The Literal-Nonliteral Distinction in Classical Indian Philosophy
Indian thinkers distinguish between literal and non-literal meaning early in their history. They do so within different intellectual disciplines (śāstra-s), each broadly philosophical, but with varying emphases. Within the grammatical discipline, Yāska’s Semantic Explanation (Nirukta), an early (perhaps 6th century to 3rd century BCE) etymological treatise recognizes the difference between ordinary (laukika) and metaphorical language (upamā). This text, possibly pre-dating the renowned Sanskrit grammarian Pāṇini (ca 4th century BCE), employs etymological analysis in order to ascertain the meanings of unfamiliar terms used in the Vedas, a collection of texts including religious hymns, poetry, and rituals. In portions of the Vedas called Upaniṣads, widely recognized as proto-philosophical, the limits of language are made explicit: ordinary speech cannot characterize ultimate reality, though figurative language can hint at it. These early texts focus on topics which would give rise to three intellectual disciplines: Grammar, Philosophy, and Aesthetics. (Capital letters distinguish the schools of thought from their subject matter.)
Two of the three disciplines, Grammar and Philosophy, are identifiable by their relationship to early “root” texts which form the basis of later commentarial reflection. Within Grammar, the aforementioned Yāska, as well as Pāṇini, Patañjali (ca 2nd century BCE), and Bhartṛhari (ca 5th century CE), are a few of the most crucial thinkers whose reflections—on the structure of Sanskrit in particular, and by way of Sanskrit, language in general—informed philosophical reflection on meaning. For instance, Pāṇini’s analysis of the morphology, syntax, and semantics of Sanskrit, in his Eight Chapters (Aṣṭādhyāyī) continues to be cited by philosophers a thousand years later. The literal/non-literal distinction is a topic as well for the various philosophical schools, each one known as a darśana, roughly a “viewpoint.” Both those who accept the Vedas as authoritative and those who do not address the distinction in the context of testimony and theories of reference. Among the former Vedic thinkers, this article primarily treats the Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā philosophical traditions, and of the Veda-denying, the Buddhists and the Jainas. Finally, the tradition here called Aesthetics (alaṃkāra) is primarily focused on the aesthetics of poetry and drama—especially the courtly poetry known as kāvya. It encompasses topics studied in rhetoric, poetics, and aesthetics. Alaṃkāra, despite meaning “embellishment” or “ornamentation,” (in reference to figures of speech), studies the psychology of utterances, their ensuing emotional states in audiences, and their logical or semantic structures. Until the highly influential Light on Suggestion (Dhvanyāloka) of Ānandavardhana (ca 9th century CE), aesthetic theory was primarily, though not exclusively, focused on taxonomies of figuration, but after Ānandavardhana, it drew on philosophical work, in particular Mīmāṃsā, to theorize about meaning itself.
What follows focuses on the conceptual space for Indian theorizing about literal and non-literal meaning in each of these three textual traditions. Since the article’s structure is topical rather than historical, a chronology of major figures is appended to help orient readers. The focus of the article is the period demarcated roughly from 200 CE to 1300 CE, often characterized as the Classical Period of Indian philosophy.
- 1. Conceptions of language in Indian philosophy
- 2. Primary and Secondary Meaning
- 3. Suggested Meaning and Speaker’s Intention
- 4. Criticizing the Distinction
- 5. Implications of the Distinction
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1. Conceptions of language in Indian philosophy
Before delving into the various disputes in Indian philosophy over what is commonly termed “literal meaning,” let us first identify the cluster of concepts and corresponding terms Indian philosophers use in their analysis of meaning. The Sanskrit term for “meaning,” artha, has a semantic range that includes also “object,” “wealth,” and “goal.” It can be used both for external referents of words as well as meanings “in the head,” although the term for occurrent mental states is frequently jñāna, usually translated as “cognition” or “awareness.” Both words and sentences are said to have meanings, although in what manner they have them, and how word- and sentence-meanings interrelate are subjects of debate.
1.1 Identifying Linguistic Capacities
Whether in the form of words or sentences, language has capacities—it can refer to things, cause mental cognitions, impel action, prompt emotional states, and so on. That such an ability exists is accepted by everyone, although thinkers enumerate the linguistic capacities differently, and also identify different results for them. In terms of outcomes, the meaning which results from the most fundamental linguistic capacity of the word is said to be “principal” (mukhya) or “denoted” (abhidhā). This meaning is sometimes defined in terms of its being understood immediately after speech, by hearers. (The extent to which the phenomenology of language comprehension guides distinctions about meaning is addressed further below.) For some philosophers, from the cognition that this meaning causes, another linguistic capacity can subsequently operate, given certain conditions, to generate a new, “secondary” meaning. This further meaning is sometimes carved into two varieties: indication (lakṣaṇā) and qualitative expression (gauṇavṛtti), something like metonymy and metaphor respectively, although this is to generalize over distinctions important especially in Aesthetics. Two other capacities are sometimes adduced: purport (tātparya) and suggestion (dhvani), which we will examine more closely below. Initially, let us characterize the first as something like speaker’s intention and the second as encompassing phenomena such as connotations and implicatures which the other capacities putatively cannot explain. In English scholarship, the first two of these four capacities are referred to as “primary” and “secondary,” and this article will follow this convention.
Whatever the number of capacities, they can be characterized functionally; in fact, the term function (vyāpāra) or operation (vṛtti) is often used in place of the word for capacity more generally. In attempts to enumerate the capacities, philosophers consider questions such as what the basis of a linguistic function might be, and whether they are one-to-one or one-to-many functions (Ganeri 2006). Discussion of linguistic functions is important for understanding epistemology, a topic of interest primarily to Philosophy in contrast to Grammar and Aesthetics (see the entry on epistemology in classical Indian philosophy). These thinkers focus on how testimonial uses of language are authoritative ways of knowing (pramāṇa), whether in ordinary discourse or religious discourse such as the Vedas or the Buddha’s speech. For one example, consider Nyāya (“Reasoning”). In the Nyāya root text, Nyāyasūtra (NS), attributed to Akṣapāda Gautama (ca 200 CE), speech is defined as the assertion of an authoritative person (NS 1.1.7). Since the cognitions resulting from testimony are an important basis for acting, Nyāya philosophers are concerned with what hearers understand from speech, in particular, from nouns (NS 2.2.56). It is in this context that they take up the relationship between primary and secondary meaning, and the basis for figurative language use. Specifically, they are concerned with whether the principal referent of a noun is—a generic property, a particular thing, or some combination (their preferred view).
Aesthetic thinkers, especially beginning with Ānandavardhana (ca 9th century CE), focus on distinctions between the capacities of language. Ānandavardhana himself is primarily concerned to defend the existence of a new linguistic capacity, suggestion (on which see section 3 below). With illustrations drawn from poetry, drama, and the epic Mahābhārata, he argues that phonemes, words, sentences, and entire discourse units can suggest subtle meanings, associated with an aestheticized emotion or “flavor” (rasa). It is up to later philosophers of aesthetics to explain the status of suggestion with regard to the ordinary categories of linguistic capacities. Some, like Mukula Bhaṭṭa (ca 9th to 10th century CE) give a reductionist account on which it is equivalent to indication, whereas others, like Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka (ca 900 CE) deny that it is a linguistic capacity at all, but argue, rather, that it is psychological. Aesthetic arguments for and against the various linguistic capacities draw on Nyāya as well as Mīmāṃsā philosophical texts.
1.2 Appeals to Phenomenology
Definitions of meaning often appeal to phenomenology, the way in which a cognition seems to arise from hearing a word or sentence. This focus on the psychology of language use is found in all three disciplines. For example, the Mīmāṃsā (“Hermeneutics”) philosopher Kumārila Bhaṭṭa (ca 7th century CE, see entry on Kumārila) writes in his Exposition on Ritual Practice (Tantravārttika, hereafter TV) that, like a face, the primary meaning is perceived first, before anything else, such as secondary meaning (TV 3.2.1). (The Sanskrit word for a face is mukha, etymologically related to mukhya, the term for primary meaning.) The Grammarian Bhartṛhari argues in his Treatise on Sentences and Words (Vākyapadīya) that division of sentences into words and phonemes is artificial. This is in part based his observation that hearers experience meaning as a unified whole. He claims that what conveys meaning is a sphoṭa, or “burst,” which is partless and different from the sequence of sounds composing a sentence (see section 4.3 and Matilal (1990: 84ff) for discussion about how precisely to characterize sphoṭa in relationship to meaning.)
Aesthetic theorists focus on the psychology of the poet and the hearer, in part to understand the relationship between ordinary language and poetic language, but also to distinguish among the varieties of poetic utterances. Among the psychological principles widely accepted by Indian thinkers is that ordinary conventional meanings are stronger than analytically-determined ones (Raja 1969). So the term paṅka-ja has constituent parts which together mean “mud-born” but conventionally it refers to the lotus, and the latter meaning would come to a hearer’s mind first. Aesthetic philosopher Mukula Bhaṭṭa argues in his Fundamentals of the Communicative Function (Abhidhāvṛttamātṛkā) that some words become so conventionalized that their status as secondary meaning is unavailable to the speaker, who takes herself to be speaking literally (McCrea 2008, Keating 2019).
However, there is a limit to the role that reflection on psychology plays in the analysis of meaning. For early Mīmāṃsā philosophers, only Sanskrit terms have genuine expressive capacities.This conclusion is not due to an investigation of the psychology of non-Sanskrit speakers, but the principle of parsimony. It is explanatorily better to posit a fundamental language, where word and meaning are fixed in one-to-one correspondence, which has been corrupted by mispronunciation over time (see TV 1.3.24ff). So, hearing a foreign word like gavi, people understand its meaning, “cow,” through its similarity with the correct Sanskrit word (gauḥ), whether or not they are aware of the process. This view is challenged by other philosophers, such as Dharmakīrti in his Vādanyāya (Norms of Debate).
1.3 Role of Sanskrit Language
Reflection on language in Indian philosophy, for the Brahminical, Veda-accepting traditions at least, begins and ends with the Sanskrit language, in what has been termed “the Sanskrit cosmopolis” (Pollock 2006). It is not merely that Sanskrit is the vehicle for reflection on language, but the Sanskrit language itself is a target of inquiry. Patañjali explains the reasons for this in his Great Commentary (Mahābhāṣya), a commentary on Kātyāyana’s 3rd century BCE commentary on Pāṇini’s Eight Chapters. These reasons are largely centered on the preservation and correct performance of Vedic rituals. Along with these pragmatic aims, there comes the belief in a special metaphysical and epistemic status for Sanskrit—it has natural (autpattika, intrinsic) connections to its referents, which other languages lack; thus, at least in the context of the Vedas, it can give us infallible knowledge about the world, without the corruption of fallible human intermediaries. This conception is not shared by all orthoprax thinkers, however, as Nyāya philosophers argue for the conventionality of language (NS 2.1.55).
Traditions which reject Vedic authority also reject the primacy of Sanskrit, largely preferring to write in Pāli and Prakrit. At a certain point, however, and for unknown reasons, Buddhist thinkers such as Nāgārjuna begin to write in Sanskrit (Kelly 1996). Regardless of which language they employ, Buddhists reject the notion of an inherent connection between the Sanskrit language and reality—indeed, they argue that no language has such a connection—arguing as early on as the famous The Questions of King Milinda (Milindapañhā) that language is conventional. Still, the fact that Naiyāyikas and Buddhists agree on the conventional nature of language shows that the religious prominence of Sanskrit does not necessarily entail specific philosophical commitments about its referential capacities. However, those who take on the assumption of an innate connection between Sanskrit word and referent then had explanatory burdens, such as how to explain linguistic innovation within Sanskrit and the referential capacities of non-Sanskrit languages.
2. Primary and Secondary Meaning
One of the most central distinctions in Indian philosophy of language is that between primary and secondary meaning. While this could be characterized as the distinction between “literal” and “non-literal” meaning, for some philosophers, word meanings that seem intuitively literal are classified as being secondary. For instance, the word “cow” in the sentence “A cow is to be led out to pasture” would, according to Mīmāṃsā philosophers following Kumārila, be taken as an instance of secondary meaning, for reasons discussed below. Further, since the literal/non-literal distinction in Western philosophy of language is vexed (see the distinction “literal/non-literal” in the entry on pragmatics), this entry henceforth avoids such terminology.
2.1 Lexical Meaning
Most classical Indian thinkers (some Buddhists being an important exception, see section 4.1) understand word meaning, or padārtha, to refer to objects in the world, and to do so directly. For these thinkers—Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā—the referential function is primary. However, despite broad agreement about the basic referential function of words, they disagree about what its objects are. One such dispute, which has implications for the primary/secondary distinction, is over the relationship between words and universals. Kumārila argues that the primary referent of words is a universal. Kumārila’s reasoning is that, without words denoting the universal property belonging to, for example, all cows, there would not be a permanent (nitya) relationship between word and referent. For if “cow” means a specific cow, Bessie, when Bessie goes out of existence, the word lacks denotation (ŚV). Further, the Vedic injunction, “A cow is to be tied up,” can be followed in numerous rituals—but if a specific cow were intended, it could be followed only once. (This argument is found in early Grammatical thought as well, see below.) Still, despite the fact that all Mīmāṃsakas accept the requirement of fixity of word and referent, they do not all accept the universal-denotation view. Some agree with another philosopher, roughly contemporaneous with Kumārila, Prabhākara (his followers are known as “Prābhākaras,” with the first long “ā” equivalent to the English “-an” as in “Fregean”). They reject the universal-denotation view in connection with their view of sentence meaning (see sections 4.3 and 5.1).
In contrast, in the NS and its commentaries, Nyāya philosophers argue that words refer to universals, forms, and individual things. They point out that universals are never instantiated without particular things, and so the universal alone cannot be the referent. But likewise, since universals are identified by form (a cow is recognized as having cowhood by its particular structure), we must also take it into account. Replying to Mīmāṃsā philosophers who defend and refine the universals-denotation view, along with other opponents who defend individual- and form-only views, Nyāya philosophers defend and refine the context-dependent view. Vātsyāyana, for example, in the Commentary on Nyāya (Nyāyabhāṣya, hereafter NBh), argues for an epistemic point, that “It is not known which among these is the object or meaning of the word, or whether all of them might be meant” (NBh 2.2.59; Dasti and Phillips 2017). He takes on arguments from interlocutors who argue that only the individual or the universal is meant by words. Vātsyāyana observes that, to take the example of “cow” again, one never encounters a bare particular (individual). Rather, the individual cow is always found to be qualified by the universal. Ceteris paribus for universals, which do not exist apart from individuals. So it is possible that both universal and particular are meant together, along with form or shape (ākṛti), though in a structured relationship where one is predominant and the others are subsidiary, the particular structure depending on context. See Dasti 2020 for a summary of early Nyāya arguments.
Grammarians also consider the question of word reference. Pāṇini takes at least a partial position on the question, claiming that if words only refer to particulars, then someone who ties up one cow for a sacrifice, in response to a Vedic command, would be in error if they, in a later ritual, tie up another cow, as the command could only refer to a single specific animal (Eight Chapters 1.2.64). After him, Patañjali, in the Great Commentary, refers to two earlier grammarians (whose work is not independently available), Vyāḍi and Vājapyāyana, who differ on this topic. Vyāḍi argues that words primarily refer to particulars and Vājapyāyana claims they refer to universals. Patañjali splits the difference, claiming that both aspects are part of word-meaning, but which one is primary may vary (see Deshpande 2003; VM; and Matilal 1971.) Matilal illustrates the moves in the debate with the example of a compound, “a brave-man” (Sanskrit: vīra-puruṣaḥ). Vājapyāyana would argue that if “brave” refers to the attribute of braveness, and “man” to the attribute of manhood, then these two referents can be related together in an underlying, unifying substratum (samānādhikaraṇa). But if his opponent, Vyāḍi, were correct, there would be no way to make sense of the compound, since both terms would refer to the same individual, and thus there would be repetition. However, by making use of the distinction between expressed meaning and the implied ground for the meaning, Vyāḍi could reply: yes, “brave” strictly refers to a brave man, but this word is used because of the man’s braveness, whereas the other word is used because of the man’s being a man.
Whether the primary word-function results in a particular or universal, philosophers understand its resultant cognition as a basis for unhesitating action. Word meaning is treated in the context of epistemology and the topic of verbal testimony. The two sets of philosophers above, Mīmāṃsakas and Naiyāyikas, both agree that verbal testimony is a way of knowing. However, for Nyāya philosophers, testimony is authoritative because of the speaker’s characteristics while Mīmāṃsakas emphasize the innately authoritative nature of statements, regardless of speaker, at at least when it comes to Vedic sentences. While they believe that sentences (vākya) are truth-bearers, and not individual words, since sentences are composed of words, Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā philosophers focus on the invariable contributions of words to sentences—their primary meanings. This emphasis, we will see, is not shared by everyone, as the grammarian Bhartṛhari rejects any ultimate metaphysical distinction between words and sentences, arguing that such divisions are provisional and arbitrary, even if useful in some contexts.
2.2 Varieties of Secondary Meaning
In what follows, we will classify any kind of derivative meaning, whether it be metaphor, metonymy, irony, hyperbole, punning, etc., as “secondary.” Again, we are in the realm of word-meanings, although there is discussion of sentence-level secondary meaning, primarily in Mīmāṃsā, Vedānta, and Alaṁkāra. While the task of precisely carving up varieties of secondary meaning was frequently left to philosophers working on aesthetics, other philosophers also took an interest in this question. Many stock examples of secondary meaning are shared among the textual traditions, although it is not until much later, in the seventeenth century, that Indian linguistic analysis becomes robustly interdisciplinary, in the work of Navya-Nyāya (see Bronner 2002). There are various ways to classify secondary meaning: it may be based on the logical relationship between primary and secondary meaning, on the semantic distance between them, or on the role of speaker intention.
For instance, Mukula Bhaṭṭa, the aforementioned philosopher of aesthetics, distinguishes between secondary meaning that is qualitative and secondary meaning that is free from qualities. The qualitative includes metaphorical cases such as “The person is an ox,” where the stubbornness of the person and the ox are understood to be shared qualities. In contrast, cases like “The village is on the Ganges” are typical of those that are free from qualities. Here, the word “bank” is understood so as to avoid the interpretation that the village is floating on the river itself—but there are no properties shared between the village and the Ganges (or the bank). In point of fact, Mukula argues that a speaker may intend different secondary meanings with the same utterance type, since another reason someone might utter the sentence is to communicate that the village and the Ganges do share qualities—the holiness of the Ganges river could be attributed to the village due to proximity. In this way, the Ganges sentence could exemplify a different utterance, one where there is “semantic imbuing” of the qualities of the river to the bank (Keating 2019:55, 117–126). Thus whether a speaker intends or does not intend a secondary meaning becomes relevant to its characterization. Finally, both the qualitative and quality-free varieties may differ in terms of how closely related the primary and secondary meanings are. Mukula describes highly conventional language use as cases of “absorption”—for instance, using the term “ruler” for to someone who is not from the ruling class (so not strictly a ruler), but who performs the functions a ruler does (such as protecting of people). In contrast, metaphors such as “The person is an ox” are not absorption, but superimposition, since some difference is understood. (See Keating 2019, Cuneo 2020, and McCrea 2008 for further discussion of Mukula and Ānandavardhana on these topics.)
All of these varieties of secondary meaning require three conditions. First, there must be an obstacle in the primary meaning of the words. Second, there must some relationship—of which kind, more below—between the primary and secondary meaning. Third, there must be a warrant for the secondary meaning, such as a motivation on the speaker’s part or some accepted conventional sense. To take a stock example, “Feed the sticks,” which means “Feed the brahmins holding the sticks,” word “sticks” refers to something which is inanimate and which cannot be fed. Thus, the first condition is met—an obstacle to what is called “semantic fit” (yogyatā) which is necessary for a unified sentence. Second, there is a relationship of association between brāhmin priests and sticks—they carry walking sticks. Association is not the only possible relationship between primary and secondary meaning, but it is one, and it fulfills the second condition. Finally, a speaker using this phrase would be trading on a conventionalized use, and thus meets the third condition, of warrant.
While this three-fold set of conditions is commonly accepted, given different analyses of primary word-meaning, the boundary between primary and secondary meaning will be drawn differently. For instance, Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsakas, who take the primary word-meaning to be a universal, find cases of secondary meaning more pervasive than Nyāya philosophers, for whom word-meaning in the primary sense is more flexible. Given the command, “A cow is to be tied up,” the correct thing to do is to find some single cow to fasten to a post. However, Mīmāṃsakas such as Kumārila argue that the primary meaning of “cow” in the command is cowhood, which cannot be fastened to a post. Thus there is an obstacle to the semantic fit of the sentence. To resolve this difficulty, Kumārila invokes the secondary meaning function known as indication (lakṣaṇā), on which see McCrea 2020. In TV 1.3.10, he argues that indication causes hearers to understand that an individual cow is meant. Hearers understand this from the knowledge that “cow” means cowhood, that individual cows are qualified by cowhood, and yet that the sentence is uttered for the purpose of fulfilling sacrificial aims. Thus the relationship between the primary and secondary meanings here is inherence (a universal inheres in an individual), and the speaker aims to pick out a particular cow.
One of the central categories of secondary meaning is those meanings which have similarities with the primary meaning. For instance, Kumārila takes qualitative expression (gauṇavṛtti), figures based on similarities, to be one of the two major types of secondary meaning, where indication (lakṣaṇā) is a catch-all category for figures based on any other kind of relationship. The figure of speech which rhetorical traditions tracing back to ancient Greece call “metaphor” would fall under qualitative expression, although Indian thinkers generally focus on the logical structure underlying figures rather than a syntactic structure by which metaphor is often characterized (Gerow 1971). Kumārila discusses the common example “Devadatta is a lion,” saying that when people hear the utterance, they find the word “lion” to be inexplicable as referring to Devadatta, and therefore conclude that the term must be used figuratively. However, while some thinkers would describe metaphors as involving a superimposition of lion on Devadatta, Kumārila explicitly rejects this analysis, saying that all that is meant is that there are similar properties that the two have, such as bravery. Otherwise, superimposition would mean there is confusion about the genuine difference between people and lions.
One might object that the three examples just given: “Feed the sticks,” “A cow is to be tied up,” and “Devadatta is a lion” do not all have the same kind of obstacle. Philosophers, in the Aesthetic discipline and elsewhere, work to make the nature of this obstacle precise. While initially the emphasis is on the semantic connection within the sentence itself, for Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā both, by the time of Maṇḍana Miśra (ca seventh century CE) and Vācaspati Miśra (ca tenth century CE), the failure is taken to be wider, including problems with the larger context. In the ninth century work of Mukula Bhaṭṭa, such a widening is apparent as he distinguishes between multiple features of context which may require a word to be taken in a secondary sense: a speaker, sentence, time, place, and circumstance. Sometimes there is a clash between a speaker and a sentence meaning, as in the case taken from courtly love poetry—a common source of linguistic examples—where a young woman utters words, “I go alone to the forest along the riverbank” to a neighbor. She is to be understood as conveying the opposite (she is not going alone) to her neighbor, but intending her husband to overhear and to believe she is telling the truth. Since we know facts (through the poetic context or genre) about the woman’s personal life, Mukula argues that the sentence cannot be taken to mean the literal truth.
2.3 Bitextuality and Polysemy
An important phenomenon in Indian poetry, double meaning (śleṣa), garnered the attention of philosophers of aesthetics and, to a lesser extent, philosophers and grammarians. At its most basic level, the figure involves using a single word in two or more different senses. It is akin to “punning” but without the connotation of triviality that often accompanies puns, hence the term “bitextuality” (Bronner 2010). In fact, according to Rudraṭa, in his Ornaments of Poetry (Kāvyālaṅkāra, ca 855 CE), bitextuality is the perfect figure of speech (Gerow 1977). The phenomenon in Sanskrit was not limited to a word or two, here and there, but entire compositions were written which admit of two different meanings. One of the most prominent examples is of poems which, read one way tell the story of the Rāmāyaṇa, and read another way, narrate the Mahābhārata. Examples are difficult to translate into English, since they rely on particularities of Sanskrit: word breaks which are frequently joined together, the ubiquity of compounds, and the fact of phonemic transformation at phonetic boundaries (saṃdhi) which can be reconstructed in multiple ways. For instance, dāsyasītyuktvā can be disambiguated as dāsy asīty uktvā (saying, “you are my slave”) or dāsyasīty uktvā (saying [to myself] “you will give!”) (Bronner 2010: xvii).
This particular linguistic device is not merely a figurative ornament, but is at the center of a major intellectual and literary movement. Poetic lexicons exist which contain stipulated meanings for syllables. These assist poets in creating bitextual compositions. Poetic commentaries tease out the multiplicities inherent in poems, whether or not they are intended by the author. Bronner (2010) identifies several ways in which the existence of bitextuality was a sticking point for theorists trying to give an account of word-meaning and the relationship between meaning and aesthetics. First, there is the difficulty of identifying a particular logical structure underpinning bitextuality. Second, there is the question of whether bitextuality’s effects are due to word-meaning or to the sounds of words. Finally, there is the problem of the psychology of bitextuality.
One reason that bitextuality resists explanation is that the multiple “registers” (ways of reading the text), such as the story of the Rāmāyaṇa and the Mahābhārata mentioned above, are not merely two distinct sets of unrelated meanings. Rather, similes or metaphors frequently connect the readings. For instance, Dhanañjaya’s “Poem of Two Targets,” through setting the Rāmāyaṇa and the Mahābhārata “side-by-side” allows the reader to contrast the protagonists of the two epics (Bronner 2010: 110). Further, even where such relationships are not obvious, given the important principle that non-literal utterances must be supported by some warrant, whether conventional or due to speaker aims, most Sanskrit thinkers argued that no one would utter a sentence with two meanings that are unrelated. Mahima Bhaṭṭa (11th century CE), in his Analysis of “Manifestation” (Vyaktiviveka), argues that paranomasia, as a kind of meaning, must be coherent in the sense of having semantic fit, even if, as a kind of secondary meaning, there are cues which lead the reader to go beyond the strictly literal sense. However, unlike cases of metaphor, where there is an obstacle to semantic fit, as in “Devadatta is a lion,” bitextuality requires that there be (at least) two sets of coherent meanings which have semantic fit and also that there be a way to bring both meanings together. Further, since the trigger for bitextuality cannot be a failure of semantic fit, there must be some cue other than just the mere possibility of reading a sentence in two ways (McCrea 2008). Ānandavardhana, however, who comes two centuries before Mahima Bhaṭṭa, argues that there may be bitextual poems in which two sets of meanings do not cause a further metaphor or simile (Bronner 2010: 204; McCrea 2008: 434).
3. Suggested Meaning and Speaker’s Intention
Ānandavardhana argues for a new linguistic capacity, suggestion (dhvani or vyañjanā), which he believes accounts for important phenomena not included within existing theories of secondary meaning. His commentator, Abhinavagupta, elaborates on this theory, though in a way which goes beyond Ānandavardhana’s original text, and he also writes his own independent treatise on the topic. As a result of these two thinkers (authoring the Light on Suggestion and The Eye, respectively), a new debate opens. It centers on whether existing theories of language can account for the subtleties of meaning found in literature, such as courtly poetry, drama, and great epics. Those who agree that suggestion must be accepted discuss what kinds of suggested meaning ought to be adduced; those who reject suggestion generally try to show that for each putative category of suggested meaning, an equivalent explanation can be given, through already-accepted processes such as indication or inferential reasoning. This discussion is not much taken up in philosophical circles in the Classical period. For instance, the Nyāya philosopher Jayanta Bhaṭṭa (ca ninth century CE) has a stray remark disparaging suggestion in his Flower Garland of Logic (Nyāyamañjarī), but he does not engage substantively with arguments against it.
3.1 Insufficiency of Existing Capacities
Ānandavardhana proceeds by citing passages which are generally accepted to have various kinds of poetic effects, and then analyzing how these effects are attained by suggestion. He divides the content of what is suggested into implied meanings, implied figures, and aesthetic moods (rasa). He also distinguishes among varieties of suggested meaning according to other criteria such as the speaker’s intention, how rapidly the hearer recovers the suggested content, and whether expressions or phonemes are the basis for what is suggested. When suggestion is a way of conveying the rasa, the dominant aesthetic mood described or intimated within a poem, it is called rasa-dhvani. Ānandavardhana tries to give an account of when it is that suggestion causes poetic beauty, and argues that rasa is the proper aim of all poetry. It is important to mark that, for Ānandavardhana, rasa is found within the text, and not the reader. The reader simply comes to have a cognition of the text’s rasa. Thus it is easily understood as meaning, and not a reader’s emotional state. After Abhinavagupta’s commentary on Ānandavardhana, the emphasis shifts onto the reader’s emotive experience, and how to understand rasa in relation to other kinds of meaning becomes more difficult. Even though many things may be suggested (figures of speech, facts), the ultimate aim of dhvani or suggestion in the poetic context is to suggest rasa.
Take the case of “The village is on the Ganges.” Here, Ānandavardhana argues that suggestion operates after both primary and secondary meaning. What is suggested is the purity of the village which is on the bank of the holy Ganges river. Note, though, that he does not think that both primary and secondary meaning are always necessary for suggestion. For instance, the word “Ganges” itself could suggest purity without being in a metaphorical or otherwise figurative context (here, it is metonymical for the bank). Ānandavardhana also contrasts the function of suggestion with the primary meaning function. As for the latter, he says the relationship between the composition of words in a sentence and its primary meaning is a “natural relation.” The sense in which the word–referent relation is “natural” is that it is fixed. A word’s primary meaning is that meaning which is cognized in every single instance the word is employed. Suggestion, in contrast, is an “artificial relation” since it is a meaning that is not given by its natural word, and the relationship between suggested meaning and a suggestive word is not one–to–one.
On Ānandavardhana’s view, the suggested meaning is a further step beyond the secondary meaning, but is not always understood through what is secondarily meant. For example, what is suggested in this case is understood through the primary meaning of “Ganges,” since it is the river and not the bank which is associated with suggested properties (specified as its purity and coolness, according to later thinkers). The crucial aspect of Ānandavardhana’s view is that while secondary meaning requires a failure of semantic fit, suggestion does not. A hearer’s understanding of “on the Ganges” as meaning “on the bank of the Ganges” is necessary in order for the sentence not to cause a cognition of a village as floating upon the Ganges. In contrast, the suggested sense does not rectify any apparent semantic incompatibility in the literal meaning of the sentence.
3.2 Varieties of Suggested Meaning
While one can present a definitive number of types of suggestion (Abhinavagupta says there are thirty-five), Ānandavardhana himself says there are an endless number of combinations if we take into account all of the facts involved in creating suggested meaning. Whether this should be taken literally or as a rhetorical flourish, the point is that Ānandavardhana does not view his analysis as a complete taxonomy of suggested meaning. In keeping with this spirit, only a few of the important divisions are discussed below.
Ānandavardhana subdivides suggestion in two ways based on two kinds of intentions a speaker has with regard to the expression she utters. This is consistent with his view that underlying all cases of suggestion there is a purpose (prayojana) the speaker has in choosing a particular expression. In particular, these intentions are defined in terms of the speaker’s attitude towards the primary meaning of an expression. First, a speaker may intend to convey the primary meaning plus some suggested meaning. Second, she may not intend to convey the primary meaning, but only have an intention to convey a suggested meaning.
As an example of the first type, Ānandavardhana cites love poetry written by the Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti (ca 6th to 7th century CE, see the entry on Dharmakīrti). The poem describes images of birds and fruit which are meant to be taken literally. However, these images are juxtaposed in a way which suggests an additional sense consistent with the romantic tone of the poem. There is no explicit comparison between the images, but the comparison is suggested. This kind of suggestion is something like the phenomenon in Ezra Pound’s famous imagist poem, “In a Station of a Metro”
The apparition of these faces in the crowd;
Petals on a wet, black bough. (Pound 1913)
There is no linguistic metaphor in the sense of an explicit predication between two things, such as faces and petals. However, the reader understands an implicit comparisons between the two images. Thus there is both primary and suggested meaning. Other times, Ānandavardhana says, the speaker intends only to convey a suggested meaning, so the primary meaning may be entirely replaced or set aside in some manner. For example, in this passage from the Rāmāyaṇa, the phrase “blinded” is not being used in a primary sense, but in a suggestive manner:
The sun has stolen our affection for the moon,
whose circle is now dull with frost
and like a mirror blinded by breath,
shines no more. (DL: 209)
Since a mirror cannot, strictly speaking, be made blind—breath merely fogs it—this is a case where the speaker intends what is suggested to replace the primary meaning.
While the previous categories are distinguished by the speaker’s aims, the two other categories are distinguished by the hearer’s experience. Ānandavardhana says that when hearers come to understand the suggested meaning of a poem, they can do so either instantaneously or else after a “reverberation”—some experienced temporal gap between recovering the literal meaning and recovering the suggested meaning. The suggested content characterized by reverberation may be similar to what contemporary philosophers talk about in terms of the metaphorical “felt gap” between literal and metaphorical meanings in particular (e.g., Camp & Reimer 2008). However, it also includes the idea of a temporal gap between understanding the literal and suggested meaning. The phenomenological observation can, and should, be distinguished from a claim about content recovery. Ānandavardhana does not appeal to the phenomenology of suggested meanings as evidence that they are recovered in a certain way, though such a move was certainly available to him, as we have seen in section 1.2.
Ānandavardhana categorizes a case of bitextuality (śleṣa) as involving reverberation, as both meanings do not occur to the reader simultaneously. Further he describes this as a case where the sentence (rather than individual words) suggests a second meaning, which comes like a “reverberation” or some time after the first. This supports the idea that reverberation is about processing time, rather than (or in addition to) a felt tension. Elsewhere, Ānandavardhana points out that for many kinds of suggestion, hearers do not have a “reverberation” or awareness of a gap between the primary meaning and what is suggested. Abhinavagupta gives an analogy to explain cases where there is no such reverberation. He says that when someone has taken to heart the relationship between smoke and fire, she will be able to reason inferentially to the existence of fire simply on the perceptual basis of smoke. There need not be any awareness of inferential processes on the part of the thinker.
Ānandavardhana distinguishes in a number of other ways between varieties of suggestion. He identifies the basis of suggestion: word meanings, sentence meanings, discourse unit meanings, and even the sounds of individual phonemes can all give rise to suggested meaning. A poem’s entire “meaning,” that is, a comparison which may not be explicit in the poem, but is suggested throughout, can itself be the basis for a suggested rasa, such as love or heroism. At a more local level, individual phonemes within a poem may also suggest an aesthetic mood, through being sonorous or harsh, etc. These distinctions within suggested meaning underscore the need for caution in drawing equivalence between suggestion and analytic philosophical concepts, such as implicature (see the entry on implicature) which is roughly analogous to, but not co-extensive with, Ānandavardhana’s dhvani, since Ānandavardhana denies that suggestion arises through inferential reasoning.
3.3 Objections to Suggested Meaning
Although Ānandavardhana’s theory of suggested meaning was influential for many philosophers of aesthetics in the years following his Light on Suggestion, not everyone accepted the new model. There were two ways of rejecting suggestion: reducing it to a non-linguistic capacity or reducing it to an already-existing linguistic capacity—primary or secondary meaning. The first strategy is followed, in different ways, by Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka and Mahima Bhaṭṭa, whereas the second is followed by Mukula Bhaṭṭa and members of the Prābhākara school of Mīmāṃsā.
In his Mirror of the Heart, Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka (ca. 900 CE) argues that Ānandavardhana is mistaken to think of rasa as something like linguistic meaning, and instead focuses on the emotional response of the reader (Pollock 2016, Ollett 2020). His argument is that rasa cannot be the kind of thing which is the meaning of a sentence—it is an experiential event which is caused by sentences. Drawing on Mīmāṃsā hermeneutics, which emphasizes how Vedic language causes hearers to follow injunctions, Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka proposes a multi-part process in which the primary meaning function operates in a normal manner, but subsequently there is what Pollock calls an “aesthetic text-event” that unifies the disparate parts of a poem through a generalizing power (bhāvakatva, De 1960 and Pollock 2016). The audience has the ability to enjoy (Pollock: “experientialize”) the result through a particular aesthetic capability (bhojakatva), and the result is a transcendent, rapturous experience of rasa. Though understanding Nāyaka’s account is difficult, given some textual problems, Ollett 2020 argues that his idea of “actualizing” multiple parts of a text has a parallel with the process by which we understand a unified sentence meaning from the parts of a sentence. While rasa is not a linguistic meaning the way that a sentence meaning is, on this understanding, it, like sentence meaning, is something unified understood in dependence on multiple constituent parts.
Mahima Bhaṭṭa (ca. 1025 CE) does not consider rasa anything more than an emotion which has been stabilized into the object of a particular kind of aesthetic enjoyment. His Analysis of “Manifestation” argues that, since the characters in a poem are unreal, the emotions they are experiencing are also unreal, and must be inferred or imputed to them. All of the talk of “manifesting” rasa is itself a figure of speech, on Mahima Bhaṭṭa’s view. In addition, he argues that any putative “secondary meaning” such as indication (lakṣaṇā) is also inferred. Primary meaning plays an evidentiary role in inference based on rules of pervasion (vyāpti) between the primary meaning and secondary or suggested meaning. This position is criticized by later thinkers, since the relationship between primary meaning and these other meanings does not easily admit of universalizable regularities, and suggested meanings are often defeasible (see the entry on logic in classical Indian philosophy for discussion of inference).
Like Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka and Mahima Bhaṭṭa, Mukula Bhaṭṭa agrees with Ānandavardhana that there are poetic phenomena that require explanation. He argues that these meanings arise from the existing category of secondary meaning, indication (lakṣaṇā), rather than the third linguistic capacity of suggested meaning. His Fundamentals of the Communicative Function, through analysis of many of the stock examples of suggestion in the Light on Suggestion, identifies the necessary features which trigger indication: an obstacle in the primary meaning, a relationship between the primary and indicated meaning, and a motive or conventional basis for the indicated meaning. Mukula argues that it is possible to have cases of indicated meaning which do not completely replace the primary meaning. Mukula’s work comes to be widely influential through its incorporation into the Illumination of Poetry (Kāvyaprakāśa) written by later philosopher of aesthetics Mammaṭa, who excerpts parts of it verbatim (McCrea 2008).
Rather than explain suggested meaning as part of secondary meaning, the Prābhākara school of Mīmāṃsā prefers to incorporate it into primary meaning. Their position, which is discussed in more detail below, criticizes the Bhāṭṭa distinction between primary and secondary meaning. On their view, word meanings do not—as per the Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā view—have a fixed primary meaning regardless of sentence context. Instead, the meaning of a word will vary depending on its relationship with other words in a given sentence. Thus a word can carry a putatively “suggested” meaning simply through force of context. Ānandavardhana himself implicitly criticizes this position, arguing that suggested meaning function has a different object, since it does not result directly from the word, but from the primary meaning of the word. For instance, the well-known case of “A village is on the Ganges” suggests the purity of the village—but this cannot be the primary meaning of the word “Ganges” even contextually. It is an additional meaning, conveyed subsequent to the ordinary meaning of “Ganges” (DL).
4. Criticizing the Distinction
Not all thinkers accept that there is a genuine difference between primary and secondary meaning. The rejection of this distinction happens in several different ways. First, and most radically, one might flatten the distinction to the point at which all language is equally “non-literal,” and reject the idea that there is a foundational stratus of meaning. This is the view of some Buddhists, although just how to cash out this idea is a significant question. Second, one might argue that while there is a pragmatic reason to distinguish between primary and secondary meaning, this distinction does not map onto any genuine facts about language or its relationship with the world. Loosely, this is the view of Grammarian Bhartṛhari, whose sphoṭa or “burst” theory is that words are simply useful heuristics, but not real in any robust sense. Finally, one might argue that word-meanings are highly context-dependent to the extent that it is not useful to think of a single “primary” meaning for a word. This is the position of Prābhākara Mīmāṃsakas who do, however, make room for secondary meaning in a sense.
Buddhism and Jainism, two so-called “heteroprax” (Veda-rejecting) traditions in India, put forward analyses of language which challenge the notion of a distinction between primary and secondary meaning, at least as drawn in the orthoprax schools. Significant textual work—as well as secondary scholarship—remains to be done in the area of how both of these traditions (especially Jainism) understand language, but there are some clear themes.
Buddhist thinkers are broadly committed to error theories about ordinary language use. As noted already, early Buddhists, in texts such as The Questions of King Milinda (Milindapañhā), argue for a kind of conventionalism: language which seems to refer to persistent whole objects, such as chariots and persons, does not, as such objects are taken to lack true existence. Later philosophical reflection, such as in the Commentary on the Treasury of Dharma (Abhidharmakośabhāṣya) of Vasubandhu (ca fourth to fifth century CE, see the entry on Vasubandhu), presents a kind of local fictionalism or reductionism, as the only truly existing things are atomic simples which exist momentarily. Thus, all language is, save for claims about ultimately real constituent parts, loose speech. Buddhist philosophy of language is famous for its “two truths” doctrine (see the entry on the theory of two truths in India), the notion that there is conventional truth and ultimate truth—but this gets deployed variously among the later schools such as Yogācāra and Madhyamaka (see Siderits 2003 and Garfield 2006).
A commitment to the ubiquitous nature of non-literal speech is seen explicitly in Buddhist texts which pick up on the existing categories in Grammarian and Aesthetic thought, such as cognitive superimposition or metaphor (upacāra), and employ them to undermine the orthoprax theories of language which were realist and referential in nature (Gold 2007 and Tzohar 2018). For instance, the Yogācāra Buddhist Sthiramati, in his Commentary on the Thirty Verses (Triṃśikābhāṣya) (ca sixth century CE), cites a common Grammarian definition of upacāra, noting that use of the term “self” and “things” is an instance of such figurative talk (Tzohar 2018). Not only is the self, when talked about in apparently ordinary ways, really being talked about indirectly, but this is so for all words which, on Sthiramati’s Yogācāra view, refer to an individual’s conscious experience of qualities, and not things in themselves. For Sthiramati, at least, there is a sense in which all language is “metaphorical,” though grounded in the conscious arising and perishing of experiential events, rather than a (putatively) objective external reality.
Another way in which this conventionalism plays out is in the development of the apoha theory of concepts, which has important implications for how language functions. The term apoha means “exclusion.” This theory first presented in the work of fifth to sixth century CE philosopher Diṅnāga (see the entry on Dharmakīrti, and the discussion of the theory of apoha). The theory of exclusion is meant to explain how we can have conceptual connections (linguistic or otherwise) with the world even though, on this Buddhist view, reality is ultimately a series of unique, momentarily-existing, ineffable particulars. Without universals or qualities, the Buddhists have a difficulty explaining how talk of a “blue lotus,” for instance, is possible. Their ingenious solution, much debated after Diṅnāga, is to propose that we carve up the world conceptually by negation. Blueness is not a universal, but the exclusion of all non-blue particular things—it is to be “not non-blue.” How this theory works in detail is the subject of Dharmakīrti’s work (ca sixth to seventh century CE) and a whole host of later thinkers, such as Ratnakīrti (ca eleventh century CE). The philosopher of aesthetics Bhāmaha (ca sixth to seventh century CE) criticizes apoha in his Ornaments of Poetry (Kāvyālaṅkāra), but not with regard to any distinction between primary and secondary meaning. Rather, he argues that the sense of a word is positive, and that on apoha, Buddhists are assigning two capacities to words—exclusion and positive designation—when there is only one (KB). Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya philosophers likewise criticize apoha extensively on these and similar grounds.
Buddhist thought also takes up the distinction between kinds of meaning in its approach to hermeneutics, with regard to the interpretation of sūtra passages, not unlike the way in which Vedic hermeneutics both informs and is informed by Mīmāṃsā philosophical reflection on language. Buddhist hermeneutics, despite its being positioned “outside” of the orthopraxy, employs lists of figures which pre-date the rise of the textual tradition of Sanskrit poetics, in a way which demonstrates that there were links between the Grammarian, Nyāya, Mīmāṃsā, and Buddhist theories of meaning (Tzohar 2018). A crucial concept in Buddhist hermeneutics, which approaches a distinction between literal and non-literal, is that of upāya or “skillful means.” With the assumption that the Buddha speaks both truthfully and with an eye towards the abilities of his particular audience, the notion of “skillful means” allows Buddhist hermeneuticists to explain apparently contradictory elements within Buddhist texts. As with Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā use of secondary meaning for Vedic interpretation, recourse to secondary meaning in the face of apparent contradiction, skillful means allowed for truth-preservation while constraining the interpretive process.
Originating with Mahāvīra, who lives around the same time as Siddhārtha Gautama, the founder of Buddhism (sixth century BCE), Jainism is known for its emphasis on language’s representational limitations. This is because of its view that reality is multi-faceted (anekāntavāda) and any single description will necessarily involve some apparent contradiction, due to the fact that it is incomplete (Balcerowicz 2001). Without relativization to a standpoint (naya), the sentences “o is P” and “o is not-P” are contradictory. To address this, Jainas propose that there are seven ways to characterize any purported fact, each one preceded by a marker of uncertainty, syāt. Any object o and its property P can be described as:
- o is P.
- o is not-P.
- o is both P and not-P.
- o is beyond words.
- o is beyond words and P.
- o is beyond words and not-P.
- o is beyond words and both P and not-P.
This seven-fold schema is found in many Jaina texts, from the early works of Kundakunda (3rd to 6th centuries) up to the to the important Flower Garland of Conditional Predication (Syādvādamañjarī) of Malliṣeṇa (13th century CE). While some, like Priest (2008), have argued that this seven-fold classification scheme lends itself to a paraconsistent (and perhaps also dialethic) formalization, it need not be, as within the scheme, each of the seven standpoints follows the law of non-contradiction, though within a many-valued truth-system (Ganeri 2002; Schang 2013). On this interpretation, the truth of an utterance is relativized to a particular context, in the sense that each standpoint restricts the context, as Balcerowicz argues, through indices such as space, time, convention, and so on (Balcerowicz 2001). (Balcerowicz also questions whether modern formalization is an eisegetical enterprise, reading into the text conceptions of axiomatization which were not present; see Balcerowicz 2015.) Minimally, according to Siddharṣigaṇi (ca tenth century CE), one must include in one’s analysis of any given utterance the speaker’s intention and the relevant linguistic connections (Clerbout, Gorisse, & Rahman 2018). The schema, further, is hierarchically ordered, so that each standpoint includes more indices than the prior, according to Malliṣeṇa (Balcerowicz 2001).
Emphasis on speaker’s intention is crucial for Jainas, especially insofar as they hold to a division between two standpoints: the ordinary standpoint (vyavahāranaya) and the transcendent or ultimate standpoint (niścayanaya, pāramārthikanaya). Ultimately speaking, language cannot be said to have any inherent communicative power, but rather it functions due to the speaker’s authority and position as having unmediated access to the truth. In fact, the Jainas hold that scriptures containing the words of Mahāvīra are not efficacious due to the words themselves—a stark contrast to the Mīmāṃsā view of an unauthored Veda—but due to a unique suggestive power as well as the religious purity of the listener. As a result of these principles, any single utterance is susceptible to a number of different analyses. Flügel (2010) distinguishes between four kinds of analysis in Jaina thinking about language:
- Principles and criteria for religious speech
- General rules and clauses for language usage
- Context-sensitive rules for proper ways of speaking
- Examples considering social implications
The existence of normative criteria governing language use, aiming at the avoidance of harm (ahiṁsā) and the preservation of truth (satya) can be compared to Gricean conversational maxims, although the intentional flouting of these principles does not lead to conversational implicatures. In fact, Jaina doctrines discourage ambiguity and emphasize precise speech (Flügel 2010).
4.3 Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā
In their explanation of word-meaning, Prābhākara Mīmāṃsakas emphasize the relationship of words with one another in a token utterance. Śālikanātha (ca. 7th century CE), in his Monograph in Five Chapters (Prakaraṇapañcikā), argues that, to avoid multiplying denotative capacities for words in different contexts, one should posit the ability for words to denote meanings-in-relation. This position is called “denotation of what is related” (anvitābhidhāna) and it is opposed to the Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā analysis discussed earlier (abhihitānvaya). The principle of parsimony is central to Prābhākara arguments. On the Bhāṭṭa view, there are multiple levels of meaning and a complex process of moving from a word to a word meaning to a unified sentence which connects those meanings. Śālikanātha argues that it would be better to explain the resultant connections (anvaya) among word meanings as being understood directly from the word. The idea that the same operation is responsible for unifying the word meanings into a sentence anticipates, to a degree, Frege’s idea of word meanings as unsaturated entities, although Śālikanātha is not thinking in the same ontological terms (see the discussion of semantic power and the reduction of semantic properties in the entry on analytic philosophy in the entry on early modern India, and Siderits 1991).
Prābhākara thinkers deny that the meaning of a “cow” is a universal and that indication is necessary to shift the generic referent of the noun to a particular. Śālikanātha argues that while it may be true that something the same is remembered in each case when someone says “cow,” this remnant of memory is not the same thing as a word meaning (PS: 381ff, Ollett 2020b). Meaning has to do with the role that a word’s cognition plays within a sentence. Further, he argues that a word conveys the universal and the particular together, since the first cannot be understood without the second. So, while he agrees with the Bhāṭṭas that a series of universals cannot be connected together in a qualificative relationship, he concludes that this is a reason to reject the view that words primarily communicate generalities (sāmānya), arguing that they must communicate a qualified thing (viśeṣana).
However, Śālikanātha does leave room for the distinction between primary and secondary meaning in cases like “The village is on the Ganges” and “The boy is a lion.” He argues that where the ordinary meaning of words cannot form a connective relationship then there is recourse to secondary meaning. So in the case of words like “Ganges” and “lion,” the meaning–in–relation which is in connection with other word meanings is the secondary meaning, not the primary meaning. Despite this allowance for a distinction, the Prābhākara view is often touted as a radically contextualist approach. For instance, Abhinavagupta, who lived after the highly influential Śālikanātha, characterizes the Prābhākara position as one on which there is no distinction between primary meaning, secondary meaning, or suggestion. He says that their view is that the meaning of the word is simply its final result (1.4b The Eye, DL). He points, however, out that the Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā must accept different kinds of statements in the Vedas for exegetical purposes—some more direct than others—and thus they should have no problem in principle allowing for suggested meaning.
Prābhākaras emphasize three concepts in their account of word and sentence meaning: expectancy (ākāṅkṣā), cognitive proximity (sannidhi), and semantic fittingness (yogyatā). Depending on the word’s role in a sentence, it will have different expectancies. This expectancy also varies depending on which word meanings are presented to the subject’s mind as candidates for connection—or which meanings have cognitive proximity (these may not be words which uttered in sequence, as a connected subject and verb may be separated by a dependent clause). Finally, the goal of a sentence is to convey something meaningful, so the word meanings in relation must work together semantically: a sentence such as “Sprinkle the garden with fire” would fail to have semantic fittingness. These three criteria determine what the meaning-in-relations are which result in a sentence. Secondary meaning is resorted to when there is no relation possible (anvayānupapatti), such as when the word “village” cannot be related to “on the Ganges,” since this expression would lack semantic fittingness. These three concepts are not restricted to Prābhākaras, however, but are discussed and refined in various ways by nearly all of the intellectual traditions treating language (see section 5.1).
4.4 Sphoṭa Theory
In his Treatise on Sentences and Words, the grammarian Bhartṛhari (ca. 450 CE) takes up the distinction between primary and secondary meaning in more detail than previous grammarians such as Pāṇini and Patañjali. His work is difficult—he is aware of, and engages with, Buddhist, Jaina, and Mīmāṃsā views of language, but not in a straightforward dialectical manner, as is the style of many other Indian thinkers. This causes controversy over his established views (for discussion of which see Cardona 1999). In terms of his position on the division between primary and secondary meaning, the interpretive debate centers on the implications of the sphoṭa-theory for the possibility of such a distinction.
In Bhartṛhari’s work, the term sphoṭa, meaning “burst,” refers to the indivisible nature of the utterance—it is a sound which carries meaning, and which cannot be subdivided into words or particular phonemes. (One might think here of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, e.g., 1953 : 191, and the idea of grasping meaning in a “flash”—and indeed, this connection has been explored in Bhattacharyya 2002 and elsewhere.) On one prevailing understanding of sphoṭa, Bhartṛhari is committed to a kind of linguistic monism, which not only denies the divisibility of utterances into grammatical categories, but asserts the identity of speech and reality. Thus any apparent distinctions between categories—letters, words, semantic powers—are illusory. He uses common examples of illusion in Indian philosophy to underscore this point: from far away, a large tree may look like an elephant; at a glance, a rope may appear to be a snake. However, these are misperceptions, as are the putative semantic distinctions we make (Raja 1969).
Jan E.F. Houben, in his translation of the “Exposition on (Semantic) Relationship” (Sambandhasamuddeśa) chapter of the Treatise, which treats figurative language extensively, argues that Bhartṛhari does distinguish between primary and secondary meaning, but on pragmatic grounds (Houben 1995). Houben thinks that Bhartṛhari is a linguistic perspectivist, in the sense that his concern is not to argue against any particular philosophical position, but to show the limits of formal analysis itself. On this view, when Bhartṛhari appeals to the analogy with perceptual illusion, it is merely to dismantle the commitment to a certain theory of reference: that which presupposes words refer to external reality. Recently, Tzohar has argued that Bhartṛhari holds a “pan-figurative” account, on which all words “figuratively signify” (Tzohar 2018: 70). On this view, word reference does not require a relationship with external referents. In contrast, all language use is “figurative” in the sense that it does not require correspondence. This interpretation incorporates but goes beyond Houben’s perspectivism, drawing out implications for the limits of language in connecting with reality.
On the linguistic monism view, Bhartṛhari is anticipating later Advaita Vedānta monism, on which empirical reality is illusory and Brahman, without having any genuine properties, is the basis for this illusion. His linguistic analysis, however, need not rely on these metaphysical assumptions in order to underscore the centrality of the sentence for meaning. Saying that grammatical categories and stable word-meanings are constructed (kalpita) based on theoretical needs, is to observe the priority of ordinary use and the role of context for actual communication. The perspectivist interpretation emphasizes the epistemic elements in theory-construction, understanding the analogical argument from illusion as less concerned with error than the pragmatic grounds to our judgments.
5. Implications of the Distinction
Different positions on the distinction between primary and secondary meaning have implications for related philosophical topics. In the realm of philosophy of language, theories of sentence meaning depend on how word meaning is understood. Within philosophy of religion, scriptural hermeneutics is also contingent upon approaches to meaning. Finally, there are normative implications for speaking and producing works of poetry, given the distinction.
5.1 Sentence Meaning
While much of the discussion about primary and secondary meaning is centered on words, there are significant implications for sentence meaning. Among those who accept the genuine compositionality of sentences, contra the sphoṭa theorists above, there are two theories of how words combine in context to convey a unified meaning which differ over the role of secondary meaning.
On the “connection of denoted meanings” view (abhihitānvāya) accepted by Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsakas, words convey their meanings, and then, in conjunction with three conditions, these meanings are related together through secondary meaning (lakṣaṇā). The three conditions mentioned in section 4.3 are expectancy of connections (ākāṅkṣā), semantic fit (yogyatā), and cognitive contiguity (āsatti or sannidhi). Expectancy of connections is defined either syntactically or in terms of a hearer’s psychological state of desiring words to fit together. Semantic fit is the requirement that the sentence makes sense, prima facie, and contiguity is the requirement that words are uttered in a temporally adjacent sequence or that they are closely related in the hearer’s mind. The view that the meaning of a sentence is due to the secondary signification of words is not necessarily connected to Bhāṭṭa view that words denote universals, as Vācaspati, in his Drop of Truth (Tattvabindu), defends this position despite elsewhere subscribing to Nyāya theories of meaning. Vācaspati argues explicitly that indication is responsible for the relationship (anvaya) between word-meanings and argues that it is commensurate with a Naiyāyika position (Sastri 2014; Phillips 2015).
In favor of this view, its defenders observe that there must be some common word-meaning among sentences such as “Bring the cow,” “See the cow,” “Bring the sheep,” and “See the sheep” in order for hearers to understand what is being communicated. What we learn as language-users, through trial and error and association of these various sentences with the world, is the invariable meaning of the words. Against this “connection of denoted meanings” view, Śālikanātha and other Prābhākara philosophers, as discussed earlier, argue that what is remembered on hearing an individual word does not constitute a genuine meaning without its being connected to the other words—emphasizing the inferential element of meaning. Their view, the “designation of meanings-as-connected” (anvitābhidhāna), rejects the role of secondary meaning as a sentence-unifier.
Jayanta Bhaṭṭa, a Nyāya philosopher, takes up a third position, on which word-purport (tātparya) plays the unifying functional role. This sense of tātparya is different from later uses of the term to mean speaker intention. His theory of word-purport is accepted by Abhinavagupta who includes it in The Eye 1.4 among his list of functions (vṛtti-s) of language: the primary, secondary, word-purport, and suggestion (Graheli 2016). For both Jayanta and Abhinavagupta, the idea that the secondary meaning function is also responsible for sentential unity was unacceptable. Abhinavagupta summarizes the four capacities and their characteristics as
- Primary meaning (abhidhā) – conveys the individual word-meanings in their ordinary sense, according to convention
- Purport (tātparya) – conveys the entire sentence meaning which would not otherwise be intelligible
- Secondary meaning (lakṣaṇā) – along with factors like blocking the ordinary sense, conveys another meaning
- Suggestion (dhvani) – along with the hearer’s imaginative abilities, based on the first three powers, it suggests another meaning.
The crucial distinction between the “connection of denoted meanings” view and the two others is whether the secondary meaning function has a role to play before the sentence meaning is understood. Abhinavagupta explicitly says that it is not possible to have an obstacle for primary meaning without first understanding the syntactical connections among words. Thus secondary meaning can only occur after the capacity of purport. He distinguishes between nonsensical but syntactically acceptable sentences such as “There are a hundred elephants on the tip of my finger” and phrases which are syntactically faulty, “Ten pomegranates, six pancakes” (DL: 1.4b L, page 86).
Finally, Mukula Bhaṭṭa identifies a theory, most likely his own, which he calls “the combined view” (Keating 2019). It takes secondary meaning to apply both before and after sentence meaning. His understanding of secondary meaning is broader than both Śālikanātha and Abhinavagupta, as it does not always replace the primary meaning. So it can play the role of purport and can also encompass the function of suggestion. Thus, where the division between primary and secondary meaning is made, and how secondary meaning is characterized has important consequences for all these views of sentence meaning.
5.2 Scriptural Hermeneutics
Primary and secondary meaning, and the boundaries between them, figured significantly in discussion over scriptural interpretation. The topic is implicated in general discussions about how to approach hermeneutics, in particular by Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta philosophers. Particular doctrinal or philosophical positions presented in, for example, the Upaniṣads or the Vedas, are subject to scrutiny based on whether they should be taken literally or not. The Mīmāṃsā system of hermeneutics, as Rajendran (2001) and McCrea (2008) have shown, subsequently comes to influence the analysis of poetic meaning.
While he is not a Mīmāṃsaka (he is called a sarva-tantra-sva-tantra, someone for whom all systems are his own), even Vācaspati, in his Drop of Truth mentioned above, takes up the question of the impact of theories of secondary meaning on the interpretation of the Vedas. He is a proponent of the view that indication acts as “glue,” metaphorically speaking, and secures the relationship between word-meanings—but this might threaten the possibility that the Vedas convey meaning secondarily, since indication requires appeal to speaker intention to make sense. This, says his opponent, threatens Vedic authority. While Vācaspati’s initial dry remark is to say, well, so much for Vedic authority, he steps back by postulating that the ordinary use of elders (vrddhavyavahāra) lets us understand, lacking a genuine person who authors the words. He thus preserves the principle that Vedic and ordinary language are cut from the same cloth, as both require indication for sentence meaning (Sastri 2014; Phillips 2015).
In the Thorough Investigation of Truth (Tattvasamīkṣā), a commentary on Maṇḍana Miśra’s The Demonstration of Brahman (Brahmasiddhi), Vācaspati argues for the truth of the Upaniṣadic claim of non-duality between self and reality, against an interlocutor who would interpret the Upaniṣads in a figurative manner. At stake is the role of language in relationship to other sources of knowledge. The opponent objects to the conflict between sense perception and the putatively ordinary meaning of the Upaniṣads, since this would entail that sense perception—which delivers knowledge of a world apart from the self—is flawed. They argue that, when such conflicts arise, perception should prevail, and a figurative meaning should be preferred. Vācaspati objects on a number of grounds, first noting that there must be a relationship between a primary and secondary meaning (one cannot simply leap to a secondary meaning when it is convenient). Then he appeals to the principle already described in detail—when it is not possible to interpret the ordinary meaning in a sensible manner, this is the impetus for secondary meaning. Conflict with other knowledge sources is not the catalyst for figurative interpretation (Vācaspatimiśra, VT: 29–32).
5.3 Normative Implications
In addition to contentful philosophical implications, the distinction between primary and secondary meaning has an impact on how philosophy is done. For instance, NS 1.2.10ff, in outlining the appropriate terms of philosophical debate, defines the flaw of casuistry (vimāṃsa) as misusing words to mislead one’s opponent. There are a number of types of casuistry, one of which is figurative. Vātsyāyana, in his commentary (NBh 1.2.14), cites one of the stock examples of secondary meaning of the indicative type: “The stands are shouting.” Here, where the meaning is that people seated on wooden structures are shouting, it would be casuistry to reply, “No, the stands are not shouting, but the people are shouting.” This overly literal interlocutor pretends to misunderstand the speaker’s intention, and makes there to be conflict when there is none. Whether or not this kind of debate flaw is an importantly unique kind of casuistry (there is some discussion about this in the commentaries), Nyāya philosophers emphasize that verbal hair-splitting without charity towards one’s debate opponent constitutes a condemnable manner of intellectual speech (NS 1.2.2, Todeschini 2010).
We have already seen in section 4.2 that Jainas emphasize careful speech using the ordinary, not figurative, meanings of words. Mīmāṃsā has a similar emphasis on correct speech, especially in the context of Vedic rituals. The utterances of mantras—parts of the Veda which accompany ritual practice—had to be performed precisely in order to guarantee the efficacy of the procedure (and mispronunciation in a ritual context was equal to sinful lying). Thus the study of grammatical rules was important, as these included pronunciation and modification of words to fit a new context (declining nouns into the plural, adjusting utterances to incorporate different deity names, and so forth). Further, grammar was a corrective to ordinary use, which is only an imperfect a guide to correct interpretation of Vedic words. Distinguishing between commands in the primary sense of words and figurative language exhortations was also crucial for Mīmāṃsā, since the proper interpretation of the latter was relevant for the performance of the ritual. For example, the exhortation, “The grass-bedding is the ritual patron” (TV 1.4.13) is a case of secondary meaning of the qualitative type (gauṇavṛtti), which praises the central role of the ritual patron. Kumārila observes that misunderstanding this meaning would lead to absurdity, since the grass-bedding (a woven mat of grass on which ritual implements are placed) is burned up—and taking the phrase literally would mean putting an early stop to the ritual process if the patron himself were burned (Harikai 2017).
Finally, Aesthetics interweaves normative implications throughout. Poetry is not merely for pleasure, but incorporates moral figures (one is instructed to be like Rāma, the hero of the Rāmāyaṇa, and not like Rāvaṇa, the evil demon) and presupposes an entire moral structure. Abhinavagupta, in his independent works, takes up the theory of suggestion into the philosophy of Kashmir Śaivism, a tantric tradition which devotes itself to the deity Śiva. For Abhinavagupta, rasa is not merely an aesthetic phenomenon, but it is a profound sense of unity with transcendent reality, found in the rasa of peacefulness (śānti) which encompasses all others. Still, one need not go so far as Abhinavagupta’s work to see the normative dimension in Aesthetics, since even in Ānandavardhana’s more ordinary understanding of rasa, there are certain emotions which are appropriate to bring into existence, and others which ought to be avoided. What is appropriate is dependent on the character’s social position, gender, and so on. These norms also constrain the interpretive possibilities of suggested meaning, providing a conventional basis for the creative use of language.
See also the supplementary document on Names and Dates of Cited Indian Philosophers.
Primary Sanskrit Texts Cited
- Ānandavardhana, [DL], The Dhvanyāloka of Ānandavardhana with the Locana of Abhinavagupta, Daniel H.H. Ingalls (trans.), Number 49 in Harvard Oriental Series, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1990.
- Bhāmaha, [KB], Kāvyālaṅkāra of Bhamaha, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1970.
- Bhartṛhari, Vākyapadīya (Series: Abhandlungen für die Kunde des Morgenlandes, XLII, 4), R. Wilhelm, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1977.
- Dharmakīrti, [VN], Vādanyāya in The Vādanyāya of Dharmakīrti: The Logic of Debate, Pradeep Gokhale (trans.), Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1993.
- Jayanta Bhaṭṭa, [NM], Nyāyamañjarī, in Jayanta Bhaṭṭa’s Nyāya-Mañjarī: The Compendium of Indian Speculative Logic, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1978.
- Kumārila Bhaṭṭa, [ŚV], Ślokavārttikam of Kumārila Bhaṭṭa with the Commentary Nyāyaratnākara of Śrī Pārthasārathi Miśra, Ganganatha Jha (transl.), volume 1, 2, 3 of Chaukhamba Indological Studies. Delhi: Chaukhamba Sanskrit Pratishthan, 2009.
- Mukula Bhaṭṭa, Abhidhāvṛttamātṛkā, Malcolm Keating (trans.), Language, Meaning, and Use in Indian Philosophy: An Introduction to Mukula’s ‘Fundamentals of the Communicative Function.’ London: Bloomsbury, 2019.
- [NS], Nyāyasūtra, (with commentaries by Vātsyāyana, Uddyotakara, and Vācaspati Miśra). Nyāyadarśanam, A.M. Tarkatirtha, Taranatha Nyayatarkatirtha, and H.K. Tarkatirtha (eds), Calcutta Sanskrit Series 18. 1936–1944. Translated (with commentaries by Vātsyāyana and Uddyotakara) Ganganatha Jha, 1912–1919, 4 vols. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
- Patañjali, [VM], Patañjali’s Vyākaraṇamahābhāṣya, University of Pune, Pune, 1968.
- Śālikanātha, [PS], Prakaraṇapañcikā of Śālikanātha with an Exposition in English, New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research, 1934.
- Vācaspatimiśra, [VT], Vācaspatimiśra’s Tattvasamīkṣā The Earliest Commentary on Maṇḍana Miśra’s Brahmasiddhi, Number 25 in Nepal Research Centre Publications. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 2006.
- Vātsyāyana, Commentary [NBh], see [NS].
Secondary Literature Cited
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- Dasti, Matthew, and S. Phillips, 2017, The Nyāya-Sūtra: Selections with Early Commentaries, Indianapolis: Hackett.
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- Flügel, Peter, 2010, “Power and Insight in Jain Discourse,” in Piotr Balcerowicz (ed.), Logic and Belief in Indian Philosophy, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, pp. 79–209.
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- Graheli, Alessandro, 2016, “The Force of Tātparya: Bhaṭṭa Jayanta and Abhinavagupta” in Eli Franco and Isabelle Ratié (eds.), Around Abhinavagupta: Aspects of the Intellectual History of Kashmir from the Ninth to the Eleventh Century, Berlin: LIT, pp. 231–262.
- Harikai, Kunio, 2017, “Mīmāṃsaka Theory of Gauṇa or Metaphor from Śabarasvāmin to Kumārilabhaṭṭa” in Christopher Vielle et al (eds.), Dieux, génies, anges et démons dans les cultures orientales & Florilegium Indiae Orientalis. Jean-Marie Verpoorten in honorem, (Acta Orientalia Belgica 30), Brüssels: Peeters, pp. 279–297.
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- Keating, Malcolm, 2013, “Mukulabhaṭṭa’s Defense of Lakṣaṇā: How We Use Words to Mean Something Else, But Not Everything Else,” Journal of Indian Philosophy, 41(4): 439–461. doi:10.1007/s10781-013-9184-5
- Kelly John D., 1996, “What was Sanskrit For? Metadiscursive Strategies in Ancient India,” in Jan E.M. Houben (ed.), Ideology and Status of Sanskrit: Contributions to the history of the Sanskrit language, Leiden: Brill, pp. 87–108.
- Matilal, Bimal Krishna, 1971, Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis, Oxford: Oxford University Press. New edition in 2005, Jonardon Ganeri (ed.).
- –––, 1990, The Word and the World, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- McCrea, Lawrence, 2020, “Kumārila on the Role of Implicature in Sentence-Signification” in Alessandro Graheli (ed.), The Bloomsbury Research Handbook of Indian Philosophy of Language, London: Bloomsbury, pp. 353–360.
- McCrea, Lawrence, 2008, The Teleology of Poetics in Medieval Kashmir, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Ollett, Andrew, 2020a, “Rasa as Sentence Meaning” in Alessandro Graheli (ed.), The Bloomsbury Research Handbook of Indian Philosophy of Language, London: Bloomsbury, pp. 371–95.
- Ollett, Andrew, 2020b, “ Salikanatha’s Introduction to his Fundamentals of Sentence Meaning” in Alessandro Graheli (ed.), The Bloomsbury Research Handbook of Indian Philosophy of Language, London: Bloomsbury, pp. 251–77.
- Phillips, Stephen, 2015, “Seeing From the Other’s Point of View: Counter the Schismatic Interpretation of Vācaspati Miśra,” APA Newsletter on Asian and Asian-American Philosophers and Philosophy, 14(2): 4–8.
- Pollock, Sheldon, 2006, The Language of the Gods in the World of Men: Sanskrit, Culture, and Power in Premodern India, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2016, A Rasa Reader: Classical Indian Aesthetics, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Pound, Ezra, 1913, “In a Station of the Metro,” Poetry, April: 12.
- Priest, Graham, 2008, “Jaina Logic: A Contemporary Perspective,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 29(3): 263–278. doi:10.1080/01445340701690233
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- Rajendran, C., 2001, “Influence of Pūrvamīmāṃsā on Alaṃkāraśāstra,” Adyar Library Bulletin, 65: 73–82.
- Sastri, V.A. Ramaswami, 2014, “Tattva-bindu,” in Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies: Philosophy of Pūrva-Mīmāṃsā, Motilal Banarsidass, pp. 325–354.
- Schang, Fabien, 2013, “A One-Valued Logic for Non-One-Sidedness,” International Journal of Jaina Studies, 9(4): 1–25.
- Siderits, Mark, 1991, Indian Philosophy of Language, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
- –––, 2003 Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy: Empty Persons, Farnham, Surrey: Ashgate.
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Other Important Primary Works
- Dharmakīrti, Pramāṇavārttika (with the commentary of Manorathanandin), D. Sastri (ed.), Varanasi: Bauddha Bharati, 1968.
- Nāgārjuna, Vigrahavyāvartaṇī in Jan Westerhoff, 2010, The Dispeller of Disputes: Nagarjuna’s Vigrahavyavartani, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Rudraṭa, Kāvyâlaṅkāra, with the Ṭippaṇī of Namisādhu., Durgaprasad and Wasudev Laxman Sastri Pansikar (eds.), Bombay: Nirnaya Sagar Press, 1928.
Other Important Secondary Works
- Chakrabarti, A. and Bimal Krishna Matilal (eds.), 1994, Knowing from Words: Western and Indian Philosophical Analysis of Understanding and Testimony, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- Coward, Harold G. and K. Kunjunni Raja (eds.), 1990, The Philosophy of the Grammarians, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
- Scharf, Peter M., 1996, The Denotation of Generic Terms in Ancient Indian Philosophy: Grammar, Nyāya, and Mīmāṃsā, Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, American Philosophical Society, NS 86(3). doi:10.2307/1006608
- Staal, Frits, 1969, “Sanskrit Philosophy of Language,” in Murray B. Emeneau and Charles A. Fergusson (eds), Linguistics in South Asia (Current Trends in Linguistics, Volume 5, Thomas A. Sebeok (series ed.)), The Hague: Mouton.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Bibliography of Indic Texts, from the PANDiT Project, a collaborative Prosopographical Database of Indic Texts.
The author wishes to thank Ben Blumson, Josh Dever, Jeremy Henkel, Ethan Mills, and Timothy Lubin for their helpful comments on drafts of this article.