Language and Testimony in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Fri Aug 20, 2010; substantive revision Sat Jun 13, 2020

Speculations about the nature and function of language in India can be traced to its earliest period. These speculations are multi-faceted in that one detects many different strands of thought regarding language. Some of these speculations are about what one may call the principle of language, but others are about specific languages or specific uses of these languages. One sees speculations regarding the creation of language as well as the role of language in the creation of the universe. Language appears in relation to gods as well as humans, and occupies the entire width of a spectrum from being a divinity herself to being a means used by gods to create and control the world, and ultimately to being a means in the hands of the human beings to achieve their own religious as well as mundane purposes. Gradually, a whole range of questions are raised about all these various aspects of language in the evolving religious and philosophical traditions in India, traditions which shared some common conceptions, but thrived in full-blooded disagreements on major issues. Such disagreements relate to the ontological nature of language, its communicative role, the nature of meaning, and more specifically the nature of word-meaning and sentence-meaning. On the other hand, certain manifestations of language, whether in the form of specific languages like Sanskrit or particular scriptural texts like the Vedas, became topics of contestation between various philosophical and religious traditions. Finally, one must mention the epistemic role and value of language, its ability or inability to provide veridical knowledge about the world. In what follows, I intend to provide a brief account of these diverse developments in ancient, classical and medieval India. (For an approximate chronology of Indian philosophers, see the supplement.)

1. Pre-systematic conceptions of language in Vedic texts

The Vedic scriptural texts (1500–500 bce) consist of the four ancient collections, i.e., the Ṛgveda, the Sāmaveda, the Yajurveda, and the Atharvaveda. The next layer of Vedic texts, the Brāhmaṇas, consists of prose ritual commentaries that offer procedures, justifications, and explanations. The last two categories of Vedic literature are the Āraṇyakas, “Forest Texts”, and the Upaniṣads, “Secret Mystical Doctrines”.

The word saṃskṛta is not known as a label of a language variety during the Vedic period. The general term used for language in the Vedic texts is vāk, a word historically related to “voice”. The Vedic poet-sages perceived significant differences between their own language and the languages of the outsiders. Similarly, they perceived important differences between their own use of language in mundane contexts and the use of language directed toward Gods. The Gods are generically referred to by the term deva, and the language of the hymns is said to be devī vāk, “divine language.” This language is believed to have been created by the Gods themselves. The language thus created by the Gods is then spoken by the animate world in various forms. The divine language in its ultimate form is so mysterious that three-quarters of it are said to be hidden from the humans who have access only to a quarter of it. The Vedic poet-sages say that this divine language enters into their hearts and that they discover it through mystical introspection. Just as the language used by the Vedic poet-sages is the divine language, the language used by the non-Vedic people is said to be un-godly (adevī) or demonic (asuryā).

In the Vedic literature, one observes the development of mystical and ritual approaches to language. Language was perceived as an essential tool for approaching the gods, invoking them, asking their favors, and thus for the successful completion of a ritual performance. While the Gods were the powers that finally yielded the wishes of their human worshipers, one could legitimately look at the resulting reward as ensuing from the power of the religious language, or the power of the performing priest. This way, the language came to be looked upon as having mysterious creative powers, and as a divine power that needed to be propitiated before it could be successfully used to invoke other gods. This approach to language ultimately led to deification of language and the emergence of the Goddess of Speech (vāk devī), and a number of other gods who are called “Lord of Speech” (brahmaṇaspati, bṛhaspati, vākpati).

In contrast with the valorous deeds of the divine language, the language of the non-Vedic people neither yields fruit nor blossom (Ṛgveda, 10.71.5). “Yielding fruit and blossom” is a phrase indicative of the creative power of speech that produces the rewards for the worshiper. From being a created but divine entity, the speech rises to the heights of being a divinity in her own right and eventually to becoming the substratum of the existence of the whole universe. The deification of speech is seen in hymn 10.125 of the Ṛgveda where the Goddess of Speech sings her own glory. In this hymn, one no longer hears of the creation of the speech, but one begins to see the speech as a primordial divinity that creates and controls other gods, sages, and the human beings. Here the goddess of speech demands worship in her own right, before her powers may be used for other purposes. The mystery of language is comprehensible only to a special class of people, the wise Brāhmaṇas, while the commoners have access to and understanding of only a limited portion of this transcendental phenomenon.

The “Lord of Speech” divinities typically emerge as creator divinities, e.g., Brahmā, Bṛhaspati, and Brahmaṇaspati, and the word brahman which earlier refers, with differing accents, to the creative incantation and the priest, eventually comes to assume in the Upaniṣads the meaning of the creative force behind the entire universe. While the Vedic hymns were looked upon as being crafted by particular poet-sages in the earlier period, gradually a rising perception of their mysterious power and their preservation by the successive generations led to the emergence of a new conception of the scriptural texts. Already in the late parts of the Ṛgveda (10.90.9), we hear that the verses (ṛk), the songs (sāma), and the ritual formulas (yajus) arose from the primordial sacrifice offered by the gods. They arose from the sacrificed body of the cosmic person, the ultimate ground of existence. This tendency of increasingly looking at the scriptural texts as not being produced by any human authors takes many forms in subsequent religious and philosophical materials, finally leading to a wide-spread notion that the Vedas are not authored by any human beings (apauruṣeya), and are in fact uncreated and eternal, beyond the cycles of creation and destruction of the world. In late Vedic texts, we hear the notion that the real Vedas are infinite (ananta) and that the Vedas known to human poet-sages are a mere fraction of the real infinite Vedas.

In the late Vedic traditions of the Brāhmaṇas, we are told that there is perfection of the ritual form (rūpasamṛddhi) when a recited incantation echoes the ritual action that is being performed. This shows a notion that ideally there should be a match between the contents of a ritual formula and the ritual action in which it is recited, further suggesting a notion that language mirrors the external world in some way. In the Āraṇyakas and Upaniṣads, language acquires importance in different ways. The Upaniṣads, emphasizing the painful nature of cycles of rebirths, point out that the ideal goal should be to put an end to these cycles of birth and rebirth and to find one’s permanent identity with the original ground of the universal existence, i.e., Brahman. The term brahman, originally referring to creative ritual chants and the chanters, has now acquired this new meaning, the ultimate creative force behind the universe. As part of the meditative practice, one is asked to focus on the sacred syllable OM, which is the symbolic linguistic representation of Brahman. Here the language, in the form of OM, becomes an important tool for the attainment of one’s mystical union with Brahman. The Sanskrit word akṣara refers to a syllable, but it also means “indestructible.” Thus, the word akṣara allowed the meditational use of the holy syllable OM to ultimately lead to one’s experiential identity with the indestructible reality of Brahman.

The role of language and scripture in the Upaniṣadic mode of religious life is complicated. Here, the use of language to invoke the Vedic gods becomes a lower form of religious practice. Can Brahman be reached through language? Since Brahman is beyond all characterizations and all modes of human perception, no linguistic expression can properly describe it. Hence all linguistic expressions and all knowledge framed in language are deemed to be inadequate for the purpose of reaching Brahman. In fact, it is silence that characterizes Brahman, and not words. Even so, the use of OM-focused meditation is emphasized, at least in the pre-final stages of Brahman-realization.

By the time we come to the classical philosophical systems in India, one more assumption is made by almost all Hindu systems, i.e., that all the Vedas together form a coherent whole. The human authorship of the Vedic texts has long been rejected, and they are now perceived either as being entirely uncreated and eternal or created by God at the beginning of each cycle of creation. Under the assumption that they are entirely uncreated, their innate ability to convey truthful meaning is unhampered by human limitations. Thus if all the Vedic texts convey truth, there cannot be any internal contradictions. If an omniscient God, who by his very nature is compassionate and beyond human limitations, created the Vedas, one reaches the same conclusion, i.e., there cannot be any internal contradictions. The traditional interpretation of the Vedas proceeds under these assumptions. If there are seeming contradictions in Vedic passages, the burden of finding ways to remove those seeming contradictions is upon the interpreter, but there can be no admission of internal contradictions in the texts themselves.

2. Conception of Language among Sanskrit grammarians

Before the emergence of the formalized philosophical systems or the darśanas, we see a number of philosophical issues relating to language implicitly and explicitly brought out by the early Sanskrit grammarians, namely Pāṇini, Kātyāyana and Patañjali. Pāṇini (400 bce) composed his grammar of Sanskrit with a certain notion of Sanskrit as an atemporal language. For him, there were regional dialects of Sanskrit, as well as variation of usage in its scriptural (chandas) and contemporary (bhāṣā) domains. All these domains are treated as sub-domains of a unified language, which is not restricted by any temporality.

Patañjali’s Mahābhāṣya refers to the views of Vyāḍi and Vājapyāyana on the meaning of words. Vyāḍi argued that words like “cow” denote individual instances of a certain class, while Vājapyāyana argued that words like “cow” denote generic properties or class properties (ākṛti), such as cowness, that are shared by all members of certain classes. Patañjali presents a long debate on the extreme positions in this argument, and finally concludes that both the individual instances and the class property must be included within the range of meaning. The only difference between the two positions is about which aspect, the individual or the class property, is denoted first, and which is understood subsequently. This early debate indicates philosophical positions that get expanded and fully argued in the traditions of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas and the Mīmāṃsakas.

The early commentators on Pāṇini’s grammar from the late Mauryan and post-Mauryan periods, Kātyāyana and Patañjali (200–100 bce), display a significant reorganization of Brahmanical views in the face of opposition from Jains and Buddhists. For Kātyāyana and Patañjali, the Sanskrit language at large is sacred like the Vedas. The intelligent use of Sanskrit, backed by the explicit understanding of its grammar, leads to prosperity here and in the next world, as do the Vedas. Kātyāyana and Patañjali admit that vernaculars as well as Sanskrit could do the function of communicating meaning. However, only the usage of Sanskrit produces religious merit. This is an indirect criticism of the Jains and the Buddhists, who used vernacular languages for the propagation of their faiths. The grammarians did not accept the religious value of the vernaculars. The vernacular languages, along with the incorrect uses of Sanskrit, are all lumped together by the Sanskrit grammarians under the derogatory terms apaśabda and apabhraṃśa, both of which suggest a view that the vernaculars are degenerate or “fallen” forms of the divine language, i.e., Sanskrit. Kātyāyana says: “While the relationship between words and meanings is established on the basis of the usage of specific words to denote specific meanings in the community of speakers, the science of grammar only makes a regulation concerning the religious merit produced by the linguistic usage, as is commonly done in worldly matters and in Vedic rituals” (first Vārttika on the Aṣṭādhyāyī). Kātyāyana refers to these “degenerate” vernacular usages as being caused by the inability of the low-class speakers to speak proper Sanskrit. The grammarians tell the story of demons that used improper degenerate usages during their ritual and hence were defeated.

The relationship between Sanskrit words and their meanings is said to be established (siddha) and taken as given by the grammarians. Patañjali understands this statement of Kātyāyana to mean that the relationship between Sanskrit words and their meanings is eternal (nitya), not created (kārya) by anyone. Since this eternal relationship, according to these grammarians, exists only for Sanskrit words and their meanings, one cannot accord the same status to the vernaculars, which are born of an inability on the part of their speakers to speak proper Sanskrit.

While Pāṇini uses the term prakṛti to refer to the derivationally original state of a word or expression before changes effected by grammatical operations are applied, Kātyāyana and Patañjali use the term vikṛta to refer to the derivationally transformed segment. However, change and identity are not compatible within more rigid metaphysical frameworks, and this becomes apparent in the following discussion. In his Vārttikas or comments on Pāṇini’s grammar, Kātyāyana says that one could have argued that an item partially transformed does not yet lose its identity (Vārttika 10 on P. 1.1.56). But such an acceptance would lead to non-eternality (anityatva) of language (Vārttika 11, Mahābhāṣya, I, p. 136), and that is not acceptable. Patañjali asserts that words in reality are eternal (nitya), and that means they must be absolutely free from change or transformation and fixed in their nature. If words are truly eternal, one cannot then say that a word was transformed and is yet the same. This points to the emerging ideological shifts in philosophical traditions, which make their headway into the tradition of grammar, and finally lead to the development of newer conceptions within the tradition of grammar and elsewhere.

In trying to figure out how the emerging doctrine of nityatva (“permanence”, “immutability”) of language causes problems with the notion of transformation (vikāra) and how these problems are eventually answered by developing new concepts, we should note two issues, i.e., temporal fixity or flexibility of individual sounds, and the compatibility of the notion of sequence of sounds, or utterance as a process stretched in time. From within the new paradigm of nityatva or eternality of sounds, Kātyāyana concludes that the true sounds (varṇa) are fixed in their nature in spite of the difference of speed of delivery (Vārttika 5 on P. 1.1.70, Mahābhāṣya, I, p. 181). The speed of delivery (vṛtti) results from the slow or fast utterance of a speaker (vacana), though the true sounds are permanently fixed in their nature. Here, Kātyāyana broaches a doctrine that is later developed further by Patañjali, and more fully by Bhartṛhari. It argues for a dual ontology. There are the fixed true sounds (varṇa), and then there are the uttered sounds (vacana, “utterance”). It is Patañjali who uses, for the first time as far as we know, the term sphoṭa to refer to Kātyāyana’s “true sounds which are fixed” (avasthitā varṇāḥ) and the term dhvani (“uttered sounds”). Patañjali adds an important comment to Kātyāyana’s discussion. He says that the real sound (śabda) is thus the sphoṭa (“the sound as it initially breaks out into the open”), and the quality [length or speed] of the sound is part of dhvani (“sound as it continues”) (Mahābhāṣya, I, p. 181). The term sphoṭa refers to something like exploding or coming into being in a bang. Thus it refers to the initial production or perception of sound. On the other hand, the stretching of that sound seems to refer to the dimension of continuation. Patañjali means to say that it is the same sound, but it may remain audible for different durations.

This raises the next problem that the grammarians must face: can a word be understood as a sequence or a collection of sounds? Kātyāyana says that one cannot have a sequence or a collection of sounds, because the process of speech proceeds sound-by-sound, and that sounds perish as soon as they are uttered. Thus, one cannot have two sounds co-existing at a given moment to relate to each other. Since the sounds perish as soon as they are uttered, a sound cannot have another co-existent companion (Vārttikas 9 and 10 on P. 1.4.109). Kātyāyana points out all these difficulties, but it is Patañjali who offers a solution to this philosophical dilemma. Patañjali suggests that one can pull together impressions of all the uttered sounds and then think of a sequence in this mentally constructed image of a word (Mahābhaṣya, I, p. 356). Elsewhere, Patañjali says that a word is perceived through the auditory organ, discerned through one’s intelligence, and brought into being through its utterance (Mahābhaṣya, I, p. 18). While Patañjali’s solution overcomes the transitoriness of the uttered sounds, and the resulting impossibility of a sequence, there is no denial of sequentiality or perhaps of an imprint of sequentiality in the comprehended word, and there is indeed no claim to its absolutely unitary or partless character. Patañjali means to provide a solution to the perception of sequentiality through his ideas of a mental storage of comprehension. But at the same time, this mental storage and the ability to view this mental image allows one to overcome the difficulty of non-simultaneity and construct a word or a linguistic unit as a collection of perceived sounds or words, as the case may be. Kātyāyana and Patañjali specifically admit the notion of samudāya (“collection”) of sounds to represent a word and a collection of words to represent a phrase or a sentence (Vārttika 7 on P. 2.2.29). Thus, while the ontology of physical sounds does not permit their co-existence, their mental images do allow it, and once they can be perceived as components of a collection, one also recognizes the imprint of the sequence in which they were perceived. Neither Kātyāyana nor Patañjali explicitly claim any higher ontological status to these word-images. However, the very acceptance of such word-images opens up numerous explanatory possibilities.

Although Kātyāyana and Patañjali argue that the notion of change or transformation of parts of words was contradictory to the doctrine of nityatva (“permanence”) of language, they were not averse to the notion of substitution. The notion of substitution was understood as a substitution, not of a part of a word by another part, but of a whole word by another word, and this especially as a conceptual rather than an ontological replacement. Thus, in going from “bhavati” to “bhavatu”, Pāṇini prescribes the change of “i” of “ti” to “u” (cf. P.3.4.86: “er uḥ”). Thus, “i” changes to “u”, leading to the change of “ti” to “tu”, and this consequently leads to the change of “bhavati” to “bhavatu”. For Kātyāyana and Patañjali, the above atomistic and transformational understanding of Pāṇini’s procedure goes contrary to the doctrine of nityatva (“permanence”) of words. Therefore, they suggest that it is actually the substitution of the whole word “bhavati” by another whole word “bhavatu”, each of these two words being eternal in its own right. Additionally they assert that this is merely a notional change and not an ontological change, i.e., a certain item is found to occur, where one expected something else to occur. There is no change of an item x into an item y, nor does one remove the item x and place y in its place (Vārttikas 12 and 14 on P. 1.1.56). This discussion seems to imply a sort of unitary character to the words, whether notional or otherwise, and this eventually leads to a movement toward a kind of akhaṇḍa-pada-vāda (“the doctrine of partless words”) in the Vākyapadīya of Bhartṛhari. While one must admit that the seeds for such a conception may be traced in these discussions in the Mahābhāṣya, Patañjali is actually not arguing so much against words having parts, as against the notion of change or transformation (Mahābhāṣya on P. 1.2.20, I, p. 75).

Kātyāyana and Patañjali clearly view words as collections of sounds. Besides using the term “samudāya” for such a collection, they also use the word “varṇasaṃghāta” (“collection of sounds”). They argue that words are built by putting together sounds, and that, while the words are meaningful, the component sounds are not meaningful in themselves. The notion of a word as a collection (saṃghāta) applies not only in the sense that it is a collection of sounds, but also in the sense that complex formations are collections of smaller morphological components.

This leads us to consider the philosophical developments in the thought of Bhartṛhari (400 ce), and especially his departures from the conceptions seen in Kātyāyana and Patañjali. Apart from his significant contribution toward an in depth philosophical understanding of issues of the structure and function of language, and issues of phonology, semantics and syntax, Bhartṛhari is well known for his claim that language constitutes the ultimate principle of reality (śabdabrahman). Both the signifier words and the signified entities in the world are perceived to be a transformation (pariṇāma) of the ultimate unified principle of language.

For Kātyāyana and Patañjali, the level of padas (“inflected words”) is the basic level of language for grammar. These words are freely combined by the users to form sentences or phrases. The words are not derived by Kātyāyana and Patañjali by abstracting them from sentences by using the method of anvaya-vyatireka (“concurrent occurrence and concurrent absence”) (Vārttika 9 on P. 1.2.45). On the other hand, they claim that a grammarian first derives stems and affixes by applying the procedure of abstraction to words, and then in turn puts these stems and affixes through the grammatical process of derivation (saṃskāra) to build the words. Here, Kātyāyana and Patañjali do make a distinction between the levels of actual usage (vacana) and technical grammatical analysis and derivation. While full-fledged words (pada) occur at the level of usage, their abstracted morphological components do not occur by themselves at that level. However, they do not seem to suggest that the stems, roots, and affixes are purely imagined (kalpita).

Bhartṛhari has substantially moved beyond Kātyāyana and Patañjali. For him, the linguistically given entity is a sentence. Everything below the level of sentence is derived through a method of abstraction referred to by the term anvaya-vyatireka or apoddhāra. Additionally, for Bhartṛhari, elements abstracted through this procedure have no reality of any kind. They are kalpita (“imagined”) (Vākyapadīya, III, 14, 75–76). Such abstracted items have instructional value for those who do not yet have any intuitive insight into the true nature of speech (Vākyapadīya, II. 238). The true speech unit, the sentence, is an undivided singularity and so is its meaning which is comprehended in an instantaneous cognitive flash (pratibhā), rather than through a deliberative and/or sequential process. Consider the following verse of the Vākyapadīya (II.10):

Just as stems, affixes etc. are abstracted from a given word, so the abstraction of words from a sentence is justified.

Here, the clause introduced by “just as” refers to the older more widely prevalent view seen in the Mahābhāṣya. With the word “so,” Bhartṛhari is proposing an analogical extension of the procedure of abstraction (apoddhāra) to the level of a sentence.

Without mentioning Patañjali or Kātyāyana by name, Bhartṛhari seems to critique their view that the meaning of a sentence, consisting of the interrelations between the meanings of individual words, is essentially not derived from the constituent words themselves, but from the whole sentence as a collection of words. The constituent words convey their meaning first, but their interrelations are not communicated by the words themselves, but by the whole sentence as a unit. This view of Kātyāyana and Patañjali is criticized by Bhartṛhari (Vākyapadīya II.15–16, 41–42). It is clear that Bhartṛhari’s ideas do not agree with the views expressed by Kātyāyana and Patañjali, and that the views of these two earlier grammarians are much closer, though not identical, with the views later maintained by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas and Mīmāṃsakas. For Bhartṛhari, the sentence as a single partless unit conveys its entire unitary meaning in a flash, and this unitary meaning as well as the unitary sentence are subsequently analyzed by grammarians into their assumed or imagined constituents.

Finally, we should note that Bhartṛhari’s views on the unitary character of a sentence and its meaning were found to be generally unacceptable by the schools of Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, as well as by the later grammarian-philosophers like Kauṇḍabhaṭṭa and Nāgeśabhaṭṭa. Their discussion of the comprehension of sentence-meaning is not couched in terms of Bhartṛhari’s instantaneous flash of intuition (pratibhā), but in terms of the conditions of ākāṅkṣā (“mutual expectancy”), yogyatā (“compatibility)”, and āsatti (“contiguity of words”). In this sense, the later grammarian-philosophers are somewhat closer to the spirit of Kātyāyana and Patañjali.

3. General philosophical approaches to the status of Vedic scriptures

Early Vedic notions about the authorship of the Vedic hymns are different from philosophical views. Vedic hymns use words like kāru (“craftsman”) to describe the poet, and the act of producing a hymn is described as (Ṛgveda 10.71.2): “Like cleansing barley with a sieve, the wise poets created the speech with their mind”. The poets of the Vedic hymns are also called mantrakṛt (“makers of hymns”). Further, each hymn of the Veda is associated with a specific poet-priest and often with a family of poet-priests. But, already in the Ṛgveda, there are signs of the beginning of an impersonal conception of the origin of the Vedas. For instance, the famous Puruṣa-hymn of the Ṛgveda describes the hymns of the Ṛgveda, the formulae of Yajus and the songs of Sāman as originating from the primordial sacrifice of the cosmic being (Ṛgveda 10.90.9). This trend to ascribe impersonal origin to the Vedas gets further accentuated in the Brāhmaṇas and the Upaniṣads.

Later Hindu notions about the Vedic scriptures and their authority are in part reflections of Hindu responses to the criticisms of the Vedas launched by the Buddhists and the Jains. The early Buddhist critique of the Vedas targets the authors of the Vedic hymns. Vedic sages like Vasiṣṭha, Viśvāmitra, and Bhṛgu are described as the ancient authors of the mantras (porāṇā mantānaṃ kattāro), but they are criticized as being ignorant of the true path to the union with Brahmā (Tevijjasutta; Dīghanikāya; Suttapiṭaka). So the Vedas are depicted as being words of ignorant human beings who do not even recognize their own ignorance. How can one trust such authors or their words? The Buddhist and the Jain traditions also rejected the notion of God, and hence any claim that the Vedas were words of God, and hence authoritative, was not acceptable to them. On the other hand, the Jain and the Buddhist traditions claimed that their leading spiritual teachers like Mahāvīra and Buddha were omniscient (sarvajña) and were compassionate toward humanity at large, and hence their words were claimed to be authoritative.

Beginning around 200 bce, Hindu ritualists (Mīmāṃsakas) and logicians (Naiyāyikas and Vaiśeṣikas) began to defend their religious faith in the Vedas and in the Brahmanical religion with specific arguments. Some of these arguments have precursors in the discussions of the early Sanskrit grammarians, Kātyāyana and Patañjali. The Mīmāṃsakas accepted the arguments of the Buddhists and the Jains that one need not accept the notion of a creator-controller God. However, the Mīmāṃsakas attempted to defend the Vedas against the criticism that the ancient human sages who authored the hymns of the Vedas were ignorant, while the figures like the Buddha and Mahāvīra were omniscient. They contested the notion of an omniscient person (sarvajña), and argued that no humans could be omniscient and free from ignorance, passion, and deceit. Therefore, the Buddha and Mahāvīra could not be free from these faults either, and hence their words cannot be trusted. On the other hand, the Vedas were claimed to be eternal and intrinsically meaningful words, uncreated by any human being (apauruṣeya). Since they were not created by human beings, they were free from the limitations and faults of human beings. Yet the Vedas were meaningful, because the relationship between words and meanings was claimed to be innate. The Vedas were ultimately seen as ordaining the performance of sacrifices. The Mīmāṃsakas developed a theory of sentence-meaning which claimed that the meaning of a sentence centers around some specific action denoted by a verb-root and an injunction expressed by the verbal terminations. Thus, language, especially the scriptural language, primarily orders us to engage in appropriate actions.

In this connection, we may note that Mīmāṃsā and other systems of Hindu philosophy developed a notion of linguistic expression as one of the sources of authoritative knowledge (śabdapramāṇa), when other more basic sources of knowledge like sense perception (pratyakṣa) and inference (anumāna) are not available. Particularly, in connection with religious duty (dharma), and heaven (svarga) as the promised reward, only the Veda is available as the source of authoritative knowledge. For Mīmāṃsā, the Veda as a source of knowledge is not tainted by negative qualities like ignorance and malice that could affect a normal human speaker.

To understand the Mīmāṃsā doctrine of the eternality of the Vedas, we need to note that eternality implies the absence of both a beginning and an end. In Indian philosophy, two kinds of persistence are distinguished, namely the ever unchanging persistence (kūṭastha-nityatā), like that of a rock, and the continuous and yet incessantly changing existence of a stream like that of a river (pravāha-nityatā). The persistence claimed for the Vedas by the Mīmāṃsakas would appear to be of the kūṭastha (“unchanging persistence”) kind, while its continuous study from time immemorial would be of the pravāha-nitya (“fluid persistence”) kind. Further, the meanings which the words signify are natural to the words, not the result of convention. Mīmāṃsā does not think that the association of a particular meaning with a word is due to conventions among people who introduce and give meanings to the words. Further, words signify only universals. The universals are eternal. Words do not signify particular entities of any kind which come into being and disappear, but the corresponding universals which are eternal and of which the transient individuals are mere instances. Further, not only are the meanings eternal, the words are also eternal. All words are eternal. If one utters the word “chair” ten times, is one uttering the same word ten times? The Mīmāṃsakas say that, if the word is not the same, then it cannot have the same meaning. The word and the meaning both being eternal, the relation between them also is necessarily so. An important argument with which the eternality of the Vedas is secured is that of the eternality of the sounds of a language.

The Mīmāṃsā conceives of an unbroken and beginningless Vedic tradition. No man or God can be considered to be the very first teacher of the Veda or the first receiver of it, because the world is beginningless. It is conceivable that, just as at present, there have always been teachers teaching and students studying the Veda. For the Mīmāṃsakas, the Vedas are not words of God. In this view, they seem to accept the Buddhist and the Jain critique of the notion of God. There is no need to assume God. Not only is there no need to assume that God was the author of the Vedas, there is no need to assume a God at all. God is not required as a Creator, for the universe was never created. Nor is God required as the Dispenser of Justice, for karman brings its own fruits. And one does not need God as the author of the Vedas, since they are eternal and uncreated to begin with. The Ṛṣis, Vedic sages, did not compose the Vedas. They merely saw them, and, therefore, the scriptures are free from the taint of mortality implicit in a human origin. The Mīmāṃsā notion of the authority of the authorless Veda also depends upon their epistemic theory, that claims that all received cognitions are intrinsically valid (svataḥ pramāṇa), unless and until they are falsified by subsequent cognitions of higher order.

The traditions of the Naiyāyikas and the Vaiśeṣikas strongly disagreed with the views of the Mīmāṃsakas and they developed their own distinctive conceptions of language, meaning, and scriptural authority. They agreed with the Mīmāṃsakas that the Vedas were a source of authoritative knowledge (śabda-pramāṇa), and yet they offered a different set of reasons. According to them, only the words of a trustworthy speaker (āpta) are a source of authoritative knowledge. They joined the Mīmāṃsakas in arguing that no humans, including Buddha and Mahāvīra, are free from ignorance, passion, etc., and no humans are omniscient, and therefore the words of no human being could be accepted as infallible. However, they did not agree with the Mīmāṃsakas in their rejection of the notion of God. In the metaphysics of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition, the notion of God plays a central role. In defending the notion of God (as in the Nyāyakusumāñjali of Udayana), they claimed that God was the only being in the universe that was omniscient and free from the faults of ignorance and malice. He was a compassionate being. Therefore, only the words of God could be infallible, and therefore be trusted. For the Naiyāyikas and Vaiśeṣikas, the Vedas were words of God, and not the words of human sages about God. The human sages only received the words of God in their meditative trances, but they had no authorship role.

On a different level, this argument came to mean that God only spoke in Sanskrit, and hence Sanskrit alone was the language of God, and that it was the best means to approach God. God willfully established a connection between each Sanskrit word and its meaning, saying “let this word refer to this thing.” Such a connection was not established by God for vernacular languages, which were only fallen forms of Sanskrit, and hence the vernaculars could not become vehicles for religious and spiritual communication. The Naiyāyikas argued that vernacular words did not even have legitimate meanings of their own. They claimed that the vernacular words reminded the listener of the corresponding Sanskrit words that communicated the meaning.

4. Language and Meaning

The term artha in Sanskrit is used to denote the notion of meaning. However, the meaning of this term ranges from a real object in the external world referred to by the word to a mere concept of an object which may or may not correspond to anything in the external world. The differences regarding what meaning is are argued out by the philosophical schools of Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā, various schools of Buddhism, Sanskrit grammar, and poetics. Among these schools, the schools of Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, and Mīmāṃsā have realist ontologies. Mīmāṃsā focuses mainly on interpreting the Vedic scriptures. Buddhist thinkers generally pointed to language as depicting a false picture of reality. Sanskrit grammarians were more interested in language and communication than in ontology, while Sanskrit poetics focused on the poetic dimensions of meaning.

The modern distinction of “sense” versus “reference” is somewhat blurred in the Sanskrit discussions of the notion of meaning. The question Indian philosophers seem to raise is “what does a word communicate?” They were also interested in detecting if there was some sort of sequence in which different aspects of layers of meaning were communicated. Generally, the notion of meaning is further stratified into three or four types. First there is the primary meaning, something that is directly and immediately communicated by a word. If the primary meaning is inappropriate in a given context, then one moves to a secondary meaning, an extension of the primary meaning. Beyond this is the suggested meaning, which may or may not be the same as the meaning intended by the speaker.

The various Indian theories of meaning are closely related to the overall stances taken by the different schools. Among the factors which influence the notion of meaning are the ontological and epistemological views of a school, its views regarding the role of God and scripture, its specific focus on a certain type of discourse, and its ultimate purpose in theorizing.

In the Western literature on the notion of meaning in the Indian tradition, various terms such as “sense,” “reference,” “denotation,” “connotation,” “designatum,” and “intension” have been frequently used to render the Sanskrit term artha. However, these terms carry specific nuances of their own, and no single term adequately conveys the idea of artha. Artha basically refers to the object signified by a word. In numerous contexts, the term stands for an object in the sense of an element of external reality. For instance, Patañjali says that when a word is pronounced, an artha “object” is understood. For example: “bring in a bull”, “eat yogurt”, etc. It is the artha that is brought in and it is also the artha that is eaten.

The schools of Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika set up an ontology containing substances, qualities, actions, relations, generic and particular properties, etc. With this realistic ontology in mind, they argue that if the relation between a word and its artha (“meaning”) were a natural ontological relation, there should be real experiences of burning and cutting in one’s mouth after hearing words like “agni” (“fire”) and “asi” (“sword”). Therefore, this relationship must be a conventional relationship (saṃketa), the convention being established by God as part of his initial acts of creation. The relationship between a word and the object it refers to is thought to be the desire of God that such and such a word should refer to such and such an object. It is through this established conventional relationship that a word reminds the listener of its meaning. The school of Mīmāṃsā represents the tradition of the exegesis of the Vedic texts. However, in the course of discussing and perfecting principles of interpretation, this system developed a full-scale theory of ontology and an important theory of meaning. For the Mīmāṃsakas, the primary tenet is that the Vedic scriptural texts are eternal and uncreated, and that they are meaningful. For this orthodox system, which remarkably defends the scripture but dispenses with the notion of God, the relationship between a word and its meaning is an innate eternal relationship. For both Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas and Mīmāṃsakas, language refers to external states of the world and not just to conceptual constructions.

The tradition of grammarians, beginning with Bhartṛhari, seems to have followed a middle path between the realistic theories of reference (bāhyārthavāda) developed by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Mīmāṃsā on the one hand, and the notional/conceptual meaning (vikalpa) of the Buddhists on the other. For the grammarians, the meaning of a word is closely related to the level of understanding. Whether or not things are real, we do have concepts. These concepts form the content of a person’s cognitions derived from language. Without necessarily denying or affirming the external reality of objects in the world, grammarians claimed that the meaning of a word is only a projection of intellect (bauddhārtha, buddhipratibhāsa). The examples offered by Sanskrit grammarians such as “śaśaśṛṅga” (“horn of a rabbit”) and “vandhyāsuta” (“son of a barren woman”) remain meaningful within this theory. Sanskrit grammarians are thus not concerned with ontological or truth functional values of linguistic expressions. For them the truth of an expression and its meaningfulness are not to be equated.

By the middle of the second millennium of the Christian era, certain uniformity came about in the technical terminology used by different schools. The prominent schools in this period are the new school of Nyāya initiated by Gaṅgeśa, the schools of Mīmāṃsā, Vedānta, and Sanskrit grammar. While all these schools are engaged in pitched battles against each other, they seem to accept the terminological lead of the neo-logicians, the Navya-Naiyāyikas. Following the discussion of the term artha by the neo-logician Gadādharabhaṭṭa, we can state the general framework of a semantic theory. Other schools accept this general terminology, with some variations.

It may be said that the term artha (“meaning”) stands for the object or content of a verbal cognition or a cognition that results from hearing a word (śābda-bodha-viṣaya). Such a verbal cognition results from the cognition of a word (śābda-jñāna) on the basis of an awareness of the signification function pertaining to that word (pada-niṣṭha-vṛtti-jñāna). Depending upon the kind of signification function (vṛtti) involved in the emergence of the verbal cognition, the meaning belongs to a distinct type. In general terms:

  1. When a verbal cognition results from the primary signification function (śakti / abhidhāvṛtti / mukhyavṛtti) of a word, the object or content of that verbal cognition is called primary meaning (śakyārtha / vācyārtha / abhidheya).
  2. When a verbal cognition results from the secondary signification function (lakṣaṇāvṛtti / guṇavṛtti) of a word, the object or content of that verbal cognition is called secondary meaning (lakṣyārtha).
  3. When a verbal cognition results from the suggestive signification function (vyañjanāvṛtti) of a word, the object or content of that verbal cognition is called suggested meaning (vyaṅgyārtha / dhvanitārtha).
  4. When a verbal cognition results from the intentional signification function (tātparyavṛtti) of a word, the object or content of that verbal cognition is called intended meaning (tātparyārtha).

Not all the different schools of Indian philosophy accept all of these different kinds of signification functions for words, and they hold substantially different views on the nature of words, meanings, and the relations between words and meanings. However, the above terminology holds true, in general, for most of the medieval schools. Let us note some of the important differences. Mīmāṃsā claims that the sole primary meaning of the word “bull” is the generic property or the class property (jāti) such as bull-ness, while the individual object which possesses this generic property, i.e., a particular bull, is only secondarily and subsequently understood from the word “bull”. The school called Kevalavyaktivāda argues that a particular individual bull is the sole primary meaning of the word “bull,” while the generic property bull-ness is merely a secondary meaning. Nyāya argues that the primary meaning of a word is an individual object qualified by a generic property (jāti-viśiṣṭa-vyakti), both being perceived simultaneously.

Sanskrit grammarians distinguish between various different kinds of meanings (artha). The term artha stands for an external object (vastumātra), as well as for the object that is intended to be signified by a word (abhidheya). The latter, i.e., meaning in a linguistic sense, could be meaning in a technical context (śāstrīya), such as the meaning of an affix or a stem, or it may be meaning as understood by people in actual communication (laukika). Then there is a further difference. Meaning may be something directly intended to be signified by an expression (abhidheya), or it could be something which is inevitably signified (nāntarīyaka) when something else is really the intended meaning. Everything that is understood from a word on the basis of some kind of signification function (vṛtti) is covered by the term artha. Different systems of Indian philosophy differ from each other on whether a given cognition is derived from a word on the basis of a signification function (vṛtti), through inference (anumāna), or presumption (arthāpatti). If a particular item of information is deemed to have been derived through inference or presumption, it is not included in the notion of word-meaning.

The scope of the term artha is actually not limited in Sanskrit texts to what is usually understood as the domain of semantics in the western literature. It covers elements such as gender (liṅga) and number (saṃkhyā). It also covers the semantic-syntactic roles (kāraka) such as agent-ness (kartṛtva) and object-ness (karmatva). Tenses such as the present, past, and future, and the moods such as the imperative and optative are also traditionally included in the arthas signified by a verb root, or an affix. Another aspect of the concept of artha is revealed in the theory of dyotyārtha (“co-signified”) meaning. According to this theory, to put it in simple terms, particles such as ca (“and”) do not have any lexical or primary meaning. They are said to help other words used in construction with them to signify some special aspects of their meaning. For instance, in the phrase “John and Tom”, the meaning of grouping is said to be not directly signified by the word “and”. The theory of dyotyārtha argues that grouping is a specific meaning of the two words “John” and “Tom”, but that these two words are unable to signify this meaning if used by themselves. The word “and” used along with these two words is said to work as a catalyst that enables them to signify this special meaning. The problem of use and mention of words is also handled by Sanskrit grammarians by treating the phonological form of the word itself to be a part of the meaning it signifies. This is a unique way of handling this problem.

6. Different views regarding sentence-meaning

Most schools of Indian philosophy have an atomistic view of meaning and the meaning-bearing linguistic unit. This means that a sentence is put together by combining words and words are put together by combining morphemic elements like stems, roots, and affixes. The same applies to meaning. The word-meaning may be viewed as a fusion of the meanings of stems, roots, and affixes, and the meaning of a sentence may be viewed as a fusion of the meanings of its constituent words. Beyond this generality, different schools have specific proposals. The tradition of Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā proposes that the words of a sentence already convey contextualized inter-connected meanings (anvitābhidhāna) and that the sentence-meaning is not different from a simple addition of these inherently inter-connected word-meanings. On the other hand, the Naiyāyikas and the Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsakas propose that words of a sentence taken by themselves convey only uncontextualized unconnected meanings, and that these uncontextualized word-meanings are subsequently brought into a contextualized association with each other (abhihitānvaya). Therefore, the sentence-meaning is different from word-meanings, and is communicated through the concatenation (saṃsarga) of words, rather than by the words themselves. This is also the view of the early grammarians like Kātyāyana and Patañjali.

For the later grammarian-philosopher Bhartṛhari, however, there are no divisions in speech acts and in communicated meanings. He says that only a person ignorant of the real nature of language believes the divisions of sentences into words, stems, roots, and affixes to be real. Such divisions are useful fictions and have an explanatory value in grammatical theory, but have no reality in communication. In reality, there is no sequence in the cognitions of these different components. The sentence-meaning becomes an object or content of a single instance of a flash of cognition (pratibhā).

7. Some important conceptions

The terms śakyatāvacchedaka and pravṛttinimitta signify a property which determines the inclusion of a particular instance within the class of possible entities referred to by a word. It is a property whose possession by an entity is the necessary and sufficient condition for a given word being used to refer to that entity. Thus, the property of potness may be viewed as the śakyatāvacchedaka controlling the use of the word “pot”.

The concept of lakṣaṇā (“secondary signification function”) is invoked in a situation where the primary meaning of an utterance does not appear to make sense in view of the intention behind the utterance, and hence one looks for a secondary meaning. However, the secondary meaning is always something that is related to the primary meaning in some way. For example, the expression gaṅgāyāṃ ghoṣaḥ literally refers to a cowherd-colony on the Ganges. Here, it is argued that one obviously cannot have a cowherd-colony sitting on top of the river Ganges. This would clearly go against the intention of the speaker. Thus, there is both a difficulty of justifying the linkage of word-meanings (anvayānupapatti) and a difficulty of justifying the literal or primary meaning in relation to the intention of the speaker (tātparyānupapatti). These interpretive difficulties nudge one away from the primary meaning of the expression to a secondary meaning, which is related to that primary meaning. Thus, we understand the expression as referring to a cowherd-colony “on the bank of the river Ganges”.

It is the next level of meaning or vyañjanā (“suggestive signification function”) which is analyzed and elaborated more specifically by authors like Ānandavardhana in the tradition of Sanskrit poetics. Consider the following instance of poetic suggestion. With her husband out on a long travel, a lovelorn young wife instructs a visiting young man: “My dear guest, I sleep here and my night-blind mother-in-law sleeps over there. Please make sure you do not stumble at night.” The suggested meaning is an invitation to the young man to come and share her bed. Thus, the poetic language goes well beyond the levels of lexical and metaphorical meanings, and heightens the aesthetic pleasure through such suggestions.

8. Why the differences?

The nuances of these different theories are closely related to the markedly different interests of the schools within which they developed. Sanskrit poetics was interested in the poetic dimensions of meaning. Grammarians were interested in language and cognition, but had little interest in ontological categories per se, except as conceptual structures revealed by the usage of words. For them words and meanings had to be explained irrespective of one’s metaphysical views. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas were primarily into logic, epistemology, and ontology, and argued that a valid sentence was a true picture of a state of reality. The foremost goal of Mīmāṃsā was to interpret and defend the Vedic scriptures. Thus, meaning for Mīmāṃsā had to be eternal, uncreated, and unrelated to the intention of a person, because its word par excellence, the Vedic scripture, was eternal, uncreated, and beyond the authorship of a divine or human person. The scriptural word was there to instruct people on how to perform proper ritual and moral duties, but there was no intention behind it. The Buddhists, on the other hand, aimed at weaning people away from all attachment to the world, and hence at showing the emptiness of everything, including language. They were more interested in demonstrating how language fails to portray reality, than in explaining how it works. The theories of meaning were thus a significant part of the total agenda of each school and need to be understood in their specific context.


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