious and passive.

First, this means that the categories relevant in this metaphysics are introduced inasmuch as a good understanding of their nature is essential in characterizing the practice that will make one progress in the path towards liberation.


these categories (tattva) are essentially “facts” about the nature of existence which enable those who analyse them properly to plot their route to liberation. (Johnson 2014)

As such, there is an inbuilt soteriological concern of Jaina ontology and metaphysics.

Third, the core categorical differentiation distinguishes between what is animate and conscious and what is not. Such an impermeable distinction is especially essential in a conception in which one needs to be able to know precisely how much her acts are correct, respectively incorrect, because the harm done to others binds her. This was an important part of the discussions concerning monastic practices.

1.4 Liberation as unobstructed knowledge

Next to these considerations, epistemological concerns are likewise prevalent in the shaping of the metaphysical and soteriological edifices. This is due to the fact that Jaina practices aim at the practitioner’s liberation from wrong conceptions (mithyātva). In the Treatise on What There Is, the self is defined in the following way:

  • TS 2.8. The defining characteristic of the self is experience (upayoga).

This definition is further commented in the Commentary on the Treatise on What There Is (Tattvārthasūtrabhāṣya [TSBh]), written in Sanskrit by Umāsvāti (400–450 CE), by dividing this experience into cognition (jñāna) and indeterminate perception (darśana) (TSBh 2.9.1).

This stress on epistemic abilities is not typical of Jainism. Indeed, in most South Asian philosophico-religious traditions, the divine, the absolute, is usually primarily knowledge (jñāna), consciousness (cit), insight (prajñā), the subject of experience (puruṣa) or the seer (draṣṭṛ). Therefore, Jaina conceptions of the self (ātman, jīva) as ultimately unobstructed consciousness are no exception here.

Nor is the fact that our spiritual progress consists in a progress which is virtuous and epistemic at the same time. To explain, karma is in Jainism conceived as a subtle type of matter that fills all cosmic space. Its specific property is to develop the consequences of our virtuous, respectively unethical, acts. And then, due to passions which act as a glue, karmic matter sticks to the self and obstructs its potency. Let us think of someone’s reflection in a mirror as a type of expression of herself. Now, imagine that the mirror is red, with the pun that the Sanskrit expression “rāga” means both “red object” and “attachment, passion.” In such a situation, the person will have a red, therefore distorted, vision of herself. Jaina thinkers teach us that karmic matter function likewise, it has the shape of one’s impetus towards objects and, doing so, it impedes one’s epistemic competence, as she approaches things as part of a given limited project she has. From this, getting rid of specific intentions, acting in an equanimous virtuous way is also burning karma is also acquiring the means to see things in a less distorted way. That is to say things as they are instead of things as I intend them to be. This is this removal of wrong habits that enables right knowledge and right sight to take place, and that explains that the acquisition of higher faculties of knowledge is ensured by renunciation from passions and the corresponding destruction of karmic bondage.

In general, within a framework that admits the karma theory:

  1. The acquisition of higher epistemic abilities is ensured by moral behavior and the corresponding destruction of karma. In this dynamic, theories of karma blur the distinction between epistemology and soteriology.
  2. Metaphysical investigations focus on the world qua knowable. For example, Jainas derive the expression “loka”, “the universe”, not from the Sanskrit etymology “open space”, but from the root “lok-”, “to see”, inasmuch as the universe is conceived as “that which is seen by the omniscient one” (Dundas 2002). In general, theories of karma blur the distinction between epistemology and metaphysics.
  3. Even a clod of earth exists as earth because it has earned its particular niche in the wider system of life processes due to its previous deeds. In consequence, the world of nature cannot be separated from the moral order. In general, theories of karma blur the distinction between metaphysics and soteriology.

2. A complete worldview: metaphysics, taxonomies, cosmology

2.1 Six types of substances

We have just seen that the Jaina ethical effort is focused on distinguishing what is the self from what it is not. This is what explains that Jaina metaphysics is regularly presented as a dualism that conceives the world a resulting from the activity of the elements belonging to these two everlasting uncreated coexisting and independent categories (Dixit 1971). This conception is close to that of Sāṃkhya philosophy, which admits of two irreducible categories, namely the Experiencer (puruṣa) and the Experienced (prakṛti), and which considers philosophy as the activity whose main goal is the disentanglement of these two categories. Now, besides these shared fundamental conceptions, both classifications deeply diverge (Bronkhorst 2007).

In Jainism, the self (jīva) is more precisely unobstructed consciousness that concretely experiences cognition and perception. It is also what desires pleasure, reads pain, acts beneficially or harmfully and experiences the fruit thereof. In other words, being an influential active self is a condition of possibility for the individual to make or unmake herself in the world, which is perceived by Jains as a condition of possibility for ethical responsibility. Here, their conception differs from the one of Sāṃkhya philosophers, who consider that in deepest reality, the self has never acted, and that all perceived activity is actually performed by non-self stuff trying to imitate the self. From this, selves have never genuinely been bound by karma, and realizing this proper nature of things thanks to the yogic practice of meditation is alone sufficient to free from rebirth and karmic retribution. For more on yoga and meditative practices in Jainism, see the Treatise on yoga (Yogaśāstra [YŚ]) by Hemacandra (1089–1172) (Chapple 2016; Tatia 1951).

Despite the success of this conception and the fact that Jaina philosophers share most of the necessary elements to also subscribe to this conception, they will not take this direction. The reason for this is that they need an active self, because moral distinctions lose their value on the hypothesis of the passivity of the soul. On this point, they are also severe critics of theories of the creation of the world by God (Īśvara), in which the intelligent subject is the mere product of an external intelligent principle; or of the fatalist theory according to which all things are fixed; to indicate but a few interlocutors.

Besides, Jaina philosophers consider that there are as many selves as there are living beings in the world. Each has a persisting self-identity preserved even in the ultimate condition, which is a condition of possibility for ethical responsibility. Concerning one’s responsibility for a series of acts, Jaina authors are highly critical, both of the Buddhist conception according to which there is no self, and of the Brahmanic conception according to which the individual self is ultimately undifferentiated with the universal self.

Finally, there is a fixed amount of selves in the universe. Not only the non-liberated ones go from one birth to the other in this cosmic cycle, but it will be the same ones who will continue to do so in the next cosmic cycle, and so on. Besides, a self is fit, respectively unfit, for liberation. When a self is unfit, no amount of good act can change this fact.

Second, the category of non-self (ajīva) deals with the matter and organisational principles thereof. To begin with, space (ākāśa) is an all-pervading single indivisible whole that includes both the part occupied by the world of things (loka) and the void and empty part beyond it (aloka). A point of space (pradeśa) is conceived as that which can be obstructed by one indivisible atom of matter and which can give space to all types of particles.

Now, space by itself is not a sufficient condition of motion and of rest. To avoid chaos, it is necessary to also postulate a medium of motion (dharma), as well as a medium of rest (adharma). The traditional metaphor is that, as water is the condition of the motion of fish, dharma and adharma are the condition of all motions. Here lies another specificity of Jainism. While in other systems, dharma (etymologically “what sustains”) represents the only really sustainable stream of acts, the virtuous way of life, the worthy behavior, one’s teaching or religion, here it stands for the medium of motion, while meritorious behavior is “puṇya” (respectively, non-meritorious behavior is “pāpa”). This is an instance of a Jaina tendency to physicalize the philosophical and ethical concepts. If we understand dharma as the universal law establishing what is fit and what is not, hereby accounting for movements with an intention, we can understand that in the early Jaina conceptions, in which the concrete acts, not the intention, are foremost, dharma becomes what accounts for movements in general.

Together, space, the medium of motion and the medium of rest are the conditions of motion of things that can move, while they are themselves unaffected by movement. They are devoid of the qualities of taste, color, smell, sound, contact. They pervade the whole universe, yet they are non-physical, non-atomic and non-discrete. These three substances form a unity, they have the same all-embracing size and continuous form. They are distinguished merely because of the difference in their respective functions. They are the conditions for the subsistence of all things, selves and matter, the connecting environment which binds together the isolated phenomena into an ordered whole.

As for matter (pudgala), it is the material cause of body, speech, mind and breath. This means that in this conception, not only bodies (śārira), but also the physical mind, words, thoughts and breath, are types of subtle material substances. Matter is especially what accounts for the existence of karma, a subtle type of matter. To explain, there is a pan-Indian conception that what has parts is impermanent. In Jainism, matter is the only type of substance that can associate or dissociate and, therefore, that has parts. Therefore, impermanence only comes from one’s association with matter. Contrarily to matter, (i) a self is a single atom devoid of parts and totally independent from both other selves and other substances; (ii) space, medium of motion and medium of rest are each a single indivisible whole that occupies all cosmic space; and (iii) time has no extension.

Furthermore, Jaina thinkers develop a complex system, with calculations, to explain the practical effects of karma, for example the precise mass of material particles assimilated after a given act, or the duration and intensity of this assimilation. This resembles physics, and one specificity of Jaina philosophy is to focus on developing this complex system of the mechanisms of karma, as seen in the Essence of [the teachings of] Mahāvīra (Gommaṭasāra [GS]) of Nemicandra (10th century CE). There are eight types of karmic matter (see TS 8.5), divided in four harming (ghātiyā) and four non-harming (aghātiyā) types (Jaini 1979). The harming types of karmic matter are:

  • delusory karma (mohanīya), which reduces one’s innate bliss and brings about attachment to incorrect views. It notably distorts one’s appreciation of the categories of reality;
  • knowledge-obstructing karma (jñāna-avaraṇīya), which covers the self, the mind and the senses, therefore impedes their natural abilities;
  • perception-obstructing karma (darśanāvaraṇīya), which impedes one’s intuitions;
  • obstacle karma (antarāya), which reduces one’s innate energy.

And the four non-harming types of karmic matter are:

  • feeling karma (vedanīya), which determines whether the experiences of the self are pleasant or not;
  • name karma (nāman), which determines what sort of rebirth is attained;
  • life karma (āyus), which decides the duration of one’s life;
  • clan karma (gotra), which determines one’s status within a species (Wiley 2011).

Finally, time is what accounts for becoming. Time is not treated with other substances, because it has no extension. From this, it is not considered as a substance properly speaking, only in some aspects. Especially, its existence can only be extrapolated from our awareness of phenomena. There is an absolute time (kāla), which is eternal, and a relative time (samaya), with a beginning and variations, determined by the motion in things. Time is called the destroyer, because all things are liable to dissolution of form in the cyclic course of time.

2.2 An atomism

The whole physics of Jainism is an atomism. In this, Jaina conceptions are close to those of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition. An atom (paramāṇu) is infinitesimal, ultimate and eternal. From this, it is neither created nor destroyed. Now, contrarily to the conceptions of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers, according to which God (Īśvara) is the one who presides over the association of these atoms and creates the world as we experience it, Jaina philosophers hold that there is no such entity. For them, atoms have always been there and their association follows natural laws. Jaina philosophers are especially critical of an attitude that does not favor ethical responsibility, and the recognition that an external consciousness is responsible for the state of the world risks to undermine this ethical responsibility beyond repair. According to them, ethics especially requires that the individual can make or unmake herself in this world. This is partly what explains that there is a lengthy tradition of refutations by both Jaina and Buddhist philosophers of the Naiyāyika arguments in favor of the fact that God is the sustainer of the world.

Next to this, an atom is not necessarily material. Indeed, selves are a type of atom. Matter exists as atom or as aggregate (skandha). The aggregates, produced out of a mutual attraction of atoms, vary from binary to infinite compounds and every perceivable object, that is to say every object endowed with a form, is an aggregate. As such, atoms are the formless basis of all forms, although sometimes it is said that it has form inasmuch as it can be perceived by the omniscient ones. Furthermore, in contradistinction with the conception of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and in agreement with Leucippus and Democritus, Jaina philosophers hold that an atom of one type is first undifferentiated, similar to any other atom of the same type, and then develops differentiated characteristics so as to become an atom of earth, an atom of water, etc. Atoms therefore acquire a kind of taste, color, smell, contact, as well as weight, the heavier moving downwards and the lighter upwards. An interesting characteristic of Jainism is that an atom may develop a motion so swift that it traverses in one moment the whole universe. This explains that some saints, who are well advanced in the path that consists in realizing the proper nature of things, can perform this miracle.

Finally, atoms can contract and expand. When in subtle state, innumerable atoms occupy the space of one gross atom. Matter is an eternal substance undetermined with regards to quantity and quality. It is because the atoms in it can expand that matter may increase or diminish in volume without addition or loss of particles. For a self, which also is an atom and which has dimensions although it is not material, this means that it is capable of expansion and contraction. The self is actually co-extensive with the physical body it occupies. This is what explains that we have sensations from the top of the head to the tip of the toes. This means that the self is of a very small size when it starts in the womb, then it expands and, at the end of each earthly life, it contracts again into the seed of the next birth. To explain how this works, Jaina philosophers use metaphors such as that of a lamp: whether placed in a small pot or in a larger room, a lamp illumines the whole space. In the same way, the self imparts consciousness according to the dimensions of the body it occupies. Another specificity of Jainism is the belief according to which, under special circumstances, an embodied self can expand beyond its body, up to the size of the universe, and act outside of it. This projection, called “samudghāta”, “extermination”, enables her to annihilate specific karmic matter (Pragya 2021).

2.3 A reasoned anthropocentrism

Jaina thinkers excel in developing lengthy and highly technical classifications. A core classification is the taxonomy that distinguishes the types of embodied selves according to the number of senses they possess. This taxonomy has retained its importance for contemporary practitioners, notably because it defines the extent of demerit acquired when one actually harms a living being.

There, the first category gathers all the living beings possessing only one sense, namely that of touch. This concerns either plants, or the elemental selves which gets embodied in an atom of earth, of water, of fire, or of air, either gross or subtle. In consequence, there are souls also in things such as stones and metals. However, it is not always the case that a self gets embodied in these atoms. When there is no self in it, the atom is purely inanimate matter, unable to suffer. In opposition to this, each plant or animal is necessarily the host of a self, this is what makes it alive. Concerning plants, some can also be the host of several selves, as in the case of moss. This also concerns the most basic life form, called “nigoda”, “idle”, and which consists in clusters of minute beings with little hope for liberation. They can be found everywhere, including in air, tissues of plants, or flesh of animals. The offense must be strong for a self once embodied in a human being to get embodied as a nigoda. One famous example is that of Makkhali Gośāla, leader of the heretic Ājīvika movement, who was disrespectful and challenged Mahāvīra. Furthermore, if a plant dies, its self transmigrates and gets re-embodied in another, more or less subtle, body. In this case, the body of the plant is not alive anymore, but it is still inhabited by the selves of the bacteria that work towards its decomposition. To conclude on one-sensed beings, they possess the sense of touch. This means that they cannot see, hear, smell, taste, nor think, but they have a minimal conscious activity in the form of the tactile experience. Besides, even in a crude not developed way, they can already experience pleasure and pain.

Next to the one-sensed beings are all the animals. First, worms and every being in their category, like leeches, mollusks, or a type of phytophagous beetles, are two-sensed beings, possessing both touch and taste. Then, ants and all the beings in their category, like phytophagous insects, termites and millipedes, are three-sensed beings, and are also able to smell. They are followed by the four-sensed beings who can also see, like bees and similar beings as flies, mosquitoes, butterflies or scorpions. Finally, human beings and all the beings in their category, like fish, reptiles, birds, quadrupeds, demons and gods, are five-sensed beings, enjoying touch, taste, smell, sight, and hearing. Amongst them, some also have an intellect (manas), considered by some authors as a sixth sense.

It is interesting to note that the English expression “animal” denotes what is animated, what has a soul. While in Jainism, what is animated, what has a soul (jīva), also includes the immobile plants and elemental beings. In this conception, the Sanskrit expression for animal is “tiryañc-”, “what is able to cross a spatial area”.

It is hard to understand what is not alive in this system. Therefore, acting in a non-harmful way is close to non-acting. In practice, while the lay community should avoid harming the beings with two or more senses, the monastic community is supposed to also avoid harming the one-sensed beings. With such a norm of action, monks and nuns cannot cook, nor perform a range of acts necessary for their survival. From this, a system of redistribution of merit and demerit is developed for the lay people, who perform some violent acts for their survival, but are redeemed in providing the means to live to the monastic community.

2.4 Of self and karma: which type of dualism for the Jaina philosopher

Each self is eternal and, as such, it has no beginning nor end. At the same time, each self is constantly experiencing change, because it is essentially active. This is a core teaching of Jainism to which we will come back in the section 3.4 on epistemology, namely, that every existing thing is at the same time persistent and changing (Bajželj 2013). This is one of the doctrinal points that prompted Jaina thinkers to speak in terms of many-sided objects of knowledge.

Now, this means that even the omniscient one who fully manifests the qualities of consciousness still has modal variations on its consciousness, like momentary and innately arising modes of absolute knowledge and of absolute perception that continuously succeed to one another being qualitatively identical, just as the innately produced modes of time are qualitatively identical to one another (Bajželj 2018).

Besides, this also means that contrarily to the Sāṃkhya view, modifications are not only in the realm of matter. Selves also are experiencing states.

But this, in turns, entails that a change happens both at the level of matter and at the radically distinct level of selves. A phenomenon that helps us understand how this works in the Jaina view is the functioning of “life karma”. First, death is not an end, but a reappraisal of the entanglement of one self with matter, regulated by karma. The fact that the life karma decides the duration of one’s life means nothing less that when one dies, say, because of a car accident, these external forces are only the material cause of the death of the embodied self, while the fruition of her life karma is the efficient cause of her death. In such a conception, death happens as the fruit of the actions that one has herself performed in a previous life.

Before we continue, it is worthy to note that one’s acts do not genuinely determine the moment of one’s death in this life, but in the next one. Besides, when death happens, the most recent volitional activities have an impact. All in all, one’s very last breath can influence the specific outcome of the determination of the life karma for one’s next life. This is what explains that the Jains seek a good death. Such a good death is a death without strong volitions, free from fears and desires. This, in turn, is what explains the popularity of the ritual fast to death, called “sallekhana”, and that has caused some legal and cultural turmoil in recent years.

Second, since everything is already determined at the moment of death, one’s transition from death to the being in a womb or other type of new type of life is considered instantaneous, there is no waiting period, since everything is already decided.

To come back to our main discussion, and try to understand how one’s acts in the previous life also engender a duration determination for this experience, a parallel with the process of sedimentation is helpful. Take a muddy water, leave it without any movement for a sufficient amount of time, and the different types of substances involved in this mixture will separate, the more gross particles being at the bottom. In this process, time differs for each mixture, since the speed of the disentanglement depends upon the nature of the substances involved. The same phenomenon happens with the self and its bodies, since their type of entanglement in the previous life mechanically has an effect on the lapse of time that the next entanglement will last. And this has nothing to do with a deserved punishment after some fault, nor with a deserved reward after some good deed. This has to do with the laws of physics. In the Treatise on What There Is, we can find calculations such as this one:

  • TS 8.15. Bondage to life karma lasts up to thirty-three ocean-measured periods (that is, 1/3 × 8,400,00 × 8,400,00 × 107 years).

With the sedimentation metaphor, it is still not clear why the efficient cause of death, the exhaustion of one’s life force, is not enough, and why material factors are here also needed. This cannot mean that Jainism is a type of occasionalism, since originated aggregates are efficient causes in their own realm. But at least, such a conception is only possible if one conceives the world as a rational whole in which things make sense together, even though only the omniscient ones can experience that.

The beginning of an answer to this question can be found in a second tradition, next to that of the Treatise on What There Is. This tradition is that of Kundakunda. “Kundakunda” is actually not a single author, but the name that stands for the collective authorship of a Jaina textual tradition composed in Prakrit (Jaina Śaurasenī) between the third and the eighth centuries CE around Karnataka in the South of India (Balcerowicz 2017). Kundakunda’s textual tradition is as influent as the TS, and is regularly revered as sacred texts in Jaina temples. This textual tradition represents within Jainism a movement focused on the self, in which the religious practice that matters is the inward experience that is self-knowledge. The central teaching of Kundakunda in his Essence of the self (Samayasāra [SSā]) is that karmic matter is never genuinely mixed with the self. Therefore, it is close to Sāṃkhya conceptions, while keeping the Jaina specificity of an essentially active self (Bronkhorst 2010). There, the self is modified by modifications of consciousness (adhyavasāna) and by states (bhāva). However, it is possible to distinguish between different types of activities, some of them not bringing about karmic retribution. And this is exactly Kundakunda’s move when he redefines the self as not the agent of what happens in the material world of karma. For him, the self is active only in its own domain. Concretely, the self is the material cause only of the modifications of consciousness, while karmic matter is the indirect instrumental cause of wrong modifications of it. In turn, the self is the indirect instrumental cause of karmic modifications, but only as a king indirectly causes the virtue in his subjects when he acts in a virtuous way and is taken as a model.

To summarize, we have seen in the Treatise on What There Is that karmic matter and the self intermingle in the same way some liquids do, since their respective nature is not modified by this mixture and can get separated. Indeed, in muddy water, water actually stays water; while sedimentary dust actually stays sedimentary dust. Then, we have seen that in the Essence of the self, the association between the self and karmic matter can be though of in terms of kings acting as models. Another metaphor is that of a mirror-like crystal: if a flower reflected in a crystal is red, we see the crystal as if it was red, while it is not. Likewise, the self sees attachment and wrong notions superposed with it, not being it. All in all, in both textual lineages, what really matters is that the two—self and karmic matter—keep their essential distinct natures. Besides, the world is a whole in which things are mechanically combined together. Even though the types of substances are radically separated, they co-exist within the same conditions and so they experience synchronized modifications (Gorisse 2019).

2.5 The universe as seen by the omniscient ones

Furthermore, Jaina authors believe that the life of the universe is a process without beginning nor end, that passes through an ongoing series of cosmic cycles, each of which is billions of years in duration. The question of an origin and end of the universe does not arise, since the latter is eternal. What matters is the transition between two types of periods. The universe goes through a series of cycles, each of which lasts several billion years. The wheel of time experiences one descending cycle, which passes through six periods during which prosperity, happiness, and morality decline; and one ascending cycle, which passes through six periods during which prosperity, happiness, and morality increase. These periods are characterized by the possibility—respectively the impossibility—of individual liberation while they happen. Indeed, on one hand, it takes a minimum of suffering to want to engage in the path of liberation. and on the other hand, serenity must be sufficiently accessible to be able to properly engage in ascetic practices. On the day when Kṛṣṇa left the earth, in the third millennium BCE, after the great battle described in the Great [Epic of the Dynasty] of the Bhāratas (Mahābhārata), we entered into the fifth descending period of the cycle. It is therefore expected that things will go from bad to worse in our world for a few millennia before they get better again. This means that it is no longer possible to achieve enlightenment in the current period, because the world order is too unstable.

We started this entry by stating that the Jains are those who consider that the teachings of the omniscient Jinas are the expression of the eternal essential nature of the universe, and that the only extant teaching is that of Mahāvīra “the Great Hero” (traditional dates 599–527/510 BCE), the twenty-fourth and last Jina of the current cosmic period. Mahāvīra is an older contemporary of the Buddha and has a biography very close to that of the latter. Notably, he left his royal family, became an ascetic and founded a community made of mendicant ascetics and lay followers. One notable difference being that he follows a tradition that was existing long before him.

So, at every cosmic cycle, the doctrine is taught by 24 such omniscient Jinas. These are also called “tīrthaṅkara” (ford makers). Since Vedic times, a tīrtha refers to holy spots in shallow waters, where people perform acts of devotion, especially bathing, which is considered as purifying sins. These shallow waters can also be a crossing place symbolizing the junction between mundane world and sacred realm. In this line, a tīrthaṅkara is a spiritual pioneer able to cross beyond the perpetual flow of earthly life and, as such, he or she (they do not have a sexual identity at this stage) acts as a model mediating the passage between a mundane state of our selves and a state of unobstructed consciousness in act. It is important to notice that these liberated beings know all, but are by essence unable to influence the course of action of the world, since they do not have intentions and that they are radically isolated from anything else.

Besides, after Mahāvīra’s liberation, liberation is not possible anymore in our realm for cosmic reasons. However, there are other realms, in which gods and demons notably live. Jainas have developed a complex model of the universe (Dundas 2005). Canonical literature (3rd century BCE—6th century CE) already includes description of the universe, but it is between the 3rd and the 13th centuries CE that specialized texts specifically dedicated to cosmography are composed, amongst them, the influential Compendium of Middle Earth (Jambūdvīpasaṃgrahaṇī [JDS]) of Haribhadra Sūri (770 CE). There, the universe is described as being constituted of two parts. On one hand, the world (loka), extremely vast, but finite, is occupied by living beings and by things; on the other hand, the rest (aloka) surrounds the world with its infinite and empty space.

The inhabited world is made of a succession of island-continents, oceans, hells and paradises. It measures the distance traveled by a god who flies for six months at a speed of sixteen million kilometers per second. In this world, human beings live only in Middle-earth, also called the Island-Continent of the Rose Apple Tree (Jambūdvīpa). Middle Earth is, as its name suggests, central. Its surface is extremely small compared to the rest of the world. The different parts of the universe are defined in relation to the possibility—respectively the impossibility—of liberation therein and the region of Middle Earth is the only region from which it is possible to achieve liberation. Such a representation is conducive to remember the rare and central character of human birth, which alone can lead to liberation. Moreover, the extent and complexity of the whole is a constant reminder of the skills of the omniscient Jinas who were able to teach such a system.

Around the 16th c., the world is presented in the form of a human being, thus emphasizing the similarities between the structure of the world and the inner struggle faced by each individual. Moreover, the extremely detailed depiction of the world provides a backdrop, both for the initiation tales of pious Jains found in narrative literature, and for meditative practices, some of which involve the contemplation of a holy object. Ultimately, the precision with which the authors describe the world allowed Jainism to stand out more clearly from other worldviews. Indeed, only the values of Jainism prevail in these descriptions of the universe. In this sense, the universe thus represented becomes an emblem of religious identity, as well as a guide to religious practice, because, above all else, the Jaina world is the abode of beings on the path of liberation (Dundas 2005).

3. Epistemology

3.1 The main types of knowledge

It is now clear that Jaina philosophy is essentially directed at the individual effort of distinguishing the self and non-self stuff, until one reaches liberation. Besides, the self is traditionally defined as experience of consciousness, which consists in cognition (jñāna) and indeterminate perception (darśana). This will bring epistemological considerations at the core of Jaina philosophical investigations. First, there are many classifications of the different types of knowledge recognized by Jaina philosophers. The Treatise of What There Is attempts at collecting and organizing the types of knowledge mentioned in earlier literature into four types of indeterminate perception, whose study is not developed; and eight types of cognition, namely ordinary cognition of the senses, testimonial cognition, mental cognition, cosmic cognition, absolute cognition, and their faulty counterparts, namely wrong ordinary cognition of the senses, wrong testimonial cognition and wrong mental cognition (Shastri 1990; Balcerowicz 2017; den Boer 2020).

A few remarks are in order. First, the distinction between cognition and indeterminate perception is inherited from older canonical sources and is discarded by most epistemologists after the seminal work of Siddhasena Mahāmati (710–780 CE), who indicates in his Guide of Logic (Nyāyāvatāra [NA]) that indeterminate perception collapses with cognition when perceptual experience already retains some details. However, it gave the opportunity for Jaina philosophers to assimilate a distinction that was especially important for Buddhist philosophers between conceptual and non-conceptual cognition.

Second, Jaina philosophers were influenced by the Nyāya classification, which was the cornerstone of all the South Asian epistemological edifice, and that recognizes five means of knowledge (pramāṇa), namely perception, inference, testimony and analogy. Jainas assimilated this model by admitting these means of knowledge either as subtypes of ordinary cognition, or as testimonial cognition.

Third, whatever enters our cognitive apparatus is a result of a contact with what exists. The senses, which include the mind, are an intermediary between our self and the object of knowledge, but the self can also know the object of knowledge directly. Mental, cosmic and absolute cognitions are such direct types of knowledge, while ordinary cognition and testimonial cognition are mediated ones. For Jainas, direct knowledge of the soul is called “pratyakṣa” (directly present to the soul); while in other systems, “pratyakṣa” (present before the eyes) is what stands for everyday life perception, therefore mediated by the organs of senses. This leads to competitive classifications by Jaina authors in their attempts at being understood by their non-Jaina interlocutors (Clavel 2015).

Fourth, the material cause of cognitive error is wrong perception (mithyādarśana), which is due to knowledge obstructing karma. Therefore, error can only affect types of cognition of selves who are still entangled with this type of karma. Conversely, error cannot affect cosmic and absolute cognition, which can be experienced only when all one’s knowledge obscuring karma has been removed.

3.2 Authoritative teaching

In this conception in which human beings are in principle able to experience up to absolute cognition, it becomes possible even for someone who is not yet liberated to have a share in this, by relying on the teaching of liberated beings. Such a possibility is especially valuable, since knowing the phenomena unknowable by ordinary cognition, like the nature of the self, what happens after death, or the primary cause and final end of the world, is essential inasmuch as it conditions one’s spiritual progress towards the realization of a proper human life. In this dynamic, Jaina philosophers consider that a discourse is authoritative if it is uttered by such a liberated teacher, who is called “the one who has achieved, who is apt, reliable” (āpta).

First, Jaina philosophers are here not concerned with everyday life testimony, but with soteriological testimony.

Second, with this definition of an authoritative discourse, they are opposing the conceptions of the exegetes of the Veda, who consider that an authoritative discourse is by definition non-human, whatever one’s spiritual advancement, since the universal validity of a corpus can only come from the power of language itself.

Third, we said that liberated beings were absolutely isolated not interacting life-monads. However, one reaches a state of experience of absolute cognition before reaching liberation. More precisely, when all knowledge obscuring karmas are removed, one still has to wait for a long time for non-harming karmas to also be exhausted. This is within this laps of time that the teaching of the Jinas happens.

Fourth, direct disciples of the liberated beings also experience extra mundane types of cognition, although lesser ones. This make them the perfect medium to interpret the sacred teaching and transmit it to us. In such a way that “correct interpretation depends upon a teacher-pupil lineage or upon one”s own seniority and wisdom’ (Jyväsjärvi 2010). Indeed, an advanced monk is by definition both more knowledgeable and less deceptive (Flügel 2010 [2016]). The fact that one can access soteriological relevant knowledge thanks to monks who are living members of a lineage of interpretation is in part what explains the importance of theories of interpretation in Jaina philosophy, as well as the fact that the commentaries are regularly more important than the canon itself.

In the Manual for the behavior of laymen which is casket of jewel (Ratna-karaṇḍa-śrāvakâcāra [RKŚĀ]), Samantabhadra (530–590 CE) characterizes the authoritative teacher in the following way:

  • RKŚĀ 1.6. This one is called the reliable one who has no hunger, thirst, old age, affliction (of body and of mind), birth, death, fear, pride, attachment, aversion, delusion.

The fact that the authoritative speaker is presented as a God-like entity who has moral aptitudes before he has intellectual ones, since, as we have seen, this is a step to reach unobstructed, absolute, knowledge, has a series of consequences on Jaina epistemology (Gorisse 2022a). Especially, since these liberated beings have no intention, an authoritative teacher who gives instructions does good to the people without being motivated by passions. He acts for the benefit of humanity on account of his very nature, like a drum giving out sound at the touch of a beater does not want anything for itself:

  • RKŚĀ 1.8. Un-egoistically and dispassionately a teacher instructs from truth what is suitable. What (else) does a muraja-drum require to sound but the touch of a skillful hand?

One consequence is that in Jainism, testimonial cognition can be considered as a proper means of knowledge, because knowledge acquired thanks to the teaching of an authoritative person is proper knowledge of what exists as it is, and not knowledge of what exists as intended. Now, this holds only if he authoritative speaker belongs to the very specific category of speakers that we have seen. This has the consequence that what is recognized as an authoritative discourse are the Jaina sacred Scriptures and their commentaries.

Finally, we should keep in mind that this is consistently within an apologetic objective to defend one’s own scriptural tradition (Qvarnström 2006) and to attack the one of others that the different philosophico-traditions of India aimed to rationally justify a given set of claims and that they developed their logical frameworks in the form of what can rightfully be called a “systematic philosophy”, as we will investigate in the next paragraph. One issue in which the co-existence of a more systematic and a more dogmatic approach is manifest is the shift that happened with notably the Buddhist Dharmakīrti (550–610) in his Considerations on knowledge (Pramāṇavārttika [PV]), when a transition was made from external criteria for the reliability of a discourse, like the existence of an authoritative utterer; to internal criteria, like soundness of the assertions themselves, or ability of the proponent to show a proof for these assertions. The Jaina tradition experiences this shift especially with the author Samantabhadra in his Investigation on Authority (Āpta-mīmāṁsā [ĀMī]) (Balcerowicz 2016a).

3.3 Inferential reasoning and the debating hall

A type of cognition that has a particular importance in South Asian philosophy is that of inference (anumāna). Inference is the type of cognition through which epistemic agents acquire new knowledge by means of reasoning upon what can be concluded with certainty from previously acquired knowledge. This is what is expressed by the Sanskrit expression “anumāna”, “the knowledge that follows [another knowledge]”. For example, when Devadatta wants to buy mangos, he wants to know which ones taste juicy before he buys them. At this point, he is not yet allowed to taste them, but he can reason based upon the color of the mangos and upon his past experience of a given color being associated with a given taste. In such a situation, the regularity of Devadatta’s past experience is not a coincidence, the co-presence of the property of having a given taste with the property of having a given color is guaranteed by the fact that both occurrences rely on the same causal complex, namely, a given stage of ripeness of the fruit at stake. This type of reasoning based on a necessary relationship between two properties is what is called “inference”. In technical terms, there is a transmission of certainty from the established knowledge that an “evidence-property” (hetu) is ascribed to a given object, to the new knowledge that a “target-property” (sādhya) is ascribed to the same object. This transmission of certainty is based on the “invariable concomitance” (vyāpti) between the two inferential properties. Vyāpti originally means “pervasion” and is used in this technical sense, because the pervasion of a property by another property, as in “whenever there is a Sissoo tree, there is a tree”, is the model for situations of necessary co-presence of the evidence-property with the target-property.

Inference has been thoroughly studied and its use strictly codified by the different philosophico-religious traditions of South Asia, Jainism included, because it provides the structure of scientific reasoning. Indeed, the conclusion of an inferential reasoning is considered as a scientific truth inasmuch as this type of reasoning relies on the emancipation from contextual parameters and on the guarantee that the isolated relations are necessary ones.

In concert, inferential reasoning has a strong argumentative potential. To explain, by means of stating an inferential reasoning, it is possible to bring somebody else to the awareness of these truths. Such a series of statements, even though it is not properly speaking a type of cognition by itself, is metaphorically called “inference for others” (parārthānumāna), in opposition to the “inference for oneself” (svārthānumāna), which is a genuine type of cognition. An inference for others is traditionally used in a philosophical debate in order to convince an interlocutor of a different faith who has different beliefs concerning what there is. In Jainism, there is an abundant literature of stories of conversion as the outcome of such debates, as well as the development of debating techniques to support one’s inferential reasoning (Gorisse 2018). Furthermore, the different traditions share the belief that from this truth-preserving argument, it is possible to define the standards of an ideally organized rational discussion, the outcomes of which are necessary true statements, and in the course of time, these philosophers developed a common inter-doctrinal framework of argumentation for philosophical discussions (Gorisse 2017).

From these observations, it comes as no surprise that the study of the rules to attack and defend the statement of an inference constitutes an important part of the logical investigations in Jainism. It also comes as no surprise that these considerations developed in close relationship with the logical investigations led by the other traditions of classical Indian philosophy. More precisely, Jaina authors routinely reference the Treatise on Logic (Nyāyasūtra [NS]), the epistemological treatise of the Naiyāyika tradition, composed by Gautama in the second century CE, which is the pan Indian inter-doctrinal reference work for the characterization of inference. Next to this, later Jaina authors consistently engaged in discussions with the Buddhists, in particular with Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, in the context of developing their theories of inference. The deep influence of Dharmakīrti’s epistemology and theories of argumentation on Jain philosophers can for example be seen in Vidyānandin’s reuse of some of the latter’s arguments in his Investigation into the True Teaching (Satyaśāsanaparīkṣā [SŚP]) (Trikha 2017).

The more systematic analysis of inference in Jainism begins with the Śvetāmbara philosopher Siddhasena Mahāmati and his younger Digambara contemporary Akalaṅka Bhaṭṭa (720–780), author of the Royal Commentary [to the Treatise on What there is] (Rājavārttika [RV]) (Balcerowicz 2016b; Shah 1967), and develops through a continued line of commentaries until authors like Vādi Devasūri (1143 CE) in his Commentary on the explanation of the nature of modes of knowledge and perspectives (Pramāṇanayatattvālokālaṃkāra [PNT]) and later authors like Yaśovijaya (1638–1688 CE) and his Manual of Jain Logic (Jainatarkabhāṣā [JTBh]) (Ganeri 2008). One of the main inter-doctrinal line of discussions and controversies in this conceptual framework is to bring the probative inferential argument to its minimal form by reducing the number of necessary statements. In these attempts, Jaina philosophers are traditionally considered as the ones to go the furthest. More precisely, the Treatise on Logic and its Commentary to the Treatise on Logic (Nyāyasūtrabhāṣya, NSBh) by Vātsyāyana (450–500 CE) had brought an old model with explicit psychological conditions like doubt and desire to know, to a model linked only with the structure of the argument. There, the only good way to express a truth-preserving argument consists of a group of five statements expressing the thesis, the evidence, the account, the application and the conclusion in the inference. Jaina authors acknowledge this model and use Naiyāyika traditional examples, like:

  • [Thesis] Sound is impermanent,
  • [Evidence] Because it is a product.
  • [Account] Whatever is such is alike, like a pot.
  • [Application] And this is a product.
  • [Conclusion] Therefore it is impermanent.

But for Jaina authors, only pedagogical reasons can motivate a philosopher to fully state an argument in this way. To explain, only the first two statements are necessary steps to ensure the adhesion of the interlocutor. In his Guide of logic, Siddhasena makes it clear, first, that the evidence is the central cog of the inferential reasoning; second, that the statement of the thesis is also indispensable, as it indicates the goal of the inference. Its absence would be like observing an archer without knowing what his target is, that is to say without the possibility to know whether he is skillful or not.

A second major line of inter-doctrinal discussions and controversies in this conceptual framework is to aim towards a theory of the proper relationship between the target-property and the evidence-property. A first attempt to distinguish between arbitrary and necessary relationships is offered by the Buddhist Dignāga (480–540 CE), according to which the evidence-property is necessarily concomitant with the target-property if and only if it is possible to prove that the evidence-property is present in the case under consideration, in similar cases and in no dissimilar cases. In our example, it means that the property “being a product” has to be present in impermanent things like sound and pots, and absent in permanent things like the self. Jaina authors show that the three conditions of Dignāga are neither necessary, nor sufficient, and that what ultimately counts is that the evidence-property cannot be thought of otherwise than in the presence of the target-property. To explain, the only ultimately relevant criteria for the correctness of an inference is that its evidence-property is known as being “impossible otherwise” (anyathānupapatti) than in the presence of the target-property. One specificity of the Jaina tradition is to consider that this necessary concomitance between the inferential properties is known thanks to another type of cognition, “tarka” (here, not used in its traditional technical sense of “suppositional reasoning”), which functions as a direct discernment of universals. More precisely, it is clear that necessary concomitance cannot be known by customary perception, since perception deals only with particulars, and that even the biggest list of particular instances would not suffice to reach certainty. Yet, we can realize that if something with certain properties exists, something else with certain properties must also exist. It is not the same type of realization as the inferential one, since it is linked with the Jaina epistemological theory of particular-in-universal, according to which an object is a complex having both an existent universal aspect and an existent particular aspect (see next section on many-sidedness). Therefore, in the same situation in which one grasps a particular Sissoo, one can also grasp the common properties shared by all Sissoos.

3.4 Realism and many-sidedness

3.4.1 On making distinctions

This complexity of the object of knowledge in Jaina philosophy has a deeply ramified history. At the time of Mahāvīra around the fifth–sixth centuries BCE, a practice was observed in the numerous movements of wandering mendicants: instead of answering philosophical questions in a one-sided way, the teacher was analyzing (vibhajya) them, showing their different presuppositions and possible meanings. Probably inherited from exegetical practices of interpretation of sacred texts, which dominantly consisted in analyzing the many perspectives that one could have on a single sentence. In Jainism, one of the most famous examples of this practice is to be found in the Venerable Exposition of teaching (Bhagavatīsūtra, or Vyākhyāprajñaptisūtra [Viy.]; old parts 5th–2th centuries BCE, new 2nd century BCE to 1st century CE), in which the disciple Indrabhūti Gautama asks to the monk Jamāli:

Is the “loka” (here meaning both “world” and “self”) eternal or is it, Jamāli, non-eternal?

Being asked in this manner, Jamāli was doubtful and wanted to know, but was overwhelmed with confusion. He was unable to speak in reply and remained silent. When Jamāli was confused, Bhagavān Mahāvīra addressed him as follows:

The world is, Jamāli, eternal […] it was, it is and it will be […].

The world is, Jamāli, non-eternal. For it becomes progressive after being regressive. And it becomes regressive after being progressive.

The soul is, Jamāli, eternal. For it did not cease to exist at any time.

The soul is, Jamāli, non-eternal. For it becomes animal after being a hellish creature, becomes a man after becoming an animal and it becomes a god after being a man.

So in this example, the Jaina teacher insists on the fact that:

  • with respect to its substance, the self is eternal, like atoms are.
  • but with respect to its modes, the self is non-eternal, like combinations of atoms.

Here, Mahāvīra does not make contradictory predications, but he refutes extremes views, which are considered as wrong, by making explicit the parameters of the different predications. It is interesting to notice that at the same period, the Buddha, who also uses distinctions of the sort in his speech, is known to refuse to answer questions of the sort (Matilal 1981).

3.4.2 From the paradoxes of causation to accounting for change and persistence

Now, this way of making distinctions in predication should be thought of in close connection with considerations about causation. Indeed, the Jaina teacher also insists on the fact that one can give a proper account of a causal process only when one acknowledges both persistence and change.

To explain, it is not so obvious that we are legitimate in considering ourselves as being the same individual in time, since after all, the cells in our body are continuously replaced, none of the cells that currently constitute me will exist in seven years, each will have been renewed. Conversely, how are we to account for change? Any mechanical explanation of it fails, like Zeno’s arrow that has to travel half the way before it meets its target, but before it meets the half, it has to travel half the half, and before that, half of the half of the half, and so, ad infinitum, without being able to even start the movement. There is a problem with our way of accounting for change. Noticing this state of affair, South Asian philosophers engaged in raging debates around the paradoxes of causality at the turn of the CE. In a nutshell, if someone says “the potter makes the pot”, there are several types of possible stance on this:

  • one can say that the effect “pot” already exists prior to the fruition of its immediate cause;
  • one can say that it does not, hence the relevance of the causation process;
  • some that it is neither existent, nor non-existent before the causation process;
  • and one can also say that it both exists and does not exist prior to that.

While philosophers from different lineages have been variously depicted as holding one or the other of these alternatives, Jainas are consistently depicted as holding the last one and it is regularly considered as a Jaina specificity to hold that something both exists and does not exist prior to the causation process. But of course, Jains are far from being the only ones to claim so. Besides, they claim more precisely that what exists is at once originating, decaying and persisting in an essential and simultaneous way:

  • TS 5.29. Existence is endowed with production, decay and duration.

Indeed, any existing entity is both made of permanent atoms, sometimes including a permanent self; and partaking to the manifold and changing world we experience (Soni 1991). Here, while it is produced:

  • the pot is already existent with respect to its substance (dravya), the clay;
  • yet formerly non-existent with respect to its particular modes (paryāya; guṇa): shape, function, etc.

Jaina philosophers insist on the fact that none of these aspects is more important than the other one. This means that substance and mode co-exist not in, but as a single discrete entity in Jainism. This single discrete entity is called a many-sided object of knowledge (prameya, vastu). This is the famous doctrine of the many-sidedness of things (anekāntavāda). It notably goes against the Vaiśeṣika conception, according to which qualities, like “being ochre”, exist independently of substances like “pots”, and are linked with them thanks to a relation of inherence. It also goes against the Buddhist conception, according to which only what is a non-complex unity is real (Gorisse 2022b). By the way, Jainas are realist philosophers who consider that human beings know a world that exists in its particularity independently of their knowledge of it, in such a way that the fact that our assertions can be specified following many perspectives can only come from the fact that the known object itself has many aspects.

3.4.3 Existence, non-existence, and the modes of predication

Now, this conception led Jaina thinkers to claim that what surrounds us is at the same time existent and non-existent. Because, this complex object is existent as permanent with respect to its substance, yet non-existent as permanent with respect to its states. The Jaina author who spends the most time on elucidating in which sense existence and non-existence can be predicated to an object is probably Haribhadrasūri in his Victory banner of the theory of non-one-sidedness (Anekāntajayapatākā [AJP]) (Mundra 2022; Van Den Bossche 1995). Now, Jainas are known to go further and to introduce not two, but seven modes of predication. Haribhadra is deeply influenced by the Investigation on Authority (Āptamīmāṃsā [Āmī]) of Samantabhadra, which is amongst the first to teach that:

  • Āmī 14. An entity is somehow possessed of the character “being”, somehow possessed of the character “non-being”, somehow possessed of both, and somehow indescribable—all these four features characterizing it in accordance with the speaker’s intention and not in an absolute fashion.
  • Āmī 15. Certainly, who will not allow that an entity is possessed of the character “being” so far as its own form etc. are concerned; while it is possessed of the character “non-being” so far as opposite is the case? For if that be not so, this entity will not be viewed as having a fixed nature of its own.

This means that existence is a property of something, inasmuch as this thing exists in relation to the substance, locus, time and state that are its own. In this dynamic, existence is identity with oneself. While non-existence is difference, and accounts for change. We need to recognize the non-existence of the thing in relation with forms, etc. which are alien to it. As such, the not-being blue is part of the essence of the red pot. Only thanks to this can the thing have that particular essence, because something is what it is as opposed to what it is not. This is close to the Mīmāṃsā doctrine of identity in difference (bhedābheda) (Uno 1997). Now, when we act in our every day life, our decisions involve objects more complex than that, i.e., objects which are existent with respect to some parameters and non-existent with respect to other parameters. Besides, also inexpressibility is somehow a property of the thing, in the sense that sometimes, existence and non-existence are considered simultaneously, and that this is impossible to express. In my everyday life, I act being surrounded by things which are all this, this is why existence, non-existence and inexpressible combine into not two, but seven modes of predication, namely, I can say that something exist; does not exist; exist and does not exists; is inexpressible; exist and is inexpressible; does not exist and is inexpressible; or exist, does not exist and is inexpressible.

3.4.4 The doctrine of perspectives

Trying to make sense of the fact that a substance is at the same time persistent and subject to modification within a single coherent metaphysical system is the old problem of the articulation of the one and the many. The solution that Jaina philosophers brought to this issue with all these doctrines linked with many-sidedness, is probably their major contribution to philosophy (Radhakrishnan 1923; Padmarajiah 1963; Shah 2000; Barbato 2018). The last doctrine which will retain our attention here is the doctrine of perspectives (nayavāda). From Siddhasena Mahāmati, Akalaṅka, and their respective lineage of commentaries, see especially Siddharṣigaṇi’s Commentary to the Guide of Logic (Nyāyâvatāravivṛtti [NAv], 900 CE) and Prabhācandra’s Sun [that opens] the lotus of the knowable (Prameyakāmalamārtaṇḍa [PKM], 980–1065 CE), the doctrine of perspective is a technical apparatus that deals with our ways to know something, like a meta-epistemology. It provides an exhaustive classification of the main epistemic perspectives through which one can consider the essentially complex knowable from the most inclusive to the most particular perspective. Indeed, human epistemic faculties are such that they subsume diversity under unity, otherwise nothing would be intelligible nor communicable, and that from this, the fundamental complexity of the object of knowledge is resolved. Now, there are different ways to subsume diversity under unity or, to say it differently, different types of epistemic attention and different contexts of assertion. And the doctrine of perspective enables to specify the main favored types of attention that are active during the performance of a knowledge statement.

Building on this, Jaina philosophers came to explain the resisting divergences between the different philosophical systems as resulting from an initial choice of an epistemic perspective. In this dynamic, they classify the historical philosophical systems with which they interact as developed not within a perspective, but within the erroneous radicalization of a perspective, because each tradition depicted focuses on a given aspect of the knowable, since each also refutes other unaddressed aspects. This will get clearer if we introduce each perspective:

  1. The first type of perspective, called the “comprehensive” (naigama), is close to the Jaina position. It is the attitude of the knowing subjects who focus on both unity and difference, but not at the same time. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika thinkers are representatives of its erroneous developments, because they consider that what exists, the reality robust to philosophical investigations, is either a substance or a property. They excel in identifying the fundamental differences between the types of objects of knowledge, but they fail to understand that it is the very same object that is grasped under it substantial or its modal aspect.
  2. The second type of perspective, called the “synthesizing” (saṃgraha) is the attitude of the knowing subjects who focus on unity, either unity of all things that exist, or unity of all things which are a given type of substance. For Jaina philosophers, Advaita-vedānta and Sāṃkhya thinkers are representatives of its erroneous developments, as they consider that the only robust reality is a single permanent reality that includes everything. Hence, they excel in identifying the imperceptible connections and the homogeneity underlying the diversity of objects of knowledge, but they fail to also understand the fundamental differences between them.
  3. In contrast to this epistemic attitude, the third type of perspective, called the “empirical”, on worldly transactions (vyavahāra), is that of the knowing subjects who focus on difference. Cārvāka thinkers are representatives of its erroneous developments, because they consider that the robust reality is the one that human beings encounter every day and that is useful to them. As such, they excel at identifying modes and epistemic constructs active in the formulation of theses that rely on more than just sense faculties, but they fail to see that also metaphysical theses are relevant and that what we call “substance”, like selves, exists and are not entirely similar with the modes that we encounter in every day life.
  4. Besides, the fourth type of perspective, the “actual”, on what is directly present to the senses (ṛjusūtra) is the stance of the knowing subjects who focus on what is present in front of us at the moment, that is to say on difference that is currently manifested. Buddhist thinkers are representatives of its erroneous developments, because they consider that only what is grasped in experience exists, nothing beyond, and that the only robust reality is an extremely transient and particular reality. They therefore excel in identifying the epistemic constructions active when operations of synthesis are performed on objects of knowledge, but they fail to understand also the elements of fundamental permanence that exist in them.
  5. The three last perspectives are those of the knowing subjects who focus on the word. Grammarians are representatives of their erroneous developments, because they consider that the robust reality is the linguistic element that expresses the world. They excel at identifying the semantic distinctions relevant to denote a given referent. But while they do so, they fail to also understand that only a plurality of frames of reference could enable to cover the integrality of referential situations that one might experience. The fifth type of perspective, the “semantic” (śabda), deals more precisely with grammatical rules. It is the perspective of the knowing subjects who focus on the word as expressing difference based on grammatical categories.
  6. While the sixth, “etymological” (samabhirūḍha) is concerned with difference based on etymology.
  7. And the seventh, the “actual etymological” (evaṃbhūta), with difference based on etymology that is currently manifested.

In his Establishment of all objects (Sarvārthasiddhi [SAS]), Pūjyapāda (540–600 CE) explains that like a piece of cloth fulfils a purpose only if its different threads are woven; in the same way, the different perspectives fulfil a purpose only if they work together, and that isolated, they do not convey even a little faith. The doctrine of perspectives seems to be the Jaina reaction to philosophical and religious pluralism in classical India. To explain, there exist resisting divergences concerning the nature of the ultimate constituent of the world, the ways in which they interact, their origin; the position of human beings in all this and the conception of the way in which we should act. No strictly regulated philosophical debate has been able to overcome these differences. Jaina thinkers are likewise not trying to flatten these irreducible views within a single conception. Rather, they show how each could contribute to the whole picture.


To conclude, philosophy within Jainism is mainly the means to come to know the categories that are the selves and karmic matter, which are especially relevant for our liberation. Many tools help us within this effort:

  • the Scriptures—the teaching of beings experiencing absolute knowledge—which, in turn, can be fully understood only by beings with a similar mind. Here, the more advanced on the path, the more senior the member of the monastic community, the better her understanding. This explains the huge number of hermeneutics techniques come from this faith in the Scriptures, which are considered by some Jains as scientific treatises.
  • our faculties of knowledge like perception, inference and the art of debate, up to a range of super-natural faculties of knowledge. Here too, a knowledge claim is to be analyzed through different types of perspectives.
  • an openness to this higher order of being within ourselves, notably through meditation.


General introductions

  • Dundas, Paul, 2002, The Jainas, London and New-York: Routledge.
  • Radhakrishnan, Sarvepalli, 1923, “The Pluralistic Realism of the Jainas”, in his Indian Philosophy, London: Georges Allen & Unwin Ltd, volume 1, pp. 286–340 (ch. 6). New edition, Delhi: Oxford University Press, 2008.

Primary literature

  • [AJP] Haribhadrasūri, Anekāntajayapatākā, in Anekāntajayapatākā, 2 vols., Hiralal Rasikdas Kapadia (ed.), Baroda: Gaekwad’s Oriental Series 88/105, 1940.
  • [ĀMī] Samantabhadra, Āptamīmāṁsā, in Āpta-mīmāṁsā of Āchārya Samantabhadra, Saratchandra Ghoshal (trans.), Delhi: Bharatiya Jnanpith, 2002.
  • [ĀS] Āyāraṃgasutta, in Gaina Sûtras, Part 1 (Sacred Books of the East 22), Hermann Jacobi (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1884. New edition, Jaina Sutras, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1964.
  • [GS] Nemicandra, Gommaṭasāra, in Gommatsara Jiva-Kanda (the soul), Rai Bahadur J. L. Jainia (trans.), The Sacred books of the Jainas 5, Lucknow: The Central Jaina Publishin House, 1927.
  • [JTBh] Yaśovijaya, Jainatarkabhāṣā, in Jainatarkabhāṣā, Sukhlalji Sanghvi, Mahendra Kumar and Dalsukh Malvania (eds.), Ahmedabad: Sri Bahadur Singh Jaina Series, 1938/1942/1997.
  • [JDS] Haribhadra, Jambūdvīpasaṃgrahaṇī, in Elements of Jaina Geography, Frank Van Den Bossche (trans.), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 2005.
  • [NA] Siddhasena Mahāmati, Nyāyāvatāra, in Jaina Epistemology In Historical And Comparative Perspective – A Critical Edition And An Annotated Translation Of Siddhasena Mahāmati’s Nyāyâvatāra, Siddharṣigaṇin’s Nyāyāvatāra-vivṛti And Devabhadrasūri’s Nyāyâvatāra-ṭippana. 2 vols, Piotr Balcerowicz (trans.), Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Stuttgart, 2001 (reed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 2009).
  • [NAv] Siddharṣigaṇi, Nyāyāvatāravivṛtti, in NA.
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  • [PNT] Vādi Devasūri, Pramāṇanayatattvālokālaṃkāra, in Vādi Devasūri‘s Pramāṇanayatattvālokālaṃkāra, Hari Satya Bhattacharya, Bombay: Jaina Sahitya Vikas Mandal, 1967.
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  • [RV] Akalaṅka, Rājavārttika, in Tattvārtha-vārttika [Rājavārttika] of Śrī Akalaṅkadeva, Mahendra Kumar Jain (ed.), Delhi: Jñānapīṭha Mūrtidevī Jaina Grantha-mālā 10, 20, 1953–1957.
  • [SAS] Pūjyapāda, Sarvārthasiddhi, in Reality. English Translation of Shri Pujyapada’s Sarvarthasiddhi, S. A. Jain (trans.), Calcutta: Vira Sasana Sangha, 1960.
  • [SSā] Kundakunda, Samayasāra, in Ācārya Kundakunda’s Samayasāra, A. Chakravarti (trans.), Benares: Bharatiya Jnanapitha Publication, 1950 (reed. Delhi: Bharatiya Jnanpith, 2008).
  • [SŚP] Vidyānandin, Satyaśāsanaparīkṣā, in Investigation into the True Teaching, Jens Borgland (trans.), 2020, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz Verlag.
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  • [TS] Umāsvāmin, Tattvārthasūtra, translted in That Which Is, Nathmal Tatia (trans.), New York: Harper Collins, 1994.
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  • [Utt.] Uttarajjhāyā, in Gaina Sûtras. Part II: The Uttarâdhyayana Sûtra ; the Sûtrakritâṅga Sûtra (Sacred Books of the East 45), Hermann Georg Jacobi (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1895 (reed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1964).
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  • [YS] Yogaśāstra, Hemacandra, in The Yogaśāstra of Hemacandra. A twelfth century Handbook on Śvetāmbara Jainims, Olle Qvarnstrōm (trans.), 2002, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

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