Discussions of hope can be found throughout the history of philosophy and across all Western philosophical traditions, even though philosophy has traditionally not paid the same attention to hope as it has to attitudes like belief and desire. However, even though hope has historically only rarely been discussed systematically—with important exceptions, such as Aquinas, Bloch and Marcel—almost all major philosophers acknowledge that hope plays an important role in regard to human motivation, religious belief or politics. Historically, discussions of the importance of hope were often embedded in particular philosophical projects. More recent discussions of hope provide independent accounts of its nature and its relation to other mental phenomena, such as desire, intention and optimism.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Philosophical History of Hope
- 3. The Standard Account and the Rationality of Hope
- 4. Analyses of Hope in the Psychological Literature
- 5. Hope in Political Philosophy
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Compared with more widely discussed attitudes like belief and desire, the phenomenon of hope presents some unique challenges for both theories of the mind and theories of value. Hope is not only an attitude that has cognitive components—it is responsive to facts about the possibility and likelihood of future events. It also has a conative component—hopes are different from mere expectations insofar as they reflect and draw upon our desires. A classic analysis of hope—the so-called “standard account” (see section 3)—takes hope to be a compound attitude, consisting of a desire for an outcome and a belief in that outcome’s possibility. But not all outcomes that we believe to be possible and that we desire are thereby objects of our hope. In order to hope one not only has to consider an outcome possible, one also has to affectively engage with this outcome in a distinctive way. This raises the question as to whether hope can be reduced to beliefs and desires.
Popular discourse often takes hope to be synonymous with optimism. But while optimism can be usefully analyzed as a desire for an outcome together with a belief that the outcome is more likely than not (or more likely than the evidence leads other people to believe), many philosophers hold that hope, properly understood, is independent of probability assessments (see section 3). One can hope for outcomes that one considers to be very unlikely and that one does not expect to happen, such as a miraculous cure of an illness. In such cases, optimism is not an appropriate response.
It is an open question whether the contribution of hope to human agency is to be identified with that of the underlying desires or whether hope makes an independent contribution to motivation or reasoning. If one assumes that hope cannot make any independent contribution to practical reasoning but still motivates, this raises the suspicion that it distorts rational agency. While such an assessment can be found across the history of philosophy, many past and contemporary philosophers provide analyses of hope that add further elements to the belief-desire analysis and use these elements to explain why acting on one’s hopes is (sometimes) rational.
2. The Philosophical History of Hope
Historically, evaluations of hope change together with the prevailing view of the relationship between human action and the future. As long as the human condition is seen as essentially unchangeable, hope is more often treated as arising from mere epistemic uncertainty and as having ambivalent effects on human happiness. In philosophical contexts where either the possibility of a future life beyond this world or the idea of human progress is emphasized, hope is more often seen as an appropriate and even virtuous attitude that enables humans to direct their agency towards these possibilities (see Miceli and Castelfranchi 2010).
2.1 Ancient Accounts of Hope
Although there are few explicit and systematic treatments of hope (elpis) in ancient Greek philosophies, they nevertheless contain important approaches to the nature of hope and its role in the good life and practical deliberation (Gravlee 2020). Ambivalent evaluations of hope can be found in many texts. On the one hand, hope is often seen as an attitude of those who have insufficient knowledge or are easily swayed by wishful thinking. It thus has a negative reputation (Vogt 2017) as an attitude that (at least potentially) misleads actions and agents. Even Solon focuses on empty hopes (see Lewis 2006: 85; Caston and Kaster 2016). On the other hand, hope is praised as a response to despair, e.g., in the dialogues of Thucydides, who advances a nuanced view of the potential dangers and advantages of hope (Schlosser 2013). An ambivalent evaluation of hope is also reflected in Hesiod’s version of the tale of Pandora. When all the evils had escaped from Pandora’s jar, famously, only hope (elpis) remained (“Works and Days”, §90). This seems to suggest that hope can also sustain human agency in the face of widespread evil. It must be noted, however, that there are many competing interpretations of why elpis remained in the jar (Verdenius 1985): Was it to keep hope available for humans or, rather, to keep hope from humankind? Is hope consequently to be regarded as good (“a comfort to man in his misery and a stimulus rousing his activity”, Verdenius 1985: 66) or as evil (“idle hope in which the lazy man indulges when he should be working honestly for his living”, Verdenius 1985: 66)? These different interpretations of Pandora’s myth are taken up throughout the history of Philosophy (especially among existentialist authors, see section 2.5).
In Plato’s dialogues, we find negative as well as positive assessments of hope. In particular, Plato even argues that hope can be rational. In the Timaeus, Plato adopts a rather negative attitude towards hope by recounting a myth according to which the divine beings give us “those mindless advisers confidence and fear, (…) and gullible hope” (Timaeus, 69b). In the Philebus, by contrast, he seems to also allow for a more favorable view of the role of hope in human life. The relevant discussion of hope takes place in the context of an argument about “false pleasures”. Against Protarch’s objection that only opinions can be true or false, but not pleasures, Socrates develops an analogy between opinion and pleasure (Philebus, 36d). In this context, he describes “pleasures of anticipation”, that is, expectations of future pleasures, that are called hopes (Philebus, 39e3). As Frede (1985) argues, in the case of such pleasures of anticipation what we enjoy at present is only a thought. As there can be a discrepancy between the thought that we enjoy and what is in fact going to happen, the pleasure can be true—in which case it seems appropriate to say that the corresponding hope can be rationally endorsed—or false (Frede 1985: 174f.). The Philebus also presents hope as essential to human agency: Plato seems to suggest that all our agential representations are concerned with the future, which connects them to hope (Vogt 2017). Plato’s positive view of hope can also be found in the Apology and the Phaedo, where he argues that hope for the afterlife is rational (Gravlee 2020).
Aristotle’s treatment of hope in the context of his discussion of the virtue of courage has received some attention (Gravlee 2000; Lear 2006), as well as the role of hope in his practical philosophy in general (Kontos 2021a). On the one hand, Aristotle describes the relationship between hope and courage as a contrast. He identifies two sources of hopefulness that are non-courageous: First, it is possible to be hopeful “at sea […] and in disease”, but this hope does not involve courage, insofar as, in such situations, there is neither “opportunity of showing prowess”, nor is death “noble” in these cases, according to Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics 3.6, 1115a35ff.). Second, one can be hopeful based on one’s experience of good fortune (Nicomachean Ethics 3.8, 1117a10ff.). In this case, the belief in the probability of a good outcome is not well grounded, but founded on mere induction. Both kinds of hopefulness are non-courageous. On the other hand, there is also a connection between hope and courage via the concept of confidence (Gravlee 2000). For example, Aristotle says:
The coward, then, is a despairing sort of person; for he fears everything. The brave man, on the other hand, has the opposite disposition; for confidence is the mark of a hopeful disposition. (Nicomachean Ethics 3.7, 1116a2)
Thus, even though not every hopeful person is courageous, every courageous person is hopeful. Hopefulness creates confidence, which, if derived from the right sources, can lead to the virtue of courage. Gravlee (2000: 471ff.) identifies two further considerations that are relevant for hope’s value in Aristotle’s thought. First, hope underlies deliberation, which is needed for any exercise of a virtuous disposition. Second, hopefulness is also presented as valuable in its connection with youth and the virtue of megalopsychia (high-mindedness): Hopefulness spurs us to the pursuit of the noble. Kontos (2021a, 2021b) focuses both on the phenomenology of hope in Aristotle’s thought, and the normative question of what the conditions are for “hoping-well”: He argues that hoping-well constitutes a correct engagement with moral luck, and it requires drawing on past experiences in a proper way as well as reliably perceiving the present reality.
Perhaps unsurprisingly, hope received a less favorable treatment by the Stoic philosophers. In particular, Seneca emphasizes hope’s relation to fear (an idea that is later taken up by Spinoza, see section 2.3):
[t]hey are bound up with one another, unconnected as they may seem. Widely different though they are, the two of them march in unison like a prisoner and the escort he is handcuffed to. Fear keeps pace with hope. Nor does their so moving together surprise me; both belong to a mind in suspense, to a mind in a state of anxiety through looking into the future. Both are mainly due to projecting our thoughts far ahead of us instead of adapting ourselves to the present. (Seneca, Letter 5.7–8; in: 1969: 38)
According to Seneca, we should avoid both fear and hope and instead focus on the present and cultivate tranquility of the soul.
2.2 Christian Authors on Hope
Pre-Christian accounts see hope mostly as an attitude to reality that is based on insufficient insight into what is true or good. By contrast, Christian philosophers such as Augustine and Thomas Aquinas analyze hope as one of the most central virtues of a believer: Hope, precisely in virtue of its capacity to justify action in a way which is not bound to knowledge, is a part of rational faith.
Even in Saint Paul’s argument for the extension of the Christian community beyond the Jewish law, hope plays a central role. Paul states that we can only hope for what is uncertain (Romans 8:24; see also Augustine, City of God, book XIX, §IV, 1960: 139). Nevertheless, such hope can be the product of the experience of suffering, if this experience is seen through the lens of faith (Romans 5:3–5) and if the desire to be saved from this suffering is supported by confidence in not being disappointed. Instead of backward-looking law-conformity (associated by Paul with the Jewish faith), it is such forward-looking hope that characterizes the appropriate relation to God. As an illustration, Paul describes Abraham as “hoping against hope” (Romans 4:18), emphasizing the way in which hope goes beyond the evidence.
Augustine of Hippo discusses hope systematically in his Enchiridion on Faith, Hope and Love (c. 420). Hope is distinguished from faith—which is also based on incomplete evidence—by two features: First, hope is necessarily directed to future events, whereas faith can also relate to past events (such as Christ’s resurrection). Second, hope only relates to what is good for the hopeful person, whereas faith can also relate to what is bad (such as punishment for one’s sins). Finally, hope, faith and love are seen as interconnected. Only if one loves the future fulfillment of God’s will and thus hopes for it can one arrive at the correct form of faith (Enchiridion, II.7). As love provides the normative outlook that underlies hope and faith (and thus, in some sense, the desire-component of hope), love is seen as a more central virtue than hope (Enchiridion, XXX.114).
The hope for a life after death also plays an important role in Augustine’s political philosophy. In the City of God, Augustine distinguishes the actual earthly city from the heavenly city that only exists in the hope placed in God (City of God, book XV, §XXI, 1966: 541). The latter provides a reference point for a Christian view of politics. Hope, however, not only provides for a perspective on politics which surpasses the narrow perspective of classical politics (Dodaro 2007), but an appropriate theorizing of hope also modifies the understanding of traditional political virtues, as it redirects their purpose from the earthly to the heavenly city. One example of such a modification concerns punishment: Through hope, a Christian ‘statesman’ will redirect punishment away from an exclusive concern with proportionality towards the potential reform of the criminal (City of God, book V, §XXIV, 1963: 263).
In one of his letters to Macedonius, a public official, Augustine finally emphasizes that the hope for a future life underlies all true human happiness, both on the level of the individual and of the state (Letter 155, Political Writings, §4–8, pp. 91–94). Thus, hope is not just of concern for individual believers but also for political leaders that are concerned with collective happiness, as paying attention to hope allows them to pursue a political constitution that allows true virtue of citizens to emerge (see also Dodaro 2007).
While Augustine is more or less exclusively concerned with the significance of hope for our pursuit of a good Christian life, Thomas Aquinas’ Summa Theologiae contains a systematic discussion of (ordinary) hope as a passion (ST I-II, q. 40) and as a theological virtue (ST II-II, qq. 17–22). The former is directed to finite, earthly goods, whereas hope as a theological virtue is directed to ultimate happiness in the union with God. Even though the two kinds of hope are clearly distinct, Aquinas provides a unified account of the formal features of their objects (I-II, q. 40, art.1) (see Bobier 2020a). The object of hope, he argues, is always thought to be good and future. Further, in contrast to mere desire, the objects of hope must be difficult to obtain but nevertheless in the realm of possibility (ST I-II 40.1). This rules out hope for that which is trivial to procure.
Regarding the rationality of hope, Aquinas has a nuanced view. On the one hand, he admits that a lack of experience can make one unaware of obstacles. This tendency (and drunkenness, ST I-II 40.6) can promote (irrational) hope. On the other hand, he assumes that hope can promote rational agency: As hope incorporates both knowledge of the possible and knowledge of the difficulties to reach the desired outcome, it can motivate agents to devote energy to their activities.
Because of this ambivalence, hope in the ordinary sense is not a virtue for Aquinas. As a passion, humans can display an excess and a deficiency of hope (ST II-II 17.5); furthermore, passions are not virtues by definition (Bobier 2018). This changes, however, as soon as we examine theological hope, i.e., the hope we can put in God. First, as primarily directed towards God, such hope does not know any excess. Second, we cannot understand theological hope as a passion. We must analyze it as a habit of the will. While hope as a passion can only be incited by sensible goods (and subsequently motivates action insofar as the subject takes herself to be capable of realizing that good), we can also hope for God’s assistance (ST II-II 17.1) in reaching eternal happiness (ST II-II 17.2). As eternal life and happiness are not sensible goods, this kind of hope cannot be a passion but must reside in the will (ST II-II 18.1). Note, however, that Aquinas describes the theological virtues as habits of the will of a special sort: They cannot be acquired by habituation, but can only be given by God’s grace (ST II-II 17.1, see Pinsent 2020 for an interpretation of hope as an “infused” virtue).
Because of these two features, hope is a theological virtue (ST II-II 17.5; see also 1 Corinthians 13). While love (or charity) is directed to God for the sake of unity, faith and hope are directed towards God with a view to some good to be obtained from that unity: Faith relates to God as a source of knowledge, hope relates to God as a source of goodness (ST II-II 17.6).
The rationality of theological hope can only be properly understood, according to Aquinas, when we acknowledge that hope has to be preceded by faith (which underlies the belief in the possibility of salvation), but, given faith, hope for the good of salvation is rational. In contrast to most modern discussions of hope, Aquinas and other Christian authors therefore see hope as compatible with confidence or even certainty about the hoped-for outcome while still excluding knowledge (Jeffrey 2020: 44). Despair, as caused either by the absence of faith or the desire to be saved, is sinful (ST II-II 20.1). As hope is, by definition, future-directed, it is only possible for human beings who are uncertain of whether they are blessed or damned, whereas love can persist even after their ultimate fate has been revealed (ST II-II 18.2–3).
2.3 Hope in 17th and 18th Century Philosophy
In 17th and 18th century philosophy, many philosophers reject Aquinas’ division between different kinds of passions in favor of a moral psychology which classifies emotions and desires together as passions that generate action, of which hope is usually conceived as a species. Almost all authors mentioned in the following also embrace some version of the idea defining for the “standard account” that hope is based on uncertainty in belief together with a representation of an object as desirable (Blöser 2020a).
According to Descartes, hope is a weaker form of confidence (Passions of the Soul,  1985: 389) and consists in a desire (a representation of an outcome to be both good for us and possible) together with a disposition to think of it as likely but not certain (Passions of the Soul,  1985: 350f, 389). This means that hope and anxiety always accompany each other (in contrast to both despair and confidence which are absolute opposites). Hobbes adopts a similar analysis. For him, hope is a complex passion or a “pleasure of the mind”, i.e., a pleasure that arises not from direct sensation but from thinking. For Hobbes, the simplest building block underlying hope is appetite, and “appetite with an opinion of obtaining” is hope (Leviathan, 36, I.VI.14). As in Descartes, hope serves as a building block for more complex mental phenomena, such as courage or confidence (Leviathan, 36f, I.VI.17/19). But hope also plays a role in the mental activity of deliberation which is defined as the alternation of hope and fear with appetites and aversion (Leviathan, 39, I.VI.49; see also Bobier 2020b). Hope—a term which Hobbes often uses more or less synonymously with (justified) expectation—plays an important role in the political application of his moral psychology: Not only is the equality in the state of nature defined as an equality of hope (Leviathan, 83, I.XIII.3)—which makes it rational for everyone to pursue their individual advantage—the laws of nature also command one to seek peace where one has hope for obtaining it (Leviathan, 87, I.XIV.4). Both the collective agency problem in the state of nature and the solution to it thus depend on what hopes individuals can rationally entertain.
Spinoza also defines the passion of hope as a form of pleasure (Ethics III, P18, Spinoza  1985: 505) or joy that is mingled with sadness (due to the uncertainty of the outcome, see Short Treatise, book II, ch. IX, Spinoza [c. 1660] 1985: 113). In contrast to more modern definitions, Spinoza distinguishes the pleasure that is involved in hope from desire. Hope (in the Ethics) is thus not necessarily connected to desire, but rather a way in which the mind is affected by the idea of a future event. In contrast to Hobbes and Descartes, Spinoza understands hope as fundamentally irrational. He argues that it must be the result of false belief inasmuch as it does not correctly represent that everything is governed by necessity (Short Treatise, book II, ch. IX, [c. 1660] 1985: 113). Additionally, in the Ethics, Spinoza describes hope as one of the causes of superstition, especially as it is always accompanied by fear (Ethics III, P50,  1985: 521). Such fear necessarily precludes it from being intrinsically good (Ethics IV, P47,  1985: 573). This is also the reason why we should attempt to make ourselves independent from hope (although Gatens et al. (2021: 202) argue that Spinoza also has room for the idea of reasonable hopes).
Spinoza agrees with Hobbes, however, by ascribing political significance to hope. As he explains in the Theological-Political Treatise, the fact that people are governed by hope and fear makes them easy victims of superstition and false belief (Theological-Political Treatise,  2002: 389); however, good laws can also take advantage of this and motivate people by arranging outcomes such that they can be motivated by hope (Theological-Political Treatise,  2002: 439; see Gatens et al. 2021 for a discussion of the political significance of hope in Spinoza). The same importance he places on hope also underlies his social contract argument. Like Hobbes, he argues that the only reason why people remain faithful to the social contract or carry out the orders of a sovereign has to be found in their hope of obtaining a certain good this way (Theological-Political Treatise,  2002: 529). Even a people as a whole is always united by common hopes and fears (Political Treatise,  2002: 700), but hope rather than fear is dominant in the case of free peoples (ibid.). This leads Spinoza to proclaim hope and fear as the basis of political power in the Political Treatise ( 2002: 686).
Hume’s account is another example of an analysis of hope as a passion—modified, however, by the specific approach he takes to human psychology. For Hume, hope is a “direct passion” that is produced when the mind considers events that have a probability between absolute certainty and absolute impossibility. Hume describes probability-beliefs as an effect of the mind entertaining contrary views—of an event or object as either existent or non-existent—in quick succession after another. Each of these views gives rise to either joy or sorrow (when the object is something good or bad) which linger longer in the mind than the original imagination of the object’s existence or non-existence. When considering objects that are probable, but not certain, the mind is thus affected by a mixture of joy and sorrow that, depending on the predominant element, can be called hope or fear.
It is after this manner that hope and fear arise from the different mixture of these opposite passions of grief and joy, and from their imperfect union and conjunction. (Treatise,  2007: 283)
As Hume sees hope as a necessary effect of the consideration of an uncertain event, it follows that we cannot but hope for any positive outcome about which we are uncertain. The uncertainty in question can be based on the actual uncertainty of the event but also on uncertain belief.
2.4 Immanuel Kant
While hope is primarily discussed as a feature of the psychology of individual humans in the 17th and 18th century and, as a non-cognitive attitude, taken to be neither essentially rational nor irrational, it is given much greater significance by Immanuel Kant who adopts a much more substantial (and complex) view of the connection between hope and reason.
Kant’s definition of hope as an “unexpected offering of the prospect of immeasurable good fortune” (AE 7:255) in the Anthropology seems to remain within the traditional discourse about hope. However, Kant eventually accords hope a central place in his philosophical system by focusing on hope as an attitude that allows human reason to relate to those questions which cannot be answered by experience. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant states the question “For what may I hope?” as one of the fundamental questions of philosophy, after “What can I know?” and “What should I do?” (A805/B833). This question, as far as its answer depends on claims regarding the consequences of moral righteousness and the existence of God, is “simultaneously practical and theoretical” (A805/B833) and it is answered by religion (AE 9:25). Kant’s account of hope consequently connects his moral philosophy with his views on religion. He emphasizes the rational potential of such hope, but he also makes clear that rational hope is intimately connected to religious faith, i.e., the belief in God.
Kant considers three primary objects of hope in his writings: (1) One’s own happiness (as part of the highest good), (2) one’s own moral progress (in the Religion) and (3) the moral improvement of the human race as a whole (in his historical-political writings).
(1) In the Canon of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant states clearly: “all hope concerns happiness” (A805/B833). However, it is not the hope for one’s own happiness simpliciter that is at stake, but the hope for happiness that one deserves because of one’s moral conduct (A809/B837). Kant argues that there is a necessary connection between the moral law and the hope for happiness. However, this connection exists only “in the idea of pure reason”, not in nature (A809/B837). A proportionality between happiness and morality can only be thought of as necessary in an intelligible, moral world, where we abstract from all hindrances to moral conduct. In the empirical world of experience, there is no guarantee for a necessary connection between moral conduct and happiness. Thus, Kant concludes, we may reasonably hope for happiness in proportion to morality only if we introduce the additional non-empirical assumption of “a highest reason, which commands in accordance with moral laws, as […] the cause of nature” (A810/B838). This way, Kant connects morality and happiness in the object of hope and secures its possibility in a highest reason, i.e., in God. Kant calls the connection between “happiness in exact proportion with the morality of rational beings, through which they are worthy of it” the highest good (A814/B842). A peculiarity of Kant’s treatment of hope in the Canon is that hope for the highest good is apparently considered necessary for moral motivation (A813/B841)—a thesis he rejects in his later writings.
Kant’s account of hope for happiness presents hope as very closely connected to Kant’s concept of faith. This becomes obvious in the Critique of Practical Reason. Kant argues that in order to believe in the possibility of the highest good—and we have to believe in this possibility, as it is prescribed by the categorical imperative—we have to believe in or postulate the existence of God and the immortality of the soul. Kant himself uses both the concept of belief or faith and the concept of hope in explaining the content of the postulate of immortality: we must presuppose immortality in order to conceive of the highest good as “practically possible” and we may therefore “hope for a further uninterrupted continuance of this [moral] progress, however long his existence may last, even beyond this life” (AE 5:123). Thus, Kant can be understood as arguing in favor of a traditional religious form of hope—hope for a life after death or immortality of the soul. However, he points out that immortality is not a ‘mere’ hope (i.e., a hope for an outcome where we lack evidence for the claim that it is really possible), but that reason makes it necessary (as a consequence of the categorical imperative) to assume that immortality is possible.
Whereas some Kant interpreters do not clearly distinguish between hope and faith (Rossi 1982, Flikschuh 2010), Andrew Chignell emphasizes that hope is an attitude that is distinct from faith or belief and that Kant follows an “assert-the-stronger” policy: He asserts the strongest justified attitude towards p (justified belief), even if one holds also weaker attitudes towards p (hope) (Chignell 2013: 198). O’Neill interprets Kant as holding that hope provides a reason for religious belief: Belief in God and immortality is not “merely possible”, but a matter of “taking a hopeful view of human destiny” (O’Neill 1996: 281). According to O’Neill, the reason for faith is the hope that moral action is successful, i.e., that our moral intention can make a difference to the natural order.
(2) In the Religion, Kant envisages one’s own moral improvement as an object of hope, which requires that one change one’s fundamental maxim from a bad one to a good one. The problem is that on the one hand, we have a duty to improve morally and hence must be capable of doing so (AE 6:45), but on the other hand, it is unclear how this can be possible if one’s fundamental maxim is corrupt. Since we cannot know how this is possible, moral improvement remains an object of hope. Kant suggests two alternative hopes: the hope to, through one’s “own efforts”, become a better person (AE 6:46) and the hope that what exceeds one’s power will be taken care of by God (AE 6:52).
(3) In his political and historical writings, Kant considers another object of reasonable hope: the hope for historical progress towards a morally better, peaceful future. We find a similar relationship between rational belief and hope as with regard to God and immortality: Kant sees the moral improvement of the human race as a hope that is based on a transcendental assumption (in the mode of faith) in a teleological order of nature. Kant assigns “hope for better times” an important function for moral motivation by claiming that without it, the desire to benefit the common good would “never have warmed the human heart” (AE 8:309). Kant recommends a view of human history with a “confirmation bias” (Kleingeld 2012: 175), i.e., with a view to the realization of moral demands.
Aside from these systematic issues regarding hope in Kant’s philosophy, it is worth summarizing some general features that Kant touches upon concerning hope. Regarding a descriptive account of what it means that a person hopes that p, one can extract two necessary conditions from Kant’s remarks that are in line with the standard account of hope: The object of hope must be uncertain, and the person must wish for it. Both conditions can be found in the following passage from Perpetual Peace:
[R]eason is not enlightened enough to survey the entire series of predetermining causes that foretell with certainty the happy or unhappy consequences of humankind’s activities in accordance with the mechanism of nature (although it does let us hope that these will be in accord with our wishes). (AE 8:370)
In regard to the normative conditions under which hope is rational, Kant is sensitive to a theoretical and practical dimension: He focuses on hopes that are (necessarily) connected with a moral duty and thus involve a practical necessity. From a theoretical point of view, Kant’s main concern is to show that these hopes are not impossible. While he holds that empirical evidence permits hoping as long as there is no proof to the contrary (AE 8:309f.), this minimal criterion is connected to the idea that hope is based on transcendental assumptions (i.e., the existence of God, immortality, and a teleology of nature) (Blöser 2020b).
Kant’s account of hope has recently attracted considerable interest, both regarding matters of Kant scholarship and the application and development of a Kantian notion of hope in various contexts. As to Kant scholarship, Düring and Düwell (2017) follow Beyleveld and Ziche (2015) in emphasizing the relevance of the Critique of Judgment for an understanding of Kantian hope –– they view hope as aesthetically structured. Zuckert (2018) argues that Kantian hope is a feeling. Danziger (2020) makes the case that hope plays a role even in Kant’s theoretical philosophy.
As to the application and development of Kant’s account of hope, Chignell (2018) reconstructs Kant’s moral argument for faith in the existence of God (where hope plays a crucial role) and explores its relevance for political contexts (the food system), where the chances that an individual will make a difference are very low. Similarly, Huber (2019) argues that Kantian hope can be seen as playing an important role in preventing demoralization and sustaining the commitment to political action when the prospects of success are dim. Dineen (2020) delineates a Kantian conception of hope that might inform practical education, because it warrants us in thinking that we are able to set and achieve ends, even in light of imperfection and vulnerability. Speight (2021) shows how Walter Benjamin took up and transformed Kant’s account of hope by shifting from a personal to a collective perspective on hope and to a concern with the past.
2.5 Post-Kantian Philosophy and Existentialism
In Post-Kantian philosophy, the role of hope is disputed. One can identify two distinct approaches. On the one hand, there are authors like Arthur Schopenhauer, Friedrich Nietzsche and Albert Camus who reject hope, not so much as epistemically irrational but as an expression of a misguided relationship to the world that is unable to face the demands of human existence. On the other hand, authors like Søren Kierkegaard and Gabriel Marcel take hope to be a means to overcome the limitations of ordinary experience.
Kierkegaard examines hope primarily as it is connected to religious faith. However, whereas Kant aims to show that our belief in God and hope for the highest good is possible within the limits of reason, Kierkegaard is keen to emphasize that (eternal) hope must transcend all understanding. As an antidote to despair, hope plays a positive role in Kierkegaard’s work, culminating in his advice: “a person’s whole life should be the time of hope!” (Kierkegaard  1995: 251). In Works of Love, Kierkegaard defines hope in its most general form as a relation to the possibility of the good: “To relate oneself expectantly to the possibility of the good is to hope” (Kierkegaard  1995: 249).
Most interpreters of Kierkegaard emphasize a distinction between “heavenly” (or eternal) hope and “earthly” (or temporal) hope (Bernier 2015; Fremstedal 2012; McDonald 2014). In some passages, Kierkegaard indeed seems to assume that there is also “natural hope” (Kierkegaard  1990: 82) or hope “for some earthly advantage” (Kierkegaard  1995: 261). However, strictly speaking, Kierkegaard considers this the “wrong language usage” (Kierkegaard  1995: 261). He completes his definition as follows: “To relate oneself expectantly to the possibility of the good is to hope, which cannot be any temporal expectancy but is an eternal hope” (Kierkegaard  1995: 249). On Kierkegaard’s view, hope—strictly speaking—is thus always directed towards the eternal, “since hope pertains to the possibility of the good, and thereby to the eternal” (Kierkegaard  1995: 249). This is connected to Kierkegaard’s account of time. Hope, as a form of expectation, is an attitude towards the possible. While expectation, generally speaking, relates to the possibility of both good and evil (Kierkegaard  1995: 249), hope relates only to the possibility of good. The possibility of the good, on Kierkegaard’s account, is a feature of the eternal (“in time, the eternal is the possible, the future”).
While the expectation of earthly goods is often disappointed—either because it is fulfilled too late or not at all (Kierkegaard [1843–1844] 1990: 215)—eternal hope cannot in principle be disappointed (Kierkegaard  1995: 261–3, Kierkegaard [1843–1844] 1990: 216). Eternal hope means “at every moment always to hope all things” (Kierkegaard  1995: 249). Kierkegaard mostly equates eternal hope with Christian hope (McDonald 2014: 164).
In order to understand the relation between earthly and heavenly hope, it is helpful to consider the dialectical progression of hope that Kierkegaard presents in the Nachlaß (Malantschuk (ed.) 1978: 247). There is a kind of hope that occurs spontaneously in youth, which appears to be a pre-reflexive hope, a kind of immediate trust or confidence (Fremstedal 2012: 52). It is followed by the “supportive calculation of the understanding”, i.e., by hope involving the reflection about the probability of the hoped-for outcome. This (earthly) hope is often disappointed by the lateness or non-arrival of the expected goods. This disappointment is necessary in order to acquire eternal hope, which “is against hope, because according to that purely natural hope there was no more hope; consequently this hope is against hope” (Kierkegaard  1990: 82). Kierkegaard’s interpretation of Abraham’s story in Fear and Trembling can be understood as an illustration of this kind of hope (Lippitt 2015).
Whereas earthly hope is judged by the understanding according to its probability, eternal hope exceeds the limits of understanding. It is therefore commonly judged as irrational or as “lunacy” (Kierkegaard  1990: 83). Kierkegaard does not explicitly take up the question of when hope is rational—presumably because eternal hope exceeds reason—but he frames the question of good or bad hope in terms of “honor” and “shame” (Kierkegaard  1995: 260f.). He observes that a person who entertained an earthly hope that has not been fulfilled is very often criticized as imprudent (or “put to shame” (Kierkegaard  1995: 260)) because this is supposed to show that she “miscalculated” (ibid.). Kierkegaard objects to this perspective of “sagacity” that judges hope only with regard to its fulfillment. Rather, we should pay attention to the value of the hoped-for ends (Kierkegaard  1995: 261). Eternal hope, on this account, “is never put to shame” (Kierkegaard  1995: 260, see also 263). Further, and in line with the Christian tradition, he argues that the value of hope depends on its relation to love: We hope for ourselves if and only if we hope for others, and only to the same degree. Love
is the middle term: without love, no hope for oneself; with love, hope for all others—and to the same degree one hopes for oneself, to the same degree one hopes for others, since to the same degree one is loving. (Kierkegaard  1995: 260)
Thus, similarly to Kant’s account, one’s hope stands in a proportional relationship to an ethical demand. However, Kierkegaard does not see hope limited by our meeting an ethical demand.
Rather, Kierkegaard sees the proportional relation as determining whether we are in fact hoping, and the actual degree of our expectancy. Our hope for ourselves is only realizable in and through our hope for another. (Bernier 2015: 315)
As already mentioned, Schopenhauer represents the opposite approach in post-Kantian philosophy. Even though he holds that it is natural for humans to hope (Parerga and Paralipomena II, 1851: §313), he also claims that we generally ought to hope less than we are inclined to, calling hope a “folly of the heart” (ibid.). Ambivalent remarks concerning the value of hope (he interprets Pandora’s box as containing all the goods, Parerga and Paralipomena II, 1851: §200) can be found throughout his writings, but on the whole, criticism prevails. There are two aspects to his critical evaluation of hope: hope’s influence on the intellect and its role for happiness. In Schopenhauer’s dichotomy of the will and the intellect, hope is an expression of the will or, more precisely, an inclination. One reason why hope is problematic with respect to its influence on the intellect is that it presents what we wish for as probable (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2,  1958: 216, 218). Schopenhauer concedes that hope sharpens our perception insofar as it makes certain features of the world salient. But he links this thesis to the stronger claim that hope may make it (often) impossible to grasp things that are relevant. Hope thus distorts cognition in a problematic way because it hinders the intellect in grasping the truth. However, Schopenhauer also concedes the possibility of a positive effect of hope, namely as motivation and support of the intellect (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2,  1958: 221).
With regard to its contribution to personal happiness, Schopenhauer mentions a positive role of hope in his comparison of the life of animals with that of humans. He states that animals experience less pleasure than humans, because they lack hope and therefore the pleasures of anticipation. But hope can not only lead to disappointment when the hoped-for object is not realized, it can even be disappointing when it is fulfilled if the outcome does not provide as much satisfaction as was expected (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2  1958: 573). Schopenhauer also criticizes Kant’s idea that we may hope for our own happiness in proportion to our moral conduct (the highest good). This conception of hope, according to Schopenhauer, leads Kant to remain implicitly committed to a form of eudaimonism (Basis of Morality II, §3, 34).
Thus, even though Schopenhauer occasionally hints at positive aspects of hope, his overall evaluation of hope is negative. This is consistent with his view that life is filled with unavoidable frustration and suffering, and that suffering can be reduced only by getting rid of one’s desires. Ideally, this amounts to the “negation of the will to life” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1,  2010: 405). The “temptations of hope” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1,  2010: 419) function as obstacles to the negation of the will, whereas hopelessness can help to transform one’s mind and acquire “genuine goodness and purity of mind” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1,  2010: 420). Interestingly, Schopenhauer does have sympathies with the idea of salvation, which lies in the denial of the will (Schopenhauer  1958: 610), that is, he seems to subscribe to a kind of transcendent hope for an end of all suffering (Schulz 2002: 125). Even though he does not say so, one could characterize his view as a “hope for the end of hope”.
Nietzsche is perhaps the most famous critic of hope in the post-Kantian tradition. In the third preface to Zarathustra, he warns: “do not believe those who speak to you of extraterrestrial hopes!” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 6) Similarly, in Beyond Good and Evil (1886) he opposes all notions of hope “in hidden harmonies, in future blessedness and justice” (Beyond Good and Evil,  2008: 562). In his interpretation of Pandora’s myth (Human, All Too Human, 1878: §71), he calls hope “the worst of all evils because it prolongs the torments of man”. However, a closer look reveals that, outside his criticism of religious and metaphysical hopes, he also hints at a positive perspective on hope: “that mankind be redeemed from revenge: that to me is the bridge to the highest hope and a rainbow after long thunderstorms” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 77). Nietzsche counts hope among the “strong emotions” (Nietzsche  2006: 103), next to anger, fear, voluptuousness, and revenge. Furthermore, he repeatedly characterizes hope using the metaphor of a rainbow: “hope is the rainbow over the cascading stream of life” [“Die Hoffnung ist der Regenbogen über den herabstürzenden jähen Bach des Lebens”] (as cited in Bidmon 2016: 188). However, the metaphor of the “rainbow” is ambivalent. On the one hand, it is connected to Nietzsches vision of the “overman”: “Do you not see it, the rainbow and the bridges of the overman?” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 36). On the other hand, however, the rainbow is elusive and withdraws itself—Nietzsche calls it an “illusory bridge” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 175; see also Bidmon 2016: 188f.). In Beyond Good and Evil, he finally claims that we should “fix our hopes” in “new philosophers”, “in minds strong and original enough to initiate opposite estimates of value” (Beyond Good and Evil,  2008: 600). In Human, All Too Human, he similarly envisages change of the social order as an object of hope:
[W]e are only reasonably entitled to hope when we believe that we and our equals have more strength in heart and head than the representatives of the existing state of things. (Human, All Too Human, 1878: §443)
Reasonable hope is thus grounded in a trust in one’s capacity to bring about the desired outcome. However, Nietzsche adds that usually this hope amounts to “presumption, an over-estimation” (ibid.).
Camus follows Nietzsche in declaring (religious) hope the worst of all evils (Judaken and Bernasconi 2012: 264). His critique of hope is linked to the idea that the human existence is absurd. The “elusive feeling of absurdity” (Camus 1955: 12) is characterized by a discrepancy: The human mind asks fundamental questions about the meaning of life, but the world does not provide answers. Camus’ understanding of the absurd is best captured in the image of Sisyphus, who exemplifies life’s absurdity in his “futile and hopeless labor” (Camus 1955: 119). The assumption that life is absurd goes hand in hand with the denial of religious hope for salvation. In his early writing Nuptials ( 1970), Camus opposes religious ideas about the immortal soul and hope for an afterlife. In fact, “[h]ope is the error Camus wishes to avoid” (Aronson 2012). Even though Camus is often regarded as an existentialist, he distances himself from this movement. One reason is precisely his disagreement with the account of hope of the existentialists, Kierkegaard in particular, of which he says that “they deify what crushes them and find reason to hope in what impoverishes them. That forced hope is religious in all of them” (Camus 1955: 32).
As already mentioned, one kind of hope that Camus flatly rejects is religious hope for a life beyond death. A second kind of hope, primarily discussed in The Rebel, is the hope founded on a great cause beyond oneself, i.e., “hope of another life one must ‘deserve’” (Camus 1955: 8). The problem with hoping for social utopias, according to Camus, is that they tend to be dictatorial. A further reason to reject such hopes seems to be that they distract from the life of the senses, from the here-and-now and from appreciating the beauty of this life. We also do not need hope to cope with the hardships of life and death: Instead of hoping for a life after death (or committing suicide), one should be conscious of death as “the most obvious absurdity” (Camus 1955: 59) and “die unreconciled and not of one’s own free will” (Camus 1955: 55). Sisyphus exemplifies the attitude of lucidity and consciousness that Camus recommends. Even though he does not hope for a better future,—or rather because he does not hope for a better future—“[o]ne must imagine Sisyphus happy” (Camus 1955: 123).
Despite his criticism of hope, Camus states that it is (nearly) impossible to live without hope, even if one wishes to be free of hope (Camus 1955: 113). Presumably this claim is only descriptive, stating a fact about human psychology. However, in a letter to his friend and poet René Char, Camus called The Rebel a “livre d’espoir” [book of hope] (Schlette 1995: 130). On that note, it has recently been suggested that Camus allows for a positive view of hope—a kind of “étrange espoir” [strange hope] that is directed towards the possibilities inherent in the present (Schlette 1995: 134) and that is characterized by humanism and solidarity with all human beings (Bidmon 2016: 233).
Whereas the positive role of hope in Camus is at best hidden, it surfaces prominently in the writings of Marcel. At the heart of Marcel’s account of hope is the distinction between “‘I hope…’, the absolute statement, and ‘I hope that…’” (Marcel  2010: 26). Marcel is mostly interested in a general, absolute hope, which he conceives as “the act by which […] temptation to despair is actively or victoriously overcome” (Marcel  2010: 30f.). One way in which Marcel characterizes the “mystery” (Marcel  2010: 29) of hope is by alluding to the connection between hope and patience (Marcel  2010: 33). Hope implies the respect for “personal rhythm” (ibid.) and “confidence in a certain process of growth and development” (Marcel  2010: 34). Marcel takes up the question of the rationality of hope in asking whether hope is an illusion that consists in taking one’s wishes for reality (Marcel  2010: 39). He answers that this objection against the value of hope applies primarily to hopes that are directed towards a particular outcome (“to hope that X”), but it does not apply when hope transcends the imagination. Because the person who hopes simpliciter does not anticipate a particular event, her hope cannot be judged with regard to whether it is likely to be fulfilled. Marcel illustrates this with the example of an invalid (Marcel  2010: 40). If this person hopes that he will be healthy at a certain point in time, there is the danger of disappointment and despair if it does not happen. However, absolute hope, Marcel explains, implies a “method of surmounting”: The patient has absolute hope if he realizes that “everything is not necessarily lost if there is no cure” (Marcel  2010: 40). Being a “theistic Existentialist” (Treanor and Sweetman 2016) like Kierkegaard, Marcel ultimately connects this possibility of absolute hope to the existence of God. Absolute hope is necessarily connected to faith in God and is a “response of the creature to the infinite Being to whom it is conscious of owing everything that it has” (Marcel  2010: 41).
Even though hope rarely features explicitly in pragmatist writings, it has been suggested that pragmatist accounts of hope can be found in the works of William James and John Dewey (Fishman and McCarthy 2007; Green 2008; Koopman 2006, 2009; Rorty 1999; Shade 2001). As Patrick Shade notes, the issue of hope is “implicit in most pragmatic philosophies”, as it is related to central pragmatist topics, such as meliorism and faith, and particular hopes for social progress (Shade 2001: 9f.). Sarah Stitzlein (2020) argues that a conception of hope as a set of habits unites the understanding of hope in the writings of the classical pragmatists (Charles Peirce, William James, John Dewey) and is further developed in the social and political writings of recent pragmatists (Richard Rorty, Judith Green, Cornel West, Patrick Shade, Colin Koopman).
Indeed, James’ concept of faith in The Will to Believe is closely linked to hope. In his essay, James aims to offer a “justification of faith, a defense of our right to adopt a believing attitude in religious matters” (James  2015: 1). Even though his primary subject is religious faith, he points out that a structurally similar justification of faith or trust can be applied to social questions. It can be rational to believe that the other is trustworthy or likes us, even though we may not be able to prove it. Three criteria have to be fulfilled for faith to be rational: the question cannot be decided scientifically, the belief may be true, and we are better off (even now) if we believe. In his argument, James draws a link to the concept of hope when claiming that the skeptic or agnostic attitude is not more rational than the attitude of faith. The skeptic holds “that to yield to our fear of its being error is wiser and better than to yield to our hope that it may be true” (James  2015: 27). James criticizes this attitude: “what proof is there that dupery through hope is so much worse than dupery through fear?” (James  2015: 27).
A pragmatist conception of hope has often been seen as closely linked to the idea of meliorism and progress (e.g., in Dewey’s work, see Shade 2001: 139). In his lectures on Pragmatism, James situates the doctrine of meliorism between pessimism and optimism: “Meliorism treats salvation as neither necessary nor impossible. It treats it as a possibility” (James 2000: 125). For Dewey, the object of hope or meliorism is first and foremost democracy, which is “the simple idea that political and ethical progress hinges on nothing more than persons, their values, and their actions” (Dewey  1980: 107).
Drawing on James’ account of conversion in the Varieties of Religious Experience, Sheehey argues that James can be seen as advocating a concept of hope that does not rely on the idea of progress, but relies on a “temporality of crisis” that allows for an understanding of historical change beyond progress or decline (Sheehey 2019).
3. The Standard Account and the Rationality of Hope
The contemporary debate about hope in analytic philosophy is primarily concerned with providing a definition of hope, explicating standards of rationality and explaining the value of hope. The debate takes as its starting point what has been called the “orthodox definition” (Martin 2013: 11) or the “standard account” (Meirav 2009: 217), which analyzes “hope that p” in terms of a wish or desire for p and a belief concerning p’s possibility. R.S. Downie is representative of this position:
There are two criteria which are independently necessary and jointly sufficient for ‘hope that’. The first is that the object of hope must be desired by the hoper. […] The second […] is that the object of hope falls within a range of physical possibility which includes the improbable but excludes the certain and the merely logically possible. (Downie 1963: 248f.)
Similarly, J. P. Day writes:
“A hopes that p” is true iff “A wishes that p, and A thinks that p has some degree of probability, however small” is true. (Day 1969: 89)
The desire-condition captures the intuition that we only hope for what we take to be good (at least in some respect) or desirable. The belief component is meant to capture the intuition that we do not normally hope for what we think is impossible (or certain), whereas this is not a problem for desires or wishes (in e.g., “I wish I could fly”).
Most authors implicitly assume that the hoped-for event is in the future. In ordinary usage however, people often express hopes regarding past events of which they do not have complete knowledge. An example is the hope that someone did not suffer excessively when they died. While some authors consider this use of language to be parasitic on the future-directed case (McGeer 2004: 104), others argue that these are genuine cases of hope (Martin 2013: 68).
Another question in this context concerns the concept of possibility that is at issue: It seems clear that we cannot hope for the logically impossible, but can we hope for the physically impossible, e.g., that the dead will rise tomorrow? Downie, for example, holds that logical possibility is not enough (Downie 1963: 249), whereas Chignell does not exclude the possibility of hope for something which is physically impossible (Chignell 2013: 201ff.). Whatever the answer to this question, all views (except Wheatley 1958) allow for cases of hope in which the outcome is extremely improbable; in other words, no lower bound to the probability is required for hoping (Meirav 2009: 219).
Objections have been raised against the idea that the standard definition provides sufficient conditions for hope. There are two main lines of objections: the “despair objection” and the “substantial hope objection” (Milona 2020a: 103). According to the “despair objection”, two people can have identical desires and beliefs about the possibility of an outcome, and yet one of them may hope for the outcome while the other despairs of it (Meirav 2009). The “substantial hope objection” holds that even though the standard definition might capture a minimal sense of hope, it fails to explain the special value of more “substantial” kinds of hope. In particular, it fails to explain how hope can have special motivating force in difficult circumstances, especially when the probability of the desired outcome is low (Pettit 2004; Calhoun 2018). These objections either lead to the claim that the standard definition must be revised or motivate the proposal that hope is entirely different from desire and belief, and hence irreducible to them.
Luc Bovens suggests that besides desire and belief, hope also involves mental imaging (Bovens 1999). However, it has been objected that mental imaging is already entailed by desire (and hence, that the standard definition can account for this) and that it is still not able to distinguish hope from despair, since a despairing person can still form mental images about the desired outcome. Andrew Chignell suggests a variant of Bovens’ account, although he does not require imaging but a specific kind of attention: A subject who hopes is disposed to focus on the desired outcome under the aspect of its possibility, while a despairing subject focuses on the outcome under the aspect of its improbability (Chignell forthcoming).
According to Meirav’s “External Factor Account” (Meirav 2009: 230), hope also involves an attitude towards an external factor (e.g., nature, fate, God) on which the realization of the hoped-for end causally depends. “If one views the external factor as good, then one hopes for the prospect. If one views it as not good, then one despairs of it” (Meirav 2009: 230). However, it is doubtful whether Meirav’s account is applicable to cases of hope where the realization of the outcome depends on luck (e.g., hoping to win the lottery). Further, it seems that one might hope even in circumstances where one believes the external factor to be bad, e.g., in unjust political circumstances.
While Meirav aims to answer the despair objection, Philip Pettit and Cheshire Calhoun suggest solutions to the substantial hope objection. In order to capture the motivating power of hope, Pettit distinguishes the “superficial” kind of hope described by the orthodox definition from a more “substantial” hope (Pettit 2004: 154). He construes substantial hope as acting on a belief that the agent does not really hold:
Hope will consist in acting as if a desired prospect is going to obtain or has a good chance of obtaining, just as precaution consists in acting as if this were the case with some feared prospect. (Pettit 2004: 158)
However, in typical cases, a hopeful person does not describe herself as acting as if the chances were higher, but as taking the chances as they are as good enough to try (Martin 2013: 23). Cheshire Calhoun (2018) shares Adrienne Martin’s criticism and argues that we need to distinguish a ‘planning idea’ from a ‘phenomenological idea’ of the future: The third component of hope besides desire and belief, according to her, is “a phenomenological idea of the determinate future whose content includes success” (Calhoun 2018: 86). This phenomenological idea, she argues, has motivational effects independently of the agent’s desires.
According to Martin’s suggestion (Martin 2013), hope involves two more elements in addition to belief and desire: First, the agent must see or treat her belief about the possibility of the outcome’s occurring as licensing hopeful activities, i.e., as not advising against some specific activities. Second, the agent must treat her attraction to the outcome as a practical reason to engage in the activities characteristic of hope. Martin calls her account the Incorporation Thesis, which refers to the fact that the hoping person incorporates the desire-element into her rational scheme of ends.
Martin’s proposal has been criticized as being overly reflective and unable to account for “recalcitrant” hopes where the hoping person does not see herself as justified in her hopeful activities (Milona and Stockdale 2018). Milona and Stockdale offer an account of hope that is inspired by the philosophy of emotions: They describe hope as a kind of perceptual state that involves a “hopeful” feeling.
There is an ever-increasing number of accounts that aim to remedy the shortcomings of the standard definition (see also Kwong 2019, Palmqvist 2021). The discussion seems to come full circle with Michael Milona’s return to the standard definition: Rather than augmenting the standard account, he suggests that one should employ a rich notion of desire and a suitable account of the relation between the desire and the belief—the belief in the possibility of the outcome must be in the “cognitive base” of the desire (Milona 2019).
The view that hope can be reduced to desires and beliefs (and a third factor) is not without alternative, however. Segal and Textor (2015) argue that hope is a primitive mental state that can be characterized by its functional role; Blöser (2019) argues that hope is an irreducible concept. This latter view is compatible with ontological variety and the view that different manifestations of hope are related in terms of family resemblance.
As for the norms of hope, there is consensus regarding the point that there is a theoretical (or epistemic) and a practical aspect to the rationality of hope. On the theoretical side, the question is whether the outcome is indeed possible (this amounts to evaluating hope in terms of its correctness) and whether the person is justified in her taking the outcome to be possible (this amounts to evaluating hope in terms of justification or responsiveness to reasons). One question of debate is whether the outcome must also be probable to a certain degree in order for hope to be rational (for an affirmative answer, see Moellendorf 2020 and Stockdale 2021). Andy Mueller captures the epistemic rationality of hope by specifying the idea that “hoping that p” is rationally incompatible with “knowing that not-p” (Mueller 2021: 45). (On the relation between hope and knowledge, see also Benton 2021).
On the practical side, most authors focus on the instrumental rationality of hope. Martin holds that hope is rational “so long as it promotes her [the agent’s] rational ends to do these things [i.e. engage in hopeful activities such as acting to promote the end, fantasizing about the outcome, entertaining certain feelings of anticipation]” (Martin 2013). Similarly, Pettit emphasizes the instrumental value hope has for the pursuit of our ends (Pettit 2004: 161).
However, the practical rationality of hope does not seem to be exhausted by instrumental considerations. Bovens argues that in cases where hoping has no instrumental value (because we cannot help bring about the desired state), hope can still have intrinsic value in virtue of its concomitant mental imaging: This characteristic of hope is responsible for its intrinsic value in three respects: First, hope has intrinsic value because the mental imaging connected to it (that is, the imaginative anticipation of the fulfillment of one’s hope) is pleasurable in itself (Bovens 1999: 675f.). Second, hope has epistemic value because it increases one’s self-understanding. Third, hope has intrinsic worth because it is constitutive of love towards others and towards oneself, which are intrinsically valuable activities. It is in virtue of mental imaging that hope is intimately connected to love, because spending mental energy in thinking about the well-being of another person is constitutive of loving her. Bloeser and Stahl (2017) argue that certain hopes—fundamental hopes—can be rational in virtue of their contribution to the practical identity of the hoping person.
Finally, it is a matter of debate how the theoretical and the practical dimension of rationality are related. On Martin’s account, the practical dimension has priority. Miriam Schleiffer McCormick, by contrast, holds that the theoretical and practical dimensions equally contribute to hope’s overall rationality and are intertwined (McCormick 2017).
Another approach to the value of hope explores the prospects of understanding hope as a virtue. Michael Milona interprets hope as a moral virtue along the lines of “getting one’s priorities straight” (Milona 2020b). (For another attempt to understand hope as a moral virtue, see Han-Pile/Stern, forthcoming; for a critical view of such an enterprise, see Bobier 2018.) Michael Lamb aims to apply the structure of Thomas Aquinas’ theological virtue of hope to argue that hope can be a democratic virtue that perfects acts of hoping in fellow citizens to achieve democratic goods (Lamb 2016). Nancy Snow (2013) proposes that hope can be understood as an intellectual virtue. (For a critical assessment of Snow’s approach, see Cobb 2015.)
Accounts of hope as a virtue suggest that not all instances of hope can be described as “hope that p”, i.e., as propositional hopes that the standard definition and its successors aim to analyze. There are two kinds of non-propositional hope that are subject to debate (see Rioux 2021): First, as Lamb’s account suggests, we might have hope in a person, which Adrienne Martin calls “interpersonal hope” (Martin 2020). Second, it has been suggested that there is an attitude of indeterminate hope that is able to survive the loss of particular, determinate hopes. The distinction between “hope that” and hope without a determinate object has been introduced into the philosophical discourse by Gabriel Marcel and has recently been taken up (with or without explicit reference to Marcel) by otherwise different accounts. Joseph Godfrey calls hope without object “fundamental hope” and bases his account on an analysis of Bloch, Kant and Marcel (Godfrey 1987). Patrick Shade’s pragmatist theory distinguishes particular hopes and hopefulness as “an openness to possibilities that are meaningful and promising for us” (Shade 2001: 139). Jonathan Lear similarly describes “radical hope” as a sense of a future in which “something good will emerge” (Lear 2006: 94), even though all particular hopes were destroyed; and Matthew Ratcliffe takes such radical hope as an instance of “pre-intentional hope”, which is
a kind of general orientation or sense of how things are with the world, in the context of which intentional states of the kind “I hope that p” are possible. (Ratcliffe 2013: 602)
4. Analyses of Hope in the Psychological Literature
Psychologists and psychoanalysts have systematically investigated hope since the 1950s (Frank 1968, for an overview, see Gallagher et al. 2020). In many of these first studies, hope was seen as a cognitive process of directing agency that rests on the perception of an outcome as important for an agent to achieve and as having a certain probability (Stotland 1969). While this understanding of hope deviates from the standard philosophical account (see section 3) by requiring a minimal probability, it continues to play a major role in the current psychological literature.
Currently, the most influential psychological approach to hope is Charles Snyder’s hope theory (for an overview, see Rand and Cheavens 2009). Snyder defines hope as follows:
Within a goal-setting framework, we propose that there are two major, interrelated elements of hope. First, we hypothesize that hope is fueled by the perception of successful agency related to goals. The agency component refers to a sense of successful determination in meeting goals in the past, present, and future. Second, we hypothesize that hope is influenced by the perceived availability of successful pathways related to goals. (Snyder et al. 1991: 570)
On this basis, Snyder and others have developed various measures of hope, such as the Adult Hope Scale (ibid.), and the State Hope Scale (Snyder et al. 1996) that have received strong experimental support and are widely used globally (see Gallagher et al. 2020: 193–196 and Rose and Sieben 2018 for discussion of other measures).
Several objections have been raised against Snyder’s analysis of hope. One is that the “perception of agency” relates both to the past and the future and therefore measures a general trait of hopefulness rather than the hope for specific outcomes. As a response, psychologists have developed further “domain-specific” hope scales (Lopez et al. 2000: 61). A second question concerns the issue of whether Snyder’s definition of hope is sufficiently distinct from optimism (see Miceli and Castelfranchi 2010; Aspinwall and Leaf 2002). Snyder wants to distinguish hope from optimism by linking hope to beliefs about self-efficacy (Snyder 2002; Snyder, Rand and Sigmon 2018; Magaletta and Oliver 1999) and reserving the term “optimism” for generalized expectations about positive outcomes. However, the ordinary use of the term is better captured by the idea that hope can be upheld even if one does not assign a high probability to the outcome.
5. Hope in Political Philosophy
Hope can play three distinct roles in politics (see Stahl 2020): It can be instrumentally valuable insofar as its motivating influence makes it more likely that people achieve politically desirable goals. It can also be constitutive of politics, in that it is necessary for certain hopes to be present for the space of the political to emerge at all. For example, Spinoza argues that citizens can only act together politically if they have civic hope, through which they see each other as sources of potential benefits (Steinberg 2018: 90). Lastly, hope can also play a justificatory role, insofar it is possible that certain policies can only be publicly justified by reference to hopes that those promoting them reasonably entertain.
The potential for hope to both motivate and mislead is widely discussed in ancient and modern philosophy, but systematic accounts of the political relevance of hope stem only from the 20th century (for an overview, see Blöser, Huber and Moellendorf 2020). Many of these contributions can be understood as raising questions about the possible justifications of being guided in one’s political agency by hope, on the one hand, and about the benefits and risks of hope for politics on the other.
Regarding the first question about the justification of hope, one of the earliest and most ambitious accounts can be found in Ernst Bloch’s The Principle of Hope. Bloch advances his argument in the context of a debate in early 20th-century Marxism, distinguishing between what he calls the “cold” and the “warm stream”: The first designates the materialist insight that all historical developments are conditioned and constrained by concrete, existing material conditions, “strict determinations that cannot be skipped over” (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:208), whereas the second acknowledges a processual constitution of reality which is captured by hope. Hope, in other words, is justified by its correctly grasping facts about the world. In particular, Bloch describes hope as always related to the “not-yet-conscious” that in turn reflects “objective possibilities”. This idea is related to Bloch’s processual metaphysics, according to which objective tendencies and possibilities interact with “closed” matters of fact, such that the moment of potentiality surpassing into actuality always opens up opportunities for the interventions of active decision-making. The right way to relate to these opportunities is, according to Bloch, “militant optimism”, i.e., not a mere assumption that things will develop in a desirable direction, but an active attitude towards real tendencies with the goal to realize them (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:201). Arguing from these premises, Bloch develops an integrated theory in which hope is not merely a subjective combination of desires and beliefs about probabilities or facts, but rather a reflection of metaphysical possibilities in the world and part of a range of human capacities that make it possible to relate to that which is not yet, but which is already prefigured in the objective potentials of reality.
While most contemporary political philosophers acknowledge that many of our political hopes are grounded in reality, few go as far as Bloch to also see a general attitude of hopefulness as justified by metaphysical considerations. In Law of Peoples, Rawls, for example, holds that political theories need to develop a “realistic utopia” of justice to reliably guide our political agency and to “support and strengthen” our political hopes (Rawls 2003: 23). Howard (2019: 300) argues that such a utopia refers to an outcome that is possible and reachable under favorable conditions, but which may be extremely improbable nevertheless. Following Kant, Rawls seems to assume that the main justification for our political hopes for justice seems to come from the fact that we need such hopes to be able to continue to be moved by considerations of justice, and that it would be unreasonable to give up political hope for that reason. Bourke (forthcoming) takes a closer look at the similarities and differences between Kant and Rawls regarding their justifications of belief and hope.
In similar terms, some contemporary authors think of a disposition to have certain hopes as a democratic virtue that can be fostered or undermined by states. Moellendorf (2006) makes an argument to this effect that is restricted to societies transitioning from severe injustice towards justice: Because citizens need hopes to be motivationally capable to engage in the risky activities necessary to pursue societal change, and because hopes for a more just future can support their self-respect under unjust circumstances, institutions of transitional societies must supply the “institutional bases of hope”, such as possibilities for free political campaigning and open debate. Snow (2018: 414) argues that societies that do not offer citizens “secure attachment” create “worrier” citizens that are more likely to succumb to paranoid nationalism, whereas “carers” who are hopeful citizens are more likely to embrace a more inclusive national identity. More narrowly, Snow defines “civic hope” as an “entrenched disposition of openness to the political possibilities a democratic government can provide. Hope must include the belief that the ends of democracy are possible” (2018: 419) and argues—drawing on the pragmatist tradition (see section 2.6 above)—that this disposition is a virtue that contributes to the flourishing of their lives as citizens as well as of the state they live in.
While most contemporary liberal views follow these arguments in replacing Bloch’s metaphysical foundations of hope with moral justifications, defenders of “unjustifiable” political hope, such as Richard Rorty, argue for the more radical claim that we cannot, as a matter of principle, provide any fundamental justification for the desirability of the outcomes that we hope for. As Rorty famously rejects the idea of a political philosophy that is based on privileged knowledge or insight, he argues that “liberal hope” (i.e., hope for the emergence and sustenance of liberal societies) similarly cannot be based on any foundations—such as knowledge about probabilities. Rather, it is an attitude by which those who have it express their commitment to certain forms of future interaction and their belief in their possibility. In Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, Rorty correspondingly contrasts two forms of liberalism: The “liberal metaphysician” expects social cooperation to be based on scientific or philosophical insight that penetrates individual idiosyncrasy and aims at the adoption of a universal, final vocabulary that then leads to solidarity. By contrast, the “liberal ironist” renounces the idea of a final vocabulary and instead assumes that only the contingent overlap between “selfish hopes” can be a source of the solidarity that grounds the commitment to liberal principles (Rorty 1989: 93). As Smith (2005) notes, Rorty does not intend to argue for unjustified hope (hope for which there is no adequate justification, although such justification is possible). Rather, he must refer to a form of hope for which the question of an ultimate justification does not arise, since it does not incorporate the idea that it is based on any such justification.
While the authors surveyed so far all agree on a positive role of hope in politics, there is also a more skeptical tradition in political thought that either questions whether hope in the standard sense is always available to political agents or argues that, at least sometimes, hope ought to be abandoned for political reasons.
One set of arguments revolves around whether the positive aspects of political hope are accessible to everyone as classic liberal accounts of hope seem to assume. Stockdale (2021) argues that many hopes of members of oppressed groups are not forms of pleasurable anticipation, but “fearful hope”, that is, hope for avoiding the worst effects of their oppression. In this sense, hope is not always something that ought to be preserved. Of course, this does not exclude more positive hopes, such as hoping for a less oppressive future. A more radical challenge to the idea that specific, objectual hopes are always available as a response to injustice is to be found in Lear’s (2006) reflections on “radical hope”. Lear considers a situation—such as that which members of the Crow nation may have faced after they were forced to live on reservations and, as a consequence, their traditional form of life became impossible—where, as a result of historical catastrophe, the vocabulary with which a group makes sense of the good collapses, and the only thing they can hope for is that a new version of a good life will become possible—a version they currently lack the words to conceptualize.
A second, skeptical argument is concerned with the objection that hope in politics might serve to encourage wishful thinking or undermine a realistic, critical evaluation of social reality (see Blöser, Huber and Moellendorf 2020 for an overview): It is often equated with optimism (see Eagleton 2015 for an argument that does not do so) and thus a naive approach to politics. It is said to disempower since hope involves seeing the outcome as dependent on factors beyond one’s control, and to misdirect our agency towards Utopian goals. As Moellendorf (2019: 154) argues, all hope imposes opportunity costs, since it precludes alternative attitudes which may be more instrumentally valuable. Political realists (such as Sleat 2013) argue that hope may be a necessary element of politics, but will by necessity go beyond that which is actually possible and thus mislead our political agency. Although these arguments draw attention to the dangers of hope in politics that have to be taken seriously, a balanced judgment must also take into account the dimensions of value discussed above. Indeed, philosophers working in the field of climate change often emphasize the instrumental value of hope in sustaining action where the attainment of the ultimate goal—managing climate change—is uncertain (McKinnon 2014, Roser 2019). Moellendorf highlights the need to develop hopeful politics when discussing climate issues (Moellendorf 2022).
A third argument finally confronts the fundamental issue of whether hope and hopefulness are always as desirable in politics as much of the preceding arguments have assumed. Warren (2015), for example, argues that the discourse and the valuation of political hope in Black American politics, serves to appropriate a theological notion of hope and uses it to enforce a “compulsory investment” of Black people’s hope in the political—although the resulting politics only prolongs and reinforces the racist structures towards the ending of which their political hope is ostensibly directed. Instead, Warren advocates for “Black nihilism”, that is, the rejection of the metaphysical and political framework in which political hope operates (see Lloyd 2018, Winters 2019 for discussion). But even Warren leaves space for “spiritual hope” as a hope for the end of political hope.
The works of Thomas Aquinas are cited according to the Corpus Thomisticum (available online) as follows: SsS for Scriptum super Sententiis, and ST for Summa Theologiae.
Kant’s works are cited according to the Akademie Edition (AE): Königliche Preußische (later Deutsche) Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Georg Reimer (later Walter De Gruyter), except for the Critique of Pure Reason. The latter is cited using the standard A- and B-edition pagination. Quoted translations of Kant are included in the list of sources below.
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Work on an earlier version of this entry was supported by the Hope and Optimism Project at Notre Dame University.